The Principle of Beneficence in Applied Ethics

First published Wed Jan 2, 2008; substantive revision Mon Feb 11, 2019

Beneficent actions and motives have traditionally occupied a central place in morality. Common examples today are found in social welfare programs, scholarships for needy and meritorious students, communal support of health-related research, policies to improve the welfare of animals, philanthropy, disaster relief, programs to benefit children and the incompetent, and preferential hiring and admission policies. What makes these diverse acts beneficent? Are such beneficent acts and policies obligatory or merely the pursuit of optional moral ideals?

These questions have generated a substantial literature on beneficence in both theoretical ethics and applied ethics. In theoretical ethics, the dominant issue in recent years has been how to place limits on the scope of beneficence. In applied and professional ethics, a number of issues have been treated in the fields of biomedical ethics and business ethics.

1. The Concepts of Beneficence and Benevolence

The term beneficence connotes acts or personal qualities of mercy, kindness, generosity, and charity. It is suggestive of altruism, love, humanity, and promoting the good of others. In ordinary language, the notion is broad, but it is understood even more broadly in ethical theory to include effectively all norms, dispositions, and actions with the goal of benefiting or promoting the good of other persons. The language of a principle or rule of beneficence refers to a normative statement of a moral obligation to act for the others’ benefit, helping them to further their important and legitimate interests, often by preventing or removing possible harms. Many dimensions of applied ethics appear to incorporate such appeals to obligatory beneficence, even if only implicitly. For example, when apparel manufacturers are criticized for not having good labor practices in factories, the ultimate goal of the criticisms is usually to obtain better working conditions, wages, and other benefits for workers.

Whereas beneficence refers to actions or rules aimed at benefiting others, benevolence refers to the morally valuable character trait—or virtue—of being disposed to act to benefit others. Many acts of beneficence have been understood in moral theory as obligatory, as determined by principles of beneficence that state moral obligation. However, beneficent acts also may be performed from nonobligatory, optional moral ideals, which are standards that belong to a morality of meritorious aspiration in which individuals or institutions adopt goals and practices that are not obligatory for everyone.

Exceptional beneficence is commonly categorized as supererogatory, a term meaning paying or performing beyond what is obligatory or doing more than is required. This category of extraordinary conduct usually refers to high moral ideals of action, but it has links to virtues and to Aristotelian ideals of moral excellence. Such ideals of action and moral excellence of character need not rise to the level of the moral saint or moral hero. Moral excellence comes by degrees, and not all supererogatory acts of beneficence or benevolent dispositions are exceptionally arduous, costly, or risky. Examples of less demanding forms include anonymous gift-giving, uncompensated public service, forgiving another person’s costly error, and complying with requests to provide a benefit that exceeds the obligatory requirements of ordinary morality or professional morality.

It is generally agreed that ordinary morality does not require beneficent acts that involve severe sacrifice or maximum altruism, such as a physician’s putting herself, without protective drugs and equipment, in a life-threatening condition in an epidemic in order to provide medical care. Such extraordinary beneficent conduct typically derives from moral ideals rather than norms of obligation, although the line between obligations of beneficence and ideals of beneficence is often difficult to draw. Saintly and heroic beneficence (and benevolence) are at the outermost end of a continuum of beneficent conduct and commitment. This continuum is not merely a continuum mapping the territory beyond duty (supererogation). It is a continuum of beneficence itself, starting with weak obligatory beneficence (e.g., helping a stranger with mild disabilities enter a room with an extremely heavy door) and then moving on to strong obligatory beneficence (such as rescuing a person in danger when the danger is not severe for the rescuer). The continuum of obligation is the first half of the continuum, which runs from weak obligations (e.g., such as conscientiousness in attending to a friend’s welfare) to strict obligation (as in the obligation to aid someone sitting next to you who has been injured in an automobile accident when you have not been injured). The continuum then moves to the domain of ideals of beneficence that are morally nonrequired, exceptionally virtuous, and the like. An absence of any level of obligatory beneficence—from weak to strong—constitutes a defect in the moral life. But a failure to perform high-level acts of supererogation such as heroic acts of self-sacrifice to benefit others cannot be accounted a defect. Beneficence is best understood as spread across this full continuum, despite the considerable controversy that exists about where obligation ends and supererogation begins on the continuum.

A celebrated example of beneficence that rests somewhere on this continuum, and yet is controversial and difficult to locate just where on the continuum, is the New Testament parable of the Good Samaritan. In this parable, robbers have beaten and left half-dead a man traveling from Jerusalem to Jericho. A Samaritan tends to his wounds and cares for him at an inn. The Samaritan’s actions are beneficent and the motives benevolent. However, they do not seem—on the information given—to rise to the level of heroic or saintly conduct. The morally exceptional, beneficent person may be laudable and emulable, yet neither a moral saint nor a moral hero.

2. The Place of Beneficence in the History of Ethical Theory

The history of ethical theory shows that there are many ways to think about beneficence and benevolence. Several landmark ethical theories have embraced these moral notions as central categories, while proposing strikingly different conceptual and moral analyses. Prime examples are found in the moral-sentiment theory of David Hume, where benevolence is the central “principle” of human nature in his moral psychology, and in utilitarian theories such as John Stuart Mill’s, where the principle of utility is itself a strong and very demanding normative principle of beneficence. In these writers beneficence is close to the essence of morality. Other writers, including Kant, have given less ascendency to beneficence, but still give it a central place in morality.

