Ibn Sina [Avicenna]

First published Thu Sep 15, 2016

Abū-ʿAlī al-Ḥusayn ibn-ʿAbdallāh Ibn-Sīnā [Avicenna] (ca. 970–1037) was the preeminent philosopher and physician of the Islamic world.[1] In his work he combined the disparate strands of philosophical/scientific[2] thinking in Greek late antiquity and early Islam into a rationally rigorous and self-consistent scientific system that encompassed and explained all reality, including the tenets of revealed religion and its theological and mystical elaborations. In its integral and comprehensive articulation of science and philosophy, it represents the culmination of the Hellenic tradition, defunct in Greek after the sixth century, reborn in Arabic in the 9th (Gutas 2004a, 2010). It dominated intellectual life in the Islamic world for centuries to come, and the sundry reactions to it, ranging from acceptance to revision to refutation and to substitution with paraphilosophical constructs, determined developments in philosophy, science, religion, theology, and mysticism. In Latin translation, beginning with the 12th century, Avicenna’s philosophy influenced mightily the medieval and Renaissance philosophers and scholars, just as the Latin translation of his medical Canon (GMed 1), often revised, formed the basis of medical instruction in European universities until the 17th century. The Arabophone Jewish and Christian scholars within Islam, to the extent that they were writing for their respective communities and not as members of the Islamic commonwealth, accepted most of his ideas (notably Maimonides in his Arabic Guide of the Perplexed and Barhebraeus in his Syriac Cream of Wisdom). The Jewish communities in Europe used Hebrew translations of some of his works, though they were far less receptive than their Roman Catholic counterparts, preferring Averroes instead. The Roman Orthodox in Constantinople were quite indifferent to philosophical developments abroad (and inimical to those at home) and came to know Avicenna’s name only through its occurrence in the Greek translations of the Latin scholastics that began after the 4th Crusade. In his influence on the intellectual history of the world in the West (of India), he is second only to Aristotle, as it was intuitively acknowledged in the Islamic world where he is called “The Preeminent Master” (al-shaykh al-raʾīs), after Aristotle, whom Avicenna called “The First Teacher” (al-muʿallim al-awwal).

1. Life and Works

1.1 Life

At some point in his later years, Avicenna wrote for or dictated to his student, companion, and amanuensis, Abū-ʿUbayd al-Jūzjānī, his Autobiography, reaching till the time in his middle years when they first met; al-Jūzjānī continued the biography after that point and completed it some time after the master’s death in 1037 AD. This auto-/biographical complex, which also contains bibliographies and has been transmitted as a single document (Gohlman 1974), is an early representative of an Arabic literary genre much cultivated by scientists and scholars in medieval Islam (Gutas 2015). It is also our most extensive source about Avicenna’s life and times. According to this document, Avicenna was born in Afshana, a village in the outskirts of metropolitan Bukhara, some time in the 70s of the tenth century, perhaps as early as 964; it has not been possible to determine the year of his birth with greater precision.[3] His father, originally from Balkh farther to the southeast who had moved north as a young man apparently in search of (better) employment, was a state functionary, a governor of the nearby district Kharmaythan. He was in the employ of the Persian Samanid dynasty that ruled Transoxania and Khurasan with Bukhara as its capital (819–1005), where the family moved when Avicenna was still a boy. Avicenna grew up and was educated there and began his philosophical career as a member of the educated elite in political circles close to the Samanids.

Bukhara lies on one of the main trade routes of the Silk Road between Samarkand and Marw, and like these and other cities along the Silk Road, had been economically and culturally active from pre-Islamic times. Under the Samanids in the 9th and 10th centuries, who followed a deliberate agenda of Persian linguistic revival as well as promotion of the high Arabic-Islamic culture radiating from the center of the Islamic world, Baghdad, it provided a sophisticated and refined milieu for the cultivation of the arts and sciences. The palace library of the Samanids, where the teenager Avicenna was allowed to visit and study following his successful treatment of the ailing ruler, contained such books on all subjects, including books by the ancient Greeks in Arabic translation, as he had never seen before nor since (Gohlman 1974, 37). This was the result of the cultural, scientific, and philosophical effervescence taking place in Baghdad due to the rationalistic outlook in political and social affairs espoused by the ʿAbbāsid dynasty upon its accession to power in 750 and the attendant Graeco-Arabic translation movement (Gutas 1998; Gutas 2014a, 359–62). Bukhara was no backwater provincial town, teeming as it was with scholars in residence and visiting intellectuals.

Avicenna had an excellent education on all subjects, but he dwells at length in the Autobiography on his study of the intellectual sciences, that is, the philosophical curriculum in practice in the Hellenic schools of higher education in late antiquity, notably in Alexandria. These consisted of logic as the instrument of philosophy (the Organon), the theoretical sciences—physics (the natural sciences), mathematics (the quadrivium: arithmetic, geometry, astronomy, and music), and metaphysics—, and the practical sciences—ethics, oeconomics (household management), and politics. Avicenna makes a point to say that he studied these subjects all by himself, in this order, at increasing levels of difficulty, and that he achieved proficiency by the time he was eighteen. At about that time he was allowed to visit the library of the Samanid ruler, just mentioned above, where, he says, he “read those books, mastered their teachings, and realized how far each man had advanced in his science” (Gohlman 1974, 36; transl. Gutas 2014a, 18). Shortly thereafter he wrote his first work, Compendium on the Soul (GP 10), dedicated to the ruler in apparent gratitude for the permission to visit the library. His fame grew, and when he was twenty-one he was asked by a neighbor named ʿArūḍī to write a “comprehensive work” on all philosophy, which he did (Philosophy for ʿArūḍī, GS 2), treating all subjects listed above except mathematics; another neighbor, Baraqī, asked for commentaries on the books of philosophy on all these subjects—essentially the works of Aristotle—and he obliged with a twenty-volume work he called The Available and the Valid (i.e., of Philosophy, GS 10) and a two-volume work on the practical sciences, Piety and Sin (GPP 1). His father having died in the meantime, he was forced to take up, but clearly had no difficulty in finding, a post in the financial administration of the Samanids.

