The Donation of Human Organs

First published Fri Oct 28, 2011; substantive revision Fri Aug 13, 2021

Organ transplantation raises difficult ethical questions about people’s claims to determine what happens to their bodies before and after death. What are these claims? What would it be to respect them? How should they fit with the claims of organ donors’ families or the needs of people whose own organs have failed? And then how should organs be allocated? Who should get priority and why? As with other topics in applied ethics, satisfactory answers require knowing the relevant facts, in this case about organ transplantation.

In summary form, the following empirical claims about organ transplantation are widely accepted:

  1. Organ transplantation is a successful treatment for organ failure in many cases.
  2. Organ transplantation is cost-effective compared with other treatments for organ failure (Machnicki et al. 2006; Persad 2018 claims that transplantation is not cost-effective compared with life-saving treatments for other conditions besides organ failure).
  3. Most organ transplantation nowadays is routine, not experimental (Tilney 2003; Veatch and Ross 2015). The organs in question are the kidney, liver, heart, lung, pancreas, and intestine. This entry discusses only the “routine” cases. Experimental ones raise additional questions, but these are more properly dealt with as part of the entry on the ethics of clinical research. Present examples of experimental transplantation include faces and uteri (Bayefsky & Berman 2016; Freeman and Jaoudé 2007; Lotz 2018; O’Donovan, Williams, & S. Wilkinson 2019; Robertson 2016; Sandman 2018; S. Wilkinson & Williams 2015; Williams 2016).
  4. Transplant organs are often scarce. Many people who would benefit from receiving a transplant do not get one.

Organs are taken from the dead and the living. Each category raises separate problems and we begin with dead organ donors.

1. Organ Retrieval from the Dead

The dead are the major sources of organs for transplantation. For a long time deceased donors came from those declared brain dead, that is, those who have irreversibly lost their brain function. In recent years, however, many donors have come from those who have died in the sense of circulatory death. Both donation after brain death and donation after circulatory death invite the important philosophical—not just medical—question “what is it to be dead”? (See the entry on the definition of death.)

Even though far more people die than require new organs, organs are scarce. Numerous factors affect the retrieval of organs from the dead. These include: the nature of people’s deaths (in only perhaps fewer than 1% of deaths can organs currently be taken, and countries vary according to the number of strokes, car crashes, shootings, and other causes of death that lend themselves to retrieval); the number of intensive care units (ICUs) (most donors die there and fewer ICUs makes for fewer donors); the medical factors that determine whether organs are retrieved successfully; the logistical factors that determine the efficient use of available organs; the extent of public awareness of transplantation; and the ethical-legal rules for consent that determine who is allowed to block or permit retrieval. Although most of these factors do not raise philosophical questions, it is important to realize that the main factor that does—the ethical-legal system for consent—is only one of many that affect retrieval rates, and nowhere near the most important at that. One should also bear in mind that the variety of factors plus unreliability or incomparability in statistics about retrieval mean that it is hard or impossible to have confidence in many of the causal claims about how consent rules affect retrieval rates.

This section explains the rules for consent as they operate in practice in most countries. It then outlines certain reform proposals, mentions the claims of the main affected parties, and, in the light of those claims, evaluates those reform proposals.

1.1 Organ retrieval in practice

In nearly all countries with a transplantation program, the following is a broadly accurate description of organ retrieval in practice, although different countries, and regions of countries, do differ in nuanced ways, for instance in how the option of donation is presented to families; and the nuances may affect retrieval rates (T.M. Wilkinson 2011).

  1. If the deceased made a refusal known, either formally (e.g., on a register) or informally, organs will not be retrieved.
  2. If the family refuses, organs will not be retrieved.
  3. If the deceased is not known to have refused, suitable organs will be retrieved if the family agrees (some jurisdictions) or does not refuse (other jurisdictions).

The first point to make from this description is that nearly all countries have, in practice, a “double veto” system. Even if the family wants to donate, the deceased’s objection will veto retrieval. Even if the deceased agreed to donate, the family’s objection will veto retrieval. (The U.S. has partial exceptions discussed shortly.) The family’s veto is in many countries, such as the U.S., the U.K., and most nations of continental Europe, a creation of the medical profession. Doctors will not take organs from consenting dead people whose families object even though the law permits retrieval. A lesson in method follows: when describing the practice of organ retrieval, looking at the law alone is inadequate.

A vital second point is that the consent of the deceased is not required before organs may be taken. (Japan was the last major exception and permitted retrieval without the deceased’s consent from 2010 – see the link to the Japan Organ Transplant Network in the Other Internet Resources section below.) When the deceased has not refused, the family’s agreement is enough to permit retrieval.

1.2 Proposals for reform

The persistent scarcity of organs has given rise to several proposals to reform the system for consent. The main ones are:

  1. Encourage or mandate clearer choices by the deceased.
  2. End the family’s power of veto.
  3. Change defaults so that organs are taken except when the deceased formally objected.
  4. Conscript organs.
  5. Pay for organs.

(1)–(4) are discussed below; for (5), see the entry on the sale of human organs. Before evaluating the proposals, we describe the claims of the main affected parties. In determining what the rules for retrieval ought to be, three main claims are in play. These are the claims of the deceased, the deceased’s family, and potential recipients of organs. Transplant professionals have claims too, which are probably best thought of as matters of professional conscience, but these are not discussed further here.

