Abu Bakr al-Razi

First published Wed May 19, 2021

Abū Bakr al-Rāzī (865–925 CE, 251–313 AH) was one of the greatest figures in the history of medicine in the Islamic tradition, and one of its most controversial philosophers. While we have ample surviving evidence for his medical thought, his philosophical ideas mostly have to be pieced together on the basis of reports found in other authors, who are often hostile to him. This concerns especially his notorious critique of religion, and his teaching that the cosmos is produced through the interaction of five “eternal principles”, namely God, Soul, matter, time, and place. We do however have direct access to one branch of his philosophy, namely ethics, represented by a work of advice called The Spiritual Medicine and a briefer rejoinder to his critics, The Philosophical Way of Life. (Note that Abū Bakr is not to be confused with other philosophers from the same city of Rayy, who are also called al-Rāzī: the most famous of these is Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī, who wrote several centuries later.)

1. Life and Works

Abū Bakr Muḥammad ibn Zakariyyāʾ al-Rāzī made his fame mostly as a doctor. As his name “al-Rāzī” indicates, he hailed from the Persian city of Rayy, near modern-day Tehran. His biographers report that he ran a hospital there, and another in Baghdad. He received patronage from Abū Ṣāliḥ al-Manṣūr (d. 914), the governor of Rayy, to whom al-Rāzī dedicated a substantial medical treatise, The Book for al-Manṣūr. We have a variety of anecdotes about al-Rāzī’s medical practice, some found in his own works and some in his medieval biographers, for instance that al-Rāzī would deal only with patients whose condition stumped his students. We also know, because he tells us himself, that he suffered from eye problems and a hand injury from copious reading, copying, and writing.

This latter piece of information is found in The Philosophical Way of Life, which is a good first text to read by al-Rāzī (Arabic edition in al-Rāzī RF; English translation in al-Rāzī PWL). In it he rebuts accusations that he is a hypocrite for claiming to model his lifestyle on that of Socrates, when in fact Socrates was rigorously ascetic and al-Rāzī is not (see Strohmaier 1974). Al-Rāzī responds by saying that reports of Socrates’ asceticism, which unbeknownst to him go back to a confusion in the sources between Socrates and Diogenes the Cynic, do not tell the whole story. In fact Socrates adopted a lifestyle of moderation as he matured, and it is this model that al-Rāzī imitates.

This is one of only two complete surviving works by al-Rāzī devoted solely to a philosophical topic; the other one also deals with ethics. This is The Spiritual Medicine (Arabic edition in al-Rāzī RF; English translation in al-Rāzī SPR and for discussion Adamson 2016), a longer book of ethical advice presented to his patron al-Manṣūr as a complement to the aforementioned medical treatise. Here al-Rāzī offers treatment for the soul, following on his overview of treatments for the body (Adamson 2019). Apart from this, the most significant surviving work for his philosophy is his Doubts about Galen (Arabic critical edition and translation by Koetschet in al-Rāzī DG). Al-Rāzī considered Galen the greatest of medical authorities, but on the basis of Galen’s own critical attitude towards esteemed predecessors, felt free to critique weak points in the extensive corpus of Galenic works that had been translated into Arabic. While a number of these points naturally concern medicine, the Doubts also touches on a wide range of philosophical issues, as discussed below.

Beyond this, the extant writings have to do mostly with medicine, including a number of smaller treatises, like a celebrated text on the difference between smallpox and measles (English translation in al-Rāzī SM), and the by no means small Comprehensive Book, a staggeringly huge collection of notes on medicine that was compiled by al-Rāzī’s students after his death. The Comprehensive Book is sometimes said to present al-Rāzī’s “case notes”. But, while it is true that he reports on his own medical experiences, the work is more accurately described as a collection of excerpts from Greek and Arabic medical sources. When he does introduce “case notes” this is to provide counterexamples and amplifications for the textual evidence (Savage-Smith 2012). Broadly speaking, despite his often harsh diatribe against Galen’s failures in the Doubts, al-Rāzī’s own medical theories fall broadly within the Galenic framework, and thus deploy such standard concepts as the four humors, the natural powers of the body, and the role of pneuma in explaining animal sensation and motion.

