The Sale of Human Organs

First published Mon Oct 17, 2011; substantive revision Thu Oct 22, 2015

Organ sale—for example, allowing or encouraging consenting adults to become living kidney donors in return for money—has been proposed as a possible solution to the seemingly chronic shortage of organs for transplantation. Many people however regard this idea as abhorrent and argue both that the practice would be unethical and that it should be banned. This entry outlines some of the different possible kinds of organ sale, briefly states the case in favour, and then examines the main arguments against.

1. Different Kinds of Organ Sale System

The expression ‘organ sale’ covers a wide range of different practices. People most readily associate it with the case in which one individual (who needs or wants money) sells his or her kidney to another (who needs a kidney). But there are other possibilities too. One (in countries where the prior consent of the deceased is required for cadaveric organ donation) is to pay people living now for rights over their body after death. Another (in countries where the consent of relatives is required for cadaveric organ donation) is to pay relatives for transplant rights over their recently deceased loved ones' bodies.

Since the kidney is the most commonly transplanted organ and since the ethics literature on organ sale is mainly about kidney sale from live donors, that is the practice on which this entry will focus. ‘Organ sale’ as the term is used here does not include the sale of body products (a category which includes blood, eggs, hair, and sperm) since this is different in some important respects. For example, the risk of permanent harm is generally much less in the case of blood and hair donation; while, the donation of eggs and sperm raises additional issues relating to the creation and parenting of additional future people. That said, many of the fundamental issues are similar and the very same concerns about (for example) exploitation and consent arise in both cases.

An important preliminary point is that almost all serious advocates of allowing payment for human organs argue not for an unfettered ‘free market’ but for a regulated one. Radcliffe Richards et al. (1998, 1950) for example, in their paper “The Case for Allowing Kidney Sales” say:

It must be stressed that we are not arguing for the positive conclusion that organ sales must always be acceptable, let alone that there should be an unfettered market.

While Wilkinson (2003, 132) is typical of organ sale defenders in wishing to distance himself from today's (largely ‘underground’) organ trade:

… far from being a reason to continue the ban on sale, the dreadfulness of present practice may be a reason to discontinue prohibition, so that the organ trade can be brought ‘overground’ and properly regulated.

Different scholars have different views about the precise scope and extent of the regulation required, but most support the requirements that organ sellers give valid consent, are paid a reasonable fee, and are provided with adequate medical care. Taylor (2005, 110) for example, says that:

At minimum … a market should require that vendors give their informed consent to the sale of their kidneys, that they not be coerced into selling their kidneys by a third party and that they receive adequate post-operative care.

One noteworthy policy proposal comes from Erin and Harris (1994; 2003) who suggest that a market in human organs should have the following features:

  1. It is limited to a particular geopolitical area, such as a state or the European Union, with only citizens or residents of that area being allowed to sell or to receive organs.
  2. There is a central public body responsible for making (and funding) all purchases and for allocating organs fairly in accordance with clinical criteria. Direct sales are banned.
  3. Prices are set at a reasonably generous level to attract people voluntarily into the market.

Features (1) and (2) combined are supposed to rule out exploitative organ trafficking from poorer countries, while the ban on direct sales and allocation by a central agency ensure that the organs go not to those most able to pay, but to those in most need. In common with many other defenders of organ sale, Erin and Harris also propose building in practical protections for donors and recipients (e.g., adequate medical care and thorough health checkups before donation takes place).

When ethically evaluating organ sale therefore it is best to focus not on the worst aspects of today's organ trafficking practices (since that is not what any serious ethicist is defending or proposing) but rather on what a reasonably well-regulated system of organ sale, controlled by some combination of the medical profession and state regulators, would look like. More specifically, it should be assumed (as it is in what follows) that the doctors, nurses, and transplant coordinators implementing an organ sale system should at least adhere to the standards around consent and clinical care advocated by The Transplantation Society and the World Health Organisation (leaving aside of course those bodies' opposition to organ sale itself) (see Other Internet Resources section below).

One final preliminary point is the distinction between questions of law and public policy, on the one hand, and personal morality on the other. The debate about organ sale is largely about whether this should be allowed (by law) and, if so, about what system of remuneration would be best. However, there is a set of separable questions about personal morality: about (for example) whether buying an organ for oneself might be morally problematic even if it should not be prohibited. Although this distinction is important, and should be kept in mind throughout, it will not be referred to much in the following sections. That is because, for the most part, the very same arguments are used both in attempts to show that organ sale is morally problematic and in attempts to show that it ought not to be allowed.

2. The Case for Organ Sale

Three main positive arguments are advanced in favour of permitting organ sale.

2.1 Arguments Based on the Principle of Respect for Autonomy, on Libertarianism, or on a notion of Self-Ownership

While there are many different variants under this heading, the basic claim common to all is that autonomous and competent adults have a strong presumptive right to do as they please with their own bodies (especially where this is not substantially harmful to third parties). Therefore, at least in the absence of strong reasons to do otherwise, people should be allowed to sell parts of their bodies if they so wish. Whether there are any such strong reasons is of course a moot point and the main candidate reasons are discussed in subsequent sections.

