Philosophy of Science in Latin America
When philosophy of science began as a professional field in the late 1940s, contributions from Latin America joined the forefront of the international debate right away. Philosophers of science from the subcontinent have expanded their presence ever since. This article aims to provide an overview of philosophy of science in the subcontinent. The primary focus is on contributions produced in Latin America by thinkers living in the region, with an emphasis on “mainstream philosophy of science”—a discipline centered on the study of scientific knowledge, metaphysics, methodology, and values, broadly analytic in style, as exemplified by works published in high-quality journals such as Philosophy of Science, Erkenntnis, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, and Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science.
This entry has four parts. Section 1 provides historical background. Section 2 is devoted to philosophy of science activity in various regional centers through the early 1990s when the Internet and improved institutional resources “globalized” the practice of philosophy of science, greatly blurring earlier geographical separations. The two following sections focus on the last decades: Section 3 presents contributions to the general philosophy of science, and Section 4 reviews advances in the philosophy of special sciences. The final Section 5 briefly considers some of the difficulties and prospects for philosophy of science in Latin America.
In this article effort is made to provide an even-handed and objective picture, but of course only a selective sketch is possible, made of choices influenced by the authors’ interpretation of the field.
- 1. Historical Background
- 2. The Early Decades
- 3. General Philosophy of Science
- 4. Philosophy of Particular Sciences
- 5. Concluding Remarks
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Historical Background
It is useful to begin with a brief historical background. Science and scientific thought have long functioned in Latin America as beacons of civic hope and progress amidst multiple recurrent frustrations that vary in kind and texture from place to place. In most of the region, the Enlightenment ideals that fueled independence movements of the early nineteenth century were quickly disappointed by the chaos and general barbarism that followed in much of the region until the 1860s. It was different in Brazil, where emancipation from Europe occurred gradually and orderly during the century, but there too problems grew as did also tensions between the economic elite and the country’s leading liberal thinkers.
Reacting against expanding frustration, many Latin Americans saw a solution in the “scientific” ways of thinking dominant in the industrialized countries. In the 1850s a progressive philosophy was in full flight in the larger world, ready-made for Latin American visionaries: French Positivism, a doctrine of progress and secular religion, centered on hope in modern science, led by Auguste Comte. Committed to fighting the temptations of barbarism, the positivists sought to continue the project of the Enlightenment. Against the impulsive approach to decision-making then prevailing in most of Latin America, local positivists sought to extend scientific thought to philosophy and political action, convinced it would promote objectivity, rational consensus, publicly accessible cumulative truth in all spheres, along the material success characteristic of modern science. Between about 1870 and 1910 positivism took strong hold in much of Latin America, with an agenda that called for methodological improvement in the local practice of the natural sciences, medicine, and education, also greatly influencing activity in philosophy, history, art, and law (see, e.g., Frondizi 1943, Zea 1943–44, Nachman 1977, Quintanilla 2006). In Argentina, scientism and Comte’s philosophy had influential defenders, notably Domingo Faustino Sarmiento, many scientists (e.g., paleontologist Florentino Ameghino), physician-philosophers (e.g., José Ingenieros and Alejandro Korn), educators (e.g., Pedro Scalabrini), and lawyers (e.g., Carlos Octavio Bunge, whose nephew Mario A. Bunge would become an international figure in philosophy of science in the following century). A conviction these thinkers shared stated that a modern and efficient system of public education was indispensable for achieving the desired transformations. Interest in advancing the positivist approach grew to religious heights especially in Brazil, where it was championed by distinguished political figures, notably Miguel de Lemos, a reorganizer of the country’s curriculum and a decisive force in the construction of the first Humanity Temple for the propagation of Comte’s ideas in the world. When Brazil became a republic in 1889, positivist doctrine made its way to the new flag, the motto “Order and Progress” lifted from Comte’s writings—in Système de Politique Positive (1851), the preliminary discourse’s conclusion begins with the words “Love for principle, order for base, and progress for aim” (L’amour pour principe, l’ordre pour base, et le progrès pour but; p. 321).
The influence of positivism in Mexico was nearly as strong, particularly in education, as exemplified by the labors of the respected chemist and medical doctor Gabino Barreda, who banned religion and traditional philosophy from the school curriculum and centralized access to higher education and culture. In Chile, the brothers Jorge and Enrique Lagarrigue were two leading advocates of Comte’s philosophy and his Humanity Religion. In Colombia, Rafael Nuñez, an educational reformer and three times president of Colombia, actively promoted positivism, as did in Peru (with touches of Herbert Spencer’s evolutionism) such figures as Javier Prado, Manuel González Prada, Celso Bambarén, and Manuel Vicente Villarán. In Bolivia, positivism also had influential defenders from the 1870s through the 1890s, notably a circle of writers, “Círculo Literario”, in whose journal works by Charles Darwin, Luis Dumont, Ernst H. P. A. Haeckel and other naturalists appeared in translation.
With all this intellectual and progressive enthusiasm in the air, hopes of imminent general improvement ran high, but “positive” results were slow in coming. The expectations of economic advancement and civic improvement did not materialize as advertised. To compound matters, the devastation caused by the Great War in Europe badly compromised social faith in the products of science. Positivism waned accordingly in Latin America, replaced in the 1920s by a more radical social thought, especially Marxism, as well as approaches distrustful of naturalist reasoning (Bergsonian spiritualism, phenomenology, and later existentialism). Metaphysics unbridled by standard logic became dominant in many university circles.
Reactions to excessively “high philosophy” began to arise in the 1940s, helped by the arrival of thinkers from Europe, for example Juan David García Bacca in the cases of Ecuador, Mexico, and Venezuela, Hans Lindemann in Argentina, and Gilles-Gaston Granger in Brazil. Along the way came a revival of interest in logic, science-friendly epistemology, and the study of conceptual structures. Thanks to these developments, when philosophy of science became a professional field in the late 1940s, Latin America had some scientists and philosophers ready and willing to fully join their counterparts in Europe and North America. Since then, for the past seventy years, a number of philosophers of science based in Latin America, often in uncooperative environments, have managed to produce work of the highest international standards (something not so clearly apparent in the developing world in other branches of international philosophy).
By the mid 1990s, academic centers in Latin America began to benefit from the kind of world-wide interaction made possible by the Internet, electronic libraries, and improved forms of institutional support for integration and travel. With geographical and institutional barriers greatly reduced, the field expanded considerably. Over the last three decades virtually every theme in philosophy of science would develop a presence in works produced in Latin America. Dialogue and collaboration between researchers now transcend the traditional local boundaries. This new global environment makes less relevant the traditional geographical approach to philosophical production in the region. Accordingly, Sections 3 and 4, devoted to activity from the mid 1990s on, structure the subject around themes, concepts, and principles (rather than around geography and individuals).
2. The Early Decades
Philosophy of science developed a robust presence at Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México (UNAM), a major institution at the forefront of intellectual life in the country and the Spanish-speaking world. The discipline gained strength in the 1960s and early 1970s through the efforts of prominent faculty members, especially Fernando Salmerón, Luis Villoro, and Alejandro Rossi who encouraged rigor and clarity in philosophy and provided scholarship support to enable students to do post-graduate work in Europe, the United Kingdom, and the United States. Together they founded the journal Crítica in 1967, a choice venue for philosophy in Latin America and Spain. An influential work by Salmerón, La Filosofía y las Matemáticas, came out the following year. Major international seminars and meetings became a regular feature at UNAM’s Institute for Philosophical Investigations (Instituto de Investigaciones Filosóficas—IIF), which in the 1970s and 1980s hosted some now legendary seminars and short courses led by world-class figures. One of these international seminars focused on the history and philosophy of science, started by Mario Bunge (Argentina and Canada). IIF became the host of many spirited philosophical debates, those between Bunge and Héctor-Neri Castañeda (Guatemala and the United States) being among the most prominentely remembered. With Bunge’s help, in 1976 an epistemology forum was established—Asociación Mexicana de Epistemología. At the beginning of the 1970s, Mario Otero (Uruguay) formally joined IIF with a considerable effect on the studies of the philosophical history of science.
The structuralist approach came to Mexico in a big way with Carlos Ulises Moulines who moved to IIF from Munich in the mid-1970s. Born in Venezuela, he studied in Europe, first under the supervision of Jesús Mosterín in Barcelona and then of Wolfgang Stegmüller in Munich. His early focus was on the rise of the logical empiricist approach, particularly the projects of logical reconstruction of the empirical world variously advocated by Bertrand Russell, Rudolf Carnap, and Nelson Goodman; Moulines developed these investigations in his first monograph, La Estructura del Mundo Sensible (1973). He took an interest in integrating some of Stegmüller’s original contributions into earlier structuralist work by Patrick Suppes in the United States and Gunther Ludwig in Germany, an effort displayed by some of his articles from this period (notably Moulines 1975, 1976). Responding to the historical turn in philosophy of science, Moulines, like Joseph Sneed in the United States and Stegmüller in Germany, focused on the issue of theory change. He devoted much of his research during the 1970s and 1980s to the dynamics of theories, applying the resources of diachronic structuralist reconstruction and Kuhnian analysis (in terms of disciplinary matrices) to the development of Newtonian mechanics and equilibrium thermodynamics. The resulting investigations were presented in the book Exploraciones Metacientíficas (1982). Moulines became an important intellectual force at IIF where he stayed for over a decade, engaged in cutting-edge research that made him a leading figure in the international structuralist movement. In Moulines’ view, scientific theories are cultural constructs of philosophical interest. He regards philosophy of science as a discipline whose epistemology is primarily interpretive rather than prescriptive or descriptive—a theorization about theorizations. A good proportion of the philosophy of science conducted at IIF during his tenure was directly influenced by him. A relevant point for present purposes is that his work in Mexico during these years reached the highest levels within the worldwide structuralist movement. In 1984 Moulines left the country, first to Bielefeld University, then to Berlin, and finally to the Center for Mathematical Philosophy at Ludwig-Maximilians University, Munich, where he became Stegmüller’s successor and is now a Professor Emeritus. Many of his subsequent publications had a lasting impact in Latin America, notably An Architectonic for Science: The Structuralist Program (Balzer, Moulines, and Sneed 1987), along many papers.
Research seminars at IIF continued to develop and strengthen in the 1980s with a series of international symposia of philosophy started by Enrique Villanueva and continued by León Olivé, a venture of impressive scale that brought together world-class figures from many parts of Latin America, the United States, Britain, and Europe. The high-quality interactions these venues generated proved remarkably fruitful as starting points of much subsequent research activity in Mexico and elsewhere in the subcontinent. This period was also marked by institutional investment in specialized research libraries and the reinforcement of publishing programs at UNAM and other institutions in Mexico. Scholarship programs helped researchers and students spend periods at major international centers. At IIF philosophical research reached a level of support never seen before in Latin America. Significant papers and monographs began to flow regularly from seminars on general philosophy of science, the philosophy of physics, and the philosophy of biology.