The dead. The “claims of the dead over their bodies” is almost invariably shorthand for “the claims of the living over their post-mortem bodies”, and that is how it will be understood here. While it is widely accepted that living people have strong claims over their own bodies, especially when it comes to vetoing invasions of their bodily integrity, it is much less widely accepted that the dead have such claims. Among the views that the dead have claims, we may distinguish between those which hold that events after death can harm the interests of the formerly-living and those which hold that it is only the fears and concerns of the living that have weight. Thus if it is asked why we should attach weight to a person’s refusal of organ retrieval, the first sort of view may say “because to take the organ of a person who refused damages his interest” and the second sort may say “because the anticipation of retrieval against his wishes will be bad for the living person”. The first sort of view is the subject of posthumous interests (see the entry on death).

Even if we accept that people may have posthumous interests, the content of those interests will often be unknown or indeterminate. Many people do not think about organ donation, which is quite reasonable given the low chance that they will die in such a way as to permit organ retrieval. In cases where they have not thought or not revealed their thoughts, it seems plausible to say that they have no interest to be taken into account in deciding whether to proceed with retrieval.

In some cases, the claims of the deceased will be in conflict with those of their families and/or the claims of potential recipients. The question arises of how to weigh the claims of the deceased. Some writers accept that the deceased can have posthumous interests, but believe them to be of little weight, particularly compared with the needs for organs of those with organ failure (Harris 2002, 2003). They may believe that people are not affected by their posthumous interests being set back or they may think the fear of retrieval is of little weight. In their view, any roughly consequentialist calculation would justify setting aside the objections of the deceased to organ retrieval. Other writers argue that if we accept posthumous interests and accept that people have strong claims over their bodies while alive, we have grounds to attribute rights to the living over their post-mortem bodies (T.M. Wilkinson 2011). Such a view needs to explain how posthumous rights are possible, since some writers in political and legal theory believe that rights could not protect posthumous interests for technical reasons to do with the nature of rights (Steiner 1994; Fabre 2008).

The family. If one accepts that the deceased have a claim, then families may acquire a claim by transfer. That is, the deceased may delegate decision-making power to their families, as is possible in some jurisdictions. Some authors have even suggested that the organs of the dead should be treated as something akin to inheritable property (Voo and Holm 2014). Acquiring a claim by transfer however is no more controversial than the deceased’s having a claim in the first place. What is the subject of dispute is whether the family should have a claim in their own right which could be set against the claims of the deceased or potential recipients.

Some argue for family decision-making on cultural grounds (Fan and Wang 2019). For them, giving priority to the deceased is unacceptably individualist either in all cases or in cases where individualism is culturally abnormal (Boddington 1998). Among the difficulties for such views is to explain why, if individualism is mistaken, the decision about retrieval should be made by individual families rather than in the interests of the wider community, which may well require taking organs against the families’ wishes so as to meet the needs of potential recipients.

If families were overridden, it is reasonable to suppose that they would suffer extra distress: that is, even more distress than they would already be experiencing upon the often untimely and unanticipated death of the relative. Few writers deny that avoiding distress would be a good reason, although some believe (without much evidence) that a norm of taking organs and overriding families’ opposition would come to be accepted (Harris 2003). What is controversial is how strong a claim the family would acquire not to be distressed.

Finally, families are not monolithic, and sometimes they disagree among themselves about whether to endorse organ retrieval. How internal disagreement affects the families is not widely discussed.

Potential recipients. As was said at the start of this entry, potential recipients stand to gain a great deal from receiving an organ in terms of both the quantity and quality of their lives. They are also badly off, in a medical sense, in that they suffer from organ failure. Utilitarian, prioritarian, and egalitarian views of justice and benevolence would, therefore, give considerable weight to the needs of potential recipients.

We now turn to consider the proposals for reform listed above.

1.2.1 Encourage or mandate clearer choices by the deceased

According to some, an important cause of family refusal of organ retrieval is uncertainty about the wishes of the deceased. Families that do not know what their relatives wanted often default to “no” (den Hartogh 2008a). To avoid the default, some writers would encourage people to decide about donation in a way others will know, for instance by paying them (De Wispelaere and Stirton 2010) and others suggest mandating choice by, for instance, withholding driving licenses from those who do not choose. The suggestion is not, or not in all cases, that people be steered into agreeing to donate or penalized if they refuse. It is that people be steered to make clear choices, yes or no.

Some ethical questions are raised by penalizing people for not choosing or for introducing monetary encouragement. It may be replied that no one is pressured to donate, as opposed to choose; that the penalties or encouragement are slight; and that transplants are of such value to the needy that any ethical objections are easily overridden. The real difficulty is that mandated choice may not increase retrieval rates by much. In some places where it has been tried (such as the U.S. states of Virginia and Texas), people who are pressured to choose themselves default to “no” (den Hartogh 2008a). In New Zealand, where one must choose as a condition of getting a driving license, the choice is often ignored by intensive care doctors and families because it does not seem like a genuine decision.

1.2.2 End the family’s power of veto

Families usually have at least the de facto power to veto retrieval from the deceased, even those who adamantly wanted to donate their organs. Does this power not give excessive weight to the interests of families as against the interests of both the deceased and potential recipients (Liberman 2015; Zambrano 2017)?

As it happens, it appears that families rarely override the donors’ known wishes. Furthermore, it seems unlikely that many people would want to donate no matter how upset their families were, so allowing families to veto retrieval is unlikely to be against the all-things-considered wishes of many of the deceased.

In any case, transplant professionals have a practical reason not to override the family: they fear bad publicity. One version of their argument is this:

there are already urban myths about people having their deaths hastened so as to make their organs available; few people understand brain-death; donation would fall if families publicly claimed that their views were overridden and their relatives were not dead; thus ending the family veto would reduce the supply of organs, not increase it.

