# Chaos

*First published Wed Jul 16, 2008; substantive revision Fri Oct 11, 2024*

The big news about chaos is supposed to be that the smallest of changes in a system can result in very large differences in that system’s behavior. The so-called butterfly effect has become one of the most popular images of chaos. The idea is that the flapping of a butterfly’s wings in Argentina could cause a tornado in Texas three weeks later. By contrast, in an identical copy of the world sans the Argentinian butterfly, no such tornado would have occurred in Texas. The mathematical version of this property is known as sensitive dependence and such sensitivity has implications for predictability of future behavior. Clarifying sensitive dependence’s significance is important given there have always been limits on prediction. Chaos studies have highlighted these implications in fresh ways, enabled forms of mitigation as well as control of chaos, and have led to other implications for how we think about our world.

In addition to exhibiting sensitive dependence, chaotic systems are deterministic and nonlinear and exhibit aperiodic behavior (Lorenz 1963). This entry discusses systems exhibiting these properties and their philosophical implications. For those not familiar with the basic phenomenology of chaos, reading nontechnical treatments such as Smith (2007) or Bishop (2023) is highly recommended. Because of the distinctive nature of quantum chaos, it is treated separately in the Supplement: Quantum Chaos, needed for discussions of broader implications in §6.

- 1. Defining Chaos: Aperiodicity, Determinism, Nonlinearity, and Sensitive Dependence
- 2. What is Chaos “Theory”?
- 3. Nonlinear Models, Faithfulness, and Confirmation
- 4. Chaos, Determinism, and Quantum Mechanics
- 5. Questions about Realism and Explanation
- 6. Some Broader Implications of Chaos
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Defining Chaos

The phenomenon of chaos is studied in disciplines as diverse as mathematics, astronomy, meteorology, population biology, economics, and social psychology. While it’s unlikely such diverse disciplines have any causal mechanisms in common, the phenomenological behavior of chaos—e.g., sensitivity to the tiniest changes in initial conditions or seemingly random and unpredictable behavior that nevertheless follows precise rules—appears in many models in these disciplines. Observing similar chaotic behavior in models across such diverse fields presents a challenge to understanding chaos as a phenomenon and what might count as unification of such phenomena.

### 1.1 Preliminaries

#### 1.1.1 Dynamical Systems and Determinism

Chaos is typically understood as a property of a dynamical system. A dynamical system is a deterministic mathematical model for how observable properties of a system evolve with time. Time can be either discrete or continuous. A one-dimensional dynamical system is called a map (though the literature sometimes deviates from this usage). As an example of a discrete map, imagine a rule where you place one penny on the first square of a checkerboard, two on the second square, three on the third square, and so on. The output or number of pennies on each square represents a step in time. This is an iterative process meaning that the current value of a variable at time \(t\), the number of pennies has the rule applied to it yielding the value of the variable at the next time step \(t+1\). Then the rule is applied to this value producing the output at the next time step \(t+2\) and so forth. A time series is built up of outputs from the map for each time step. The number of pennies on square one (\(t\)), square two (\(t+1\)), square three (\(t+2\)) and so on would be an example of a discrete time series produced by iterating a map.

Dynamical systems of two dimensions or higher are called flows. Flows can also be discrete or continuous and their outputs also form a time series albeit of two or more dimensions.

Such models may be studied as mathematical objects or used to describe a target system (e.g., physical, biological, or economic). A simple example would be the equation describing the motion of a pendulum. The equations of a dynamical system describe the evolution in time of variables taken to adequately describe the target system (e.g., velocity as a function of time for a pendulum). A complete specification of the initial state of such equations is referred to as the initial conditions for the model, while a characterization of the boundaries for the model domain are known as the boundary conditions. An example of a dynamical system with a boundary condition would be the equation modeling the flight of a rubber ball fired at a wall by a small cannon. The boundary condition might be that the wall absorbs no kinetic energy (energy of motion) so that the ball is reflected off the wall with no loss of energy. The initial conditions would be the position and velocity of the ball as it left the mouth of the cannon. The dynamical system would then describe the flight of the ball to and from the wall under these conditions.

A mathematical model is deterministic if it exhibits unique evolution:

**(Unique Evolution)** A given state of a model is always
followed by the same history of state transitions. Given a state at a
specific time there is only one history of transitions consistent with
the relevant laws.

Although some popularized discussions of chaos claim it invalidates determinism, chaotic behavior is always deterministic. Much of the confusion over chaos and determinism derives from equating determinism with predictability. While it’s true that apparent randomness can be generated if the state space (see §1.1.3 below) one uses to analyze chaotic behavior is coarse-grained, this produces only an epistemic form of nondeterminism. The underlying equations are still fully deterministic. For a breakdown of determinism in chaotic systems, there must be some kind of indeterminism introduced such that the property of unique evolution is violated (see §4 and §6.1 below).

Dynamical systems exhibit various kinds of attractors, a value (or set of values in the case of a flow) that trajectories converge onto in state space. There are four kinds of attractors:

- Fixed points: The dynamical system repeats the same value.
- Periodic loops: The dynamical system produces periodically repeating values such as the small hand of a clock pointing to 12 every 60 seconds.
- Quasi-periodic loops: The dynamical system produces values exhibiting a regular pattern but which don’t have a fixed period such as the tides rolling in and out. Such attractors can also exhibit behavior with two or more periods of incommensurable frequencies (i.e., frequencies which are not rational multiple of each other).
- Aperiodic: The dynamical system produces values that appear to never repeat but intricate order exists.

The intricate order of aperiodic attractors is where the phenomenon of chaos lies.

When a dynamical system’s trajectory narrows down onto an attractor it’s said to be dissipative. Dissipative dynamical systems have the property that their activity shrinks to a smaller area or volume in state space (see §1.1.3). In contrast, conservative dynamical systems, also called Hamiltonian, preserve state space area or volume. Chaotic behavior is exhibited in both dissipative and conservative dynamical systems.

#### 1.1.2 Nonlinear Dynamics

The dynamical systems of interest in chaos studies are nonlinear, such as the Lorenz (1963) model equations for convection in fluids:

\[\begin{align*} \frac{dx}{dt} &= -\sigma x + \sigma y; \\ \tag{Lorenz} \frac{dy}{dt} &= rx - y + xz ; \\ \frac{dz}{dt} &= xy - bz.\\ \end{align*}\]

A dynamical system is characterized as linear or nonlinear depending on the nature of the equations describing the target system. Consider a differential equation system \(d\bx/dt = \bF\bx\) for a set of variables \(\bx = x_1, x_2, \ldots, x_n\). These variables might represent positions, momenta, chemical concentration, or other key features of the target system, and the system of equations describes how these key variables change with time.

Let \(\bx_{1}(t)\) and \(\bx_{2}(t)\) be solutions of the equation system \(d\bx/dt = \bF\bx\). If the system of equations is linear, it can easily be shown that \(\bx_{3}(t) = a\bx_{1}(t)+ b\bx_{2}(t)\) is a solution, where \(a\) and \(b\) are arbitrary constants. This is known as the principle of linear superposition. If the principle of linear superposition holds, then a system behaves linearly: Any multiplicative change in a variable by a factor \(\alpha\) implies a multiplicative or proportional change of its output by \(\alpha\).

Suppose you start with your stereo at low volume and turn the volume control one unit. The volume increases by one unit. If you now turn the control two units, the volume increases two units. This is an example of a linear response. In a nonlinear system, such as Lorenz’s, linear superposition fails, and a system need not change proportionally to the change in a variable. If you turn your volume control too far, the volume may not only increase more than the number of units of the turn, but whistles and various other distortions occur in the sound. These are examples of a nonlinear response.

#### 1.1.3 State Space and the Faithful Model Assumption

Mathematical models of physical systems involve state space, an abstract mathematical space of points. Each point represents a possible state of the system. When the state of the system is fully characterized by position and momentum variables, the resulting space is often called phase space, though some authors use the term phase space for any state space. A dynamical system is a rule for how a model behaves in state space. A state is taken to be characterized by the values of the variables considered crucial for a complete description of said state and its behavior. The dimensionality of the state space is determined by the number of independent variables needed to characterize the system state.

In addition to the variables characterizing the state, a dynamical system also has one or more parameters determining the strength of the contributions of particular terms in the mathematical model to the model’s behavior. The initial state as well as the mathematical model and its parameters are important to chaotic dynamics.

For a map, the first number inputted—the initial state— is iterated producing a trajectory in state space, a series of state transitions creating a time series. Similarly for a flow, where as many numbers as there are dimensions for the state space serve as the initial state. A model can be studied in state space by following its trajectory from the initial state to some chosen final state. The equations describe the path—the history of state transitions—of the system in state space. Often working in state space enables study of useful geometric properties of the dynamical system’s trajectories without knowing the exact solutions to the equations.

Scientists presume a close connection between the model used to forecast weather, say, and the weather system being tracking. However, note some crucial, often unexamined, assumptions. For instance, that the state of a target system, such as weather, is characterized by the values of the crucial state space variables and that a physical state corresponds via these values to a point in state space. The implication is that the target system’s state represented in state space corresponds to the actual-world system of interest and that the possibilities encoded in the state space correspond to the actual-world system’s physical possibilities.

These assumptions allow development of mathematical models for behavior in state space and such models are taken to represent (perhaps through an isomorphism or some more complicated relation) the target systems of interest. Mathematicians and scientists assume that our mathematical models are faithful representations of target systems and that the state spaces employed faithfully represent the actual possibilities of target systems. This package of suppositions is the faithful model assumption. In its idealized limit—the perfect model framework—it can license the (perhaps sloppy) slide between model talk and system talk (i.e., whatever is true of the model is also true of the target system and vice versa).

Given faithfulness, it’s reasonable to think we can plot trajectories for both the target system and its model in the same state space for comparison. In the context of nonlinear models, faithfulness appears to be inadequate (§3).

### 1.2 A Brief History of Chaos

While some scientists and mathematicians prior to the 20th century explored the phenomenon of sensitive dependence on initial conditions (SDIC) for system behavior, these isolated investigations never produced a sustained field of inquiry. For instance, James Clerk Maxwell identified behavior resembling SDIC (1876, p. 13). He described such phenomena as cases where the “physical axiom” that from like antecedents flow like consequences is violated. He recognized this kind of behavior could be found in systems with a sufficiently large number of variables. But he also argued that such sensitive dependence could happen in the case of two colliding spheres (1860).

