Pluralist Theories of Truth

First published Mon Mar 5, 2012; substantive revision Fri Oct 19, 2018

The plausibility of theories of truth has often been observed to vary, sometimes extensively, across different domains or regions of discourse. Because of this variance, the problems internal to each such theory become salient as they overgeneralize. A natural suggestion is therefore that not all (declarative) sentences in all domains are true in exactly the same way. Sentences in mathematics, morals, comedy, chemistry, politics, and gastronomy may be true in different ways, if and when they are ever true. ‘Pluralism about truth’ names the thesis that there is more than one way of being true.

1. Alethic pluralism about truth: a plurality of properties

1.1 Strength

The pluralist’s thesis that there are many ways of being true is typically construed as being tantamount to the claim that the number of truth properties is greater than one. However, this basic interpretation,

  • (1) there is more than one truth property.

is compatible with both moderate as well as more radical precisifications. According to moderate pluralism, at least one way of being true among the multitude of others is universally shared:

  • (2) there is more than one truth property, some of which are had by all true sentences.

According to strong pluralism, however, there is no such universal or common way of being true:

  • (3) there is more than one truth property, none of which is had by all true sentences.

Precisifying pluralism about truth in these two ways brings several consequences to the fore. Firstly, both versions of pluralism conflict with strong monism about truth:

  • (4) there is exactly one truth property, which is had by all true sentences.

Secondly, moderate—but not strong—pluralism is compatible with a moderate version of monism about truth:

  • (5) there is one truth property, which is had by all true sentences.

(2) and (5) are compatible because (5) does not rule out the possibility that the truth property had by all true sentences might be one among the multitude of truth properties endorsed by the moderate pluralist (i.e., by someone who endorses (2)). Only strong pluralism in (3) entails the denial of the claim that all true sentences are true in the same way. Thus, moderate pluralists and moderate monists can in principle find common ground.

1.2 Related kinds of pluralism and neighboring views

Not infrequently, pluralism about truth fails to be distinguished from various other theses about associated conceptual, pragmatic, linguistic, semantic, and normative phenomena. Each of these other theses involves attributing plurality to a different aspect of the analysandum (explanandum, definiendum, etc.). For instance, linguistically, one may maintain that there is a plurality of truth predicates (Wright 1992; Tappolet 1997; Lynch 2000; Pedersen 2006, 2010). Semantically, one may maintain that alethic terms like ‘true’ have multiple meanings (Pratt 1908; Tarski 1944; Kölbel 2008, 2013; Wright 2010). Cognitively or conceptually, one may maintain that there is a multiplicity of truth concepts or regimented ways of conceptualizing truth (Künne 2003; cf. Lynch 2006). Normatively, one might think that truth has a plurality of profiles (Ferrari 2016, 2018).

These parameters or dimensions suggest that pluralism is itself not just a single, monolithic theory (see also Sher 1998; Wright 2013). Any fully developed version of pluralism about truth is likely to make definitive commitments about at least some of these other phenomena. (However, it hardly entails them; one can consistently be an alethic pluralist about truth, for instance, without necessarily having commitments to linguistic pluralism about truth predicates, or about concepts like fact or actuality.) Nonetheless, theses about these other phenomena should be distinguished from pluralism about truth, as understood here.

Likewise, pluralism about truth must be distinguished from several neighbouring views, such as subjectivism, contextualism, relativism, or even nihilism about truth. For example, one can maintain some form of subjectivism about truth while remaining agnostic about how many ways of being true there are. Or again, one can consistently maintain that there is exactly one way of being true, which is always and everywhere dependent on context. Nor is it inconsistent to be both a pluralist and an absolutist or other anti-relativist about truth. For example, one might argue that each of the different ways of being true holds absolutely if it holds at all (Wright 1992). Alternatively, one might explicate a compatibilist view, in which there are at least two kinds of truth, absolute and relative truth (Joachim 1905), or deflationist and substantivist (Kölbel 2013). Such views would be, necessarily, pluralistic. Occasionally, pluralists have also been lumped together with various groups of so-called ‘nihilists’, ‘deniers’, and ‘cynics’, and even associated with an ‘anything goes’ approach to truth (Williams 2002). However, any version of pluralism is prima facie inconsistent with any view that denies truth properties, such as nihilism and certain forms of nominalism.

1.3 Alethic pluralism, inflationism, and deflationism

The foregoing varieties of pluralism are consistent with various further analyses of pluralists’ ideas about truth. For instance, pluralists may—but need not—hold that truth properties are simply one-place properties, since commitments to truth’s being monadic are orthogonal to commitments to its being monistic. However, most pluralists converge on the idea that truth is a substantive property and take this idea as the point of departure for articulating their view.

A property is substantive just in case there is more to its nature than what is given in our concept of the property. A paradigmatic example of a substantive property is the property of being water. There is more to the nature of water—being composed of H\(_2\)O, e.g.—than what is revealed in our concept of water (the colourless, odourless liquid that comes out of taps, fills lakes, etc.)

The issue of substantiveness connects with one of the major issues in the truth debate: the rift between deflationary theories of truth and their inflationary counterparts (Horwich 1990; Edwards 2013b; Künne 2003; Sher 2016b; Wyatt 2016; Wyatt & Lynch 2016). A common way to understand the divide between deflationists and inflationists is in terms of the question whether or not truth is a substantive property. Inflationists endorse this idea, while deflationists reject it. More specifically, deflationists and inflationists can be seen as disagreeing over the following claim:

  • (6) there exists some property \(F\) (coherence, correspondence, etc.) such that any sentence, if true, is so in virtue of being \(F\)—and this is a fact that is not transparent in the concept of truth.

The inflationist accepts (6). According to her, it is not transparent in the concept of truth that being true is a matter of possessing some further property (cohering, corresponding, etc.). This makes truth a substantive property. The deflationist, on the other hand, rejects (6) because she is committed to the idea that everything there is to know about truth is transparent in the concept—which, on the deflationist’s view, is exhausted by the disquotational schema (‘\(p\)’ is true if, and only if, \(p)\), or some principle like it.

Deflationists also tend to reject a further claim about truth’s explanatory role:

  • (7) \(F\) is necessary and sufficient for explaining the truth of any true sentence \(p\).

Inflationists, on the other hand, typically accept both (6) and (7).

Strong and moderate versions of pluralism are perhaps best understood as versions of a non-traditional inflationary theory (for an exception, see Beall 2013; for refinements, see Edwards 2012b and Ferrari & Moruzzi forthcoming). Pluralists side with inflationists on (6) and (7), and so, their views count as inflationary. Yet, traditional inflationary theories are also predominantly monistic. They differ about which property \(F\)—coherence, identity, superwarrant, correspondence, etc.—truth consists in, but concur that there is precisely one such property:

  • (8) there is a single property \(F\) and truth consists in a single property \(F\).

The monistic supposition in (8) is tantamount to the claim that there is but one way of being true. In opposing that claim, pluralism counts as non-traditional.