If the practical argument is correct, it is understandable why families have a medically-created power of veto. Moreover, it is hard to see that the veto is contrary to the claims of the deceased. While the deceased may have a claim to block retrieval, no one has a claim that other people use his or her organs. If the veto is in the interests of potential recipients, doctors may refuse the offer of organs by the deceased without infringing on the deceased’s claim (T.M. Wilkinson 2007a).

Some states in the U.S. have implemented “first person” consent laws that mandate overriding families in cases where the deceased has ticked the “donate” box or its equivalent on a form. It is unclear how far such laws are upheld. In principle, it might be possible to get some data on the effect of overriding families on the organ supply, thus testing the practical argument in the previous paragraphs. Ethically, first person consent laws arguably do not respect the wishes of the deceased, at least in cases where the deceased donors who ticked the box did not fully grasp that their families’ wishes would be overridden.

1.2.3 Change defaults so that organs are taken except when the deceased formally objected

This proposal favors what is variously called “opt-out” or “presumed consent”. A “hard” version would take organs even when the deceased’s family objected (with all the problems mentioned in the previous sub-section); a “soft” version would allow the family to veto retrieval. The leading argument for opt-out claims that many people want to donate but through inertia do not get round to opting in. In an opt-out system, inertia would prevent them opting out so their organs could be taken and, since most people do want to donate, the deceased would be more likely to get what they want and more organs would be available (Thaler and Sunstein 2008).

The proposal envisages taking organs without the explicit consent of the deceased. One may object that people’s rights over their bodies establish a duty of non-interference which can be lifted only with the consent of the rightholder (Kluge 2000). A different objection points out that taking organs without consent would sometimes be against the wishes of the deceased; and while not taking would be against the wishes of the deceased who had wanted to donate, taking in error is a worse mistake than not taking in error, because people have a right not to have their organs taken but no right to have their organs taken (Veatch and Ross 2015; for criticism specifically of their views see den Hartogh 2019). As against these views, we must dispose of the bodies of the dead in some way, even if not consented to; and we give unconsented medical treatment to the unconscious even though some would have opposed treatment (Gill 2004; T.M. Wilkinson 2011).

Is it right to use the bodies of the deceased without either their consent or knowing that they had wanted the use? The question is an important and difficult one. It is very important to note, however, that this question is raised by virtually all existing organ procurement systems To restate: all systems allow organs to be taken without the deceased’s consent. It follows that the simple inertia argument for shifting defaults is flawed. There is no default of non-retrieval in the absence of the deceased’s consent. Other arguments for variations of opting out turn on the empirical question of effects on retrieval. Since many different factors affect retrieval rates, it is often hard to be confident about the difference that changes to consent would make.

1.2.4 Conscript Organs

The idea of conscription is to take organs in all suitable cases even when the deceased or family objected (except, perhaps, in cases of conscientious objection). Unlike the other reform proposals, conscription seems to have little political support. Nonetheless, some powerful philosophical arguments can be given for it. One argument, mentioned above, compares the strength of the interests of the deceased, families, and potential recipients, and claims that the need for transplants of those with organ failure is much greater than the needs of the deceased or their families (Kamm 1993; Harris 2002, 2003). Another argument draws an analogy with the relief of poverty. Many people think the state may use its coercive powers to transfer material resources from those with a surplus to those with little. In other words, we think that people have welfare rights to resources. One way to fulfill those rights is to tax the estates of the deceased. By parity of reasoning, because organs are also resources and no longer of use to the dead, they too should be coercively transferred to fulfill the welfare rights of those with organ failure (Fabre 2006).

Conscription may be politically infeasible or be subject to practical objections. But what of principled ethical objections? One could point to the distress that families would suffer (Brazier 2002), but what of the distress of the families of people who die for want of an organ? One could point to the interests of the deceased, but the arguments above need not deny that the deceased have interests; they claim that those interests are outweighed. One could claim that the deceased have rights that protect their interests and deny that potential recipients have rights to organs. Even if the deceased have rights and potential recipients do not, it would have to be shown that the rights of the deceased are not outweighed by the needs of those with organ failure.

1.2.5 Further Proposals

As noted above, many factors affect the supply of organs and transplantation systems have made clinical, logistical, and marketing attempts to increase supply. Some of these raise ethical questions. Consider preparing for organ retrieval patients who are not yet dead, for example by ventilating patients thought likely to die in the near future. If the preparatory measures are permitted, more donors would become available than if they are not. But these measures would not be done for the therapeutic benefit of the patient. They would be contrary to a duty to act only in the best interests of the patient, at least when “best interests” are understood as only medical interests. On the other hand, if “best interests” were understood more broadly, as explained in 2.1 below, then in some cases, such as where the patient had agreed to donate, the preparatory measures might be in the patient’s non-medical interests. In any case, the measures need not be against the patient’s medical interests.

As for social marketing (or “nudging”) to try to increase consent rates, these might target potential donors, as with campaigns to increase the number on a donor registry, or the families of those who have died, say by using specially trained people to ask their consent. In some cases, these ideas invite the question of whether they involve manipulation and whether any consent obtained is valid (Sharif and Moorlock 2018; T.M. Wilkinson 2011). They also raise again the question of how much it would matter if consent were not valid if the supply of organs increased.

2. Organ Retrieval from Living Donors

The successful early transplants used organs taken from living donors. For a long time the hope was that, when technical problems were overcome, enough organs would be supplied by dead donors (Price 2009). That way, healthy living people need not undergo the risk and discomfort of non-therapeutic organ retrieval. That hope however was false and the persistent shortage of donors has led to the increasing use of living donors. It has been reported that 37,360 live donor kidney transplants occurred in 2019 (Global Observatory on Donation and Transplantation), over 37% of the global total. For livers, the global total from living donors was 7,610, over 21% of the total. Rules governing living donation have generally become more permissive, allowing donations from close genetic relatives, then spouses, then partners and friends, and, in some jurisdictions, even strangers.