Not much directly will be said about these positive arguments for permitting organ sale since they rely on more fundamental and general questions in moral and political theory that cannot be tackled within the confines of a piece on organ sale (within SEP, see the entries on libertarianism, privacy and medicine, and property and ownership). Later sections will indirectly address these arguments, though, because many of the objections to sale considered could, if successful, overturn any defeasible presumption in favour of allowing ‘self-ownership’ to prevail.

2.2 The Saving of Lives

This argument is straightforward. Permitting (or encouraging) organ sale will, it is claimed, save lives by (at least partially) alleviating the shortage of transplant organs. The saving of lives is a good end and organ sale is then defensible as a means of achieving that positive end.

The shortage of transplant organs is a major worldwide public health problem. According to the US Department of Health and Human Services Organ Procurement and Transplantation Network, there are approximately 123,000 patients on transplant waiting lists in the US and around 300,000 patients waiting for an organ transplant in China (The Economist 2014). In the US in 2014, the overall median waiting time for a kidney transplant was over three and a half years (National Kidney Foundation 2014). The situation is similar in the UK (Department of Health 2014). Furthermore, waiting list sizes do not even fully reflect the actual level of need because doctors are sometimes reluctant even to list patients who they feel do not stand a realistic chance of getting an organ in time. (see Other Internet Resources section below).

Opposition to the Saving of Lives Argument takes one of two forms. It may be objected to empirically, with the critic arguing either that permitting organ sale would be ineffective or that an alternative system would work better: for example, the ways in which we approach bereaved relatives could be improved, as could the ways in which the possibility of (unpaid) living donation is publicized, or there could be a move to a Mandated Choice or Presumed Consent system (Hinkley 2005). Alternatively, one might concede the empirical point that allowing organ sale would be an effective option, but nonetheless argue that there are sufficiently strong countervailing (moral or practical) reasons to justify leaving the prohibition on sale in place. These reasons are the subject of some later sections.

The Saving of Lives Argument (unless rejected on empirical grounds) has an important role in placing the onus of proof on the shoulders of the prohibitionists (those who wish organ sale to be banned). For given that this prohibition may, in effect, be causing deaths (or at least preventing the saving of lives) a strong reason to continue with it will be required.

2.3 Consistency

Many authors have pointed out that there appears to be no fundamental difference between selling organs and other widely accepted practices, particularly selling one's own ‘risky labour’ (work that involves a risk of harm that is the same as or greater than that involved in organ donation) (Harris 1992; Brecher 1990, 1994; Wilkinson & Garrard 1996). Furthermore, common forms of ‘risky labour’ (coal mining, deep-sea diving, fire fighting, military service in a just war, etc.) are often more dangerous than selling a kidney, but are regarded as heroic, rather than condemned; it is seen as just and proper to reward those who do these things. This difference in attitude cannot be justified in terms of the good consequences that ‘risky labour’ produces, since the consequences of an organ sale (often, saving a life) may be just as good or better. Therefore, it is inconsistent to allow people to be paid for ‘risky labour’ while not allowing them to be paid for their organs. Savulescu (2003, 138) makes the point as follows:

If we should be allowed to sell our labour, why not sell the means to that labour? If we should be allowed to risk damaging our body for pleasure (by smoking or skiing), why not for money which we will use to realise other goods in life? … or consider the diver. He takes on a job as a deep sea diver which pays him an extra $30,000 … This loading is paid because the job has higher risks to his life and health. He takes the job because he likes holidays in expensive exotic locations.

Similarly, Fabre (2006, 131) argues that:

If someone's interest in raising income by engaging in very risky activities, such as being a full-time boxer or a building-site worker, is deemed important enough to confer on her the right to do so … there is no reason to deny her the right to make parts of her body available to others in exchange for money, even though she would incur similar risks in doing so.

Recently, some scholars have questioned whether organ sale and ‘risky labour’ are as similar as they might appear to be. Malmqvist (2015), for example, argues that it is not clear that kidney sales and dangerous jobs really do involve comparable risks, all things considered.

3. Harm and Risk

The first, and most straightforward, objection to organ sale is that it is excessively harmful or dangerous for paid organ donors. Present-day organ trafficking certainly does involve excessive and unacceptable levels of harm. But, as mentioned earlier, when considering the moral permissibility of organ sale, it is advisable to focus not on the worst case, but rather on the likely level of harm that would occur within a properly regulated system. Once this is borne in mind, the harm argument against organ sale appears vulnerable to a number of objections.

The first (an empirical point) is that the most widely discussed form of organ sale, kidney sale, is not terribly dangerous if performed in good conditions. Radcliffe Richards makes the point as follows.

… living organ donation is now so safe that many surgeons actively recommend it, and they would hardly do that if they expected a string of dead or damaged donors. They expect that virtually all donors will make a full recovery to normal health. But the only obvious difference between paid and unpaid donation is that the vendor receives something in return which is, to all appearances, a positive advantage. (Radcliffe Richards 2012, 55).

The UK body NHS Blood and Transplant (NHSBT), for example, informs us that the risk of postoperative death (to the donor) is about one in 3,000. There is also a small risk (less than 1%) of minor complications (such as chest, wound, or urine infections). As regards long-term health risks, NHSBT claims that there is no long-term effect on the health of the donor or on his/her remaining kidney, and that donors are at no greater risk of developing kidney failure after donating than anyone in the general population. So, while there are some not completely insignificant risks to consider, arguably these are tolerable compared to both the risks to the prospective recipient of not receiving the kidney, and the financial benefit to the donor, provided that the level of reward is set at a suitably high level.