Closer to our modern notion of SDIC in the growth of uncertainties is Poincaré’s example of a cyclone, where observational error of “one-tenth of a degree” leads to apparent randomness in landfall creating prediction difficulties (1921, p. 398).

Study of small disturbances’ impact on system behavior intensified with a famous paper by Edward Lorenz (1963). His pioneering work demonstrated that a meteorological model could exhibit exquisite sensitive dependence on small changes in initial conditions.

Three benchmarks for characterizing uncertainty growth are linear, exponential, and geometric growth rates. Linear growth is represented by the expression \(y = ax+b\), where \(a\) is an arbitrary positive constant and \(b\) is an arbitrary constant. A special case of linear growth is illustrated by stacking pennies on a checkerboard \((a = 1\), \(b = 0)\). Using the rule of placing one penny on the first square, two pennies on the second square, three pennies on the third square, and so forth, we’ll end up with 64 pennies stacked on the last square. The total number of pennies on the checkerboard will be 2080.

Exponential growth is represented by the expression \(y = n_{0}e^{ax}\), where \(n_{0}\) is some initial quantity (say the initial number of pennies) and \(a\) is an arbitrary positive constant. Going back to our penny stacking analogy with \(a = 1\), start with placing 1 penny on the first square, about 2.7 pennies on the second square, about 7.4 pennies on the third square, and so forth, resulting in about \(6.2 \times 10^{27}\) pennies staked on the last square! This is an example of a nonlinear map.

Finally, there are faster than exponential growth
rates^{[1]},
but exponential uncertainty growth is considered an important mark of
chaotic dynamics. Thus, these faster growth rates are usually ignored
in chaos discussions.

The other behavior Lorenz’s model demonstrated was aperiodicity. Aperiodic solutions don’t repeat their behavior (at least on reasonable timescales; demonstrating solutions never repeat on a computer is very difficult).

Aperiodicity was treated as an uninteresting mathematical oddity until the publication of Lorenz (1963) demonstrating model solutions that wouldn’t repeat their behavior because they had a deep relationship to the Cantor set. Lorenz’s work indicated aperiodicity had practical implications.

Lorenz (1963) usually represents the ‘discovery’ of chaos. The earliest use of the term “chaotic” to describe the phenomenon Lorenz reported was in David Ruelle and Floris Takens (1971); the term “strange attractor” (see §5.1 below) also first appears in this paper. Nonetheless, it was Tien-Yien Li’s and James A. Yorke’s (1975) influential “Period Three Implies Chaos” paper that led to the widespread use of the term “chaos” for these mathematical behaviors.

### 1.3 Defining Chaos

To identify systems as chaotic, we need a definition or a list of distinguishing characteristics.

#### 1.3.1 Qualitative Definitions of Chaos

The logistic map,

\[x _{t+1}= \alpha x_{t}(1-x_{t}), \]

where \(\alpha\) is a parameter whose value ranges from one to four
and the variable \(x\) ranges from zero to one, is a model chaotic
system. A definition of chaos should identify what makes such a
dynamical system chaotic, but this turns out to be a difficult task.
Stephen Kellert defines chaos theory as “the qualitative study
of unstable aperiodic behavior in deterministic nonlinear dynamical
systems” (1993, p. 2). His definition picks out two key features
that are simultaneously present: instability and aperiodicity.
Unstable systems are those exhibiting sensitivity to initial
conditions, where Kellert gestures towards Robert Devaney’s
definition, and examples of qualitatively different behaviors (1993,
p. 12). Aperiodicity we’ve already
met.^{[2]}

This definition is both qualitative and restrictive. It’s qualitative in that Kellert doesn’t rely on mathematically precise criteria for instability and aperiodicity. Although one can add such definitions, this precision may only add limited improvements (see below). The definition is restrictive in that it limits chaos to be a property of mathematical models (although Kellert (1993) is sometimes ambiguous as to whether chaos is only a behavior of mathematical models or of actual-world systems), so the import for actual-world systems is left open. At this point, we must invoke the faithful model assumption—namely, that our mathematical models and their state spaces have close correspondence to actual-world target systems and their possible behaviors—to forge a link between this definition and chaos in actual systems. Immediately we face two related questions:

- How faithful are our models? How strong is the correspondence with target systems? This relates to issues in realism and explanation (§5) as well as confirmation (§3).
- Do features of our mathematical analyses (e.g., characterizations of instability) turn out to be problematic such that their application to target systems may not be useful (see below)?

Furthermore, Kellert’s definition is too broad to pick out only chaotic behaviors. For instance, take the map \(x_{n + 1} = cx_{n}\), a map exhibiting only unstable and aperiodic orbits. For the values \(c = 1.1\) and \(x_{0} = .5\), successive iterations continue to increase and never return near \(x_{0}\). Kellert’s definition would classify this map as chaotic, but the map doesn’t exhibit chaotic behavior.

Robert Batterman’s (1993) discusses problematic definitions of chaos, namely, those focusing on notions of unpredictability. Unpredictability is neither necessary nor sufficient to distinguish chaos from any other unpredictable behavior (Supplement: The Chaotic Hierarchy). Batterman doesn’t specify an alternative definition but suggests exponential growth in uncertainty is a necessary condition while leaving open whether it’s sufficient.

However, a crucial feature of chaos is the presence of “stretching and folding” mechanisms in the dynamics (Batterman 1993, p. 49). Such mechanisms cause some trajectories to converge rapidly while causing others to diverge rapidly leading to trajectories issuing from various points in some small neighborhood of state space mixing and separating in dramatic ways. For instance, some initially neighboring trajectories on the Lorenz attractor (Figure 1) become separated, where some end up on one wing while others end up on the other wing rather rapidly. As another example, the logistic map stretches the interval \([0,1]\) and folds it from a straight line into a parabola. Successive iterations repeat this stretching and folding process eventually producing chaotic dynamics for appropriate values of the parameter \(\alpha\).

Figure 1. The Lorenz Attractor.

Stretching of trajectories is associated with the explosive growth in uncertainties, folding with confinement to a region of state space. The presence of appropriate stretching and folding mechanisms in the dynamics, Batterman argues, is a necessary condition for chaos. Such behavior is associated with nonlinearities. As such, this defining characteristic could be applied to both mathematical models and actual-world systems, though the identification of such mechanisms in target systems may be rather tricky: When dealing with a fluid system, say, we have several nonlinear mechanisms that have been well explored as sources for stretching and folding. In contrast, when we only have time series data (e.g., the hourly price of Chicago Board of Trade hog futures), identifying possible nonlinear mechanisms is difficult.

Stretching and folding mechanisms lead to dynamics with attractors, so focusing on such mechanisms in developing a definition of chaos appears fruitful. From a qualitative standpoint we have determinism, nonlinearity, stretching and folding dynamics, aperiodicity, and SDIC as factors relevant to a definition identifying chaotic behavior fitting our intuitions for chaos.

#### 1.3.2 Quantitative Definitions of Chaos

Let’s start with distinguishing weak and strong forms of sensitive dependence (somewhat following Smith 1998). Weak sensitive dependence can be characterized as follows. Consider the propagator, \(\bJ(\bx,\Delta t)\), where trajectories \(\bx(t+\Delta t) = \bJ(\bx,\Delta t)\) . Let \(\bx(0)\) and \(\by(0)\) be initial conditions for two different trajectories. Then, weak sensitive dependence is

**(WSD)**

\(\exists \varepsilon \gt 0\) \(\forall \bx(0)\) \(\forall \delta \gt
0\) \(\exists t\gt 0\) \(\exists \by(0)\), \(\abs{\bx(0) - \by(0)} \lt
\delta\) and \(\abs{\bx(t) - \by(t)} \gt \varepsilon.\)

No matter how close together \(\bx(0)\) and \(\by(0)\) are the trajectory initiating from \(\by(0)\) will eventually diverge by \(\varepsilon\) from the trajectory initiating from \(\bx(0)\). However, WSD doesn’t specify the rate of divergence (it’s compatible with linear rates of divergence) nor does it specify how many points surrounding \(\bx(0)\) will give rise to diverging trajectories (it could be a set of measure zero).

On the other hand, chaos is usually characterized by a stronger form of sensitive dependence:

**(SD)**

\(\exists \lambda\) such that for almost all points \(\bx(0)\),
\(\forall \delta \gt 0\) \(\exists t\gt 0\) such that for almost all
points \(\by(0)\) in a small neighborhood \((\delta)\) around
\(\bx(0)\), \(\abs{\bx(0) - \by(0)}\lt \delta\) and \(\abs{\bx(t) -
\by(t)} \approx \abs{\bx(0) - \by(0)}e^{\lambda t}\),

where “almost all” is understood as applying for all points in state space except a set of measure zero. Here, \(\lambda\) is often interpreted as the largest global Lyapunov exponent (Supplement: Global Lyapunov Exponents) and is taken to represent the average rate of divergence of neighboring trajectories issuing forth from some small neighborhood centered around \(\bx(0)\). Exponential growth is implied if \(\lambda \gt 0\) (convergence if \(\lambda \lt 0)\). In general, such growth cannot go on forever. If the system is bounded in space and momentum, there are limits to how far nearby trajectories can diverge from one another.

One strategy for devising chaos definitions is to begin with discrete models and generalize to the continuous case. If one begins with a continuous system by using a Poincaré surface of section—roughly, a two-dimensional plane is defined and one plots the intersections of trajectories of a flow with this plane—a discrete model can be generated. If the discrete model generated by the surface of section exhibits chaotic behavior, the original continuous system will also be chaotic.

Let \(f\) be a smooth function defined on state space \(S\). \(f\) can
be iterated or reapplied a number of
times.^{[3]}
To indicate this, we can write \(f^{n}(x)\), meaning \(f\) is applied
iteratively \(n\) times. For instance, \(f^{3}(x)\) would indicate
\(f\) has been applied three times, thus \(f^{3}(x) = f(f(f(x)))\).
The logistic map is a simple example of this iterative procedure.
Furthermore, let \(K\) be a subset of \(S\). Then \(f(K)\) represents
\(f\) applied to the set of points \(K\), that is, \(f\) sends the set
\(K\) into \(f(K)\). If \(f(K) = K\), then \(K\) is an invariant set
under \(f\).

