First published Fri Sep 11, 2015

Relativism, roughly put, is the view that truth and falsity, right and wrong, standards of reasoning, and procedures of justification are products of differing conventions and frameworks of assessment and that their authority is confined to the context giving rise to them. More precisely, “relativism” covers views which maintain that—at a high level of abstraction—at least some class of things have the properties they have (e.g., beautiful, morally good, epistemically justified) not simpliciter, but only relative to a given framework of assessment (e.g., local cultural norms, individual standards), and correspondingly, that the truth of claims attributing these properties holds only once the relevant framework of assessment is specified or supplied. Relativists characteristically insist, furthermore, that if something is only relatively so, then there can be no framework-independent vantage point from which the matter of whether the thing in question is so can be established.

Relativism has been, in its various guises, both one of the most popular and most reviled philosophical doctrines of our time. Defenders see it as a harbinger of tolerance and the only ethical and epistemic stance worthy of the open-minded and tolerant. Detractors dismiss it for its alleged incoherence and uncritical intellectual permissiveness. Debates about relativism permeate the whole spectrum of philosophical sub-disciplines. From ethics to epistemology, science to religion, political theory to ontology, theories of meaning and even logic, philosophy has felt the need to respond to this heady and seemingly subversive idea. Discussions of relativism often also invoke considerations relevant to the very nature and methodology of philosophy and to the division between the so-called “analytic and continental” camps in philosophy. And yet, despite a long history of debate going back to Plato and an increasingly large body of writing, it is still difficult to come to an agreed definition of what, at its core, relativism is, and what philosophical import it has. This entry attempts to provide a broad account of the many ways in which “relativism” has been defined, explained, defended and criticized.

1. What is Relativism?

The label “relativism” has been attached to a wide range of ideas and positions which may explain the lack of consensus on how the term should be defined. The profusion of the use of the term “relativism” in contemporary philosophy means that there is no ready consensus on any one definition. Here are three prominent, but not necessarily incompatible, approaches:

1.1 The co-variance definition

A standard way of defining and distinguishing between different types of relativism is to begin with the claim that a phenomenon x (e.g., values, epistemic, aesthetic and ethical norms, experiences, judgments, and even the world) is somehow dependent on and co-varies with some underlying, independent variable y (e.g., paradigms, cultures, conceptual schemes, belief systems, language). The type of dependency relativists propose has a bearing on the question of definitions. Let us take some examples.

  • (a) Justice is relative to local norms.
  • (b) Truth is relative to a language-game.
  • (c) The measurement of temperature is relative to the scale we use.

Each of (a)–(c) exhibits a relation of dependence where a change in the independent variable y will result in variations in the dependent variable x. However, of the three examples cited above, normally only (a) and (b) are deemed relevant to philosophical discussions of relativism, for one main attraction of relativism is that it offers a way of settling (or explaining away) what appear to be profound disagreements on questions of value, knowledge and ontology and the relativizing parameter often involves people, their beliefs, cultures or languages.

The co-variance definition proceeds by asking the dual questions: (i) what is relativized? and (ii) what is it relativized to? The first question enables us to distinguish forms of relativism in terms of their objects, for example, relativism about truth, goodness, beauty, and their subject matters, e.g., science, law, religion. The answer to the second question individuates forms of relativism in terms of their domains or frames of reference—e.g., conceptual frameworks, cultures, historical periods, etc. Such classifications have been proposed by Haack (1996), O’Grady (2002), Baghramian (2004), and Swoyer (2010). The following table classifies different relativistic positions according what is being relativized, or its objects, and what is being relativized to, or its domains.

(I) Individual’s viewpoints and preferences (II) Historical Epochs (III) Cultures, society, social groupings (IV) Conceptual schemes, languages, frameworks (V) Context of assessment, e.g., taste parameter, assessor’s/agent’s set of beliefs
(A) Cognitive norms, e.g., rationality, logic Alethic Subjectivism/ Epistemic Subjectivism Alethic and Epistemic Historicism Alethic Cultural Relativism/ Epistemic Cultural Relativism Alethic Relativism/Epistemic Relativism Alethic
(B) Moral values Moral Subjectivism Ethical Historicism Ethical Cultural/ Social Relativism Moral Conceptual Relativism (New) Moral Relativism
(C) Aesthetic values Aesthetic Subjectivism Aesthetic Historicism Aesthetic Cultural/ Social Relativism Aesthetic Conceptual Relativism (New) Aesthetic Relativism
(D) Thoughts, Perception Thought/percept Subjectivism Thought/percept Historicism Thought/percept Cultural/Social Relativism Thought/percept Conceptual Relativism, Linguistic Relativity N/A
(E) Propositions or tokens of utterances expressing personal preferences, future contingents, epistemic models, aesthetic and moral predicates N/A N/A N/A N/A New Relativism

Table 1: Domains of Relativization (y)

Table 1 reflects the availability of fine-grained distinctions between different forms of relativism as functions of both objects (x) and domains (y) of relativization. In practice, however, much contemporary discussions of relativism focus on subjectivism, historicism, cultural relativism and conceptual relativism, along the axis of y, and cognitive/epistemic relativism, ethical or moral relativism and aesthetic relativism, along the axis of x. As we shall see in §5, New Relativism, where the objects of relativization (in the left column) are utterance tokens expressing claims about cognitive norms, moral values, etc. and the domain of relativization is the standards of an assessor, has also been the focus of much recent discussion.

1.2 Relativism by contrast

A second approach to defining relativism casts its net more widely by focusing primarily on what relativists deny. Defined negatively, relativism amounts to the rejection of a number of interconnected philosophical positions. Traditionally, relativism is contrasted with:

Absolutism, the view that at least some truths or values in the relevant domain apply to all times, places or social and cultural frameworks. They are universal and not bound by historical or social conditions. Absolutism is often used as the key contrast idea to relativism.

Objectivism or the position that cognitive, ethical and aesthetic norms and values in general, but truth in particular, are independent of judgments and beliefs at particular times and places, or in other words they are (non-trivially) mind-independent. The anti-objectivist on the other hand, denies that there is such thing as simply being “true’, “good”, “tasty” or “beautiful” but argues that we can coherently discuss such values only in relation to parameters that have something to do with our mental lives.

Monism or the view that, in any given area or topic subject to disagreement, there can be no more than one correct opinion, judgment, or norm. The relativist often wishes to allow for a plurality of equally valid values or even truths.

Realism, when defined in such a way that it entails both the objectivity and singularity of truth, also stands in opposition to relativism.

Relativism in this negative sense is a prominent feature of the work of the relativists malgré eux such as Richard Rorty (1979) and Jacques Derrida (1974). What justifies the appellation “relativist”, rather than “skeptic”, is not only these philosophers’ suspicion of the possibility of objectivity but their insistence on the role of socio-historical, psychological and textual contexts in accounts of “truth” and “knowledge” claims.

1.3 The hidden parameter definition

What also binds various forms of relativism is an underlying idea that claims to truth, knowledge or justification have an implicit, maybe even unnoticed, relationship to a parameter or domain. Gilbert Harman (1975), Robert Nozick (2001), and Crispin Wright (2008) are among the philosophers to propose versions of this thesis. Paul Boghossian summarizes the position this way:

the relativist about a given domain, D, purports to have discovered that the truths of D involve an unexpected relation to a parameter. (Boghossian 2006b: 13)

To take an example, moral relativism, according to this approach, is the claim that the truth or justification of beliefs with moral content is relative to specific moral codes. So the sentence “It is wrong to sell people as slaves” is elliptical for “It is wrong to sell people as slaves relative to the moral code of …”. Or alternatively, as Kusch (2010) formulates the idea on behalf of the relativist: “It is wrong-relative-to-the-moral-code-of-…” to sell people as slaves. The resulting sentence(s) turns out to be true, according to the relativist, depending on how we fill in the “…”. So, “It is wrong to sell people as slaves” comes out true relative to the moral code of the United Nations Charter of Human Rights and false relative to the moral code of ancient Greece. The justifying thought is that judgments about the morality of slavery, or any other ethical issue, are based on differing conventions, and there is no universal or objective criterion for choosing among differing competing socio-historically constituted conventions. Moreover, as a corollary of this approach, there is no truth of the matter of whether it is wrong to sell people as slaves, independently of the specification of some standard. Thus on the hidden parameter account, a consequence is that the relevant claims will be true, if at all, only relative to some parameter.

This particular approach to relativism is often expressed in explicitly linguistic terms and is favored by philosophers interested in the semantic dimensions of relativism. The claim is that predicates such as “is true”, “is rational”, “is right”, “is good” etc. in a natural language have the apparent logical form of one-place predicates, but their surface grammatical form is misleading, because upon further investigation they prove to be elliptical for two-place predicates such as “is true relative to…”, “is right according to”, etc., (of course, where such predicates are available). Relativism, according to this approach, is the claim that a statement of the form “A is P” within a given domain (e.g., science, ethics, metaphysics, etc.) is elliptical for the statement “A is P in relation to C”, where A stands for an assertion, belief, judgment or action, P stands for a predicate such as “true”, “beautiful”, “right”, “rational”, “logical”, “known” etc., and C stands for a specific culture, epistemic framework, language, belief-system, etc.

The three approaches outlined here are compatible and sometimes complementary. A relativistic thesis as captured by the approach outlined in §1.1 for instance, will also be relativistic in at least one of the negative senses outlined in §1.2. Moreover, as we shall see, since various subdivisions of relativism appearing in table 1 could, with appropriate modification, be expressed as claims about the truth of sentences falling in a particular domain, then the hidden predicate approach is applicable to them as well. (See §5 for a more detailed way to give expression to the hidden parameter insight within recent work in the philosophy of language.)

1.4 The scope of relativism

A further consideration relevant to defining relativism is its scope.

1.4.1 Global vs. Local Relativism

The basic idea of global relativism is captured by the oft-repeated slogan “all is relative”. The claim is that all beliefs, regardless of their subject matter, are true only relative to a framework or parameter. Local relativists, by contrast, limit their claim of relativization to self-contained areas of discourse, e.g., ethics, aesthetics and taste but argue that, for instance, scientific truths are not suitable candidates for a relativistic understanding (but also see §4.4.3). It is worth noting that local relativisms, typically, are endorsed on the basis of philosophical considerations connected to the kinds of features that are claimed to be relative (e.g., aesthetic standards, epistemic principles), or relatedly, semantic considerations to do with discourse where such features are attributed. Global relativism, by contrast, seems to be motivated not so much by considerations about particular features, but by more general considerations about truth itself.

As we will see, global relativism is open to the charge of inconsistency and self-refutation, for if all is relative, then so is relativism. Local relativism is immune from this type of criticism, as it need not include its own statement in the scope of what is to be relativized. Unsurprisingly, local rather than global relativism is much more common within contemporary debates. There is also a question mark on whether we could apply relativism to all truths in a completely unrestricted way; for instance, Kölbel (2011) has argued that claims such as “an object is beautiful and not beautiful” and “an object is identical to itself” have to be excluded.

1.4.2 Strong vs. Weak Relativism

A further distinction is made between weak and strong forms of relativism. Strong relativism is the claim that one and the same belief or judgment may be true in one context (e.g., culture or framework or assessment) and false in another. Weak relativism is the claim that there may be beliefs or judgments that are true in one framework but not true in a second simply because they are not available or expressible in the second. Bernard Williams’ “relativism of distance” (Williams 1985) and Ian Hacking’s (1982) defense of variability in styles of reasoning are instances of weak relativism. Williams argues that certain concepts are only available to people who live a particular form of life. These are concepts that are not a part of what Williams calls the “absolute conception of the world” and do not express truths that any rational creature, regardless of her culture, would in principle acknowledge. Truths that require these concepts for their formulation are expressible only in languages whose speakers take part in that particular form of life. Such truths need not be true in a relativized sense—true relative to some parameters, false relative to others; rather, such truths are perspectival: real but visible only from a certain angle, i.e., for people who adopt a certain way of life. This weaker form of relativism, in so far as it denies the universality of certain truth claims, is captured more readily by the negative definition (§1.2) of relativism.

2. Why Relativism?

Interest in relativism as a philosophical doctrine goes back to ancient Greece. In more recent decades, however, relativism has also proven popular not only as a philosophical position but also as an idea underwriting a normative—ethical and political-outlook. (see Bloom 1987, in particular the Introduction). A number of philosophical considerations as well as socio-historical developments explain the enduring interest in and the more recent popularity of relativism.