2.1 Hume’s Theory

Hume’s moral psychology and virtue ethics make motives of benevolence all important in moral life. He argues that natural benevolence accounts, in great part, for what he calls the origin of morality. A major theme is his defense of benevolence as a principle in human nature, in opposition to theories of psychological egoism. Much in Hume’s moral theory is directed against Bernard Mandeville’s (and likely Hobbes’s) theory that the motive underlying human action is private interest and that humans are naturally neither sociable nor benevolent. Hume argues that egoism rests on a faulty moral psychology and maintains that benevolence is an “original” feature of human nature. Benevolence is Hume’s most important moral principle of human nature, but he also uses the term “benevolence” to designate a class of virtues rooted in goodwill, generosity, and love directed at others. Hume finds benevolence in many manifestations: friendship, charity, compassion, etc. Although he speaks of both benevolence and justice as social virtues, only benevolence is a constitutive principle of human nature. Rules of justice, by contrast, are normative human conventions that promote public utility. The virtues of benevolence and justice are therefore extraordinarily different virtues in Hume’s ethics.

In his inquiries into the principle of self-love, Hume does not reject all aspects of the egoists’ claims about the absence of impartial benevolence in human motivation. He acknowledges many motives in human nature and uses metaphors of the dove, wolf, and serpent to illustrate the mixture of elements in our nature. Principally, he sees human nature in the domain of moral conduct as a mixture of benevolence and self-love. Whereas the egoist views human nature as limited to motives such as survival, fear, ambition, and the search for happiness, Hume regards persons as motivated by a variety of passions, both generous and ungenerous. He maintains that these elements vary by degree from person to person. Lacking distinctive information about a particular individual, we cannot know whether in that person benevolence typically dominates and controls self-love, or the converse.

2.2 Mill’s Theory

In Utilitarianism, John Stuart Mill argues that moral philosophers have left a train of unconvincing and incompatible theories that can be coherently unified by a single standard of beneficence that allows us to decide objectively what is right and wrong. He declares the principle of utility, or the “greatest happiness” principle, to be the basic foundation of morals: Actions are right in proportion to their promotion of happiness for all beings, and wrong as they produce the reverse. This is a straightforward principle of beneficence and potentially a very demanding one. Mill and subsequent utilitarians mean that an action or practice is right (when compared with any alternative action or practice) if it leads to the greatest possible balance of beneficial consequences (happiness for Mill) or to the least possible balance of bad consequences (unhappiness for Mill). Mill also holds that the concepts of duty, obligation, and right are subordinated to, and determined by, that which maximizes benefits and minimizes harmful outcomes. The principle of utility is presented by Mill as an absolute principle, thereby making beneficence the one and only supreme or preeminent principle of ethics. It justifies all subordinate rules and is not simply one among a number of basic principles.

Mill’s theory of morality is welfare-oriented at its core because moral rightness is determined by goodness, which is itself to be understood in terms of the welfare of individuals. It is a consequentialist theory because the moral rightness and obligatoriness of actions are established by their beneficial results. It is an aggregative theory because a judgment about right or obligatory action depends on an appraisal of the effects of different possible actions on the welfare of all affected parties, which entails summing positive benefits and negative effects over all persons affected. Beneficence has rarely occupied such a central role in a moral theory.

2.3 Kant’s Theory

Kant rejects the utilitarian model of a supreme principle of beneficence, but he still finds a vital place in the moral life for beneficence. He seeks universally valid principles (or maxims) of duty, and beneficence is one such principle. A motive of benevolence based on sentiment—highly admired by Hume—is morally unworthy in Kant’s theory unless the motive behind benevolent action is a motive of duty. The motive likewise cannot rest on utilitarian goals.

Kant argues that everyone has a duty to be beneficent, i.e. to be helpful to others according to one’s means, and without hoping for any form of personal gain thereby. Benevolence done from friendly inclination he regards as “unlimited” (a term subject to different interpretations, but meaning at least “having no boundaries in potential scope”), whereas beneficence from duty does not place unlimited demands on persons. Nonetheless, the limits of duties of beneficence are not clear and precise in Kant. While we are obligated to some extent to sacrifice some part of our welfare to benefit others without any expectation of recompense, it is not possible in the abstract to fix a definite limit on how far this duty extends. We can only say that everyone has a duty to be beneficent, according to that person’s means, and that no one has an unlimited duty to do so.

Kant here anticipates, without developing, what would later become one of the most difficult areas of the theory of beneficence: How, exactly, are we to specify the limits of beneficence as an obligation? Neither Kant, Hume, nor Mill has a precise answer to this question.

3. Is Beneficent Action Obligatory or Merely a Moral Ideal?

As discussion above about the continuum of beneficence indicates, deep disagreements have emerged in moral theory regarding how much is demanded by obligations of beneficence. Some ethical theories insist not only that there are obligations of beneficence, but that these obligations sometimes demand severe sacrifice and extreme generosity in the moral life. Some formulations of utilitarianism, for example, appear to derive obligations to give our job to a person who needs it more than we do, to give away most of our income, to devote much of our time to civic enterprises, etc. It is likely that no society has ever operated on such a demanding principle, but it does seem embraced, at least abstractly, by a number of moral philosophers—arguably even in Kant’s theory of the categorical imperative (although, as previously mentioned, Kant seems to deny such scope to obligatory beneficence).

By contrast, some moral philosophers have claimed that we have no general obligations of beneficence. We have only duties of beneficence that derive from specific roles and assignments of duty that are not a part of ordinary morality. These philosophers hold that beneficent action is virtuous and a commendable moral ideal, but not an obligation, and thus that persons are not morally deficient if they fail to act beneficently. An instructive example is found in the moral theory of Bernard Gert, who maintains that there are no moral rules of beneficence, only moral ideals. The only obligations in the moral life, apart from duties encountered in professional roles and other specific stations of duty, are captured by moral rules that prohibit causing harm or evil. In Gert’s theory, the general goal of morality is to minimize the causation of evil or harm, not to promote good. Rational persons morally should act impartially at all times in regard to all persons with the aim of not causing evil, he argues, but rational persons are not morally required to act impartially to promote the good for all persons at all times.