Activity in the field also became more diverse at IIF in the 1980s. One major area focused on the limits of scientific knowledge, represented by Luis Villoro’s 1982 critique of scientism in Creer, Saber, Conocer, where he advocates a revaluation of “wisdom” (characterized as knowledge drawn from lived experiences), which in Villoro’s view is richly found in the “wise men” of traditional cultures; in this book he explores how human reason has operated throughout history and the extent to which it has led to situations of domination and/or emancipation from subjection.
It is important to emphasize that the professionalization of the philosophy of science in Mexico was achieved mainly through the creation of specialized degree programs. Nowadays, the Posgrado en Filosofía de la Ciencia, founded at UNAM in 1993, is the program where most of the new generations now working in the discipline in Mexico have been trained.
An influential textbook by Gilles-Gaston Granger, Lógica e Filosofia das Ciências —first published in 1955—is acknowledged as the first introduction to the field in Portuguese. A disciple of Gaston Bachelard, Granger taught at the University of São Paulo (USP) from 1947 to 1953 and was a major force in the development of philosophy of science in Brazil. His work favored a historically-oriented approach hospitable to the Anglo-Saxon analytic style. Back in Europe he associated himself with various philosophical and social projects; in 1986 he was elected to the Chair of Comparative Epistemology at the Collège de France. The research projects Granger started in Brazil continued after his tenure, especially thanks to the efforts of Oswaldo Porchat.
In 1964 a military coup led to government action eradicating academics suspected of leftist sympathies, seriously disrupting many fields, including philosophy of science. Nevertheless, faculty groups were soon able to restore activity. In 1970, at USP João Paulo Monteiro managed to start Ciência e Filosofia, a journal dedicated to logic and philosophy of science from a plurality of perspectives. Revitalization of the discipline continued throughout the decade with timely research projects, often carried out in conjunction with international visits and courses, notably ones organized by Porchat, first at USP and after 1975 at State University of Campinas (UNICAMP), where he headed a new unit, Centro de Lógica, Epistemologia e História da Ciência (CLE), whose members included Zeljko Loparic and other distinguished scholars. In 1977 CLE launched the prestigious journal Manuscrito, supplemented in 1980 by Cadernos de Filosofia e História da Ciência, and in 1987 by a book series (Coleção CLE). CLE quickly became a symbol of hope for philosophers and historians of science as well as logicians. In particular, CLE is involved in the articulation of “Paraconsistent Logic”, a field Newton C. da Costa began to develop in the late 1950s and early 1960s when he was working at Federal University of Paraná. Da Costa is one of the most charismatic and energetic thinkers in Latin America, a world-class figure in mathematics, logic, and philosophy of science, with a widely recognized reputation for original works on non-classical logics, the axiomatization of scientific theories, and structuralist philosophy of science, orientations that continue to be active in Brazil with such figures as Itala D’Ottaviano and Walter Carnielli.
In philosophy of science CLE supports significant research on the character and structure of modern science as well as its concepts and theories—conducted from a variety of perspectives, including investigations in science teaching and the uses of philosophy of science in education. Critical dialogue has been fostered through seminars, distinguished international visits, research funding, faculty and student exchanges, interdisciplinary studies, and the publication of monographs and papers by Brazilian authors as well as translations of major works into Portuguese. Post-graduate studies and postdoctoral fellowships in logic and philosophy of science are thriving accordingly at UNICAMP. One scheme developed by CLE to attract promising faculty recently graduated from institutions worldwide produced excellent results. In the 1980s Michel Ghins and Harvey Brown energized analytic activity on space-time physics. Steven French did likewise in advancing the model-theoretic approach and the metaphysics of quantum mechanics at Campinas. With the help of these and other recruits, philosophy of physics, mathematics, and formal approaches to the philosophy of science thrived. At Campinas, French and da Costa started a long-lasting collaboration that proved remarkably fertile, resulting in influential contributions to current debates on the metaphysics of quantum mechanics, structuralism, and the semantic approach to theories, as well as a fresher way of looking at the concept of truth (“pragmatic truth” and “partial truth”). These collaborations led to many papers (Da Costa and French 1989, 1990, 1991, 1993) as well as a book in 2003, Science and Partial Truth: A Unitary Approach to Models and Scientific Reasoning, which received international acclaim for the light it casts on philosophical logic, structuralism, and realism. Brown and French made Brazil their country, and it is easy to imagine how different the geography of philosophy of physics and mathematics might have turned out had circumstances in Brazil been a little kinder to academic life in the 1980s. Together with da Costa, the international recruits and the local talents they began to nurture would have probably turned CLE and USP (where Otávio Bueno had worked with da Costa) into top centers for philosophy of science in the world. Destiny dictated otherwise, however; Ghins left to a professorship at Louvain-la-Neuve, Belgium; Brown moved to a distinguished career at Oxford, where he is now professor of the philosophy of physics; and French went to the United States and then back to England where he is now professor of philosophy of science at the University of Leeds and Editor-in-Chief of The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science. Brown and French have each served terms as presidents of the prestigious British Society for the Philosophy of Science. Happily, all these international old members maintain productive ties with Brazilian groups. CLE has continued to prosper over the last two decades.
Philosophical activity has expanded in Brazil at many other institutions since the 1990s, as described in the following sections.
2.3. Andean Countries
As with the previous countries, the field developed a presence in the Andean countries in the early days of professional philosophy of science.
In Venezuela, Juan David García Bacca, a critic of Francisco Franco, was forced to leave Spain and arrived in Caracas in 1946 after periods in Ecuador and Mexico. He led a productive career at the Faculty of Letters and Philosophy, Central University (Universidad Central de Venezuela, UCV). In the mid-1930s, after completing a doctoral dissertation on the logico-genetic structure of the physical sciences, García Bacca joined the Vienna Circle. In Latin America he became a prolific writer, his works including Teoría de la relatividad (1941), La física (1962), Historia filosófica de la ciencia (1963), Teoría y metateoría de la ciencia, Vol. I (1977) and Vol II (1984). He remained a major force in Caracas until 1971. In the 1970s and 1980s, Andrés Kalnay led a small group interested in the foundations of quantum mechanics, first at UCV’s School of Physics and then at Venezuela’s leading center for scientific research, Instituto Venezolano de Investigaciones Científicas. Presently UCV runs a master’s program in logic and philosophy of science coordinated by Franklin Galindo.
Philosophy of science in Colombia has long-enduring ties with Continental European schools, but analytic philosophy of science has not been absent. Already in the 1950s Mario Laserna at Universidad de los Andes (Uniandes), Bogotá, promoted the study of logic and the scientific philosophy of Hans Reichenbach. Subsequently, local groups, helped by international visitors, have played a consistent role in the country, notably Gonzalo Munévar, a Colombian philosopher of science now based in the United States, who visits regularly his country.
Activity in Peru started early in the 1950s, as attested by gatherings organized at Universidad Nacional Mayor de San Marcos (UNMSM, Peru’s oldest university) and Sociedad Peruana de Filosofía, both in Lima. Broad interest is also reflected in articles published in the 1950s and 1960s in the weekly literary supplement of “El Comercio” by Oscar Miró-Quesada, Francisco Miró-Quesada, and other intellectuals interested in logic, science, and mathematics. Francisco Miró-Quesada, the country’s leading philosopher, was one of the pioneers in the development of modern philosophical logic and science studies in Latin America, where he has indefatigably encouraged hope in the power of human reason. Miró-Quesada taught at UNMSM for more than two decades, and then at Universidad Cayetano Heredia (UPCH) and other centers in the country. He also headed institutes for philosophical research, first at Universidad de Lima and subsequently at Universidad Ricardo Palma. Miró-Quesada was the author of numerous works in the area of philosophy of science, including a book in the philosophy of mathematics, Filosofía de las Matemáticas (1954). He has also been a champion of research in logic in the region (it was Miró-Quesada who suggested to name Newton da Costa’s approach “paraconsistent logic”, which he helped to promote). Miró-Quesada’s most heartfelt project focused on the study of human reason, regarded as the capacity to reach truth, broadly understood, as outlined in his preliminary book Apuntes para una Teoría de la Razón (1962), followed in 2013 by Esquema de una Teoría de la Razón, in which Miró-Quesada discusses the pursuit of rational validity in logic, science, metaphysics, and ethical theory. In the early 1970s, young faculty trained in Europe and the United States expanded and updated the philosophical study of science in the country, particularly at UNMSM. Timely contributions were made, especially by Luis Piscoya (philosophy of psychology and general philosophy of science), Juan Abugattas (philosophy of science), Julio-Cesar Sanz-Elguera (philosophy of science), and David Sobrevilla (philosophy of the social sciences). Ever since, at San Marcos, Luís Piscoya has been working on the interface between philosophy of science and education; he is the author of Investigación Científica y Educacional: un Enfoque Epistemológico (1995), and numerous papers (e.g., Piscoya, 1993). In the late 1970s, an innovative program in philosophy opened at UPCH, one of the leading research universities in the subcontinent. Under Francisco Miró-Quesada, many international workshops, seminars, and courses took place in Lima as part of this venture. From the late 1980s on, activity at UPCH continued through a program named “Scientific Thought”, headed by Alberto Cordero, with the collaboration of Sandro D’Onofrio and other faculty members.
In Chile, meanwhile, Gerold Stahl, Nathan Stemmer, and Augusto Pescador made logic a major field in Chile in the 1960s. Later in the decade, Roberto Torretti published a seminal book, Manuel Kant. Estudio sobre los Fundamentos de la Filosofía Crítica (1967; revised edition 2005). His subsequent work on Kant led him to wider research on the philosophical history of science, a field that had a growing audience, especially in Santiago. However, life in Chile became increasingly challenging as the decade progressed. In 1970 Torretti left to Puerto Rico, where he continued to develop his philosophical work, especially on nineteenth-century geometry and the theory of relativity. In 1973 a ruthless military dictatorship took over the government. It was a difficult time for academia; Chile’s leading journal, Revista de Filosofía, ceased publication and remained dormant until 1977. Although the institutional environment suffered greatly at most centers, quality research continued in logic, as evidenced by internationally acclaimed contributions during the period by Rolando Chuaqui and others.
