#### Supplement to Chaos

## Global Lyapunov Exponent

One way to get a handle on global Lyapunov exponents is to see how they arise out of linear stability analysis of the trajectories of evolution equations. Consider the first-order, ordinary differential equation system \(d\bx/dt = \bF\bx\) and suppose that \(\bx^*\) is a steady point, i.e. a point at which \(\bF(\bx^*) = 0\). We can study the behavior of trajectories near \(\bx^*\) by considering \(\bx(t) = \bx^* + \varepsilon(t)\), where \(\varepsilon(t)\) is an infinitesimal perturbation to every component of \(\bx\). Substituting back into \(\bF\) and expanding to first order in \(\varepsilon(t)\) (considering only the perturbations at \(t = 0\) and dropping the explicit dependence on \(t\) from \(\varepsilon)\) yields

\[\tag{A1} \bF(\bx^* + \varepsilon) = \bF(\bx^*) + \bJ(\bx^*)\varepsilon + O(\varepsilon^2), \]where the matrix \(\bJ(\bx)\) is the \(n\times n\) Jacobian matrix of partial derivatives of \(\bF\) evaluated at the point \(\bx\). We then obtain an equation for the time dependence of the perturbation of \(\bx\), namely

\[\tag{A2} \frac{d\varepsilon}{dt} = \bJ(\bx^*)\varepsilon + O(\varepsilon^2). \]A linear stability analysis results if we neglect terms of \(\varepsilon^{2}\) or higher powers in (A2). If \(\varepsilon\) is a real-valued vector and \(\bJ\) a real-valued matrix (i.e., having no complex values), and we assume a solution of the form \(\varepsilon = \lambda e^{st}\), (A2) reduces to the eigenvalue equation

\[\tag{A3} \bJ\lambda = s\lambda. \]Linear stability analysis can be used to characterize Lyapunov exponents for nonlinear systems of equations. Consider the initial condition \(\bx(0)\) for our first-order system of differential equations and an infinitesimal displacement from \(\bx(0)\) in the direction of some tangent vector, \(\by(0)\). Then the evolution of \(\by\) according to (A2) is given by

\[\tag{A4} \frac{d\by}{dt} = \bJ(\bx)\cdot\by, \]valid for only an infinitesimal neighborhood about \(\bx(0)\). So the value of the vector \(\by\) changes in time according to the values \(\bJ\) takes on over time. Here \(\by/|\by|\) gives the direction of the infinitesimal displacement from \(\bx\), where the bars indicate absolute magnitude. Additionally, \(|\by|/|\by(0)|\) gives the factor by which the infinitesimal displacement grows (|\(\by|\gt |\by\)(0)|) or shrinks (|\(\by|\lt |\by\)(0)|). The Lyapunov exponent is now defined with respect to initial condition \(\bx\)(0) and initial orientation of the infinitesimal displacement \(\by(0)/|\by(0)|\) as

\[\begin{align*}\tag{A5} \lambda(\bx(0), \frac{\by}{\by(0)}) &= \lim_{t\rightarrow \infty} t^{-1} \ln\left(\frac{d\by/dt}{\by(0)}\right) \\ &= \lim_{t\rightarrow \infty} t^{-1} \ln\left(\frac{\bJ(x)\cdot\by}{\by(0)}\right) \end{align*}\]
For an \(n\)-dimensional system, there will be at most \(n\) distinct
Lyapunov exponents for a given \(\bx\)(0), and the relevant exponent
is picked out by the initial orientation \(\by(0)/ |\by(0)|\). The
infinite time limit plays an important role in this analysis as it
indicates that the Lyapunov exponents represent time-averaged
quantities (meaning that transient behavior has decayed). The
existence of this limit is guaranteed by Oseledec’s (1969)
multiplicative ergodic theorem, which holds under mild conditions. In
addition, \(\bJ\) is a constant in space in this limit (otherwise its
value varies in space), and the Lyapunov exponents obtained from (A5)
are then the same for almost every value of \(\bx(0)\). Hence, one
often drops the dependence on the initial condition in (A5). Such
exponents are usually called *global* Lyapunov exponents.

### L1 Calculating Lyapunov Exponents

There are two basic kinds of procedures for calculating global Lyapunov exponents. One kind is to begin by selecting two points in state space separated by a small finite distance \(d_0\). For a map, the system of equations is then iterated one time step and the distance recomputed and the logarithm of the distance is taken. The map is iterated forward one time step and the procedure is repeated for as many iterations as are needed. The results are averaged because the distance between the trajectories might diverge from each other on one step, converge on another time step, and so forth. Such procedures imply that the state space has a metric so that distances can be defined. And every few time steps for maps (every time step for flows) the distance is recalibrated to a new d0 to account for how the distance between the two trajectories is expanding and contracting on the attractor.