A final group of works that come down to us from al-Rāzī discuss alchemy (Ruska 1935). He was evidently a practicing alchemist and describes in detail a wide variety of chemical procedures, all aimed towards the goal of manufacturing valuable minerals and stones, or likenesses thereof. It may be that al-Rāzī’s atomist theory of matter provided him with a basis for understanding these processes. Chemical transformation would involve breaking down complex substances to more primitive particles and then recombining them in other proportions to produce the desired result (Kraus 1942–3: vol. 2, 10–11; Adamson 2021: 96–98).

Beyond these extant works we have reports on the full range of al-Rāzī’s writings by later authors who recorded lists of their titles. These confirm that he wrote much on medicine, philosophy, and alchemy, as well as mathematics, logic, and poetry. Most eye-catching here, though, are works in which he discussed religion and, especially, prophecy. The latter bear titles like On the Tricks of Supposed Prophets and On the Necessity of the Prophetic Mission. That could just show that he was concerned to refute the claims of spurious prophets, while accepting the legitimacy of true prophets. But in reports by still other authors, we are given a picture of al-Rāzī as a fundamentally anti-religious author who rejected all revelation and prophecy. This is especially the case with al-Rāzī’s contemporary, also from Rayy, Abū Ḥātim al-Rāzī (d. 934). In a treatise called The Proofs of Prophecy, Abū Ḥātim recounts face-to-face debates he had with al-Rāzī and then summarizes, and elaborately refutes, a treatise by al-Rāzī that supposedly sought to unmask the falsehoods of all revelatory religious traditions (see AHR in the bibliography).

Along with Abū Ḥātim, two other sources are crucial for reconstructing al-Rāzī’s cosmology. These are Naṣīr-e Khosraw (d. 1088), who explained this cosmology in order to refute it in his Persian work Provision for the Traveler (hereafter NK, selective trans. into Arabic in al-Rāzī RF), and yet another al-Rāzī, this time the famous theologian-philosopher Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (d. 1210), in his Exalted Topics (hereafter FDR). From these and a few other sources, we can piece together the details of a remarkable account of the creation of the world, which invokes five factors that have always existed and come together to produce the cosmos: God, Soul, matter, time, and place. Abū Ḥātim and Naṣīr-e Khosraw both present this as an appalling departure from Islam, since it involves postulating four eternal principles alongside God.

2. The Five Eternal Principles

Some reports suggest that al-Rāzī saw his five principles as having a systematic structure: God and Soul are active and alive, matter passive and non-living, and time and place neither active, nor passive, nor alive. But the scheme does not seem to be motivated by its ability to satisfy all logical possibilities. Rather, al-Rāzī argues specifically for each of the five principles. God’s existence is demonstrated on the basis of the good design of the universe; more contentious are the other four.

While the Soul is invoked as the source of life in bodies, its primary function in al-Rāzī’s philosophy is to facilitate a distinctive theodicy. The presence of great suffering in the world, alongside the aforementioned good design of that world, shows that it cannot have been created directly by God. Furthermore, al-Rāzī is concerned with a traditional argument against the eternity of the universe, namely that a perfectly wise and rational God could not arbitrarily choose a moment for the universe to begin existing. Both problems are solved by postulating a Soul which is “foolish” where God is wise. The Soul conceives of a desire or even passion (ʿishq) to be “mixed” with matter, which initiates the process of the world’s creation. God intervenes to make the world as good as it can be, but our bodily life is still inevitably full of pain.

One question that arises here is why God would not prevent the Soul from mixing with matter, if this is such a bad idea. Al-Rāzī’s explanation is that God allows it to happen as a learning experience for the Soul (Goodman 1975). God bestows upon the Soul the gift of reason or intellect (ʿaql), and Soul can use this to realize that it should be working to free itself from its unwise bond with matter (Druart 1996). We have reports of parables used by al-Rāzī to explain this. A wise father might allow his inexperienced child to venture to a dangerous country, but send with him a good advisor (namely the intellect; Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī, FDR: vol. 4, 416). Similarly, a wise father might allow his foolish child to go into an alluring garden full of thorns and stinging insects, so as to teach the child a lesson (Abū Ḥātim al-Rāzī, AHR: 18–19). This theodicy points the way towards a conception of our ultimate end, namely to escape from the material world, achieving “liberation” through moderate lifestyle and the practice of philosophy.