2. Motivating pluralism: the scope problem

Pluralists’ rejection of (8) typically begins by rendering it as a claim about the invariant nature of truth across all regions of discourse (Acton 1935; Wright 1992, 1996; Lynch 2000, 2001; for more on domains see Edwards 2018b; Kim & Pedersen 2018, Wyatt 2013; Yu 2017). Thus rendered, the claim appears to be at odds with the following observation:

  • (9) the plausibility of each inflationist’s candidate for the property \(F\) differs across different regions of discourse.

For example, some theories—such as correspondence theories—seem intuitively plausible when applied to truths about ladders, ladles, and other ordinary objects. However, those theories seem much less convincing when applied to truths about comedy, fashion, ethical mores, numbers, jurisprudential dictates, etc. Conversely, theories that seem intuitively plausible when applied to legal, comic, or mathematical truths—such as those suggesting that the nature of truth is coherence—seem less convincing when applied to truths about the empirical world.

Pluralists typically take traditional inflationary theories of truth to be correct in analyzing truth in terms of some substantive property \(F\). Yet, the problem with their monistic suppositions lies with generalization: a given property \(F\) might be necessary and sufficient for explaining why sentences about a certain subject matter are true, but no single property is necessary and sufficient for explaining why \(p\) is true for all sentences \(p\), whatever its subject matter. Subsequently, those theories’ inability to generalize their explanatory scope beyond the select few regions of discourse for which they are intuitively plausible casts aspersion on their candidate for \(F\). This problem has gone by various names, but has come to be known as ‘the scope problem’ (Lynch 2004b, 2009; cf. Sher 1998).

Pluralists respond to the scope problem by first rejecting (8) and replacing it with:

  • (10) truth consists in several properties \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\).

With (10), pluralists contend that the nature of truth is not a single property \(F\) that is invariant across all regions of discourse; rather the true sentences in different regions of discourse may consist in different properties among the plurality \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\) that constitute truth’s nature.

The idea that truth is grounded in various properties \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\) might be further introduced by way of analogy. Consider water. We ordinarily think and talk about something’s being water as if it were just one thing—able to exist in different states, but nevertheless consisting in just one property (H\(_2\)O). But it would be a mistake to legislate in advance that we should be monists about water, since the nature of water is now known to vary more than our intuitions would initially have it. The isotopic distribution of water allows for different molecular structures, to include hydroxonium (H\(_3\)O), deuterium oxide (D\(_2\)O), and so-called ‘semi-heavy water’ (HDO). Or again, consider sugar, the nature of which includes glucose, fructose, lactose, cellulose, and similar other such carbohydrates. For the pluralist, so too might truth be grounded as a plurality of more basic properties.

One reason to take pluralism about truth seriously, then, is that it provides a solution to the scope problem. In rejecting the ‘one-size-fits-all’ approach to truth, pluralists formulate a theory whose generality is guaranteed by accommodating the various properties \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\) by which true sentences come to be true in different regions of discourse. A second and related reason is that the view promises to be explanatory. Variance in the nature of truth in turn explains why theories of truth perform unequally across various regions of discourse—i.e., why they are descriptively adequate and appropriate in certain regions of discourse, but not others. For pluralists, the existence of different kinds of truths is symptomatic of the non-uniform nature of truth itself. Subsequently, taxonomical differences among truths might be better understood by formulating descriptive models about how the nature of truth might vary between those taxa.

3. Prominent versions of pluralism

3.1 Platitude-based strategies

Many pluralists have followed Wright (1992) in supposing that compliance with platitudes is what regiments and characterizes the behavior and content of truth-predicates. Given a corollary account of how differences in truth predicates relate to differences among truth properties, this supposition suggests a platitude-based strategy for positing many ways of being true. Generally, a strategy will be platitude-based if it is intended to show that a certain collection of platitudes \(p_1 , \ldots ,p_n\) suffices for understanding the analysandum or explanandum. By ‘platitude’, philosophers generally mean certain uncontroversial expressions about a given topic or domain. Beyond that, conceptions about what more something must be or have to count as platitudinous vary widely.

3.1.1 Discourse pluralism/minimalism

A well-known version of platitude-based pluralism is discourse pluralism. The simplest versions of this view make the following four claims. Firstly, discourse exhibits natural divisions, and so can be stably divided into different regions \(D_1 , \ldots ,D_n\). Secondly, the platitudes subserving some \(D_i\) may be different than those subserving \(D_j\). Thirdly, for any pair \((D_i, D_j)\), compliance with different platitudes subserving each region of discourse can, in principle, result in numerically distinct truth predicates \((t_i, t_j)\). Finally, numerically distinct truth predicates designate different ways of being true.

Discourse pluralism is frequently associated with Crispin Wright (1992, 1996, 2001), although others have held similar views (see, e.g., Putnam 1994: 515). Wright has argued that discourse pluralism is supported by what he calls ‘minimalism’. According to minimalism, compliance with both the disquotational schema and the operator schema,

  • (11) ‘\(p\)’ is true if, and only if, \(p\).
  • (12) it is true that \(p\) if, and only if, \(p\).

as well as other ‘parent’ platitudes, is both necessary and sufficient for some term \(t_i\) to qualify as expressing a concept worth regarding as TRUTH (1992: 34–5). Wright proposed that the parent platitudes, which basically serve as very superficial formal or syntactic constraints, fall into two subclasses: those connecting truth with assertion (‘transparency’),

  • (13) To assert is to present as true.
  • (14) Any attitude to a proposition is an attitude towards its truth.

and those connecting truth with logical operations (‘embedding’),

  • (15) Any truth-apt content has a negation which is also truth-apt.
  • (16) Aptitude for truth is preserved under basic logical operations (disjunction, conjunction, etc.).

Any such term complying with these parent platitudes, regardless of region of discourse, counts as what Wright called a ‘lightweight’ or ‘minimal’ truth predicate. Yet, the establishment of some \(t\) as a minimal truth predicate is compatible, argued Wright, with the nature of truth consisting in different things in different domains (2001: 752).

Wright (2001) has also suggested that lightweight truth predicates tend to comply with five additional subclasses of platitudes, including those connecting truth with reality (‘correspondence’) and eternity (‘stability’),

  • (17) For a sentence to be true is for it to correspond with reality.
  • (18) True sentences accurately reflect how matters stand.
  • (19) To be true is to “tell it like it is”.
  • (20) A sentence is always true if it ever is.
  • (21) Whatever may be asserted truly may be asserted truly at any time.

and those disconnecting truth from epistemic state (‘opacity’), justification (‘contrast’), and scalar degree (‘absoluteness’),

  • (22) A thinker may be so situated that a particular truth is beyond her ken.
  • (23) Some truths may never be known.
  • (24) Some truths may be unknowable in principle.
  • (25) A sentence may be true without being justified and vice-versa.
  • (26) Sentences cannot be more or less true.
  • (27) Sentences are completely true if at all.

The idea is that \(t\) may satisfy additional platitudes beyond these, and in doing so may increase its ‘weight’. For example, some \(t_i\) may be a more heavyweight truth predicate than \(t_j\) in virtue of satisfying platitudes which entail that truth be evidence-transcendent or that there be mind-independent truth-makers. Finally, differences in what constitutes truth in \(D_1 , \ldots ,D_n\) are tracked by differences in the weight of these predicates. In this way, Wright is able to accommodate the intuition that sentences about, e.g., macromolecules in biochemistry are amenable to realist truth in a way that sentences about distributive welfare in ethics may not be.