There are issues with this kind of distance difference method. If the starting conditions are too close to a limit cycle, an accurate Lyapunov component cannot be calculated. And if the two initial points are too close to each other, then any exponent can be fitted to the trajectory divergence.

For these and other reasons, the methods of choice are variational ones. A variational equation is evolved for the growth rate of the orthogonal initial deviation vectors of an ellipse centered on the initial conditions. The procedure is more complicated than this brief summary captures, but it avoids the need to repeatedly renormalize the distance between two trajectories as in the difference method.

No matter which kind of method is used, in practice, it is the finite-time Lyapunov exponents that are calculated and averaged to produce an average exponent. These calculated exponents are substituted for the global Lyapunov exponent that is used in theoretical analyses and defined only infinitesimally. We already know that the infinitesimal Lyapunov exponent and finite-time exponents do not agree. Hence, it is a practically-calculated average Lyapunov exponent–a complex average of the finite-time exponents–that scientists use.

### L2 Trouble with Lyapunov Exponents

In much physics and philosophy literature, something like the following set of conditions are assumed as adequately defining chaos:

- Trajectories are confined due to some kind of stretching and folding mechanism.
- Some trajectory orbits are aperiodic, meaning that they don’t repeat themselves on any time scales (that we can determine) and are dense in at least some neighborhood of state space.
- Trajectories exhibit Chaos\(_{\lambda}\).

Although usually suspected as being related to the other two, exponential growth in uncertainties characterized by \(\lambda\) is taken to be a property of a particular kind of dynamics that can only exist in nonlinear systems and models.

Though the favored approaches to defining chaos involve global Lyapunov exponents, there are problems with this way of defining SDIC. First, note the definition Chaos\(_{\lambda}\) is formulated in terms of maps, one-dimensional dynamical systems. For two or higher dimensional systems, the definition has to be generalized for flows. This complicates the idea of using a global Lyapunov exponent as a signature for chaos as such systems have as many global Lyapunov exponents as there are dimensions in a state space. Among the global Lyapunov exponents corresponding to each dimension, the largest is denoted as the leading global Lyapunov exponent. The latter exponent typically is used in estimates of the growth of uncertainty in the time series of a chaotic system.

Second, the definition of global Lyapunov exponents involves the infinite time limit, so, strictly speaking, the global Lyapunov exponent only characterizes growth in uncertainties as \(t\) increases without bounds, not for any finite \(t\). Hence, the combination \(\exists \lambda\) and \(\exists t\gt 0\) in SD is inconsistent. At best, SD can only hold in the large time limit for global Lyapunov exponents implying that chaos as a phenomenon can only arise in this limit, contrary to what we take to be our best evidence. Furthermore, neither our models nor physical systems run for infinite time, but an infinitely long time is required to verify the presumed exponential divergence of trajectories issuing from infinitesimally close points in state space. If the uncertainty only grows infinitesimally, then there is no radical impact on our ability to predict system behavior meaning that the lead global Lyapunov exponent is not a useful measure of system predictability. It turns out that the doubling time often is a more useful measure of predictability for chaotic systems.

On might try to get around these problems by invoking the standard physicist’s assumption that an infinite-time limit can be used to effectively represent some large but finite elapsed time. However, one reason to doubt this assumption in the context of chaos is that the calculation of finite-time Lyapunov exponents do not usually lead to on-average exponential growth as characterized by global Lyapunov exponents (e.g., Smith, Ziehmann, and Fraedrich 1999). In general, for finite times the propagator varies from point to point in state space (i.e., it’s a function of the position \(\bx(t)\) in state space and only approaches a constant in the infinite time limit), implying that the local finite-time Lyapunov exponents vary from point to point. Therefore, trajectories diverge and converge from each other at various rates as they evolve in time—the uncertainty doesn’t vary uniformly in the chaotic region of state space (Smith, Ziehmann and Fraedrich 1999; Smith 2000).

This contrasts with global Lyapunov exponents which are on-average global measures of trajectory divergence and which imply uncertainty grows uniformly (for \(\lambda \gt 0\)), but such uniform growth rarely occurs outside a few simple mathematical models. For instance, the Lorenz, Moore-Spiegel, Rössler, Hénon, and Ikeda attractors all possess regions dominated by decreasing uncertainties in time, where uncertainties associated with different trajectories issuing forth from some small neighborhood shrink for the amount of time trajectories remain within such regions (e.g., Smith, Ziehmann, and Fraedrich 1999, pp. 2870–9; Ziehmann, Smith, and Kurths 2000, pp. 273–83). Hence, on-average exponential growth in trajectory divergence isn’t guaranteed for chaotic dynamics. Linear stability analysis indicates when nonlinearities can be expected to dominate the dynamics, and local finite-time Lyapunov exponents can indicate regions on an attractor where these nonlinearities will cause all uncertainties to decrease—cause trajectories to converge rather than diverge—so long as trajectories remain in these regions. Calculating global Lyapunov exponents ignoring the behavior in these regions would be misleading.