As for matter, time, and place, these principles are required in order that the universe may be created at all (for an overview see Fakhry 1968). First, al-Rāzī thinks that there must already be some material before the cosmos exists, out of which it is constructed. As Nāṣir-e Khosraw (NK: 75) complains, al-Rāzī believed that creation ex nihilo was impossible. He argued for this on the grounds that we constantly see things being produced through lengthy processes of development, even though instantaneous manifestation would be far easier and involve less suffering: he gives the example of the need for childbirth and growth to maturity. His point is that God would not cause this to happen, if He could just make humans exist from nothing. Time and place are needed for an analogous reason. Time cannot be created, since creation must occur at a time, and place cannot be created, because there would already need to be somewhere to put it.

Al-Rāzī’s conception of matter is unusual among falāsifa, that is, thinkers of the Islamic world who respond primarily to the Greek philosophical tradition. More or less all of them, from al-Kindī (d. after 870) to al-Fārābī (d. 950), Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna, d. 1037), and Ibn Rushd (Averroes, d. 1198), endorse a broadly Aristotelian understanding of bodies as potentially subject to indefinite division. By contrast, al-Rāzī is an atomist (Pines 1936 [1997], Baffioni 1982, Langermann 2009). He believes that the four elements (or possibly five: our sources are not clear as to whether he thinks the heavens are constituted from a distinct fifth element) differ in their properties because of variations in the ratio of atoms to void. Thus earth, which has little or no void in it, is dark, cold, dense, and moves downward; fire is luminous, hot, subtle, and moves upward. Actually these are not strictly “elements” but only the most basic compounds of atoms, which are truly fundamental. Though contemporary Islamic theologians were also atomists (Dhanani 1994), al-Rāzī’s theory differs from theirs in some respects, and we know that he debated the topic of matter with a theologian named al-Miṣmaʿī.

Al-Rāzī referred to atoms as “absolute (muṭlaq) matter”, a locution echoed in his characterizations of the last two principles, namely “absolute time” and “absolute place”. These are also known, respectively, as “eternity (dahr)” or “duration (mudda)” and “void (khalāʾ)”. As we learn from the report of the debate with Abū Ḥātim, al-Rāzī was concerned to stress the independence of time and place from bodies, that is, from composites of atoms (Abū Ḥātim al-Rāzī, AHR: 12). Time in itself is simply eternal duration, with events (including the creation of the world) and motions happening within that duration. Similarly, place in itself is an infinite void, into which the bounded physical cosmos is placed. As already explained, void also exists (at least at the microscopic level) within the cosmos, since its admixture into bodies explains the variation between the elements.

Al-Rāzī’s theories may be usefully contrasted to those of Aristotle; we know he was familiar with Aristotle’s Physics because he tells us as much in his Philosophical Way of Life. For Aristotle, time and place are dependent or supervenient phenomena: place is the inner boundary of the body that contains the body that is in place, while time is the number of motion. Al-Rāzī by contrast makes space-time independent. For instance he proposed a thought experiment that, if the universe were taken away, its place would remain (a similar idea is proposed by Philoponus in Phys. 574, translated in Philoponus CPV: 36). However his attitude towards Aristotelian physics is more nuanced than straightforward rejection (Adamson 2021: ch.5). For he accepts that one may speak of “relative” time and place, which would be the time and place of a particular motion and particular body, respectively. For example a year would be a demarcated segment of eternal duration that measures the sun’s motion along the ecliptic, while the place of a ball would be the limit of the region of void occupied by the ball. Likewise, al-Rāzī includes the Aristotelian elements, earth, water, air, fire, and perhaps ether, in his cosmology but does not accept that these are fundamental. As just seen, the real “element” that underlies them is atomic.