Now Devaney’s (1989) definition of chaos can be stated as follows:

**(Chaos\(_{d})\)**

A smooth map \(f\) is chaotic if \(f\) has an invariant set
\(K\subseteq S\) such that

- \(f\) satisfies WSD on \(K\),
- The set of periodic orbits of \(f\) are dense in \(K\), and
- \(f\) is topologically transitive on \(K\).

Topological transitivity is the following notion: consider open sets \(U\) and \(V\) around the points \(u\) and \(v\) respectively. Regardless how small \(U\) and \(V\) are, some trajectory initiating from \(U\) eventually visits \(V\). This condition guarantees trajectories starting from points in \(U\) will eventually explore all of \(S\).

Devaney’s definition is often favored by mathematicians and has
the virtues of being precise and compact. Since the time he proposed
his definition, it has been shown that (2) and (3) imply (1) if the
set \(K\) has an infinite number of elements (Banks et al*.*
1992), although this result doesn’t hold for sets with finite
elements. The definition is counterintuitive in that it emphasizes
periodic orbits rather than aperiodicity, when the latter is a much
better characterization of chaos. After all, it’s precisely the
lack of periodicity that is characteristic of chaotic behavior.
However, if the set of nonstable periodic points is dense in \(K\),
then given (3) the abundance of aperiodic orbits characteristic of
chaos is guaranteed. Some have argued that (2) is not even necessary
for characterizing chaos (e.g., Robinson 1995, pp. 83–4).
Furthermore, nothing in Devaney’s definition hints at the
stretching and folding of trajectories (e.g., linear models can
exhibit WSD), which appears to be a necessary condition for chaos from
a qualitative perspective. Peter Smith (1998, pp. 176–7)
suggests that Chaos\(_{d}\) is a consequence rather than a mark of
chaos.^{[4]}

A possibility for capturing the concept of the stretching and folding of trajectories so characteristic of chaotic dynamics is the following:

**(Chaos\(_{h})\)**

A discrete function \(f\) is chaotic if, for some iteration \(n \ge
1\), it sends the unit interval \(I\) into a horseshoe.

Consider the Smale horseshoe: Start with the unit square. First, stretch it in the \(y\) direction by more than a factor of two. Then compress it in the \(x\) direction by more than a factor of two. Now, fold the resulting rectangle and lay it back onto the square so that the construction overlaps and leaves the middle and vertical edges of the initial unit square uncovered. Repeating these stretching and folding operations leads to the Smale attractor.

This definition has at least two virtues. First, it can be proven that Chaos\(_{h}\) implies Chaos\(_{d}\). Second, it yields exponential divergence, so we get SD as expected for chaotic systems. Nevertheless, it has a significant disadvantage in that it cannot be applied to invertible functions, the kinds of functions characteristic of many systems exhibiting Hamiltonian chaos. A Hamiltonian system is one where the total kinetic energy plus potential energy is conserved; in contrast, dissipative systems lose energy through some mechanism such as friction. Hamiltonian chaos, then, is chaotic behavior in a Hamiltonian system and a definition for chaos must be able to cover both conservative and dissipative systems.

Other possible definitions have been suggested in the literature. For instance (Smith 1998, pp. 181–2),

**(Chaos\(_{te})\)**

A discrete function is chaotic just in case it exhibits topological
entropy.

Roughly, given points in a neighborhood \(N\) around \(x(0)\) less than \(\varepsilon\) away from each other, after \(n\) iterates of \(f\) the trajectories initiating from the points in \(N\) will differ by \(\varepsilon\) or greater, where more and more trajectories will differ by at least \(\varepsilon\) as \(n\) increases. For maps, however, it can be shown that Chaos\(_{h}\) implies Chaos\(_{te}\), so this doesn’t look to be a basic definition, though it’s often more useful for proving theorems relative to the other definitions.

Some authors advocate characterizing chaos in terms of notions from ergodic theory (e.g., Berkovitz, Frigg, and Kronz 2006; Sklar 1995, pp. 235–4; see the Supplement: The Chaotic Hierarchy).

#### 1.3.3 Lyapunov Exponents and Chaos

The most popular candidate definition for chaos among scientists and philosophers is

**(Chaos\(_\lambda\))**

A function is chaotic if it has a positive global Lyapunov
exponent.

This definition takes SD as its base with \(\lambda\) as the global Lyapunov exponent. The meaning of positivity is that \(\lambda > 0\) for almost all points in the specified set \(S\). Moreover, it offers practical calculation advantages for mathematical models and can often be related (sometimes with difficulty) to experimental data in the sense of examining data sets generated from physical systems for the presence of global Lyapunov exponents.

The global Lyapunov exponent is a parameter characterizing the average growth rate of any uncertainty. This average rate is estimated over many initial conditions. Such exponents can be thought of as indicating the stretching rate per time step of a function averaged over a trajectory. In this context, stretching is the rapid divergence of neighboring trajectories away from each other and is related to the presence of nonlinearities in the mathematical model.

The usefulness of Lyapunov exponents as potential diagnostics is illustrated by comparing the values of the Lyapunov exponents for the logistic map with its bifurcation diagram (e.g., Bishop 2023, pp. 54–55). The sign of the global Lyapunov exponent tracks with the bifurcation behavior. This tracking is always the case for chaotic mathematical models. Studying such relationships reveals a larger set of parameter values leading to stable behavior compared to chaotic for all dynamical systems.

One advantage of Global Lyapunov exponents is that they provide a convenient measure of the growth in the uncertainty giving some insight into system predictability. A common measure of predictability horizon for a system is the doubling rate \(2^t\), a measure of when the uncertainty grows to twice that in initial data as \(t\) increases. In linear systems, it takes a very long time for the uncertainty to grow to twice that of the initial data. For chaotic behavior, the doubling time is \(2^{\lambda t}\) because the growth in uncertainty is thought to be a pure exponential with exponent \(\lambda\).

#### 1.3.4 Trouble with Definitions

All the definitions discussed suffer counterexamples (see Supplement: Chaos Definition Counterexamples):

- Systems exhibiting WSD can fail to have positive global Lyapunov exponents.
- Attempts to align definitions such as Chaos\(_{d}\) , SD, Chaos\(_{te}\), or Chaos\(_{\lambda}\) with the ergodic hierarchy yield examples with exponential divergence of trajectories where all past states are perfectly correlated with any future states yielding no randomness associated with chaos.
- Some cases with positive global Lyapunov exponents have trajectories accelerating off to infinity raising questions about the importance of requiring confinement.
- Even for bounded systems, the presence of a positive global Lyapunov exponent may not lead to exponential growth in uncertainties.
- Some systems exhibit SDIC and generate dense periodic orbits, but lack topological transitivity raising questions about Chaos\(_{d}\), SD, Chaos\(_{te}\), and Chaos\(_{\lambda}\).
- Aperiodic horocyclic flows on a compact surface of negative curvature are ergodic and satisfy conditions (2) and (3) for Chaos\(_{d}\) but never exhibit even WSD.
- Periodic horocyclic flows on a compact surface of negative curvature can have a positive global Lyapunov exponent, but aren’t dense in the subspace challenging SD, Chaos\(_{te}\), and Chaos\(_{\lambda}\).
- KAM-type systems raise question about strong mixing as either a necessary or sufficient condition for chaos.
- Chaos\(_{d}\) or strong mixing classify much linear behavior as chaotic.

In light of this, one might suggest a modification to Devaney’s definition:

**(Chaos\(_{d\text{exp}}\))**

A smooth map \(f\) is chaotic if \(f\) has an invariant set
\(K\subseteq S\) such that

- \(f\) satisfies SD on \(K\),
- The set of periodic orbits of \(f\) are dense in \(K\), and
- \(f\) is topologically transitive on \(K\).

This definition has the virtue of all three conditions being independent of each other while clearly distinguishing linear from nonlinear behavior reserving chaotic dynamics for the latter. This fits most closely with intuitions of exponential growth in uncertainties as well as a dense set of aperiodic orbits matching researchers’ expectations for chaotic behavior.

Chaos\(_{d\text{exp}}\) agrees with intuitions that WSD is too weak to
capture chaotic
dynamics.^{[5]}
Specifying SD plus a set of dense periodic points and topological
transitivity rules out cases where there is (1) a positive global
Lyapunov exponent and no randomness, (2) a positive global Lyapunov
exponent and no exponential growth in uncertainties, (3) a set of
dense periodic points and topological transitivity but no positive
global Lyapunov exponent, (4) KAM-type systems, and (5) linear
dynamics. Although likely not immune to some counterexamples, this
definition gets closer to characterizing the phenomenology of chaotic
dynamics.

In practice, it’s the average Lyapunov exponents that are calculated to demonstrate when exponential growth in uncertainties occurs (Supplement: Global Lyapunov Exponents). This means that what really gets plugged into a definition such as chaos\(_{d\text{exp}}\) is an average global Lyapunov exponent; one can always examine the step-by-step finite-time exponents for detailed information about the attractor.

Finally, as the phenomenology of chaotic dynamics illustrates,
mathematical models only exhibit SDIC for particular parameter values
(Bishop 2023). Although often ignored in discussions about defining
chaos, sensitive dependence on parameter settings shouldn’t be
neglected.^{[6]}

### 1.4 Taking Stock

The image of butterfly wings flapping in Argentina leading to a tornado forming in Texas three weeks later suggests stringent limits on predictability. Given the resolution constraints on our weather models, there’s no way for us to “see” the butterfly wings disturbing the air currents that eventually lead to the tornado. Nonetheless, predictability is not a lost cause.