The primary ethical question raised by living donation is to do with the risk of having an organ taken. Having an organ taken imposes risks of death, disease, and discomfort from trauma, infection, the use of a general anaesthetic, and the loss of all or part of an organ (although the liver will usually regenerate, replacing the part removed). These risks are not negligible. However, the risk of death is not enormous. Focusing on the kidney, the most frequently donated organ and the safest to take from live donors, it has been estimated that the risk of death from kidney retrieval is 1/3000. There appears to be no difference between healthy screened living kidney donors and the general population in long-term survival and the risk of kidney failure. (Ibrahim et al. 2009). That said, the general population is less healthy on average than the healthy screened living donors, who do in fact undergo some extra risk of long-term renal failure as a result of one kidney being removed (Grams et al. 2016).

Under what conditions, if any, is it permissible to impose such a risk on someone who will receive no therapeutic benefit? For competent people, it is overwhelmingly accepted that their valid consent is a necessary condition of morally permissible retrieval. (A very few writers disagree, e.g., Rakowski 1991 and, less clearly, Fabre 2006). But even if consent is necessary, it may not be sufficient, and a further question is how much risk it is permissible to impose even on those who consent. Living donor transplantation also raises important questions about the validity of consent and about whether organs may ever be taken from healthy non-competent people, such as children.

2.1 “Do no harm”

Medical ethics traditionally instructs clinicians not to harm people. Taking organs from healthy people does seem to harm them, so living donor transplantation appears contrary to traditional medical ethics. One reply is to say that the “do no harm” rule is a relic of the medical profession’s paternalism; if people want to donate their organs and know what they are doing, why stop them (Veatch and Ross 2015)? This reply raises the difficult problem, discussed below, of how far consent justifies harm. Another reply is to say that taking organs from willing living donors may not be all-things-considered harmful to them (Spital 2004). This reply usually draws on one of the following normative views: (a) that living donation is only permissible when we expect the donor not to be harmed; or (b) that it is only permissible when we expect the donor to benefit (in both cases, all things considered, taking account of a wider range of factors than just physical wellbeing) (Williams 2018).

Suppose a person were prevented from donating an organ. On the one hand, the person would avoid the risks of physical harm. But, on the other, the person may suffer what are, in the medical literature, called “psychosocial harms”. These could include loneliness from losing a relative, having to act as caregiver to a person with organ failure, and survivor guilt. In philosophical terms, a person may also suffer vicarious harm. People whose welfare is intertwined with others suffer a loss when the other person does (Feinberg 1984; Raz 1986). Quite possibly, then, a person who donates may not suffer harm all-things-considered, that is, when all the different instances of harm are weighed up.

The “do no harm” argument against living donation is not widely accepted—that is why living donation proceeds apace. Nonetheless, even if the physical harm can be outweighed by the need to avoid other harms, or by consent, or both, one may think that as a matter of policy living donation should be discouraged. One fear is that increasing the use of living donors relieves the pressure to find ways to get more organs from other sources, notably the deceased.

2.2 Valid Consent

Assuming consent is ethically necessary before taking organs from living competent people, questions arise about what makes consent valid. The usual answer in medical ethics is that consent must be free (voluntary), sufficiently informed, and made by someone with the capacity (competence) to consent. Thus, in the context of living donation, people must know what living donation involves, including the risks to them and the chances of success for the recipient, they must be able to decide freely whether to donate, and they must be competent to do so. (See the entry on informed consent.)

Can people freely give consent when considering whether to donate to a close relative? It may be thought that consent in such a case is suspect because potential donors would be: (1) desperate to save their relatives (2) subject to a feeling of moral obligation or (3) subject to family pressure. The first two reasons are not good ones. People give valid consent in other desperate circumstances, for instance to a lifesaving operation, and acting out of a reasonable sense of moral obligation is a way of exercising one’s freedom rather than a constraint upon it (we consider below unusual senses of obligation in the context of religious stranger donation) (Radcliffe-Richards 2006; T.M. Wilkinson and Moore 1997).

Family pressure is different. Family pressure may take the form of credible threats of violence, in which case the potential donor is coerced and any consent invalid. Family pressure may be felt as a form of moral obligation on the part of the donor, in which case (see above) consent would not be made invalid for that reason. Somewhat harder to think through is family pressure that consists of the implicit threat of ostracism. On the one hand, that pressure may be very effective. On the other, it works by family members withdrawing their goodwill, something people are generally entitled to do. Some views of coercion and valid consent imply that consent to avoid ostracism would be valid (e.g., Nozick 1974); others do not (e.g., Cohen 1988). As it happens, transplanters will often furnish reluctant donors with “white lies” to enable them to avoid donating while retaining the appearance of honour. For instance, reluctant donors may be told to say they are clinically unsuitable on anatomical grounds. Whether “white lies” are mandatory or even permissible depends partly on resolving the question of when family pressure undercuts valid consent (den Hartogh 2008b).

Many living donor programs use extensive psychosocial screening as well as a lengthy consent process (Price 2000). Potential donors are screened for physical health, which is largely uncontroversial, but they are also screened for their motivations. The typical advice is to screen for excessive sense of duty, undue influence, unconscious internal neurotic influences, and abnormal emotional involvement. Screening of this nature is more controversial since it involves making difficult judgments about what counts as excessive in a sense of duty, undue in influence, and abnormal in emotional involvement, and it requires spotting neurotic influences. At least in the past, some critics have thought that transplant professionals have overused their power to refuse people as donors (MacFarquhar 2009).