Those who defend such a beneficence-negating conclusion (regarding obligation) do not hold the extreme view that there are no obligations of beneficence in contexts of role-assigned duties such as those in professional ethics and in specific communities. They acknowledge that professional and other roles carry obligations (or duties, as Gert prefers) that do not bind persons who do not occupy the relevant roles. They claim that the actions one is obligated to perform within the roles are merely moral ideals for any person who is not in the specific role. That is, these philosophers present beneficence not as a general obligation, but as a role-specific duty and as institutionally or culturally assigned.

In rejecting principles of obligatory beneficence, Gert draws the line of obligations by presenting a sharp contrast between beneficence and nonmaleficence. That is, he embraces rules of obligation that prohibit causing harm to other persons, even though he rejects as obligatory all principles or rules that require helping other persons, which includes acting to prevent harm to them. Accordingly, he accepts moral rules such as “Don’t kill,” “Don’t cause pain or suffering to others,” “Don’t incapacitate others,” “Don’t deprive others of the goods of life,” and the like. His theory therefore makes nonmaleficence central to his theory of moral obligation while denying that beneficence has a place in the theory of obligation.

However, the mainstream of moral philosophy makes both not-harming and helping to be obligations, while preserving the distinction between the two. This literature can be confusing, because some writers treat obligations of nonmaleficence as a species of obligations of beneficence, although the two notions are very different. Rules of beneficence are typically more demanding than rules of nonmaleficence, and rules of nonmaleficence are negative prohibitions of action that must be followed impartially and that provide moral reasons for legal prohibitions of certain forms of conduct. By contrast, rules of beneficence state positive requirements of action, need not always be followed impartially, and rarely, if ever, provide moral reasons that support legal punishment when agents fail to abide by the rules.

The contrast between nonmaleficence and beneficence notwithstanding, ordinary morality suggests that there are some rules of beneficence that we are obligated to follow impartially, such as those requiring that we make efforts to rescue strangers under conditions of minimal risk to ourselves. Even some legal punishments (as they exist in some legal jurisdictions) for failure to rescue strangers may be justifiable. Significant controversies have arisen in both law and moral philosophy about how to formulate and defend such requirements, but one influential idea has been to argue that a person P has an obligation of beneficence to help another whenever the other is at risk of significant loss of or damage to some basic interest; P’s action is necessary (singly or collaboratively) to prevent this loss or damage; P’s action (singly or collaboratively) is likely to prevent the loss or damage; and P’s action does not present significant risks, costs, or burdens to P while the benefits that the rescued person can be expected to gain outweigh any burden that P is likely to incur.

4. The Problem of Over-Demanding Beneficence

Some philosophers defend extremely demanding and far-reaching principles of obligatory beneficence. Peter Singer’s theory has been the most widely discussed account. Singer has throughout his career been interested in how to reduce the evils of global harm and suffering in the most effective manner. In his early work, Singer distinguished between preventing evil and promoting good and contended that persons in prosperous nations are morally obligated to prevent something bad or evil from happening if it is in their power to do so without having to sacrifice anything of comparable importance. The argument is that serious shortages of housing, food, and healthcare are harmful to human life and welfare and are preventable. If person P has some capacity to prevent these evils—for example, by donation to aid agencies—without loss of comparable item(s) of importance, P acts unethically by not contributing to the alleviation of these shortages. Accordingly, in the face of preventable disease and poverty we are morally obligated to donate time or resources toward their eradication until we reach a level at which, by giving more, we would cause as much suffering to ourselves as we would relieve through our gift. This demanding principle of beneficence requires us to invest heavily in rescuing needy persons in the global population; merely donating at the level of local communities and nation states is insufficient. However, Singer leaves it open what counts as being of comparable importance and as being an appropriate level of sacrifice.

Singer’s principle implies that morality sometimes requires us to make enormous sacrifices. The demand is placed not only on individuals with disposable incomes, but on all reasonably well-off persons, foundations, governments, corporations, etc. All parties have moral obligations to refrain from spending resources on nonessential items and to use the available resources or savings to lend assistance to those in urgent need. Frills, fashion, luxuries, and the like are never to determine expenditures, and one is to give to the needy up to the point that one (or one’s dependent) would be impoverished. Singer does not regard such conduct as an enormous moral sacrifice, but only as the discharge of a basic obligation of beneficence.

Singer’s proposals have struck many as overly demanding, impracticable, and a significant departure from the demands of ordinary morality. This assessment has generated a number of criticisms, as well as defenses, of demanding principles of beneficence such as the one he proposes. Critics argue that a principle of beneficence that requires persons, governments, and corporations to seriously disrupt their projects and plans in order to benefit the poor and underprivileged exceeds the demands of ordinary moral obligations and has no plausible grounding in normative moral theory about obligations. They argue that the line between the obligatory and the supererogatory has been unjustifiably erased by such a principle. In effect, the claim is that Singer’s aspirational moral ideal is an attempt to redraw established lines in morality that distinguish between moral obligation and supererogatory moral ideals.

In response to criticism Singer has attempted to reformulate his position so that his theory of beneficence does not set an overly demanding standard. He maintains that no clear justification exists for the claim that obligations of ordinary morality do not contain a demanding principle of beneficence, in particular a strong harm-prevention principle. He apparently would explain the lack of concern often shown for poverty relief as a failure to draw the correct implications from the very principles of beneficence that ordinary morality embraces and that utilitarian moral theory justifies. Later in his series of publications on the subject, Singer has attempted to take account of objections that his principle sets an unduly high standard. He has not given up his strong principle of beneficence, but he has suggested that it might be morally wise and most productive to publicly advocate a lower standard—that is, a weakened principle of beneficence. He therefore has proposed a more guarded formulation of the principle, arguing that we should strive for donations of a percentage of income, such as 10 per cent, which amounts to more than a token donation and yet also is not so high as to make us miserable or turn us into moral saints. This standard, Singer suggests, is the minimum that we ought to do to conform to obligations of beneficence.