Distinctions among truth predicates, according to the discourse pluralist, are due to more and less subtle differences among platitudes and principles with which they must comply. For example, assuming that accuracy of reflection is a matter of degree, predicates for truth and truthlikeness diverge because a candidate predicate may comply with either (18) or else either of (26) or (27); to accommodate both, two corollary platitudes must be included to make explicit that accurate reflection in the case of truth is necessarily maximal and that degrees of accuracy are not equivalent to degrees of truth. Indeed, it is not unusual for platitudes to presuppose certain attendant semantic or metaphysical views. For example,

  • (28) A sentence may be characterized as true just in case it expresses a true proposition.

requires anti-nominalist commitments, an ontological commitment to propositions, and commitments to the expression relation (translation relations, an account of synonymy, etc.). Discourse pluralists requiring predicates to comply with (28) in order to count as truth-predicates must therefore be prepared to accommodate other claims that go along with (28) as a package-deal.

3.1.2 Functionalism about truth

‘Functionalism about truth’ names the thesis that truth is a functional kind. The most comprehensive and systematic development of a platitude-based version of functionalism comes from Michael Lynch, who has been at the forefront of ushering in pluralist themes and theses (see Lynch 1998, 2000, 2001, 2004c, 2005a, 2005b, 2006, 2009, 2012, 2013; Devlin 2003). Lynch has urged that we need to think about truth in terms of the ‘job’ or role, \(F\), that true sentences stake out in our discursive practices (2005a: 29).

Initially, Lynch’s brand of functionalism attempted to implicitly define the denotation of ‘truth’ using the quasi-formal technique of Ramsification. The technique commences by treating ‘true’ as the theoretical term \(\tau\) issued by the theory \(T\) and targeted for implicit definition. Firstly, the platitudes and principles of the theory are amassed \((T: p_1 , \ldots ,p_n)\) so that the \(F\)-role can be specified holistically. Secondly, a certain subset \(A\) of essential platitudes \((p_i , \ldots ,p_k)\) must be extracted from \(T\), and are then conjoined. Thirdly, following David Lewis, \(T\) is rewritten as

  • (29) \(R(\tau_1,\ldots , \tau_n , \omicron_1,\ldots , \omicron_n )\)

so as to isolate the \(\tau\)-terms from the non-theoretical (‘old, original, other’) \(o\)-terms. Fourthly, all instances of ‘true’ and other cognate or closely related \(\tau\)-terms are then replaced by subscripted variables \(x_1 , \ldots ,x_n\). The resulting open sentence is prefixed with existential quantifiers to bind them. Next, the Ramsey sentence is embedded in a material biconditional; this allows functionalists to then specify the conditions by which a given truth-apt sentence \(p\) has a property that plays the \(F\)-role:

  • (30) \(p\) has some property \(\varrho_i\) realizing the \(F\)-role \(\equiv \exists x_1 , \ldots ,\exists x_n [R(x_1 , \ldots ,x_n , \omicron_1,\ldots , \omicron_n ) \amp p\) has \(x_1\)],

where, say, the variable \(x_1\) is the one that replaced ‘true’. Having specified the conditions under which \(p\) has some property realizing \(F\), functionalists can then derive another material biconditional stating that \(p\) is true iff \(p\) has some property realizing the \(F\)-role.

However, as Lynch (2004: 394) cautioned, biconditionals that specify necessary and sufficient conditions for \(p\) to be true still leave open questions about the ‘deep’ metaphysical nature of truth. Thus, given the choice, Lynch—following up on a suggestion from Pettit (1996: 886)—urged functionalists to identify truth, not with the properties realizing the \(F\)-role in a given region of discourse, but with the \(F\)-role itself. Doing so is one way to try to secure the ‘unity’ of truth (on the presumption that there is just one \(F\)-role). Hence, to say that truth is a functional kind \(F\) is to say that the \(\tau\)-term ‘truth’ denotes the property of having a property that plays the \(F\)-role, where the \(F\)-role is tantamount to the single unique second-order property of being \(F\). Accordingly, this theory proposes that something is true just in case it is \(F\).

Two consequences are apparent. Firstly, the functionalist’s commitment to alethic properties realizing the \(F\)-role seems to be a commitment to a grounding thesis. This explains why Lynch’s version of alethic functionalism fits the pattern typical of inflationary theories of truth, which are committed to (6) and (7) above. Secondly, however, like most traditional inflationary theories, Lynch’s functionalism about truth appears to be monistic. Indeed, the functionalist commitment to identifying truth with and only with the unique property of being \(F\) seems to entail a commitment to strong alethic monism in (5) rather than pluralism (Wright 2005). Nonetheless, it is clear that Lynch’s version does emphasize that sentences can have the property of being \(F\) in different ways. The theory thus does a great deal to accommodate the intuitions that initially motivate the pluralist thesis that there is more than one way of being true, and to finesse a fine line between monism and pluralism.

For pluralists, this compromise may not be good enough, and critics of functionalism about truth have raised several concerns. One stumbling block for functionalist theories is a worry about epistemic circularity. As Wright (2010) observes, any technique for implicit definition, such as Ramsification, proceeds on the basis of explicit decisions that the platitudes and principles constitutive of the modified Ramsey sentence are themselves true, and making explicit decisions that they are true requires already knowing in advance what truth is. Lynch (2013a) notes that the problem is not peculiar to functionalism about truth, generalizing to virtually all approaches that attempt to fix the denotation of ‘true’ by appeal to implicit definition. Some might want to claim that it generalizes even further, namely to any theory of truth whatsoever. Another issue is that the \(F\)-role becomes disunified to the extent that \(T\) can accommodate substantially different platitudes and principles. Recall that the individuation and identity conditions of the \(F\)-role—with which truth is identified—are determined holistically by the platitudes and principles constituting \(T\). So where \(T\) is constituted by expressions of the beliefs and commitments of ordinary folk, pluralists could try to show that these beliefs and commitments significantly differ across epistemic communities (see, e.g., Næss 1938a, b; Maffie 2002; Ulatowski 2017, Wyatt 2018). In that case, Ramsification over significantly different principles may yield implicit definitions of numerically distinct role properties \(F_1, F_2 , \ldots ,F_n\), each of which is a warranted claimant to being truth.

3.2 Correspondence pluralism

The correspondence theory is often invoked as exemplary of traditional monistic theories of truth, and thus as a salient rival to pluralism about truth. Prima facie, however, the two are consistent. The most fundamental principle of any version of the correspondence theory,

  • (31) Truth consists in correspondence.

specifies what truth consists in. Since it involves no covert commitment about how many ways of being true there are, it does not require denying that there is more than one (Wright & Pedersen 2010). In principle, there may be different ways of consisting in correspondence that yield different ways of being true. Subsequently, whether the two theories turn out to be genuine rivals depends on whether further commitments are made to explicitly rule out pluralism.

