Supplement to Chaos
The Chaotic Hierarchy
Some authors have defined chaos as a hierarchy from weak to strong drawing on the ergodic hierarchy (e.g., Zhilinskii 2009; Ullmo 2016). The ergodic hierarchy is an ordering of properties dynamical systems may possess: ergodicity, weak mixing, strong mixing, Ksystems, and Bsystems (see The Ergodic Hierarchy for details).

Ergodicity: A single trajectory on an energy surface, starting from almost any initial condition, explores the entire available state space densely; in other words, for all initial conditions except a set of measure zero, the time average and the space average of the function describing the trajectory on an energy surface are equal.
Let a state space \(S\) be equipped with a measure \(\mu\) and let \(T_\mu\) be a measure preserving transformation (e.g., a map or a flow). The the remaining properties can be defined as follows:

Weak mixing: For any two sets of points \(A\) and \(B\) of the energy surface in \(S\) (excluding those of zero measure), \(\lim_{n\to \infty} {1 \over n} \sum_{i=0}^{n1} T_{\mu}^{i}A \cap B  \mu(A)\mu(B) = 0\).

Strong mixing: For any two sets of points \(A\) and \(B\) of the energy surface in \(S\) (excluding those of zero measure), \(\lim_{n\to \infty} (T_{\mu}^nA) \cap B = \mu(A)\mu(B)\).

Ksystems (Kolmogorov): A quasiregular dynamical systems having positive Kolmogorov entropy, also known as KolmogorovSinai entropy. Where
\[k(T,\xi) = (T_{\mu}^{1}A_{i_1} \cap T_{\mu}^{2}A_{i_2} \cap T_{\mu}^{3}A_{i_3} \cap \cdots \cap T_{\mu}^{n}A_{i_n})\]let
\[ h(T,\xi) = \lim_{n\to \infty} {1 \over n} \sum_{i_1, i_2,i_3,\ldots,i_n} k(T,\xi) \ln k(T,\xi) \]be the entropy over the finite partition \(\xi = \{ A_{i_1}, A_{i_2}, A_{i_3},\ldots,A_{i_n} \}\) of the state space \(S\). A dynamical system is a Ksystem if \(h(T) = \sup_{\xi}h(T,\xi)\), where the supremum is taken over all finite partitions \(\xi\).