2.1 Empirical claims of diversity and their consequences

Data regarding diversity of belief systems, conceptual frameworks and ways of life have frequently been used by philosophers and anthropologists alike to give credibility to philosophical arguments for relativism (For example see Hollis & Lukes 1982 and Wilson 1970). The mere fact of empirical diversity does not lead to relativism, but, relativism as a philosophical doctrine, has often been taken as a natural position to adopt in light of empirical diversity, in part, because relativism helps to make sense of such diversity without the burden of explaining who is in error.

Descriptive relativism, an empirical and methodological position adopted by social anthropologists, relies on ethnographic data to highlight the paucity of universally agreed upon norms, values and explanatory frameworks. From polygamy to cannibalism, from witchcraft to science we find major differences between the worldviews and outlooks of individuals and groups. Descriptive relativism is often used as the starting point for philosophical debates on relativism in general and cultural relativism in particular. The observed radical differences among cultures, it is argued, show the need for a relativistic assessment of value systems and conceptual commitments. Some anti-relativist universalists, on the other hand, argue that underlying the apparent individual and cultural differences, there are some core commonalities to all belief systems and socio-cultural outlooks (e.g., Nussbaum 1997). But the relativistically inclined respond by first pointing to the seeming incommensurability of various ethical and conceptual frameworks and the variability of cognitive norms and practices in difference cultures, and then, on this basis, maintain that the so-called “commonalities” belie significant differences. The anti-relativist may concede the point and insist that where such disagreements exist, at most one view is correct and the rest mistaken. But in so far as we are reluctant to impute widespread and systematic error to other cultures, or to our own, relativism remains an attractive option. Descriptive relativism is also central to the brand of relativism advocated by the sociologists of scientific knowledge and other social constructionists who argue that, even in the so-called “hard sciences”, we cannot escape the specter of irresolvable differences and even incommensurability (see §4.4.3).

2.2 Disagreements and intractability

There is not only a marked diversity of views on questions of right and wrong, truth and falsehood, etc., but more significantly, many disputes arising from such differences seem intractable. There are instances of long-standing disagreement, such that the disputants are very plausibly talking about the same subject matter (thus avoiding incommensurability) and genuinely disagreeing with each other; and yet, no amount of information and debate enables them or us to resolve the disagreement. And moreover, in such cases, it can seem that neither side seems to have made any obvious mistake (see, e.g., Hales 2014).

If well-informed, honest and intelligent people are unable to resolve conflicts of opinion, we should, some relativists argue, accept that all parties to such disputes could be right and their conflicting positions have equal claims to truth, each according to their own perspective or point of view. Their disagreement is faultless (Kölbel 2004; Brogaard 2007; Hales 2014). Many relativistically inclined philosophers, (e.g., Max Kölbel (2004), Wright (2006) and John MacFarlane with terminological qualification (2014: 133–136)) see the presence of faultless disagreements as central to motivating and justifying relativism. The anti-relativists counter that the very notion of a “faultless” disagreement is incompatible with our common understanding of what it means to disagree. It is a hallmark of disagreement, as commonly understood, that the parties involved find fault with the other sides’ views. When people disagree at least one of them is making a mistake or is failing to believe what he or she ought to believe given his or her cognitive aims. Relativism accordingly offers a revisionary account of what it means to disagree (e.g., MacFarlane 2007, 2014; see §5 where the point has been discussed in some detail); but it is not clear if the account can explain what is left of a disagreement to preserve once we allow that both parties to a disagreement could be right (Carter 2013; Dreier 2009).

A sophisticated semantic version of relativism about truth, known as truth-relativism, and alternatively as “new relativism”, has been proposed in recent years and which attempts to deal with some of these issues (e.g., MacFarlane 2014). We will return to this variety of relativism in §5.

A different perspective on the move from disagreement to relativism is offered in recent work by Carol Rovane (2012 and 2013), who rejects the prevailing consensus on what she calls the “disagreement intuition of relativism” in favor of an “alternatives intuition”. According to Rovane, relativism is motivated by the existence of truths that cannot be embraced together, not because they contradict and hence disagree with each other but because they are not universal truths. The example Rovane gives is conflict between a belief that deference to parents is morally obligatory in Indian traditionalist sense and the belief that it is not morally obligatory in the American individualist sense. Each belief is true within its particular ethical framework but the two beliefs cannot be conjoined or embraced together. Or more generally, it is not possible both to exercise full autonomy and simultaneously be dedicated to one’s community and its norms. The underlying thought, for Rovane, is that not all truth-value-bearers are in logical relations to one another, that there are many noncomprehensive bodies of truths that cannot be conjoined.

What the two approaches have in common is the claim that truth and justification are plural, that there could be more than one correct account of how things stand in at least some domains and their correctness has to be decided relative to a framework of context of assessment.

2.3 No neutral ground

Additionally, the relativistically inclined find further support for their position in the contention that there is no meta-justification of our evaluative or normative systems, that all justifications have to start and end somewhere (see Sankey 2010 and 2011) and that there are no higher-order or meta-level standards available for adjudicating clashes between systems in a non-question begging way. Steven Hales, for instance, argues that faced with disagreement and given non-neutrality, relativism is the most viable non-skeptical conclusion to draw (Hales 2006: 98; 2014). Similar considerations apply to attempts to anchor beliefs on secure foundations. Various intellectual developments, leading to loss of old certainties in the scientific and social arena have strengthened the appeal of this point. The scientific revolution of the early 20th century, brought about by, for instance, the advent of Relativity Theory and Quantum Mechanics and the loss of faith in lasting religious or political truths (Marxism in particular), as well as the failure of foundationalist philosophical programs have been used in arguments to vindicate relativistic views (for relativism about science see §4.4.3). The relativists often argue that justifications are not only perspectival but also interest-relative and there is no neutral or objective starting ground for any of our beliefs (see Seidel 2014; Carter 2015: ch. 4 and Siegel in Hales 2011: 205 for criticisms of this type of justification of relativism).

2.4 Underdetermination of theory by data

Pierre Duhem’s (1861–1916) thesis of underdetermination of theory by data, the claim that empirical evidence alone is not adequate for providing justification for any given scientific theory, has played an important role in building up a case both for conceptual relativism (§4.2) and for constructionism and relativism about science (§4.4.2 and §4.4.3). According to the underdetermination thesis, incompatible theories can be consistent with available evidence. Relativism threatens whenever conflicting theories or views appear to have equal claim to truth or justification. The relativistically inclined use underdetermination to claim that evidence could be brought to justify opposing explanations and justification. The underdetermination thesis is also used to highlight the absence of neutral starting points for our beliefs. Choices between incompatible but equally well-supported rival theories, it is argued, are often made based on interests and local preferences rather than neutral universal grounds.

2.5 Context Dependence

Relativists argue that beliefs and values get their justification or truth only relative to specific epistemic systems or practices (see Kusch forthcoming). Strong support for this view has come from social scientists and cultural theorist who focus on the socio-cultural determinants of human beliefs and actions. The social sciences, from their very inception, were hospitable to relativism. Indeed, August Comte, the father of sociology, claimed that a strength of “positive sociology” was its “tendency to render relative the ideas which were at first absolute” (Comte 1976 [1830–42]: 89). Comte also was responsible for the battle cry “all is relative”, but immediately and no doubt self-consciously contradicted himself by adding “and that’s the only absolute”. Other social scientists, under the influence of Karl Marx (1818–1883), Max Weber (1864–1920), and Wilhelm Dilthey (1833–1911), have given credence to the idea that human beliefs and actions could be understood and evaluated only relative to their social and economic background and context. Beliefs, desires and actions, the argument goes, are never independent of a background of cultural presuppositions, interests and values. We cannot step out of our language, culture and socio-historical conditions to survey reality from an Archimedean vantage point. Even perceptions are “theory-laden” and could vary between linguistic and cultural groupings. The sociological view that beliefs are context-dependent, in the sense that their context helps explain why people have the beliefs they do, has also been used to support what is sometimes called “social” or “sociological relativism” or the view that truth or correctness is relative to social contexts because we can both understand and judge beliefs and values only relative to the context out of which they arise. Context-dependence is also used to explain empirical observations of diversity in beliefs and values; different social contexts, the argument goes, give rise to differing, possibly incompatible norms and values.

2.6 The Principle of Tolerance

Advocates of relativism, particularly outside philosophical circles, often cite tolerance as a key normative reason for becoming a relativist. On this rationale, all ways of life and cultures are worthy of respect in their own terms, and it is a sign of unacceptable ethnocentrism to presume that we could single out one outlook or point of view as objectively superior to others. The Principle of Tolerance acquires an overtly socio-political form in the hand of Paul Feyerabend who maintains that “A free society is a society in which all traditions are given equal rights” (Feyerabend1978: 30). Anti-relativists find this normative advocacy of relativism unconvincing for two key kinds of reasons. Some anti-relativists (e.g., Rachels 2009) often appeal to cases at the limits (e.g., toleration of heinous crimes) to show the thesis to be implausibly overpermissive (see §4.5). Others argue that if all values are relative then tolerance and maximizing freedom are valuable only to those who have already embraced them. Relativists counter that they are not defending a global version of relativism regarding all truths and justification but local versions concerning the ethics and politics of belief and the usefulness of relativism in our attempt to become better, or at least more flexible and less dogmatic, thinkers and more tolerant citizens (e.g., Feyerabend 1978: 82–84). The anti-relativists counter-argue that even if we grant that political tolerance is an important value, and that accepting relativism would promote it, we should never adopt philosophical views about the nature of truth or justification simply because of their assumed good moral or political consequences. Second, and more importantly: political toleration does not require the strong and doctrine of philosophical relativism. Increased awareness of diversity together with an awareness of the historical contingency of one’s own convictions will promote political toleration just as effectively. As Knobe and Nichols point out, simply being made aware of radically different view points can lead to a:

…crisis akin to that of the [Christian] child confronted with religious diversity… For the discovery of religious diversity can prompt the thought that it’s in some sense accidental that one happens to be raised in a Christian household rather than a Hindu household. This kind of arbitrariness can make the child wonder whether there’s any reason to think that his religious beliefs are more likely to be right than those of the Hindu child (Knobe & Nichols 2007: 11)

3. A Brief History of an Old Idea

The English term “relativism” came into usage only in the 19th Century. John Grote was probably the first to employ it when in Exploratio Philosophica (1865) he wrote:

The notion of the mask over the face of nature is…. what I have called “relativism”. If “the face of nature” is reality, then the mask over it, which is what theory gives us, is so much deception, and that is what relativism really comes to. (Grote 1865: I.xi, 229).

Its German counterpart, “Relativismus”, has a longer history. Wilhelm Traugott Krug, who succeeded Kant in the University of Konisberg in his philosophical lexicon, defines it as

the assumption that everything which we experience and think (the self, the idea of reason, truth, morality, religion etc.) is only something relative, and therefore has no essential endurance and no universal validity. (Krug 2010 [1838]: 224)

Although the term “relativism” is of recent coinage, doctrines and positions, with some of the hallmarks of contemporary relativism, date back to the very beginnings of Western philosophy. Protagoras of Abdera (c. 490–420 BC) is often considered the first overt champion of relativism, and his dictum

Man (anthrôpos) is the measure (metron) of all things (chrêmatôn), of the things which are, that they are, and of the things which are not, that they are not (tôn men ontôn hôs esti, tôn de mê ontôn hôs ouk estin) (from Plato’s Theaetetus 152a 2–4)

its first battle-cry. According to Plato, Protagoras thought:

Each thing appears (phainesthai) to me, so it is for me, and as it appears to you, so it is for you—you and I each being a man. (Theaetetus 152a 6–8)

For instance, the same wind could be cold to one person and hot to another. The extent to which Protagoras’s view, or at least what comes down to us from Plato, amounts to genuine relativism remains somewhat controversial. As Burnyeat (1976b: 172) notes, Sextus Empiricus thought—though Burnyeat thinks mistakenly—that the Protagorean measure doctrine was to be understood as the subjectivist thesis that every appearance is true (simpliciter). This kind of radical subjectivism, though, quickly can be shown to turn on itself: it can appear that the thesis that “every appearance is true” is false. And so this radical subjectivist interpretation, regardless of whether it is accurate, is as Sextus had thought, untenable. However, Plato also ascribes a social or ethical dimension to Protagorean relativism which seem to go beyond individualistic subjectivism. In Theaetetus 172a 2–6 he says

what may or may not fittingly be done, of just and unjust, of what is sanctioned by religion and what is not; and here the theory may be prepared to maintain that whatever view a city takes on these matters and establishes as its law or convention, is truth and fact for that city. In such matters, neither any individual nor any city can claim superior wisdom. [emphasis added]

Plato’s attempted refutation of Protagoras, known as peritrope or “turning around”, is the first of the many attempts to show that relativism is self-refuting.