Thus Aristotle managed to articulate genuine principles of physics, but only “relative” ones that need to be understood within a more basic framework. It was Plato who, in al-Rāzī’s opinion, had gotten closest to putting forward that framework. Abū Ḥātim says that al-Rāzī told him as much: “what Plato says is hardly different from what I believe concerning time, and this, according to me, is the best thing that has been said about it” (Abū Ḥātim al-Rāzī, AHR: 13). The text he must have in mind is Plato’s Timaeus, which he would have known through the intermediary of Galen (see Galen, CTP for the Arabic translation of his paraphrase of the dialogue). The Timaeus likewise postulates a pre-existing matter that is formed into the cosmos; it can also be read as suggesting that time and place in some sense pre-exist the cosmos. Furthermore, Plato puts forward an atomic theory in the Timaeus. In fact, al-Rāzī rises to the defense of that theory in Doubts about Galen (al-Rāzī, DG: §15.1-6). So there is good reason to believe that al-Rāzī was modeling his cosmology primarily on Plato’s, as he understood it, albeit with adjustments.

On the other hand, Naṣīr-e Khosraw tells us that al-Rāzī plagiarized this whole theory from his teacher, Īrānshahrī. He is an obscure figure whose works are lost, though al-Bīrūnī (d. ca. 1050) does speak of him as an expert in astronomy and the diversity of religions. Another witness, Abū l-Maʿālī (fl. 1092), has Īrānshahrī claiming to have been a prophet who had received revelation from an angel, like the Prophet Muhammad did. He reports that for Īrānshahrī, all religions put forth a single teaching, an idea which might be thought to resonate with al-Rāzī’s own irenic, rationalist approach to revelation. If Naṣīr-e Khosraw is right to trace the Razian cosmology to this shadowy teacher, then perhaps we should think of al-Rāzī’s project as a creative fusion of Īrānshahri’s ideas and Plato’s.

3. Ethics

From the foregoing discussion of al-Rāzī’s theodicy it may seem obvious that his ethical teaching would focus on the goal of liberation from the body and its concerns. But as mentioned already, his Philosophical Way of Life defends a lifestyle of moderation, and distances itself from outright asceticism. Furthermore, in this text he says that bodily pleasure may licitly be sought so long as one does not transgress what he calls a “limit past which one may not go”. This limit dictates that we should partake of no pleasures

that can be attained only by engaging in evildoing, murder, and in general anything that displeases God, when the judgment of intellect and justice is that it is unnecessary. All else is permitted. (al-Rāzī, RF: 106–7)

On the other hand, in the Spiritual Medicine he seems to take a dim view of pleasures, and offers advice for resisting the allure of food, drink, sex, and luxury. One point made in both works is that it is a violation of reason to enjoy things that entail more pain than pleasure in the long run, like overeating. In the Spiritual Medicine al-Rāzī tells the story of how he chastized a man who gobbled down a plate of dates, warning him that it would lead to illnesses, and thus “many times more pain than the pleasure you have had” (al-Rāzī, RF: 71).

Two interpretations have been offered to explain al-Rāzī’s position on pleasure. According to Lenn E. Goodman (1971, 1999, followed by Groff 2014), al-Rāzī was defending an Epicurean ethic in which pleasure should be maximized. On this account, his rationale for moderation is that it is the way to have the most pleasure: going too far with pleasures turns out to be more painful in the long run. This interpretation has been criticized by Adamson (2008a, 2021), on the grounds that it ignores al-Rāzī’s own theory of pleasure. According to this theory, which is clearly based on the Timaeus, pleasure can be had only as the result of a process of removing a harmful state. For example, drinking is pleasant because it eliminates thirst. On this account of pleasure, as Plato himself pointed out, hedonism is an attempt to win at a zero-sum game: you can only have pleasure to the extent that you have suffered pain, or at least harm. (Not all harm is felt as pain, just as not all restoration is felt as pleasure, because only fast changes are noticeable.) Furthermore, al-Rāzī says himself in the Doubts about Galen (DG: §7.7) that pleasure is not the good to be sought in itself, which is a direct rejection of the sort of hedonism adopted in Epicureanism.