To take one example, consider whether a member of a religious sect, such as the Jesus Christians, should be allowed to donate to a stranger. It may be thought that such a person could not be giving valid consent, perhaps because of what a sect has done (the “brainwashing” worry) or because of some psychological vulnerability. However, it is often difficult to decide whether a way of influencing someone is illegitimate or whether motivations and beliefs are signs of mental illness (see entry on mental disorder).

2.3 The moral force of consent

Assuming a potential donor would give valid consent, how far would that justify retrieval of organs? The “do no harm” rule implies that people should not be harmed even with their consent although, as was said earlier, some living organ donation may not harm the donor all-things-considered. Suppose a man wanted to donate his second kidney to his second son, having already donated a kidney to another son, thus paying the price of a life on dialysis. Suppose a parent wanted to donate her heart to her child, thus causing her own death. Would transplant teams act wrongly if they took organs in such cases? And—what is a separate question—should they be allowed to?

It cannot be assumed that, in these desperate cases, the parents would be all-things-considered harmed by retrieval. Whether they are would depend on how the correct specification of harm handles vicarious harms and psychosocial harms. Perhaps a parent could be better off dead than to have to live without her child (which is not to say that her reason to donate is self-interest).

Suppose, though, that genuinely consensual organ retrieval would all-things-considered harm the donor. One way to try to decide when retrieval should nonetheless be permitted is to compare the values of autonomy with well-being. The question would then become an aspect of familiar debates about paternalism and the limits of consent. Living donation does have the unusual twist that, if one were to prevent donation, one would prevent an act of considerable value to a badly off person, the potential recipient. Moreover, to prevent living donation would be dissimilar to many acts of state paternalism, such as mandatory wearing of seat belts or the prohibition of certain drugs, in that donating an organ would not generally be the result of inattention, weak-will, addiction, or excessive short-sightedness. Because of its value to the recipient and because donors’ choices are not obviously flawed, living donation of the sorts that actually take place should be allowed and seems ethically permissible.

What about organ donation that goes beyond what is currently permitted, such as the donation of the second kidney or donation of an organ necessary for life? Liberal democracies do not generally allow consent to be a defense to bodily harm at or well below the level of death (Price 2000), but should they? The answer turns in part on how far third parties—transplant teams in this case—may inflict harms on those who genuinely give autonomous consent or, to put it another way, the extent to which autonomous people can waive their rights of bodily integrity. But policy considerations are also relevant. Can one be sure that consent is genuine? Would some people be forced into consenting in a way that a screening process would fail to detect? If so, how much weight should be attached to cases where organs are taken without genuine consent? These questions arise for living donation in general, but the errors are worse in cases where severe harm or death is the certain consequence of donation. (The questions also arise in the debates about whether voluntary slavery or euthanasia should be permitted (Feinberg 1986)).

2.4 Incompetent living donors

Although rules and practices governing living donation have generally become more permissive in most respects, they have become stricter in the case of incompetent donors (Price 2000). Only six living kidney donations by minors were performed between 2000 and 2015 in the U.S., for example. Additionally, in the U.S., just 20 minors have donated a liver lobe or segment since 1987. In Europe, only three cases of living kidney donation by minors have been reported, all involving adolescents and occurring in the U.K. prior to 2006 (Van Assche et al. 2016).

As the discussion above of psychosocial screening implies, competence is not always easily determined, but let us assume in this section that we are considering clearly incompetent donors, namely relatively young children and people with severe mental disabilities or illnesses.

If valid consent were a necessary condition of ethically permissible organ retrieval from the living, then retrieval from incompetent donors would be wrong. However, it is not clear why consent should be a necessary condition in all cases rather than only in those cases where people are capable of giving it.

Several arguments have been given for permitting retrieval from incompetent people. Utilitarian arguments appear to permit retrieval because the donor loses less than the recipient gains. On the face of it, however, that argument would support organ conscription from living competent people too. Some people have argued in specific cases that the person would have wanted to donate, thus using the idea of substituted judgment familiar in other cases of deciding for incompetent patients. However, substituted judgment is misapplied in cases where the person is not, and never has been, competent (Buchanan and Brock 1990). More plausibly, it may be thought that, at least in some cases, incompetent donors are not harmed by donating an organ. If a child’s donation would save the life of a sibling with organ failure, the donor may gain in the psychosocial and vicarious senses described above in the discussion of the “do no harm” rule. Donors may be no worse off for donating, in which case organ retrieval would not infringe the “do no harm” rule (T.M. Wilkinson 2011).

Even if organ retrieval from an incompetent donor were ethically permissible in a given case, it may be that policy considerations, such as the risk of abuse, would justify an outright ban. Some writers, though, believe that legal safeguards would be enough to protect incompetent donors from abuse (Munson 2002).

3. The Allocation of Organs

The scarcity of organs creates an allocation problem. A great deal has been written in philosophy on the principles of the allocation of scarce resources, although not much on the allocation of organs specifically (see the entries on distributive justice; equality; justice and access to health care). Unsurprisingly, many of the principles cited in official transplantation allocation documents are familiar (see Other Internet Resources: TSANZ 2014; NHSBT 2013). These principles include allocating to those who would benefit the most (a proxy for utility), to those who are the sickest (a proxy for helping the worst off), to those whose medical condition will deteriorate the soonest (urgency), and to those who have been waiting the longest (often linked to equity). Official documents also stress principles of non-discrimination, which are taken to exclude allocating according to judgments of social worth, as well as race, sex, religion etc. In practice, the principles conflict; the person waiting the longest may not be the one who would gain the most from a transplant, for example. So official allocation protocols also have to say how the conflict between principles should be resolved. (For a philosophical discussion of the principles and their application to organ allocation see Kamm 1993.)