To summarize, the folklore that uncertainty in initial conditions will grow on-average exponentially in a chaotic region of state space is false in any sense other than for infinitesimal uncertainties in the infinite time limit for simple mathematical models.

The third problem with the standard account is that there simply is no implication that finite uncertainties will exhibit an on-average growth rate characterized by any Lyapunov exponents, local or global. For example, the linearized dynamics used to derive global Lyapunov exponents presupposes infinitesimal uncertainties (see above). But when uncertainties are finite, such dynamics do not apply and no valid conclusions can be drawn about the dynamics of finite uncertainties. Certainly infinitesimal uncertainties never become finite in finite time (barring super exponential growth). Even if infinitesimal uncertainties became finite after a finite time, that would presuppose the dynamics is unconfined, whereas the interesting features of nonlinear dynamics usually take place in subregions of state space. Presupposing an unconfined dynamics would be inconsistent with the features mathematicians and scientists typically study.

Can the on average exponential growth rate characterizing SD ever be attributed legitimately to diverging trajectories if their separation is no longer infinitesimal? Examining simple models (e.g., the Baker’s transformation) might seem to indicate yes. Nonetheless, answering this question requires some care for more complex systems such as the Lorenz or Moore-Spiegel models. It may turn out that the rate of divergence in the finite separation between two nearby trajectories in a chaotic region changes character numerous times over the course of their winding around in state space, sometimes faster, sometimes slower than that calculated from global Lyapunov exponents, sometimes contracting, sometimes diverging (Smith, Ziehmann, and Fraedrich 1999; Ziehmann, Smith, and Kurths 2000). But in the long run, some of these trajectories could effectively diverge as if there was on-average exponential growth in uncertainties as characterized by global Lyapunov exponents. However, it’s conjectured that the set of initial points in the state space exhibiting this behavior is a set of measure zero, meaning, in this context, that although there are an infinite number of points exhibiting this behavior, this set represents zero percent of the number of points composing the attractor. The details of the kinds of divergence (convergence) neighboring trajectories undergo turn on the detailed structure of the dynamics (i.e., it’s determined point-by-point by local growth and convergence of finite uncertainties and not by any global Lyapunov exponents).

As a practical matter, all finite uncertainties saturate at the diameter of the attractor meaning there is a maximum amount of spreading after a finite time which isn’t well quantified by measures derived from global Lyapunov exponents (e.g., Lorenz 1965). Therefore, the folklore—that on-average exponential growth in uncertainty characterizes chaotic dynamics is misleading for nonlinear models and systems, in particular the ones we want to label as chaotic. Hence, drawing an inference from global Lyapunov exponents to the existence of on-average exponentially diverging trajectories is invalid. Hence, SD or Chaos\(_{\lambda}\) turn out to be misleading definitions of chaos, and even Chaos\(_{d\text{exp}}\) stands in need of some remedy for how to unambiguously capture the expected exponential growth in uncertainty associated with chaotic dynamics.

Nonzero Lyapunov exponents do indicate that the dynamics of a system involves trajectory stretching and folding. This is the kind of process that can lead two initially nearby trajectories diverging away from one another. It’s the specific kind of stretching and folding dynamics that picks out a system as chaotic, but such dynamics is much harder to mathematically characterize in a general way compared to computing global Lyapunov exponents. Stretching of trajectories is associated with the explosive growth in uncertainties, while folding confines all trajectories to a region of state space.

I also want to briefly draw attention to the observer-dependent nature of global Lyapunov exponents in special relativity. Global Lyapunov exponents change in magnitude under Lorentz transformations (Zheng, Misra, and Atmanspacher 2003), though not in sign (e.g., positive exponents are always positive under Lorentz transformations). However, under Rindler transformations, global Lyapunov exponents aren’t invariant. A system characterized as chaotic under SD or Chaos\(_{\lambda}\) for an accelerated Rindler observer turns out to lack positive global exponents for an inertial Minkowski observer, and vice versa. Along with simultaneity subtleties raised for observers by special relativity (see conventionality of simultaneity), Lyapunov exponents turn out to also have observer-dependent features for pairs of observers in different reference frames. Implication for understanding chaos remain largely unexplored.