Personhood in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Mon Jan 3, 2022

Selves and persons are often used as synonyms in contemporary philosophy, and sometimes also in the history of Western philosophy. This is almost never the case in classical Indian philosophical traditions. The Sanskrit term ‘ātman’ properly translated as self stands for whatever it is that is the essence of individual humans (manuṣya) or the psychophysical complex (pudgala) which includes the mind, body and sense organs. There is disagreement among the philosophical schools about whether the essence is a substantial soul or pure consciousness and whether there is such an essence at all. The Buddhist no-self theorists and the Cārvāka materialists deny that there is any such essence, the psychophysical complex is all there is. Finding an equivalent term across the classical Indian philosophical schools that properly can be translated as person is a bit more challenging. The concept of ‘pudgala’ used to signify the psychophysical complex as whole in Buddhist philosophy is properly translated as person. But ‘pudgala’ is not used with this strict meaning across the philosophical spectrum. The Jaina philosophers use it as an equivalent for matter or material object. There are several terms in Sanskrit, for example, ‘jīva-ātma’, ‘puruṣa’, ‘manuṣya’ which are often used to indicate persons, but these terms have wider meanings and do not apply strictly to persons. The lack of an exact equivalent in Sanskrit does not, however, mean that the concept of personhood was not central to classical Indian philosophies other than Buddhism.

A primary concern that motivated most philosophers in ancient India was to find the best way forward in an individual person’s quest for liberation from suffering. All living beings are trapped in the cycle of birth and rebirth (saṃsāra) which according to most classical Indian philosophers, is characterised by suffering. The highest goal of life is liberation (mokṣa or nirvāṇa). Except the Cārvāka materialists who believed that death is the end and there is nothing like rebirth or liberation, all other philosophical schools believed in the possibility of liberation in this life or in future lifetimes. The ultimate aim of the classical Indian philosophy teachings is thus to help individual persons attain liberation or at least a better life in this life and future lifetimes. Most classical Indian philosophers agreed that our ignorance about “who we really are” is the source and the means to bringing an end to suffering. Thus, metaphysical debates about the nature of individual persons and the universe and our place in it are central to the classical Indian philosophical traditions. These debates, however, tended to focus on the essence of persons, the self (ātman) or the soul substance.

This is in contrast with contemporary Western philosophy where questions about personal identity and its normative significance are at the forefront at least since Parfit (1984). In Section 2, we turn briefly to the contemporary debates about personal identity and reflect on how they might benefit from paying attention to the discussions of personhood in classical Indian philosophy. But before we attempt that, in Sections 1 and 2, we describe the different conceptions of personhood in classical Indian philosophy. As I said, there is not much explicit discussion of personhood, so most of the time I draw out the conceptions of persons from other discussions that implicitly refers to persons.

1. Classical Indian Conceptions of Persons

1.1 Vedic Conception of Persons: Upaniṣads

Hindu philosophical schools develop their philosophical position as an attempt to interpret and defend the various metaphysical theses that are found in the Vedas (the foundational Hindu scriptures) and more specifically the Upaniṣads. The Upaniṣads, literally “the last chapters, parts of the Veda”, are often thought of as expressing the crux or the purpose of the Veda. The concept of ātman (soul, self) as the essence of individual persons and knowledge of that ātman is the central focus in all of the Upanishads. The self (ātman) is primarily conceived of in the Upaniṣads as a pure subject of experiences, detached from the objects of its consciousness, enduring and changeless and separate and independent of its mental and physical states. In the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, the sage Yājñavalkya says

The sages call it the eternal self. It is neither big nor small, neither long nor short, neither hot nor cold, neither bright nor dark, neither air nor space. It is without attachment, without taste, smell, or touch, without eyes, ears, tongue, mouth, breath, or mind, without movement, without limitation, without inside or outside. It consumes nothing, and nothing consumes it.

The Self is the seer, Gargi, though unseen; the hearer, though unheard; the thinker, though unthought; the knower, though unknown. Nothing other than the Self can see, hear, think, or know (BU 3.7, 8, 11).

This picture of the self as a witnessing subject is in sharp contrast with another Upaniṣadic conception: that of persons as agents, the doers and the enjoyers of the fruits of their actions. This conception of persons is also found in the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad:

What a man turns out to be depends on how he acts and on how he conducts himself. If his actions are good, he will turn into something good. If his actions are bad, he will turn into something bad. A man turns into something good by good action and into something bad by bad action. And so people say: “A person here consists simply of desire.” A man resolves in accordance with his desire, acts in accordance with his resolve, and turns out to be in accordance with his action. (BU 4.4, 5)

And again, in the Śvetāśvatara Upaniṣad, we find talk of person as an embodied soul. Chapter 5 explains the cycle of birth and rebirth of individual persons as process of soul (self) becoming embodied as a result of being entangled in the material qualities (Guṇas):

Only he [the person] who gets attached to the pleasurable qualities of things does work for the sake of its fruits, and enjoys the fruits of his own deeds. Though really the master of the senses, he becomes bound by Guṇas, and assuming various forms, wanders about the three paths as a result of his own deeds.
By desire, contact, sight and delusion, the embodied soul assumes successively various forms in various places according to his deeds, just as the body grows nourished by showers of food and drink.
The embodied soul chooses many forms, gross and subtle, based on the qualities belonging to himself, to the actions and to the mind. The cause of their combination is found to be still another. (ŚVU 5. 7, 10, 11)

The agential conception of persons assumes the Vedic doctrine of karma, so it deserves to a short explication. The doctrine of karma has two dimensions: a moral cosmology and a psychological dimension (Phillips 1997, 329). According to the thesis of moral cosmology, actions have immediate as well as non-immediate consequences. The latter embody a moral dimension: good actions result in rewards, bad actions in punishments in the form of karmic residues which ripen and bear fruit in this lifetime or in future lifetimes. According to the psychological thesis, actions create a tendency, a disposition to repeat that act. The two dimensions together might seem to entail fatalism, bad actions result in acquisition of bad karmic residues and bad habits that dispose the agent to repeat the same offences with the result that the agent is doomed to inferior rebirths with no possibility of liberation from the cycle of birth and rebirth. This impression is mistaken. The individual person is free at all times to break the bad habits and perform novel good actions in accordance with duty (dharma) and thereby inculcate the right dispositions that incline the agent to good actions and superior births and finally liberation. There is an important caveat though, “duty has to be performed for the sake of duty alone” not because of attachment to pleasures or fruits of actions because that results in bondage of the soul to the material qualities and many different rebirths follow. The quality of the deeds, good or bad, determines the kind of embodiment (physical and psychological characteristics, caste), length of life, quality of experiences, dreams and much else that is to be endured by person while it is entrapped in the cycle of birth and rebirth. Although the soul is thought of as the controller of the senses, once it is embodied, the qualities of material form have the habit of taking over and driving individual persons on account of their attachments to sensual pleasures. And it is on account of the quality of its actions and their karmic fruits, in this birth, that the embodied soul is reborn in (another) new form. The only way out of suffering in the perpetual the cycle of birth and rebirth is knowledge the real nature of the individual person and its entanglement in the material world.