Correspondence theorists have occasionally made proposals that combine their view with a version of pluralism. An early—although not fully developed—proposal of this kind was made by Henry Acton (1935: 191). Two recent proposals are noteworthy and have been developed in detail. Gila Sher (1998, 2004, 2005, 2013, 2015, 2016a) has picked up the project of expounding on the claim that sentence in domains like logic correspond to facts in a different way than do sentences in other domains, while Terence Horgan and colleagues (Horgan 2001; Horgan & Potrč 2000, 2006; Horgan & Timmons 2002; Horgan & Barnard 2006; Barnard & Horgan 2013) have elaborated a view that involves a defense of the claim that not all truths correspond to facts in the same way.

For Sher, truth does not consist in different properties in different regions of discourse (e.g., superwarrant in macroeconomics, homomorphism in immunology, coherence in film studies, etc.). Rather, it always and everywhere consists in correspondence. Taking ‘correspondence’ to generally refer to an \(n\)-place relation \(R\), Sher advances a version of correspondence pluralism by countenancing different ‘forms’, or ways of corresponding. For example, whereas the physical form of correspondence involves a systematic relation between the content of physical sentences and the physical structure of the world, the logical form of correspondence involves a systematic relation between the logical structure of sentences and the formal structure of the world, while the moral form of correspondence involves a relation between the moral content of sentences and (arguably) the psychological or sociological structure of the world.

Sher’s view can be regarded as a moderate form of pluralism. It combines the idea that truth is many with the idea that truth is one. Truth is many on Sher’s view because there are different forms of correspondence. These are different ways of being true. At the same time, truth is one because these different ways of being true are all forms of correspondence.

For Sher, a specific matrix of ‘factors’ determines the unique form of correspondence as well as the correspondence principles that govern our theorizing about them. Which factors are in play depends primarily on the satisfaction conditions of predicates. For example, the form of correspondence for logical truths of the form

  • (32) Every \(x\) either is or is not self-identical.

is determined solely by the logical factor, which is reflected by the universality of the union of the set of self-identical things and its complement. Or again, consider the categorical sentences

  • (33) Some humans are disadvantaged.


  • (34) Some humans are vain.

Both (33) and (34) involve a logical factor, which is reflected in their standard form as I-statements (i.e., some \(S\) are \(P)\), as well as the satisfaction conditions of the existential quantifier and copula; a biological factor, which is reflected in the satisfaction conditions for the predicate ‘is human’; and a normative factor, which is reflected in the satisfaction conditions for the predicates ‘is disadvantaged’ and ‘is vain’. But whereas (34) involves a psychological factor, which is reflected in the satisfaction conditions for ‘is vain’, (33) does not. Also, (33) may involve a socioeconomic factor, which is reflected in the satisfaction conditions for ‘is disadvantaged’, whereas (34) does not.

By focusing on subsentential factors instead of supersentential regions of discourse, Sher offers a more fine-grained way to individuate ways in which true sentences correspond. (Sher supposes that we cannot name the correspondent of a given true sentence since there is no single discrete hypostatized entity beyond the \(n\)-tuples of objects, properties and relations, functions, structures (complexes, configurations), etc. that already populate reality.) The upshot is a putative solution to problems of mixed discourse (see §4 below): the truth of sentences like

  • (35) Some humans are disadvantaged and vain.

is determined by all of the above factors, and which is—despite the large overlap—a different kind of truth than either of the atomic sentences (33) and (34), according to Sher.

For their part, Horgan and colleagues propose a twist on the correspondence theorist’s claim that truth consists in a correspondence relation \(R\) obtaining between a given truth-bearer and a fact. They propose that there are exactly two species of the relation \(R\): ‘direct’ (\(R_{dir}\)) and ‘indirect correspondence’ (\(R_{ind}\)), and thus exactly two ways of being true. For Horgan and colleagues, which species of \(R\)—and thus which way of being true—obtains will depend on the austerity of ontological commitments involved in assessing sentences; in turn, which commitments are involved depends on discursive context and operative semantic standards. For example, an austere ontology commits to only a single extant object: namely, the world (affectionally termed the ‘blobject’). Truths about the blobject, such as

  • (36) The world is all that is the case.

if it is one, correspond to it directly. Truths about things other than the blobject correspond to them indirectly. For example, sentences such as

  • (37) Online universities are universities.

may be true even if the extension of the predicate ‘university’ is—strictly speaking—empty or what is referred to by ‘online universities’ is not in the non-empty extension of ‘university’. In short, \(p\) is true\(_1\) iff \(p\) is \(R_{dir}\)-related to the blobject given contextually operative standards \(c_i, c_j , \ldots ,c_m\). Alternatively, \(p\) is true\(_2\) iff \(p\) is \(R_{ind}\)-related to non-blobject entities given contextually operative standards \(c_j, c_k , \ldots ,c_n\). So, truth always consists in correspondence. But the two types of correspondence imply that there is more than one way of being true.

4. Objections to pluralism and responses

4.1 Ambiguity

Some take pluralists to be committed to the thesis that ‘true’ is ambiguous: since the pluralist thinks that there is a range of alethically potent properties (correspondence, coherence, etc.), ‘true’ must be ambiguous between these different properties. This is thought to raise problems for pluralists. According to one objection, the pluralist appears caught in a grave dilemma. ‘True’ is either ambiguous or unambiguous. If it is, then there is a spate of further problems awaiting (see §4.4–§4.6 below). If it is not, then there is only one meaning of ‘true’ and thus only one property designated by it; so pluralism is false.

Friends of pluralism have tended to self-consciously distance themselves from the claim that ‘true’ is ambiguous (e.g., Wright 1996: 924, 2001; Lynch 2001, 2004b, 2005c). Generally, however, the issue of ambiguity for pluralism has not been well-analyzed. Yet, one response has been investigated in some detail. According to this response, the ambiguity of ‘true’ is simply to be taken as a datum. ‘True’ is de facto ambiguous (see, e.g., Schiller 1906; Pratt 1908; Kaufmann 1948; Lucas 1969; Kölbel 2002, 2008; Sher 2005; Wright 2010). Alfred Tarski, for instance, wrote:

The word ‘true’, like other words from our everyday language, is certainly not unambiguous. […] We should reconcile ourselves with the fact that we are confronted, not with one concept, but with several different concepts which are denoted by one word; we should try to make these concepts as clear as possible (by means of definition, or of an axiomatic procedure, or in some other way); to avoid further confusion we should agree to use different terms for different concepts […]. (1944: 342, 355)

If ‘true’ is ambiguous de facto, as some authors have suggested, then the ambiguity objection may turn out to be—again—not so much an objection or disconfirmation of the theory, but rather just a datum about ‘truth’-talk in natural language that should be explained or explained away by theories of truth. In that case, pluralists seem no worse off—and possibly better—than any number of other truth theorists.