Controversy continues in philosophy about how to analyze and evaluate the commitments of a principle of beneficence, including how to formulate limits that reduce required burdens on agents’ life plans and make meeting the obligations of beneficence a realistic possibility. Various writers have noted that even after many persons have donated generous portions of their income, they could still donate more while living decent lives; and, according a strong principle of beneficence demands that they should donate more. Recent ethical theory shows that establishing the theoretical and practical standards of donation and sacrifice is challenging, and perhaps an impossible ideal.

However, it does not follow that we should give up a principle of beneficence. It only follows that establishing the moral limits of the demands of beneficence is profoundly difficult. Liam Murphy has discussed a number of “limited principles of beneficence” and has proposed to fix the limits of individual beneficence to meet global problems of need by using a cooperative principle of fairness in which, in any given circumstance, it must first be determined what each reasonably affluent person must do to contribute a fair share to an optimal outcome. An individual is only required to aid others beneficently at the level that would produce the best consequences if all in society were to give their fair share. One is not required to do more even if others fail to act on their fair-share obligations of beneficence, and it would be an unfair imposition of responsibility to ask more of them. Unlike act-consequentialism, this theory does not demand more of agents when non-complying agents fail to do their part.

Murphy’s cooperative principle is intuitively attractive, but it may not have the necessary moral punch to address issues such as global poverty. Murphy seems right to suggest that large-scale problems requiring beneficence should be conceived as cooperative projects, but his limit on individual obligations seems unlikely to have a practical effect of increasing international aid and the like beyond present commitments and levels. If, as is to be expected in virtually all situations of global poverty, others fail to comply with their fair-share obligations of beneficence as set out in this demanding theory, it is not clear why each person’s obligation is set only by the original calculation of a single fair share. This is not to say that Singer’s approach is superior. The more demanding a principle is, the less likely are people to comply with its demands. Also, at an intuitive level, Murphy seems right that an individual’s obligations of beneficence should not increase to fill gaps merely because others are failing to meet their obligations.

Singer has defended his arguments about beneficence, with a somewhat sympathetic response to Murphy. Singer seems concerned with which social conditions will motivate people to give, rather than with attempting to determine obligations of beneficence with precision. He responds to critics such as Murphy by conceding that perhaps the limit we should publicly advocate as a level of giving is no more than a person’s fair share of what is needed to relieve poverty and the like. Unless we draw the line here, we might not be able to motivate people to give at all. A fair share seems to be a lower threshold of one’s obligations than the obligations Singer originally envisaged, but more realistic. The emphasis on motivation is presumably intended to provide a more subtle and convincing approach to increasing charitable donations even though the nature and limits of beneficence should be set by his utilitarian moral theory, as he has always proposed.

Wherever the line of precise limits of obligatory beneficence is drawn, the line is likely to be revisionary of ordinary morality. Singer’s proposals, unlike Murphy’s, represent a revision of ordinary morality’s requirements of beneficence. A variety of proposals regarding the limits of beneficence have been made by philosophers, but no agreement exists on even a single general principle. Given this situation, some now doubt that ethical theory and practical deliberation are equipped to establish precise conditions and limits of obligations of beneficence, especially when confronting problems of global poverty.

5. Liberty-Limiting Beneficence: The Problem of Benefit Paternalism

A much-discussed issue about beneficence descends historically from Mill’s On Liberty, where Mill inquired into the nature and limits of justifiable social control over the individual. He argues that the measure of a person’s liberty—or personal autonomy—is the measure of the person’s independence from influences that control the person’s preferences, thoughts, and behavior. Various principles commonly assumed to be moral principles have been advanced to justify the limitation of individual liberties. Joel Feinberg, who was philosophically close to various of Mill’s views, appropriately called these principles “liberty-limiting principles.” Mill defended the view that only one principle validly limits liberty. Feinberg called it the harm principle: A person’s liberty (or autonomy) is justifiably restricted to prevent harm to others caused by that person. Feinberg agreed with Mill that the principle of paternalism, which renders acceptable certain acts intended to benefit another person when the other does not prefer to receive the benefit, is not a morally acceptable liberty-limiting principle.

The term paternalism has its roots in the notion of paternal administration—government as by a father to administer in the way a beneficent father raises his children. The analogy with the father presupposes two features of the paternal role: that the father acts beneficently (that is, in accordance with the interests of his children) and that he makes all or at least some of the decisions relating to his children’s welfare, rather than leaving them free to make those decisions. On this model, “paternalism” may be defined as the intentional overriding of one person’s known preferences or choices by another person, where the person who overrides justifies the action by the goal of substantially benefiting or avoiding harm to the person whose preferences or choices are overridden. (Both “benefiting” and “avoiding harm” can generally, though not always, be understood as forms of beneficence.) An act of paternalism, then, overrides moral obligations to respect autonomous choice on grounds of beneficence.

Philosophers divide sharply over whether some restricted form of paternalism can be justified and, if so, on what basis. One plausible beneficence-based justification of paternalistic actions places benefits on a scale with autonomy interests and balances the two: As a person’s interests in autonomy increase and the benefits for that person decrease, the justification of paternalistic action becomes less cogent; conversely, as the benefits for a person increase and that person’s interests in autonomy decrease, the justification of paternalistic action becomes more plausible. In this account preventing minor harms or providing minor benefits while deeply disrespecting autonomy lacks plausible justification; but actions that prevent major harms or provide major benefits while only trivially disrespecting autonomy have a plausible paternalistic rationale.