The second objection says that, if our concern is exposing the organ vendor to risk, then the last thing we should be doing is banning sale since, as Cameron and Hoffenberg put it:

It is the marginalization of paid organ donation that leads to its performance in less than ideal circumstances. Paid organ donations need be no more risky than unpaid.

In other words, the best way of avoiding harm to organ vendors is not to criminalize and drive sale underground but rather to accept and regulate it. This style of argument is familiar from other contexts: notably debates about the legalization of abortion, drugs, and prostitution.

The third (related) objection is that no matter how dangerous paid donation is, it need not be any more dangerous than unpaid donation, since the mere fact of payment does not add any danger. So if paid donation is wrong because of the danger to which the donor is subjected, then free donation must also be wrong on the very same ground. Free donation, though, is not wrong; on the contrary, it is generally regarded as commendable and heroic. Therefore, paid donation is not wrong either; or, if it is wrong, it is wrong because of something other than the danger to which the donor is subjected (Radcliffe Richards 2012; Wilkinson and Garrard 1996).

It might be argued that what is wrong with organ sale is not danger per se but rather the fact that someone is being paid to endanger herself. There are two readings of this. One is as a worry about consent, the idea being that payment invalidates the vendor's consent; this will be examined in Section 5. The other is as a moral principle according to which (independently of concerns about consent) it is wrong to pay someone to endanger herself. Quite what the basis for such a principle might be is hard to fathom and it does seem implausible for reasons given during the earlier discussion of consistency. Paying people to undertake dangerous and/or unpleasant work is widespread and, while the world might well be a better place if people were not required to undertake such tasks, it would be hard to defend the view that all such arrangements are wrong: especially in those cases where the work is done voluntarily for fair pay.

4. Altruism

A very different style of argument against organ sale appeals to the supposed value of altruism. These arguments arise in a number of different forms, but most of them have the following underlying structure:

  1. Altruism is a good thing, either intrinsically, or because of its positive effects (or both).
  2. Permitting and/or practicing organ sale would lessen the amount of altruism in the world.
  3. So we ought not to permit and/or practice organ sale.

4.1 Is altruism (always) a good thing?

Altruism is usually defined as acting out of a concern for the well-being of others (Nagel 1970; Scott & Seglow 2007). Why might one think that such actions are morally good? Two main answers are available. The first is that altruism is intrinsically good and to be contrasted with morally bad characteristics and motivations, in particular selfishness. The second (which is not incompatible with the first) says that altruism is good because of its positive effects, not only its direct effects on the person to whom the altruism is directed but also its indirect effects on society. Both answers have considerable plausibility. Many examples of acting out of disinterested concern for the well-being of others do seem to be clear-cut cases of moral virtue. And it seems likely that, all other things being equal, a society with more altruistic acts would be a better place to live than one with fewer.

That said, two reservations about the claim that altruism is a good thing should be noted. First, altruistic acts are not always morally good. Scott and Seglow (2007, 2) give the following very pertinent example:

Consider the racist organ donor … who wishes to donate their organs, but only to those of their own race. They are altruistic but hardly moral.

Indeed, there seem to be several ways in which an altruistic act might be wrong. For example:

  1. The altruist is culpably mistaken about what is really in the interests of the person s/he is trying to help and ends up harming rather than helping.
  2. The altruist benefits the person s/he is trying to help, but her intervention is wrongfully paternalistic.
  3. The altruist benefits the person s/he is trying to help, but in so doing wrongfully harms innocent third parties.

It is not hard to come up with examples in which A loves B so much that A is prepared to do bad things to a third party, C, in order to benefit A. Such cases range from minor wrongdoing to serious evil. So, as McLachlan (1998) points out, while many acts of altruism are paradigm cases of virtue, others are ‘extremely wicked’.

In defence of the value of altruism, it could be argued that even though many altruistic acts are wrong, all things considered, nonetheless altruism is always a positive (or ‘right-making’) characteristic. On this view, the analysis of Scott and Seglow's racist donor example is that, while his racism is to be condemned, his altruism is not and that, in the case of racist donation (assuming that this really is wrong, all things considered), the ‘negative’ racism simply outweighs the ‘positive’ altruism. If this view is correct, then the claim that some altruistic acts are wrong becomes less relevant than it might at first appear, since what matters is the value of altruism as a positive moral property of actions, not whether all altruistic acts are good or permissible all things considered.

4.2 Would organ sale displace or reduce altruism?

… if to a voluntary blood donor system we add the possibility of selling blood, we have only expanded the individual's range of alternatives. If he derives satisfaction from giving … he can still give, and nothing has been done to impair that right (Arrow 1972, 350).

As the quotation from Arrow (above) suggests, there is a puzzle about why permitting payment for blood or organs should be thought to reduce the amount of altruism in the world. For why couldn't paid and unpaid donation systems peacefully coexist, with people who want to give freely continuing to do so? Furthermore, paid donations may even add to the amount of altruism in the world. For there can be cases in which a person sells an organ not for ‘selfish’ reasons, but in order to pay (for example) for someone else's medical care (Brecher 1994).

Given this, how exactly will allowing organ sale lead to there being less altruism in the world? The main answer given is that it would undermine the practice of free donation. Abouna (1991, 167), for example, claims that there is:

… considerable evidence to indicate that marketing in human organs will eventually deprecate and destroy the present willingness of members of the public to donate their organs out of altruism.