On this latter reading, much of al-Rāzī’s advice for readers focuses on helping non-philosophers work towards a moderate lifestyle, which will prepare them for the more serious and important undertaking of adopting a “philosophical way of life” that will ultimately lead to liberation from the body. Al-Rāzī himself seems to accept this distinction between “pre-philosophical” and “philosophical” ethics (Druart 1997, Adamson 2016), for example in the aforementioned passage about the glutton who loves dates. Al-Rāzī says he threatened the man with stomach aches and illness because

this and other such remarks are of more benefit to someone who has not engaged in philosophical training than proofs built on philosophical principles.

As for the truly philosophical life, it resides in the Platonic ideal of imitating God (Theaetetus 176b), realized through the pursuit of wisdom and justice towards all living things. In a remarkable passage of the Philosophical Way of Life, al-Rāzī stresses the importance of not mistreating beasts of burden and other non-rational animals (Adamson 2012). This would explain the “upper limit” placed on the pursuit of justice: that limit does not derive from the need to maximize pleasure and minimize pain, but from the injunction to avoid “displeasing God” by engaging in injustice.

In more recent publications this interpretive dispute seems to be moving towards agreement. Goodman (2015) now concedes that al-Rāzī, unlike Epicurus, does not make pleasure the highest good and sole criterion in ethics. He does however adopt a therapeutic approach to ethics, which is characteristic of Epicureanism, as of course is the advice to avoid things that bring pain than pleasure all things considered. Adamson accepts this (2021: 6), but suggests that the resonances with Epicureanism may rather reflect a more general reception of Hellenistic ethics by al-Rāzī, again through the intermediary of Galen (see also Bar-Asher 1989).

4. Medicine and the Doubts

As yet, al-Rāzī’s extensive medical corpus has barely been explored with a view to its philosophical significance. An account of the human body and its primary organs in the Spiritual Life—here ascribed to Plato—echoes what he says on this topic in medical works (Adamson 2021: 57–58). His view, following both Galen and the Timaeus, is that humans have three general powers or faculties (quwan), the rational, animal or irascible, and vegetative or desiderative, associated respectively with the brain, heart, and liver. The rational soul is not really seated in the brain, as the other two faculties are seated in their organs; it uses the brain only as an instrument. In medical contexts al-Rāzī makes the same three organs to be the seats of these powers, albeit that the power in the brain is instead called “psychic (nafsānī)”, perhaps to acknowledge the fact that its powers of voluntary self-motion and sensation also belong to irrational animals.

Al-Rāzī’s views on medical epistemology are also Galenic, and presuppose that the best doctor should understand the human body at a theoretical level while also drawing on a wealth of experience (Pormann 2008). This provides a methodological context for understanding the aforementioned Comprehensive Book, which as mentioned collects book-learning on medical theory, but uses al-Rāzī’s own empirical observations to confirm or disconfirm those theories.

But the most rewarding medical text for philosophical readers is Doubts about Galen. Or rather, it should be said that this work deals with a range of philosophical, as well as medical, issues, including the relation between soul and body, vision, atomism, and pleasure (see the ample introduction by Koetschet in al-Rāzī, DG). Regarding the first of these issues, al-Rāzī criticizes Galen for suggesting that the soul is entirely dependent on bodily states or “temperament”, that is, the mixture of the body’s constituents. As in the Spiritual Medicine, he defends Plato’s idea that the rational part of the soul only uses the brain as an “instrument (āla)”, and that injury to the brain impedes rational function only in the way that damage to a flute would make it harder for the flute player to perform (al-Rāzī, DG: §21.4). When it comes to vision, al-Rāzī strikes a less Platonist note, since he rejects Galen’s “extramissionist” theory, which is in part inspired by Plato’s Timaeus. According to Galen, spirit (pneuma) is sent forth from the eyes and transforms air, making it into an instrument for contacting the visual object (Ierodiakonou 2014). Instead, al-Rāzī defends the view that incorporeal images are sent from the seen object and arrive at the eye (Koetschet 2017a).