Bsystems (Bernoulli): A dynamical system having a generating partition for \(T\) such that for all \(i\), \(\bigvee_{j=1}^{i1}T^j\xi\) and \(T^j\xi\) are independent, where \(A\bigvee B = \{ A_i \cap B_j \}\).
The implication of the hierarchy is that any dynamical system which is a Bsystem is also a Ksystem, any which is a Ksystem is strong mixing, any which is strong mixing is weak mixing, and any weak mixing system is ergodic. Sometimes the ergodic hierarchy is discussed as characterizing different degrees of randomness (e.g., Ott 1993, 299–300), nonetheless note that any degrees of randomness in the hierarchy are apparent only because all dynamical systems are deterministic by definition.
This is a classification scheme for dynamical systems, but note there are subtleties with applying such a hierarchy to chaos. For dissipative systems, there may be an attractor that is ergodic in only a limited region of the state space meaning a trajectory only densely covers the attractor and hardly any of the rest of the state space for the system. For conservative systems, chaotic trajectories do not always cover the entire state space densely. Moreover, most of the chaotic models are run on computers and though the graphical output looks convincing as a case for ergodicity, the discrete nature of the calculations means that we cannot obtain a rigorously numerical proof for ergodicity. And for many chaotic maps, such as the Chirikov standard map, ergodicity only holds for regions of state space where there is no mixture of both chaotic and regular orbits.
Nevertheless, some authors associate weak chaos with systems exhibiting ergodicity and some form of mixing, while associating strong chaos with systems exhibiting SDIC and/or continuous energy spectra, loss of temporal correlations, and other properties that appear in K and Bsystems (e.g., Casati and Prosen 2009; Ullmo 2016), hence a “chaotic hierarchy.” The idea is that there is a gradation of levels or strengths of chaotic dynamics. For example, ergodicity does not produce SD but only WSD at best.
Others attempt to be more precise and definite, identifying strong mixing as a necessary condition for chaos while being a Ksystem is sufficient (e.g., Belot and Earman 1997), since only dynamical systems that are Ksystems exhibit SDIC on the ergodic hierarchy. Another way of putting this is that a positive KolmogorovSinai entropy is necessary and sufficient for a positive global Lyapunov exponent (e.g., Lichtenberg and Liebermann, 1992). Charlotte Werndl (2009) has argued that strong mixing is necessary and sufficient to define a dynamical system as chaotic because this property implies that trajectories will cover the state space (or an attractor in state space) densely, and implies Chaos\(_{d}\).
Another feature of the ergodic hierarchy, feeding into the idea of a chaos hierarchy, is the famed unpredictability of chaotic systems. Starting from weak mixing, at successive levels of the hierarchy the dynamical system’s past behavior becomes less and less effective (some might argue less and less relevant) to its future behavior. While this offers a hierarchy of successive forms of unpredictability, we currently lack a measure of unpredictability that picks out a specific degree of unpredictability unequivocally associated with chaotic dynamics. Moreover, unpredictability of chaotic dynamics is more subtle than the ergodic hierarchy can take into account.
In actualworld forecasting, scientists deal with finite uncertainties and their growth, and often do not bother with trying to compute Lyapunov exponents. Consider a typical weather forecasting scenario. Scientists take measurements of the initial state of their system (e.g., temperature, pressure, humidity, etc. in some region) yielding ensembles of initial conditions. One reason they have to deal with ensembles is all these measurements have accuracy limitations introducing some uncertainties into the observed values. Scientists then use data assimilation processes to transform these observations into the model state space (remember the faithful model assumption §1.1.3). This forms a model of the initial conditions for the forecasting model. Using these, they can run their forecasting model to produce an ensemble forecast: On 30% of the model runs using the ensembles, rain is predicted for Washington, D. C. tomorrow.
The chaotic dynamics of weather systems is a real thing, but scientists have techniques for coaxing good, useful forecasting for such systems over the near and mediumrange future. Your evening weather forecast is still quite useful even though chaotic dynamics exists. The story is similar for many other types of chaotic systems. While chaos places some limits on forecasting, the idea that chaotic systems are unpredictable is a myth.
Correcting this myth has implications for how some have tried to define chaos. One suggestion is to define chaos in terms of unpredictability and the ergodic hierarchy appears to offer a natural way for classifying unpredictability (e.g. Berkovitz, Frigg, and Kronz 2006). The proposal is that the hierarchy can be viewed as characterizing degrees of probabilistic relevance due to the different rates or kinds of decay of correlations between system states over time. The rough idea is that a system’s outcome is unpredictable if the outcome’s probability is independent of the system’s past history. Think of a dice throw: The outcome is unpredictable because even knowledge of every throw in the past gives no information about the outcome of the next throw.
To make this more precise, one can examine the rate or kinds of decay of correlations between system states over time through the autocorrelation function. For our dice throw example, all past states are uncorrelated with the current or any future state of the thrown dice. For ergodic systems, there need not be any decay of correlation among system states over time, whereas for strong mixing systems, all correlations tend to decay to zero as time tends to infinity. So far, for the ergodic hierarchy, one can imagine systems that start off with highly correlated states and these correlations decaying over time, where the past states of a stronglymixing system become increasingly irrelevant to the current state of the system. For Ksystems, there is a stronger result, namely that a coarsegrained history of states in the infinitely remote past are uncorrelated with the current system state no matter how refined the partition used for the coarse graining. For Bsystems, the current system state is independent, that is uncorrelated with, all past states. Given some technical assumptions, probability distributions of outcomes can be related to the state space measure yielding an objective probability. A form of epistemic predictability can then be associated with these probabilities making precise how to relate different grades of apparent randomness as unpredictability to each level of the ergodic hierarchy. For instance, by comparison, a strong mixing system’s current state is probabilistically independent from its states at some time in the past, whereas the current states of a Ksystem is probabilistically independent from the system’s entire history, while the current state of a Bsystem is independent of any of its past states.
These considerations lead to taking chaos to be a matter of degree rather than kind (Berkovitz, Frigg, and Kronz 2006, pp. 688–689), another version of the chaos hierarchy cashed out in terms of unpredictability. But this move questions whether there is a clear definition of chaos with distinguishing marks, leaving us with any behavior on the ergodic hierarchy except mere ergodicity counting as chaotic by degrees. Another issue with linking a hierarchy of unpredictability with a definition of chaos is that the global Lyapunov exponents implied by K and Bsystems measure infinitesimal growth in uncertainty and only become relevant to predictability, if they are at all, in the infinite time limit. This places significant constraint on the effectiveness of characterizing chaotic dynamics in terms of unpredictability. The proposal for characterizing chaos in terms of unpredictability takes us back to Chaos\(_{d}\) and WSD as markers for when a dynamics is chaotic, where we already know there are issues.
A third problem is that the ergodic hierarchy categorizes dynamical systems, hence is applicable to deterministic mathematical models. Return to Poincaré’s symmetric cone standing on its tip. The direction it will fall from its unstable equilibrium is unpredictable. Moreover, each time we return it to its unstable equilibrium point, its fall will be independent of the entire past history of being placed in unstable equilibria and falling over. These are the kinds of characteristics Ksystems have, but Poincaré’s cone is not a chaotic system. If we were to apply the ergodic hierarchy as an unpredictability hierarchy to pick out degrees of chaotic behavior, we would misidentify the character of the Poincaré cone system, running the risk of identifying all forms of unpredictability with chaos.