But history dealt its blows, ending Avicenna’s idyllic existence of secure employment, intellectual renown, and the admiration of his compatriots. In 999 the Turkic Qarakhanids effectively put an end to the Samanids and took over Bukhara. Avicenna, manifestly because of his close affiliation with the ruling dynasty and his high position in the Samanid administration, saw fit to flee Bukhara. In the Autobiography he provides no political context for his decision but merely says, “necessity led me to forsake Bukhara” (Gohlman 1974, 40–41), though the nature of this “necessity” could hardly be mistaken by his contemporaries and even by us. Thus began Avicenna’s lifelong itinerant career and the attendant quest for patronage and employment (Reisman 2013). Initially he moved north to Gurganj in Khwarizm (999?–1012), but eventually he had to leave again and traveled westwards, staying for a while (1012–1014?) first in Jurjan, off the southeastern Caspian, and then going on into the Iranian heartland, in Ray (1014?–1015), in Hamadhan (1015–1024?), and finally in Isfahan (1024?–1037), in the court of ʿAlāʾ-ad-Dawla, the Kakuyid ruler of the area (Gutas 2014b-I, 6–9). Avicenna served the various local rulers in these cities certainly in his dual capacity as physician and political counselor, functions he had assumed already back home, but also as scientist-in-residence. Engaging in science and philosophy during the first three Abbasid centuries (750–1050) in Islam was done mostly under the political patronage of the rulers and the ruling elite who were the sponsors and also among the consumers of the scientific production. It was certainly a matter of prestige for a ruler to be flanked by the top scientists of his day, but patronage of the sciences was also seen, politically more importantly, as legitimizing his right to whatever throne he was occupying. As a result, many a ruler evinced sheer interest in science itself out of a desire to appear knowledgeable and participated in scientific debates, usually conducted in political fora. It is for this reason that we find Avicenna, involved in certain political/intellectual controversies in some of the cities in which he lived, addressing to political elites a scientific treatise instead of political oratory in his defense (Michot 2000; Reisman 2013, 14–22; Gutas 2014a, personal writings listed on p. 503). Science was much more integrally related to the social and political life and discourse during this period, which is also a significant factor in its rapid spread and development in the Islamic world.

In the court of ʿAlāʾ-ad-Dawla in Isfahan where he spent his last thirteen years or so, Avicenna enjoyed the appreciation that it was felt he deserved. His productivity never flagged, even during these years that were militarily and politically turbulent. He completed there his major work, The Cure (al-Shifāʾ, GS 5), and four further summae of philosophy, along with shorter treatises, and conducted a vigorous philosophical correspondence with students and followers in response to questions they raised about sundry points in logic, physics, and metaphysics. He died in 1037 in Hamadhan and was buried there. A mausoleum in that city today purports to be his.

1.2 Works

Despite his peregrinatory life spent in historically turbulent times and areas, including the frequently unfavorable personal circumstances in which he found himself (as recounted in the Autobiography and Biography, Gohlman 1974), Avicenna was terribly productive, even by the standards of the highly prolific authors writing in Arabic in medieval Islam. In the Autobiography he says that by the time he was eighteen he had mastered all subjects in philosophy without anything new having come to him since (Gohlman 1974, 30–39). Even though the Autobiography has particular philosophical points to make (discussed in the next section), this is no mere boast. There are reports that he wrote major portions of his greatest work, The Cure, without any books to consult (Gohlman 1974, 58; transl. and analysis Gutas 2014a, 109–115), that he composed in a single night, dusk to dawn, a treatise on logic in one hundred quarto (large size) pages (Gohlman 1974, 76–81), and that he compiled The Salvation (GS 6) “en route”—on horseback, manifestly, or during rests from riding—in the course of a military expedition in which he had accompanied his master, ʿAlāʾ-ad-Dawla (Gohlman 1974, 66–67). Exaggerated and hagiographic as some of these reports might be, it is clear that Avicenna had constructively internalized (not to say “memorized”) the philosophical curriculum and he could reproduce it, properly assimilated and analytically reconstructed, at will. This is also evident in his disregard (rather than neglect?) for keeping copies of his works; as it must have happened rather frequently, when commissioned or asked to write about a subject that he had treated earlier, it was apparently just as easy for him to compose a treatise anew as it was to copy an earlier version of it. Avicenna could write fast and with great precision, sacrificing nothing in analytical depth. At the same time, however, given his undisputed fame and immense intellectual authority that he exercised soon after his death, pseudepigraphy became a major factor multiplying the works attributed to him (Reisman 2004 and 2010). Accordingly, some medieval bibliographies of his works (and some modern ones, based on the former) list close to three hundred titles, though a recent sober tally of them brings the authentic writings down to fewer than one hundred, ranging from essays of a few pages to multi-volume sets, and flags the pseudepigraphs that need to be assessed and authenticated (Gutas 2014a, Appendix, 387–540). Much work still remains to be done in this regard.

Avicenna wrote in different genres, but his major innovation was the development of the summa philosophiae, a comprehensive work that included all parts of philosophy as classified in the late antique Alexandrian and early Islamic tradition (cited above). This was due as much to his own philosophical training, which followed this curriculum, as to the earliest commissions he received while still in Bukhara for works that would encompass all philosophy; but then these commissions inevitably reflect the broad philosophical culture of the period that viewed science and philosophy as an integral whole. Already in his very first philosophical treatise, Compendium on the Soul, which Avicenna dedicated to the Samanid ruler, as noted above, he presented the theoretical knowledge (the intelligible forms) to be acquired by the rational soul precisely as classified in the philosophical curriculum (Gutas 2014a, 6–8), and with his second work, the Philosophy commissioned by ʿArūḍī, he fleshed out this outline into the first scholastic philosophical compendium or summa. He went on to write seven more such summae in his career, ranging in length from a sixty-page booklet (Elements of Philosophy, ʿUyūn al-ḥikma, GS 3), written earlier in his career, to the monumental The Cure (al-Shifāʾ), in his middle period. It runs to twenty-two large volumes in the Cairo edition (1952–83), and its contents exhibit all the parts of philosophy in the Aristotelian tradition which they reproduce, revise, adjust, expand, and re-present, as follows:

  1. Logic
    1. Eisagoge (Porphyry’s Eisagoge)
    2. Categories (Aristotle’s Categories)
    3. On interpretation (Aristotle’s De interpretatione)
    4. Syllogism (Aristotle’s Prior Analytics)
    5. Demonstration (Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics)
    6. Dialectic (Aristotle’s Topics)
    7. Sophistics (Aristotle’s Sophistical Refutations)
    8. Rhetoric (Aristotle’s Rhetoric)
    9. Poetics (Aristotle’s Poetics).
  2. Theoretical Philosophy
    1. Physics
      1. On nature (Aristotle’s Physics)
      2. On the heavens (Aristotle’s De caelo)
      3. On coming to be and passing away (Aristotle’s De generatione et corruptione)
      4. Mineralogy (Aristotle’s Meteorology IV)
      5. Meteorology (Aristotle’s Meteorology I–III)
      6. On the soul (Aristotle’s De anima)
      7. Botany (De plantis by Nicolaus of Damascus)
      8. Zoology (Aristotle’s History, Parts, and Generation of Animals)
    2. Mathematics
      1. Geometry (Euclid’s Elements)
      2. Arithmetic (Nicomachus of Gerasa, Diophantus, Euclid, Thābit b. Qurra, and others)
      3. Music (mostly Ptolemy’s Harmonics with other material)
      4. Astronomy (Ptolemy’s Almagest)
    3. Ilāhiyyāt / Metaphysics
      1. Universal Science: the study of being as being, first philosophy, natural theology (Aristotle’s Metaphysics)
      2. Metaphysics of the Rational Soul (phenomena of religious and paranormal life studied as functions of the rational soul)
  3. Practical Philosophy
    1. Prophetic legislation as the basis for the three parts of practical philosophy
    2. Politics (prescriptions by the prophet legislator for public administration and political ruler to succeed him; [Plato’s and Aristotle’s books on politics])
    3. Household management (prescriptions of the prophet legislator for family law; [Bryson’s Oikonomikos and related books by others])
    4. Ethics (as legislated by a caliph; [Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics])[4]