A second possible line of response from pluralists is that their view is not necessarily inconsistent with a monistic account of either the meaning of ‘true’ or the concept TRUTH. After all, ‘true’ is ambiguous only if it can be assigned more than one meaning or semantic structure; and it has more than one meaning only if there is more than one stable conceptualization or concept TRUTH supporting each numerically distinct meaning. Yet, nothing about the claim that there is more than one way of being true entails, by itself, that there is more than one concept TRUTH. In principle, the nature of properties like being true—whether homomorphism, superassertibility, coherence, etc.—may outstrip the concept thereof, just as the nature of properties like being water—such as H\(_2\)O, H\(_3\)O, XYZ, etc.—may outstrip the concept WATER (see, e.g., Wright 1996, 2001; Alston 2002; Lynch 2001, 2005c, 2006). Nor is monism about truth necessarily inconsistent with semantic or conceptual pluralism. The supposition that TRUTH is both many and one (i.e., ‘moderate monism’) neither rules out the construction of multiple concepts or meanings thereof, nor rules out the proliferation of uses to express those concepts or meanings. For example, suppose that the only way of being true turns out to be a structural relation \(R\) between reality and certain representations thereof. Such a case is consistent with the existence of competing conceptions of what \(R\) consists in: weak homomorphism, isomorphism, ‘seriously dyadic’ correspondence, a causal \(n\)-place correspondence relation, etc. A more sensitive conclusion, then, is just that the objection from ambiguity is an objection to conceptual or semantic pluralism, not to any alethic theory—pluralism or otherwise.

4.2 The scope problem as a pseudo-problem

According to the so-called ‘Quine-Sainsbury objection’, pluralists’ postulation of ambiguity in metalinguistic alethic terms is not actually necessary, and thus not well-motivated. This is because taxonomical differences among kinds of truths in different domains can be accounted for simply by doing basic ontology in object-level languages.

[E]ven if it is one thing for ‘this tree is an oak’ to be true, another thing for ‘burning live cats is cruel’ to be true, and yet another for ‘Buster Keaton is funnier than Charlie Chaplin’ to be true, this should not lead us to suppose that ‘true’ is ambiguous; for we get a better explanation of the differences by alluding to the differences between trees, cruelty, and humor. (Sainsbury 1996: 900; see also Quine 1960: 131)

Generally, pluralists have not yet developed a response to the Quine-Sainsbury objection. And for some, this is because the real force of the Quine-Sainsbury objection lies in its exposure of the scope problem as a pseudo-problem (Dodd 2013; see also Asay 2018). Again, the idea is that traditional inflationary theories postulate some candidate for \(F\) but the applicability and plausibility of \(F\) differs across regions of discourse. No such theory handles the truths of moral, mathematical, comic, legal, etc. discourse equally well; and this suggests that these theories, by their monism, face limitations on their explanatory scope. Pluralism offers a non-deflationary solution. Yet, why think that these differences among domains mark an alethic difference in truth per se, rather than semantic or discursive differences among the sentences comprising those domains? There is more than one way to score a goal in soccer, for example (via corner kick, ricochet off the foot of an opposing player or the head of a teammate, obstruct the goalkeeper, etc.), but it is far from clear that this entails pluralism about the property of scoring a goal in soccer. (Analogy belongs to an anonymous referee.) Pluralists have yet to adequately address this criticism (although see Blackburn 2013; Lynch 2013b, 2018; Wright 1998 for further discussion).

4.3 The criteria problem

Pluralists who invoke platitude-based strategies bear the burden of articulating inclusion and exclusion criteria for determining which expressions do, or do not, count as members of the essential subset of platitudes upon which this strategy is based (Wright, 2005). Candidates include: ordinariness, intuitiveness, uninformativeness, wide use or citation, uncontroversiality, a prioricity, analyticity, indefeasibility, incontrovertibility, and sundry others. But none has proven to be uniquely adequate, and there is nothing close to a consensus about which criteria to rely on.

For instance, consider the following two conceptions. One conception takes platitudes about \(x\) to be expressions that must be endorsed on pain of being linguistically incompetent with the application of the terms \(t_1 , \ldots ,t_n\) used to talk about \(x\) (Nolan 2009). However, this conception does not readily allow for disagreement: prima facie, it is not incoherent to think that two individuals, each of whom is competent with the application of \(t_1 (x), \ldots ,t_n (x)\), may differ as to whether some \(p\) must be endorsed or whether some expression is genuinely platitudinous. For instance, consider the platitude in (17), which connects being true with corresponding with reality. Being linguistically competent with terms for structural relations like correspondence does not force endorsement of claims that connect truth with correspondence; no one not already in the grip of the correspondence theory would suppose that they must endorse (17), and those who oppose it would certainly suppose otherwise. Further inadequacies beleaguer this conception. It makes no provision for degrees of either endorsement or linguistic incompetence. It makes no distinction between theoretical and non-theoretical terms, much less restrict \(t_1 (x), \ldots ,t_n (x)\) to non-theoretical terms. Nor does it require that platitudes themselves be true. On one hand, this consequently leaves open the possibility that universally-endorsed but false or otherwise alethically defective expressions are included in the platitude-based analysis of ‘true’. An old platitude about whales, for example—one which was universally endorsed on pain of being linguistically incompetent—prior to whales being classified as cetaceans—was that they are big fish. The worry, then, is that the criteria may allow us to screen in certain ‘fish stories’ about truth. This would be a major problem for advocates of Ramsification and other forms of implicit definition, since those techniques work only on the presupposition that all input being Ramsified over or implicitly defined is itself true (Wright 2010). On the other hand, making explicit that platitudes must also be true seems to entail that they are genuine ‘truisms’ (Lynch 2005c), though discovering which ones are truly indefeasible is a further difficulty—one made more difficult by the possibility of error theories (e.g., Devlin 2003) suggesting that instances of the \(T\)-schema are universally false. Indeed, we are inclined to say instances of disquotational, equivalence, and operator schemas are surely candidates for being platitudinous if anything is; but to say that they must be endorsed on pain of being linguistically incompetent is to rule out a priori error theories about instances of the \(T\)-schema.

A second, closely related conception is that platitudes are expressions, which—in virtue of being banal, vacuous, elementary, or otherwise trivial—are acceptable by anyone who understands them (Horwich 1990). The interaction of banality or triviality with acceptance does rule out a wide variety of candidate expressions, however. For instance, claims that are acceptable by anyone who understands them may still be too substantive or informative to count as platitudinous, depending on what they countenance. Similarly, claims that are too ‘thin’ or neutral to vindicate any particular theory \(T\) may still be too substantive or informative to count as genuinely platitudinous on this conception (Wright 1999). This is particularly so given that nothing about a conception of platitudes as ‘pretheoretical claims’ strictly entails that they reduce to mere banalities (Vision 2004). Nevertheless, criteria like banality or triviality plus acceptance might also screen in too few expressions (perhaps as few as one, such as a particular instance of the \(T\)-schema). Indeed, it is an open question whether any of the principles in (11)–(28) would count as platitudes on this conception.

An alternative conception emphasizes that the criteria should instead be the interaction of informality, truth, a prioricity, or perhaps even analyticity (Wright 2001: 759). In particular, platitudes need not take the form of an identity claim, equational definition, or a material biconditional. At the extreme, expressions can be as colloquial as you please so long as they remain true a priori (or analytically). These latter criteria are commonly appealed to, but are also not without problems. Firstly, a common worry is whether there are any strictly analytic truths about truth, and, if there are, whether they can perform any serious theoretical work. Secondly, these latter criteria would exclude certain truths that are a posteriori but no less useful to a platitude-based strategist.