Nearly always based in Latin American centers (Chile and Puerto Rico), Torretti is an icon of rigor and philosophical sense and an author of world-class level contributions; his writings are celebrated for his insightful commentaries and educated perspectives on the rational development of ideas, especially in Galileo, Newton, Leibniz, Kant, nineteenth-century mathematics, Helmholtz, Poincaré, and Einstein. Torretti’s major publications on these subjects have a secure place on the reading lists of leading seminars in philosophy of science anywhere, in particular Philosophy of Geometry from Riemann to Poincaré (1978), Relativity and Geometry (1985), Creative Understanding: Philosophical Reflections on Physics (1990), and The Philosophy of Physics (1999), each an authoritative work in the philosophy and the philosophical history of science. In the years that Torretti spent at the Rio Piedras Campus of Universidad de Puerto Rico, he led a fruitful career until his retirement in 1995. During most of this period he was the editor of Diálogos, one of the leading philosophy journals in Latin America.
2.4. Argentina and Uruguay
On the eastern side of the southern cone, developments of considerable international impact took place in Argentina between the 1940s and 1970s. The arrival of Hans Lindemann in the 1940s marked a turning point in analytic philosophy in Argentina where his discussions of the philosophy of Bertrand Russell and the Vienna Circle (he had studied under Moritz Schlick and been a member of the Circle) encouraged further activity, in particular research seminars and courses by Mario Bunge, Gregorio Klimovsky, and Julio Rey Pastor. Throughout the 1950s, the Buenos Aires area enjoyed a decade of optimism about the academic and cultural possibilities of philosophy of science and its applications. Several centers prospered, particularly two that were founded in 1952. In one of them, Instituto Libre de Estudios Superiores, Klimovsky and Rolando García discussed the “logical empiricist” approach and gave courses that systematically presented the new philosophy to wider audiences. The other center was Círculo Filosófico, led by Bunge, where his book Causalidad (1959a) and other works of the period took shape, and their central materials were presented in lectures and discussions. Bunge and Klimovsky managed to secure chairs at Universidad de Buenos Aires (UBA) in philosophy of science and logic, respectively. In the mid-1950s, their research and courses turned the university into a world-class place in the field. Bunge’s administrative and cultural efforts during this period put a strong emphasis on making professional philosophical activity possible in Argentina. A new association for logic and scientific philosophy, Agrupación Rioplatense de Lógica y Filosofía Científica, was founded in 1956, aimed at drawing together thinkers from Argentina and Uruguay who wanted to study philosophy in the rational and rigorous style of the new approach, with Bunge, Klimovsky, Jorge Bosch, Gino Germani, and Rolando Garcia among its members. A consistent group began to form, resulting in such achievements as Cuadernos de Epistemología, a series that gave the whole of Latin America and Spain access to key works in the field translated into Spanish.
In Causalidad, Bunge (1959a) focused on the empiricist conception of causality and its shortcomings, blaming the empiricist outlook for having created unnecessary confusion and pessimism in philosophy. In this work Bunge distinguishes causal determination from other forms of determination (structural, teleological, dialectical, and statistical), telling apart three different senses in which the term “causality” enters scientific discourse—as a law stating that same causes produce same effects, as a relation between cause and effect, and as a principle stating that everything has a cause. The book came out in 1959, gaining considerable international reception, especially due to the realist conception it articulates. Causality also marks a turning point: philosophy books one may call “classics” were now coming out of Latin America and finding a place in mainstream reading lists in the English-speaking world and Europe. A citizen of the world, perhaps the most universalist of philosophers in the subcontinent, Bunge is nonetheless very South American (it is hard to imagine him growing up anywhere else but in cosmopolitan Argentina). Bunge has always been a socially engaged intellectual, a trend already present in his efforts as founder and secretary general of a college for workers, Universidad Obrera Argentina, from 1938 until 1943. He has remained a spirited spokesman for the need to maintain in Latin America cultural and educational institutions capable of promoting the practice of philosophy by minds free from ideological pressure, financial oppression, and political or governmental control. First in Argentina and then elsewhere, Bunge has been at “war” against, as he puts it, the kind of uncritical understanding of philosophy he found prevailing at the Faculty of Philosophy and Letters when he joined in the 1950s, laboring to inspire a lasting sense of professional rigor in his students and collaborators. The series he launched, Cuadernos de Epistemología, had a substantial impact on scientists, philosophers, and the educated public in the Spanish-speaking world. Bunge’s production during these years was remarkable; apart from Causality, other works of relevance are Bunge (1959b, 1960, 1961a, 1961b, 1962a, and 1962b). Unfortunately, these accomplishments were not achieved without friction with colleagues and groups sympathetic to alternative ideas Bunge could not respect. In addition, the country’s political and economic conditions were deteriorating. Early in the 1960s, internal fractions within the Argentine army began to make civic life increasingly difficult. Bunge left the country in 1963, first to the United States (where the Vietnam War and other political developments made him uncomfortable), then moving in 1966 to McGill University, Montreal, where he remains to this day.
Few thinkers associated with analytic philosophy strive to produce a comprehensive philosophical system. Bunge is one of them, a thinker trying to integrate ontology, metaphysics, epistemology, semantics, psychology, and science coherently and fruitfully. Thus far Bunge’s publications make more than fifty books and hundreds of philosophical and scientific articles, mostly in English and Spanish; his main works were also translated into German, Italian, Russian, French, Hungarian, and Portuguese among other languages. His works of greatest impact in mainstream philosophy of science are arguably Causality (1959a), The Myth of Simplicity (1963), and Foundations of Physics (1967). Bunge’s search for a naturalist vision worth having was given systematic expression in his Treatise on Basic Philosophy (an eight-volume work published between 1974 and 1989). More recent publications by Bunge include Emergence and Convergence: Qualitative Novelty and the Unity of Knowledge (2003), Chasing Reality: Strife over Realism (2006), and Medical Philosophy: Conceptual Issues in Medicine (2013), as well as his much-awaited autobiography Memorias entre Dos Mundos (2014), to mention a fraction of his abundant production.
In his oral presentations and seminars, Bunge pays forceful and particular attention to the evaluation of the arguments at hand, championing the use of logic as an expediter of clarity of thought. He is renowned for his scathing critiques of positions that demean reason, the search for truth, and the universality of science, scientific naturalism, as well as positions that fail to respect human beings as individuals. Bunge enthusiastically endorses the way in which the Enlightenment tried to disseminate conceptual and moral tools to revise and improve human thought and life in general. Bunge’s works steadily emphasize the idea that science can lead (and has often led) to what he regards as the only sensible foundation for social and political action: relevant knowledge of the world. Importantly, early on in Latin America Bunge played the role of a much-needed exemplar, a leading thinker who in the 1960s became a “possibility proof” that philosophers working in the subcontinent could, despite the often bizarre difficulties academics face, stand up and join the philosophical conversation at the highest levels. No Latin American philosopher had achieved anything comparable before in cosmopolitan philosophy.
Losing Bunge was a major blow, one of many as the decade unfolded. When the military intervened the universities in 1966, many of the most talented minds in science and the humanities fled the country. Klimovsky remained, however, and his presence helped keep the discipline active during this difficult period, first at UBA and then at Belgrano University from the late 1970s until his death. Philosophy of science did not stop in Argentina, young talent continuing to arise, notably Alberto Coffa, at Universidad de la Plata until he too left to the United States. The surrounding turmoil was a negative factor, yet a remarkable period of expansion began at the end of the decade, marked by the foundation of the Sociedad Argentina de Análisis Filosofico (SADAF), a model institution supported by its own members, in which fellows and invited international guests meet around topics of philosophical interest, including many of central importance in philosophy of science. A major journal saw the light in Buenos Aires in 1975: Revista Latinoamericana de Filosofía, followed in 1981 by another important periodical, Análisis Filosófico.
Activity in philosophy of science has grown in the country since then, as the remaining sections of this article describe.
3. General Philosophy of Science
3.1. Scientific Method
Although Gregorio Klimovsky was one of the founding fathers of the philosophy of science in Argentina, he was still active until the first decade of the twenty-first century. He introduced mathematical logic and axiomatic set theory in Argentinian universities and defended a hypothetico-deductive method close to that of Popper, not only for natural sciences but also for social sciences. At the turn of the century, he published three books that were very relevant in university education (Klimovsky 1994, Klimovsky and Hidalgo 1998, Klimovsky and Boido 2005). Moreover, his autobiography (2008) presents a vivid portrayal of the inception of analytic philosophy of science in Argentina. But perhaps the most important merit of Klimovsky was having been the teacher of several generations of Argentine logicians and philosophers of science such as Tomás Moro Simpson, Raúl Orayen, and Alberto Coffa.
The interest in Popper’s theses reappears in the work of Carlos Verdugo (2009). By contrast, Alejandro Cassini (2003) argues for the advantages of the Bayesian theory of confirmation over the hypothetico-deductive method.
The semantic approach to scientific theory was studied by Germán Guerrero Pino (2008, 2010), who compared van Fraassen’s proposal with that of the structuralist school. In turn, Juan Manuel Jaramillo Uribe (2009, 2014) builds a bridge between metatheoretical structuralism with other philosophical schools, such as French structuralism and structural realism. Pablo Lorenzano has also developed sustained work in the field of metatheoretical structuralism (Balzer and Lorenzano 2000, Lorenzano and Díez 2002, Lorenzano 2013), particularly applied to biology, leading a research group with young members of different Latin American countries.
3.2. Rationality and Theory Choice
We noted that Francisco Miró-Quesada’s most heartfelt project focused on the study of human reason, regarded as the capacity to reach truth in logic, science, metaphysics, and ethical theory (1962, 2013). In turn, from a perspective that defends rationality against the attacks of postmodern thought, Ricardo Gómez (2003) develops a strong criticism to Rorty’s arguments. A very radical position is adopted by Gonzalo Munévar (1981) who considers the rationality of science a social property that should be understood in terms of biological performance.
In Mexico the interest in the rationality of science led to the publication of two relevant volumes on the subject, one compiled by Ambrosio Velasco (1997) and the other by Velasco and Ana Rosa Pérez Ransanz, and Ambrosio Velasco (2011); the second contains more than 40 contributions of Iberoamerican authors and offers a wide picture of the discussion on the matter in the region. In particular, Sergio Martínez (2003) focused on the relationship between rationality and scientific practices.
More recently, problems of the empirical equivalence between theories and the underdetermination of theory choice were addressed by Pablo Acuña, particularly in the case of Lorentz’s ether theory and Einstein’s special relativity (Acuña and Dieks 2014, Acuña 2014a). Acuña (2014b) also analyses three artificial cases of empirical equivalence, arguing that they are not the result of practice of real science but cooked up by philosophers of science.
3.3. Dynamics of Science
As a consequence of his close collaboration with Jean Piaget (Piaget and García 1971, 1987), Rolando García became the author who still represents genetic epistemology in Latin America (1997). In particular, he developed with Piaget the idea of a parallelism between psychogenesis and the evolution of sciences (Piaget and García 1983). More recently, García (2000) linked genetic epistemology with the theory of complex systems.