The Upaniṣadic philosophers recognize the conception of the self as the pure detached subject of experiences separate and unaffected by the material world (nivṛtti) and the person as an active agent engaged with the material world (pravṛtti). The nivṛtti tradition is the exemplified in the later Upaniṣadic renunciant tradition and is also developed by Hindu schools such as the Vedānta and Sāṃkhya-Yoga. In contrast the pravṛtti tradition exemplified in the Vedic ritualistic tradition is developed by the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Mīmāṃsā schools. This difference in emphasis is also brought out in the various paths to liberation: the path of action (karma yoga) and the path of knowledge (jñāna yoga). The nivṛtti tradition stresses the importance of knowledge of the self (ātma-vidyā) sometimes equated with mystical awareness of Brahman (brahma-vidyā). This, according to Upaniṣads, is the most promising route to the supreme good, liberation (mokṣa). But it is not exclusive or independent of karma yoga, because knowledge of the self will result in transformation of a person’s attitudes towards sensual pleasure and earthly goods, and desires which contribute to action. And conversely, the training in karma yoga together with the doctrine of rebirth and transmigration will result in a transformation of how the person views the self.

The Upaniṣadic conception of person is that of an ‘embodied soul’. The soul is essence of the person and it is what makes us the same person over time (possibly even across lifetimes). The Hindu schools defend what is contemporary philosophers call the Non-Reductionist view of persons. According to the Non-Reductionist view, the continued existence of persons is a deep, further fact, distinct from physical and psychological continuity, and a fact that holds completely or not at all (Parfit 1984, 445). Parfit notes that a Cartesian Ego, would be one such entity. The soul (ātman) as described by the Vedas and explicated by Hindu would be another. These ideas from the Upaniṣads are developed into various conceptions of persons by the Hindu philosophical schools which will be discussed in turn Sections 1.2 and 1.3 before we turn to unorthodox conceptions in Section 1.4.

1.2 Spiritual Conceptions of Persons

The Vedānta and Sāṃkhya-Yoga is the most important school that develop the spiritual and mystical insights in the Upaniṣads. The Advaita Vedānta is well-known for upholding monism, there is only one reality and that is Brahman. Furthermore, the Advaita Vedānta philosophers argue that the individual self and the supreme Self (Brahman) are identical. The plurality of the external world of everyday experience is explained away as an illusory projection (māyā), a cosmic illusion which is a product of our ignorance. The nature of this self is simply pure consciousness. Self, according to the Advaita Vedānta is not to be understood as a substance that has the property of consciousness but rather it is consciousness itself, the principle of illumination or manifestation (prakāśa). This consciousness manifests all things. Just as without the sunlight, the universe would be shrouded in darkness, similarly without consciousness nothing would be known or manifested’ (Gupta 2003: 31–2; cf. 106). According to the Advaitins,

consciousness has no form, no content; its only function, like that of light, is to show the object on which it is focused…. The Advaitins argue that, that which manifests everything cannot have the form of any particular thing; manifestation is its only function. (Gupta 2003: 119–20)

The Advaita Vedānta thesis is that this consciousness is what a person is at the most fundamental level, the self (ātman). But as far as my sense of myself as a person is concerned, I take myself to be a psychophysical thing among others, having certain properties and relations, such as belonging to a certain family (caste, according to the Hindus) and having a certain social role. The Advaita Vedānta philosophers argue that this sense of self is a result of a false identification with aspects of the projected world. Person (an empirical self in their terminology) in their sense has no ultimate reality, it is merely another projection of the cosmic illusion. Though the person is ordinarily experienced as a particular entity in the world and standing in manifold relations to other entities, it is dismissed as a product of ignorance. Their concern is with the ‘self/supreme Self’ identity and with self-knowledge as the most promising route to liberation (mokṣa). Once we understand the true nature of ourselves, primarily through the study of the Upaniṣads complemented by the practice of meditation, we will grasp that essence of an individual (ātman) is identical with the real Self (Brahman). The person or empirical self will fall away as merely an illusory projection of consciousness.

The Sāṃkhya and Yoga schools draw inspiration for their metaphysics of persons from the Upaniṣads and develop the insight that the real essence of a person is the soul or in Sāṃkhya terminology, the Spirit (puruṣa). But unlike the Vedānta, the Sāṃkhya and Yoga philosophers do not regard the multiplicity of true persons as a mere illusion. They speak of the absolute puruṣa (īśvara) and individual puruṣas (jīvas). Verse 18 of the Sāṃkhya-kārikā offers a proof and explanation for the existence of multiplicity of real persons

The incidence of birth and death and the action of the sense faculties different for different individuals; all people not having the same inclinations at the same time; the thoughts arising out of the action of the three guṇas being different for different people – it follows that souls (puruṣas) are many (each person having a separate soul). (Translation adapted from Radhanath Phukan 1960).

Every individual person (jīva) is a manifestation or instantiation of the absolute puruṣa, which is present as an undivided whole in every person. The puruṣa is thus the universal aspect in virtue of which we are persons. But each individual person is also a finite particular. The particular aspect of an individual person is derived from the material form or nature (prakṛti ) which supplies the physical body and its adjuncts (sense organs, etc.). Nature (prakṛti) works through three guṇas which are its functional forces, known as existence or beingness (sattva), force of bringing about change (rajas), and force for restrains change (tamas). Sattva exhibits the physical characteristic of buoyancy and illumination, and the psychological characteristic of pleasure. Rajas exhibits the physical characteristic of stimulation and movement and the psychological characteristics of pain and passion. Tamas exhibits the physical characteristic of weight and resistance and the characteristics of dejection and despondency. The disturbance in the equipoise of the three guṇas starts the process of evolution which is the process of creation. As explained in the quote above, each individual person is a unique composition of guṇas that determine her physical and psychological characteristics, for example those with a predominance of tamas will be naturally disposed to resist change and activity.