4.4 The instability challenge

Another objection to pluralism is that it is an inherently instable view: i.e., as soon as the view is formulated, simple reasoning renders it untenable (Pedersen 2006, 2010; see also Tappolet 1997, 2000; Wright 2012). This so-called instability challenge can be presented as follows. According to the moderate pluralist, there is more than one truth property \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\). Yet, given \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\), it seems we should recognize another truth property:

  • (38) \(\forall p[F_U (p) \leftrightarrow F_1 (p) \vee \cdots \vee F_n (p)]\).

Observe that \(F_U\) is not merely some property possessed by every \(p\) which happens to have one of \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\). (The property of being a sentence is one such a property, but it poses no trouble to the pluralist.) Rather, \(F_U\) must be an alethic property whose extension perfectly positively covaries with the combined extension of the pluralist truth properties \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\). And since nothing is required for the existence of this new property other than the truth properties already granted by the pluralist, (38) gives a necessary and sufficient condition for \(F_U\) to be had by some \(p\): a sentence \(p\) is \(F_U\) just in case \(p\) is \(F_1 \vee \cdots \vee F_n\). Thus, any sentence that is any of \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\) may be true in some more generic or universal way, \(F_U\). This suggests, at best, that strong pluralism is false, and moderate monism is true; and at worst, there seems to be something instable, or self-refuting, about pluralism.

Pluralists can make concessive or non-concessive responses to the instability challenge. A concessive response grants that such a truth property exists, but maintains that it poses no serious threat to pluralism. A non-concessive response is one intended to rebut the challenge, e.g., by rejecting the existence of a common or universal truth property. One way of trying to motivate this rejection of \(F_U\) is by attending to the distinction between sparse and abundant properties, and then demonstrating that alethic properties like truth must be sparse and additionally argue that the would-be trouble-maker \(F_U\) is an abundant property. According to sparse property theorists, individuals must be unified by some qualitative similarity in order to share a property. For example, all even numbers are qualitatively similar in that they share the property of being divisible by two without remainder. Now, consider a subset of very diverse properties \(G_1 , \ldots ,G_n\) possessed by an individual \(a\). Is there some further, single property of being \(G_1\), or …, or \(G_n\) that \(a\) has? Such a further property, were it to exist, would be highly disjunctive; and it may seem unclear what, if anything, individuals that were \(G_1\), or …, or \(G_n\) would have in common—other than being \(G_1\), or …, or \(G_n\). According to sparse property theorists, the lack of qualitative similarity means that this putative disjunctive property is not a property properly so-called. Abundant property theorists, on the other hand, deny that qualitative similarity is needed in order for a range of individuals to share a property. Properties can be as disjunctive as you like. Indeed, for any set \(A\) there is at least one property had by all members of \(A\)—namely, being a member of \(A\). And since there is a set of all things that have some disjunctive property, there is a property—abundantly construed—had by exactly those things. It thus seems difficult to deny the existence of \(F_U\) if the abundant conception of properties is adopted. So pluralists who want to give a non-concessive response to the metaphysical instability challenge may want to endorse the sparse conception (Pedersen 2006). This is because the lack of uniformity in the nature of truth across domains is underwritten by a lack of qualitative similarity between the different truth properties that apply to specific domains of discourse. The truth property \(F_U\) does not exist, because truth properties are to be thought of in accordance with the sparse conception.

Even if the sparse conception fails to ground pluralists’ rejection of the existence of the universal truth property \(F_U\), a concessive response to the instability challenge is still available. Pluralists can make a strong case that the truth properties \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\) are more fundamental than the universal truth property \(F_U\) (Pedersen 2010). This is because \(F_U\) is metaphysically dependent on \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\), in the sense that \(F_U\) is introduced in virtue of its being one of \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\), and not vice-versa. Hence, even if the pluralist commits to the existence of \(F_U\)—and hence, to moderate metaphysical monism—there is still a clear sense in which her view is distinctively more pluralist than monist.

4.5 Problems regarding mixed discourse

4.5.1 Mixed atomic sentences

The content of some atomic sentences seems to hark exclusively from a particular region of discourse. For instance, ‘lactose is a sugar’ concerns chemical reality, while ‘\(7 + 5 = 12\)’ is solely about the realm of numbers (and operations on these). Not all discourse is pure or exclusive, however; we often engage in so-called ‘mixed discourse’, in which contents from different regions of discourse are combined. For example, consider:

  • (39) Causing pain is bad.

Mixed atomic sentences such as (39) are thought to pose problems for pluralists. It seems to implicate concepts from the physical domain (causation), the mental domain (pain), and the moral domain (badness) (Sher 2005: 321–22). Yet, if pluralism is correct, then in which way is (39) true? Is it true in the way appropriate to talk of the physical, the mental, or the moral? Is it true in neither of these ways, or in all of these three ways, or in some altogether different way?

The source of the problem may be the difficulty in classifying discursive content—a classificatory task that is an urgent one for pluralists. For it is unclear how they can maintain that regions of discourse \(D_1 , \ldots ,D_n\) partially determine the ways in which sentences can be true without a procedure for determining which region of discourse \(D_i\) a given \(p\) belongs to.

One suggestion is that a mixed atomic sentence \(p\) belongs to no particular domain. Another is that it belongs to several (Wyatt 2013). Lynch (2005b: 340–41) suggested paraphrasing mixed atomic sentences as sentences that are classifiable as belonging to particular domains. For example, (39) might be paraphrased as:

  • (40) We ought not cause pain.

Unlike (39), the paraphrased (40) appears to be a pure atomic sentence belonging to the domain of morals. This proposal remains underdeveloped, however. It is not at all clear that (40) counts as a felicitous paraphrase of (39), and, more generally, unclear whether all mixed atomic sentences can be paraphrased such that they belong to just one domain without thereby altering their meaning, truth-conditions, or truth-values.

Another possible solution addresses the problem head-on by questioning whether atomic sentences really are mixed, thereby denying the need for any such paraphrases. Consider the following sentences:

  • (41) The Mona Lisa is beautiful.
  • (42) Speeding is illegal.

Prima facie, what determines the domain-membership of (41) and (42) is the aesthetic and legal predicates ‘is beautiful’ and ‘is illegal’, respectively. It is an aesthetic matter whether the Mona Lisa is beautiful; this is because (41) is true in some way just in case the Mona Lisa falls in the extension of the aesthetic predicate ‘is beautiful’ (and mutatis mutandis for (42)). In the same way, we might take (39) to exclusively belong to the moral domain given that the moral predicate ‘is bad’. (This solution was presented in the first 2012 version of this entry; see Edwards 2018a for later, more detailed treatment.)