Protagorean relativism directly influenced the Pyrrhonian Skeptics, who saw the “man is the measure” doctrine as a precursor to their brand of skepticism. Sextus Empiricus, for instance, in his “Relativity Mode” states that judgments and observations are relative to the person who makes them, to their context as well as the object being observed and goes on to say,

since we have established in this way that everything is relative (pros ti), it is clear then that we shall not be able to say what an existing object is like in its own nature and purely, but only what it appears to be like relative to something. (Sextus Empiricus PH I 140)

But the conclusion he draws favors skepticism rather than relativism as understood in modern philosophy, for he concludes, “It follows that we must suspend judgment about the nature of objects” (ibid.).

Glimpses of relativistic thinking were in evidence in Boethius (480–524) (see Marenbon 2003) as well as in the double truth doctrine, or the view that religion and philosophy are separate and at times conflicting sources of truth, originally found in Averroes (1126–1198) and the 13th century Latin Averroists. However, the dominant belief in a singular and absolute revealed truth within a Christian framework, on the whole, made the medieval period inhospitable to relativism. There was a renewed interest in both relativism and skepticism at the inception of modern philosophy inspired, in part, by Latin translations of Sextus Empiricus in the 16th century. Michel de Montaigne’s work (1533–1592), in common with others sympathetic towards relativism, ancient or contemporary, relies on accounts of faraway cultures to argue that “we have no other criterion of truth or right-reason than the example and form of the opinion and customs of our own country” (Montaigne 1991 [1580]: 152) (but also see Fricker 2013 for a dissenting view). His advocacy of toleration, even for the cannibal, paved the way for not only the acceptance but the valorization of idealized versions of alien creeds and distant cultures by Enlightenment figures such as Rousseau (1712–1778), Voltaire (1694–1778), Diderot (1713–1784), Montesquieu (1689–1755) and Condorcet (1743–1794), who in turn, were instrumental in establishing an intellectual climate hospitable to cultural relativism. These authors were also the first to explore the idea of viewing one’s culture from an outsider’s point of view and using this external perspective as a vehicle to criticize local customs and norms. To take just one example, Diderot, in his “Supplement to the Voyage of Bougainville”, tells us that the Tahitian is mild, innocent, and happy while civilized people are corrupt, vile, and wretched; the natives live according to customs and rules that vary greatly from the Western ones. They do not possess private property or operate their affairs based on egalitarian principles, and they exercise sexual freedom not accepted in “civilized societies”. Diderot accordingly opposes the European mission of civilizing the natives, and despite his belief in a common human nature, he advocates the relativistic sounding maxim to

be monks in France and savages in Tahiti. Put on the costume of the country you visit, but keep the suit of clothes you will need to go home in. (Diderot 1956 [1772]: 228 in Baghramian 2010: 37)

Discussions of relativism in the 19th century had two sources (see Gardiner 1981). On the one hand, figures from the so-called Counter-Enlightenment, a philosophical movement which arose in the late 18th century and the early 19th century in opposition to the Enlightenment, Johann Georg Hamann (1730–1788), Johann Gottfried Herder (1744–1803), Wilhelm von Humboldt (1767–1835) emphasized the diversity of languages and customs and their role in shaping human thought. Hamann’s views on language, for instance, foreshadow contemporary conceptual and epistemic relativism. He maintained that language is the “instrument and criterion of reason” as well as the source of all the confusions and fallacies of reason. Furthermore, the rules of rationality are embedded within language, which in turn, is governed by local norms of custom and use (Hamann 1967 [1759]). Relativism ensues because languages and their rules of rationality vary a great deal. Herder, on the other hand, not only railed against the rational, universalizing and science-oriented ethos of the Enlightenment but, much like later relativists, also argued that different nations and epochs have their distinct preferences in ethical and aesthetics matters as well as their varied conceptions of truth and we are not in a position to adjudicate between them (Herder 2002: 272–358).

The Counter Enlightenment had a significant influence on Hegel, Nietzsche, and Dilthey, who in turn have shaped relativistic thinking in certain strands of continental philosophy, postmodernism and cultural studies. Hamann’s rejection of objectivism was central to Nietzsche’s even more profound recoil from objectivity. And indeed, Nietzsche is possibly the single most influential voice in shaping relativistic sensibilities in 20th century continental philosophy. His declaration that all human conceptions and descriptions, including those advanced by scientists, are

only an interpretation and arrangement of the world (according to our own requirements, if I may say so!)—and not an explanation of the world. (Nietzsche 1996 [1886a]: §14)

and that “there is only a perspective seeing, only a perspective knowing” (Nietzsche 1968 [1886b]: §540), irrespective of how Nietzsche himself intended them, have been taken to express a core contention of relativism that no single account of truth or reality can occupy a privileged position, for such accounts are only one of many perspectives that prevail at a given time in history. We cannot appeal to any facts or standards of evaluation independently of their relation to the perspectives available to us; we can do little more than to insist on the legitimacy of our own perspective and try to impose it on other people through our “will to power”.

A second source was the German post-Kantian and British Idealist discussions of the “relativity of knowledge” taking place in the context of the distinction between being-for-other (für anderes sein) and being-for-itself (fürsichsein)—a distinction influenced by the Kantian idea that all knowledge is ultimately relational because knowledge of the Real or “the thing in itself” is impossible. John Stuart Mill, for instance ascribes to the Kantian William Hamilton the “doctrine of relativity of our human knowledge” because Hamilton, according to Mill, believed that there could be no unconditional or absolute knowledge for all knowledge is dependent on the knowing mind (Mill 1884: 8).

The end of 19th century witnessed the emergence of yet another strand of relativism motivated by empirical-psychological and physiological-interpretations of Kantian categories. The view, known as species relativism, and defended by neo-Kantian psychologists such as Theodore Lipps (1851–1914), holds that the rules of logic are products of the human mind and psychology and therefore may be unique to the human species; different species could have and use different logical principles. The view was vehemently, but quite effectively, attacked by Frege and Husserl as part of their arguments against what they called “psychologism” and “speciesm” (Kusch 1995: 47). Logic in this approach is identified with the actual thinking processes of individuals or communities and its authority is seen to be local, or relative to the practices of particular epistemic groupings. But Frege and Husserl argued that with such relativization we would lose the ability to distinguish between reasoning correctly and merely seeming to do so.

Finally, the popularity of the very idea of relativism in the 20th century owes something to Einstein’s Special Theory of Relativity (1905) which was to be used both as model and as well as a vindication for various relativistic claims. Gilbert Harman is among the philosophers to use Einsteinian relativity as a model for philosophical versions of relativism. He says:

According to Einstein’s Theory of Relativity even an object’s mass is relative to a choice of spatio-temporal framework. An object can have one mass in relation to one such framework and a different mass in relation to another. …. I am going to argue for a similar claim about moral right and wrong. … I am going to argue that moral right and wrong …. are always relative to a choice of moral framework. (Harman 1996: 3)

The Sapir-Whorf theory of linguistic relativity (see §4.1) is also thought to have been inspired by the Relativity Theory. It is however worth noting that Einstein did not think that the Theory of Relativity supported relativism in ethics or epistemology because, although in his model simultaneity and sameness of place are relative to reference frames, the physical laws expressing such relativity are constant and universal and hence in no sense relative.

The different strands of the intellectual genealogy of relativism have shaped a variety of relativistic doctrines.

4. Varieties of Relativism

Relativism is discussed under a variety of headings some of which have been more prominent in recent philosophical and cultural debates.

4.1 Cultural relativism

Public debates about relativism often revolve around the frequently cited but unclear notion of cultural relativism. The idea that norms and values are born out of conventions can be traced back to the Greek historian Herodotus (c. 484–425 BC), but it is only in the 20th century, and particularly with the advent of social anthropology, that cultural relativism has gained wide currency. Franz Boas, responsible for the founding of social anthropology in the U.S., claimed that

The data of ethnology prove that not only our knowledge but also our emotions are the result of the form of our social life and of the history of the people to whom we belong. (Boas 1940: 636)

Boas’s views became the orthodoxy of anthropology through M. J. Herskovits’ “principle of cultural relativism” stating: “Judgments are based on experience, and experience is interpreted by each individual in terms of his own enculturation” (Herskovits 1955:15).

Since those early days, social anthropologists have come to develop more nuanced approaches to cultural relativism (see for instance Geertz 1993); however, its core tenet, a claim to the equal standing of all cultural perspectives and values which co-vary with their cultural and social background, has remained constant.

Cultural relativists justify their position by recourse to a combination of empirical, conceptual and normative considerations:

  • (a) The empirical observation that there is a significant degree of diversity in norms, values and beliefs across cultures and historic periods, known as descriptive relativism (see §2.1).
  • (b) An inductive argument to the effect that failures in previous attempts to resolve disagreements arising from (a) show that there are no universal criteria for adjudicating between differing world-views.
  • (c) The methodological assumption that human behavior and thought carry the imprint of their cultural and social context such that biology by itself is not sufficient for explaining many of their most important features, especially those with respect to which cultures differ.
  • (d) The normative principle of a need for tolerance and acceptance towards other points of view (see §2.6), which leads to so-called “normative or prescriptive cultural relativism”, or the positions that cultural relativism is a moral requirement (see also normative moral relativism in §4.5).

Claims (a)–(d) are open to a variety of objections. Some anthropologists and biologists have argued against the empirical assumption of the variability of cultures and have disputed its extent. Kinship, death and its attendant rituals of mourning, birth, the experience of empathy, expressions of sympathy and fear, and the biological needs that give rise to these, are some of the constant elements of human experience that belie the seeming diversity reported by ethnographers (Brown 2004). (c) has also been challenged by naturalistically inclined social scientists who believe that an evolutionary or a biologically informed approach can provide a context-independent, universally applicable theoretical framework for explaining what is common to all cultures, despite their superficial differences. Moreover, Moody-Adams (1997), among others, has argued that cultures are not integrated wholes that could determine uni-directionally the beliefs and experiences of their members; they are porous, riddled with inconsistencies and amenable to change. Finally, (d) is under pressure from the very relativism it advocates. Other critics, Pope Benedict XVI for instance, in his very first homily delivered upon election (18 April 2005), reject and condemn prescriptive cultural relativism as a harbinger of nihilism and an “anything goes” extreme permissiveness.

An influential form of descriptive cultural relativism owes its genesis to linguistics. Benjamin Whorf, inspired by his teacher Edward Sapir, who in turn was supervised by the social anthropologist Fran Boas, used ethnographic evidence from American Indian languages, such as Hopi, to argue that languages mold our views of the world and different languages do so differently, because “we dissect nature along lines laid down by our native languages” (Whorf 1956: 213). In the case of the Hopi, the claim was that their language imposes a conception of time very different from that of the speakers of the Indo-European languages. The so-called Sapir-Whorf hypothesis, and the position known as “linguistic relativity”, became popular in both psychology and social anthropology in the mid 20th century. However, the empirical work by the psychologists Berlin and Key (1969) and later by Eleanor Rosch (1974) pointed to the universality of color terms. The linguistic theories of Noam Chomsky regarding the universality of grammar were also widely taken to have discredited linguistic relativity. Moreover, Malotki (1983) had argued that, contrary to Whorf’s claim, the Hopi language does indeed have tense, as well as units of time, such as days, weeks, months and seasons, and terminology for yesterday and tomorrow. Things have changed recently and there has been a slight swing of the pendulum back in favor of linguistic relativity on the part of so called “neo-Whorfians”. Stephen Levinson, for instance, drawing on experimental evidence, has argued that the frame of reference that underlies any given language shapes our spatial experiences and perceptual modalities (see Gumperz & Levinson 1996). Similar claims have been made about emotions, object representation, and memory. But the claims of linguistic relativity in all these cases are much more modest than Whorf’s original thesis.