According to Sāṃkhya philosophers, the relation between prakṛti and puruṣa in an individual person is said to be eternal and irresolvable. This raises a problem for the Sāṃkhya, namely, how are we to explain the bondage (coming together) of prakṛti and puruṣa (soul), and how is the final release liberation of puruṣa possible? The clue lies in understanding the process of evolution. Verse 21 of the Sāṃkhya-kārikā offers a succinct answer:

For the sake of puruṣa’s perception of prakṛti and for the sake of his release, a union of the two takes place, which resembles the union of the lame and the blind (translation adapted from Majumdar 1930, 77).

The author of the Kārikā makes use of an analogy often exploited in classical Indian philosophy, of the union of the lame and the blind who happen to encounter each other and decide to cooperate for their mutual benefit which is to reach their desired destination (metaphorically liberation). The lame man (soul) mounts the shoulders of the blind man (matter) and directs both to the desired destination. And, just as the blind man and the lame man part company when they reach their mutual destination, so do soul and matter. Creation of an individual person results from the desire to perceive and experience prakṛti and her manifestations in the form of sensual pleasures derived from material objects. Creation is more properly understood as evolution of prakṛti to reveal her many forms to the soul for the sake of his enjoyment, even though the union of prakṛti and puruṣa is eternal. Bondage results in the soul being tricked by the various forms of prakṛti especially the ego-sense (ahaṃkāra) and the physical body to the extent of identifying with these material forms as part of the soul. This identification results in the soul forgetting its true nature and being totally spell-bound by prakṛti and the many pleasures afforded by material forms. This forgetfulness results in alienation of the soul which causes in unhappiness and misery. Most of us, ordinary persons, are in fact in this situation. But because the enjoyment of the material forms and the union of matter and soul is tainted with suffering and pain, persons seek liberation. The way out for an individual person is to dispel the delusion of the soul by developing the right kind of psychical conditions. The right kind of psychical development requires proper moral and religious training though it may take an inordinately long time, possibly many rebirths. The end of the delusion also means the end of bondage and with it goes all unhappiness and misery. Liberation of the soul consists in indifference towards the manifestation of prakṛti and with it the renunciation of many sensual pleasures and material objects. The puruṣa thus returns to its native enlightened state of bliss. (For an elaborate account of such a delusion and its consequences, see the Śāntiparvan of the Māhābhārata, Chapter 302 (verse 41–49) and Chapter 303).

The Yoga school shares much with the Sāṃkhya regarding the nature of the true self and the individual person, differing in its emphasis on the yogic practices (psychophysical techniques centering on meditation) as the means of discovering the true nature of the real self. The Sāṃkhya and Yoga philosophers disagree with the Advaitic thesis that individual persons (jīvas) are only delusions, but agree that the true self, the essence of the person is the soul or consciousness untainted by matter. There is no value to development of persons as such, according to these spiritual philosophies, the only activity worthy of pursuit is the search for the true self.

1.3 Worldly Persons

The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Mīmāṃsā philosophers differ from the philosophers of Advaita-Vedānta in that they emphasise the reality of distinct many distinct individual persons (jīva). However, because of their allegiance to the Vedas there is not much explicit discussion of persons, the focus is on the search for is the essence of persons (ātman) and their pursuit of the highest good, liberation (mokṣa). Ordinary persons are embodied souls, according to these philosophers. The soul (ātman) is the essence of the person; the mind, body and the senses are merely adjuncts. The soul is a distinct and independent substance, possessing the property of consciousness. The philosophers belonging to Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Mīmāṃsā traditions, contra the spiritual philosophers, emphasized that the soul is not just an experiencer but more importantly an agent – a knower and a doer and enjoyer (of karmic consequences). But, one may ask how might a disembodied separate soul substance be a doer and knower and enjoyer? We return this question below in the discussion of these views.

The focus of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika is on the self rather than the person. The individual self (jīva-ātma is their preferred term) occupies a central place in the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika ontology. Selves are really distinct individuals and do not merge into one ultimate reality at liberation. Much attention has been paid to the Nyāya arguments for the existence of the self, the ways of knowing the self, the characteristics of the self and the means to liberation. Let us begin by noting Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.10, which provides the famous ‘characteristics of the self’ as well as the basis of the inferential proof for the existence of the self:

Desire, aversion, volition (prayatna), pleasure, pain, and cognition are characteristics of the self. (NS 1.1.10)

Dasti writes that for Nyāya, agency is a special expression of the self’s different capacities and potentialities, which coherently ties together all its distinctive characteristics (2013, 114). Dasti is right to emphasise that the Nyāya self is much more than a subject of experience, that it is more importantly an agent – a doer and a knower. But Dasti and others in contemporary literature fail to emphasise that the distinctive qualities (viśeṣa) of the self, desire, cognition, pain, etc., are transitory and come into existence only when the self is in contact with the mind-sense organs-body complex. The substance-quality distinction which is the hallmark of Nyāya ontology, and an important tool that accounts for all the goods afforded by the Nyāya postulation of the self as distinct substance. As Dasti puts it:

Nyāya’s account of personhood involves substances and properties: an enduring substantial self with its fluctuating, world-engaging properties like memory, awareness, and volition allow for full personhood. Like Sāṃkhya, Nyāya allows for a self which endures through time, survives bodily death, and participates in ultimate liberation. But like the Buddhists, Nyāya’s person is directly engaged in the world. We are here now (2013: 135).

Dasti rightly uses the term personhood as signifying the self together with its properties and talks about person (rather than the self) as directly engaged in the world, but he fails to note that the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika account is plagued with problems. Problems arise when we pay attention to the fact that according to the Nyāya philosophers, although the self is a substance which is separate from the mind-sense organs-body complex, the self is totally dependent on this complex for its functionality. The mind-sense organs-body contact is needed to engender cognition, desire, etc., the self cannot bring cognition into being by itself. Reflection and memory too require the self to be in contact with the mind. Even the effort of the self is induced by the mind-sense-body contact, so it seems that the self cannot initiate any activity by itself. Self by itself is causally impotent (this is, indeed, exactly the Buddhist argument against the existence of the Nyāya self). It seems that the self by itself is just a bearer of its distinctive qualities which are induced by mind-sense organs-body contact. It is merely the passive observer of activity and remote carrier of the mediate (karmic) consequences of actions. Therefore, it is not the self by itself but the embodied self or person that is the agent, doer and originator of all actions and the enjoyer of the results of the action.