Already in the nineties, Oscar Nudler began to develop a view of the dynamics of science in terms of conflicts (1990). This view became a well-articulated model based on what he called “controversy space” (Nudler 2002, 2004): a dynamic structure composed of inter-related controversies, with a “focus”, composed by the issues that are the main object of the disagreements, and a “common ground”, which consists of the commitments not subject to discussion within the controversy space. Controversy spaces typically change by re-focalization which occurs when certain assumptions move from the common ground to the focus. This model was successfully applied to different scientific cases, such as the origins of chaos theory, the debate about the relations between chemistry and physics, the origins of molecular biology, and the development of twentieth century American linguistics, among others (see Nudler 2011).
The philosophy of Thomas Kuhn attracted the interest of many Latin American philosophers of science. For instance, during the 1980s, some Cuban scholars focused on the Kuhnian concept of scientific revolution (Núñez 1985, 1989). In Uruguay, Mario Otero (1997) edited a volume about Kuhn with contributions from his research group. After his retirement, the group was left in the hands of Lucía Lewowicz, who continued that line of research (2004, 2005), focusing particularly on the Kuhnian notion of taxonomic category (2007). In Colombia, the research group of Jaramillo Uribe also compiled a collective volume devoted to the philosophy of Kuhn (Jaramillo Uribe et al. 1997) and, in a more recent book, Guerrero Pino (2003) considered the relevance of the Kuhnian philosophy for science education. In Argentina, Nélida Gentile (2013) published a book on incommensurability commemorating the 50th anniversary of The Structure. The book Kuhn y el Cambio Científico, by Ana Rosa Pérez Ransanz (1999), deserves particular attention, for it has been much discussed in the Spanish-speaking world and, as a consequence, was reprinted two times (2000, 2012).
After getting his PhD under the supervision of Paul Feyerabend, Gonzalo Munévar became one of the main international specialists on the philosophy of the author (see the compilation of his articles in Munévar 2006). Moreover, Munévar (1998) advocates for an evolutionary philosophy that leads to a thorough evolutionary relativism of scientific knowledge which, nevertheless, is not an obstacle to a theory of relative truth.
3.4. Scientific Realism
Christián Carman worked extensively on the problem of realism in science. He offered a detailed elucidation of the term “scientific realism” (2005a), and he considered the theoretical-observational distinction in light of the problem of realism (2005b). Carman also critically analyzed Harré’s inductive argument for scientific realism (2005c). Moreover, he reformulated the no-miracle argument in order to apply it to simultaneous predictions (2010b), in particular in the context of Ptolemy’s planetary theory (Carman and Díez 2015).
Recently, some surveys of the arguments regarding the problem of realism have been produced. For instance, Bruno Borge (2015) reconsiders the no-miracle argument 40 years after its formulation, and Borge and Gentile (2019) compiled a volume on the subject with contributions from Latin American authors.
3.5. Pluralisms in Science
After the strong influence of logical empiricism and its claim for the “unity of science”, in the last decades of the twentieth century many pluralist approaches were proposed from different perspectives. In Latin America, different pluralistic views have been advanced.
Although Félix Schuster was a student of Mario Bunge and Gregorio Klimovsky, he directed his interest to social sciences. In this field, he defends methodological pluralism as the way to access social reality (Schuster 1992).
Roberto Torretti’s view of scientific knowledge finds its roots in his interpretation of Kant’s philosophy (Torretti 1967). According to Torretti, it does not follow from the transcendental deduction of the categories that they are contained in a definitive and immutable list; by admitting that the patterns ruling the constitution of the objects of knowledge may change, “Kant opens a wide door to intellectual pluralism” (2008: 87). From this perspective, Torretti (2000) explicitly rejects the scientific realism that conceives the aim of science as the development of a discourse that “cuts reality at its joints”, and agrees with Hilary Putnam’s pragmatic realism (Putnam 1987) on the basis of some examples drawn from past and present scientific practice.
Also under the influence of Putnam, but now of his internal realism (Putnam 1981), Olimpia Lombardi and Ana Rosa Pérez Ransanz (2012) propose an ontological pluralism that, instead of being applied to the problem of theory change, finds its main fertility in a synchronic sense: when theories embodying different conceptual schemes are simultaneously accepted, it must be admitted that different ontologies may coexist since each one of them is constituted by its corresponding theory. This view, which denies the ontological dependence of the supposedly “secondary” disciplines or “phenomenological” theories regarding those fields conceived as “fundamental”, has been applied to the relationship between chemistry and physics with the purpose of defending the ontological autonomy of the physical world (Lombardi and Labarca 2005); this view has sparked an intense debate in the field of the philosophy of chemistry (it will be considered below, in the subsection about the philosophy of chemistry).
3.6. Representation in Science
The role played by models in science was studied in Latin America since the first years of the twentieth century. In México, Alfredo López Austin (2005) compiled a volume including five contributions that explore the meaning and the nature of scientific models. Recently, Mario Casanueva and Ximena González-Grandón (2016) edited a special issue of the journal Scientiae Studia, whose articles fall into two groups: those in the first group emphasize that models amplify our capacities of representation, perception, and calculation; those in the second stress the function of models in legitimating scientific knowledge.
Also very recently, Alejandro Cassini paid close attention to the nature of scientific models. In particular, he criticizes fictionalism, which conceives models as useful fictions (Cassini 2013), and contends that every scientific model has a target against those who claim that some models do not (Cassini 2018). In turn, Hernán Accorinti (2015a, 2015b) discussed the problem of the autonomy of models with respect to theories, with applications to chemistry; in particular, to atomic and molecular models in quantum chemistry (Accorinti and Martínez González 2016, Accorinti, Fortin, and Martínez González 2018) and to the different models of electronegativity (Accorinti 2019).
Although not directly concerned with models, an interesting volume about the epistemic role of images in science was published as the result of a workshop held in Mexico D.F. in 2007 (Casanueva and Bolaños 2009). In the introduction to the volume, the editors refer to the “pictorial turn” to stress the increasing relevance of pictorial representation as an epistemic vehicle for science, where “pictorial” includes not only visual pictures but also tactile and auditory representations.
3.7. Causation and Laws of Nature
Although Mario Bunge’s already classical book Causality (1959a) was a landmark in the study of causation, it was only several decades later that the interest on causation took off in the region. Eduardo Flichman developed a “deflationist” view of causation according to which causation is not an ontological relation between events but an anthropomorphic asymmetric relation that speakers project over reality. From this perspective, Flichman (1989) criticized the counterfactual theory of causation proposed by David Lewis (1973) by showing that clear cases of causation can be meaningfully reversed and, therefore, challenge the supposed asymmetry of causation.
This criticism sparked an interesting debate in the Mexican journal Critica during the 1990s. Dorothy Edgington (1990) accepted Flichman’s criticism as an argument against the possibility of analyzing the concept of causation. Horacio Abeledo (1995), in turn, showed that there would be a “formal” way out of Flichman’s criticism, but with no philosophical support. From an opposite perspective, Helen Beebee (1997) explicitly responded to Flichman’s argument and to Abeledo’s conclusion by arguing that the putative counter-example presented by Flichman is not in fact a counter-example after all. Both Flichman and Abeledo reacted to Beebee’s paper. On the basis of a refutation of Beebee’s argument, Flichman (2000) elaborated on his criticism of Lewis’s theory and his defense of an acausal position. Finally, Abeledo (2000) offered a clear and detailed summary of the whole controversy, adding new arguments against Beebee’s view but stressing his disagreements with Flichman’s position.
Other Latin American authors were interested in causation. For example, Sergio Martínez (1997) provides a detailed review of the role of causation in scientific explanation along the history of science. In Santiago de Chile, Wilfredo Quezada Pulido leads a research group mainly devoted to study physical causation. In his published works, Quesada Pulido (2002) compared the theories of causal transference, of causal processes, and of conserved quantities, and analyzed the manipulability theory of causation in the light of the problem of anthropomorphism (2007). More recently, Fernanda Samaniego appeals to the manipulability approach to define a notion of “explanatory depth” (2014) and to account for spin-echo experiments (2013, 2015).
His work on causation led Flichman (1990, 1995) to discuss the concept of scientific law: according to him, the distinction between laws of nature and accidental uniformities depends on the role they play in a scientific theory; moreover “hard” and “soft” accidental uniformities must be carefully distinguished because the latter are frequently confused with laws of nature. Pablo Lorenzano (1998, 2007) also reflects upon the concept of law of nature in relation to the existence of biological laws.
3.8. Philosophical History of Science
The history of science from a philosophical perspective has been extensively studied in Latin America. For instance, in Argentina Guillemo Boido has strongly promoted the area; his book on Galileo (Boido 1996) not only offers a historical narrative, but also explains historiographic discussions in light of the historical record. In Colombia, Mauricio Nieto Olarte (2000, 2007) developed relevant research work on the origins of science in the region during the colonial period. In Mexico, Laura Benítez published several works on early science (e.g., Benítez 1993, 2000, 2004), and developed a long and fruitful collaboration with José Antonio Robles about science in Modern times (e.g., Benítez and Robles 2000, 2006; Robles and Benítez 2004). Also in México, Godfrey Guillaumin (2005) studied the historical evolution of the notion of scientific evidence.
Some philosophers of science of the region also manifested their interest in particular events of the history of science. For instance, Pablo Mariconda analyzed Galileo’s tide theory (1999), the simple machines designed by Galileo (2008), and Galileo’s argument for the autonomy of science (Lacey and Mariconda 2012). He also studied the method of astronomy according to Kepler (Tossato and Mariconda 2010).
In turn, Alejandro Cassini and Marcelo Levinas developed a fruitful collaboration studying different aspects of the history of physics at the beginning of twentieth century, particularly regarding Einstein’s works: Einstein’s reinterpretation of Michelson-Morley experiment (Cassini and Levinas 2005), his explanations of photoelectric effect (Cassini and Levinas 2008; Cassini, Levinas, and Pringe 2015) and of the Compton effect (Cassini, Levinas, and Pringe 2013), his reinterpretation of Fizeau experiment (Cassini and Levinas 2019), as well as the role played by the ether in the conceptual change to special relativity (Cassini and Levinas 2009). In the quantum context, Olival Freire Jr. (2015) published a book that traces the passionate foundational controversies that accompanied the ripening of quantum physics during the second half of the twentieth century.