One explanation for this is that when we give people financial incentives to do some act this undermines or reduce the extent to which they feel morally obliged to do that act. In this way, financial incentives ‘crowd out’ altruism (Satz 2010, 193; Sandel 2012).

But is it really true that kidney sale would undermine the practice of free donation? Well, it could do and ultimately this is a contested empirical matter about which, as a mere philosopher, one ought not to claim to have an authoritative view. That said, there are reasons for scepticism about the claim that kidney sale would undermine the practice of free donation.

The most important of these is that, at least as far as living donation is concerned, there is not a very large practice out there to be undermined. Given the pain and inconvenience involved, free donation is likely to remain a minority pursuit. Living donation is admittedly on the rise and, according to the National Kidney Foundation, almost a third of US kidney transplants in 2014 came from live donors. However, this is still a 'drop in the ocean' compared to the 102,000 people on the waiting list and a majority of these live donors are friends or (more commonly) relatives of the recipient, or are part of a 'pairing arrangement' (where A's relative donates to B, and B's relative donates to A). Given such people's strong interest in saving their friends' or relatives' lives, one would think that many of them will not be put off by the mere possibility of payment. And it is notable that fewer than 200 people in the US in the same year became unrelated anonymous live donors.

Kidneys may then be importantly different from (say) blood. For if there is no substantial system of free donation in place, then free donation cannot be undermined by permitting sale. But if an almost adequate system of free donation does exist (as, in many countries, it does with blood) then there is a serious possibility of its being undermined. Thus, the argument which says that what is wrong with sale is that free donation would be undermined might well work for blood, even if it does not for kidneys. The same might be true of the arguments in favour of an altruistic blood system proposed by Titmuss and others. Perhaps the voluntary blood donation system (and indeed a voluntary posthumous organ donation system) can be used as a method of encouraging a valuable culture of altruism, but this is much less likely to work in the case of living organ donation (Archard 2002; Campbell 2009; Titmuss 1997).

This difference between kidneys and blood reveals a general structural difficulty for altruism arguments against sale. For altruism arguments (insofar as they work at all) work better for those things which are already freely donated on a large scale, than for those things which are hardly freely donated at all. Hence, they will tend to be most successful where, in a sense, they are needed least—because if there is already widespread free donation, then commercialization will be unnecessary. This is not a decisive objection, since there are things which are in short supply in spite of widespread free donation (blood and sperm might be examples of this). But it is a problem for this style of argument because there will be a tendency for it to be least successful where it is most needed (Radcliffe Richards 1996, 2009, 2012; Wilkinson & Moore 1999).

4.3 Altruism, Supererogation, and Duties to Rescue

However, even if altruism can survive this first challenge, there is a second reason to question its importance for the debate about the permissibility of organ sale. This is the distinction between cases in which altruism is obligatory (where there is a moral duty to help others) and those in which altruism is supererogatory (morally good, but not morally required—going ‘above and beyond’ one's duty) (Wilkinson 2003). This distinction is relevant for the following reason. If (say) altruistic kidney donation were morally obligatory, then to demand money for one's organ (and, arguably, to accede to such a demand) would be wrong. But if, on the other hand, altruistic donation were supererogatory, then to demand money for one's organ would not be wrong. Rather, it would be merely non-supererogatory: perhaps not good, but not wrong. So, with this distinction in place, one might (at least in some cases) accept that altruistic donations are good whilst also saying that there is nothing wrong with non-altruistic donation—the point being that non-altruistic donation, while not as good as altruistic donation, is nonetheless (morally) permissible. This has implications for the sort of altruism argument which can be made against organ sale. If it could be shown that altruistic donation is obligatory then the argument would be stronger, or at least more straightforward, because it would follow that selling was wrong (it is wrong to demand money for what one ought to be giving freely anyway). But if all that could be shown was that altruistic donation is good, then it would not follow from this, or at least it would not follow directly, that selling is wrong. For it might be merely non-supererogatory (Wilkinson & Garrard 1996).

This may be one area then where the differences between different possible organ sale systems are relevant. For it is not wildly implausible to posit the existence of a duty to donate one's organs for posthumous transplantation. Indeed, this view is not confined to utilitarian bioethicists, with even the Church of England stating in 2007 that (posthumous) organ donation is a Christian duty (BBC News Online 2007). Thus there may well be a valid altruism argument against a system in which people sell rights to their body after death: the argument being that they should donate them anyway without expecting payment. This style of argument looks less promising, though, when looking at non-directed living kidney donation (to strangers). Here, I suspect most of us want to say that becoming such a donor is heroic and supererogatory, not a moral obligation, and so the altruism argument does not engage. Another interesting example is blood (from living donors). In many countries, there is a widespread view that people ought to do this freely and (if this view is correct) this could underpin an altruism argument against paying for blood: the claim being that people ought not to be paid for that which they have an obligation freely to give.

5. Inducements and Consent

Monetary incentives, it is sometimes argued, make valid consent difficult, impossible, or problematic (Radcliffe Richards 2010, 2012). Some of the main arguments offered for this view are that—

  1. Financial incentives encourage people to do things that they would not otherwise do.
  2. Financial incentives encourage people to do things that are likely to be harmful to them and which go against their ‘better judgement’.
  3. Financial incentives can make people's actions, consents, and decisions less autonomous or less voluntary (Wilkinson 2005).