Furthermore, the distinctive qualities of the self are not its essential qualities. The self is without its qualities temporarily during sleep and similar states and loses these qualities permanently in the state of liberation (mokṣa). The self in the state of liberation is totally lacking in consciousness, Dravid describing it as ‘an insentient stone-like condition’ (1995, 1). The firm separation between the self and its qualities means that even though the latter are always changing, the self is totally unaffected by these changes. The Buddhist objects if the self remains totally unaffected by changes in its qualities it would not be able to register the changes, that is to say that the self by itself would not be able to perceive those changes (Watson, 2018, 337). This robs the self of its status as the cognizer (jñātṛ); it is rather the embodied worldly self or persons that perceive. So, it seems that the Nyāya self by itself can’t even be an experiencer. To ensure that self can really live up to its job description as an agent and experiencer the Nyāya discussion should have been focused on the embodied wordly self or person that is the agent (kartṛ), enjoyer (bhōktṛ) and cognizer (jñātṛ), rather than the self.

Most Nyāya philosophers claim that the agential self is not perceived but can only be inferred from the actions of the body. The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers offer the analogy of inferring the driver of a chariot when you see it moving along the road, avoiding potholes and other moving vehicles and persons. The analogy might remind us of Descartes’ analogy of a sailor in the ship. But as Descartes pointed out in the sixth Meditation that the connection between self (conceived of as the referent of ‘I’) and body has to be much more intimate than that of a sailor in the ship, otherwise the self would not feel pain when the body was hurt, but would merely perceive the damage just as a sailor perceives by sight if his ship is broken (Cottingham, 1996, 56). The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika self in the driver’s seat, independent and separate from the chariot (body), doesn’t quite do justice to the relationship between the self and its body.

The Nyāya philosophers have two options at this point. They must give up on the notion of the self as a separate substance untouched by its qualities. The talk of the remote self needs to be replaced with embodied selves (or persons). Or, they need to conceive of the self in the way the Bhaṭṭa Mīmāṃsā do as more closely connected with its qualities, so that it can undergo modification. The second option is available, but does it suffice? We will revisit this question after drawing out the conception of person implicit in Mīmāṃsā.

The stated goal of Mīmāṃsā is to interpret the statements of the Vedas, and thus to provide specific guidance to Hindus for performing the rituals and sacrifices they enjoin. The Mīmāṃsā philosophers agree with other Hindu schools that the true self that we cognize in self-recognition is a single thing that remains identical over time and thus it cannot be identified with the mind, body and the sense organs (See Taber 1992 for the Mīmāṃsā argument for a self). There is not much discussion of their notion of a person directly in the texts. However, there is implicit discussion of wordly persons in the context of the performance of duty (dharma) and religious rituals. A person is one who performs the rituals and follows the dharma, the doer of the deeds and enjoyer of the fruits of the deeds in accordance with the karma doctrine. Every religious ritual or sacrifice, according to the Mīmāṃsā philosophers, is said to have a specific result and characterized by an eligible persons (adhikāra) (Freschi, et al. 2019). The eligibility identifies the person who is enjoined by the Vedas to perform a religious ritual or sacrifice, has the means to perform it and will be the bearer of the karmic result accrued on account of the performance. This is particularly relevant in the context of Vedic sacrifices, since they always include many performers. An eligible person (adhikārin) is the one who is enjoined by the Vedas to perform the sacrifice and entitled to its result; the former implies that one can hear or read a Vedic injunction and understand oneself as the addressee, which, in turn, implies that one belongs to one of the social groups that is traditionally expected to study the Vedas. Being eligible further implies having physical ability (see Exegetic Aphorisms 6.1.42) and material resources (Exegetic Aphorisms 6.7.18–20) to organize the performance of a sacrifice (Freschi, et al. 2019). The latter, the entitlement to the result of the successful performance of a sacrifice is automatically guaranteed by the law of karma. This notion of a person implicit in this discussion of injunctions by Mīmāṃsā philosophers suggests that persons are embodied beings, belonging to a certain social class, possessing material wealth or otherwise, the bearers of karmic residues and the enjoyers of karmic results.

The Bhaṭṭa Mīmāṃsā, specifically Kumārila, argues that the self can undergo transformation even though it is eternal. Pleasure, pain etc. are qualities of the self, changes in these qualities entail a change in the self, but it is mere qualitative change. The self can be transformed but it remains numerically identical through the change in its qualities. Some aspects of the self are permanent, for example its consciousness, existence and substantiality, but other aspects such as pleasure, pain etc. undergo change. The self, Kumārila says, can be compared to a piece of gold that can be remoulded into a necklace or earrings or a gold coin. The stuff of which the self is composed is eternal, just like the eternal gold atoms. The self can change, but to count as the same self there can be no change in whatsoever in its essence, it must remain the very same substance. In this sense, the self remains a pure subject untainted by physicality. The Vedic assumption that the self is a separate soul substance is difficult to square with the conception of the self as cognizer, agent and the enjoyer. The Hindu philosophers who want to maintain this conception must reject the assumption of an eternal separate soul substance. An embodied self or person, by contrast, is a more suitable candidate for it can be the cognizer and characterized by agency and by enjoyment.

2. Unorthodox Conceptions of Persons

2.1 Jaina

Among the non-Hindu traditions, we begin with Jaina conception of persons because it is closest to the Hindu conception, specifically that of the Bhaṭṭa Mīmāṃsā and Sāṃkhya schools. Like the Sāṃkhya, the Jainas are essentially dualistic. The universe is constituted by two kinds of things: living (jīva) and non-living (ajīva) akin to puruṣa anf prakṛti. The self is described in Jaina from the noumenal and the phenomenal points of view. From the ultimate or noumenal points of view the self or the soul is pure and perfect, characterised by pure consciousness. It is a simple, immaterial and formless substance. From the phenomenal point of view, the soul is described as life force (prāna) which in conjunction the non-living forces is manifested in various life forms, including human persons. The Jainas posit only four non-living (ajīva) forces: matter or pudgala which is manifested as karma, time, space and movement (Kalghatgi, 1965). The coming together of these things is the Jaina conception of life as pervading all aspects of the natural world. Each life-form stands within a hierarchy of ascent from elemental beings, microbes and plants, worms, insects and the array of fish, reptiles, amphibians and mammals all the way to persons. The nature of the next birth is dependent of the actions performed in the immediate past body, plants and microbes can be reborn higher up in the hierarchy, or mammals can be demoted to lower forms. Persons too depending on whether their actions are virtuous or vicious can be reborn in a heavenly realm, or suffer torture in one of the seven hells. Persons at the top of the hierarchy, are unique in that they are able to perform the karmic necessary purgations to attain freedom or liberation (kevala), the highest end which is break free from the cycle of birth and rebirth. The story so far is not very different from what we find in the Hindu texts, except that karma is literally a material force.