The works of Christián Carman deserve a special mention since they make him a top-ranked international specialist in ancient astronomy due to their quantity and quality. His first works focused on Ptolemy’s calculations and explanations (Carrman 2009, 2010a, 2011, 2015; Recio and Carman 2018), but soon his interest expanded to other authors, such as Aristarchus (2014), Martianus Capella (2017a), Copernicus (2018), and Heraclides of Pontus (2017b). In an additional line of research, Carman collaborated with the renowned scholar James Evans in a detailed study of the Antikythera mechanism which resulted in several very relevant works (Evans, Carman, and Thorndike 2010; Carman, Thorndike, and Evans 2012; Carman and Evans 2014). Carman developed further his analyses of the mechanism, in some cases in single-authored works and in other cases in collaborartion with other international scholars (Anastasiou, Seiradakis, Carman, and Efstathiou 2014; Carman and di Cocco 2016; Carman 2017c). Finally, Carman has recently extended his collaboration with Evans beyond the original interest in the Antikythera mechanism, examining other issues in ancient astronomy (Carman and Evans 2015).
3.9. Science, Society, and Values
In Latin America, the discussions about science and values have traditionally focused on the question of the dependence of scientific research in Latin American countries on the agenda set by central countries. Due to their local interest, most of the material was written in Spanish. In 1971, a debate, remembered until today for its philosophical and political significance, confronted Oscar Varsavsky and Gregorio Klimovsky in Argentina. For Varsavsky (1971), since science is essentially ideology-laden, ideology must appear explicitly in scientific policy as a guide toward a new social order. Klimovsky (1971), by contrast, advocated for a neutral basic science: politics appear mostly in the application of scientific knowledge. The original debate was complemented with the contribution of other prominent Argentine thinkers, and appeared in 1975 as the book Ciencia y Ideología. Aportes polémicos (Klimovsky et al. 1975). In the same year, Jorge Sabato compiled a significant book with articles by more than twenty specialists about ideology in science, relations between science, technology, and society, the structural scientific-technological dependence of Latin America, the production of technology, and the planning of scientific-technological development in Latin American countries. The lively debates of those years were drastically interrupted by the military coup d’état in Argentina in 1976.
The claim for a Latin American science, guided by regional interests and ideological views, is in resonance with those philosophical and sociological studies, like that of Enrique Dussel (1995) which denounces the Eurocentric “myth of modernity” that justifies the superiority of European culture over Native American cultures. In turn, the need to contextualize scientific knowledge in the framework of social needs of a particular community also appears in the works of Rolando García (1981) under the concept of interdisciplinary research, that is, a research that combines different theoretical approaches in the search for solving localized social requirements.
Whereas the above contributions focused mainly on natural science, the interest in how social knowledge is produced in Latin America has grown during the last decades. An example of this interest is the book of Leandro Rodríguez Medina (2014) which examines the circulation of knowledge within globalization, focusing on the differences between centers and peripheries of knowledge production in the social sciences, and in the ways in which foreign ideas shape peripheral fields.
Two philosophers of science, who are well-known in the Latin American communities, were also very interested in issues connected with social and political values in science, although from different perspectives. Since the 1990s, León Olivé (1988 ) stood at the interface between the philosophy and the sociology of knowledge, trying to explain the double nature of knowledge as a social construct and a representation of reality. More recently, his interest focused on how technology has pervaded contemporary society, modeling both knowledge and values (Olivé 2007). Ricardo Gómez, by contrast, develops his position in open confrontation with neoliberalism (2002, 2017a). On this basis, he considers that the ethical dimension of science and technology should stand against neoliberal principles from a clear political position (Gómez 2017b).
The interaction between scientific activities and values has been the interest of Pablo Mariconda (Lacey and Mariconda 2014a, 2014b). In particular, Mariconda (2014) discusses the technological risks associated with transgenic agriculture. Along the same lines, Guillemo Folgera analyzes the techno-scientific discourse regarding genetically modified organisms (Folguera, Carrizo, and Massarini 2014) and denounces the omission of risks in the use of such organisms (Francese and Folguera 2018).
In the context of science, society, and values, studies that combine the reflection upon scientific knowledge with gender matters must be mentioned. For instance, Fabrizzio (now Siobhan) Guerrero Mc Manus (2016) provides Spanish-speaking readers with an overview of a feminism that seeks to develop a critical framework aimed at detecting, exposing, and correcting the many gender biases nowadays present in the sciences. In this context, the works of Diana Maffía cannot be forgotten since she has critically analyzed the links between gender and science in the past twenty years or so (e.g., Maffía 2001, 2005, 2006, 2007; Rietti and Maffía 2005).
4. Philosophy of Particular Sciences
4.1. Philosophy of Physics
Although Mario Bunge and Roberto Torretti were central figures for the philosophy of physics in Latin America, their early emigration prevented them from starting research lines around their works. As a consequence, the development of the philosophy of physics in the region is relatively recent.
Quantum mechanics is one of the focuses of the research group led by Olimpia Lombardi which developed its work in two directions: the interpretation of the theory and the analysis of the meaning of decoherence. Regarding the first topic, Lombardi and Mario Castagnino proposed the modal-Hamiltonian interpretation of quantum mechanics: a realist, non-collapse interpretation that endows the Hamiltonian with a determining role. The interpretation proved to be effective in explaining ideal and non-ideal measurements and many other well-known physical situations such as hydrogen atom, Zeeman effect, fine structure, etc. (Lombardi and Castagnino 2008). The interpretation was reformulated in a Galilean invariant form (Ardenghi, Castagnino, and Lombardi 2009; Lombardi, Castagnino, and Ardenghi 2010), and was applied to further situations, such as the non-collapse account of consecutive measurements in physics (Ardenghi, Lombardi, and Narvaja 2013), the understanding of quantum decoherence (Lombardi, Ardenghi, Fortin, and Castagnino 2011), the view of quantum measurement in informational terms (Lombardi, Fortin, and López 2015), and the problem of optical isomerism in chemistry (Fortin, Lombardi, and Martínez González 2016, 2018). In addition, the modal-Hamiltonian interpretation proposes a bundle-of-properties ontology that adequately accounts for contextuality and indistinguishability (da Costa, Lombardi, and Lastiri 2013; da Costa and Lombardi 2014), but without preventing the emergence of particles under certain particular circumstances (Lombardi and Dieks 2016).
By stressing the distinction between collapse and decoherence, Osvaldo Pessoa (1997) criticized the assumption that decoherence solves the measurement problem. Following Pessoa’s view, Castagnino, Sebastian Fortin, and Lombardi (2010) deepened the criticisms of the orthodox approach to decoherence (see also Lombardi, Fortin, and Castagnino 2012; Fortin and Lombardi 2014, 2017), proposed a new approach for closed systems (Castagnino and Lombardi 2004; Fortin and Lombardi 2018), and developed a general conceptual framework for decoherence in closed and open systems (Castagnino, Laura, and Lombardi 2007). On the basis of this new perspective, the research group offered a particular view of the classical limit of quantum mechanics (Castagnino and Lombardi 2005; Fortin and Lombardi 2016) and applied it to the problem of defining the quantum ergodic hierarchy (Castagnino and Lombardi 2007; Gómez and Castagnino 2014).
In the subtle frontier between logic and physics, Décio Krause developed an impressive work related to the quantum challenges to the notions of identity and individuality. Already in his PhD dissertation, under the supervision of Newton da Costa, Krause supplied a semantics to the so-called “Schrödinger logic” (da Costa and Krause 1994, 1997) designed to account for elementary quantum particles. This work led him to formulate his quasi-set theory (Krause 1991, 1992, 1996a, 1996b), according to which there are urelements for which identity makes no sense. Krause’s semi-extensional quasi-set theory was compared with the intensional quaset theory developed by Maria Luisa dalla Chiara and Giuliano Toraldo di Francia (dalla Chiara, Giuntini, and Krause 1998), and was applied to particular problems in the foundations of quantum mechanics (Sant’Anna and Krause 1997; Krause, Sant’Anna, and Volkov 1999; Krause 2000; Domenech, Holik, and Krause 2008).
Krause also developed an intense collaboration with Steven French to develop a concept of individuality for the quantum ontology (Krause and French 1995, 2007; French and Krause 1995, 1999, 2003); they also advanced some ideas about individuality in quantum field theory (French and Krause 2010). This collaboration gave rise to a very relevant book on the matter (French and Krause 2006), which discusses the problem of individuality in philosophy and in classical and quantum physics and articulates quasi-set theory as a theory for non-individuals.
More recently, Krause produced a relevant collaborative work with Jonas Arenhart, his former PhD student, about quantum non-individuality (Krause and Arenhart 2012, 2016a) and its compatibility with Einstein’s realism (Krause and Arenhart 2014). They also examined the view of quantum particles as individuals in a primitive sense (Arenhart and Krause 2014a, 2014b). This collaboration led to a recent book about the logical foundations of scientific theories (Krause and Arenhart 2016b). In recent years, Krause also worked with da Costa in the application of paraconsistent logics to physics (da Costa and Krause 2014, 2016).
Still in the field of the interpretation of quantum mechanics, Elías Okon and Daniel Sudarsky (2014a, 2014b) criticized Robert Griffiths’s consistent histories approach by arguing that it is interpretively vague and does not solve the measurement problem. These works were rebutted by Griffiths (2015), and the rebuttal was immediately answered by Okon and Sudarsky (2015a) by claiming that the consistent histories interpretation introduces anthropomorphic terms not contained in the formalism. In turn, based on Okon and Sudarsky’s criticism, Marcelo Losada and Lombardi (2018) defend a “formalism of contextual histories” which is free from the shortcomings of Griffiths’s proposal.
Given the need for an observer-independent interpretation of quantum mechanics for cosmology, Okon and Sudarsky (2014c) defended an objective collapse theory for the application to cosmology and quantum gravity, and on this basis, they proposed an adaptation of objective collapse models to a general relativistic context (2018a). The authors also examined the black hole information loss paradox as a situation that can be accounted for by collapse interpretations (Okon and Sudarsky 2015b, 2017, 2018b).
Other aspects and interpretations of quantum mechanics have also been explored. For instance, Sergio Martínez explored the physical content of the Luders Rule (1990, 1991), Pessoa (2005) proposed a modal logical treatment of quantum mechanics, and Pablo Acuña (2016b) pointed out the difficulties in defining the notion of inertial trajectory in Bohmian mechanics which is considered a different theory and not a different interpretation of quantum mechanics (Acuña forthcoming). In turn, Rodolfo Gambini, Luis Pedro García-Pintos, and Jorge Pullin (2010, 2011) devised an interpretation that offers a solution to the quantum measurement problem based on the loss of coherence due to the use of realistic clocks.