Historical relativism, or historicism, is the diachronic version of cultural relativism. As Clifford Geertz points out, cultural and historical relativism are in effect the same doctrine with a core claim that “we cannot apprehend another people’s or another period’s imagination neatly, as though it were our own” (1993: 44). Historicism originated in reaction to the universalist tendencies of the Enlightenment but proved most influential in the social sciences, particularly in the hands of 19th century theorists such as Karl Marx and Max Weber. Oswald Spengler, the then-influential turn-of-the-century German historian and philosopher, also declared that: “There are no eternal truths. Every philosophy is an expression of its time” (Spengler 1918: 58). Karl Mannheim, to whom we owe the sub-discipline of sociology of knowledge, pronounced that historicism is a significant intellectual force that epitomizes our worldview (Weltanschauung).

The historicist principle not only organizes, like an invisible hand, the work of the cultural sciences (Geisteswissenschaften), but also permeates everyday thinking. (Mannheim 1952 [1924]:84)

As we will see (§4.4.3), in more recent times historicist interpretations of science, chiefly those espoused by Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend, have played a major role in popularizing relativistic interpretations of scientific knowledge.

4.2 Conceptual relativism

Conceptual relativism is a narrowly delineated form of relativism where ontology, or what exists, rather than ethical and epistemic norms, is relativized to conceptual schemes, scientific paradigms, or categorical frameworks. In this sense, conceptual relativism is often characterized as a metaphysical doctrine rather than as variant of epistemic or cultural relativism. The underlying rationale for this form of relativism is the anti-realist thesis that the world does not present itself to us ready-made or ready-carved; rather we supply different, and at times incompatible, ways of categorizing and conceptualizing it. Reflection on the connections between mind and the world, rather than empirical observations of historic and cultural diversity, is the primary engine driving various forms of conceptual relativism, but data from anthropology and linguistics are also used in its support. The thought, at least since Kant, is that the human mind is not a passive faculty merely representing an independent reality; rather, it has an active role in shaping, if not constructing, the “real”. The conceptual relativist adds, as Kant did not, that human beings may construct the real in different ways thanks to differences in language or culture.

In the 20th century, a variety of positions sympathetic to conceptual relativism were developed. Quine’s ontological relativity, Nelson Goodman’s “irrealism” with its claim of the plurality of “world-versions” and Hilary Putnam’s conceptual relativity are prominent examples. What these authors have in common is an insistence that there could be more than one “right” way of describing what there is, that incompatible “manuals of translation” and “world-versions” can be equally correct or acceptable.

Quine’s thesis of ontological relativity, probably the most influential of 20th century approaches to conceptual relativity, is expressed both in an epistemic as well as in a stronger metaphysical form. Quine supports an epistemic thesis when he claims that incompatible scientific theories can account equally adequately for the data available to us (his underdetermination thesis) and that “there are various defensible ways of conceiving the world”, (Quine 1992: 102). But his thesis of the indeterminacy of translation makes the stronger claim that different incompatible manuals of translation, or conceptual schemes, can account for one and the same verbal behavior and the indeterminacy resides at the level of facts rather than our knowledge, a position that leads to unavoidable ontological relativity.

Nelson Goodman’s irrealism is an even more radical claim to the effect that the existence of many adequate, and indeed correct, but irreconcilable descriptions and representations of the world shows that there is no such thing as one unique actual world; rather there are many worlds, one for each correct description (e.g., Goodman 1975; cf. Sider 2009). Hilary Putnam disagrees with Goodman’s formulation of relativity with its radical talk of “world-making” but relies on arguments from conceptual plurality to reject metaphysical realism, the view that there is one single correct account of what the world is like. According to Putnam, our most basic metaphysical categories, e.g., objecthood and existence, could be defined variously depending on what conceptual scheme we use. What counts as an object itself, he argues, is determined by and hence is relative to the ontological framework we opt for.

Thomas Kuhn’s highly influential discussion of the governing role of paradigms in science (see §4.4.3) has also been interpreted as a form of conceptual relativism by friends (Kusch 2002) and critics (Davidson 1974) of relativism alike.

The key difficulty facing conceptual relativism is that of formulating the position in a coherent but non-trivial manner. Trivial versions allow that the world can be described in different ways, but make no claims to the incompatibility of these descriptions. The charge of incoherence arises from the claim that there could be genuinely conflicting and equally true accounts or descriptions of one and the same phenomenon. To use an example that is the corner-stone of Hilary Putnam’s conceptual relativity, Putnam claims that the simple question how many objects there are (say on a given table) could be answered variously depending on whether we use “a mereological or a Carnapian, common-sense, method of individuating objects. In circumstances where a Carnapian counts three objects A, B and C, a mereologist will count seven: A, B, C, plus the mereological sum objects A+B, A+C, B+C, A+B+C. As Putnam puts it:

The suggestion … is that what is (by commonsense standards) the same situation can be described in many different ways, depending on how we use the words. The situation does not itself legislate how words like “object”, “entity”, and “exist” must be used. What is wrong with the notion of objects existing “independently” of conceptual schemes is that there are no standards for the use of even the logical notions apart from conceptual choices. (Putnam 1988: 114)

The puzzle is to explain how both the Carnapian and mereological answers to the one and same question could be correct and yet mutually incompatible, for unless we abandon the most fundamental law of logic, the law of non-contradiction, we cannot deem one and the same proposition true and not true. Relativists respond that both answers are correct, each relative to the conceptual scheme it invokes. So, once we accept the insight that there is no Archimedean vantage point for choosing among conflicting frameworks, we no longer face a genuine contradiction. The response invokes, often implicitly, a relativized conception of truth, which as we shall see below, faces its own difficulties.

4.3 Relativism about truth or alethic relativism

Relativism about truth, or alethic relativism, at its simplest, is the claim that what is true for one individual or social group may not be true for another, and there is no context-independent vantage point to adjudicate the matter. What is true or false is always relative to a conceptual, cultural, or linguistic framework.

Alethic relativism is the most central of all relativistic positions since other subdivisions of the philosophical theses of relativism—with the possible exception of some narrowly defined versions of conceptual relativism such as Nelson Goodman’s irrealism (see §4.2)—are in principle, reducible to it (Baghramian 2004: 92). For instance, relativism about logic may be restated as a view according to which the standing of logical truths (including truths about consequence relations) is relative to cultures or cognitive schemes. Ethical relativism can be seen as the claim that the truth of ethical judgments, if such truths exist, is relative to context or culture. If truth is to be seen as equally applicable to all areas of discourse and also unitary, rather than domain specific or plural, then alethic relativism is not only a strong form of global relativism but it also entails the denial of the possibility of more local forms of relativism because all localized relativistic claims are also attempts at relativizing truth (seemingly in a particular domain of discourse).

The central claim of the alethic relativism is that “is true”, despite appearances to the contrary, is (at least, in some relevant domains of discourse) not a one-place but a two-place predicate such that “P is true” should correctly be understood as (modulo differences in particular ways of developing this idea) shorthand for “P is true for X”, where X is a culture, conceptual scheme, belief framework, etc. And within the broad camp of alethic relativists, the matter of how it is that which we should opt for “P-is-true-for-X”, rather than “P is true”, simpliciter, is developed in different ways (e.g., see Meiland 1977; MacFarlane 2014: ch. 5; Egan 2007). One shared commitment of relativizing the truth predicate is that claims such as “misfortune is caused by witchcraft” could be true according to the Azande cultural framework and false in the Western scientific framework. One major difficulty facing alethic relativists is to explain what “true for” actually means, and how “true for” should be understood as related to the more familiar absolutist truth predicate. For instance, should relative truth be understood as a modification on an already familiar strategy for thinking about truth (e.g., the correspondence, pragmatic or epistemic model) or in some different way, entirely? (MacFarlane 2014: ch. 2). Much of the work of New Relativists such as John MacFarlane (see §5) can be see as an attempt to clarify this thorny issue.

4.3.1 Alethic Relativism and the charge of self-refutation.

The strongest and most persistent charge leveled against all types of relativism, but (global) alethic relativism in particular, is the accusation of self-refutation. Here is for instance Harvey Siegel:

This incoherence charge is by far the most difficult problem facing the relativist. It is worth noting that attempts to overcome the problem by appealing to the notion of relative truth appear not to succeed. Many versions of relativism rely on such a notion, but it is very difficult to make sense of it. An assertion that a proposition is “true for me” (or “true for members of my culture”) is more readily understood as a claim concerning what I (or members of my culture, scheme, etc.) believe than it is as a claim ascribing to that proposition some special sort of truth. Constructing a conception of relative truth such that “p is relatively true” (or “p is true for S”, or “p is true for members of culture C”) amounts to something stronger than “S believes that p” (or “members of culture C believe that p”), but weaker than “p is true (simpliciter)”, has proved to be quite difficult, and is arguably beyond the conceptual resources available to the relativist. (Siegel 2011: 203)

The original argument goes back to Plato’s criticism of Protagoras in the Theaetetus where he argues:

Most people believe that Protagoras’s doctrine is false.

Protagoras, on the other hand, believes his doctrine to be true.

By his own doctrine, Protagoras must believe that his opponents’ view is true.

Therefore, Protagoras must believe that his own doctrine is false (see Theaetetus: 171a–c)

Plato’s argument, as it stands, appears to be damaging only if we assume that Protagoras, at least implicitly, is committed to the universal or objective truth of relativism. On this view, Plato begs the question on behalf of an absolutist conception of truth (Burnyeat 1976a: 44). Protagoras, the relativists counter, could indeed accept that his own doctrine is false for those who accept absolutism but continue believing that his doctrine is true for him. He could also try to persuade others to become the sort of thinker for whom relativism is true without being entangled in self-contradiction. Such an effort at persuasions, however, could involve Protagoras in a performative contradiction as the relativist cannot assume that her arguments are good for persuading others. Ordinarily, the very act of defending a philosophical position commits us to the dialectical move of attempting to convince our interlocutors of the superior value of what we are arguing for. The relativist cannot make such a commitment and therefore his attempts to persuade others to accept his position may be pragmatically self-refuting. The relativist can avoid the standard charge of self-refutation by accepting that relativism cannot be proven true in any non-relative sense—viz., that relativism itself as a philosophical position is at best true only relative to a cultural or historical context and therefore could be false in other frameworks or cultures. But such an admission will undermine the relativist’s attempt to convince others of her position, for the very act of argumentation, as it is commonly understood, is an attempt to convince those who disagree with us of the falsehood of their position. In other words, if Protagoras really believes in relativism why would he bother to argue for it?

It may be argued that Protagoras could have opted for a more sensible form of alethic relativism where a person’s beliefs are not automatically true relative to the framework she accepts. Rather a belief p is true according to X’s framework iff (roughly) X would believe that p if she were to reason cogently by her own standards on the basis of full relevant information. This form of alethic relativism allows for argument and persuasion among people who initially disagree, for despite their disagreement they may share or come to share a framework. Protagoras may, on this reinterpretation, be trying to persuade his interlocutor that if she were to reason cogently by her own standards from their shared framework, she would accept relativism. However, it is not clear how the relativist could share a framework with the absolutist on the nature of truth or what argumentative strategies he can use to convert the absolutist without presupposing a shared (relativist or absolutist) conceptions of truth. In particular, a consistent relativist will have only a relativized criteria of what counts as “true” information, which presumably will not be shared by the absolutist.

A second strand of the self-refutation argument focuses on the nature and role of truth. J.L. Mackie, for instance, has argued that alethic absolutism is a requisite of a coherent notion of truth and that a claim to the effect that “There are no absolute truths” is absolutely self-refuting (Mackie 1964: 200). But the relativists reject the quick move that presupposes the very conception of truth they are at pains to undermine and have offered sophisticated approaches of defense. A good example of such a defense is Hales’ (1997)—who uses a “u” operator to represent “It is true in some perspectives that” and a “n” operator to represent “It is true in all perspectives that”—in order to establish that there could indeed be a consistent relativist logic which avoids the charge of self-refutation). Key to this approach, according to Hales, is that we abandon a conception of global relativism on which the lose thesis “everything is relative” is embraced—a thesis Hales concedes to be inconsistent—for the thesis “everything that is true is relatively true”, which he maintains is not (cf. Shogenji 1997 for a criticism of Hales on this point).