Though no consensus exists over the justification of paternalism, virtually no one thinks that benefit paternalism can be justified unless at least the following conditions are satisfied:

  • A person is at risk of a substantial and preventable harm or loss of a benefit.
  • The paternalistic action has a strong likelihood of preventing the harm or obtaining the benefit.
  • The projected benefits of the paternalistic action outweigh its risks.
  • The least autonomy-restrictive alternative that will secure the benefits or reduce the risks is implemented.

Debates about benefit paternalism have also emerged in public policy contexts. Often health policies have the goal of avoiding a harm or providing a benefit in a population in which most affected parties are not consulted. Some percentage of the population will not support the policy because they are given no choice in the matter, whereas others will approve the policy. In effect, the policy is intended to benefit all members of a population without consulting the specific preferences of the individuals affected—all the while foreseeing that many individuals will in fact reject the imposed control that the policy exerts over their lives.

So-called libertarian paternalists (or neopaternalists), principally the team of Cass Sunstein and Richard Thaler, have argued for government and other institutional policies intended to protect or benefit individuals through shaping, steering, or nudging their choices without altogether disallowing or coercing those choices. These writers recommend policies developed by public and private institutions to “nudge” people to the advancement of their welfare without coercively making them to do so, while purportedly preserving their autonomy. These policies pursue values that an intended beneficiary allegedly already holds, at least implicitly, but does not realize because of limited capacities, limited resources, or limited self-control. Here the individual’s own stated preferences, choices, or actions are deemed unreasonable in light of other values the person is believed to embrace. Since they already embrace these values, their autonomy is not violated despite the paternalism at work.

This conception must confront two major problems: The first is conceptual. It is head-scratching how a libertarian can be a paternalist in the standard senses of these terms. Genuine libertarians firmly support freedom of choice, freedom of contract, and the like, which seems to lack any firm support in “libertarian paternalism.” Second, what an informed and competent person chooses to do generally supplies the evidence of his or her true values, not some hidden value that contradicts what they choose. For example, if a politically conservative man fails in one election to support the platform of a party whose platform he has always wholly supported and has often said he will always support, he seems in some respect committed to his party’s platform, but his departure from the platform in this case seems to be the best evidence we have of his true values now on the particular matter of which political positions he supports. It would be improper to assert that he supports the current platform of the party he has always supported in the past. Similarly, a justified paternalism must have adequate evidence of any assumption it makes about an individual’s deepest beliefs or hopes and whether they are misguided in any given case.

6. Beneficence in Biomedical Ethics

Since the late 1970s, principles of beneficence have been a mainstay of the literature of biomedical ethics. Persons engaged in medical practice, research, and public health appreciate that risks of harm presented by interventions must often be weighed against possible benefits for patients, subjects, and the public. Their professional obligations are deeply informed by their commitments to prevent or reduce harm and to produce a positive balance of goods over inflicted harms.

6.1 Biomedical Research Ethics

The principle of beneficence plays a foundational role in the framework of research ethics and federal regulations in the United States (and beyond). This principle’s prominence is historically traceable to the publication of the Belmont Report in 1978 by The National Commission for the Protection of Human Subjects of Biomedical and Behavioral Research. The Belmont Report has provided the basic moral framework for research ethics in the United States. This commission was established in 1974 by the U.S. Congress with a charge to discover and publish the basic principles of human research ethics and also to "consider" the boundaries between biomedical research and accepted medical practice. The commission found that beneficence is one of only three basic principles of research ethics. This principle soon became and remains today one of three canonical principles in American research ethics governing research funded by the federal government.

The three basic principles are (1) respect for persons, (2) beneficence, and (3) justice. In this context, the principle of beneficence is understood as an abstract norm that includes derivative rules such as "Do no harm," "Balance benefits against risks," and "Maximize possible benefits and minimize possible harms." This principle is satisfied in the research context by intentionally refraining from causing injury and by assuring that risks stand in reasonable relation to probable benefits. As one major demand of beneficence, the National Commission required that during the course of the ethical review of research protocols there be arrayals of data pertaining to benefits and risks and of alternative ways of obtaining the benefits (if any) sought in the research. It also demanded that systematic and nonarbitrary presentations of risks and benefits be made to subjects, as part of the informed consent process, and that assessments of risks and safeguards be considered by ethics committees when they evaluate whether research protocols are justified.

The National Commission demanded that, to fulfill obligations of beneficence, research subjects not be asked or allowed to consent to more risk than is warranted by anticipated benefits and that forms of risk incommensurate with participants’ previous experience not be imposed in the case of groups such as children. The moral concern is that some subjects, notably children, would be overburdened and possibly disturbed or terrified. However, the commission recognized that risks must be permitted during the course of many forms of research, including pediatric research, in order for investigators to be positioned to distinguish harmful from beneficial outcomes. Today, the problem might be expressed in terms of the need for investigators to determine the safety or effectiveness of a therapy or diagnostic tool under investigation in a study.

This understanding of beneficence and its role in protecting human subjects is deeply embedded at the core of research ethics in many countries.

6.2 The Ends of Medicine

Beneficence has played a major role in a central conceptual issue about the nature and goals of medicine as a social practice. If the end of clinical medicine is healing, which is a goal of beneficence, then arguably medicine is fundamentally a beneficent undertaking, and beneficence grounds and determines the professional obligations and virtues of the physician. Authors such as Edmund Pellegrino write as if beneficence is the sole foundational principle of professional medical ethics. In this theory, medical beneficence is oriented exclusively to the end of healing and not to any other form of benefit. The category of medical benefits does not, for Pellegrino, include items such as providing fertility controls (unless for the prevention and maintenance of health and bodily integrity), performing purely cosmetic surgery, or actively helping a patient to effect a merciful death by the active hastening of death.