Consider an iterated map with the following behavior: the initial uncertainty grows by a factor of four on the first iteration, by a factor of three on the second iteration, by a factor 1/3 on the third iteration, by a factor of four on the fourth iteration, and a factor of two on the fifth iteration. This is behavior is similar to local Lyapunov exponents. While uncertainty has grown by a factor of 32 by the fifth iteration, the geometric average growth in uncertainty is only a factor of two per iteration. Although uncertainty growth isn’t uniform, the geometric average gives some useful information about predictability for this system. It’s even the case that the uncertainty shrinks on some iterations. Knowing specifics about the dynamics involved affords greater predictability on some iterations than others. For another example, consider the logistic map. For values of \(x\) close to zero or one the uncertainty grows rapidly, while for values around .5 uncertainty shrinks. These growth rates hold true when the logistic map exhibits chaotic behavior. Even for the Lorenz system there are regions in state space where uncertainties decrease, meaning forecasting the future is quite good in these regions even with chaotic dynamics (Shen et al. 2018).

In actual-world forecasting, scientists deal with finite uncertainties and their growth, often not computing Lyapunov exponents. Consider a typical weather forecasting scenario. Scientists take measurements of the initial state of their system (e.g., temperature, pressure, humidity, etc. in some region) yielding ensembles of initial conditions. One reason they have to deal with ensembles is all measurements have accuracy limitations introducing some uncertainties into the observed values. Scientists then use data assimilation processes to transform observations into the model state space (remember the faithful model assumption §1.1.3). This forms a model of the initial conditions for the forecasting model. Using these they can run their forecasting model to produce an ensemble forecast: On 30% of the model runs using the ensembles, rain is predicted for Washington, D. C. tomorrow.

The chaotic dynamics of weather systems is a real thing, but scientists have techniques for coaxing good, useful forecasting for such systems over the near and medium-range future. Your evening weather forecast is still quite useful even though chaotic dynamics exists. Hence, the idea that chaotic systems are unpredictable is a myth.

There is no consensus regarding a precise definition of chaotic behavior among mathematicians and scientists, although mathematicians often prefer Chaos\(_{d}\) and scientists typically prefer Chaos\(_{\lambda}\). The latter definition, however, is trivially false for finite uncertainties in actual-world systems (Supplement: Global Lyapunov Exponents) and of limited applicability for mathematical models unless reformulated using average Lyapunov exponents. Different definitions have varying strengths and weaknesses regarding tradeoffs on generality, theorem generation and proving, calculation ease, number of counterexamples, and so forth. The best candidates for necessary conditions for chaos still appear to be (1) something like chaos\(_{d\text{exp}}\) or (2) the presence of stretching and folding mechanisms. Chaos\(_{d\text{exp}}\) may function as a sufficient condition for chaos in many circumstances.

These definitions may only hold for our mathematical models, but not be applicable to actual-world systems. Formal definitions seek to fully characterize chaotic behavior in mathematical models, but we’re also interested in capturing chaotic behavior in physical and biological systems. Phenomenologically, actual-world systems exhibit features such as SDIC, aperiodicity, predictive limits, instability under small perturbations, and apparent randomness. Since target systems run for only finite time and uncertainties are always larger than infinitesimal, such systems violate the assumptions necessary for deriving global Lyapunov exponents. Even if we have good statistical measures yielding on-average exponential growth in uncertainties for a data set, what guarantees that this corresponds with the exponential growth of Chaos\(_{\lambda}\)? After all, any growth in uncertainties can be fitted with an exponential. If there is no physical significance to global Lyapunov exponents (because they only apply to infinitesimal uncertainties), then one is free to choose any parameter to fit an exponential for the growth in uncertainties. One needs the control provided by calculating local Lyapunov exponents (preferably by variational methods).

Are our attempts at definitions inadequate? Is there only one definition for chaos, and if so, is it only a mathematical property or also a physical one? Do we, perhaps, need multiple definitions (some of which are inequivalent) to adequately characterize such complex and intricate behavior? Is it reasonable to expect that the phenomenological features of chaos of interest to physicists and applied mathematicians can be captured in precise mathematical definitions given that there may be irreducible vagueness in the characterization of these features? From a physical point of view, is a phenomenological characterization sufficient for the purpose of identifying and exploring underlying mechanisms responsible for the stretching and folding of trajectories? Answers to these questions largely lie in our inquiry purposes (e.g., proving rigorous mathematical theorems vs. detecting chaotic behavior in physical data vs. designing systems to control such behavior).

Chaos only exists in nonlinear systems (at least for classical macroscopic systems; see Supplement: Quantum Chaos for quantum chaos subtleties). Nonlinearity is a necessary condition for stretching and folding mechanisms, so would seem to be a necessary condition for chaotic behavior. Yet, there’s an alternative way to characterize systems in which such stretching and folding takes place: nonseparability.

As discussed in §1.1.5, linear systems always obey the principle of linear superposition. The Hamiltonians describing such systems are always separable. A separable Hamiltonian can be transformed into a sum of separate Hamiltonians with one element in the sum corresponding to each subsystem. In effect, the interactions among subsystems can be transformed away leaving the subsystems independent of each other. The whole is the sum of the parts, as it were. Chaos is impossible for separable Hamiltonians.

By contrast, interactions in nonlinear systems cannot be decomposed into individual independent subsystems. Consequently the whole system and its environment cannot be ignored. Nonseparable classical systems are where chaotic behavior can manifest itself. Therefore, one could say that nonseparability of a Hamiltonian is a necessary condition for stretching and folding mechanisms and, hence, for chaos (e.g., Kronz 1998). The nonseparability of Hamiltonians may be more relevant for understanding potential quantum chaotic behavior.

As a practical matter, mathematicians and scientists describe and apply various definitions of chaos to both the character of the state space trajectories issuing forth from initial conditions as well as to the equations defining the dynamical systems. What one wants to avoid are overly simple “tests” for chaos that risk simply finding some form of exponential growth in a noisy data set and pronouncing that “chaos” as one measure is up to the task (e.g. Toker, Sommer, and D’Esposito 2020).

## 2. What is Chaos “Theory”?

One often finds references in the literature to “chaos theory.” For instance, Kellert characterizes chaos theory as “the qualitative study of unstable aperiodic behavior in deterministic nonlinear systems” (Kellert 1993, p. 2). Is chaos a theory in the same sense that electrodynamics or quantum mechanics (QM) are theories?

One difficultly answering such questions is the lack of consensus about what a theory is (see the entry on the structure of scientific theories) . Scientists often treat theories as systematic bodies of knowledge that provide explanations and predictions for actual-world phenomena. Being more precise than this generates significant differences for how to conceptualize theories. Options range from axiomatic or syntactic views of the logical empiricists (see the entry on the Vienna Circle) to semantic or model-theoretic views (see the entry on models in science), to Kuhnian (see the entry on Thomas Kuhn) and less rigorous conceptions of theories. Axiomatic views appear to be inapplicable to chaos. There are no chaos axioms—no chaos laws—no deductive structures, no linking of observational statements to theoretical statements in the chaos literature. Meanwhile, there are many chaotic models but these occur in a variety of scientific theories and no shortage of popularizations referring to chaos as a “new paradigm.”

Kellert’s (1993) focus on chaos models is suggestive of semantic views, and much chaos literature focuses on models. Briefly, on semantic views, a theory is characterized by (1) a set of models and (2) hypotheses linking models with idealized physical systems. The mathematical models discussed in the literature are concrete and fairly well understood, but what about the hypotheses linking chaos models with idealized physical systems? In the chaos literature, there’s a great deal of discussion of various robust or universal patterns and the kinds of predictions that can or cannot be made using chaotic models. Moreover, there’s a lot of emphasis on qualitative predictions, geometric mechanisms, and patterns, but this all comes up short of spelling out hypotheses linking chaos models with idealized physical systems.

Chaos models are deployed to ascertain various kinds of information about bifurcation points, period doubling sequences, the onset of chaotic dynamics, strange attractors, and other denizens of the chaos zoo. Hypotheses connecting chaos models to actual-world systems need filling in if we’re to employ the semantic conception fully (e.g., how strange attractors reconstructed from physical data relate to the physical system from which the data were originally recorded).

Currently no good candidates for laws of chaos over and above the laws
of classical physics exist, and some, such as Kellert, explicitly deny
chaos laws exist (1993, ch. 4). Furthermore, the relationship between
the state spaces of chaotic models and the spaces of idealized
physical systems is quite delicate, a dissimilarity with analytical
mechanics. In analytical mechanics, we seem to be able to translate
between models and state
spaces.^{[7]}
In chaotic dynamics, we can derive a state space for chaotic models
from the full nonlinear model (e.g., using a Poincaré surface
of section), but we cannot reverse the process and get back to the
nonlinear model state space using that generated chaotic model. One
might expect the hypotheses connecting chaos models with idealized
physical systems to piggy back on the hypotheses connecting classical
physics models with their corresponding idealized physical systems.
But it’s unclear how this would work in the case of nonlinear
models in classical physics let alone for chaotic models in biology,
economics and other
disciplines.^{[8]}

Problems arise from thinking about the faithful model assumption:
What’s the relationship between model and target system? Is it
one-to-one as standardly assumed? Or is it one-to-many (several
different nonlinear models of the same target system or, potentially,
vice versa) or a
many-to-many?^{[9]}
When linear models or force functions are used in Newton’s
second law, the translation between model and target system appears to
be straightforwardly one-to-one. In nonlinear contexts, where one
might construct a model from data generated by observing a system,
potentially many nonlinear models can be constructed, where each model
is empirically adequate to the system behavior. Is there really only
one unique model for each target system and we simply don’t know
the True one (say, because of underdetermination problems—see
the entry on
scientific realism
and see the entry on
underdetermination of scientific theory)?
Or is there really no one-to-one relationship between mathematical
models and target systems?

Moreover, an important feature of semantic views is that models are only intended to capture crucial features of target systems and always involve various forms of abstraction and idealization (see the entry on models in science). Any errors in nonlinear models for such systems, no matter how accurate our initial data, lead to errors in predicting actual-world systems over time. This highlights a problem with the faithful model assumption masked in the context of linear systems: Models can be erroneous by leaving out “negligible” factors and, at least for reasonable times, our model predictions don’t differ significantly from target systems behavior (wait long enough, however, and such predictions will differ significantly, though this length of time may exceed time scales of interest). In nonlinear contexts, by contrast, it’s not clear there are any “negligible” factors. The smallest omission in nonlinear models can lead to disastrous effects because of the differences these terms would have made versus their absence (see §3).