One of the more elaborate philosophical discussions in the Doubts about Galen comes early in the work, and is devoted to the eternity of the world (this section is translated in PWL). Al-Rāzī here takes issue with Galen’s suggestion that empirical observation shows that the world was not created after not existing. Galen’s idea, based on a passage in Aristotle (On the Heavens 1.3, 270b11–16), is that the universe seems to be unchanging in its general features. If it is unchanging then it is not liable to corruption, and what is incorruptible is also ungenerable. Thus the universe has always existed, and always will. Al-Rāzī has little difficulty poking holes in this argument: he points out that the universe could be unchanging for a long time, and then be destroyed all at once, like a glass being smashed or a building collapsing when previously solid ground under it gives way (al-Rāzī, DG: §2.3). Furthermore, the incorruptibility of the universe would not be guaranteed by its lacking a natural tendency to decay. One also needs to rule out that there is some external cause that could destroy it (al-Rāzī, DG: §2.5). As often in the Doubts, al-Rāzī is here not trying to show that Galen’s conclusion is wrong—though in this case, we know that he thinks it is wrong—but that the argument offered for the conclusion is not sufficient. Ironically, this seems to be in accord with Galen’s own original intention. Galen’s argument is taken from his On Demonstration and was actually offered as an example of a proof that is not demonstrative (Koetschet 2015). Al-Rāzī is either being remarkably contentious, or has lost sight of the context of the argument: he even accuses Galen of being inconsistent, as he elsewhere states that it cannot be proven whether or not the universe is eternal.

5. Religion and Prophecy

If the five eternal theory was considered problematic by contemporaries and later authors, al-Rāzī’s views on religion were considered utterly outrageous and heretical. In his Proofs of Prophecy, Abū Ḥātim selectively quotes and paraphrases from a work by al-Rāzī on this topic, and presents him as having flatly denied the validity of prophetic revelation. Accepting this evidence as more or less reliable, some modern-day scholars have celebrated al-Rāzī as a “freethinker” comparable with such daringly unorthodox thinkers as Ibn al-Rāwandī (Urvoy 1996, Stroumsa 1999), or even as having had pagan sympathies (Vallat 2015a, 2015b, 2016). Against this, Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī quotes our al-Rāzī as having offered interpretations of the Qurʾān, which were designed to show that this revelatory text and indeed the whole history of prophecy was in agreement with his own philosophy (this evidence is presented and discussed in Rashed 2000, 2008). The bio-bibliographical tradition is also ambiguous in its evidence. For instance al-Bīrūnī, who clearly admired al-Rāzī, admits that he made foolish and obstinate remarks about religion and prophecy. But another broadly favorable witness, Ibn Abī Uṣaybiʿa, says that a supposed work attacking religion was perhaps written by “malicious enemies of al-Rāzī and ascribed to him” (for references, see Adamson 2021: 11).

The most ample, if not necessarily trustworthy, evidence is found in Abū Ḥātim. He says that in face-to-face debate, al-Rāzī argued against prophecy on the grounds that it would be unjust to single out only some people for knowledge that is useful by everyone. Furthermore, appointing only a certain few as religious leaders (imāms) would lead to dissension between their followers (Abū Ḥātim, AHR: 1). Followers of religious law are guilty of the cardinal intellectual sin of the Islamic world, taqlīd, which means uncritically adopting beliefs on the basis of authority (AHR: 24). Instead, al-Rāzī argues, God gives reason (ʿaql) to everyone, and in this respect everyone is created equal, able to determine for themselves what goals they should be pursuing. Furthermore, Abū Ḥātim tells us about a range of more specific religious teachings rejected by al-Rāzī in his book against prophecy, such as anthropomorphic descriptions of God and the possibility of miracles, including the inimitability of the Qurʾān (iʿjāz).