Avicenna did not treat all of these subjects in each one of his summae, but he varied their contents and emphasis depending on the specific purpose for which he composed them. He developed a style of supple Arabic expository prose, complete with technical philosophical terminology, that remained standard thenceforth. After The Cure, he was asked to write a brief exposition of the philosophical subjects, which he did by collecting and putting together—at times even splicing together—material from his earlier writings and produced The Salvation (al-Najāt). He did the same, in Persian this time, for his patron the Kakuyid ʿAlāʾ-ad-Dawla, the Philosophy for ʿAlāʾ (Dāneshnāme-ye ʿAlāʾī, GS 7). In both of these books he left out the mathematical sciences and the subjects of practical philosophy, only the former of which was later supplemented by Jūzjānī, first in Arabic and then in Persian, on the basis of earlier writings by Avicenna.

Toward the end of his life Avicenna wrote two more summae in slightly divergent modes. In one of them, which he called Eastern Philosophy (al-Mashriqiyyūn or al-Ḥikma al-mashriqiyya, GS 8) to reflect his own locality in the East of the Islamic world, broader Khurasan (mashriq), he concentrated on “matters about which researchers have disagreed” in logic, physics, and metaphysics, but not mathematics or the subjects of practical philosophy (except for prophetic legislation which he introduced; see below) insofar as there was little disagreement about them. His approach is doctrinal, not historical, presenting, as he says, “the fundamental elements of true philosophy which was discovered by someone who examined a lot, reflected long,” and had nearly perfect syllogistic prowess, namely, himself (GS 8, p. 2 and 4; transl. and analysis Gutas 2014a, 35–40; Gutas 2000). In the second, also his very last summa, he diverged even more drastically from traditional modes of presentation and developed an allusive and suggestive style which he called “pointers and reminders” (al-Ishārāt wa-l-tanbīhāt, GS 9). The purpose in this, for which he borrowed the topos of late antique Aristotelian commentarial tradition explaining why Aristotle had developed a cryptic style of writing, was to train the student by providing not whole arguments and fully articulated theories but only pointers and reminders to them which the student would complete himself. The book, in two parts, deals with logic in the first and with physics, metaphysics, and metaphysics of the rational soul in the second. It proved hugely popular as a succinct though frequently amphibolous statement of his mature philosophy, open to interpretation, and it became the object of repeated commentaries throughout the centuries, apparently as Avicenna must have intended. It is a difficult work, and it must be understood always through constant reference to the more explicit expository statement of Avicenna’s theories in The Cure. Traditionally it has rarely been read except together with a commentary, notably those of Fakhr-ad-Dīn al-Rāzī and especially Naṣīr-ad-Dīn al-Ṭūsī.[5]

Other than in the summae, Avicenna wrote comprehensively on all philosophy in two major and massive works, both in about twenty volumes, both now lost. The first was his youthful commentary on the works of Aristotle which he wrote upon commission by his neighbor Baraqī, mentioned above, The Available and the Valid [of Philosophy]. The second, Fair Judgment (GS 11), composed in 1029, was a detailed commentary on the “difficult passages” of the entire Aristotelian corpus, in which was included even the suspect Theology of Aristotle (actually Plotinus’ Enneads IV–VI). The title refers to Avicenna’s adjudication between traditional Aristotelian exegeses and Avicenna’s own views by presenting arguments in support of the latter. As Avicenna explains his title, “I divided [in the book] scholars into two groups, the Westerners [the Greek commentarial tradition and the Baghdad Aristotelians] and the Easterners [Avicenna’s positions], and I had the Easterners argue against the Westerners until I intervened to judge fairly when there was a real point of dispute between them” (GS 14, 375; transl. Gutas 2014a, 145). The book was unfortunately lost during some military rout, and only the commentary on Book Lambda, 6–10, of Aristotle’s Metaphysics survives (GS 11a; Geoffroy et al. 2014), along with two incomplete recensions of his commentary on the Theology of Aristotle (GS 11b; Vajda 1951). Some marginal notes on De anima, surviving independently as transcribed in a manuscript, have the same approach and manifestly belong to the same period and project (GS 11c; Gutas 2004b).

Independent treatises on individual subjects written by Avicenna deal with most subjects, but especially with those for which there was greater demand by his sponsors and in which he was particularly interested, notably logic, the soul, and the metaphysics of the rational soul. In an effort to reach a wider audience, he expressed his theories on the rational soul in two allegories, Alive, Son of Awake (Ḥayy b. Yaqẓān, GM 7; Goichon 1959) and The Bird (GM 8; Heath 1990), and he versified still others: The Divine Pearl (al-Jumāna al-ilāhiyya) on the oneness of God and the emanated creation in 334 verses (GM 9), The Science of Logic, in verse, in 290 lines (GL 4), and a number of poems on medical subjects, notably his Medicine, in verse, in 1326 lines (GMed 27), which was commented upon by Averroes. In addition, he engaged in protracted correspondence with scholars who asked or questioned him about specific problems; noteworthy are his Answers to Questions Posed by Bīrūnī [GP 8], the other scientific genius of his time, on Aristotelian physics and cosmology, and especially the two posthumous compilations of his responses and discussions circulating under the titles Notes (GS 12a) and Discussions (GS 14). He also wrote what amounts to open letters depicting the controversies in which he was involved and seeking arbitration or repudiating calumniatory charges against him (GPW 1–3).

Avicenna lived his philosophy, and his desire to communicate it beyond what his personal circumstances required, as an intellectual in the public eye, is manifest in the various compositional styles and different registers of language that he used. He wrote with the purpose of reaching all layers of (literate) society, but also with an eye to posterity. His reach was as global in its aspirations as his system was all-encompassing in its comprehensiveness; and history bore him out.

2. Philosophical Aims

The Autobiography, written at a time when Avicenna had reached his philosophical maturity, touches upon a number of issues that he felt were highly significant in his formation as a thinker and accordingly point the way to his approach to philosophy and his philosophical aims and orientation. These were, first, his understanding of the structure of philosophical knowledge (all intellectual knowledge, that is) as a unified whole, which is reflected in the classification of the sciences he studied; second, his critical evaluation of all past science and philosophy, as represented in his assessment of the achievements and shortcomings of previous philosophers after he had read their books in the Samanid library, which led to the realization that philosophy must be updated; and third, his emphasis on having been an autodidact points to the human capability of acquiring the highest knowledge rationally by oneself, and leads to a comprehensive study of all functions of the rational soul and how it acquires knowledge (epistemology) as well as to an inquiry into its origins, destination, activities, and their consequences (eschatology). Accordingly Avicenna set himself the task of presenting and writing about philosophy as an integral whole and not piecemeal and occasionalistically; bringing philosophy up to date; and studying how the human soul (intellect) knows as the foundation of his theory of knowledge, logical methodology, and the relation between the celestial and terrestrial realms, or the divine and human.