The Jainas also agree with the Bhaṭṭa Mīmāṃsā that the essence and the qualities of the self are not totally separate from each other. They are two aspects of the same thing: one and the same self substance is unchanging and eternal when viewed from one point of view, and changing when viewed from another point of view. Its permanence is indexed to its essence and its impermanence to its qualities to allow for the very same self to be transformed through the cycle of birth and rebirth. Though there is much similarity between Jaina and the Bhaṭṭa Mīmāṃsā view, there is a curious difference. The Jainas think that though the self is immaterial, it changes it size according to the body with which it is associated. The self, so to say, fits the body it is housed in.

Again, though there is not much explicit discussion of persons in the Jaina tradition, the notion of a person is present as a moral agent with the capacity for attaining the highest freedom or liberation. Persons alone have the capacity to escape the cycle of birth and rebirth. Moral agency requires sensitivity to the nature of our world, according to which all living beings are said to be interconnected. This brings with it a moral obligation to respect all living beings including plants and not be unscrupulous in using natural resources. What makes us the same person over time is the soul substance, so the Jainas would also be classified as Non-Reductionists about persons in contemporary parlance.

2.2 Buddhist

The next group of philosophers to consider in this section are the Buddhists. The Buddhist tradition is unique in having a clear concept of a person as distinct from a self. Mark Siderits sums up the Buddhist distinction between persons and selves succinctly: “By ‘self’ (ātman) they understand whatever counts as the essence of the psychophysical complex, while by ‘person’ (pudgala) they understand the psychophysical complex as a whole” (2019, 303). It is well-known that the Buddhists reject the self, but it is not so well known that some Buddhists defended the reality of persons. There are many different Buddhist schools and the most well-known for an ardent defenders of persons, against fellow Buddhists, are called Pudgalavādins or personalists. The main impetus for the introduction of persons in Buddhist philosophy, in the absence of selves, is the need for a bearer of moral responsibility. We need a bearer to support the notion of moral responsibility, which is a constitutive element of their theory of karma and rebirth. Buddhists believe in rebirth without appeal to transmigration of self. All Buddhists allude to the Buddha’s talk of persons in the Bhārahārasūtra (the sūtra on the bearer of the burden) as one of the most important reasons to consider the question about the reality of persons. The text reads as follows:

I am going to teach you, O monks, the burden, the taking up of the burden, the laying down of the burden, and the bearer of the burden. Listen to it, pay attention carefully and well. I am going to speak. Of what does the burden consist? It consists of the five constituents to which one clings. Which five? The constituent to which one clings that consists of corporeality, [and] the [four] constituents to which one clings that consist of [affective] sensation, ideation, the conditioning factors, and cognition. Of what does the taking up of the burden consist? It consists of craving, which leads to rebirth [and] which, accompanied by desire for joys, takes delight here and there. Of what does the laying down of the burden consist? It is the total elimination, the abandonment, the removal, the exhaustion, the avoidance, the cessation, the extinction, and the disappearance of that very craving which leads to rebirth [and] which, accompanied by desire for joys, takes delight here and there. Of what does the bearer of the burden consist? One could say: ‘A person’, i.e., that sir who has such a name, who has such an origin(/birth), who belongs to such a family(/lineage), who has such a livelihood, who experiences such pleasure and pain, who has such a long life span, who remains for such a long time, whose life has such an end. [I have thus] answered to what I [promised to] say, i.e., “I am going to teach you, O monks, the burden, the taking up of the burden, the laying down of the burden, and the bearer of the burden”. The Blessed One said this. Having said this, the Sugata, the Teacher, further said this: “Having laid down the heavy burden, one would not take up another one, [for] taking up the burden is suffering, [while] laying down the burden is bliss. Having, due to the exhaustion of all fetters, eliminated all craving [and] thoroughly known all substrates [of existence], one no [longer] falls into rebirth.” (Eltschinger 2014: 457).

The originality of this sūtra lies in introducing the notion of a burden-bearer (bhārahāra) defined as a ‘person’ (pudgala). In the text, the term ‘burden’ is interpreted as desire or craving that is the root cause of morally wrong action, which in turn is the cause of rebirth and suffering according to the Buddhist doctrine of karma. The person is introduced in the original sūtra as the bearer of moral desert.

The controversy over persons raged among Indian Buddhists for more than a millennium. The question is whether the ‘person’ in the sūtra is to be interpreted as ultimately real, as Pudgalavādins (Personalists) did, or, as only conventionally real, as the mainstream Abhidharma Buddhists did. According to the Abhidharma doctrine, the only things that are ultimately real are the indivisible, momentary physical and mental dharmas (best understood as tropes; see Ganeri 2001). Everything else that can be decomposed into parts, physically or conceptually, is only conventionally real. Siderits explains the Ābhidharmika position thus:

A statement is said to be ultimately true iff it corresponds to how things are independently of the concepts one happens to employ. Such a statement can neither assert nor presuppose the existence of any composite entity… . Many entities in people’s folk ontology are not ultimately real: chariots, forests, trees, pots, and so on. Such entities are said to be conventionally real, mere conceptual fictions. (2019: 314)

Different schools in the Indian Buddhist tradition have different strategies for making sense of the Buddha’s thought and talk of persons. The Pudgalavādins are alone in holding that persons are ultimately or substantially real. The dispute between the Pudgalavādins and their opponents is not just an attempt to lay claim to ‘what the Buddha taught’, but it is also motivated by philosophical considerations about consistency with the no-self doctrine and other important Buddhist theses, for example impermanence, dependent origination, and the karma theory. The Pudgalavādin position on persons is best placed in the Emergentist camp, they try to steer a middle path between Hindu Non-Reductionism (eternalism) and Abhidharma Buddhist Reductionism (annihilationism) (Ganeri, 2012; Carpenter, 2015). They regard persons as emergent entities not reducible to mental and psychological and mental atoms (dharmas), although they depend on those atoms. The Abhidharma and Madhyamaka traditions hold very different views about persons.