It has also been claimed that alethic relativism gives rise to what J.L. Mackie calls “operational” (Mackie 1964: 202) and Max Kölbel “conversational” self-refutation (Kölbel 2011) by flouting one or more crucial norms of discourse and thereby undermines the very possibility of coherent discourse. One version of the argument, advanced most notably by Gareth Evans (1985: 346–63), begins with the premise that a publicly shared distinction between correct and incorrect, and hence true and false, assertion is a necessary condition for coherent assertoric discourse. As Evans puts it, a theory that

permits a subject to deduce merely that a particular utterance is now correct but later will be incorrect … cannot assist the subject in deciding what to say, nor in interpreting the remarks of others. What should we aim at, or take others to be aiming at?. (1985: 349)

And if truth is relative, then there is no single shared definite aim for any given assertion (see MacFarlane 2014: ch. 12 for a discussion). The relativists however, could respond that truth is relative to a group (conceptual scheme, framework) and they take speakers to be aiming a truth relative to the scheme that they and their interlocutors are presumed to share. The difficulty with this approach is that it seems to make communication across frameworks impossible.

Such a response, however, will be answerable to the charge of incoherence raised by Donald Davidson against both alethic and conceptual relativism. According to Davidson, the principle of charity—the assumption that other speakers by and large speak truly (by our lights)—is a pre-requisite of all interpretation. He takes this to imply that there could not be languages or conceptual schemes that we cannot in principle understand and interpret, in other words, if a system of signs L is not recognizable as a language by us then L is not a language. Languages are either inter-translatable and hence not radically different from ours, or incommensurable and beyond our ability to recognize them as languages (Davidson 1974). The relativist, in effect, places other speakers and their languages beyond our recognitional reach and thereby undermines the initial claim that they could be radically different or incommensurable.

New Relativism, as we shall see, offers a novel take on the old question of alethic relativism and gives weight to Alasdair MacIntyre’s observation that relativism may have been refuted a number of times too often, whereas genuinely refutable doctrines only need to be refuted once (MacIntyre 1982: 22).

4.4 Epistemic relativism

Claims to knowledge and justification have proven receptive to relativistic interpretations. Epistemic relativism is the thesis that cognitive norms that determine what counts as knowledge, or whether a belief is rational, justifiable, etc. could vary with and are dependent on local conceptual or cultural frameworks and lack the universality they aspire or pretend to. The three key assumptions underlying epistemic relativism are:

  • (a) Epistemic justification is framework relative. It makes no sense to ask whether a belief is justified simpliciter; we can only ask questions about justification relative to an epistemic system, which casts doubts on the very possibility of objectivity.
  • (b) There are many genuinely alternative, even incompatible, epistemic systems.
  • (c) We cannot demonstrate in a non-circular way that our epistemic system is superior to any other. (see Williams 2007: 94 for one version of this approach to epistemic relativism; cf. Carter 2015)

The epistemic relativist, as Paul Boghossian in developing his trenchant criticisms of relativism points out, is committed to a “doctrine of equal validity”, the view that “there are many radically different, incompatible, yet, ‘equally valid’ ways of knowing the world, with science being just one of them” (Boghossian 2006a: 2). The relativist’s key claim is that either we can chauvinistically maintain that our epistemic system is superior to all or accept the equal legitimacy of varying epistemic systems.

One crucial question facing epistemic relativism is how to identify and individuate alternative epistemic systems. The intuitive idea is that varying and possibly incompatible cognitive principles, ground-level beliefs and presuppositions, or what Wittgenstein calls “hinge” and “bedrock” propositions (Wittgenstein 1969: §§341–343) separate non-convergent epistemic schemes. A simple and quite commonly used example is the contrast between scientific and religious belief systems. Boghossian, for instance, uses the debate between Galileo and Cardinal Bellarmine as a case study of an encounter between antagonists operating within putatively different epistemic frameworks, who use different frameworks, or as Rorty (1979) put it “grids”, for determining what would count as appropriate evidence on planetary movements. The relativist claims that there is no fact of the matter about whether the Copernican theory or the geocentric view is justified by the evidence, “for there are no absolute facts about what justifies what” (Boghossian 2006a: 62) while the anti-relativist attempts to show the unintelligibility or the implausibility of such a claim.

Boghossian has been criticized however for his characterization of epistemic relativism. One notable such criticism has been advanced by Crispin Wright (2008), who takes issue with Boghossian’s attributing to the epistemic relativist a version of (a) above, what Boghossian calls epistemic relationism, or the thesis that any claim of the form “Evidence E justifies belief B”, if it is to have any prospect of being true, must be construed as expressing the claim According to the epistemic system C, that I, S accept, information E justifies belief B (Boghossian 2006a:73). Having characterized the relativist’s position in this fashion, Boghossian suggests—after considering various ways of articulating what the relativist might say about the untruth of claims of the form “Evidence E justifies belief B”—that the relativist is left, ultimately, with no coherent way to account for how she should count as accepting or adhering to a given epistemic system. And on this basis, Boghossian concludes that there is no coherent way to formulate the position because the relativist in formulating his position and setting up the opposition between two or more alternative non-convergent epistemic systems cannot but assume the universality of at least some epistemic principles, including deduction, induction, warrant through empirical evidence, etc. (see Boghossian 2006a).

As Wright sees it, however, Boghossian’s attributing the relationist clause to the epistemic relativist is to simply

fail to take seriously the thesis that claims such as [Evidence E justifies belief B] can indeed by true or false, albeit only relatively so. (Wright 2008: 383, our italics)

Moreover, Wright argues, the epistemic relationist clause Boghossian includes in the kind of epistemic relativism he challenges betrays a failure to distinguish between (i) making a judgment in the light of certain standards and (ii) judging that those standards mandate that judgment. (See also MacFarlane (2008b) for a different critique of Boghossian’s argument against the epistemic relativist.)

Conceptions of rationality, and its key components of logic and justification, are some of the principles that are often used to differentiate between epistemic systems. Below we look at attempts at relativizing each.

4.4.1 Relativism about Rationality

Earlier defenses of epistemic relativism centered on the idea of alternative rationalities and were often developed as a reaction to the charge of irrationality leveled at non-Western tribal people. Rationality traditionally is seen as a cognitive virtue as well as a hallmark of the scientific method. The complex notion of rationality is intimately tied to requirements of consistency, justification, warrant and evidence for beliefs. Relativists about rationality cast doubt on the universal applicability of one or more of these features of rational thought, and deem them merely local epistemic values. Peter Winch’s treatment of E.E. Evans-Pritchard’s account of the Azande tribe’s beliefs in witchcraft and magic is now a classic of the “rationality wars” of the 1960s and 70s. Winch had argued that since standards of rationality in different societies do not always coincide, we should use only contextually and internally given criteria of rationality in our assessment of the systems of belief of other cultures and societies. Under the influence of the later Wittgenstein, he maintained that it does not make sense to speak of a universal standard of rationality because what is rational is decided by a backdrop of norms governing a given language and form of life. As outside observers, we are not in a position to impute irrationality or illogicality to the Azande or any other group whose practices and language-games may differ from ours. Critics of Winch, Steven Lukes, for instance, using considerations reminiscent of Davidson’s principle of charity, have argued that we will not be in a position to understand a language or culture with standards of rationality radically different from ours, and that we must have at least some core principles, or what Martin Hollis had called a “bridgehead” with elements such as consistency and the goal of truth, in common with the Azande in order to understand them (Hollis 1968; Lukes 1970). They, thereby, conclude that an all-out or strong relativism about rationality is not tenable. The weaker claim is that some elements of rationality, for instance what counts as good evidence or a better style of reasoning, could vary with historic conditions and traditions of enquiry and therefore a degree of relativization of such norms, without succumbing to irrationalism, is acceptable (see Hacking 1982 and MacIntyre 1988).

Being rational also means having warrant, in the form of good reasons and justification for one’s beliefs. Epistemic relativists maintain that the legitimacy of a justificatory system and the presumed strength of epistemic warrants are decided locally. Richard Rorty has made the influential claim that

there is nothing to be said about either truth or rationality apart from descriptions of the familiar procedures of justification which a given society—ours—uses in one or another area of inquiry. (Rorty 1991: 23)

For Rorty, warrant is a “sociological matter, to be ascertained by observing the reception of [a speaker’s] statement by her peers” (1993: 449). Rorty also claims that knowledge and truth are compliments “paid to beliefs which we think so well justified that, for the moment, further justification is not needed” (Rorty 1991: 24) where the “we” is historically conditioned community of enquirers. Rorty rejects the label “relativist” because he insists that, unlike the relativists, he does not subscribe to the view that all beliefs are equally true or good. He calls his position “ethnocentrism”, because the only form of warrant available to any of us is the one provided through solidarity with our peers. His rejection of the label “relativist” has had little effect on critics such as Hilary Putnam (1999) or Paul Boghossian (2006a) who do not see the distinction Rorty wishes to draw between his brand of ethnocentrism and relativism

4.4.2 Relativism about Logic

Debates about the scope and authority of logic have also focal to discussions of rationality. The argument for relativism about logic is usually traced to the French anthropologist Lucien Lévy-Bruhl (1857–1939) who claimed that tribal or “primitive” cultures did not subscribe to universal laws of logic such as the principles of non-contradiction and identity and were in a pre-logical stage of thinking (Lévy-Bruhl 1922/1923). In a posthumous publication, Lévy-Bruhl renounced his earlier views, finding them “simplistic and rather crude” (Lévy-Bruhl 1949/1975: 48) but he remains the standard bearer for relativism about logic.

Peter Winch’s interpretation of the Azande material became the impetus for a new wave of arguments for relativism about logic. Barry Barnes and David Bloor, for instance, have argued that different societies may have incompatible but internally coherent systems of logic because validity and rules of inference are defined by, and hence are relative to, the practices of a given community, rather than a priori universal restrictions on all thought. According to Bloor,

The Azande have the same psychology as us but radically different institutions. If we relate logic to the psychology of reasoning we shall be inclined to say that they have the same logic; if we relate logic more closely to the institutional framework of thought then we shall incline to the view that the two cultures have different logics. (Bloor 1976: 129–130)

Even the status of “contradictions” is at times seen as culturally relative and the Azande’s application of witchcraft in determining guilt is cited as an example. The Azande, according to Evans-Prichard, believe that it is possible to identify a witch by examining the contents of his intestine (through the use of a poison oracle). They also believe that Witchhood is inherited patrilineally. Since the Azande clan members are related to each other through the male line, it follows that if one person is shown to be a witch, then all the members of his clan must also be witches. Evans-Pritchard tells us that although the Azande see the sense of this argument they do not accept the conclusion; they seem to side-step the contradiction in their belief-system. Relativistically inclined commentators have argued that the Azande both do and do not contradict themselves depending on, or relative to, the culture that is being taken as the vantage point (Bloor 1976: 124 and Jennings 1989: 281). See Seidel (2014) for a sustained critique.

More recently, Peng and Nisbett, using experimental data, have argued that Chinese and American students have different attitudes towards the Law of Non-Contradiction. The Chinese, they claim, are more willing to accept that conflicting views may be compatible and therefore are less disposed to recognize or condemn contradictions (Peng & Nisbett 1999). In his The Geography of Thought (2003), Nisbett has generalized his results to claim that Asian and European structures of thinking, including perception and conceptualization, differ significantly.

Nesbitt’s data, as well as the claims by Barnes and Bloor, are contributions to a long-standing debate about the status of logic. Their approach attempts to naturalize logic by tying it to the actual practices of the human subjects, The relativistically inclined, however, argue that to think of logic as singular, a priori, and universal speaks of a philosophical prejudice and does not sit well with a naturalistic and scientific attitude. As to the claim by Quine and Davidson, that an allegedly illogical culture is in fact a misinterpreted or badly interpreted culture—that if the speakers of a language seem to accept sentence of the form “P and not-P”, this is conclusive evidence that “and” and “not” in their language do not mean what these words mean in English (Quine 1960)—the relativistically inclined point out that reasoning in deviant ways is quite common and is not an impediment to understanding or translating others (e.g., Stich 2012). They further argue that such diversity is better explained by the relativist’s claim that the correctness of the principles of reasoning is relative to their cultural background rather than by the absolutist approach that attributes wholesale error to alternative epistemic systems or to the members of other cultures.