The implementation of the first task, the treatment of all philosophy as a unified whole, though historically seemingly unachievable, was accomplished by Avicenna almost without effort. Aristotle himself stands at the very beginning of this process. He clearly had a conception of the unity of all philosophy, which could be systematically presented on the basis of the logical structure set forth in the Posterior Analytics (Barnes 1994, p. xii), while his classification of the sciences in Metaphysics E1 and K7 showed what the outline of such a systematic presentation would be. In the polyphony of philosophical voices and systems that followed his death in 322 BC and throughout the Hellenistic period (336–31 BC), his suggestions went mostly unheeded by the Peripatetics and were only followed, at the end of that period, by Andronicus of Rhodes if only for the purposes of the order in which he put Aristotle’s school treatises (his extant corpus) in his first edition of them. In subsequent centuries, when the polyphony subsided to just two voices, of the Platonists and the Aristotelians, which eventually had to be presented as one for political reasons (to counter the one “divine” voice of the rapidly Christianizing Roman empire, east and west), the tendency to return to the texts of the two masters (ad fontes) for their defense, which had started even before the domination of Christianity, intensified. Accordingly, while the classification of the different parts of philosophy continued to be presented as a virtual blueprint for a potential philosophical summa, the main form of philosophical discourse was the individual treatise on one or more of related themes and, predominantly, the commentary on the works of “divine” Plato and, by the sixth century, also “divine” Aristotle. When philosophy was resuscitated after a hiatus of about two centuries (ca. 600–800) with the translation and paraphrase, in Arabic this time, of the canonical source texts (Gutas 2004a), these compositional practices reappeared. But the social context in which philosophy now found itself had changed. The literate population in the Islamic near and farther East during the early Abbasid period was favorably disposed toward philosophy as a rational scientific system, and with the different parts of this system—the philosophical curriculum—broadly known in its range if not in detail, it was possible, indeed expected, that an educated layman like Avicenna’s neighbor in Bukhara, Abū-l-Ḥasan Aḥmad ibn-ʿAbdallāh al-ʿArūḍī (I give his full name because he deserves to be noted in a history of philosophy), would be interested to have and read a comprehensive account of the entire discipline and to commission such a work from the youthful Avicenna. Avicenna complied, and thus was born the first philosophical summa treating in a systematic and consistent fashion within the covers of a single book all the branches of logic and theoretical philosophy as classified in the Aristotelian tradition. That Avicenna was able to produce such a work (and repeat it seven more times thenceforth) is of course a tribute to his genius (universally acknowledged both then and now), but that the request for it should have come from his society is telling evidence of its cultural attitude regarding science.

The creation of the philosophical summa—and not only this particular first one for ʿArūḍī but especially the major work, The Cure, and the alluring and allusive Pointers and Reminders—had momentous consequences. It presented for the first time to the world a comprehensive, unified, and internally self-consistent account of reality, along with the methodological tools wherewith to validate it (logic)—it presented a scientific system as a worldview, difficult to resist or even refute, given its self-validating properties. This was good for studying philosophy and disseminating it. But by the same token, and by its very nature, this worldview so clearly presented, documented, and validated, set itself up against other ideologies in the society with contending worldviews. Up until that time, philosophical treatises on discrete subjects and abstruse commentaries, the two dominant forms of philosophical discourse, as just indicated, were matters for specialists that could not and did not claim endorsement or allegiance from society as a whole; the philosophical summa did. And Avicenna who wrote in different styles and genres to reach as many people as possible, as also noted above, clearly intended as much. As a result, his philosophical system dominated intellectual history in both Shi’ite and most of Sunni Islam (Gutas 2002), and through the sundry reactions it elicited, it determined, and can now explain, developments not only in philosophy but also in theology and mysticism, and it generated several fields of what can be called para-philosophy:[6] theology using philosophical discourse to express (or hide) Islamic content (the tradition of al-Ghazālī and his followers and imitators), “philosophical” mysticism (the tradition of Ibn al-ʿArabī, who was called the Greatest Master” [al-Shaykh al-Akbar] to rival Avicenna’s “The Preeminent Master” [al-Shaykh al-Raʾīs]), occultism, numerology, lettrism.

Performance of the first task, necessarily entailed the second, bringing philosophy up to date. The philosophical knowledge that Avicenna received was neither complete nor homogeneous. He had no access to the entirety of even the very lacunose information that we now have about the philosophical movements during the 1330 years separating him from Aristotle (Avicenna gives this quite accurate number himself), but could view the entire tradition as essentially Aristotelian. Plato was not available in Arabic other than in brief excerpts, in Galen’s epitomes, in gnomologies, and in second-hand reports in Aristotle and Galen (Gutas 2012a), and accordingly Avicenna could dismiss him. The lesser philosophical schools of antiquity—the Stoics, Epicureans, Sceptics, and Pythagoreans, who had ceased to exist long before late antiquity—he knew mostly as names with certain basic views or sayings affiliated with them. Those whom we call Neoplatonists he knew as commentators of Aristotle along with the rest, and even Plotinus and Proclus were available to him in translated excerpts under the name of Aristotle, as the Theology of Aristotle and The Pure Good respectively. However, both the substantive and temporal diversity of these sources in the tradition presented grave inconsistencies and divergent tendencies, to say nothing of anachronisms, while the surviving work even of Aristotle himself contained discrepancies and incomplete treatments. Furthermore, the Islamic tradition before Avicenna was not any less unhomogeneous, as it was represented by the eclectic al-Kindī and his disciples, the Aristotelians of Baghdad, and the sui generis Rhazes (of whom Avicenna thought little even as a physician). To these philosophers should be added the philosophically sophisticated theologians of the various Muʿtazilite branches (one of whose most prominent representatives, the judge ʿAbd-al-Jabbār, Avicenna may have met in Ray between 1013 and 1015). Faced with this situation, Avicenna set himself the task of revising and updating philosophy, as an internally self-consistent and complete system that accounts for all reality and is logically verifiable, by correcting errors in the tradition, deleting unsustainable arguments and theses, sharpening the focus of others, and expanding and adding to the subjects that demanded discussion. An area that needed to be added most urgently in both the theoretical and practical parts of philosophy, if all reality was to be covered by his system, was all manifestations of religious life and paranormal events. As he put it, “it behooves his [Aristotle’s] successors to gather the loose ends he left, repair any breach they find in what he constructed, and supply corollaries to fundamental principles he presented” (GS 8, 2–3; transl. Gutas 2014a, 36).