According to the Mādhyamikas, the pragmatic usefulness of person-talk is important as a catechetic device for teaching the doctrine to the uninitiated. The Buddha’s talk about persons and other continuing entities in the sūtras is aimed at ordinary people who, due to ignorance are beset with the false view of a self. As Vincent Eltschinger puts it, “these preliminary and merely provisional teachings are meant to offer a transition between the adhesion to worldly beliefs and the intuition of universal emptiness” (2014, 470). The Prāsaṇgika Mādhyamikas not only deny the inherent existence of persons at the ultimate level but also deny the inherent existence of persons at even the conventional level. In doing so the Prāsaṇgikas take themselves to be faithful to the original teachings of Nāgārjuna, the founder of Madhyamaka. Nāgārjuna denies both that the person is the same as the psychophysical constituents to which the Buddhist Reductionists try to reduce it and that it is other than those constituents in the way that the Hindu Non-Reductionists claim. Nāgārjuna warns: “Beyond good and evil, profound and liberating, this [doctrine of emptiness] has not been tasted by those who fear what is entirely groundless.” In contemporary terms, Madhymaka position can be likened to minimalism (Perrett, 2002). As Johnston argues in “the particular case of personal identity, minimalism implies that any metaphysical view of persons which we might have is either epiphenomenal or a redundant basis for our practice of making judgements about personal identity and organizing our practical concerns around this relation” (Johnston 1997, 150).

Nāgārjuna, and his follower Candrakīrti denied that persons are reducible to the aggregates and that they are distinct from the aggregates. They are irrealists about selves and persons. According to Candrakīrti the proper explanation of this is that our everyday conception of self or person consists in ‘an appropriative act of laying claim to the elements of the psycho-physical aggregate, an act that does not require there to be any object that is the person, nor any of the usual apparatus of reference to things. The term ‘I’ does not refer to selves or persons. In support of Candrakīrti’s view, Ganeri notes that that Reductionist accounts fail to explain the significance of the distinction between the anticipation of one’s own future pain and the concern one feels for the future pain of another (2007, 195). He further claims that irrealists are able to avoid this problem by substituting for a positive account of the metaphysics of persons an account of how one’s sense of self arises from the psycho-physical stream. According to this irrealist account, in spite of appearances the function of person-talk is not to talk about persons, or selves, but to appropriate experiences, emotions, and bodies.

The Ābhidharmikas, on the other hand, did not think of ‘person’ as a useful pragmatic device or skillful means but emphasized that it is nothing but a conventional designation, a mere name for a group of psychophysical aggregates, ultimately the collections of dharmas The Abhidharma position has been classified by Siderits as Reductionism. Parfit claims that on the Reductionist view, “persons do exist. But they exist only in the way in which nations exist. Persons are not, as we mistakenly believe fundamental. This view in this sense is more impersonal” (1984, 445). So-called Abhidharma Reductionism about persons was first championed by Mark Siderits in his classic paper “Buddhist Reductionism” (1997, see also Perett 2002). More recently, this interpretation has been challenged in literature. Chadha (2021) argues that Vasubandhu’s Abhidharma is best construed as an Eliminativism about persons. Vasubandhu’s argument against the Pudgalavādins is based on the causal efficacy principle: everything that is real or substantial (dravya) is causally efficient, having specifiable cause-and-effect relations with other entities (see, for example, Gold 2015). Everything else is a conceptual construct, a mere convention (prajñapti), and thus should be rejected as only conventionally real. Vasubandhu’s uses the same principle to argue against the self as posited by the Hindu philosophers (in particular the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika). Selves too, according to Vasubandhu, are only conventionally real.

What does Vasubandhu mean by saying that persons are only conventionally real? The term person is just a collective term for a group of aggregates, ultimately collection of physical and mental dharmas, just as milk is a term for a collection of tropes—such as whitishness, liquidness, and potability. For Vasubandhu, only dharmas or tropes exist ultimately or substantially. All other things exist in name only. Siderits explains the idea thus: ‘The point about “chariot” and “person” is that they are opaque enumerative expressions: when taken at face value they seem to denote individual entities, only further analysis shows them to be ways of referring to a plurality of entities in a certain arrangement’ (2019: 313). So, persons, chariots and pots are conceptual fictions. Siderits adds, ‘The idea here is that the enumerative term “pot” represents a concept that has proven useful for creatures with certain interests (in this case, for storage) and certain cognitive limitations (such as the inability to track all the many parts)… . Now conventional truths do typically guide one to successful practice. This would be difficult to explain if the truth-makers for conventionally true statements consisted of nothing but mere conceptual fictions. Thus conventionally real entities are said to supervene on ultimately real entities’ (2019: 314–15). The idea of conventional realities like persons being useful fictions was introduced in Siderits (1997) as a faithful interpretation of Abhidharma. Recently, this too has been contested (Chadha 2021). Some conventional entities may well be useful fictions, for example, chariots, armies and nations. But persons cannot be on that list. Persons inherit the work of the selves, so they are just as dangerous as selves. The Buddhist Eliminativist about selves cannot and should not condone persons.

2.3 Cārvāka

The last group of philosophers to consider in this section are the Cārvākas. Cārvāka philosophers are materialists in the classical Indian tradition and the most ardent critics of the Vedas and scriptural authority among the heterodox schools. They deny the existence of the self, as the essence of the person and with it the possibility of transmigration and rebirth. They are the only philosophers in the classical Indian tradition that rejected the doctrine of karma and liberation or freedom. Death of the body is the end of the person. The Cārvāka philosophers are best thought of as defending animalism or the biological view of personal identity. The Cārvāka philosophers argued that a person, just like everything else in the world, is just a body, an aggregate of material elements qualifies by consciousness. Consciousness is an emergent property of the four material elements (earth, water, fire and air) in a specific proportion. The Cārvākas offer the analogy of an Indian after dinner treat called “paan” which releases red colour when chewed even though none of its ingredients (betel leaf, chopped betelnut (areca) and slaked lime (calcium hydroxide)), are red. Just so consciousness emerges when several material elements come together in a specific proportion that constitutes a person. Their view is surprisingly close to modern day physicalism. They did not believe in the existence of the soul as the essence of the individual person or any other immaterial substance. The main argument against the existence of the self rests on an epistemological principle: perception is the only source of knowledge. The argument can be stated thus:

P1: The self cannot be perceived.
P2: Whatever exists must be perceived.
C: The self does not exist.