This characterization of the ends of medicine allows Pellegrino to limit severely what counts as a medical benefit for patients: Benefit in medicine is limited to healing and related activities such as caring for and preventing injury or disease. This thesis is controversial. Even if healing and the like are interpreted broadly, medicine does not seem to many in bioethics to have such precise boundaries. If beneficence is a general moral principle and if physicians are positioned to supply many forms of benefit, there is no manifest reason why physicians’ hands are tied to the single benefit of healing, even in their role as medical professionals. The range of benefits that might be considered relevant seems broader and could include prescribing pharmaceutical products or devices that prevent fertility (where there is no healing-related purpose), providing cosmetic surgery for strictly aesthetic (by contrast to reconstructive) reasons, helping patients write realistic living wills, complying with terminally ill patients’ requests for physician-assistance in dying by hastening death, and the like. If these are bona fide medical benefits, how far does the range of benefits extend? If a physician runs a company that manufactures powered wheel chairs for the elderly, does this activity supply a medical benefit? When physicians consult with an insurance company about cost-effective treatments that save their patients money, is this activity a beneficent component of the practice of medicine?

Controversy over the ends of medicine requires decisions about what is to count as the practice of medicine and, derivatively, what counts as medical beneficence. Controversy appears not only in the literature of biomedical ethics, but also in some split decisions of the U. S. Supreme Court—notably in Gonzales v. Oregon, a case dealing with physician-hastened death. The majority decision in this case asserts that there is no consensus among health care professionals about the precise boundaries of the legitimate practice of medicine, a legal notion similar to the medical-ethics notion of the proper ends of medicine. The court notes that there is reasonable disagreement in the community of physicians regarding the appropriate process for determining the boundaries of medical practice and that there is also reasonable disagreement about the extent to which the government should be involved in drawing boundaries when physicians themselves disagree. This court opinion allows that, depending on state law, a physician may legitimately assist in various ways to help bring about the death of a terminally ill patient who has explicitly and competently requested this assistance from the physician.

6.3 Harms and Benefits in Health Care

A health professional’s conception of both harm to and benefit for a patient can differ sharply from that of the patient, but the health professional’s understandings of benefits also often depend on the patient’s view of what constitutes a benefit or a worthwhile risk. Different patients take different views about what constitutes a harm and a benefit, and when each view is reasonable it is morally unacceptable to maintain that the notions of medical benefit and harm are independent of the patient’s judgment.

Physician-hastened death by request of the patientcontroversially characterized as physician-assisted suicide—is again a prominent example of this problem. Physicians and nurses have long worried that patients who forgo life-sustaining treatment with the intention of dying are killing themselves and that health professionals are assisting in their suicide. These worries have recently receded in significance in biomedical ethics, because there is now a consensus in law and ethics (in the U.S. and far beyond) that it is never a moral violation to withhold or withdraw a medical treatment that has been validly refused. This consensus began to be developed with the case of Karen Ann Quinlan in 1976 and eventually was formed around U. S. Supreme Court decisions, especially the Cruzan Case of 1990. The writings of numerous philosophers and lawyers contributed to the formation of this consensus. A clear part of the consensus is that it is a moral violation not to withhold or withdraw a validly refused life-sustaining treatment. If death is hastened in this way by a physician’s omission or action, there can be no moral objection to what has been done, and a physician’s cooperation can rightly be viewed as merciful and benevolent.

However, this problem has been replaced by another: Is it harmful or beneficial to help a competent patient who has requested help in causing a hastened death? In addition to vexed questions about the purported distinction between killing and letting die, this issue presses the question of what counts as a benefit and what counts as a harm. Is requested death in the face of miserable suffering a benefit for some patients while a harm caused to other patients? When is it a benefit, and when a harm? Is the answer to this question determined by the method used to bring about death--for example, withdrawal of treatment by contrast to use of lethal medication?

6.4 Social Beneficence and Public Policy

A number of controversial issues in biomedical ethics concern how public policy could, and should, change if obligations of social beneficence were given more strength in policy formulation than they have traditionally been afforded. The foundations of public policy regarding organ procurement provide an instructive example. Established legal and policy precedents in many countries require express consent by a decedent before death or by the family after death. A near absolute right of autonomy to decide about the disposition of organs and tissues has been the prevailing norm. However, this approach impairs the efficient collection of needed tissues and organs, and many people die as a result of the shortage of organs. The scarcity of organs and tissues and the inefficiency of the system have prompted a spate of proposals for reform of the current system of procurement, with the goal of creating more space for social beneficence.

One policy proposal with a notably strong social-beneficence commitment is the routine retrieval of organs and tissues. In this system of procurement, a community is permitted to, and encouraged to, routinely collect organs and tissues from the deceased, unless the dead person had previously registered his or her objection to the system with the state. The routine retrieval of tissues and organs from the deceased is regarded by many as unjustified on traditional grounds of respect for autonomy. However, advocates of the policy of routine retrieval argue that members of a community have an obligation to provide other persons with objects of lifesaving value when no cost to themselves is required. That is, the justification is based on beneficence, not respect for autonomy.

The debate is likely to continue for many years about whether beneficence or respect for autonomy should prevail in public policy governing organ retrieval. Advocates of the current system argue that individual and family rights of consent should retain dominance. Advocates of routine retrieval argue that traditional social priorities involving beneficence in conflict with autonomy have been wrongly structured. Meanwhile, most contributors to the literature on the subject agree that the present situation of low-level organ-procurement is morally unsatisfactory and in need of some significant measure of reform.