This entry does not provide a full account of allocation principles for organs. Rather, it aims to do three specific things. First, it explains some of the features of allocation of organs that need to be taken into account when applying basic principles. This section draws to the attention of philosophers the real-world complexity of applying abstract principles of allocation. Second, it discusses the problems of responsibility for condition and social value. These problems are both ethically interesting and, while not unique to organ allocation, are more poignant than for other scarce resources because they often cannot be avoided just by making more money available. Third, it describes some transplantation-specific cases of the interaction between allocation rules and the number of organs retrieved for transplantation. These cases raise doubts about the coherence of some actually existing allocation practices.

3.1 The complexity of organ allocation

The allocation of organs is certainly not just a medical problem to be solved with medical expertise (Veatch and Ross 2015). The principles that apply to allocation are quintessentially ethical principles. However, applying those principles correctly to produce final answers as to who receives organs does require medical knowledge and much other knowledge besides. To see the point, imagine that we have to design an organ allocation scheme.

Suppose we start with first-best principles, such as allocation according to need, or urgency, or benefit, or equity, or some mix of these principles based on some judgment of their relative weight. Clearly, applying these principles requires considering what organs do. Organs differ in many ways that matter to allocation, such as

alternative treatments to transplantation, the ability to stratify risk, the different factors that affect patient and/or graft survival, and differences in the interactions between donor graft and recipients on outcomes. (NHSBT 2013, p. 8)

To explain just one of these factors, nearly all patients in rich countries whose kidneys have failed have the alternative of dialysis, whereas most of those with acute liver failure have no alternative to transplantation but death. Liver allocation, to a much greater extent than kidney allocation, must thus make some judgment about the importance of saving lives immediately compared with, for instance, improving quality or extending lifespan.

Next, the application of the principles ought to range across all the stages of transplantation. Details vary from place to place and organ to organ but in general the pathway to transplantation can be thought of as having these steps: being referred for assessment; being assessed and then listed; and receiving an organ once listed. People may be halted at each step, perhaps for medical reasons, perhaps because they cannot pay (the so-called “green screen”) or because the public system will not pay. Principles need to range over all steps. For instance, scrupulous fairness to those on a waiting list may obscure injustice in access to the list.

Implementing first-best principles can have important secondary consequences. To take one example, the scheme the U.S. introduced in 1989 to allocate kidneys increased the weighting for immune system compatibility and the effect was to reduce the proportion of African-Americans transplanted (Elster 1992: ch. 5). Many thought the result inequitable because of the disparate impact even though the difference was not due to overt discrimination (see the entry on justice, inequality, and health).

In addition, a scheme must take account of procedural values such as transparency, non-arbitrariness, and public deliberation (Miller 1999, ch.5). For instance, we may think that time spent waiting on a list is only a rough proxy for fairness. Perhaps someone entered a list late because of the difficulties in finding the time and resources to complete the requirements for listing; in perfect fairness that person should not be disadvantaged as a result. And yet time waiting is a visible and checkable criterion, whereas taking account of diverse social and economic circumstances would be procedurally fraught when it comes to ordering a priority list.

Finally, allocation must take account of incentives in two distinct ways. It must consider how the scheme would be operated. The ideal application of first-best principles would require considerable flexibility and discretion. Fixed rules or algorithms inevitably fail to capture all the relevant information. And yet flexibility and discretion are open to gaming by doctors and patients, for instance in exaggerating the urgency of transplanting a patient. Thus incentive effects may make an ideal method sub-ideal in practice.

Allocation must also consider the incentive effects of an allocation scheme on the size of the donor pool.

This topic is discussed below.

3.2 Self-inflicted illness and social value

Two other specific allocation questions are:

  1. Should people who have caused themselves to be in need of a transplant by leading a “high risk” life be assigned lower priority?
  2. Should people who are more “socially valuable” be assigned higher priority?

Some people increase their chances of needing a transplant organ by leading what they know to be unhealthy lifestyles. Many of those who smoke, or drink alcohol excessively, or eat too much know that they are acting unhealthily (whether or not they know that smoking increases the risks of heart and lung failure, that drinking increases the risk of liver failure, and that obesity increases the risk of kidney and pancreas failure). It has been suggested that such people forfeit or weaken their claims to medical treatment (Brown 2013; Buyx 2008; Smart 1994; Walker 2010).

There is one “non-ethical” argument for this view, called the Medical Argument. According to this:

… patients with self-inflicted illness … should have lower priority in access to health care because they are more likely to experience poor medical outcomes. (Sharkley and Gillam 2010: 661)

On the factual premise, it seems false that as a class those with “self-inflicted” illness would do so badly they should be deprioritized (Munson 2002), although transplant systems often do try to screen out those who would continue to act in ways that jeopardize their new organs. In any case, the Medical Argument is essentially just an application of more general cost-effectiveness criteria and not something that requires a special ethical justification. The arguments considered below, in contrast, are ones which claim that (for example) heavy drinkers and smokers should have lower priority access to organs even if they are no more likely than others to experience poor transplant outcomes. There are three main ethical arguments for this claim, two of which are clearly quite weak; a third, the Restoration Argument, is worth taking more seriously.

The first argument concerns incentives. It says that if (for example) we refuse to provide heavy drinkers with liver transplants then this will discourage irresponsible drinking. Similar things are said about overeating and obesity.