Another possibility is to drop hypotheses connecting models with target systems and simply focus on models themselves in the spirit of the mathematical theory of dynamical systems. The focus is on models and their relations, but little emphasis on hypotheses connecting with actual systems, idealized or otherwise. Unfortunately, this would mean that chaos theory is only a theory about models.

Both syntactic and semantic views of theories focus on the formal structure of theoretical bodies of knowledge, and their “fit” with theorizing about chaotic dynamics seems quite problematic. In contrast, perhaps one should conceive of chaos theory in a more informal or paradigmatic way, say along the lines of Kuhn’s (1996) analysis of scientific paradigms (see the section on the concept of a paradigm in the entry on Thomas Kuhn) No emphasis on the precise structure of scientific theories; rather, theories are cohesive, systematic bodies of knowledge defined by the roles they play in normal science practice within a dominant paradigm. A very strong sense in chaos literature is that a “new paradigm” has emerged emphasizing unstable rather than stable behavior, dynamical patterns rather than mechanisms, universal features (e.g., Feigenbaum’s constant) rather than laws, and qualitative understanding rather than precise prediction.

## 3. Nonlinear Models, Faithfulness, and Confirmation

Scientists consider models to be simplified mathematical descriptions of key variables and processes of target systems under study. There’s a tight connection between the model used to produce a weather or Sunspot forecast, say, and the state space of variables thought important to track. This is the faithful model assumption, a direct enough correspondence between model state in state space and the actual-world’s possible states through these key variables and processes.

Invoking the faithful model assumption, there are two basic approaches
to model confirmation discussed in the philosophical literature on
modeling following a strategy known as piecemeal
improvement.^{[10]}
One basic approach focuses on successive refinements to the accuracy
of initial data while keeping the model fixed (e.g., Koperski 1998).
As uncertainty in the initial data is reduced, a faithful
model’s behavior should converge to the target system’s
behavior. The faithful model assumption implies that if one plots the
trajectory of the target system in an appropriate state space, model
trajectories in the same state space should monotonically become more
like the system trajectories on some measure as the data is refined.^{[11]}

The other basic approach focuses on successive model refinements while keeping the initial data fixed (e.g., Koperski 1998). After all, if a model is faithful in reproducing the behavior of the target system, refining the model should produce even better fit with the target system’s behavior. Again, the faithful model assumption implies that if one were to plot target system trajectories in an appropriate state space, model trajectories in the same state space should monotonically become more like the system’s as the model is made more realistic.

Piecemeal strategies’ intuitive appeal for linear models is clear: Small changes in the magnitude of a variable are guaranteed to yield proportional changes in model output. Making small improvements in a faithful linear model “in the right direction” in either initial data or the model can be tracked by improved model performance. The qualifier “in the right direction,” drawing upon the faithful model assumption, means the data quality and accuracy really is increased or the model really is more realistic (captures more features of the target system in an increasingly accurate way), and is signified by the model’s monotonically improved performance with respect to the target system.

Nonetheless, piecemeal approaches encounter serious difficulties in
nonlinear contexts, where the principle of linear superposition fails.
Successive small refinements in initial data used by nonlinear models
isn’t guaranteed to lead to convergence between model and target
system behaviors. Small refinements “in the right
direction” aren’t guaranteed to lead to a nonlinear model
monotonically improving in capturing the target system’s
behavior; it can lead to model behavior diverging away from system
behavior.^{[12]}

Similarly, keeping data fixed but making successive model refinements isn’t guaranteed to lead to convergence between model and target system behaviors. With loss of linear superposition, small changes in the model can lead to non-proportional changes in model behavior. Even if a small refinement is made “in the right direction,” there’s no guarantee nonlinear models will monotonically improve in capturing target system behaviors. A small refinement can lead to model behavior diverging away from system behavior.

Intuitively, piecemeal convergence strategies look to be dependent on the perfect model framework. Given a perfect model, refining the quality of the data should lead to monotonic convergence between model and target system behaviors, but this expectation isn’t always justifiable for perfect models (cf. Judd and Smith 2001; Smith 2003). On the other hand, given good data, perfecting a model intuitively should lead to monotonic convergence between model and target system behaviors.

Even perfect models don’t live up to our intuitions (Judd and Smith 2001; Judd and Smith 2004). For example, no matter the number of system observations, there will be a set of trajectories in the model state space indistinguishable from the actual trajectory of the target system. Even for infinite past observations, we cannot eliminate the uncertainty in the epistemic states given some unknown ontological state of the target system. No matter how faithful the nonlinear model state space is to the physical possibilities of the target system, no matter how fine-grained the model state space, there will always be many more target system states than model states for any computational models since the equations must be discretized (Bishop 2023).

In principle, when we can develop a fully analytical model, there
could be an exact match between the number of possible model states
and target system states. However, such analytical models are rare in
complexity
studies.^{[13]}
Recall the shift map. As a mathematical model it’s
perfect—specifying periodic initial conditions for the map
result in periodic orbits with no uncertainty. Yet, specifying even
the smallest amount of uncertainty in the initial conditions leads to
rapid amplification of uncertainty in the map’s orbits.
Similarly, even a perfect nonlinear model will amplify any uncertainty
in initial conditions.

Therefore, perfect models don’t guarantee monotonic improvement
with respect to target system behavior. This is the upshot of the
failure of the principle of linear superposition. No matter how
faithful the model, no guarantee exists for piecemeal monotonic
improvement of nonlinear model behavior with respect to target
systems.^{[14]}

For nonlinear models, faithfulness can fail and piecemeal perfectibility cannot be guaranteed, raising questions about scientific modeling practices and our understanding of them when linear superposition fails. Similarly, policy assessment utilizing model forecasts (e.g., economic and pandemic modeling) is also affected by the same lack of guarantee as model confirmation. Such problems remain largely unexplored in philosophy of science, but there are mitigation strategies (Bishop 2023; Smith 2000).

Lack of perfect measurements further complicates nonlinear modeling for chaos in actual-world systems. While modeling discussions often assume it’s possible in principle to reduce measurement errors to arbitrary accuracy, this is more hope than sound reasoning. Suppose arbitrarily accurate measurement processes are possible. Perfect measurement accuracy still isn’t attainable because error reduction is a limiting process. Perfect measurement accuracy requires infinite precision for any chaotic model. As the supposed measurement process is refined, information storage needs will exceed the capacity of universe because the information needed to account for accuracy grows exponentially without limit.

Furthermore, there’s another limit to measurement accuracy: Any
measurement apparatus introduces some small disturbance into systems
being
measured.^{[15]}
Even if measurement inaccuracy is reduced to zero, the act of
measurement introduces disturbances into the True state of the system
being observed meaning uncertainty will be amplified (not to mention
small disturbances due to minute fluctuations in gravity and
electromagnetic fields owing to the movement of scientists and their
vehicles, etc.). Completely accounting for all these effects on
chaotic system exceeds the data storage capacity of the universe.

The upshot is that the perfect model framework underestimates difficulties dealing with uncertainty when modeling nonlinear systems exhibiting chaos. Scientists realize this and generally exercise care when analyzing and modeling actual-world situations.

## 4. Chaos, Determinism and Quantum Mechanics

Some authors have argued SDIC opens a door for quantum influences in
“infect” chaotic macroscopic systems (e.g., Barone et al.
1993; Hobbs 1991; Kellert
1993).^{[16]}
The central argument runs as follows and is known as the sensitive
dependence argument (SD argument):

- For systems exhibiting SDIC, trajectories starting in a highly localized region of state space will diverge on-average exponentially fast from one another.
- Quantum effects limit the precision with which physical systems
can be specified to a neighborhood in state space of no less than a
magnitude of \(1/(2\pi/h)^{N}\), where \(h\) is Plank’s constant
and \(N \) is the dimension of the system in
question.
^{[17]} - Given enough time, two trajectories of the same chaotic system will have future states localizable to a much larger region \(\delta\) in phase space (from (A) and (B)).
- Therefore, quantum effects will influence systems exhibiting SDIC leading to violations of unique evolution (§1.1.3).

As a concrete example, consider a damped driven pendulum exhibiting chaotic behavior so it’s sensitive to small effects. If a photon strikes the pendulum, in principle a minute amount of momentum from the photon can be transferred to the pendulum affecting the behavior of a macroscopic system.

The SD argument doesn’t go through as smoothly as its advocates claim, however. The appropriate version of QM (e.g., von Neumann, Bohmian, or decoherence theories; see the entry on quantum mechanics), the nature of quantum measurement theory (collapse vs. non-collapse theories; see the discussion of the measurement problem in the entry on philosophical issues in quantum theory), the selection of the initial state characterizing the system, and the system-apparatus cut must be resolved before one can say clearly whether unique evolution is violated (e.g., Bishop 2008). For example, if indeterminism in QM isn’t ontologically genuine, then whatever contribution quantum effects make to macroscopic systems exhibiting SDIC wouldn’t violate unique evolution. In contrast, if QM is genuinely indeterministic, then the possibility may exist for quantum effects to influence macroscopic system. However, damping due to friction can place constraints on how quickly amplification of quantum effects takes place before being completely washed out. Moreover, if the photon deposits its momentum contribution to a chaotic pendulum when the local Lyapunov exponents are negative, then the quantum effect will dissipate rather than amplify.

## 5. Questions about Realism and Explanation

Although not well explored in the context of chaos, there are interesting questions regarding both realism and explanation deserving further investigation.

### 5.1 Realism and Chaos

Is chaos only a property of mathematical models? Consider the Feigenbaum constant. Computing it for period doubling in physical systems, such as flowing fluids, chemical reactions, or lasers, yields values very close to \(-4.6992016091\), the value for the logistic map. Yet, the logistic map has no discernible relationship to these quite different physical systems.

Consider the damped driven pendulum. The mathematical model describing it exhibits chaos for some combinations of the values of parameters for the magnitude of friction and magnitude and frequency of driving force. Constructed pendula with these parameter values behave chaotically as the model predicts. Eventually, the magnitude of the working coefficient of friction and the driving frequency of the motor varies due to components heating up and chaotic behavior is lost. Chaotic behavior is persistent in our mathematical model while relatively short lived in physical pendula illustrating that mathematical models can often be inadequate representations of the material world even when relevant variables and parameters are included.