6.5 Social Beneficence and Social Justice

Some of the most important issues in the ethics of health and health care today are widely classified as issues of social justice. However, at the hands of many writers, social justice is notably similar to social beneficence. For example, perhaps the most important moral problem in global ethics is how to structure both the global order and national systems that affect health so that burdens are avoided, benefits are provided, and then both are fairly distributed using a threshold condition of equitable levels of health and access to health care. Globalization has brought a realization that problems of protecting health and providing beneficial services are international in nature and that their alleviation will require a restructuring of the global system.

John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice has been enormously influential in advanced work on these problems in biomedical ethics. Rawls argues that a social arrangement forming a political state is a communal effort to advance the good of all in the society. His starting assumptions are layered with beneficent, egalitarian goals of making the unequal situation of the naturally disadvantaged members of society both better and more equal. His recognition of a positive societal obligation to eliminate or reduce barriers that prevent fair opportunity and that correct or compensate for various disadvantages has implications for discussions of both beneficence and justice in health care.

Rawls himself never pursued these health-centered issues, but his theory has influenced many writers on moral problems of health and biomedical ethics, including Norman Daniels, Martha Nussbaum, and the team of Madison Powers and Ruth Faden. One of Daniels’ main questions is “How can we meet health needs fairly under reasonable limits to resources committed to the task?” The “fairly” part of this formulation may be justice-based, but the notion of “reasonable limits to resources” is closely tied to the problems of the limits of beneficence mentioned previously. Daniels argues that because health is affected by many social factors, theories of justice should not center entirely on access to health care, but also on the need to reduce health inequalities by improving social conditions that affect the health of societies, such as having clean water, adequate nutrition, and general sanitation.

Powers and Faden view the well-being of the worst-off members of global society as the proper starting point for a practical theory of justice, but their theory can also be expressed as an argument from social beneficence. The sweep of global poverty and its impact on health and welfare is a major topic in the theories of Singer and Powers and Faden. The consequences of extreme poverty for health are well-documented, and these consequences inform Powers and Faden’s theories of both basic well-being and justice. Their theory also identifies unfair patterns of advantage and unfair relations of power such as subordination, exploitation, and social exclusion that are rooted in unjust social-structural conditions. Among other things, their theory assesses the degree to which institutional structures can be expected to fulfill the mandates of the theory.

Recently, “capability theory” has, at the hands of various writers from several disciplines, merged concerns of justice and beneficence. This type of theory focuses on distributions intended to enable persons to reach certain functional levels essential for a flourishing life that is protected by social institutions. The idea is to start with an understanding of health and individual well-being and then to connect that account to basic capabilities for achieving levels of functioning essential to well-being—through, for example, proper nutrition and access to health care. Some core capabilities are bodily health, ability to play, ability to affiliate socially, freedom of movement, and adequate educational level. Amartya Sen and Martha Nussbaum are advocates of a capabilities theory.

Some writers closely connected to bioethics and health policy have moved beyond capabilities theory with a twist toward beneficence and well-being. Powers and Faden provide a theory closely connected to global health policy. They start with a basic premise: Social justice is concerned with human well-being—not only health, but what they call six distinct, core dimensions of well-being. The six are health, personal security, reasoning, respect, attachment, and self-determination. Each of these dimensions is an independent concern of justice. While this list of six dimensions is in some respects similar to Nussbaum’s—for example, “attachment” resembles what Nussbaum calls “affiliation”—Powers and Faden reject the language of capabilities as misleading and wide of the target of theories of justice and beneficence. Theirs is a list of essential core dimensions of well-being, not core capabilities. Being healthy, being secure, and being respected are desirable states of being, not merely capabilities or functionings. For example, we want not merely the capability to be well-nourished, but to be well-nourished.

In this theory the justice and beneficence of societies and of the global order are to be judged by how well they effect these well-being dimensions in their political structures and social practices. The job of global justice and beneficence is to secure a sufficient level of each dimension for persons and to alleviate the social structures that cause the corresponding forms of ill-being. This theory of well-being and its place in moral theory and social policy can be expressed in terms of the roles of both social beneficence and social justice.

7. Beneficence in Business Ethics

Business ethics is a second area of applied ethics in which questions about beneficence have emerged as central. Hume’s immediate successor in sentiment theory, Adam Smith, held an important view about the role and place of benevolence that has influenced a number of writers in business ethics. Smith argued that the wealth of nations and the well-being of their citizens are dependent upon social cooperation—fundamentally, political and economic cooperation—but that this realm is not dependent on the benevolence of moral relations. Smith proposes that it would be vain for us to expect benevolence in market societies. In commercial transactions the only successful strategy in motivating persons is to appeal to personal advantage: Never expect benevolence from a butcher, brewer, or baker; expect from them only a regard to their own interest. Market societies operate not by concerns of humanity and benevolence, but from self-love.

7.1 Corporate Beneficence

Several problems in business ethics are attempts to come to grips with Smith’s view. Discussions of the role of the corporation in society and the very purpose of a corporation as a social institution are examples. It is not disputed that the purpose of a for-profit corporation is to make a profit for stockholders, but there is an intense debate about whether maximizing stockholder profits is the sole legitimate purpose of corporations—as Milton Friedman and others have argued—and whether truly beneficent corporate conduct is justifiable. This question is normative, but Smith also raises questions of moral psychology: Is it reasonable to expect benevolent acts from members of the business community? Does beneficence have any place in the world of business as we know it?