Performance of this second task, in turn, entailed the third, the accuracy and verifiability of the knowledge which would constitute the contents of his updated philosophy. Verifiability depends on two interdependent factors for the person doing the verification: following a productive method and having the mental apparatus to employ that method and understand its results. The method Avicenna adopted already at the start of his career was logic, and the mental apparatus wherewith we know involved an understanding and study of the human, rational soul. Thus logic and the theory of the soul as the basis for epistemology are the two motors driving Avicenna’s philosophy. He wrote more, and more frequently, on these two subjects than on anything else.

3. Logic and Empiricism

The starting point of Avicenna’s logic is that all knowledge is either forming concepts (taṣawwur) by means of definitions—i.e. in good Aristotelian fashion, realizing the genus and specific difference of something—or acknowledging the truth (taṣdīq) of a categorical statement by means of syllogisms. The inspiration here is clearly the beginning of Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics (cf. Lameer 2006). Avicenna took this book seriously, following both the curriculum, in which this book was made the center of logical practice, and especially his two Peripatetic predecessors in Baghdad, Abū-Bishr Mattā and al-Fārābī, who made it the cornerstone of their philosophy and advertised its virtues (cf. Marmura 1990).

Acknowledging the truth of a categorical statement meant verifying it, and this could only be done by taking that statement as the conclusion of a syllogism and then constructing the syllogism that would conclude it. There being three terms in a syllogism, two of which, the minor and the major, are present in the conclusion, the syllogism that leads to that conclusion can be constructed only if one figures out or guesses correctly what the middle term is that explains the connection between the two extreme terms. In other words, if we seek to verify the statement “A is C,” we must look for a suitable B to construct a syllogism of the form, “A is B, B is C, therefore A is C.” The significance of the middle term is discussed in the Posterior Analytics (I.34), where Aristotle further specifies, “Acumen is a talent for hitting upon (eustochia) the middle term in an imperceptible time” (Barnes 1994 transl.). Avicenna picked up on the very concept of the talent for hitting upon the middle term, literally translated in the Arabic version as ḥads (guessing correctly, hitting correctly upon the answer), and made it the cornerstone of his epistemology (Gutas 2001). This theory made the core of syllogistic verification by means of hitting upon the middle term the one indispensable element of all certain intellectual knowledge, and it explained why people differ in their ability to apply this syllogistic method by presupposing that they possess a varying talent for it, as with all human faculties.

In essence, following this method of logical verification meant for Avicenna examining the texts of Aristotle, read in the order in which they are presented in the curriculum, and testing the validity of every paragraph. How he did this in practice, teasing out the figures and forms of syllogisms implied in Aristotle’s texts, can be seen in numerous passages in his works. By his eighteenth year, he had internalized the philosophical curriculum and verified it to his own satisfaction as a coherent system with a logical structure that explains all reality.

According to the scientific view of the universe in his day which he studied in the curriculum—Aristotelian sublunar world with Ptolemaic cosmology and Neoplatonic emanationism in the supralunar—all intelligibles (all universal concepts and the principles of all particulars, or as Avicenna says, “the forms of things as they are in themselves”) were the eternal object of thought by the First principle, and then, in descending hierarchical order, by the intellects of the celestial spheres emanating from the First and ending with the active intellect (al-ʿaql al-faʿʿāl), the intellect of the terrestrial realm. Avicenna’s identification of hitting upon the middle term as the central element in logical analysis on the one hand established that the syllogistic structure of all knowledge is also as it is thought by the celestial intellects, and on the other enabled Avicenna to unify and integrate the different levels of its acquisition by the human intellect within a single explanatory model. As a result, he succeeded in de-mystifying concepts like inspiration, enthusiasm, mystical vision, and prophetic revelation, explaining all as natural functions of the rational soul. At the basic level there is discursive thinking in which the intellect proceeds to construct syllogisms step by step with the aid of the internal and external senses, and acquires the intelligibles by hitting upon the middle terms (something which in emanationist terms—but also, though less conspicuously, Aristotelian—is described as coming into “contact” with the active intellect, to be discussed further below, note 6). At a higher level, Avicenna analyzed non-discursive thinking, which takes no time and grasps its object in a single act of intellection, though the knowledge acquired is still structured syllogistically, complete with middle terms (because in its locus, the active intellect, it is so structured) (Adamson 2004). Avicenna also discussed a facility for or habituation with intellection, which he called direct vision or experience (mushāhada) of the intelligibles. It comes about after prolonged engagement with intellective techniques through syllogistic means until the human intellect is not obstructed by the internal or external senses and has acquired a certain familiarity or “intimacy” with its object, “without, however, the middle term ceasing to be present.” This kind of intellection is accompanied by an emotive state of joy and pleasure (Gutas 2006a,b). The highest level of intellection is that of the prophet, who, on account of his supremely developed ability to hit upon middle terms, acquires the intelligibles “either at once or nearly so … in an order which includes the middle terms” (GS 6, 273–274; transl. Gutas 2014a, 184).

This knowledge, which represents and accounts for reality and the way things are, also corresponds, Avicenna maintains, with what is found in books, i.e. with philosophy, or more specifically, with the philosophical sciences as classified and taught in the Aristotelian tradition. However, the identity between absolute knowledge, in the form of the intelligibles contained in the intellects of the celestial spheres, and philosophy, as recorded in the Aristotelian tradition, is not complete. Though Aristotelianism is the philosophical tradition most worthy of adherence, Avicenna says, it is nevertheless not perfect, and it is the task of philosophers to correct and amplify it through the acquisition of further intelligibles by syllogistic processes. It is this understanding that enabled Avicenna to have a progressive view of the history of philosophy and set the framework for his philosophical project. For although the knowledge to be acquired, in itself and on the transcendent plane of the eternal celestial intellects, is a closed system and hence static, on a human level and in history it is evolutionary. Each philosopher, through his own syllogistic reasoning and ability to hit correctly upon the middle terms, modifies and completes the work of his predecessors, and reaches a level of knowledge that is an ever closer approximation of the intelligible world, of the intelligibles as contained in the intellects of the spheres, and hence of truth itself. Avicenna was conscious of having attained a new level in the pursuit of philosophical truth and its verification, but he never claimed to have exhausted it all; in his later works he bemoaned the limitations of human knowledge and urged his readers to continue with the task of improving philosophy and adding to the store of knowledge.