Given these actual-world phenomena, chaos raises a number of questions about scientific realism only some of which will be touched on here. First and foremost, scientific realism is usually formulated as a thesis about the status of unobservable terms in scientific theories and their relationship to actual-world entities and processes. But there are serious questions about formulating a theory of chaos (§2), let alone determining how this theory fares under scientific realism. It’s more reasonable to discuss some less ambitious realism questions regarding chaos: How well do our chaos models track with actual phenomena? Do the various denizens of chaos, such as fractals, actually exist?

Problems with Lyapunov exponents raise the tracking question. While it’s relatively straightforward to calculate exponents for simple mathematical systems, such as the Logistic map, it’s more difficult to calculate them for dynamical systems such as Lorenz’s equations. And it’s harder still—perhaps impossible sometimes—to measure Lyapunov exponents for physical systems using their time series data.

Another tracking question is illustrated by a peculiar geometric structure of dissipative chaotic models called a strange attractor, which can form based upon the stretching and folding of trajectories in state space. A characteristic feature of strange attractors is self-similar structure. Magnify any small portion of the attractor and the magnified portion looks identical to the original region. Magnify the magnified region and identical structure is repeated again. Continuous repetition of this process yields the same results over and over. An important geometric implication of self-similarity is that there’s no inherent size scale in state space so any magnification of a region of the attractor yields statistically similarly structure.

Strange attractors are often characterized by noninteger or fractal
dimension.^{[18]}
The type of dimensionality we encounter in everyday experience is
characterized by integers. A point has dimension zero; a line has
dimension one; a square has dimension two; a cube has dimension three
and so on. In contrast, the dimensionality of the butterfly strange
attractor for the Lorenz system in Figure 1 is 2.0627160 (Viswanath
2004).^{[19]}
The presence of strange attractors in Lorenz or time series data from
an experiment indicates the chaotic behavior under study is
dissipative (conserves neither state space volume nor energy) rather
than Hamiltonian (conserves both).

A warning is in order because detecting fractals in a time series doesn’t mean the dynamics of the system generating that time series is deterministic. For instance, the fractal dimension of the Cantor set is approximately 0.631, yet it’s possible to produce a nondeterministic generator for Cantor-like sets. Therefore, focusing on the fractal alone doesn’t imply a deterministic process produced it. This same example illustrates that detecting a fractal in a time series doesn’t guarantee the system producing it is chaotic. While dissipative chaotic systems will have fractal attractors, not all dissipative systems having fractal attractors will be chaotic (Ott 1992, pp. 233–236).

Although there’s no universally accepted definition for strange attractors or fractal dimension among mathematicians, the more serious question is whether strange attractors and fractal dimensions are properties of our models only or also of actual-world systems. For instance, empirical investigations of actual-world systems indicates there’s no infinitely repeating self-similar structure like that of strange attractors (Avnir, et al. 1998; Shenker 1994). Self-similar structure is repeated on only two or three spatial scales in the reconstructed state space. This is a prefractal, where self-similar structure only repeats on a finite number of length scales.

The dissipative chaotic models used to characterize some actual-world systems exhibit strange attractors with fractal geometries. What’s the relationship of infinite fractal geometries in chaotic model state spaces to the pre-fractal features of actual-world systems? Fractal features of such models clearly are false of target systems though the models themselves may still be useful for helping scientists locate interesting dynamics characterized by prefractal properties.

There are caveats to thinking fractals are fictions, however. The prefractal character of analyzed data sets could be an artifact of the way data is massaged before it’s analyzed or due to the analog-to-digital conversion that must take place before data analysis can begin. Reducing real-number-valued data to finite strings of digits would destroy fractal structure as would the conversion of real numbers to integers in measurement processes.

QM offers a reason to suspect physical systems cannot have such self-repeating structures “all the way down.” Strange attractors are supported in classical state spaces because an infinity of length scales supporting smooth curves are possible. Quantum state spaces, by contrast, cannot support infinitely fine length scales because of Planck’s constant. Hence, we’re applying a classical model carrying a tremendous amount of excess, fictitious structure to understand features of physical systems. One of the key structures playing a crucial role in chaos explanations—infinitely intricate structure of strange attractors—is absent from the corresponding physical system.

Peter Smith (1998, ch. 3) argues such false models are justified because the infinitely intricate structure of strange attractors (1) is the result of stretching and folding mechanisms, and (2) many of the points in state space of interest are invariant under this stretching and folding mechanism. The infinite structure is merely geometric extra baggage, but the stretching and folding leading to period-doubling sequences, onset of chaos, and so forth are real enough. This is an antirealist move about some key elements of explanation in chaos (§5.2) and has been criticized as such (Koperski 2001). Jeffrey Koperski (2001) has also challenged the strategy of throwing out what appears to be excess mathematical structure (e.g., strange attractors’ topological transitivity) when we need such structure for quasi-periodic attractors.

We’re back to the faithful model assumption: Model equations faithfully capture target systems’ behavior and model state spaces faithfully represent target systems’ actual possibilities. Is the sense of faithfulness that of actual correspondence between mathematical models and features of actual-world systems? Or can faithfulness be understood in terms of empirical adequacy alone, a primarily instrumentalist construal? Is a realist construal of faithfulness threatened by the mapping between models and systems potentially being one-to-many or many-to-many?

A related question is whether mathematical models are simulating or merely mimicking target system behavior. To simulate a system suggests there’s some genuine correspondence between a model and the actual-world target system it’s designed to capture. In contrast, to merely mimic the behavior of a target system suggests there’s no genuine correspondence to actual properties of the target system other than correlation. These issues become crucial for modern techniques of building nonlinear dynamical models from large time series data sets (e.g., Smith 1992). In such cases, after performing some tests on the data set, the modeler constructs a mathematical model reproducing the time series as the model’s output. Do such models only mimic behavior of target systems? What of realism?

What about an alternative account of realism, structural realism, which focuses on the causal structures in well-confirmed scientific hypotheses and theories? The kinds of universal structural features identified in chaotic phenomena in realms as diverse as physics, biology, and economics is suggestive of some form of structural realism and look to play key roles in chaos explanations. Significant questions about infinitely repeating self-similar structure not being realized in physical systems remains. One still faces the difficulty that strange attractors of our mathematical models are at best too gross an approximation to the structure of physical attractors and at worst terribly misleading.

Other kinds of geometric structures associated with chaos would qualify on a structural realist view. After all, it also seems to be the case that realism for chaos models has more to do with processes—namely stretching and folding mechanisms at work in target systems. But here the connection with realism and chaos models would come indirectly via an appeal to causal processes at work in the full nonlinear models taken to represent physical systems. Perhaps there is a way to arrive at more realistic chaos models via prefractal attractors.

### 5.2 The Nature of Chaos Explanations

Chaos is invoked as an explanation for or contributing substantially to actual-world behaviors such as epileptic seizures, heart fibrillation, neural processes, chemical reactions, weather, and industrial control processes. Chaotic dynamics is also invoked to explain features such as the actual trajectories exhibited in a given state space. But what’s the role chaos plays in these various explanations?

The nature of scientific explanation (see the entry on scientific explanation) in the literature on chaos is thoroughly under-discussed. Traditional accounts for scientific explanation such as covering-law, causal mechanical, and unification models all present drawbacks when applied to chaotic phenomena. For instance, if there are no universal laws lying at the heart of chaos explanations, covering-law models don’t look promising as candidates for chaos explanations.

Causal-mechanical models of explanation maintain that sciences provide understanding of diverse facts and events by showing how these fit into the causal structure of the world. If chaos is a behavior exhibited by nonlinear systems, then it’s reasonable to think there are some mechanisms or processes standing behind this behavior. Chaos is typically understood to be a property of the dynamics of such systems, and dynamics presumably reflects the processes at work and their interactions. Links between causal mechanisms and behaviors in the causal-mechanical model are supposed to be reliable connections along the following lines: If mechanism \(C\) is present, behavior \(B\) typically follows. Chaos explanations, then, provide reliable connections between mechanisms and the chaotic behavior exhibited by systems containing such mechanisms.

Unification accounts of explanation hold that sciences provide understanding of diverse facts and events by showing how these may result from a much smaller set of explanatory factors (e.g., laws or causes). One can argue chaos is a set of a limited number of patterns and tools (e.g., stretching and folding) for explaining characteristic behaviors found in diverse phenomena spread across physics, chemistry, biology, economics, social psychology, and so forth.

#### 5.2.1 Explanation, Faithful Models and Chaos

Typical causal and unification accounts presuppose theories are in place, where models of those theories play an explanatory role. In causal accounts, processes are key components of the models. In unification accounts, laws might be the ultimate explanatory factors, but we often connect laws with physical systems via processes. To be explanatory, however, such accounts must make the faithful model assumption; namely, that our models and state spaces are faithful representation of actual-world systems.

As discussed in §3, it’s not straightforward to confirm nonlinear models are good explanations when chaotic dynamics is present, because slight refinements to initial conditions or models can lead to markedly differing behavior. Therefore, on many standard approaches to model confirmation, it’s difficult to say when we have a good explanation even for perfect models (Judd and Smith 2001).

We could either search for processes yielding stretching and folding in the dynamics (causal form of explanation) or for common properties underlying the behavior of nonlinear systems of interest (unification form of explanation). Nevertheless, it appears that the properties to which one appeals on unification accounts pick out the patterns of chaos we want to understand: How do these properties arise? We want unification accounts that avoid citing the very phenomena in need of explanation as explanatory factors.

Suppose we appealed to strange attractors in our models or in state space reconstruction techniques. Modulo worries raised in §5.1, even if the presence of a strange attractor in the state space was both necessary and sufficient for a model being chaotic, this wouldn’t amount to an explanation of chaotic behavior in target systems. The strange attractor is an object in state space, which isn’t the same as saying that the actual system behaves as if there’s a strange attractor in the physical space of its activity. A trajectory in state space provides useful information about the target system (via the faithful model assumption). The presence of a strange attractor would only be a potential mark of chaos, not an explanation for why chaotic properties emerged.