Matters not directly related to quantum mechanics have also been studied by Latin American philosophers of physics. For instance, Acuña (2016a) critically assessed the debate concerning the direction of explanation between Minkowski spacetime and the Lorentz invariance of dynamical laws. Diego Romero-Maltrana (2015) analyzes the relationship between symmetries and conserved quantities supported by Noether’s theorems in order to argue for the priority of conserved quantities over symmetries.
The problem of time’s arrow was addressed by Castagnino, Lombardi and collaborators by elaborating on John Earman’s heresy (1974) according to which the arrow of time is a geometrical property of the universe (Castagnino, Lombardi, and Lara 2003). This global arrow is transferred to the local domain as an energy flow that points to the same time direction on the entire spacetime (Castagnino and Lombardi 2009), which in turn supplies the foundations for local irreversible theories (Aiello, Castagnino, and Lombardi 2008). Castagnino and Lombardi also collaborated with Manuel Gadella, one of the authors of the time-asymmetric quantum mechanics, in order to analyze irreversibility and time’s arrow in the quantum realm (Castagnino, Gadella, and Lombardi 2006), a work recently followed by Cristian López (2019).
4.2. Philosophy of Chemistry
Although the philosophy of chemistry is a relatively young subdiscipline in philosophy of science,it has attracted the interest of several researchers in Latin America.
The group led by Olimpia Lombardi worked on the topic since 2005 when a paper advocating for the ontological autonomy of chemistry (Lombardi and Labarca 2005) was published. The paper sparked a hot debate which began with a criticism by Paul Needham (2006) that was immediately responded by Lombardi and Labarca (2006), and was followed by many other authors. In the meantime, Labarca and Lombardi (2010) also argued for the existence of orbitals in the ontology of chemistry relying on ontological pluralism. On the basis of the impact of her view, Lombardi (2014a) reviewed and organized the different criticisms and offered a systematic response to them; in turn, with Mariana Córdoba, she stressed the Kantian roots of her ontological pluralism (Córdoba and Lombardi 2013).
Given her antireductionist perspective, Lombardi (2013, 2014b) also criticized the book of Hinne Hettema (2012), Reducing Chemistry to Physics, stressing the many difficulties that must be faced by those who insist on the reduction of chemistry to physics; the papers received immediate replies from Hetterma (2014).
The problems regarding the relations between chemistry and physics were addressed by Lombardi’s group from various perspectives. In particular, they brought to light several interpretive issues of quantum mechanics that are not accommodated when the theory is used in chemistry (Lombardi and Castagnino 2010; Martínez González, Fortin, and Lombardi 2019) and argued that quantum decoherence does not solve the problem of isomerism (Fortin, Lombardi, and Martínez González 2016). They also began to examine the issue of the relationship between chemistry and quantum mechanics from a theoretical perspective, such as the Quantum Theory of Atoms in Molecules (Jaimes Arriaga, Fortin, and Lombardi 2019) and Bohmian mechanics (Fortin, Lombardi, and Martínez González 2017); this last paper was critically assessed by Giovanni Villani, Elena Ghibaudi, and Luigi Cerruti (2018).
As a continuation of her previous work in Spanish, Lombardi (2012) offered a critical analysis of Ilya Prigogine’s proposals. In turn, with Lucía Lewowicz, she analyzed the ontological category of stuff as required by macro-chemistry (Lewowicz and Lombardi 2013). The problem of the categories underlying the chemical discourse was also addressed in the context of the group by Córdoba and Alfio Zambon (2017) for the particular case of nano-materials. A particular mention is needed to Zambon’s (2018) completely new representation of the periodic system based on atomic-number triads.
Guillermo Restrepo focused his interest on how formal tools can be applied to chemistry. With José Luis Villaveces, he noted the resemblance between Leibniz’s and Lavoisier’s programs regarding a lingua philosophica for understanding nature (Restrepo and Villaveces 2011) and reviewed the origins of mathematical thinking in chemistry (Restrepo and Villaveces 2012). Restrepo also analyzed the mathematical aspects of the periodic law (Restrepo and Pachón 2007) and considered the different foundational aspects of the field called “mathematical chemistry” (2013; Restrepo and Villaveces 2013). Restrepo has been working in Germany since 2014 where he still produces interesting contributions to the philosophy of chemistry.
The development of the technological aspects of chemistry has been the interest of José Antonio Chamizo (2013, 2017, 2019) with applications to chemistry education.
4.3. Philosophy of Biology
The philosophy of biology in the region has been developed in various directions from the most traditional topics in the area to more innovative questions.
The traditional topic of natural selection is treated in relation to its explanatory power by Pablo Lorenzano in collaboration with the Spanish philosopher José Díez (Díez and Lorenzano 2013, 2015). Santiago Ginnobili (2016) offers a metatheoretical structuralist reconstruction of Darwin’s theory with the purpose of elucidating the concept of ecological fitness, and Mario Casanueva (2011) proposes a structuralist reconstruction of the mechanism of natural selection by means of graph resources. In turn, Gustavo Caponi (2013) studies the concepts of function, fitness, and adaptation in natural selection theory.
Closely related with natural selection, the issue of evolution is approached from very different perspectives. For instance, Guillemo Folguera stresses the dependence of macroevolution on microevolution even in the criticisms of the synthesis since the seventies (Folguera and Lombardi 2012), and Maurizio Esposito (2011) supplies examples of how Darwinism was used and adapted in different contexts. But the most extensive work on this issue has been developed by Edna Suárez-Díaz who focused specifically on molecular evolution. In this field, she studied the role played by the concept of informational molecule and by the idea of molecular evolution of informational molecules in differentiating molecular from classical evolutionists and in the constitution of genomics (Suárez-Díaz 2009, 2010). Despite stressing the importance of the molecular experimental approach in evolutionary biology (Suárez-Díaz and Barahona 1996), Suárez-Díaz acknowledges the methodological and conceptual difficulties embedded in the use of molecular evidence to elaborate molecular phylogenies (Suárez-Díaz and Anaya-Muñoz 2008; Suárez-Díaz 2014a), and emphasizes the generative nature of experimentation (Suárez-Díaz 2013).
Heredity, always linked with biological knowledge, has been the topic of interest of Carlos López-Beltrán who shows the transformation of the concept from playing a metaphorical role to acquire a narrative role (1994) and subsequently being conceived in statistical terms (2006). By relating heredity with genetics, Esposito (2017) emphasizes the longstanding relationships between the reductionist view of gene as hereditary unit, the idea of information encoded in DNA, and the prophecies about the power of controlling genetic information. From a structuralist perspective, Lorenzano offers a metatheoretical reconstruction of classical genetics (Balzer and Lorenzano 2000), paying special attention to the Hardy-Weinberg law within population genetics (2014). Mario Casanueva (1997) explores the relationship among the sexual theory of reproduction, Mendelian genetics, and Mendel’s hybridisation theory. In turn, Juan Manuel Torres (1997, 2002, 2006) focuses on the use of genetic tests in medical practice, and Anna Barahona (2007) considers how different inheritance issues can be represented by genetic maps.
Fabrizzio (now Siobhan) Guerrero Mc Manus examines methodological problems: the rational selection of an algorithm for phylogenetic inference (2009), and the limitations of mechanistic explanations when dealing with developmental mechanisms (2012). In turn, the issue of causation is treated by Maximiliano Martínez in terms of the concept of multi-level causation (Martínez and Moya 2011; Martínez and Esposito 2014). The ideas of a multiplicity of levels and of downward causation appears repeatedly in the works of Charbel El-Hani (El-Hani and Pereira 1999; El-Hani and Emmeche 2000; Queiroz and El-Hani 2006), with the purpose of advocating for property and process emergence in biology.
In collaboration with El-Hani, João Queiroz has developed extensive work on the biosemiotic approach to biology (El-Hani, Queiroz, and Stjernfelt 2010; Queiroz, Emmeche, Kull, and El-Hani 2011; Queiroz 2012; Queiroz, Stjernfelt, and El-Hani 2014), and its relationship with genetic information (El-Hani, Queiroz, and Emmeche 2006). From a completely different viewpoint, Suárez-Díaz (2007) discusses what she considers the metaphor of information in molecular biology.
Other non-classical but currently very relevant topics in life sciences are also treated in the region, such as environmental matters (Klier et al. 2017), ecology (Nunes-Neto, Moreno, and El-Hani 2014), and evo-devo (Baedke and Mc Manus 2018).
Finally, it is worth mentioning a recent trend that, in the confluence among philosophy, anthropology, and biology, considers political issues in biological research (Wade et al. 2015; García-Deister and López-Beltrán 2015; Delgado 2018), studies genomic variations in Latin America (Suárez-Díaz 2014b; Anaya-Muñoz, García-Deister, and Suárez-Díaz 2017), examines the relationship among genetic research, nationalism, and the construction of collective social identities (Kent et al. 2015), and explores the relationships among homosexuality, homophobia, and biomedical sciences in the region (Mc Manus 2014).
4.4. Philosophy of Formal Sciences
Sometimes very close to logic itself, the philosophy of logic has an important presence in Latin American philosophy of science from multiple perspectives.
The logical treatment of contradiction attracted great interest, mainly in the groups of Campinas and Buenos Aires, although with different motivations. In Campinas, where one underlying interest was the possibility of modeling contradictory information in scientific practice, Newton da Costa focused on the mathematical concept of “pragmatic truth” (Mikenberg, da Costa, and Chuaqui 1986) with the purpose of showing that the logic of pragmatic truth is paraconsistent (da Costa, Bueno, and French 1998). In turn, Walter Carnielli and Marcelo Coniglio developed an approach in which the distinction between logic and philosophy is not straightforward. On the philosophical side, and following the path opened by da Costa, they focused on the so-called “logics of formal inconsistency”, a family of paraconsistent logics that can express the notion of consistency within the object language (Carnielli, Coniglio, and Marcos 2007). Carnielli also developed dialogical and epistemic approaches to paraconsistency (Rahman and Carnielli 2000; Carnielli and Rodrigues 2019).
In the group led by Eduardo Barrio at Buenos Aires, works on inconsistency were motivated by semantic reasons, in particular, the treatment of paradoxes (Barrio 2010; Picollo 2012; Barrio and Picollo 2013). They studied non-transitivity as a solution of paradoxes (Barrio, Rosenblatt, and Tajer 2015; Barrio, Pailos, and Szmuc 2018), and considered non-traditional approaches to paradoxes (Da Ré and Rosenblatt 2018). Some members of the group were also interested in classical recapture in the contexts of paraconsistent logic (Teijeiro forthcoming) and of logics of formal inconsistency (Tajer forthcoming). Recently, Barrio and collaborators have begun to focus specifically on paraconsistency in its different aspects (Barrio, Pailos, and Szmuc 2017, forthcoming a; Barrio and Da Ré 2018b; Barrio, Clerbout, and Rahman forthcoming).