The human intellect can engage in a syllogistic process in the order which includes the middle terms and which is identical with that of the celestial intellects for the simple reason, as Avicenna repeatedly insists, that both human and celestial intellects are congeneric (mujānis), immaterial substances. However, their respective acquisition of knowledge is different because of their different circumstances: the human intellect comes into being in an absolutely potential state and needs its association with the perishable body in order to actualize itself, whereas the celestial intellects are related to eternal bodies and are permanently actual. Thus unfettered, their knowledge can be completely intellective because they perceive and know the intelligibles from what causes them, while the human intellect is in need of the corporeal senses, both external and internal, in order to perceive the effect of an intelligible from which it can reason syllogistically back to its cause. This makes it necessary for Avicenna to have an empirical theory of knowledge, according to which “the senses are the means by which the human soul acquires different kinds of knowledge (maʿārif ),” and man’s predisposition for the primary notions and principles of knowledge, which come to him unawares, is itself actualized by the experience of particulars (GS 12a, 23; transl. and analysis in Gutas 2014b-VII, esp. pp. 25–27). For human knowledge, therefore, the intellect functions as a processor of the information provided by the external and internal senses. It is important to realize that this is not because the intellect does not have the constitution to have purely intellective knowledge, like the celestial spheres, but because its existence in the sublunar world of time and perishable matter precludes its understanding the intelligibles through their causes. Instead, it must proceed to them from their perceived effects. However, once the soul has been freed of the body after death, and if, while still with the body, it has acquired the predisposition to perceive the intelligibles through philosophical training, then it can behold the intelligibles through their causes and become just like the celestial spheres, a state which Avicenna describes as happiness in philosophical terms and paradise in religious.

4. The Metaphysics of the Rational Soul; Practical Philosophy

Avicenna’s rationalist empiricism is the main reason why he strove in his philosophy on the one hand to perfect and fine-tune logical method and on the other to study, at an unprecedented level of sophistication and precision, the human (rational) soul and cognitive processes which provide knowledge through the application of rational empirical methods. In section after section and chapter after chapter in numerous works he analyzes not only questions of formal logic but also the mechanics through which the rational soul acquires knowledge, and in particular the conditions operative in the process of hitting upon the middle term: how one can work for it and where to look for it, and what the apparatus and operations of the soul are that bring it about (Gutas 2001). This entailed detailed study of the operations of the soul in its totality and in all its functions, whether rational, animal, or vegetative. He charts in great detail the operations of all the senses, both the five external senses and especially the five internal senses located in the brain—common sense, imagery (where the forms of things are stored), imagination, estimation (judging the imperceptible significance or connotations for us of sensed objects, like friendship and enmity, which also includes instinctive sensing), and memory—and how they can help or hinder the intellect in hitting upon the middle term and perceiving intelligibles more generally. When, at the end of all these operations just described, the intellect hits upon a middle term or just perceives an intelligible that it had not been thinking about before, it acquires the intelligible in question (hence the appellation of this stage of intellection, “acquired intellect,” al-ʿaql al-mustafād ), or, otherwise expressed, acquires it from the active intellect which thinks it eternally and atemporally since the active intellect is, in effect, the locus of all intelligibles, there being no other place for them to be always in actual existence. The human intellect can think an intelligible for some time, but then it disappears, it being impossible for the immaterial intellect to “store” it, or have memory of it, as opposed to the two internal senses, imagery and memory, which have a storage function for their particular oblects (forms and connotational attributes) because they have a material base in the brain. Avicenna calls this process of acquisition or apprehension of the intelligibles a “contact” (ittiṣāl) between the human and active intellects.[7] In the emanative language which he inherited from the Neoplatonic tradition, and which he incorporated in his own understanding of the cosmology of the concentric spheres of the universe with their intercommunicating intellects and souls, he referred to the flow of knowledge from the supernal world to the human intellect as “divine effluence” (al-fayḍ al-ilāhī). The reason that this is possible at all is again the consubstantiality and congeneric nature of all intellects, human and celestial alike. Only, as already mentioned, because of their varied circumstances, the latter think of the intelligibles directly, permanently, and atemporally, while the human intellect has to advance from potentiality to actuality in time by technical means leading to the discovery of the middle term as it is assisted by all the other faculties of the soul and body.

The wording itself of this acquisition of knowledge by the human intellect—“contact with the active intellect,” or receiving the “divine effluence”—has misled students of Avicenna into thinking that this “flow” of knowledge from the divine to the human intellect is automatic and due to God’s grace, or it is ineffable and mystical. But this is groundless; the “flow” has nothing mystical about it; it just means that the intelligibles are permanently available to human intellects who seek a middle term or other intelligibles at the end of a thinking process by means of abstraction and syllogisms. Avicenna is quite explicit about the need for the human intellect to be prepared and to demand to hit upon a middle term, or actively to seek an intelligible, in order to receive it. He says specifically, “The active principle [i.e. the active intellect] lets flow upon the [human rational] soul form after form in accordance with the demand by the soul; and when the soul turns away from it [the active intellect], then the effluence is broken off” (GS 5, De anima, 245–246; transl. Gutas 2014a, 377; cf. Hasse 2013, 118).

The same applies to other forms of communication from the supernal world. In the case of the prophet, he acquires all the intelligibles comprising knowledge, complete with middle terms as already mentioned, because the intellective capacity of his rational soul to hit upon the middle terms and acquire the intelligibles is extraordinarily high; this capacity is coupled with an equally highly developed internal sense of imagination that can translate this intellective knowledge into language and images (in the form of a revealed book) that the vast majority of humans can easily understand. But in addition to intelligible knowledge, the divine effluence from the intellects and the souls of the celestial spheres also includes information about events on earth, past, present, and future—what Avicenna calls “the unseen” (al-ghayb)—, for all of which the intellects and souls of the celestial spheres are directly responsible. This information can also be received by humans in various forms—as waking or sleeping dreams, as visions, as messages to soothsayers—depending on the level of the humoral equilibrium of the recipient, the proper functioning of his internal and external senses, and the readiness of his intellect. Somebody whose internal sense of imagination or estimation is overactive, for example, may be hindered thereby in the clear reception of dream images so that his dreams would require interpretation, while someone else not so afflicted may get clearer messages; or a soothsayer who wishes to receive information about the future has to run long and hard in order to bring about such a humoral equilibrium through the exertion, thereby preparing his intellect to receive the message.

The logistics of the reception of information from the supernal world thus varies in accordance with what is being communicated and who is receiving it, but in all cases the recipient has to be ready and predisposed to receive it. All humans have both the physical and mental apparatus to acquire intelligible and supernal knowledge and the means to do so, but they have to work for it, just as they have to prepare for their bliss in afterlife while their immortal rational souls are still affiliated with the body. There is no free emanation of the intelligibles on “couch-potato” humans, or afterlife contemplation for them of eternal realities in the company of the celestial spheres (Avicenna’s paradise). To have thought so would have negated the entire philosophical project Avicenna so painstakingly constructed.

This analysis and understanding of the rational soul, precisely elaborated on the basis of the Aristotelian theory but also going much beyond it, enable Avicenna to engage systematically primarily with all aspects of religion, cognitive and social alike, and secondarily with what we would call paranormal phenomena (prognostication of the future, telekinesis, evil eye, etc.). All issues relating to the cognitive side of religion he added to the traditional contents of metaphysics, and those relating to the social side he added to the practical sciences. In the former case he created a veritable metaphysics of the rational soul (Gutas 2012b), which he added to the traditional treatment of metaphysics (being as such, first philosophy, natural theology) as an additional subject, called “theological” (al-ʿilm al-ilāhī, al-ṣināʿa al-ilāhiyya). Its contents can be seen in his extensive treatment of it all at the end of the metaphysics part of The Cure, as follows.