(a) will not work. For the fact that payments encourage people to do things that they otherwise would not does not, in and of itself, invalidate consent. If it did, consent problems would be endemic and occur every time someone was encouraged by payment to go to work for wages or to surrender property for a price. So although some people would only provide organs because of the money, this fact alone would not invalidate consent.

(b) is more plausible. Or at least it is plausible to suppose that we ought not to encourage donors to subject themselves to more than a certain level of danger. But the fundamental problem with this would be not payment or consent, but rather the fact that they are exposed to too much danger. So, provided that we have an adequate way of controlling and regulating risk to organ sellers this particular worry about payment ought not to arise.

This is supported by two additional considerations.

First, as mentioned earlier, the amount of danger remains the same regardless of whether or not payment takes place. So if someone objects to paying donors on the grounds that payment will encourage excessive risk-taking, s/he ought to object to donation itself (including free donation) not just the payment. Imagine someone who objects to paying astronauts on the grounds that it encourages them to do something excessively dangerous. Surely we should say to her that, if the objection is danger, s/he should object to space travel in general, not (just) to paid space travel. Much the same goes for paying organ donors. If the worry is danger, we should object to dangerous donation of all kinds, not just the paid variety.

Second, it is not clear that monetary incentives make people act against their better interests or judgement. Indeed, this is a rather surprising view to take since people trade off monetary gains and losses against other factors on a daily basis; commerce and work require us to do this all the time. So if an adequately informed and competent person decides, after deliberation, that it is worth subjecting herself to a given risk in return for $10,000 then we should not just assume that s/he is acting against her better judgement since, for all we know, the $10,000 is more valuable to her than avoiding the risk (Wilkinson 2005).

Finally, there is (c): the idea that financial incentives, when allowed to operate in certain conditions, ‘pressurise’ people in ways which are harmful and/or which render their decisions not truly voluntary. Rippon (2014, 148), for example, tells us that:

… because people in poverty often find themselves either indebted or in need of cash to meet their own basic needs and those of their families, they would predictably find themselves faced with social or legal pressure to pay the bills by selling their organs, if selling organs were permitted. So we would harm people in poverty by introducing a legal market that would subject them to such pressures.

It is difficult, he argues:

… to see how regulation could prevent the kind of pressure in question, while still maintaining the organ supply. Suppose that a high minimum price for organs was set. This would prevent one sort of exploitation ... as everyone who sold an organ would be substantially compensated for it. However, this would do nothing to address the problem that some might sell their organs out of economic desperation, rather than out of a choice made free from external pressure.

The underlying argument here is that certain sorts of payment, or payment in certain circumstances, exert undue influence on a person's decision (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2002). Accusations of undue inducement almost always occur in one of two different contexts. The first is where the ‘victim’ of the inducement is in desperate need of money; the second is where the ‘victim’ is not desperate, but is offered such a huge amount of money to do X that doing X becomes almost irresistible. Wilkinson terms these ‘desperate offeree’ cases and ‘enormous offer’ cases. One notable thing that these have in common is that there is a huge gap between the offeree's welfare-level if s/he does not accept the offer, and her welfare-level if s/he does accept (Wilkinson 2003).

Is valid consent possible in these cases? In both scenarios it may be terrifically hard to decline. However this does not mean that valid consent to the offer is impossible. Radcliffe Richards (2010, 291) makes the point as follows:

It does not normally occur to us that people coerced by circumstances into doing things they would not otherwise do should have their consent regarded as invalid. If you have cancer, with the choice between risking its unchecked progression and putting up with pretty nasty treatments, nobody would think of arguing that the narrow range of options made your consent to treatment invalid.

So even if we grant that the recipients of enormous offers and desperate offerees will find it hard to refuse, this does not mean that they cannot validly consent. This must be so. Otherwise, it would be impossible for anyone ever to consent validly to lifesaving operations, not to mention lottery ‘jackpot’ wins or large wage rises; the mere fact that a proposal is tremendously attractive does not mean that it cannot be voluntarily accepted.

A slightly different tack is to invoke the idea of coercion by circumstances, specifically coercion by poverty (Annas 1984; Rippon 2014; Torcello & Wear 2000). Thus, someone might argue that even though valid consent from ‘desperate’ people is possible in principle for the reasons just given, consent will normally be invalid when the person consenting (e.g., to selling her kidney) is coerced by poverty. The difference between coercion by poverty and Radcliffe Richards' cancer example is supposed to be that whereas the cancer is a morally neutral natural occurrence, the poverty (at least in some cases) is the result of immoral acts and policies; it is unjust poverty.

One initial response to the ‘coercion by poverty’ refers us back to the fact that almost all defenders of organ sale are arguing not for unfettered international trafficking in transplant organs but rather for a regulated system of compensation. Within the context of a regulated system (particularly that advocated by Erin and Harris, which would be limited to one economic area) there is no reason to believe that most organ sellers would be desperately poor. Organ sale may admittedly be more attractive to those with the least money (for why would someone rich need or want to sell an organ?) but then much the same can be said of some of the least sought-after and worst paid agricultural and cleaning jobs, and we do not generally say that people cannot consent to do these or that these types of employment should be banned.