Another argument offered by the Cārvākas for the claim that a person is identical with the body is a linguistic argument. Consider sentences: “I am youthful”, “I am stout”. In these sentences the “I” refers to the body. Linguistic arguments were quite common in classical Indian philosophy because of the influence of the grammarians and also because the Indian philosophers paid attention to common speech behaviour which presumably expresses what common sense teaches us. With respect to the conception of a self, philosophers in the Indian tradition paid attention to the usages employing the first-person pronoun as data that any philosophical theory of the self must account for. The Nyāya philosophers also relied on arguments from language to respond to the Cārvāka philosophers. The Nyāya philosophers claim that the referent of ‘I’, whatever it is, appears in our consciousness as something internal. Therefore, ‘I’ cannot refer to the body. Furthermore, the word ‘I’ in each person’s mouth refers to (picks out, denotes) that person uniquely. The referent of ‘I’ cannot be a generic body (material object) because it does not refer to the body of another person. Nor can ‘I’ refer to one’s own body because properties of the body (physical characteristics) are not sufficient to identify a unique person. Any physical property, for example, the shape of the body is an essential property of the body, but other bodies can have exactly the same shape. If the term ‘I’ referred properties of the body, two persons who have exactly the same shape would be equally good candidates for the referent of a given use of ‘I’ by either of them. Therefore, ‘I’ cannot refer to the body. And lastly, the Naiyāyikas challenged the Cārvākas to account for phrases like ‘my body’. Such phrases suggest that there is a distinction between me and the body, it implies that there is something, the referent of ‘I’, a self, which has or possesses a body. The Cārvākas dismiss such phrases as ‘my body’ are mere metaphors and do not indicate that there is a self that is separate from the body. It is worth noting that the Naiyāyikas and other Hindu philosophers have a similar problem accounting for statements such as “I am fat”, “I am tall” etc.

To conclude, it is worth noting that apart from Abhidharma Buddhism and Advaita Vedānta, most Buddhist philosophers and other classical Indian philosophers accept that persons are real.

3. What do we need persons for?

Contemporary philosophical investigation into questions about the nature of persons and personal identity may seem very far from these ancient discussions in classical Indian philosophy. The Non-Reductionist view so popular among the mainstream Hindus is not in favour these days. The most important reason to deny that we are separately existing non-physical soul substances is that such things are impossible to trace through space-time. If we are essentially non-physical souls, there still would be no way to know that you now are one and the same person that committed the crime at an earlier time. If judgments about personal identity were grounded on judgements about the identities of immaterial souls, then personal identity would be completely mysterious (Perry 1978, 402–3). It is true that we sometimes lack epistemic access to metaphysical truths. But if this were the right metaphysical theory it should undermine all confidence in our judgments of identity in a way that seems bizarre (Shoemaker and Tobia, forthcoming). That might seem bizarre from a contemporary point of view, but the Hindu Non-Reductionists are not going to be worried by these objections. Most classical Indian philosophers, except the Cārvākas, agree that ignorance about our own natures— about who and what we are—is the cause of our bondage in the cycle of birth and rebirth and the suffering that comes with it. The Upaniṣadic sages were no strangers to metaphors and mysteries. Their strategy was to heighten the mystery associated with knowledge, “not so much in a self‐serving secretiveness or a disinclination to share the knowledge that gives them power but as response to a deep respect for the power of that knowledge, and a recognition of the need not to be frivolous either with the knowledge itself or with its potential recipients” (Ganeri 2007,13). The Katha Upaniṣad puts it thus: “Hidden in all the beings, this self is not visibly displayed. Yet, people of keen vision see him with eminent and sharp minds.” (KU 3.12).

Most contemporary philosophers assume that Reductionism is true. The Reductionists draw inspiration from Locke, perhaps the first philosopher in the history of Western philosophy to put forward a version of the psychological continuity view that was developed by Parfit. But there is another more important point that Locke brought centre-stage to the discussion about personal identity: theorizing about persons is motivated by a distinctive normative concern about moral responsibility. Locke writes:

In this personal Identity is founded all the Right and Justice of Reward and Punishment; Happiness and Misery, being that, for which every one is concerned for himself…the Apostle tells us, that at the Great Day, when every one shall receive according to his doings, the secrets of all Hearts shall be laid open. The Sentence shall be justified by the consciousness all Persons shall have, that they themselves in what Bodies soever they appear, or what Substances soever that consciousness adheres to, are the same, that committed those Actions, and deserve that Punishment for them. (Locke 1690 [1975, 341–347])

In the classical Indian context, as we have seen above, it is the same concerns that led to the search for an eternal soul as the essence of persons by the Hindu philosophers and also motivated the Buddhist personalists to introduce persons (pudgala) as ‘burden-bearers’. Classical Indian philosophers did not invoke God but relied on karma to dole out just rewards and punishments in the course of the cycle of birth and rebirth. Normative concerns about responsibility are thus an important motivating concern across the East-West divide.

Contemporary philosophers, however, have broadened the scope of normative concerns beyond that of moral responsibility. Shoemaker (2007, 318–9) helpfully presents a list of practical concerns that are presumably grounded in personal identity which includes moral responsibility but adds many more: anticipation of future experiences; special self-concern for one’s own future self; surviving death and anticipation of the afterlife; compensation, maximizing utility intrapersonally but not interpersonally; self-conscious emotions (pride, regret, etc.); special non-derivative concern and other-regarding emotions I have for a certain limited network of people, all of whom bear certain sorts of special relations to me; first-person reidentification and self-regarding emotions I have for my past and future self. This long list is likely to put pressure on any single criterion of personal identity.