In several respects this teaching on prophecy fits well with what we know of al-Rāzī’s philosophy more generally. It invokes the idea that reason is given to the soul as a gift from God, something confirmed in other sources and suggested at the beginning of al-Rāzī’s Spiritual Medicine. Furthermore, Abū Ḥātim has al-Rāzī arguing that God would not send prophets because this is an unreasonable and overly difficult way to achieve His goals (Abū Ḥātim, AHR: 1; 131–2). Why not just give everyone the ability to figure things out for themselves? This same premise that God only proceeds in the most rational way is also important in his theodicy as we know it from other sources, as seen above. Furthermore the critique of taqlīd, while admittedly commonplace, does sound like it could come from al-Rāzī: his irreverent approach to Galen bears witness to a similar independence of mind, albeit in a very different context.

On the other hand, the evidence presented by Fakhr al-Dīn casts serious doubt on the notion that al-Rāzī was openly hostile to the Islamic revelation. And this is backed up by evidence internal to al-Rāzī’s own surviving works, for instance acknowledgment of the preeminent value of “books sent by God” in Doubts about Galen (al-Rāzī, DG: §2.1). At a minimum it seems clear that al-Rāzī was a forthright rationalist, who believed that the truth of a revelatory text would necessarily accord with the truth discoverable by human reason. But that position would not be so remarkable: it is shared from other philosophers of the Islamic world, from al-Kindī to al-Fārābī to Ibn Rushd. The question is whether al-Rāzī went further and insisted that revelation is useless, or even counterproductive, as claimed by Abū Ḥātim.

Recent material brought to light by Philippe Vallat (2015a, 2015b, 2016) could confirm this interpretation. It would show that al-Rāzī said in debate with a theologian named Abū Qāsim al-Balkhī, also called al-Kaʿbī, that “prophets are unnecessary, because we have reason which suffices, assuming that prophecy is in accordance with reason” (on al-Kaʿbī in general see El Omari 2016; and on their debate Rashed 2000, Shihadeh 2006: 103). It has however been argued that Vallat’s new evidence cannot convincingly be linked to the debate between al-Kaʿbī and al-Rāzī, who is never named in these texts (Adamson 2021: 148–151). A different approach would be to read Abū Ḥātim as having distorted al-Rāzī’s position, which may have been a more targeted attack on schismatic and controversialist groups including the Ismāʿīlī branch of Islam to which Abū Ḥātim belonged. Ismāʿīlism is characterized by its insistence on the need for a religious leader or imām to guide the faithful to a true understanding of Islam. It may have been this doctrine, and not prophecy more generally, that al-Rāzī attacked, as a signal example of the dangers of taqlīd (Mohaghegh 1970: 160–1; Adamson 2021: 147).

6. Legacy

Whatever the case, there is no doubt that the Ismāʿīlīs were especially hostile to al-Rāzī. Alongside Abū Ḥātim al-Rāzī and the aforementioned Naṣīr-e Khosraw, who was also an Ismāʿīlī, one may mention another representative of this group named Ḥamīd al-Dīn al-Kirmānī (d. after 1020), who attacked al-Rāzī’s ethical teachings (Ḥamīd al-Dīn al-Kirmānī, see HDK in bibliography). This is not to say that only Ismāʿīlī authors are critical of al-Rāzī, though. Another opponent, who polemicizes against al-Rāzī’s cosmology and apparent belief in the possibility of transmigration (al-Rāzī, RF: 174), is the Andalusian jurist and philosopher Ibn Ḥazm. Also in the Western Islamic world, Maimonides includes a diatribe against the Razian theodicy in his Guide for the Perplexed (GP: §3.12). Though Ibn Ḥazm associates other thinkers with al-Rāzī’s teachings (al-Rāzī, RF: 170 and 174) it does not seem that his daring ideas gained much traction among later philosophers. Perhaps the most productive engagement with the five eternal theory is found in Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī. He gives a fair hearing to al-Rāzī’s account of place and time, and adopts a similar view on the question of time in particular (Adamson and Lammer 2020).