But let us allow for the sake of argument that organ vendors would be very poor. What would follow from this? Poverty (or threatening poverty) can clearly be a method of coercion. An obvious example of this is the behaviour of exploitative employers during times of high unemployment. They can threaten workers with unemployment—and, hence, poverty—if they do not comply with their demands (Wilkinson 2003). The position of the prospective organ buyer though seems rather unlike that of the exploitative employer and, as Wilkinson and Moore (1999, 378) point out:

… it is a necessary condition of an offer's being coercive that the offerer is also responsible for the bad circumstances of the offeree. For example, if we poison you and then offer to provide the only available antidote in exchange for your stamp collection, that is coercive. If you are poisoned in a way for which we are not responsible, and we make the same offer, that is not coercive … as long as those making an offer are not responsible for the circumstances of the potential subjects, their offer is not coercive.

So in order for prospective organ purchasers to be coercing through poverty, they must be responsible for the poverty. This need not mean that they caused the poverty, for people may be responsible for (improving or preventing) situations that they have not themselves caused. Hence, another scenario in which the buyers may be responsible is if they have a positive duty to rescue the prospective sellers from poverty (and ‘for free’ rather than in exchange for an organ).

An illuminating analogy is Nozick's Drowning Case (Nozick 1969, 449). This is a situation in which P (the occupant of a boat) offers to save Q (who is drowning close to the boat) but only if Q promises to pay P $10,000 within three days of reaching shore. One view of this case is that P coerces Q (into paying) if and only if P has a freestanding duty to save Q without reward. Whether P does in fact have such a duty is not something we need to decide upon here and that will depend upon a wide range of facts about the situation.

Organ vendors then are somewhat like the person in the boat. If they have an independent duty to alleviate the poverty (i.e., a duty that does not depend on their getting an organ in return) then to insist on an organ for the money (when they should have been giving the money anyway) would be coercive. It would be like charging someone who would otherwise drown in a situation where there is a duty freely to rescue.

It is not hard to see how, in principle, this style of coercion argument could work against organ sale. What is much harder is working out whether, in most of the cases envisaged, organ buyers have a duty to alleviate the poverty. The case most often discussed is where the organ purchaser is a rich Westerner and the vendor is someone desperately poor from the developing world. The Westerner, it is said, uses poverty to ‘force’ (coerce) the poor person into giving up the organ. This may be the case if the Westerner has a duty to alleviate the prospective organ seller's poverty. But, as well as difficult general questions about global distributive justice and the like, there is also the question of whether the individual in question is directly responsible for alleviating the other's poverty in these cases. The problem with attributing responsibility to individual organ purchasers is that the extent to which they have a positive ‘duty to rescue’ those in dire poverty may vary enormously depending on their own positions of wealth and power, and on the extent to which they have already done virtuous things in an attempt to act on their duties towards the poor. For example, a Western organ purchaser could have already devoted a large part of her income and time to charitable projects aimed at the alleviation of poverty and may herself have relatively little money—just enough to buy a kidney. Do we really want to say that such a person has a duty to give her money to the prospective organ vendor without receiving the kidney (without which she may well die) in return?

A more promising option is to focus on groups rather than individuals. One might argue, for example, that the rich nations have a duty to alleviate poverty in the poor nations. With this (plausible) assumption in place, it could then be argued that when the rich nations collectively offer the poor nations money (but only) in return for organs, this is not really an offer, but rather a threat (a threat to wrongfully withhold resources if they do not hand over organs). The rich nations (it is argued) should be giving the money anyway, not demanding organs in return for it. So what the rich nations are doing is threatening to withhold resources to which the poor nations have a moral right, unless the poor nations hand over organs: a seemingly clear case of coercion.

However, there is a further problem with the ‘coercion by poverty’ argument—or at least there is a serious problem with attempting to use it specifically as an argument for the legal prohibition of organ sale. The problem is that the argument works equally well against all trade between the rich nations and the poor ones. For (in simplistic terms) if the rich nations have a duty to give resources to the poor nations, then any time that the rich nations insist on trading rather than donating, they will be practicing coercion—threatening to withhold money that they should be giving anyway, unless they are provided with goods of one sort or another. And, as far as the coercion argument is concerned, there is no reason to single out the trade in organs for special treatment. This looks like a decisive objection to the coercion argument. Either it does not work at all, or it works but ‘proves too much’ and gives us no reason to single out organ sale for condemnation and/or prohibition.

One possible reply to this is to make a distinction between forms of global trade which benefit developing world economies and societies and those which do not. One might then argue that a difference between the organ trade and (say) the development of hi-tech manufacturing is that only the latter has the potential to emancipate populations in the longer-term, whereas buying an organ is merely a ‘resource grab’ with no positive side-effects on socio-economic development. Like many of the other arguments discussed in this entry, much depends on the how the empirical evidence shapes up, but this response does seem to have some plausibility. However, it could still be claimed that the international organ trade is no worse (as far as the quality of consent is concerned) than any other form of international trade which fails positively to contribute to long-term development. So perhaps the organ trade is (in this respect) on a par with logging, or mining, or some basic forms of agriculture.