The argument however is problematic. To continue with alcohol, would organ allocation policy really make much difference to people’s drinking-behavior? Some reasons for thinking not include:

  1. The very long-term nature of the calculation that drinkers would be required to make. They would need to gamble on organ allocation policies staying as they are for perhaps many decades and would need to trade off highly speculative longer-term gains (maybe needing and then getting an organ many years down the line) against short-term pleasure and reward (having another drink now).
  2. Serious liver disease ought to be incentive enough. If the prospect of serious organ failure is not acting as an incentive then what are the chances of allocation policy doing so?
  3. Many heavy drinkers are dependent on alcohol and so incentives may not engage them effectively. Similar things might be said about smoking, illegal drug use, and even diet (Walker 2010).

Another challenge for the incentives approach is that if the rationale for deprioritising heavy drinkers, say, is simply incentivisation then there is no reason to restrict these measures to cases of organ failure. Why not instead remove their driving licenses, or their access to non-urgent healthcare, or subject them to punitive rates of tax? Such measures could all be incentives to stop drinking and would surely be more effective—not least because their effects would be felt straightaway, rather than many years down the line.

The next argument suggests that heavy drinkers and smokers should be deprioritised on transplant waiting lists as a punishment for wrongdoing. There are several reasons to reject such a position:

  1. Unhealthy behavior such as excessive drinking, overeating, and smoking may well not be morally wrong nor merit punishment.
  2. If punishing wrongdoing is the purpose of the allocation exercise then there are probably more deserving candidates for punishment than those who overindulge (even if there is something morally wrong with such overindulgence).
  3. Using healthcare resource allocation as a mode of punishment is impracticable and unfair, and may have adverse consequences (such as negative effects on public attitudes to organ donation and to doctors). Selecting only certain risky behavior as immoral seems arbitrary. Waiving that problem, how are judgments about causal and moral responsibility to be made in a timely and cost-effective way, and how are doctors going to make them? Punishment should only be meted out by state bodies (i) for prohibited acts (so not, in most countries, drinking, overeating, and smoking) and (ii) following “due process” in a court (Harris 1985).

A version of objection (c) applies to an opposite policy proposal: that higher priority should be given to patients with high social value. This “social value” could either be instrumental (doctors, nurses, parents of young children perhaps) or moral (prioritising the virtuous). The fundamental objection to rewarding social value is that it infringes a principle of equal treatment but, putting that aside, it has the practical and fairness problems of the punishment proposal. How is social value to be determined and then how is it to be applied in a timely and cost-effective manner? And, given the potentially dire consequences of being assigned low social value (which could in practice be a “death sentence”), procedurally it seems reasonable to expect something akin to a court hearing. A version of allocating according to perceived social value (among other criteria) was tried in Seattle in the 1960s in allocating very scarce dialysis (Alexander 1962). The result seems to have removed any enthusiasm among transplant systems for trying it again.

Perhaps one exception to this is giving higher priority to frontline healthcare workers in situations where such workers are themselves a scarce resource, and where therefore there would be fewer transplants overall if sick healthcare workers were not prioritised. The justification here is that whereas many other “social value” based allocation decisions are zero-sum games, prioritising healthcare workers could instead increase the total number of available transplants. This argument has some merit but is not fundamentally so much about social value per se as about the pragmatics of maximising lives saved. Thus, social value notwithstanding, if the healthcare labor market was oversupplied and doctors and nurses could easily be replaced then this pragmatic argument would not apply. Conversely, this pragmatic argument could apply to any shortage profession: e.g. in a situation where, because of a shortage of Human Resources consultants in the health sector, fewer operations are taking place than would otherwise be the case.

The most promising argument in favor of deprioritising those with “unhealthy” lifestyles is the Restoration Argument, which goes as follows (Harris 1985; Smart 1994; S. Wilkinson 1999).

  1. Some people (risk-takers) knowingly and voluntarily have unhealthy and/or dangerous lifestyles.
  2. Risk-takers are more likely to need transplant organs than the general population (non-risk-takers).
  3. Transplant organs are in short supply.
  4. Because of (2) and (3), if we allocate on the basis of clinical need or clinical outcomes alone, non-risk-takers will be harmed by the risk-takers’ lifestyle choices; the non-risk-takers’ chances of getting a transplant organ will be lower because of the risk-takers’ increased demands on the system.
  5. To allow the non-risk-takers to be harmed by the risk-takers would be unfair. Why should non-risk-takers have to pay the price for risk-takers’ lifestyle choices?
  6. In order to avoid this unfairness, risk-takers’ entitlements should be reduced such that there is no harm to the non-risk-takers.

One of the most attractive features of this argument is that it grounds the deprioritisation of those with unhealthy lifestyles not in value judgments about their lifestyles, but rather in a more neutral set of concerns about preventing harm to innocent third parties. Thus this argument could apply regardless of whether the risk-taking behavior in question is virtuous or vicious.

Even this argument faces difficulties though. One is that risk-taking may not generate additional healthcare costs or demand for organs. Indeed, some kinds of risk-taking behavior (motor sports perhaps) could even increase the supply of high-quality cadaveric organs available for transplant.

S. Wilkinson (1999) takes this fact as a point of departure for a deeper critique of the Restoration Argument. He claims that, if it turned out (as is possible in many European countries) that smokers cost the state less than non-smokers overall (because on average they die younger, and hence consume fewer health and social care resources in retirement) then proponents of the Restoration Argument would be committed to the unpalatable conclusion that smokers should be given not lower but higher priority than other patients. Otherwise smokers would be harmed by the non-smokers’ deliberate attempts to extend their own lives by avoiding smoking. His argument is about financial resources but similar considerations would apply to organs in relevantly similar situations of scarcity.