Corporate social programs often appear to involve a mixture of limited beneficence and self-interested goals such as developing and sustaining relationships with customers. An example is found in public utilities’ programs to help customers pay for electricity, gas, oil, phone service, and the like. These programs sometimes decrease rather than increase corporate profits. They are, in effect, a form of corporate philanthropy. The programs locate and attempt to remedy the root causes of bill nonpayment, which typically involve financial distress. The programs also seek to rescue people in the community who are in unfortunate circumstances because of industrial injury, the ill health of a spouse or child, drug dependency, and the like. The company may even pay for consumer advocates, who are social workers trained to deal with customers and their problems. These programs, by design, make life better for various members of the community who have suffered misfortune. They may not be entirely motivated by benevolence, however, because they may be heavily designed to achieve a positive public image as well as to receive payment for overdue bills.

Some firms have charitable programs that seem to be cases of pure beneficence—that is, not ones admixed with forms of outreach that will help the company. Money is taken directly out of profits, with no expected return of benefits. It has been questioned, however, whether programs of even this description are instances of pure benevolence. In the precedent U. S. case of A. P. Smith Manufacturing v. Barlow (1953), a judge determined that a beneficent charitable donation to Princeton University by the A. P. Smith Co. was a legitimate act of beneficence by responsible corporate officers. However, the judge acknowledged that such beneficence may not be pure beneficence, but rather an act taken in the interest of the corporation by building its public image and esteem. In effect, the judge suggests that such a gift, while beneficent, may not derive from entirely benevolent motives. If beneficent acts by corporations are nothing more than clever ways to maximize profits, then these actions seem to satisfy Friedman’s conception.

Whatever the truth about businesses’ motives, a separate question is whether businesses have obligations of beneficent action. Stakeholder theory answers in the affirmative. In the classical profit-to-stockholder view, stockholders’ interests were supreme, but this view often lost sight of the interests of other stakeholders, particularly those whose efforts are necessary for a firm’s survival and flourishing. Who deserves to benefit from corporate income? A stakeholder is any individual or group that can affect or benefit, or be affected by or benefited by, a business organization. Stakeholders who can be affected by corporate activities include customers, employees, suppliers, owners, local communities, subcontractors, consultants, and stockholders. Stakeholder theory is commonly regarded as a theory of corporate responsibility—the theory that managers of a firm have obligations to a specified group of stakeholders. Many of these obligations are ones of beneficence, especially with regard to employees and other stockholders. Benefit packages for employees provide a standard example. Stockholder theory, by contrast, is the theory that managers have obligations—conceived as fiduciary duties—only to stockholder interests. In contemporary business ethics it is commonly held that corporate responsibility requires some form of stakeholder inclusion, but this perspective has not been developed in adequate detail as a theory of corporate obligations of beneficence, because there may be additional obligations of beneficence to contribute to social awareness and public policy even if the affected community is not truly a stakeholder.

Do corporations have obligations of beneficence to some larger community? Many corporations have answered yes to this question. In a statement of “The Johnson and Johnson Way,” the Johnson and Johnson Company credo, it is said that Johnson and Johnson is responsible to the communities in which it thrives, and indeed to the world community. The company asserts an obligation to be good citizens, including offering the support of charities, the encouragement of civic progress, the bettering of public health, and the improvement of education. Johnson and Johnson and other companies assert that they have obligations to these ends, but to many writers in business ethics this claim of obligations is either misguided or overstated. They regard such moral demands as broad moral ideals or institutional commitments, especially if they reach out to the world community.

7.2 Corporate Benefit-Paternalism

Paternalism is often found in the practices of business and in government regulation of business. For example, many businesses require employees to deduct money from their salary for a retirement account; they may also deduct salary money to pay for a life insurance policy. If employees do not want these “benefits,” they are not free to reject them. Paternalism is here assumed to be an appropriate liberty-limiting principle. Another commonplace example comes from the construction industry and the chemical industry. If an employee wishes not to wear a particular suit, mask, or other protective device, the company (and perhaps also the government) will compel it anyway, often (though not always) for paternalistic reasons.

An ongoing example of paternalism is the restriction for paternalistic reasons (there might be other reasons as well) of various pictures, literature, or information—often violent depictions—on the internet, in bookstores, and in video stores. Customers may wish to purchase or receive information about these products, but paternalism thwarts their preferences. Arguments are put forward maintaining that those exposed to violent conduct will harm themselves by such exposure—for example, pornography might reinforce their emotional problems or render them incapable of love and other distinctively human relationships.

A classic problem of paternalism in business ethics derives from the principle of caveat emptor—Latin for “let the buyer beware.” This property-law-derived principle is a general principle governing sales: A buyer is responsible for determining any unfitness in a product and is not due any form of refund or exchange unless the seller has actively concealed the unfitness. The buyer is free to make the purchase or not make it. Paternalistic restrictions on purchasing have the objective that buyers not harm themselves or not fail to receive benefits that they otherwise might not receive. For example, the control and inspection of pharmaceutical products and controlled substances–through government policies and licensed pharmacies—has often been justified by appeal to paternalism. Many believe that the Food and Drug Administration (FDA) in the U.S. is fundamentally a paternalistic agency that operates to protect the public even while some members of the public do not want or approve of the protections afforded.

As the marketplace for products has grown more complex and the products more sophisticated, buyers have become increasingly dependent upon salespersons to know their products and to tell the truth about them. An enduring question in business ethics is whether a salesperson’s role should be viewed as that of paternalistic protector of the interests of the buyer. Suppose, for example, that a consumer wants a sprinkler system in his yard to water his grove of evergreens. He loves the sound and look of sprinklers. However, these sprinklers are worthless for appropriate watering of the roots of his evergreens: The owner needs drip-hose for his large collection of pine, spruce, cedar, and cypress. Should a salesperson insist on selling only drip-hose, refusing to sell sprinkler heads; or should the salesperson acquiesce to the customer’s preference for sprinklers?

Traditionally salespersons have not viewed their obligations of beneficence in this way, but perhaps paternalistic beneficence would be a commendable change of practice.


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