Perhaps more importantly, though, we must remember that, in any case, most of these concerns about coercion and poverty can be dealt with by having a controlled system such as the Erin-Harris proposal. Of course it is not the case that there is no unfair poverty within the Western countries that they have in mind. And so, even under the Erin-Harris system, some account would have to be taken of the coercion by poverty argument. Perhaps, for example, we would want to say that, in order for the national organ purchasing agency not to be coercing-by-poverty it needs to be the case that there is a minimum wage law and a welfare state that are at least close to being fair, so that there is no poverty in society for which the state is morally responsible (either actively or by omission). This is probably a lot to ask but then we must remember that any actual organ sale system, along with all other aspects of the economy, is unlikely to be perfect; and, provided that the organ sale system is not substantially more exploitative or harmful than most other widely accepted economic transactions then it would seem arbitrary and unfair to single it out for particular condemnation or prohibition.

Finally, Radcliffe Richards offers an argument to the effect that even if there is a consent problem caused by ‘coercion through poverty’ (a claim about which she is sceptical) this is unlikely to be a sound basis for prohibiting sale. She asks us to consider a case in which your daughter is kidnapped. The kidnappers ask for a ransom in return for your daughter's life. Clearly, your consent to this arrangement (if forthcoming) would be invalid because coerced. But—

Suppose the police appeared on the kidnapping scene and prevented you from signing the [ransom payment] document, perhaps with the outcome that your child was shot. They might have good public policy reasons for doing this … but it would be preposterous for them to claim that they were doing it because the consent you were trying to give would be invalid … [T]he whole point of declaring invalidity is to protect the alleged consenter, and here the police would actually be compounding the wrong done to you by constricting still further the range of options already constricted by the kidnapper (Radcliffe Richards 2010, 294).

According to Radcliffe Richards, this is analogous to the situation in which state action is used to prevent organ sale. As with the kidnapping, there may be legitimate reasons for such state action (for example, if the police suspect that the organ purchaser's surgeon is planning to take several organs and then kill the organ vendor). However, the invalidity of the seller's consent (due to poverty) would not in and of itself be a sufficient reason for state intervention in these circumstances.

Since the metaphorical coercer (poverty) is still present, and the individual is making the best choice among a still-constricted range of options, disallowing the choice is like preventing you from meeting the demands of the kidnapper while he still has your child (Radcliffe Richards 2010, 294).

So even if there is a quality of consent problem in these organ sale cases this is unlikely to justify prohibition.

6. Exploitation, Instrumentalisation, and Objectification

Perhaps the most commonly discussed objection to organ sale is the claim that it is exploitative (Greasley 2014; Hughes 1998; Lawler 2011, 2014; Wilkinson 2003). Saying what exploitation amounts to is itself a complex task, however, and I will not say much here about how it should be defined (see the SEP entry on exploitation). It is, however, worth noting that, on one view, defective (or invalid) consent is a necessary condition for the occurrence of exploitation. Thus (according to this view) a transaction can only be exploitative if the putative victim of exploitation is coerced, lacking capacity, ill-informed, or manipulated (or more generally, if there is some consent-invalidating factor in play). If this view of the relationship between consent and exploitation were correct, then the discussion of exploitation could be ended here; for consent issues were dealt with in the previous section and the exploitation worry about organ sale would only be worth taking seriously inasmuch as those consent arguments discussed above were sound. However, not everyone thinks that defective consent is required for there to be exploitation and so there may be some mileage in looking independently at exploitation.

Similar thoughts apply to the unjust distribution of benefits and burdens. One view is that a transaction can only count as exploitative if the relevant benefits and burdens are unfairly distributed in favour of the exploiter and/or against the exploited. With this in mind, Harris (1992, 120) usefully distinguishes between two kinds of exploitation-claim. The first:

… involves the idea of some disparity in the value of an exchange of goods and services.

Exploitation concerns of this kind, or at least most of them, can be taken care of by utilizing some version of the Erin-Harris proposal (discussed above) since this is designed to ensure that organ sellers receive just rewards and adequate care, whilst also going a long way towards ensuring that the distribution of organs to transplant recipients is fair. And while there may be some practical obstacles to creating such a system there seem no reasons to suppose that it is impossible in principle.

There is, however, another sense of ‘exploitation’. This is:

… the idea of wrongful use and may occur when there are no financial or commercial dimensions to the transaction. A classic case here would be where it is claimed that lovers may exploit one another, that is, use one another in some wrongful way. The most familiar of such wrongful ways in this context might be where it is claimed that one partner uses the other or treats the other merely as a ‘sex object’ (1992, 120).

Similarly Goodin (1987, 166) notes that:

Lovers can exploit one another just as surely as can economic classes. Yet neither party in an affectionate relationship is functioning in any standard sense as a ‘factor of production’. Nor, since neither party is creating valuable objects in any ordinary respect, does it in that context make much sense to define exploitation in the standard economics-based terms …

So it looks as if (in Harris's terms) ‘wrongful use’ exploitation is independent of some of the usual concerns about distributive justice and could persist even within a distributively fair organ sale system. Exploitation of this second kind is closely related to a number of other concepts or terms (Wilkinson 2003). One of these is objectification: wrongfully treating something (or someone) that is not a mere object as if it were a mere object. Another is instrumentalisation, which can be similarly defined as treating something (or someone) that is not a mere means as if it were a mere means (Davis 2009). A third is commodification, treating something (or someone) that is not a mere commodity as if it were a mere commodity (Sandel 2012; Wilkinson 2000). These ideas are closely connected to the Kantian idea of dignity (Radin 1996). As Dillon (2010) puts it, on this view:

To be a person is to have a status and worth that is unlike that of any other kind of being: it is to be an end in itself with dignity. And the only response that is appropriate to such a being is respect.