It is crucial to the latter two proposals that any given mixed atomic sentence \(p\) has its domain membership essentially, since such membership is what determines the relevant kind of truth. Sher (2005, 2011) deals with the problem of mixed atomic sentences differently. On her view, the truth of a mixed atomic sentence is not accounted for by membership to some specific domain; rather the ‘factors’ involved in the sentence determine a specific form of correspondence, and this specific form of correspondence is what accounts for the truth of \(p\). The details about which specific form of correspondence obtains is determined at the sub-sentential levels of reference, satisfaction, and fulfillment. For example, the form of correspondence that accounts for the truth of (39) obtains as a combination of the physical fulfillment of ‘the causing of \(x\)’, the mental reference of ‘pain’, and the moral satisfaction of ‘\(x\) is bad’ (2005: 328). No paraphrase is needed.

4.5.2 Mixed compounds

Another related problem pertains to two or more sentences joined by one or more logical connectives, as in

  • (43) Killing innocent people is wrong and \(7 + 5 = 12\).

Unlike atomic sentences, the mixing here takes place at the sentential rather than sub-sentential level: (43) is a conjunction, which mixes the pure sentence ‘\(7 + 5 = 12\)’ with the pure sentence ‘killing innocent people is wrong’. (There are, of course, also mixed compounds that involve mixed atomic sentences.) For many theorists, each conjunct seems to be true in a different way, if true at all: the first conjunct in whatever way is appropriate to moral theory, and the second conjunct in whatever way is appropriate to arithmetic. But then, how is the pluralist going to account for the truth of the conjunction (Tappolet 2000: 384)? Pluralists owe an answer to the question of which way, exactly, a conjunction is true when its conjuncts are true in different ways.

Additional complications arise for pluralists who commit to facts being what make sentences true (e.g., Lynch 2001: 730), or other such truth-maker or -making theses. Prima facie, we would reasonably expect there to be different kinds of facts that make the conjuncts of (43) true, and which subsequently account for the differences in their different ways of being true. However, what fact or facts makes true the mixed compound? Regarding (43), is it the mathematical fact, the moral fact, or some further kind of fact? On one hand, the claims that mathematical or moral facts, respectively, make \(p\) true seem to betray the thought that both facts contribute equally to the truth of the mixed compound. On the other hand, the claim that some third ‘mixed’ kind of fact makes \(p\) true leaves the pluralist with the uneasy task of telling a rather alchemist story about fact-mixtures.

Functionalists about truth (e.g., Lynch 2005b: 396–97) propose to deal with compounds by distinguishing between two kinds of realizers of the \(F\)-role. The first is an atomic realizer, such that an atomic proposition \(p\) is true iff \(p\) has a property that realizes the \(F\)-role. The second is a compound realizer, such that a compound \(q * r\) (where \(q\) and \(r\) may themselves be complex) is true iff

  • (44) \({*} = \wedge : q \wedge r\) has the property of being an instance of the truth-function for conjunction with conjuncts that both have a property that realizes the \(F\)-role.
  • (45) \({*} = \vee : q \vee r\) has the property of being an instance of the truth-function for disjunction with at least one disjunct that has a property that realizes the \(F\)-role.
  • (46) \({*} = \rightarrow : q \rightarrow r\) has the property of being an instance of the truth-function for material conditional with an antecedent that does not have the property that realizes the \(F\)-role for its domain or a consequent that has a property that realizes the \(F\)-role.

The realizers for atomic sentences are properties like correspondence, coherence, and superwarrant. The realizer properties for compounds are special, in the sense that realizer properties for a given kind of compound are only had by compounds of that kind. Witness that each of these compound realizer properties requires any of its bearers to be an instance of a specific truth-function. Pure and mixed compounds are treated equally on this proposal: when true, they are true because they instantiate the truth-function for conjunction, having two or more conjuncts that have a property that realizes the \(F\)-role (and mutatis mutandis for disjunctions and material conditionals).

However, this functionalist solution to the problem of mixed compounds relies heavily on that theory’s monism—i.e., its insistence that the single role property \(F\) is a universal truth property. This might leave one wondering whether a solution is readily available to someone who rejects the existence of such a property. One strategy is simply to identify the truth of conjunctions, disjunctions, and conditionals with the kind of properties specified by (44), (45), and (46), respectively (as opposed to taking them to be realizers of a single truth property). Thus, e.g., the truth of any conjunction simply \(is\) to be an instance of the truth-function for conjunction with conjuncts that have the property that plays the \(F\)-role for them (Kim & Pedersen 2018, Pedersen & Lynch 2018 (Sect. Another strategy is to try to use the resources of multi-valued logic. For example, one can posit an ordered set of designated values for each way of being true \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\) (perhaps according to their status as ‘heavyweight’ or ‘lightweight’), and then take conjunction to be a minimizing operation and disjunction a maximizing one, i.e., \(v(p \wedge q) = \min\{v(p), v(q)\}\) and \(v(p \vee q) = \max\{v(p), v(q)\}\). Resultingly, each conjunction and disjunction—whether pure or mixed—will be either true in some way or false in some way straightforwardly determined by the values of the constituents. For example, consider the sentences

  • (47) Heat is mean molecular kinetic energy.
  • (48) Manslaughter is a felony.

Suppose that (47) is true in virtue of corresponding to physical reality, while (48) true in virtue of cohering with a body of law; and suppose further that correspondence \((F_1)\) is more ‘heavyweight’ than coherence \((F_2)\). Since conjunction is a minimizing operation and \(F_2 \lt F_1\), then ‘heat is mean molecular kinetic energy and manslaughter is a felony’ will be \(F_2\). Since disjunction is a maximizing operation, then ‘heat is mean molecular kinetic energy or manslaughter is a felony’ will be \(F_1\).

The many-valued solution to the problem of mixed compounds just outlined is formally adequate because it determines a way that each compound is true. However, while interesting, the proposal needs to be substantially developed in several respects. For example, how is negation treated—are there several negations, one for each way of being true, or is there a single negation? Also, taking ‘heat is mean molecular kinetic energy and manslaughter is a felony’ to be true in the way appropriate to law betrays a thought that seems at least initially compelling, viz. that both conjuncts contribute to the truth of the conjunction. Alternatively, one could take mixed compounds to be true in some third way. However, this would leave the pluralist with the task of telling some story about how this third way of being true relates to the other two. Again substantial work needs to be done.

Edwards (2008) proposed another solution to the problem of mixed conjunctions, the main idea of which is to appeal to the following biconditional schema:

  • (49) \(p\) is true\(_i\) and \(q\) is true\(_j\) iff \(p \wedge q\) is true\(_k\).

Edwards suggests that pluralists can answer the challenge that mixed conjunctions pose by reading the stated biconditional as having an order of determination: \(p \wedge q\) is true\(_k\) in virtue of \(p\)’s being true\(_i\) and \(q\)’s being true\(_j\), but not vice-versa. This, he maintains, explains what kind of truth a conjunction \(p \wedge q\) has when its conjuncts are true in different ways; for the conjunction is true\(_k\) in virtue of having conjuncts that are both true, where it is inessential whether the conjuncts are true in the same way. Truth\(_k\) is a further way of being true that depends on the conjuncts being true in some way without reducing to either of them. The property true\(_k\) is thus not a generic or universal truth property that applies to the conjuncts as well as the conjunction.