In his primary vocation of medicine, too, al-Rāzī had his critics, including Ibn Sīnā, his only rival for the title of most influential figure in the Islamic medical tradition. In an epistolary exchange with al-Bīrūnī, Ibn Sīnā says that al-Rāzī overreached his competence in both philosophy and medicine (“he exceeded his abilities when lancing abscesses and examining urine and feces”, quoted at al-Rāzī, RF: 290). Al-Rāzī’s project in Doubts was also deemed presumptuous by later medical writers, who composed refutations of the work. Nonetheless, al-Rāzī’s works were widely consulted by doctors in the Islamic world, and he had a wide diffusion in the Latin speaking world under the name “Rhazes”. This began in the medieval period and persisted through the Renaissance, with sixty-seven printed editions of his works before 1700 (Hasse 2016: 8). No less an authority than Vesalius edited an older translation of al-Rāzī’s Book for al-Manṣūr, and al-Rāzī’s medical writings were on the teaching syllabus at Bologna, the most important university in Europe for medical training (Siriasi 1990: 131 and 178). The independent-minded Girolamo Cardano, who in personality and diversity of interests was in some ways the heir of Galen and al-Rāzī, praised the latter as one of several doctors from the Islamic world who had improved upon Galenic medicine through empirical observation (experimentum) (Siriasi 1997: 60). More recently, al-Rāzī has been praised for his innovative approach and for breakthroughs in the history of medicine, for example by investigating differential diagnosis (Iskandar 1962) and using a control group to test the efficacy of a drug (Pormann 2008). Thus al-Rāzī the doctor has had a more illustrious posthumous career than al-Rāzī the philosopher.


Primary sources and translations

Works by Abū Bakr Muhammad al-Rāzī

[RF] al-Rāzī, 1939, Rasāʾil falsafiyya (The Philosophical Way of Life), Paul Kraus (ed.), Cairo: Paul Barbey.
[SPR] Rhazes, The Spiritual Physick of Rhazes, Arthur J. Arberry (trans.), London: John Murray, 1950.
[SM] Rhazes, A Treatise on the Small-Pox and Measles, William Alexander Greenhill (trans.), London: Sydenham Society, 1848. [available online]
[PWL] al-Rāzī, selections from several works, in Classical Arabic Philosophy: an Anthology of Sources, Jon McGinnis and David C. Reisman (trans.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2007, 36–43.
[DG] al-Rāzī, Abū Bakr, Doutes sur Galien (Scientia Graeco-Arabica, 25), Pauline Koetschet (ed./trans.), Berlin: de Gruyter, 2019. Arabic critical edition with French translation.

Works by other authors

[AHR] Abū Ḥātim al-Rāzī, The Proofs of Prophecy: A Parallel English-Arabic Text (Aʻlām al-nubūwah), Tarif Khalidi, Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2011.
Abū Hātim al-Rāzī, 1989, “Le temps, l’espace et la genèse du monde selon Abū Bakr al-Rāzī. Présentation et traduction des chapitres I, 3–4 du Kitāb al-nubuwwa d’Abū Hātim al-Rāzī”, Brion, Fabienne (trans.), Revue philosophique de Louvain, 87(74): 139–164.
[FDR] Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī, al-Maṭālib al-ʿāliya, A.Ḥ. Al-Saqqā (ed.), 9 vols, Beirut: Dār al-Kitāb al-ʿArabī, 1987.
[In Phys.] Philoponus, John, 517, Commentary on Aristotle’s ‘Physics’, H. Vitelli (ed.), Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca [CAG] XVI–XVII, Berlin: Reimer, 1887–88.
[CPV] –––, “Corollaries on Place and Void”, translated by David Furley in Philoponus: “Corollaries on Place and Void”, with Simplicius: “Against Philoponus on the Eternity of the World”, David Furley and Christian Wildberg (trans.), London: Bloomsbury, 1991.
[CTP] Galen, Compendium Timaei Platonis, Paul Kraus and Richard Walzer, London: Warburg Institute, 1951.
[HDK] Ḥamid al-Din al-Kirmāni, al-Aqwāl al-dhahabiyya, ed. S. al-Sāwi, Tehran: Anjuman-e Shāhanshāhī-e Falsafa-e Īrān, 1977.
[NK] Nāṣir-e Khosraw, 2014, Zād al-musāfir (Provision for the Traveler), Tehran.
[GP] Maimonides, The Guide of the Perplexed, trans. S. Pines, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1963.

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