Book 9, Chapter 7: Destination of the rational soul in the afterlife and its bliss and misery; real happiness is the perfection of the rational soul through knowledge.

Book 10, Chapter 1: Celestial effects on the world: inspiration, dreams, prayer, celestial punishment, prophecy, astrology.

On the social side of religion, he added a fourth subdivision to practical philosophy (in addition to ethics, household management, and politics) which he called “the discipline of legislating” (al-ṣināʿa al-shāriʿa, Kaya 2012; Kaya 2014; Gutas 2014a, 470–471, 497). As mentioned above, the prophet, through his supremely developed ability to hit upon the middle of terms of syllogisms, acquires all knowledge (all the intelligibles actually thought by the active intellect) “either at once or nearly so.” This acquisition “is not an uncritical reception [of this knowledge] merely on authority, but rather occurs in an order which includes the middle terms: for beliefs accepted on authority concerning those things which are known only through their causes possess no intellectual certainty” (GS 5, De anima, 249–250; transl. Gutas 2014a, 183–184). With this secure and syllogistically verified knowledge, the prophet then is in a position to legislate and regulate social life as well as have a legitimate ground for gaining consent. The subjects of all parts of practical philosophy are covered briefly also at the very end of The Cure, as follows:

Book 10, Chapter 2: Proof of prophecy on the basis of the need for laws, to be enacted by the prophet legislator, in order to regulate social life which is necessary for human survival.

Chapter 3: Acts of worship as reminders of the afterlife and as exercises predisposing the rational soul to engage in intellection (cf. Gutas 2014a, 206–208).

Chapter 4: Household management.

Chapter 5: Politics (the caliphate and legislation); ethics.

For further reading, see the entries on Ibn Sina’s metaphysics and Ibn Sina’s natural philosophy.

5. Conclusion

Avicenna synthesized the various strands of philosophical thought he inherited—the surviving Hellenic traditions along with the developments in philosophy and theology within Islam—into a self-consistent scientific system that explained all reality. His scientific edifice rested on Aristotelian physics and metaphysics capped with Neoplatonic emanationism in the context of Ptolemaic cosmology, all revised, re-thought, and critically re-assessed by him. His achievement consisted in his harmonization of the disparate parts into a rational whole, and particularly in bringing the sublunar and supralunar worlds into an intelligible relation for which he argued logically. The system was therefore both a research program and a worldview.

Aristotelian ethics provided the foundation of the edifice. The imperative to know, and to know rationally, which is the motivation behind Avicenna’s conception and then realization of his scientific system, is based on Aristotle’s concept of happiness as the activity of that which differentiates humans from all other organic life, of the mind (Nicomachean Ethics X.7, 1177b19–25): “the activity of the intellect is thought to be distinguished by hard work (spoudê, ijtihād), since it employs theory, and it does not desire to have any other end at all except itself; and it has its proper pleasure …. Complete happiness (eudaimonia, saʿāda) is this.”[8] Avicenna subscribed fully to this view of human happiness in this world, and extended it to make it also the basis for happiness in the next—as a matter of fact, he made it a prerequisite for happiness in the next. Only the contemplative life while in the body prepares the intellect, which has to use the corporeal external and internal senses to acquire knowledge and gain the predisposition for thinking the intelligibles, for the contemplative life after death. In understanding the goal of human life in this manner Avicenna was again being true to the Aristotelian view of divine happiness as the identity of thinker, thinking, and thought (Metaphysics XII.7, 1072b18–26). Using the words of Aristotle, Avicenna paraphrases this passage as follows: “As for the foremost ‘understanding (noêsis, fahm) in itself, it is of what is best in itself;’ and as for ‘what understands itself, it is’ the substance ‘of the intellect as it acquires the intelligible, because it becomes intelligible’ right away just as if ‘it touches it,’ for example. ‘And the intellect,’ that which intellects, ‘and the intelligible are one and the same’ with regard to the essence of the thing as it relates to itself…. ‘And if the deity<’s state> is always like the state in which we sometimes are, then this is marvelous; and if it is more, then it is even more marvelous’” (Geoffroy et al. 2014, 59).[9]

There is thus a deeply ethical aspect to Avicenna’s philosophical system. The core conception was the life of the rational soul: because our theoretical intellects—our selves—are consubstantial with the celestial intellects, it is our cosmic duty to enable our intellects to reach their full potential and behave like the celestial ones, that is, think the intelligibles (cf. Lizzini 2009). And because we (i.e. our essential core which identifies us and survives, our rational souls) are given a body and our materiality hampers our unencumbered intellection like that enjoyed by the First and the other celestial beings, we have to tend to the body by all means, behavioral (religious practices, ethical conduct) and pharmacological, to bring its humoral temperament to a level of equilibrium that will help the function of the intellect in this life and prepare it for unimpeded and continuous intellection, like that of the deity, in the next. This is humanist ethics dictated by a scientific view of the world.


Apart from the references in the text, the bibliography also lists several recent studies on Avicenna along with some reference works. For a full list of Avicenna’s works in Arabic and Persian, their editions, translations, and studies, see the inventory in Gutas 2014a, also for further bibliography.