So we have the claim that exploitation, objectification, instrumentalisation, or commodification could occur within distributively fair transactions. How might this apply in the case of organ sale? Specifically, how could these ideas underpin a sound moral argument against organ sale?

In common with some of the arguments considered earlier, attempts to use these ideas in an argument against organ sale run up against two problems. First, there is the similarity of (free) donation and sale. Let us say that someone objects to organ sale (even where there is consent and distributive justice) on the grounds that the seller's body (organ) or the seller herself is objectified or instrumentalised. This immediately raises the question of why the very same consideration does not apply to (free) donation, which is standardly thought to be admirable rather than morally dubious. For in both cases, a part of the donor's (or vendor's) body is removed and treated (quite possibly solely) as a means by the recipient and the transplant team.

Then, second, there is the question of consent. For can we really make sense of someone being instrumentalised or objectified (in the relevant normative or pejorative senses of these terms) if what is done to them is done with valid consent, and especially if what is done to them would not have been done but for their giving of valid consent? So one possible principle that we might wish to endorse here is that:

If A requires and obtains from B valid consent to do x to B, that is sufficient to guarantee that, in doing x to B, A does not wrongfully instrumentalise or objectify B.

Or, to put it another way, as with the other sort of exploitation discussed above, perhaps even instrumentalisation and objectification turn out to rely on defective consent: or perhaps rather on the fact that the putative instrumentaliser (objectifier) does not care about or require valid consent. Alternatively we might make this principle slightly more cautious and include a substantial harm constraint as follows:

If A requires and obtains from B valid consent to do x to B, and if doing x to B will not substantially harm B, that is sufficient to guarantee that, in doing x to B, A does not wrongfully instrumentalise or objectify B.

To help think through these principles consider the case of Manuel Wackenheim. Wackenheim is a (so-called) ‘dwarf’ who (until a ban was imposed by the local mayor) made a living from being ‘tossed’ by customers in bars and nightclubs. This ‘tossing’ formed part of a dwarf throwing competition—a sport ‘in which the aim of the competitors is to fling a dwarf over the furthest distance possible’ (Millns 1996, 375). Wackenheim appeared keen to pursue his chosen career and didn't welcome the ban on dwarf throwing, saying ‘this spectacle is my life; I want to be allowed to do what I want’.

Wackenheim can be regarded both as intrinsically valuable as a person but also as instrumentally valuable as an object (specifically as a projectile). That is, there is no reason in principle why a friend of his could not both respect him as an ‘end’ and recognise the fact that his body is formed in a way which makes it instrumentally valuable to ‘dwarf throwers’. But could Wackenheim's friend actually use him as a projectile, whilst at the same time respecting the fact that he is a person or (in Kantian terms) an end-in-himself? It is the overall context of the relationship, along with other structural features of the situation, which determine whether he is appropriately respected. Surely this must be right, for it would be extraordinarily hard to argue plausibly that it is impossible, in all contexts, to use Wackenheim as a projectile whilst at the same time respecting his personhood. For what if he enjoys being thrown, gets paid for it, and freely and knowingly consents to it? If for these reasons—i.e., because I want to ensure that he derives pleasure and money, and am certain that it is what he really wants etc.—I throw him, then there seems no basis whatsoever for saying that I am failing to respect his personhood. For in such a case, I am (let us assume) deliberately giving him what he wants (and wants in a free, informed and otherwise autonomous way) and deliberately benefiting him. How can this be a failure to recognise his status as an ‘end’?

It is difficult to see how it could be. Although we should add two caveats. First, this doesn't rule out the existence of other separate moral objections to ‘dwarf throwing’. Second, there certainly are contexts in which this practice would constitute wrongful instrumentalisation. These may include cases in which the people thrown are substantially harmed and cases in which they do not consent or in which their consent is invalid. Indeed, this is the main point. What does all the ethical work here is context: in particular issues relating to the existence and quality of the ‘dwarf's’ consent—and perhaps also those relating to harm and welfare.

Much the same goes for organ sale, or indeed (unpaid) organ donation. When we look at a person with a view to using her organs for transplantation we are of course viewing at least the organ, or possibly even the person, as a means to an end, and as a useful object. But this is not inconsistent with also respecting the person's dignity and viewing her as an end-in-herself provided that we take seriously the person's rational agency by requiring her valid consent for the organ removal and by ensuring that any risk of harm is minimized and reasonable. The particular issues for organ sale (as opposed to free donation) then turn out to be those discussed at length in previous sections. Perhaps there is an increased risk that consent will be flawed in sale cases; if organ removal proceeded without proper consent then that could be a failure to respect the person. And perhaps there is an increased risk that harm will occur in sale cases; if so (and if the risk goes above a certain level) then perhaps this also would constitute a failure to respect the person. Thus the appeal to dignity, instrumentalisation, and objectification would seem merely to amplify some of the concerns aired previously about consent and harm.


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I would like to thank Dr. Nicola Williams for providing research support for the August 2015 version of this entry.

Copyright © 2015 by
Stephen Wilkinson <>

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