Wilkinson concludes that this objection seriously weakens the Restoration Argument. Either it is simply a reductio ad absurdum of the Restoration Argument, in which case the argument must be rejected wholesale. Or at least its defenders will need to appeal to something else, such as moral or social value, in order to avoid the argument’s unacceptable consequences—thus making it vulnerable to some of the problems with appealing to social value noted above (Walker 2010; S. Wilkinson 1999).

Another wider issue with all of the arguments in this section is that assigning responsibility for patterns of action and saying what responsibility amounts to in such cases will be complex, often involving the interaction of multiple agents and multiple environmental, genetic, and social factors (Brown & Savulescu 2019). Therefore, at least in practice, ascertaining for which health states an individual is sufficiently responsible will be too difficult and multi-faceted for use in allocation decisions.

3.3 The interaction of allocation and donation

In the economy, the amount produced depends in part on how production will be allocated, at least insofar as people respond to incentives (see the entry on distributive justice). For instance, a guaranteed equal share gives no self-interested incentive to work hard or in an efficient job. In organ transplantation, the number of organs available also depends on how they would be allocated. In the economy, ideal allocation principles may have to yield to the reality of incentives, which is why it is often thought that strict equality is precluded by concern for efficiency. Similarly, transplantation seems to face a choice; it can keep its ideal principles and have fewer organs or compromise them and have more. Some examples discussed here are live donation, kidney exchanges, directed deceased donation, priority to donors, and priority to children. These examples are diverse so one cannot straightforwardly tell whether practice in one is consistent with practice in another. Nonetheless, they have in common the question: what if the usual principles of allocation led to fewer organs being donated than would deviating from those principles? That they have this question in common has not been widely appreciated, which may explain why the question has been answered in different ways in the examples described below.

Live donation. Most live organ donations have a designated recipient, usually a relative or friend (Baily et al. 2020). Usually the designated recipient is not the person who would have got the organ if it were allocated via the method for deceased donor organs. Transplantation systems could refuse such offers for the sake of their normal allocation principles—but they do not. One obvious sufficient reason is that, if the organs were not allocated to the person the donor designates, the donor would not donate and an organ would be forgone.

The suspension of normal allocation principles when live donation is involved often passes by without notice, although one recent exception is a debate over people on transplant waiting lists who use social media campaigns to find willing donors (Moorlock 2015; Moorlock and Draper 2018). Such cases are a good illustration of the shape of the underlying issue. If these donors were merely being redirected – that is, if they were intending to donate anyway, even without a social media campaign – then arguably suspending the normal principles would be tantamount to unfair queue jumping via what has been termed a “beauty contest”. But if these social media campaigns bring new donors and extra organs into the system, and provided that other ethical conditions are met (notably the valid consent of the donor), then it would seem churlish to reject such offers, given their capacity to extend and/or improve recipients’ lives.

Kidney exchange. Sometimes potential live kidney donors cannot donate to the recipients they wish because their kidneys are incompatible with the recipient’s body. Many systems now arrange complicated swaps whereby pairs or more than pairs of live donors give to each other’s recipients (Fortin 2013). Sometimes people donate into the general pool in exchange for their preferred recipient getting the next available deceased donor kidney. Unless the preferred recipients would happen to get the deceased donor organ anyway under normal allocation rules, they jump the queue. As with more common methods of live donation, the normal allocation principles are suspended so as not to forgo extra organs.

Directed deceased donation. Much more controversial is directed deceased donation. The direction can take the form of naming a recipient, as when a dying person stipulates that she wants her organ to go to her daughter. Or it can take the form of specifying a group either to receive or be denied the organ. The most controversial direction has been ethnic, when donors or their families have tried to prevent organs going to members of certain ethnic groups (T.M. Wilkinson 2007b). On the face of it, refusing directed donations forgoes organs for the sake of a principle of allocation, which is the opposite of practice with live donation. Matters are more complicated because the overall incentive effects of accepting directed donations are unclear. However, jurisdictions such as the U.K. have banned accepting directed donation for reasons besides the overall effect on the organ supply (U.K. Department of Health 2000 in Other Internet Resources). They have cited principles such as allocation according to need as giving sufficient reason, independent of effect on numbers. A consistency argument can be put to them: why do they accept deviations from allocation according to need in the case of live donation but reject them for deceased donation?

Priority to donors. A minority of jurisdictions give some priority in receiving organs to those who have declared their willingness to donate (Cronin 2014). One reason is the supposed incentive effect of giving priority to donors of encouraging more donations. Priority schemes have been criticized on practical grounds but some criticism invokes principles, such as allocation according to need (Quigley et al. 2012). As before, the principles are supposed by those who cite them to be sufficient to defeat priority schemes even if they would produce more organs. By contrast, the principles are not thought to outweigh getting more organs with live donation and kidney exchange.

Priority to children. Nearly all jurisdictions give priority to children when allocating kidneys from deceased donors. One upshot seems to be a reduction in the overall supply of organs, at least in the United States (Axelrod et al. 2010). People who would have been live donors to children do not donate when the children get rapid access to deceased donor kidneys. Perhaps potential living donors would rather have the child get a deceased donor organ than run the risk for themselves; perhaps they would like to hold their kidneys in reserve in case the children need retransplantation or other children need them. One might think that if priority to children reduces the number of living donors to them it should increase the number of living donors to adults. Nonetheless, the overall effect is negative. As before, those who endorse the principle of priority to children have some choosing to do; how many organs are they willing to forgo for the sake of the principle, and is the answer consistent with their willingness to accept designated live organ donations (T.M. Wilkinson and Dittmer 2016)? A more unpalatable choice would arise if discriminating against children produced more organs via live donation.


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