At this point, a question implied at the end of the previous subsection arises: What’s effecting the unification in chaos explanations? Unification accounts typically posit an explanatory store of a relatively small number of laws or mechanisms serving to explain or unify a diverse set of phenomena. A standard example is that of Newtonian mechanics providing a small set of principles explaining phenomena as diverse as projectile motions, falling bodies, tides, planetary orbits, and pendula. If a unification construal of chaos explanations only focuses on the mathematical similarities in behaviors of diverse phenomena (e.g., period doubling route to chaos or SDIC), then one can question whether the relevant sense of unification is in play in chaos explanations. If unification is supposed to be achieved through underlying mechanisms producing these mathematical and geometrical features, then the explanatory store appears to be very large and heterogeneous—the mechanisms in physics are different from those in biology, are different from those in ecology, are different from those in social psychology. In this light, the causal-mechanical model appears to make more sense for characterizing the nature of chaos explanations.

#### 5.2.2 Chaos and Understanding

In contrast to causal explanation, Kellert argues what’s new about chaos explanations is qualitative understanding. He argues this is achieved by constructing, elaborating, and applying simple dynamical models (1993, ch. 4). Kellert gives three points of contrast between qualitative understanding and what he takes to be the standard approach to scientific explanation. First, chaos explanations involve holistic rather than microreductionist models seeking to break systems down into constituent parts looking for law-like relations among them. In contrast, mathematical tools of chaotic dynamics are holistic yielding information about the behavior of the model system as a whole not readily apparent from the nonlinear equations of the model themselves. Second, he argues deductive explanatory schemes are irrelevant because chaos studies appeal to computer simulations due to the difficulty or even impossibility of deducing chaotic behavior of a system from the model equations (e.g., no proof of SD for the Lorenz model equations). Third, when linear superposition fails, full specification of an instantaneous state of the system plus the equations of motion doesn’t yield all needed information, for example, if there are memory effects (hysteresis), or measurement acts introducing disturbances that SDIC can amplify. Chaos explanations must take model histories as well as a model for the uncertainty into account.

Kellert argues the understanding achieved in chaos explanations involves (1) predictions of qualitative behavior rather than quantitative detail, (2) geometric mechanisms rather than causal processes, and (3) patterns rather than law-like necessity.

Support for (1) comes from Kellert focusing on the practices of
scientists predicting when qualitative features of the nonlinear
dynamics undergo sudden changes (e.g., control parameter
values^{[20]}
at which various bifurcations occur, the onset of chaos, the return
of periodic orbits) rather than studying the precise values of system
variables. Yet, rather precise predictions can be made for chaotic
models such as the logistic map. Kellert underestimates the
quantitative detail mathematicians and scientists study in these
models.

Kellert is on safer ground arguing for (2), where the kinds of mechanisms on which chaos explanations focus aren’t causal, but geometric. As Koperski (2001) points out, trajectories on strange attractors “can only move through state [space] points that are ’already there’” in the sense that the possibilities for states are already described by the state space and its related evolution equations; strange attractors add nothing that isn’t already present in the possibilities encompassed by the evolution equations (p. 698).

Regarding (3), chaos studies do study patterns rather than proposing revisions to physical laws as relativity and QM did. The focus is on techniques for analysis at the length scale of wholes where interesting phenomenological regularities exist which cannot be probed by microreductionist approaches. But at first blush, this may not count against the microreductionist in anything other than an epistemological sense (§6.2).

Kellert, contrasts dynamical understanding focused on causal
explanation through full nonlinear models with chaos explanations
pursuing understanding using reduced equations derived through various
techniques, though still based on the full nonlinear equations. This
contrast suggests there’s a kind of unification going on in
chaos explanation after all: A set of patterns serves as the
explanatory or unificatory features uniting qualitative understanding
across a very diverse set of phenomena and
disciplines.^{[21]}
In turn, this suggests a further possibility: A causal account of
explanation is more appropriate when focusing on the full model, while
a unification account of phenomenology and patterns is more
appropriate when focusing on the reduced chaotic model. In the latter
case, understanding is achieved not because the model trajectories are
isomorphic to the system trajectories; rather, because there’s a
topological or geometric similarity between the models and systems
being modeled. This is a different version of the faithful model
assumption in that now the topological/geometric features of target
systems are taken to be faithfully represented by our chaotic
models.

### 5.3 Taking Stock

Kellert’s discussion of “dynamic understanding” highlights that various robust or universal features of chaos are important for chaos studies. Focusing on universal features, such as patterns, critical parameter values, and so forth, suggest some form of unification could be at work in chaos explanations: group together all examples of chaotic behavior via universal patterns and other features.

Kellert argues we understand how chaos arises when we can point to a period doubling sequence or to the presence of a strange attractor, for instance. But this only provides distinguishing marks for chaos rather than yielding genuine insight into what causes the behavior. he eschews causes regarding chaos explanations and there’s a fairly straightforward reason for this: Simplified mathematical models, such as the baker’s map or derived from Poincaré surface of section techniques, make no references to causes. Hence, whether causal, unificationist, or some other approach to scientific explanation best capture chaos research remains open.

Moreover, since all these simplified models use the same mathematics, is it surprising to see the same patterns arise over and over again in disparate models? After all, if all the traces of processes and interactions—the causes—have been removed from chaos models, as Kellert suggests, chaos models in physics, biology, economics, and social psychology should exhibit similar behavior. If it really boils down to the same mathematics in all the models, then what are we actually coming to understand? On the other hand, perhaps chaos studies are uncovering universal patterns in the actual world, not just in mathematics. Identifying and describing these universal patterns with similar mathematics is one thing; explaining them is another. This challenge, too, is similar for understanding the role of universality classes in explanations in condensed matter physics and quantum field theory.

## 6. Some Broader Implications of Chaos

### 6.1 Chaos and Determinism

Mathematically, chaos is a property of dynamical systems which are
deterministic
(§1.1.1)^{[22]},
yet some think chaos reflects a form of indeterminism. Chaotic
systems are notorious for unpredictability, and some, such as Karl
Popper (1950), have argued unpredictability implies indeterminism.
Yet, this identifies determinism (an ontological property) with
predictability (an epistemic property).

Physicist turned Anglican priest John Polkinghorne drew on critical
realism to argue that SDIC creates an ontological openness of complex
dynamical systems to influences not fully accounted for in physics
descriptions leading to a failure of determinism (1989). Physicist
Boris Chirikov, of Chirikov standard map fame, claims chaos “has
destroyed the deterministic image of … classical physics” (1992,
p. 9). Nevertheless, unique evolution is preserved in our mathematical
models of chaos, the ontic descriptions of chaotic
systems.^{[23]}

What could challenge the determinism of actual-world systems? Presumed connections between nonlinear dynamical systems and target systems are one possibility. Mathematical modeling requires distinctions between variables and parameters as well as between systems and boundaries. However, without linear superposition such distinctions become problematic as illustrated throughout this article. This situation raises questions about our epistemic access to systems and models in the investigation of complex systems, but also challenges inferring determinism of target systems based on these models: For nonlinear systems the faithful model assumption (§1.1.3) raises difficulties for inferring the determinism of the target system from the deterministic character of the model.

Consider relationships between model and target system. There’s no general guarantee this relationship is one-to-one even for the most faithful model. The relationship may actually be many-to-one or many-to-many. A many-to-one relationship raises problems. For instance, it’s not uncommon for different modeling groups to develop models for the same project, with some being deterministic models while others are nondeterministic models.

Perhaps determinism is context-dependent as illustrated by the stark differences between the character of the macroscopic and microscopic realms. The physics of the macroscopic is filled with material systems well-described by deterministic models. Meanwhile, QM is filled with material systems well-described by indeterministic models. The algebras of observables and related state spaces of macroscopic and microscopic systems are different representing distinct kinds of contexts. Furthermore, there are reasons to think that even in the macroscopic realm conditions establishing deterministic contexts may not always hold (e.g., Bishop 2024; Earman 1986; Jones 1990; Koperski 2020). For instance, there are conditions under which unique evolution fails in Newtonian gravity (e.g., Xia 1992).

Determinism as context dependent implies that if determinism is a necessary condition for chaos in mathematical models, then we would expect it to be a necessary condition for chaotic dynamics in actual-world systems, returning us to our realism discussion.

### 6.2 Chaos and Emergence

Relating quantum and classical domains is more nuanced than usually appreciated. While this relationship, along with philosophy of mind, is classic territory for emergence debates (e.g., Bedau and Humphreys 2008; Gibb, Hendry, and Lancaster 2019), chaos exhibits marks of emergence. For instance, it isn’t found in QM but arises in macroscopic/classical systems with algebras of observables and state spaces distinct from those of QM.

The Born-Oppenheimer procedure in quantum chemistry illustrates how chaos only appears for appropriate classical observables and state spaces (Supplement: Quantum Chaos, §Q3.1). The quantum-to-classical transition is singular requiring physical stability conditions such as large disparity between nuclear and electron masses and motions as well as three spatial dimensions, among others. Even in semi-classical mechanics, classical signatures of chaos only emerge if classical state spaces and observables arise.

Tunneling provides another example (Supplement: Quantum Chaos, §Q3.2). Similar to how chaos in classical billiards constrains the possible behaviors of quantum billiards models, chaos and the structure of the corresponding classical state spaces constrain tunneling behavior in corresponding quantum models, an unexpected relationship based on typical textbook presentations of QM and the correspondence principle.

Some marks of classical chaos can be found in Bohmian mechanics (Supplement: Quantum Chaos, §Q3). Yet even here, marks of emergence are found in the quantum/classical algebra of observables and mixed state space arising from the stability condition of having trajectories with classical position and momentum observables.

Quantum chaology has a subtle, complicated relationship to classical chaos that isn’t captured by reductionism. Marks and tools of quantum chaology have no direct correspondence to marks and tools of classical chaos, nor are the latter marks and tools results of limiting procedures from the quantum domain to the macroscopic. Even, the replacement of classical observables by quantum operators already entails an ontological shift in states and observables as well as in the relevant state spaces bearing no resemblance to an approximation relation.