The strong contact between the groups of Campinas and Buenos Aires resulted in the publication of two special issues of the Logic Journal of the IGPL (Barrio and Carnielli forthcoming a,b) devoted to logics of formal inconsistency. The interest in paradoxes and inconsistency also appeared in other authors of the region, such as Andrés Bobenrieth (1998).
Topics related to non-extensionality, in particular modal logics and Kripkean semantics, were also treated by some philosophers of logic in Latin America (e.g., Mortari 2007; Marcos 2009; Estrada González 2012; Rosenblatt and Szmuc 2014). In particular, Max Freund (2001, 2004, 2007, 2015) focused on modal logics with sortal quantifiers and wrote a collaborative book on modal logic (Cocchiarella and Freund 2008).
The question of the coexistence of different logics was additionally addressed by the groups in Buenos Aires and Campinas. Whereas Barrio and collaborators discussed logical pluralism (Barrio, Pailos, and Szmuc forthcoming b), Carnielli and Coniglio focused on the problems of translations between logics (Carnielli, Coniglio, and D’Ottaviano 2009) and combinations of logics (Carnielli and Coniglio 2007 ).
More traditional problems related with truth have also been treated by the philosophers of logic of the region (e.g., Barrio and Rodríguez-Pereyra 2015; Barrio and Da Ré 2018a). In particular, Mario Gómez-Torrente (1998, 2000, 2002, 2008, 2006 ) developed a longstanding work on the notion of logical truth, truth-preservation, and the relationships among logical truth, derivability, and model-theoretic validity.
Although in the boundaries between logic and epistemology, the logic of belief revision and the works of Carlos Alchourrón (Alchourrón and Makinson 1981, 1982; Alchourrón 1996) cannot be forgotten: the AGM model (Alchourrón, Gärdenfors, and Makinson 1985) is still the dominant theory of belief revision (see entry logic of belief revision in this Encyclopedia). Andrés Páez (2006) uses the theory of belief revision to supply a concept of explanation embodied with pragmatic conditions. Closely related with this topic, “defeasible reasoning” was extensively studied by Gustavo Bodanza and Fernando Tohmé (2005, 2009; Bodanza, Tohmé, and Simari 2016; Bodanza, Tohmé, and Auday 2017; see also Bodanza 2002; Bodanza and Alessio 2017). Tohmé also supplied a category-theoretic representation of abduction (Tohmé, Caterina, and Gangle 2015), and analyzed abduction in its application to economy (Crespo, Tohmé, and Heymann 2010; Tohmé and Crespo 2013). Abductive reasoning was also the main interest of Atocha Aliseda (2003; Soler-Toscano, Nepomuceno-Fernández, and Aliseda-Llera 2009), who applied abduction to medical diagnosis (Aliseda and Leonides 2013) and proposed a conditional logic to formalize abduction (Beirlaen and Aliseda 2014). She also published a book completely devoted to abduction (Aliseda 2006), which not only discusses conceptual and formal matters, but also pays special attention to the epistemic applications of abductive reasoning.
4.5. Philosophy of Cognitive Sciences
The philosophy of cognitive sciences is a very complex field, mainly due to the difficulty to distinguish it from other areas such as philosophy of mind, epistemology, linguistics, philosophy of action, and logic.
The traditional topic of consciousness has been treated in its relation to brain functions from a naturalized perspective by José Luis Díaz (1995, 2000) and more recently by Miguel Angel Sebastián (2014) on the basis of the neurophysiology of dreams; in turn, Beatriz Sorrentino Marques and Osvaldo Pessoa (2017) analyze the role of consciousness in agent causation theories. Another traditional topic, perception, is addressed by Juan Carlos González who analyzes the process of perceptual recalibration (González, Bach-y-Rita, and Haase 2005) and the case of hallucinations (González 2010, 2016), and by Laura Danón and Daniel Kalpokas (2017) who offer an explanation of the direct perception of mental states of others. Juan Pablo Bermúdez, in turn, focuses on mental actions, supplying an account of skillful action that rejects both intellectualism and anti-intellectualism (2017) and claiming that remembering is not merely passive but must be viewed as a mental action (Arango-Muñoz and Bermúdez 2018). In collaboration with Bermúdez, Alejandro Rosas stresses the cognitive and non-cognitive roots of shared intentionality (Rosas and Bermúdez 2018) and the influence of cognitive dispositions on weakness of will attribution (Rosas, Bermúdez, and Gutiérrez 2018).
In addition to his collaborative work with Bermúdez, Rosas developed an extensive work on the evolution of moral cognition and the cognitive roots of cooperation (2002, 2008a). In particular, he claims that altruism is selected both at the individual and at the group levels (2008b) and proposes a unified theory of human cooperation based on reciprocity (2010, 2012). Recently, with colleagues coming from philosophy and from science, he has contributed to the research on moral judgment with moral dilemmas (Rosas and Koenigs 2014; Rosas, Viciana, Caviedes, and Arciniegas 2019).
An approach that received much attention in the region is that of embodied cognition and, in particular, enactivism (see González 2013; Hutto and Satne 2017; Martínez, Español, and Pérez 2018). For instance, Ignacio Avila analyzes bodily awareness and its role in perceptual self-location (2014, 2017) and considers certain enactive accounts of perception (2015). Adrian Cussins (2012) discusses the role that representation of the body plays in cognition. In turn, Maria Eunice Quilici González asks whether embodied cognition can be applied to artificial systems as robots (Haselager and González 2007a).
Axel Barceló Aspeitia and Angeles Eraña focused their work mainly on the modularity of mind in order to adapt the idea of domain specificity (Barceló, Eraña, and Stainton 2010) and to compare the hypothesis of massive modularity to other views about the structure of mind (Eraña 2012). In this context, Claudia Lorena García (2007) argues that the hypothesis of the modularity of mind needs to be understood in terms of the evolutionary biological concepts of variational independence (2007) and of functional homology and functional variation (2010).
Metacognition is the topic that attracted the interest of Santiago Arango-Muñoz who distinguishes between the rationalizing level and the controlling level in metacognition (2011) and appeals to the concepts of metamemory and metacognitive feelings to address the interactions between the mind and the world (2013). Furthermore, he explores the nature of the so-called “epistemic feelings” from a metacognitive perspective (2014, 2019).
Cognitive functions are approached from an informational perspective by M.E.Q. González, who analyzes mechanical models of intelligence (2005) and of reasoning (González, Broens, and D’Ottaviano 2007; Haselager and González 2007b). From the same informational approach, Sebastián and Artiga (forthcoming) explore metarepresentation. Other formal perspectives are adopted to verify the so-called cognitive task analysis (Laureano-Cruces and Barceló-Aspeitia 2002) and to analyze the agent’s resolution of conditional probability problems (Moro, Bodanza, and Freidin 2011).
From a completely different viewpoint, several authors in the region prefer to understand cognitive phenomena in an analytical framework, specifically in relation to language (e.g., Skidelsky 2013; García-Ramírez 2011; García-Ramírez and Shatz 2011) with affinity with research in philosophy of mind.
4.6. Philosophy of Social Sciences
Certain methodological problems of social sciences have been addressed by Diego Ríos, who analyzed explanation with mechanistic and evolutionary models (2004; Kuchle and Ríos 2015), and studied the relationship between methodological individualism and methodological holism (Ríos 2005, 2009; Ríos Pozzi 2007). In particular, the autonomy and irreducibility of economics has been discussed (Scarano 2012; Gómez 2012). Nevertheless, almost all of the philosophy of social sciences in Latin America has been directed to theoretical issues in specific sciences or particular problems of the region.
A field that attracts great interest is the philosophy of history. Elías Palti recalls the evolution and crisis of the area (2018), and distinguishes the so-called “politico-intellectual history” from the old “history of political ideas” (2010, 2014). Veronica Tozzi (2012a, 2016, 2018), in turn, proposes an original pragmatist approach to the philosophy of history, which appeals to Dewey’s notion of “practical meaning” in relation to the knowledge of the past. Tozzi also focuses on the problem of the roles memory and testimony play in representing the recent past (2009, 2012b). In connection to these concepts, Esteban Lythgoe (2011, 2014) analyzes how Paul Ricoeur articulates history, memory, and testimony.
Other topics involved in the philosophy of history have also been considered: the historicity of the concept of subject (Palti 2004), the ideas of progress (Ratto 2018), and of future (Belvedresi 2018). In particular, María Inés Mudrovcic highlights the different types of consciousness of temporality (2014) and analyzes the political self-understanding of the present in terms of the past in contemporary Western societies (2013). The impact of the phenomenon of globalization on historiographical paradigms (Brauer 2018) and on the deformation of ethical and political concepts (Roldán 2018) are also examined. In turn, the idea of Global History is considered by Rosa Belvedresi (2012) who compares it with the concept of universal history, and by Francisco Naishtat (2012) as a framework for the Marxist debate on colonialism and modernization.
At the crossroads between philosophy of politics and political philosophy—if there is any difference between them—the categories of equality and liberty (Hilb 1994), authority (Oyarzún 2012), and power (Oyarzún 2017) have been analyzed. In this field, Naishtat has developed extensive research mainly directed to the critical evaluation of phenomena at the global scale. For instance, he analyzes the relationship between fragile sovereignties, global-intensive governance apparatuses, and a horizon-less catastrophe-world (2010a), and argues that the political dimension of the global is global justice (2011). In turn, Naishtat stands in the context of recent political events, when he considers the possibility of peace and rights transcending state frontiers in the light of the 1990s Balkan wars (2000) and the displacement of the content of the terms “terror” and “terrorism” after 9/11 towards a meaning functional to globalization (2010b).
Latin American themes are recurrent in the philosophy of social sciences of the region. Palti has been very active in this field: he studied the nineteenth century Latin American intellectual history in the context of the thesis of the essential contestability of concepts (2005), considered the limitations of the notion of “misplaced ideas” by means of which Roberto Schwarz analyzed the dynamics of ideas in Latin America (2006), and critically examined the radical transformation in the ways of conceiving the process leading to the break of colonial ties that linked Latin America with Spain (2009). Other authors share this interest in regional problems, such as Pablo Oyarzún (2007) who focused on Latin American singularities, Gustavo Leyva (2014) who considered how the democratic project was reformulated and radicalized in Latin America over the last decades, and Ambrosio Velasco Gómez (2015) who proposes an original thesis about the intellectual roots of Mexican independence.