4.4.3 Relativism about Science

Discussions of relativism about science gained currency with the publication of Thomas Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962) and the emergence of a historicist approach to question of change and progress in science. Pronouncements such as

In so far as their only recourse to [the] world is through what they see and do, we may want to say that after a revolution scientists are responding to a different world (Kuhn 1970 [1962]: 111)


The very ease and rapidity with which astronomers saw new things when looking at old objects with old instruments may make us wish to say that, after Copernicus, astronomers lived in a different world (Kuhn 1970 [1962]: 117)

were taken to suggest that not only standards of epistemic appraisal but even the data gathered by scientists were, to a significant extent, determined by governing paradigms and hence relative to them. Although Kuhn stepped back from such radical relativism, his views gave currency to relativistic interpretations of science.

Relativism about science is motivated by considerations arising from the methodology and history of science (Baghramian 2007). As we saw in §4.2, Quine has argued that

Physical theories can be at odds with each other and yet compatible with all possible data even in the broadest possible sense. In a word, they can be logically incompatible and empirically equivalent. (1970: 179)

Relativists about science have argued that only with the addition of auxiliary hypotheses could the scientist choose between various theories and that such auxiliary hypotheses are colored by socially and historically grounded norms as well as by personal and group interests. Paul Feyerabend’s “democratic relativism”—the view that different societies may look at the world in different ways and regard different things as acceptable (1987: 59) and that we need to give equal voice to these differing perspectives—is one instance of the use of the underdetermination thesis in support of relativism. According to Feyerabend, underdetermination ultimately demonstrates that

for every statement, theory, point of view believed (to be true) with good reason there exist arguments showing a conflicting alternative to be at least as good, or even better. (1987: 76)

Larry Laudan usefully lists the ways underdetermination is used to motivate relativism or its proximate doctrines. He says:

Lakatos and Feyerabend have taken the underdetermination of theories to justify the claim that the only difference between empirically successful and empirically unsuccessful theories lies in the talents and resources of their respective advocates (i.e., with sufficient ingenuity, more or less any theory can be made to look methodologically respectable). Hesse and Bloor have claimed that underdetermination shows the necessity for bringing noncognitive, social factors into play in explaining the theory choices of scientists (on the grounds that methodological and evidential considerations alone are demonstrably insufficient to account for such choices). H. M. Collins, and several of his fellow sociologists of knowledge, have asserted that underdetermination lends credence to the view that the world does little if anything to shape or constrain our beliefs about it. (Laudan 1990: 321)

Laudan even connects Derrida’s deconstructionism and the view that texts do not lend themselves to determinate readings with underdetermination (ibid.). He also believes that an appropriately modest understanding of what underdetermination entails will distance it from relativism, but most relativistically inclined advocates of underdetermination are not willing to follow Laudan’s advice to circumscribe its scope. The key issue is that both the relativists and the anti-relativists could agree that the totality of evidence available does not prove the truth of any given theory. But the anti-relativists responds to this fact of underdetermination by pointing out that the we have good reasons for embracing the best theory available and moreover that there are indeed objective facts about the world, even if we are not in possession of them. The relativist, in contrast, argues that there are many, equally acceptable principles for accepting theories, all on the basis of evidence available, but such theories could result in very different verdicts. They also argue that in the absence of any strong epistemic grounds for accepting the existence of absolute facts in any given domain, we have no grounds, other than some kind of metaphysical faith, for thinking that there are such facts.

Relativism about science is also influenced by the related doctrine that all observations are theory-laden. Even anti-relativists such as Karl Popper admit that the idea that observations are not in some way tinted by theoretical assumptions is naïve. But some relativists about science offer a particularly extreme form of the doctrine of the widely accepted thesis of theory-ladenness. Feyerabend, for instance, goes so far as to argue that different systems of classification can result in perceptual objects that are not easily comparable.

Relativists about science also point to the prevalence of both synchronic and diachronic disagreement among scientists as a justification of their view. Looking at the history of science, Kuhn and his followers argued that Aristotelian physics presupposes a totally different conception of the universe compared to Newtonian physics; the same is true of Einsteinian physics compared to its predecessors. Moreover, these differing conceptions may be incommensurable in the sense that they are not readily amenable to comparison or inter-theoretical translation. There are also strong and unresolved disagreements between scientists working contemporaneously. The many different interpretations of quantum mechanics are a case in point.

Anti-relativist philosophers of science are often willing to concede all three points above, but insist that they do not, singly or jointly, justify the claim that scientific knowledge, in any philosophically interesting sense, is relative to its context of production. The success of science, both theoretical and applied, indicates that progress does take place. Fallibilism, the view that all scientific claims are provisional and liable to fail, they argue, is sufficient for dealing with difficulties arising from considerations of underdetermination and theory-ladenness of observations. Relativism, with its attendant denial that there could be objective and universal scientific truths or knowledge exacts too high a price for dealing with these allegedly troublesome features of the methodology and history of science.

4.4.4 Social Constructionism

Social constructionism is a particularly radical form of conceptual relativism with implications for our understanding of the methodology and subject matter of the sciences. According to social constructionism, nature as studied by scientists does not come carved at its joints (to use Plato’s metaphor from Phaedrus: 265d–266a). Reality—with its objects, entities, properties and categories—is not simply “out there” to be discovered only by empirical investigation or observation; rather, it is constructed through a variety of norm-governed socially sanctioned cognitive activities such as interpretation, description, manipulation of data, etc. Social constructionism has relativistic consequences insofar as it claims that different social forces lead to the construction of different “worlds” and that there is no neutral ground for adjudicating between them. The “Science Studies” approach of Bruno Latour is a prime example of constructionism with relativistic consequences. Latour and Woolgar (1986) have argued that so-called “scientific facts” and the “truths” of science emerge out of social and conceptual practices and inevitably bear their imprints. This is because the very idea of a mind-independent reality open to scientific study, or as they call it “out-there-ness”, itself is the consequence of scientific work rather than the cause. A crucial difference between scientific realists and constructionists is that whereas the realists see nature and society as the causes that explain the outcomes of scientific enquiry, for the constructionists the activity of

scientists and engineers and of all their human and non-human allies is the cause, of which various states of nature and societies are the consequence. (Callon & Latour 1992: 350–1)

Scientific theories are also products of socially constituted practices. They are

contextually specific constructions which bear the mark of the situated contingency and interest structure of the process by which they are generated. (Knorr-Cetina 1981: 226)

So called “scientific facts” and “natural kinds”, the primary subjects of scientific investigation are, at least in part, the products of the contingent social and epistemic norms that define the very subject matter of science. It may be argued that the view, if taken literally, entails a counter-intuitive form of backward causation to the effect that, for instance, the scientific facts about dinosaur anatomy 50 million years ago were caused in the 20th century when a scientific consensus about dinosaur anatomy was formed (see Boghossian 2006a). But constructionism, at least in its most extreme form, accepts this consequence, insisting that there are indeed no facts except for socially constructed ones, created and modified at particular times and places courtesy of prevailing theoretical and conceptual frameworks.

4.5 Moral Relativism

Moral or ethical relativism is simultaneously the most influential and the most reviled of all relativistic positions. Supporters see it as a harbinger of tolerance (see §2.6), open-mindedness and anti-authoritarianism. Detractors think it undermines the very possibility of ethics and signals either confused thinking or moral turpitude.

Briefly stated, moral relativism is the view that moral judgments, beliefs about right and wrong, good and bad, not only vary greatly across time and contexts, but that their correctness is dependent on or relative to individual or cultural perspectives and frameworks. Moral subjectivism is the view that moral judgments are judgments about contingent and variable features of our moral sensibilities. For the subjectivist, to say that abortion is wrong is to say something like, “I disapprove of abortion”, or “Around here, we disapprove of abortion”. Once the content of the subjectivist’s claim is made explicit, the truth or acceptability of a subjectivist moral judgment is no longer a relative matter. Moral relativism proper, on the other hand, is the claim that facts about right and wrong vary with and are dependent on social and cultural background. Understood in this way, moral relativism could be seen as a sub-division of cultural relativism. Values may also be relativized to frameworks of assessment, independent of specific cultures or social settings.

Moral relativism, like most relativistic positions, comes in various forms and strengths. It is customary to distinguish between descriptive or empirical, prescriptive or normative, and meta-ethical versions of moral relativism. These views in turn are motivated by a number of empirical and philosophical considerations similar to those introduced in defense of cultural relativism. The purported fact of ethical diversity, the claim that there are no universally agreed moral norms or values, conjoined with the intractability of the arguments about them, are the core components of descriptive moral relativism. The anti-relativists counter-argue that the observed diversity and lack of convergence in local norms can in fact be explained by some very general universal norms, which combine with the different circumstances (or false empirical beliefs) of the different groups to entail different particular norms. The objectivist, thereby can accommodate diversity and lack of agreement at this higher level of generalization (see Philippa Foot (1982) for this type of argument)

As in the case of cultural relativism, the imperative of tolerance is often seen as a normative reason for adopting moral relativism,. Moral relativism, it is argued, leads to tolerance by making us not only more open-minded but also alerting us to the limitations of our own views. Edward Westermarck, for instance, in his early classic defense of relativism writes:

Could it be brought home to people that there is no absolute standard in morality, they would perhaps be on the one hand more tolerant and on the other more critical in their judgments. (Westermarck 1932: 59)

Critics however point out that for the consistent relativist tolerance can be only a framework-dependent virtue, while Westermarck, and others, seem to recommend it as a universal desideratum. A second problem with arguing for normative moral relativism on the grounds of tolerance is known as the Argumentum ad Nazium. Relativists, as this argument goes, are not in a position to condemn even the most abhorrent of worldviews as they are forced to admit that every point of view is right (relative to the perspective of its beholder). W.T. Stace, arguing against Westermarck’s relativism gives an early example of this type of criticism:

Certainly, if we believe that any one moral standard is as good as any other, we are likely to be more tolerant. We shall tolerate widow-burning, human sacrifice, cannibalism, slavery, the infliction of physical torture, or any other of the thousand and one abominations which are, or have been, from time approved by moral code or another. But this is not the kind of toleration that we want, and I do not think its cultivation will prove “an advantage to morality”. (Stace 1937: 58–59)

More moderate forms of normative moral relativism, positions that sometimes are characterized as moral pluralism, have been defended by David Wong (2006) and David Velleman (2013). Moderate moral relativists endorse the idea of diversity and plurality of ethical values and accept that such values are justified according to differing local normative frameworks, but they avoid a full blown “anything goes” relativism by maintaining that all such frameworks are ultimately answerable to conditions for human flourishing and other overarching universal constraints such as the value of accommodation (Wong 2006). (It should however be noted that while theses under the description of pluralism needn’t entail a commitment to relativism, some formulations of relativism (such as Boghossian’s 2006b), include, as an essential ingredient, a “pluralist” clause. Whether particular instances of moral pluralism entail moral relativism depends entirely on the details of relevant claim to pluralism).

Metaethical versions of moral relativism are often motivated by the thought that ethical positions, unlike scientific beliefs, are not apt for objective truth-evaluation. Strong realists about science such as Gilbert Harman have argued that the intractability of moral disagreements, the absence of convergence in ethics as opposed to the natural sciences and mathematics, point to fundamental differences between natural facts and ethical values (Harman & Thompson 1996). This is a metaethical, rather than a descriptive or normative position, because it is a theory about the nature of ethics or morality. The ethical domain, Harman argue, is such that all relevant evaluations could be undertaken only in the context of social norms or personal preferences and commitments. Values are not objective—they are not part of the fabric of the universe. Rather they always arise from some form of convention and agreement among people. Therefore, there can be no objective or externally justified ethical knowledge or judgment (Harman 1975). In this sense, metaethical relativism shares common concerns with non-cognitivist approaches to ethics. What distinguishes it, however, is the insistence on the part of metaethical relativists that moral judgments contain an implicit relativization to the speaker’s moral outlook (Dreier 2006: 261). It is possible to talk about the truth or falsity of a moral judgment but only in the context of pre-existing standards or value systems. For instance, we can ask questions about just actions or judgments in the context of standards of justice prevalent in a society at a given time; but questions about the objective standing of these standards do not make sense. (For further discussion of moral relativism see the separate entry on this topic. What has become known as New Moral Relativism will be discussed below).