As Cotnoir (2009) emphasizes, Edwards’ proposal provides too little information about the nature of true\(_k\). What little is provided makes transparent the commitment to true\(_k\)’s being a truth property had only by conjunctions, in which case it is unclear whether Edwards’s solution can generalize. In this regard, Edwards’ proposal is similar to Lynch’s functionalist proposal, which is committed to there being a specific realizer property for each type of logical compound.

4.5.3 Mixed inferences

Mixed inferences—inferences involving truth-apt sentences from different domains—appear to be yet another problem for the pluralist (Tappolet 1997, 2000; Pedersen 2006). One can illustrate the problem by supposing, with the pluralist, that there are two ways of being true, one of which is predicated of the antecedent of a conditional and the other as its consequent. It can be left open in what way the conditional itself is true. Consider the following inference:

  • (50) Satiated dogs are lazy.
  • (51) Our dog is satiated.
  • (52) Our dog is lazy.

This inference would appear to be valid. However, it is not clear that pluralists can account for its validity by relying on the standard characterization of validity as necessary truth preservation from premises to conclusion. Given that the truth properties applicable to respectively (51) and (52) are different, what truth property is preserved in the inference? The pluralist owes an explanation of how the thesis that there are many ways of being true can account for the validity of mixed inferences.

Beall (2000) argued that the account of validity used in multi-valued logics gives pluralists the resources to deal with the problem of mixed inferences. For many-valued logics, validity is accounted for in terms of preservation of designated value, where designated values can be thought of as ways of being true, while non-designated values can be thought of as ways of being false. Adopting a designated-value account of validity, pluralists can simply take \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\) to be the relevant designated values and define an inference as valid just in case the conclusion is designated if each premise is designated (i.e., one of \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n)\). On this account, the validity of (mixed) arguments whose premises and conclusion concern different regions of discourse is evaluable in terms of more than one of \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\); the validity of (pure) arguments whose premises and conclusion pertain to the same region of discourse is evaluable in terms of the same \(F_i\) (where \(1 \le i \le n)\). An immediate rejoinder is that the term ‘true’ in ‘ways of being true’ refers to a universal way of being true—i.e., being designated simpliciter (Tappolet 2000: 384). If so, then the multi-valued solution comes at the cost of inadvertently acknowledging a universal truth property. Of course, as noted, the existence of a universal truth property poses a threat only to strong pluralism.

4.5 The problem of generalization

Alethic terms are useful devices for generalizing. For instance, suppose we wish to state the law of excluded middle. A tedious way would be to produce a long—indeed, infinite—conjunction:

  • (53) Everything is either actual or non-actual, and thick or not thick, and red or not red, and …

However, given the equivalence schema for propositions,

  • (54) The proposition that \(p\) is true iff \(p\).

there is a much shorter formula, which captures what (54) is meant to express by using ‘true’, but without loss of explanatory power (Horwich 1990: 4):

  • (55) Every proposition of the form \(\langle\)everything is \(G\) or not\(-G\rangle\) is true.

Alethic terms are also useful devices for generalizing over what speakers say, as in

  • (56) What Chen said is true.

The utility of a generalization like (56) is not so much that it eliminates the need to rely on an infinite conjunction, but that it is ‘blind’ (i.e., made under partial ignorance of what was said).

Pluralists seem to have difficulty accounting for truth’s use as a device for generalization. One response is to simply treat uses of ‘is true’ as elliptical for ‘is true in one way or another’. In doing so, pluralists account for generalization without sacrificing their pluralism. A possible drawback, however, is that it may commit pluralists to the claim that ‘true’ designates the disjunctive property of being \(F_1 \vee \cdots \vee F_n\). Granting the existence of such a property gives pluralists a story to tell about generalizations like (55) and (56), but the response is a concessive one available only to moderate pluralists. However, as noted in §4.2.3, the existence of such a property is not a devastating blow to all pluralists, since the domain-specific truth properties \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\) remain explanatorily basic in relation to the property of being \(F_1 \vee \cdots \vee F_n\).

4.6 The problem of normativity

As is often noted, truth appears to be normative—i.e., a positive standard governing immanent content (Sher 2004: 26). According to one prominent tradition (Engel 2002, 2013; Wedgwood 2002; Boghossian 2003; Shah 2003; Gibbard 2005; Ferrari 2018; Lynch 2009; Whiting 2013), truth is a doxastic norm because it is the norm of correctness for belief:

  • (57) \(\forall p\)(a belief that \(p\) is correct iff \(p\) is true).

Indeed, many take it to be constitutive of belief that its norm of correctness is truth—i.e., part of what makes belief the kind of attitude that it is. If correctness is understood in prescriptive—rather than descriptive—terms, then (57) presumably gives way to the following schema:

  • (58) \(\forall p\)(one ought to believe that \(p\) when \(p\) is true).

A third normative schema linking truth and belief classifies truth as a good of belief (Lynch, 2004a, 2005b: 390, 2009: 10; David 2005):

  • (59) \(\forall p\)(it is prima facie good to believe that \(p\) when \(p\) is true).

What these schemas suggest is that the apparent doxastic and assertoric normativity of truth appears to be entirely general, in a manner analogous to which winning appears to be a general norm that applies to any competitive game (Dummett 1978: 8; Lynch 2005b: 390). Hence, if \(p\) is true, then it is correct and good to believe that \(p\), and one should believe that \(p\)—regardless of whether \(p\) concerns fashion or physics, comedy or chemistry. And again, the generalized normativity of truth appears to make trouble for pluralists, insofar as the thesis that there are several ways of being true apparently implies a proliferation of doxastic truth norms. Yet, instead of truth being the single normative property mentioned in (57), (58), and (59), the pluralist commits to a wide variety of norms—one for each domain-specific truth property \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\). For example, for any given trigonometric statement p, it is prima facie good to believe \(p\) when \(p\) is true in the way appropriate to trigonometry, while the prima facie goodness of believing a truth about antibodies is tied to whatever truth property is apropos to immunology. Hence, whereas the normative aspects of truth seem characterized by unity, pluralism renders disunity.

As before, a concessive response can be given by granting the existence of a disjunctive, universal truth property: the normative property of being \(F_1 \vee \cdots \vee F_n\). Although this amounts to an endorsement moderate pluralism, it poses no threat to the importance of the domain-specific norms \(F_1 , \ldots ,F_n\), insofar as these properties are explanatorily more basic than the normative property of being \(F_1 \vee \cdots \vee F_n\). However, at the same time, they do provide the unity needed to maintain that the predicate is true in (57), (58), and (59) denotes a single, universally applicable norm:

  • (60) \(\forall p\)(a belief that \(p\) is correct iff \(p\) is \(F_1 \vee \cdots \vee F_n)\).
  • (61) \(\forall p\)(one ought to believe \(p\) when \(p\) is \(F_1 \vee \cdots \vee F_n)\).
  • (62) \(\forall p\)(it is prima facie good to believe that \(p\) when \(p\) is \(F_1 \vee \cdots \vee F_n)\).

Likewise, functionalists once again respond to the challenge by invoking the monist aspect of their view. There is a single normative property—the property of having a property that realizes the \(F\)-role—that delivers a uniform understanding of (57), (58), and (59).


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