Works by Ibn Sina

GL 4 The Science of Logic, in verse (Urjūza fī ʿilm al-manṭiq). Text in Manṭiq al-mashriqiyyīn wa-l-Qaṣīda al-muzdawija, taṣnīf al-Raʾīs Abī ʿAlī Ibn Sīnā, Cairo 1910, pp. 1–18. Modern Latin translation in Aug. Schmoelders, Documenta philosophiae Arabum, Bonn 1836, pp. 26–42.
GM 7 Alive, Son of Awake (Ḥayy Ibn-Yaqẓān). Text in M.A.F. Mehren, Traités mystiques d’Abou Alî al-Hosain b. Abdallah b. Sînâ ou d’Avicenne, I, Leiden 1889–1899. French translation by Goichon 1959.
GM 8 The Bird (al-Ṭayr). Text in Mehren (as in GM 7), II,27–32. English translation in Heath 1990.
GM 9 The Divine Pearl: On Professing the Unity of God (Al-Jumāna al-ilāhiyya fī l-tawḥīd). No edition or translation available.
GMed 1 The Canon of Medicine (al-Qānūn fī l-ṭibb). Text in E. al-Qashsh and ʿAlī Zayʿūr, eds., Al-Qānūn fī l-ṭibb, 4 vols., Beirut 1413/1993. For various partial translations see Janssens 1991, 30–35, and Janssens 1999, 17–18.
GMed 27 Medicine, in verse (Urjūza fī l-ṭibb). Text and French translation in H. Jahier and A. Noureddine, eds., Avicenne, Poème de la médecine, Paris 1956.
GP 8 Answers to Questions Posed by Bīrūnī (Al-Ajwiba ʿan masāʾil Abī Rayḥān al-Bīrūnī). Text in S.H. Nasr and M. Mohaghegh, Abū Reyḥān Bērūnī va Ebn-e Sīnā, Al-Asʾila wa-l-ajwiba, Tehran 1352Sh/1974. English translation in R. Berjak and M. Iqbal, “Ibn Sīnā - al-Bīrūnī Correspondence,” Islam & Science 1 (2003) 91–98, 253–260; 2 (2004) 57–62, 181–187; 3 (2005) 57–62, 166–170.
GP 10 Compendium on the Soul (Kitāb fī l-Nafs ʿalā sunnat al-iḫtiṣār). Text and German translation in S. Landauer, “Die Psychologie des Ibn Sīnā,” Zeitschrift der Deutschen Morgenländischen Gesellschaft 29 (1875) 335–418.
GPP 1 Piety and Sin (al-Birr wa-l-ithm). The work does not survive except in some fragments of questionable provenance; see Gutas 2014a, 498. A fragment in a MS going under that title was published in ʿA.Z. Shamsaddīn, ed., Al-Madhhab al-tarbawī ʿinda Ibn Sīnā, Beirut 1988, pp. 353–368.
GPW 1 Letter to the Scholars of Baghdad (Risāla ilā ʿUlamāʾ Baghdād yasʾaluhum al-inṣāf baynahu wa-bayna rajul Hamadhānī yaddaʿī l-ḥikma). Text in E. Yarshater, ed., Panj Resāle, Tehran 1332Sh/1953, pp. 73–90. German translation in R. Arnzen, Platonische Ideen in der arabischen Philosophie, Berlin 2011, pp. 355–370.
GPW 2 Letter to a Friend (R. ilā Ṣadīq  yasʾaluhu l-inṣāf baynahu wa-bayna l-Hamadhānī alladhī yaddaʿī l-ḥikma). Text and French translation in Y. Michot, Ibn Sînâ. Lettre au vizir Abû Sa‘d, Beirut and Paris 2000.
GPW 3 Repudiating Charges of Imitating the Qurʾān (R. fī Intifāʾ ʿammā nusiba ilayhi min muʿāraḍat al-Qurʾān). Text and French translation in Y. Michot, “Le Riz trop cuit du Kirmânî,” in Mélanges offerts à Hossam Elkhadem, F. Daelemans et al., eds., Archives et Bibliothèques de Belgique, Numéro Spécial 83, Brussels 2007, pp. 81–129.
GS 2 The Compilation / Philosophy for ʿArūḍī (al-Majmūʿ/ al-Ḥikma al-ʿArūḍiyya). Text in M. Ṣāliḥ, Kitāb al-Majmūʿ aw al-Ḥikma al-ʿArūḍiyya, Beirut 1428/2007. No full translation yet available.
GS 3 Elements of Philosophy (ʿUyūn al-ḥikma). Text in ʿA. Badawī, ed., Avicennae Fontes Sapientiae [Mémorial Avicenne - V], Cairo 1954. No translation available.
GS 5 The Cure (al-Shifāʾ). Edition by various scholars in 22 volumes, Cairo 1952–1983.
 De anima (part of The Cure). Text in  F. Rahman, ed., Avicenna’s De anima, London: Oxford University Press, 1959. No full translation available. For parts in English translation see The Salvation.
GS 6 The Salvation (al-Najāt). Text in M.T. Dāneshpaǰūh, ed., Al-Najāt, Tehran 1364Sh/[1985]. English translation of the logic part in A.Q. Ahmed, Avicenna’s Deliverance: Logic, Karachi: Oxford University Press, 2011. English translation of parts on the soul in F. Rahman, Avicenna’s Psychology. An English Translation of Kitāb al-Najāt,Book II, Chapter VI, London: Oxford University Press, 1952.
GS 7 Philosophy for ʿAlāʾ-ad-Dawla (Dāneshnāme-ye ʿAlāʾī). Text in M. Meshkāt, Manṭiq and Ṭabīʿiyyāt;  M. Moʿīn, Ilāhiyyāt; and M. Mīnovī, Riyāḍiyyāt, Tehran 1331Sh/[1952]. French translation in M. Achena and Henri Massé, Le Livre de science, Paris: Les Belles Lettres / UNESCO, ²1986.
GS 8 The Easterners; Eastern Philosophy (al-Mashriqiyyūn; al-Ḥikma al-mashriqiyya). Text in Manṭiq al-mashriqiyyīn wa-l-Qaṣīda al-muzdawija, taṣnīf al-Raʾīs Abī ʿAlī Ibn Sīnā, Cairo 1910.
GS 9 Pointers and Reminders (al-Ishārāt wa-l-tanbīhāt). Text in J. Forget, Ibn Sīnā. Le livre des théorèmes et des avertissements, Leiden 1892, and in M. Zāreʿī, Al-Ishārāt wa-l-tanbīhāt li-l-Shaykh al-Raʾīs Ibn Sīnā, Qum 1381Sh/2002. French translation in Goichon 1951; English translation in Inati 1984, 1996, and 2014.
GS 10 The Available and the Valid [of Philosophy] (al-Ḥāṣil wa-l-maḥṣūl). Not extant.
GS 11 Fair Judgment (al-Inṣāf). Only the following parts are extant:
 (a) Commentary on [Metaphysics] Lambda (Sharḥ Kitāb al-lām). Text and French translation in Geoffroy et al. 2014.
 (b) Commentary on the Theologia Aristotelis (Tafsīr/Sharḥ Kitāb Uthūlūjiyā). Text in Badawī 1947, pp. 37–74. French translation in Vajda 1951.
 (c) Marginal Glosses on Aristotle’s De anima (al-Taʿlīqāt ʿalā ḥawāšī Kitāb al-Nafs li-Arisṭūṭālīs). Text in Badawī 1947, pp. 75–116; no translation available.
GS 12a Notes (al-Taʿlīqāt). Text in ʿA. Badawī, Ibn Sīnā, al-Taʿlīqāt, Cairo 1973. No full translation available.
GS 14 Discussions (al-Mubāḥathāt). Text in M. Bīdārfar, Al-Mubāḥathāt, Qum 1371Sh/1992.

Secondary Sources

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  • –––, 2002, “Arabisch-islamische Enzyklopädien: Formen und Funktionen,” in Die Enzyklopädie im Mittelalter vom Hochmittelalter bis zur frühen Neuzeit, Ch. Meier (ed.), München: Wilhelm Fink, pp. 43–83.
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  • Davidson, H.A., 1987, Proofs for Eternity, Creation and the Existence of God in Medieval Islamic and Jewish Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1992, Alfarabi, Avicenna, and Averroes, on Intellect, Oxford / New York: Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Eichner, H., 2009, The Post-Avicennian Philosophical Tradition and Islamic Orthodoxy: Philosophical and Theological Summae in Context, unpublished professorial dissertation (Habilitationsschrift), Halle.
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