5. New Relativism

There is a recent version of relativism according to which some of the views considered so far—for instance, Harman’s (1975) variety of moral relativism—will be regarded varieties of contextualism as opposed to bona fide relativism. This recent version—sufficiently distinct from the relativisms so far considered that it is deserving of attention in its own right—we are calling “New Relativism”, a variety of relativism that has arisen out of work in the philosophy of language in the analytic tradition, and for which the leading proponents have included Max Kölbel (2003, 2004), Peter Lasersohn (2005), Crispin Wright (2006) and, in particular, John MacFarlane (2005b, 2007, 2014). In this section we aim to (i) outline several features that individuate New Relativism; (ii) consider in turn motivations for (and objections to) several prominent strands of it; and, finally, (iii) conclude with some philosophical problems that face New Relativism more generally.

5.1 The individuating features of New Relativism

It is a commonplace that the truth-value of an utterance can depend on the context in which it is uttered. If you say “I’m happy” and I say the same sentence, your utterance may be true and mine false. In such cases, the context of utterance plays a role in determining which proposition the sentence expresses. This can happen even when the sentence does not contain an overtly indexical expression. Thus Harman and Dreier hold that a statement of the form “A is wrong” is roughly equivalent to “A is wrong according to the moral system I accept”. So two utterances of (say) “Torture is wrong” can differ in truth-value if they are uttered by speakers who accept very different moral systems. Contextualists about (for instance) moral, aesthetic and epistemic discourse will view moral, aesthetic and epistemic expressions likewise as indexical expressions but (as we’ll see) with some difficulty explaining apparent genuine disagreement in these areas of discourse. On this point, New Relativists claim an important advantage over contextualists. New relativism, by contrast with contextualism, aims to achieve this advantage via a much less familiar form of context dependence.

Truth-relativism with respect to utterances in area of discourse D is the claim that, following MacFarlane’s notable version of the view: the truth of S’s D-utterance u depends (in part) on a context of assessment; that is (and in short) what S asserts, u, gets a truth value—according to the truth-relativist’s D-semantics—only once the D-standard of the assessor is specified. Independent of the specification of such a standard, S’s u assertion lacks a truth-value much as, by comparison, indexical expressions such as “The barn is nearby” do not get a truth-value independent of contextual facts about the context of use (i.e. the context in which the utterance is made). And, as a further point of clarification here: while the contextualist can, no less than the relativist, recognize a “standards” or “judge” parameter, for the contextualist, its value will be supplied by the context of use, whereas the relativist takes it to be supplied completely independently of the context of use, by the context of evaluation (or, as MacFarlane calls it, the context of assessment).

To see how this view is claimed to offer a satisfying take on disagreement, consider a simple example, concerning predicates of personal taste. A utters, “Pretzels are tasty”, and B utters, “Pretzels are not tasty”. While the semantic invariantist (for whom the truth-value of taste predications is in no way context sensitive) will insist that the above exchange constitutes a genuine disagreement about whether pretzels are tasty and that at least one party is wrong, contextualists and truth-relativists have the prima facie advantageous resources to avoid the result that at least one party to the apparent disagreement has made a mistake.

The contextualist claims that the truth-evaluable content expressed by A’s utterance encodes A’s standards (cf. non-indexical contextualism). Thus, in this apparent disagreement, the proposition expressed by A is “Pretzels are tasty relative to my [A’s] standards” while B expresses the proposition “Pretzels are not tasty relative to my [B’s] standards”. This maneuver avoids the result that at least one of the two parties has uttered something false, but (as the new relativist points out) this result comes at the price of being unable to offer a clear explanation of our intuition that there is some uniform content about which A and B disagree.

The new relativist, on the other hand, claims to be able to preserve both the apparent subjectivity of taste discourse and (and, unlike the contextualist) our intuition that exchanges of the form mentioned constitute genuine disagreements. They do this by first insisting (unlike the contextualist) that there is a single truth-evaluable proposition which A affirms and B denies. In the case where A says “Pretzels are tasty”, and B denies this, there is a uniform content that is affirmed by A’s utterance and denied by B’s, namely the proposition that pretzels are tasty, period. So we have a genuine disagreement. Unlike the truth-absolutist, however, the new relativist will add that the disagreement is faultless because the proposition affirmed in A’s utterance has a truth value only relative to a judge or standards parameter, and in this case: A’s standards, when A is the assessor, B’s standards, when B is the assessor. Hence, the truth-relativist about predicates of personal taste will, by insisting that the truth of Pretzels are tasty depends on the context of assessment, allow a single proposition to be (at the same time):

  • (i) true relative to the context of assessment where A’s standards of taste are operative and
  • (ii) false relative to the context of assessment where B’s standards of taste are operative.

New Relativist views, which endorse truth-relativism locally for some domain of discourse, stand in opposition to the more traditional view of propositional content (what Cappelen & Hawthorne call “The Simple View”) according to which propositions bear truth and falsity as monadic properties (cf. however, MacFarlane 2011a for some resistance to Cappelen & Hawthorne’s claim that this simple characterization should be regarded as the “received” view.)

A key source of philosophical motivation for relativizing truth in the fashion of New Relativism traces to Lewis’s (1980) and Kaplan’s (1989) foundational work in semantics, according to which sentence truth is to be understood as relative to a circumstance of evaluation that includes world, time and location. New Relativists inherit the formal apparatus of Lewis and Kaplan and add another parameter, but their reasons for doing so are quite different from the reasons that motivated the framework in the first place. While Lewis’s and Kaplan’s reasons for “proliferating” parameters were primarily based on considerations to do with intensional operators, the more contemporary reasons for adding a judge or standard parameter are often to do with respecting (for instance) disagreement data. (For further discussion here, see Kölbel (2015)). (Note that “old-style contextualism” can also be stated in Kaplan’s framework; it involves variation in content with respect to the context of utterance rather than in truth value with respect to the circumstance of evaluation).

Kaplan’s view specifically was that the need for particular parameters in the circumstance of evaluation was a function of the non-specificity of certain propositional contents with respect to world, time and location (see Kaplan’s (1989) analysis of indexicals). On Kaplan’s view:

A circumstance will usually include a possible state or history of the world, a time, and perhaps other features as well. The amount of information we require from a circumstance is linked to the degree of specificity of contents and thus to the kinds of operators in the language…. (1989: 502)

John MacFarlane, a leading contemporary relativist, writes:

Taking this line of thought a little farther, the relativist might envision contents that are “sense-of-humor neutral” or “standard-of-taste neutral” or “epistemic-state neutral”, and circumstances of evaluation that include parameters for a sense of humor, a standard of taste or an epistemic state. This move would open up room for the truth value of a proposition to vary with these “subjective” factors in much the same way that it varies with the world of evaluation. (MacFarlane 2007: 6–7)

Similarly, Cappelen and Hawthorne write:

Contemporary analytic relativists reason as follows: ‘Lewis and Kaplan have shown that we need to relativize truth to triples of <world, time, location>[’]. … But, having already started down this road, why not exploit these strategies further? In particular, by adding new and exotic parameters into the circumstances of evaluation, we can allow the contents of thought and talk to be non-specific (in Kaplan’s sense) along dimensions other than world, time and location. (2009: 10; edited)

A question on which New Relativists are divided, however, is: what contents are non-specific along dimensions other than world, time and location? It is with respect to this general question that different families of New Relativism are generated.

The taxonomy we offer is that a view falls within the category of New Relativism if, and only if, the view endorses a truth-relativist semantics (as previously outlined) for utterance tokens in some domain of discourse, such as: discourse about predicates of personal taste (Lasersohn 2005; Kölbel 2003), epistemic modals (Egan 2007; Egan, Hawthorne & Weatherson 2005; MacFarlane 2011b; Stephenson 2007), future contingents (MacFarlane 2003), indicative conditionals (Weatherson 2009; Kolodny & MacFarlane 2010) gradable adjectives (Richard 2004), deontic modals (Kolodny & MacFarlane 2010 and MacFarlane 2014: ch. 11) and knowledge attributions (Richard 2004); MacFarlane 2005b, 2011c, 2014). The motivations for truth-relativism in each of these domains include various considerations unique to those domains. We consider some of the arguments for New Relativism in four of these domains in the following sections.

5.2 Truth Relativism and predicates of personal taste

One area of discourse that has been particularly fertile ground for New Relativism is discourse that concerns predicates of personal taste (e.g., “tasty” and “fun”.)

5.2.1 Lasersohn (2005) and the judge parameter

Take a case where Mary says: “The chili is tasty” and John says, “The chili is not tasty”. Lasersohn argues (much as Kölbel does) that only the truth-relativist can make sense of the nature of John and Mary’s disagreement: It is a genuine disagreement. One affirms what the other denies. And yet neither is wrong. Lasersohn argues that there is an elegant way to make sense of the idea that John and Mary are both (in some sense) right, even though John asserts the negation of what is expressed by Mary. What Lasersohn) suggests, more formally, is the introduction of a judge parameter.

Instead of treating the content of a sentence as a set of time-world pairs, we should treat it as a set of time-world-individual triples. We assume that the content will provide an individual to be used in evaluating the sentences for truth and falsity, just as it provides a time and world. (Lasersohn: 2005: 17)

Lasersohn adds (2005: 23) that in order to maintain an authentically subjective assignment of truth-values to sentences containing predicates of personal taste, we must allow that the objective facts of the situation of utterance do not uniquely determine a judge. But who is the judge? Typically, it is us, and when it is, the evaluation is from what Lasersohn calls an autocentric perspective. Importantly, Lasersohn allows that in certain circumstances we take an exocentric perspective when assessing predicates of personal taste: assessing these sentences for truth relative to contexts in which someone other than ourselves is specified as the judge (cf. “Come on, it’ll be fun!” “Is this fun?” (2005: 26); cf. Stanley (2005: 10) for a response to Lasersohn’s program).

5.2.2 Kölbel and Faultless Disagreement

Kölbel’s (2003) faultless disagreement argument for relativism about predicates of personal taste features a “proof” that there is no faultless disagreement followed by a demonstration that the proof is indefensible. The proof proceeds from two premises: an equivalence schema

  • (ES)It is true that p iff p;

and an apparent truism about mistakes:

  • (T)It is a mistake to believe a proposition that is not true.

(ES) and (T) generate the conclusion that there is no faultless disagreement through the following proof (see also Wright 2001:52)

  • (1) A believes that p. (Assumption)
  • (2) B believes that not-p (Assumption)
  • (3) p (Assumption)
  • (4) not-true (not-p) 3, ES
  • (5) B has made a mistake 2, 4, T
  • (6) Not-p (Assumption)
  • (7) Not-true (p) 6, ES
  • (8) A has made a mistake (1, 6, T)
  • (9) Either A or B has made a mistake (3–8)

But because Kölbel takes (9) to be implausible in what Kölbel takes to be “discretionary” (non-objective, as Kölbel sees it) areas of discourse he contends that we should introduce a relativized version of (T) to avoid the conclusion that at least one party has made a mistake.

  • (T***) It is a mistake to believe a discretionary proposition that is not true as evaluated from one’s own perspective. (2003: 70)

Kölbel claims further that, for reasons of uniformity, we should “relativize truth of all propositions across the board…” and he accordingly endorses the following version of truth relativism:

  • (TR) It is a mistake to believe a proposition that is not true in one’s own perspective. (2003: 70).

Kölbel (2003: 71) thinks that this position allows the possibility of maintaining that faultless disagreement is impossible in some non-discretionary (objective) areas, and this will depend on the relation of perspective possession (but see also Boghossian 2011 for the contrary view). An implication of the position is that Kölbel’s view will allow assertions of the form: “Pretzels are not tasty, though John believes they are. And yet John is not mistaken”. For other discussions of faultless disagreement, see Richard (2008), MacFarlane (2012, 2014: ch. 6).

5.2.3 Moral relativism

There is a version of moral relativism (e.g., Kölbel 2004) that falls squarely within the New Relativist tradition. We can think of this relativism simply as a generalization of the position just discussed that treats moral terms (e.g., “right”, “good”) as assessment-sensitive along with predicates of personal taste.

Such an extension faces problems analogous to those faced by truth-relativists about predicates of personal taste (cf. Beebe (2010) for a helpful discussion of truth-relativist semantics versus varieties of contextualist competitors).