Then consider the phenomenon of classical chaos and its tools of study. Lyapunov exponents, for instance, are only definable in dynamical systems under appropriate limits and conditions corresponding to classical state spaces and trajectories. Despite some confusion in the quantum chaology literature, Lyapunov exponents are a classical concept and a mathematical object definable only for classical dynamical systems.

Furthermore, chaotic dynamics only emerges under particular parameter values for both mathematical models and actual-world systems exhibiting unique evolution. Features such as determinism and parameters are relevant as stability conditions for when SDIC, aperiodicity, and other signatures of chaos emerge from regular system behavior.

It’s often the case that the only ontological form of emergence
contrasted with reductionism is so-called strong or radical emergence,
where brute inexplicable bridge laws or causal powers come into
existence with no connection to any other properties, laws, or
activities at other temporal and length scales (e.g., Broad 1925;
Hendry 2019; Symons
2018).^{[24]}
However, such emergence accounts yield a disunified world with
radically emergent properties and entities. Chaos isn’t a
disconnected phenomenon along these radical lines.

Alternative ontological accounts of emergence rooted in the sciences and scientific practice offer frameworks for situating chaotic dynamics in a unified understanding. For instance, transformational emergence emphasizes dynamical transformations, where smaller-scale properties and constituents disappear in the formation of new larger-scale properties or entities, or emergent wholes transform the dynamics and properties of smaller-scale properties or entities (Humphreys 2016; Santos 2015 and 2020). Contextual emergence emphasizes multi-scale relations and the roles of stability conditions not given at smaller length and shorter time scales that nevertheless constrain or enable properties, entities, and processes at these smaller/shorter scales, making modal changes to possibility and actualization at these latter scales (Bishop, Silberstein, and Pexton 2022). Such ontological accounts capture the emergent phenomena of chaos in intelligible ways exhibiting order and unity.

### 6.3 Chaos, Laws, and Causation

Kellert’s line on explanation (§5.2) questions the relevance of laws and causation for chaotic dynamics. Chaos exhibits an exquisite order and since the 17th century laws of nature have been conceived of as the source of order in the universe. The two main traditions for analyzing laws of nature are: (1) nomological realist accounts, where laws have metaphysical existence and enforce patterns and regularities on properties and processes in nature; and (2) regularity accounts, where patterns and relations observed in nature exist with no additional necessity or metaphysical glue needed to enforce or sustain them.

Nomological realist accounts often invoke a form of necessity or “governance.” Chaos challenges these intuitions. For instance, one might argue that equations of a system govern its behavior, but as we’ve seen equations simpliciter don’t fulfil this expectation. Chaotic behavior is sensitive to particular parameter values and, within this context, SDIC. Nevertheless, parameter values don’t govern behavior any more than the value of \(\pi\) governs the circumference of a circle. One might argue the stretching and folding properties of dynamics underlying chaos are reflections of dynamical laws governing systems. This leads to concluding there are no genuine chaos laws; instead, chaos results from interaction among various dynamical laws subject to specific parameter values.

Regularity accounts differ based on how they cash out the nature of which regularities count as laws, such as best systems or supervenience approaches. There’s some form of determination going on in chaotic dynamics. For instance, chaos exhibited in classical models plays some determining role in the behavior of the corresponding quantum models, such as modifying tunneling rates. However, the determination relation runs in the opposite direction of the supervenience intuition in these cases from the larger-scale classical phenomena to the micro-scale quantum phenomena.

Dynamical laws have been an important class of scientific laws in both traditions. Such laws are often conceived as either governing or describing the history of state transitions a system makes given some initial and boundary conditions. Nonlinear dynamics and chaos won’t settle debates among adherents to these two traditions. Nonetheless, chaotic dynamics, its properties, and practices associated with its study may suggest an alternative approach to understanding the regularities in question.

Consider Newton’s second law, \(F=ma\) , where \(F\) is a model for the force acting on a particle, \(a\) the acceleration or rate of change of the particle’s velocity, and \(m\) the particle’s mass. Instead of thinking of the force as “governing” the particle’s behavior, or of the particle’s behavior as supervening on the force, the modeling of forces and system states in physics typically is carried out in terms of energy, constraints and affordances. Such models are defined over state spaces delimiting the range of possibilities for the system. Newton’s law constrains the action of forces along with other constraints and affordances (e.g., Koperski 2020, pp. 101–104, 134, 155–156; Bishop, Silberstein, and Pexton 2022, sec. 7.8; Adlam, E. 2022). These factors are physical, dimensional (e.g., many forces behave differently in two dimensions versus three), dynamical (e.g., due to system dynamics arising over time), and so forth. These different stability conditions define the particulars of a physical context for system behaviors. In fluid convection, for instance, emergent large-scale fluid rotation constrains possible motions of smaller-scale fluid molecules under the action of gravity (Bishop 2024).

In short, physical laws, such as the two-way speed of light in vacuum, may delineate bounds of possibility; they don’t determine concrete actualization of any of those delineated possibilities. More features of actual-world contexts are needed for particular actualizations.

Chaotic dynamics behaves as stability conditions while also being shaped by laws and other features of context. For example, parameter values can prevent chaos from arising, but for parameter values enabling chaos, chaotic dynamics constrains system constituents from behaving regularly in particular regions of state space. These situations involve lawlike relations structuring possibility spaces while parameter values determine when possibilities for irregular motion arise. None of the laws relevant for the systems in question determine parameter values; rather, parameter values function as stability conditions for the existence/nonexistence of chaos within the space of possibility. Moreover, tunneling and other behaviors in quantum models are modified by the corresponding classical chaotic dynamics.

Similarly for causation. One can offer counterfactual analyses of system behavior, based on presence or absence of chaotic dynamics. Or one can offer process accounts of causation (e.g., Dowe 2000; Salmon 1984), focusing on chaotic processes. Or one could offer probabilistic accounts for how various factors raise the probability for a system to exhibit chaotic behavior or for the presence of chaos to raise or lower the chances of an expected outcome. And so forth. Each account has something to recommend it in particular circumstances and some may combine in contexts to yield more insight.

Perhaps Kellert’s form of understanding (§5.2.2) can be related to how affordance and constraint function in the possibilities offered by state spaces and actual-world systems. For instance, trajectories caught in a strange attractor in state space are constrained to remain on the attractor and can no longer exhibit regular behavior. These possibilities have been excluded, while the possibilities for a wide variety of irregular behavior are now accessible. For trajectories away from the strange attractor, irregular behavior is impossible yet a variety of regular behavior is available. The faithful model assumption is needed to transfer these insights from constraint and affordance in models to their actual-world counterparts. Nevertheless, physical models, such as damped driven pendulums, are able to exhibit chaotic motion so long as parameters remain in value ranges enabling chaotic but closing off regular motion. Reduction/emergence issues are relevant here as well.

### 6.4 Consciousness and Free Will

Several authors have looked to QM to help explain consciousness and free will (e.g., Beck and Eccles 1992; Compton 1935; Eccles 1970; Kane 1996; Penrose 1991, 1994 and 1997; Stapp 1993; quantum consciousness). Interplay between SDIC in macroscopic systems and quantum effects provide opportunities for quantum effects to influence such systems (see §4). SD arguments purport to demonstrate that chaos in classical systems can amplify quantum fluctuations. Suppose chaotic dynamics could amplify quantum events causing a single neuron to fire that wouldn’t otherwise. If the brain is also in a chaotic dynamical state, making it sensitive to small disturbances, this additional neural firing could be amplified causing brain states to evolve differently than if the neuron hadn’t fired affecting human choices.

While the presence of chaos in the brain and its operations is an empirical matter that’s hotly debated, these discussions typically assume SD or Chaos\(_{\lambda}\) as the definition of chaos. All that’s really needed for sensitivity to and amplification of quantum effects in the brain is the loss of superposition found in nonlinear systems. Yet, these kinds of sensitivity arguments depend on how QM and measurements are interpreted as well as the status of indeterminism (§4). Furthermore, applying SD arguments to concrete physical systems indicates amplification processes may be severely constrained. In the case of the brain, we currently don’t know all the constraints on amplification, but large amounts of parallel redundancy in brain regions and neural networks make changes in one neuron’s firing unlikely to be amplified to any appreciable degree affecting neural dynamics.

Whether such approaches to understanding the nature of consciousness and free will represent genuine advances remains an open question. For instance, if the world is deterministic, then the invocation of SDIC in cognitive dynamics (e.g., Kane 1996) may provide a sophisticated framework for exploring deliberative processes, but wouldn’t be sufficient for incompatibilist notions of freedom. If indeterminism (quantum mechanical or otherwise) is operative in the brain, the challenge remains for indeterminists, such Robert Kane (1996), to demonstrate agents can effectively harness such indeterminism by utilizing the exquisite sensitivity provided by nonlinear dynamics to explain free will. Questions about realism and explanation in chaotic dynamics are relevant here as well as the faithful model assumption and emergence.

There has also been relevant work applying the perspective of dynamical systems to cognition and action, drawing explicitly on such properties as attractors, bifurcations, SDIC, and other denizens of the chaos zoo (e.g., van Gelder 1995; Juarrero 1999 and 2023; Kelso 1995; Port and van Gelder 1995; Tsuda 2001). The basic idea is deploying the nonlinear dynamics framework for interpreting neural and cognitive activity as well as complex behavior. The aim is that patterns of neural, cognitive, and human activity can be explained as resulting from nonlinear dynamical processes involving causal interactions, constraints, and affordances at multiple length and time scales (e.g., neurons, brains, bodies, physical environments). Such approaches are highly suggestive, but also face challenges. For instance, the nature of neural and cognitive dynamics is still much disputed. Ultimately, it’s an empirical matter whether these dynamics are largely nonlinear though more evidence has been gathered in recent decades suggesting the appropriate nonlinearity (e.g., Anderson 2010; Chemero and Silberstein 2008; Stam 2006; Pesenson 2013; Shettigar et al. 2022; Juarrero 2023). Again, questions about realism and explanation in chaotic dynamics are relevant here as well as the faithful model assumption and emergence.

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## Other Internet Resources

- Chaos, from Wolfram MathWorld.
- Lyapunov Characteristic Exponent, from Wolfram MathWorld.