The psychological continuity criterion originally proposed by Locke and developed most famously by Parfit (1984) does well to account for moral responsibility and anticipation of the afterlife and survival but falls short on compensation and maximizing utility intrapersonally. The animalist or biological continuity criterion does not fare well in accounting for concern about moral responsibility, but it does much better on compensation and special non-derivative concern and other-regarding emotions I have for a certain limited network of people, all of whom bear certain sorts of special relations to me (DeGrazia 2005). These are not the only competitors though. Some might suggest, as do Tierney et al., that we can be pluralists about personal identity. Rather ‘empirical evidence and philosophical thought experiments indicate that judgments about personal identity are regimented by two different criteria, one in terms of psychological traits and one that largely conforms to biological criteria’ (Tierney et al. 2014, 198). Shoemaker (2007) goes further to settle for a wide-ranging pluralism in the face of the disunity of our practical concerns. But Shoemaker stops short of giving up on persons and person-related concerns in the hope that there is a theory (or theories!) of the relation between personal identity and our person-related practices and concerns. He says, ‘several concessions may be required, including admission, perhaps, of (a) the irrelevance of certain powerful and popular criteria of personal identity for (at least some of) our practices and concerns, (b) the ultimate disunity of these practices and concerns (such that multiple types of theories of the relation between them and the metaphysics may be called for), and/or (c) the possibility of different types of rational grounding—justification and rendering-possible—where justification may actually be off the table altogether for some practices and concerns’ (2007, 354).

Some others though develop a different approach to the problem of personal identity which upends the debate between the supporters of animalism and psychological continuity theorists. One example of such an approach is the “characterisation” criterion that has been recently developed by Marya Schectman (2014). In her words, personal identity “just consists in the fact that the person before us now is viewed as, treated as, and acts as the same locus of normative concerns as the [previous] person” (Schectman 2014, 152). Although Schectman has only four normative concerns in mind from the above list (moral responsibility, special self-interested concern, compensation, and survival), her move ensures that these normative concerns trump any metaphysical considerations. According to Schectman, a person is, whatever it is, that is the locus of our normative concerns. Another recent view that deserves a mention in this context is the Minimalist view, defended in a series of papers by Mark Johnston (1987, 1992, 1997). According to Minimalism, the metaphysical “deep” facts of personal identity are irrelevant to the justification of our person-related practices and practical concerns. Our practices are grounded not on a metaphysics of persons but on our circumstances and needs. Johnston writes: “in the particular case of personal identity, minimalism implies that any metaphysical view of persons which we might have is either epiphenomenal or a redundant basis for our practice of making judgements about personal identity and organizing our practical concerns around this relation” (Johnston 1997, 150). The characterisation criterion and Minimalism extol the primacy of our normative practices and concerns suggesting the latter

may actually authoritatively constrain, shape, or even be immune or irrelevant to one’s theory of personal identity. This is a general methodological dispute about the proper direction of argumentation in the arena of personal identity and ethics. (from section 7 of the entry personal identity and ethics, Winter 2021 Edition)

This is, however, not the only dispute. The biggest problem is that we have no settled conception of persons or personal identity. I’ve discussed four different views here, and there are many more. There seems to be no clear winner.

Revisionism about personal identity has been popular since Parfit’s Reasons and Persons. But contemporary philosophers stop short of questioning our normative concerns and practices. Parfit flirted with revisionism about normative concerns about practices in proposing the Extreme Claim, according to which, one’s moral and prudential concerns cannot be grounded without a deep separate fact about personal identity. But Parfit thinks that another view is also defensible. This view results from the combination of reductionism with the Moderate Claim, which says that our moral and prudential concerns may well be grounded in what does matter in personal identity. This, according to Parfit, is psychological connectedness and/or continuity (1984, 311). Parfit believed that the Extreme Claim is defensible, he retracted it only because he did not have an argument to defend it. But if we run with the Extreme Claim it entails that our person-related practices and concerns are ungrounded, period. This opens the door for reconsideration of our person-related practices. However, this option is ignored in contemporary philosophy. Philosophers, as we saw, are willing to consider pluralism about criteria of personal identity, pluralism about theories of the relation between personal identity and person-related practices. Shoemaker, as we saw above, is also willing to consider the disunity of practices. But no one is willing to consider revising the practices themselves. But why are the practices considered sacrosanct? P.F. Strawson balks at such a question. He writes, ‘I shall reply, first, that such a question could seem real only to one who had utterly failed to grasp the purport of … the fact of our natural human commitment to ordinary inter-personal attitudes. This commitment is part of the general framework of human life, not something that can come up for review’ (1974: 14, emphasis added). Strawson is not only claiming that it is hard for us to give up our interpersonal attitudes and concerns, but he also thinks to give up these would be to give up on our humanity.

A thoroughgoing revisionist willing to explore the consequences of endorsing the Extreme Claim would reconsider some of our person-related concerns and practices and attitudes. That is exactly the strategy adopted by the Abhidharma Buddhist Reductionist. Buddhist Reductionists are willing to revisit our ordinary normative practices and concerns, especially those to do with self-concern and the special concern that we have for those we love dearly. The Buddhists do recognize that it is built-in precondition of our form of life that we have self-concern and special concern for our loved ones. That is why the Buddhists do not recommend giving up on this self-concern or special concern for our loved ones. Rather they recommend expanding similar concern to all others, including one’s enemies. And they do not think that such an expansion comes easy to us given our human nature: it has to be inculcated by extensive training in ‘spiritual exercises’ which include meditation, knowledge of the Buddhist texts and insight. This expansion is not to be thought of as the giving up of one’s humanity, as feared by Strawson, rather the idea is to enlarge our humanity.

It is important for us to realise that any set of norms or value system is not immune to revision, just because it is, as Strawson puts, ‘part of the general framework of human life’. The problem is that there is no such ‘general’ framework. The normative concerns and practices of human societies are varied, and not such as to be weighed systematically against each other. The practices we regard as important because they are ‘part of the general framework of human life’ cannot be justified as having been chosen by ideally rational beings. Persons as moral beings are a product of our histories and culturally constrained preferences. Imagine being in a world in which the Buddhist thesis of the no self was widely held. Or consider a culture where the really significant entities are family lines, and it is axiomatic that children are justly to be held responsible for their parents’ wrongdoing. What evidence is there against such a code, or in favour of ‘our’ belief that persons are separate individuals, responsible for their own crimes. It is therefore not clear that we should assume that all normative systems must include some special concern for one’s future self and those that we love dearly. The anticipation of one’s own future self or one’s survival are also up for question. These important assumptions that often goes unnoticed because they basically treated as “part of the general framework”. Buddhist philosophy invites us to ask the question: Is there such a framework?


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