A broader kind of problem for this semantic thesis (as well as to moral relativists more generally), raised by Coliva and Moruzzi (2012) is that it succumbs to the progress argument, an argument that famously challenges, in particular, cultural relativists (as well as indexical contextualists) about moral judgments by insisting that moral progress is both evident and not something the relativist can countenance (e.g., Rachels 2009). A third and particularly important kind of worry, addressed by Capps, Lynch and Massey (2009), involves explaining the source and nature of moral relativity, on a truth-relativist framework. Specifically, they claim that

we ought to have some account of why it is that truth in the moral domain is such that it varies with a parameter set by the context of assessment. (Capps, Lynch & Massey 2009: 416)

5.3 Truth relativism and epistemic modals

Epistemic modality (e.g., claims of the form “S might be F”) is another particularly fertile ground for New Relativists. A key reason for this is the dialectical force of Eavesdropper Arguments, which attempt to show the perils of contextualist treatments of utterances containing epistemic modals. Another prominent argument concerns metasemantic complexity. We will examine both of these argument strategies. But first, let’s distinguish epistemic modality from metaphysical modality. To say that p is metaphysically possible is to say that p might have been the case in the sense that: in some possible world, p is true. To say that p is epistemically possible is by contrast to say that p might be the case, or that p is the case for all we know (see the entry on Varieties of Modality). A canonical example of a statement expressing an epistemic modal is the claim A might be F. The truth of claims of the form A might be F will depend on whether F is an epistemic possibility for some individual or group, which is to say, that F must not be ruled out by what some individual or group knows. But which individual or group? This is not always clear. As Egan and Weatherson (2011: 4) remark:

…statements of epistemic possibility in plain English do not make any explicit reference to such a person, group, evidence set, or information state. One of the key issues confronting a semanticist attempting to theorize about epistemic modals is what to do about this lack of reference.

Eavesdropper-style cases highlight the difficulty of determining exactly which individual’s or group’s body of information is relevant to the truth of claims of epistemic possibility and are taken by defenders of truth-relativism about epistemic modals to motivate their position. A variety of different eavesdropper cases have been given by different proponents (and attempted refuters) of truth-relativism about epistemic modals in the literature. For ease of exposition, we will use an especially simple version of the case, from Hawthorne’s (2007), slightly amended:

EAVESDROPPER: [Sandra] is on the way to the grocery store. I hear her say: “Susan might be at the store. I could run into her”. No party to the conversation that I am listening in on knows that Susan is on vacation. But I know that she is. Despite the fact that it is compatible with what the conversants know that Susan is in the store and that the speaker will run into her, I am inclined to judge the speaker’s [Sandra’s] modal judgments to be incorrect. (Hawthorne 2007: 92)

Egan (2007), Egan, Hawthorne and Weatherson (2005) and MacFarlane (2011b) share a similar set of diagnoses here: (i) it seems that while Sandra and I disagree about the truth value of Sandra’s statement, neither she nor I have made a mistake; (ii) the contextualist can’t explain this; (iii) the truth-relativist can.

Why can’t the contextualist explain this? As noted, the truth of claims expressing epistemic modals must depend on what some individual or group knows. But in these cases the context of use does not pick out a single such individual or group. After all, if it did, then either Sandra or I would be wrong, but it seems that neither of us is. That the context of use does not uniquely pick out one relevant body of knowledge for determining the truth of epistemic modal statements is not, as MacFarlane notes, something that can be accommodated by “the framework of contextualism, which requires that the relevant body of knowledge be determined by features of the context of use”. (MacFarlane 2011c)

Additionally, as Egan and Weatherson (2011) suggest, any contextualist account of the semantics of epistemic modals that could handle eavesdropper-style cases in a principled way would be hideously complicated. This motivates a metasemantic argument against contextualism (and a corresponding argument for relativism): if contextualism about epistemic modals is correct, then the semantics for epistemic modals will be hideously complicated; the semantics is not hideously complicated on the truth-relativist’s proposal, therefore, ceteris paribus, truth-relativism for epistemic modals is more plausible than contextualism. However, Glanzberg (2007) notably denies that metasemantic complexity in this case must be problematic.

How can the relativist accommodate eavesdropper cases? MacFarlane (2011b) articulates the relativist solution: Sandra and I disagree about the truth-value of a single proposition, the proposition that Susan might be at the store. This proposition, even when fully articulated, makes no reference to any particular body of knowledge. But such propositions cannot be true or false simpliciter. They are true only relative to a context of assessment that includes a body of knowledge. In this case, the proposition is true relative to a context of assessment where what Sandra knows is operative—a context in which Sandra is the evaluator—and false relative to a context of assessment where what I know is operative because I am the evaluator. Thus: both disagreement and faultlessness are preserved (cf. Ross & Schroeder 2013 for criticism).

Along with MacFarlane, Egan (2007) and Stephenson (2007) have also offered positive defenses of truth-relativism about epistemic modals; their defenses share MacFarlane’s view that propositions expressing epistemic modals are non-specific along dimensions that include the body of information possessed by a judge or assessor.

5.4 Truth relativism and future contingents

Propositions termed “future contingents” are about the future and their truth-values are not settled by the state of the world in the past or present (see entry on Future Contingents, and MacFarlane 2014: ch. 9). In a deterministic world there are no future contingent statements in this sense. But in an indeterministic world, statements partly about the future will often satisfy these conditions. Consider Aristotle’s oft-cited example: the proposition There will be a sea battle tomorrow, uttered at t. Contrast now two intuitions: the determinacy intuition that utterances that “turned out true” were true at the time of utterance; and the indeterminacy intuition that, at the time of the utterance, multiple histories are possible, including one where there was a sea battle and the proposition is true, and one where there was not, and the proposition is false. The indeterminacy intuition leads us to think the truth-value of future contingents is indeterminate at the time of utterance, and either true or false at a later time (cf. MacFarlane 2003; Carter 2011).

John MacFarlane (2003) thinks that both the indeterminacy intuition and the determinacy intuition should be taken at face value and that the only way to account for the semantics of future contingents is to allow the truth of future contingent statements to be, as he puts it, doubly relativized: to both the context of utterance and the context of assessment. When we evaluate a single token utterance of “There will be a sea battle tomorrow” produced on (say) Monday, this counts as neither true nor false when the context of assessment is the context in which the utterance is being made (as multiple possible histories are open at this point). However the very same statement will have a determinate truth-value relative to the context of assessment of the following day. So we can have faultless transtemporal disagreement about the truth-value of a single utterance (MacFarlane 2003: 36; cf. Carter 2011).

5.5 Truth relativism and knowledge ascriptions

MacFarlane (2005b) argues that “know” is sensitive to the epistemic standards at play in the context of assessment; that is, the extension of “know” varies with the context of assessment. Much as the relativist about future contingents aimed to accommodate both the determinacy and indeterminacy intuitions, the relativist about knowledge attributions can be viewed as offering an attempted synthesis between the contextualist and both sensitive and insensitive varieties of invariantist (see entry on Epistemic Contextualism). As MacFarlane (2014: 190) puts it:

Invariantism is right that there is a single knowledge relation, and that the accuracy of knowledge ascriptions does not depend on which epistemic standard is relevant at the context of use. But contextualism is right that the accuracy of such ascriptions depends somehow on contextually relevant standards. Relativism seeks to synthesize these insights into a more satisfactory picture.

To apply this view, suppose George says, “Bill knows that his car is in the driveway”, while Barry says, “Bill doesn’t know that his car is in the driveway”. According to the relativist, the assessment of the truth-values of Bill’s and Barry’s statements depends also on the specification of some epistemic standard. For the truth-relativist, the standard will be the operative standard in the context of assessment. George’s utterance may be true (and Barry’s false) relative to a context of assessment in which ordinary “low” standards are in place, whereas Barry’s may be true (and George’s false) relative to a context of assessment in which high “Cartesian” standards are in place. See Stanley (2005: ch. 7) for a detailed criticism of this position, though see also MacFarlane (2014: §8.5 for a reply). See also Richard (2004), for another version of truth-relativism for knowledge attributions. In MacFarlane’s more recent (2014) defense of a truth-relativist semantics for “knows”, the context of assessment is taken to fix which alternatives count as relevant. See, however, Carter 2015 for an argument that MacFarlane’s more recent view generates counterintuitive results in cases of environmental epistemic luck (e.g., barn façade-style cases) and normative defeaters.

5.6 General Objections to New Relativism

We turn now to two general arguments against New Relativism in all its forms. The first is an argument from assertion, the second an argument from simplicity.

5.6.1 Relativism and assertion

Two assertion-related objections to New Relativism arise from work by Gareth Evans (1985) and Robert Stalnaker (1978), respectively. Greenough (2010: 2) concisely captures Evans’s challenge to truth-relativism on assertoric grounds as follows:

  • (1) The question “What should [an assertor] aim at?” is a legitimate question.
  • (2) Any legitimate answer to this question will generate a once-and-for-all answer.
  • (3) Any once-and-for-all answer is incompatible with Truth-Relativism
  • (4) Therefore, Truth Relativism is ruled out.

The relativist must plausibly take issue with (2) or (3), (or both). For an attempt to meet Evans’ challenge, MacFarlane has defended a way to effectively reject (2) via what Marques has called a “meet-the-challenge” norm of assertion (cf. MacFarlane 2003; though see also his 2014: ch. 5)—according to which (à la Brandom 1983), in asserting p one undertakes a commitment to either defending p or giving up p if the challenge cannot be met satisfactorily (see Kölbel (2004: 308) for some other discussions of this objection).

A related assertion-based challenge to truth-relativism emerges by appeal to Stalnaker’s (1978) belief transfer model of assertion (cf. 2011). The idea here is to appeal to a plausible view of the purpose of assertion—to “transfer beliefs from assertor to members of her audience” (Egan 2007: 15) and then to object that what is asserted, according to the truth-relativist, cannot play this characteristic role; specifically, this will be because, for the truth-relativist, the asserted contents are liable to be true relative to the speaker but false relative to the audience. For instance, Sam hardly (on the truth-relativist’s program) seems to “transfer” to Dean his belief Apples are tasty (which is true) by asserting this to Dean, when what Dean comes to believe Apples are tasty is something (on the assumption that Dean doesn’t like apples) that will be false. Thus, and more generally, it’s not clear what, exactly, could be said to be transferred and a fortiori asserted. See Egan (2007) for an attempt to reconcile truth-relativism (about epistemic modals) with Stalnaker’s belief-transfer model of assertion.

5.6.2 Simplicity

Cappelen and Hawthorne (2009) assess the merits of New Relativism as it stands to challenge what they take to be the received view of the objects of thought and talk, “Simplicity”, the core tenets of which are:

  • (T1) There are propositions and they instantiate the fundamental monadic properties of truth simpliciter and falsity simpliciter.
  • (T2) The semantic values of declarative sentences relative to contexts of utterance are propositions.
  • (T3) Propositions are, unsurprisingly, the objects of propositional attitudes, such as belief, hope, wish, doubt.
  • (T4) Propositions are the objects of illocutionary acts; they are, e.g., what we assert and deny.
  • (T5) Propositions are the objects of agreement and disagreement. (Cappelen & Hawthorne 2009: 1)

Cappelen and Hawthorne understand New Relativism (what they call analytic relativism) as a direct challenge to (T1) and that, if this challenge were successful, it would consequently bring down the more general picture they call “simplicity”. Accordingly, Cappelen and Hawthorne’s central objective is to show that truth-relativist’s arguments aimed at undermining (T1) are ultimately unsuccessful; more specifically, their broad strategy is to insist that the arguments adduced in favor of truth-relativism—when thoroughly understood—constitute a presumptive case for contextualism (in the domains where relativism was defended, and in particularly, in the domain of predicates of personal taste).

6. Conclusion

Relativism comes in a plethora of forms that are themselves grounded in disparate philosophical motivations. There is no such thing as Relativism simpliciter, and no single argument that would establish or refute every relativistic position that has been proposed. Despite this diversity, however, there are commonalities and family resemblances that justify the use of the label “relativism” for the various views we have discussed. Relativism remains a hotly disputed topic still surviving various attempts to eliminate it from philosophical discourse. What is most surprising, however, is the recent popularity of some versions of the doctrine in at least some circles of analytic philosophy.


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We would like to thank Paul Boghossian, Annalisa Coliva, Steven Hales, Max Kölbel, Martin Kusch, John MacFarlane, Michela Massimi, Brian Morrissey, Brian Rabern, Tim Williamson and two anonymous referees for their valuable comments on various earlier drafts of this paper.

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