When Latin American themes are considered, the so-called Philosophy of Liberation cannot be forgotten: a philosophical movement that emerged in the late sixties in Argentina and spread through Latin America in the following decades with authors such as Enrique Dussel, Leopoldo Zea, Arturo Roig, Francisco Miró Quesada, Arturo Roig, and Carlos Cullen among many others. Nevertheless, here the topic will not be treated because a complete entry of the Encyclopedia is devoted to it (Eduardo Mendieta, philosophy of liberation).
4.7. Philosophy of Technology
The philosophy of technology has attracted significant interest from Latin American researchers working from very different perspectives whether ontological-epistemological or ethical-political. From a general viewpoint, Ricardo Gómez (2010) offers a detailed overview of the philosophical ideas about technology.
Regarding the ontological status of technical artifacts and actions, Diego Lawler critically analyzes the functional and intentional theories about the nature of artifact kinks (Vega and Lawler 2014) and proposes a praxeological approach to technological practices (Lawler 2018). In turn, Andrés Vaccari directs criticisms to the functionalist assumptions underlying the dual nature of technical artifacts program (2013) and the extended cognition theory applied to artifacts (2017), claiming that transhumanism has failed in its aim to ground the transformation of the human condition on technology (2015). The ontological status of artificial agents and artificial life was addressed by Mari González and Osvaldo Pessoa (2008), who face the problem of whether life and autonomy could in principle be sustained with components other than carbon, and by Diego Parente (2018) who considers the challenges that these cases pose to the traditional dichotomy between natural/artificial. Pablo Rodríguez and Javier Blanco (2017), in turn, confront Gilbert Simondon’s theory of individuation with ideas coming from cybernetics. From an epistemological perspective Myriam Altamirano Bustamante, Adalberto de Hoyos, and León Olivé (2011) argue that much of the tacit knowledge involved in technology can be transmitted as explicit knowledge through patents.
The ethical and socio-political dimensions of technology are topics that have received great attention in the region. For instance, Jorge Linares Salgado (2018) analyzes the ethical and societal consequences of the production of bio-artifacts derived from synthetic biology. A more specific study is offered by Carlos Osorio Marulanda (2018), who addresses the problems related with drinking water production, especially in rural areas of Latin America, from the perspective of science, technology, and society (STS) studies.
In the area of STS studies, the extensive work of Hebe Vessuri occupies a relevant place. In the boundaries between sociology and philosophy, Vessuri has addressed general problems from a regional point of view. For example, she considers how the current admission of the underlying ontological complexity of the world influences both the socio-cognitive and the institutional organization of disciplinary knowledge, particularly in developing countries (2000) and how science and technology can respond to the particular needs of Latin American societies (2003). Vessuri also discusses the world distribution of scientists, engineers, and technologists and the movement of these personnel from peripheral countries to central countries (de la Vega and Vessuri 2008). The readers interested in STS studies in Latin America can turn to the article “Latin American science, technology, and society. A historical and reflexive approach” (Kreimer and Vessuri 2018), which describes the development of STS in the region, its institutionalization and its spaces of interaction.
Finally, two books in Spanish by León Olivé must be recalled due to their impact in the Latin American community of philosophers of science: whereas in the first (Olivé 2000) science and technology are considered on a par, the second book (Olivé 2007) deals specifically with the different facets of technology.
4.8. Other Topics
Other topics, not easily included in the traditional philosophies of particular sciences, have also been addressed in Latin America.
What is now known as philosophy of information has been an interest of Olimpia Lombardi and her research group from different perspectives. The meaning of the term “information” is elucidated from a general viewpoint (Lombardi 2004), paying particular attention to Shannon information (Lombardi 2005; Lombardi, Holik, and Vanni 2016a), and arguing for a pluralistic interpretation of the concept (Lombardi, Fortin, and Vanni 2015). By adopting a critical perspective regarding Christopher Timpson’s deflationary view of information (Lombardi, Fortin, and López 2016), it is argued that there is no qualitative difference between Shannon and quantum information besides the difference in the way in which they are encoded (Lombardi, Holik, and Vanni 2016b). In turn, an interpretational account of quantum measurement is offered (Lombardi, Fortin, and López 2015). On the basis of this critical work, Lombardi and Cristian López (2018) have elucidated the concept of information as used in Giulio Tononi’s Integrated Information Theory of consciousness, and have proposed a manipulation-based interpretation of communicational information (López and Lombardi 2019).
The philosophy of science as a resource for science education is a topic that has acquired an increasing interest in Latin America during the last decades. In this field, two authors have developed intensive work. Agustín Adúriz-Bravo addressed the use of well-known episodes from the history of science, such as the formulation of the pendulum law by Galileo (2004) and the discovery of radium by the Curies (Adúriz-Bravo and Izquierdo-Aymerich 2009) for science education. Moreover, he applied the cognitive model of science (Izquierdo-Aymerich and Adúriz-Bravo 2003; Adúriz-Bravo and Izquierdo-Aymerich 2005) and the semantic view of scientific theories (Adúriz-Bravo 2011, 2013) both to the practice of science teaching and to research on science education. He also appealed to the so called “Nature of Science” view of science for the education of science teachers (Adúriz-Bravo 2007, 2014). On the basis of those theoretical bases, Adúriz-Bravo focuses on the philosophy of chemistry as a resource for the didactics of chemistry (Erduran, Adúriz-Bravo, and Mamlok Naaman 2007; Izquierdo-Aymerich and Adúriz-Bravo 2009; Adúriz-Bravo, Merino, and Izquierdo-Aymerich 2012).
The interest of Charbel El-Hani is mainly centered on the philosophy of biology for didactics of biology. He advocates for a theory-centered approach to the concept of life (2008) and considers the advantages of the dialogue between the students’ ethnobiological knowledge and biology school knowledge (Baptista and El-Hani 2009). He also appeals to the works of Mendel and Darwin for teaching genetics and evolution (Bizzo and El-Hani 2009; El-Hani 2015) and analyzes the different concepts of gene that often overlap in biology education (Dos Santos, Joaquim, and El-Hani 2012; Meyer, Bomfim, and El-Hani 2013, Gericke, Hagberg, dos Santos, Joaquim, and El-Hani 2014). Beyond the specific field of biology, El-Hani accounts for the different ways in which individuals and societies represent concepts (Aguiar Jr, Sevian, and El-Hani 2018), discusses how to deal with the relations between different cultural perspectives in classrooms (Moreira-dos-Santos and El-Hani 2017), and advocates for understanding as one of the major goals of science education (Ferreira, El-Hani, and da Silva Filho 2016).
5. Concluding Remarks
After reviewing the development of philosophy of science in Latin America since its emergence in the mid-twentieth century, it can be said that there are some distinctive features in different countries. But in the last decades, especially given the widespread use of the Internet and digital libraries by the mid-1990s, a growing intercommunication and collaboration can be verified as well as the tendency to form an academic community with an important international presence, which, at the same time, has certain characteristics of its own. Among the common features, the following deserve to be mentioned.
- In general, in Latin American countries, the philosophy of science began to be cultivated in the mid-twentieth century in those academic circles that were favorable to analytic philosophy, understood in a broad sense. The so-called “philosophical analysis”, more than a school or doctrinal body, represented in Latin America an alternative way of doing philosophy: in this trend, the methodological demands of conceptual elucidation and argumentative rigor supported a reaction against the metaphysical, speculative, or dogmatic traditions that predominated in the 1940s. Thus, analytic philosophy favored the focus on problems posed in the fields of logic, science, and language (without restricting the analysis of the latter to ordinary language). Based on this common root, since the 1960s philosophy of science has acquired a place of its own in most countries of the region.
- Although the “Americanist” concern (understood as the search for a philosophy of the region, with its own identity) did not prevail in philosophy of science of Latin America, the constant and growing exchange between Latin American philosophers of science has had the result of generating lines of research that integrate the concerns for the social problems afflicting the countries of the region and the role that science and technology can play in its solution. Thus, from the 1990s, a triple movement was generated: orientation towards practical issues, openness to other philosophical traditions—different from the analytic tradition—and a direct connection between the main Latin American nuclei where philosophy of science is developed.
- At the turn of the century, a vigorous growth of the philosophy of particular sciences can be observed, especially the philosophy of physics and biology, and more recently the philosophy of cognitive sciences. The philosophy of chemistry—a field that had been ignored all over the world until 1980—has only recently begun to be cultivated in countries such as Argentina and Mexico. In contrast, in philosophy of the social sciences, Latin America shows an unequal growth compared to the philosophy of the natural sciences. Despite this, it can be said that a sustained effort is being made to promote areas such as the philosophy of psychology, sociology, and economics. Furthermore, the philosophy of formal sciences has advanced significantly.
- Regarding philosophy of technology, it received very little attention until the end of the last century. However, the frequent interaction with the Spanish philosophers of technology, through their participation in specialized meetings and their collaboration in graduate programs, has favored the cultivation of this research axis in close connection with the critical reflection on the relationships between technology and the economic, social, and environmental problems afflicting the region.
- Regarding general philosophy of science, its development shows a remarkable diversification in Latin America. In a relatively short period of time—which started in the late 1980s—there has been a growing expansion of problems, approaches, and lines of research. Even the discussion of great classical problems, such as rationality and realism, is carried out from alternative perspectives, many of which have recovered the naturalist approach of classical pragmatists, which in the 1960s gained a new impetus under the so-called “Historicist turn”. On the other hand, this strong tendency to develop a naturalized philosophy of science has been accompanied by the defense of markedly pluralist positions, both in the methodological as well as the epistemological and ontological fields. All of this points to a conception of philosophical work that, without neglecting argumentative rigor and conceptual elucidation, deals with and worries about the problems of its context and historical moment. In the philosophy of science, this has been reflected in a growing awareness of the need to rethink the relationships among science, technology, and society, along with its ethical, political, economic, environmental, and gender dimensions.
- By way of conclusion, it should be noted that, in contrast to the way in which philosophy of science has developed in the Anglo-Saxon sphere, works in Latin America have moved much more rapidly from the merely “academic” stage, where discussions revolve around what other colleagues (classical or contemporary) have proposed, to the stage of critical reflection on the problems of broader social environment in which scientific activity takes place. However, it should also be noted that this expansion of horizons has not affected negatively the research on the central problems of the discipline (logical, semantic, methodological, pragmatic, epistemological, and ontological) which continue to be the core of the curriculum of the specialized degree programs, as well as of the research centers where philosophy of science is developed.
Finally, it is worth stressing that the area strongly progressed in spite of the many obstacles that philosophical research faces in the region; the erratic political situation and the cyclic economic crisis in Latin American countries influence research policies, and this places scholars in unstable and uncertain positions. Nevertheless, regardless of the difficulties, at present a new generation of young philosophers of science allows us to foresee that the philosophy of science produced in Latin America will continue to grow in quantity and quality, increasing its already considerable international presence.
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