Feminist Perspectives on Argumentation
The noun “argument” and verb “to argue” can describe various things in ordinary language and in different academic disciplines (O’Keefe 1982; Wenzel 1980 ). “Argument” may identify a logical premise-conclusion complex, a speech act, or a dialogical exchange. Arguments may play off other arguments or support each other; smaller arguments can serve as sub-arguments inside larger arguments to which they contribute. Following the practice of Anglophone philosophers, this entry uses the term “argument” only to indicate a premise-conclusion complex that may involve sub-arguments. “Argumentation” also includes the larger context belonging to the activity of “arguing”, understood as the offering of reasons.
Feminist philosophical work on argumentation takes a number of different directions. Some feminists note a general association of arguing with aggression, competition, and masculinity, and they question the necessity of these connections. Also, because many view arguing as a central method of philosophical reasoning, if arguing involves gendered assumptions and standards then that would pose special problems for the discipline. In particular, the goal of winning might get in the way of the other purposes for arguing. So, some feminists ask: Can allegedly “feminine” modes of arguing provide an alternative or supplement to allegedly “masculine” modes? Can overarching epistemological standards account for the benefits of different approaches to arguing? These are some of the prospects for argumentation inside and outside of philosophy that feminists consider.
Some feminists charge, moreover, that the academic study of argumentation—by philosophers and other scholars—has failed to account for the type of reasoning required to provide social justice. Ordinary politeness or even a more robust conception of civility can be inadequate to counteract the influence on argumentation of inequalities based on social identity. What resources can informal logic and interdisciplinary argumentation studies provide to help arguing practices avoid the reinforcement of social injustices? Are informal logic and the study of rhetoric any more helpful than deductive logic? Feminist scholars suggest certain strategies for reasoning and for argument pedagogy, especially looking at ways to address the personal nature that arguing often has.
Other feminists find problems with argumentation standards fairly specific to the discipline of philosophy. It emerges that philosophers often invoke claims about arguments and arguing contrary to accepted argumentation scholarship. Feminists especially note this problem in the way that philosophers employ fallacy labels and how they teach argument in critical thinking courses. Even though argumentation scholarship stands in need of further feminist development, it provides some resources to help philosophy better address social justice concerns.
- 1. Arguing to Win
- 2. Other Goals for and Styles of Arguing
- 3. Informal Logic and Argument Interpretation
- 4. Credibility and Argumentative Injustice
- 5. The Fallacies Approach to Argument Evaluation
- 6. Critical Thinking and Argument Pedagogy
- 7. Feminism, the Discipline of Philosophy, and Argumentation Scholarship
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Arguing to Win
Theories about arguing generally assume that arguers disagree, and sometimes arguing operates as a type of battle among ideas that may be preferred over physical combat among people. Adversarial orientation among people arguing may, however, marginalize women’s patterns of communication and discount social norms of “femininity” (that regularly attach to women and girls but vary across time and culture). The connection between “masculinity” (understood also as a social norm, ideal, or role) and adversarial processes for reasoning may be heightened and even become stylized as a disciplinary method in contemporary Euro-American philosophy (Moulton 1983; Burrow 2010; Rooney 2010; Alcoff 2013). When reasoners treat arguing as a contest, each aiming to win by defeating the other’s claim, it can become “eristic”, which is to say that the goal of winning takes over from other purposes that arguing serves. In the same way as adversarial reasoning and eristics, other discursive norms can complicate the ways that women may be marginalized and marginalize other groups of people, including men. Little attention has been given in Euro-American philosophy to the gendered dimensions of arguing in other cultures. However, feminists regularly suggest that where adversarial arguing dominates, non-dominant styles of reasoning can provide productive alternatives or complements to it, and this often involves styles gendered as “feminine”.
Some feminist philosophers suggest that an aggressive culture associated with masculinity poorly serves processes of reasoning and hinders the discipline of philosophy insofar as it sidelines, downgrades, and even excludes people’s non-adversarial engagement with each other and with each other’s reasoning. Evidence for this problem emerges in various places, beginning with the prevalence of military and aggressive language to describe philosophical discourse and rational arguing more generally (Lakoff & Johnson 1980; Ayim 1988; Cohen 1995).
Janice Moulton (1983) argues that a particular style she calls “the Adversary Method” dominates the discipline of philosophy, and this goes beyond a set of attitudes or styles of interaction to include prioritizing a particular discursive logic. Further evidence for Moulton’s characterization of disciplinary practices in philosophy comes from Phyllis Rooney (2012) and Catherine Hundleby (2010).
1.1 Metaphors and norms of masculine aggression
The metaphor of argument-as-war provides a central example for George Lakoff and Mark Johnson’s landmark book, Metaphors We Live By (1980). War can operate as “structural metaphor” for arguing:
Though there is no physical battle, there is a verbal battle, and the structure of an argument—attack, defense, counterattack, etc.—reflects this. (1980: 4)
Without that structure, Lakoff and Johnson suggest that we could not even recognize a piece of discourse as an argument.
Moulton (1983) observes that prioritizing aggression in the practice of arguing and the association of aggression with certain forms of masculinity is problematic. If people assume that success requires aggression, then discussants must appear aggressive in order to appear competent at arguing. Not only may the assumption be false, but it may entail a distinct disadvantage for women. Cultures that treat aggression as a natural quality in men encourage and advantage men in eristic modes of engagement. When success demands aggression, contributions to an exchange of reasons made in other styles—including those that read as feminine—will not measure up; and they may not even be noticed. At the same time, a woman can seem to be aggressive merely by asserting her own viewpoint or by showing competence in some other fashion. She may tend to stand out in many contexts as behaving inappropriately, even as her actions become acknowledged, because of her feminine social identity (Moulton 1983: 150; Rancer & Stewart 1985; Hample et al. 2005; Kukla 2014; Olberding 2014).
Moulton calls attention to ways in which philosophical approaches to arguing and reasoning in Euro-American culture take on a pronounced adversarial dynamic that reflects aggressive expectations. Her concern about the discipline and about models for argumentation is shared by many feminist philosophers (Ayim 1988; Burrow 2010; Gilbert 1994, 1997; Hundleby 2010, 2013b, Rooney 2003, 2010) and some who are not specifically feminist (Cohen 1995). Maryann Ayim observes that a culture of hostility can be viewed in the militaristic, violent, subjugating, and controlling language used to describe philosophical arguing, especially the metaphor of argument-as-war:
Philosophers tend to value their “sharper” students, whom they may openly praise for their “penetrating” insights. Occasionally they find students of “piercing” intelligence, one or two perhaps with minds like “steel traps”. Philosophers regard such students as important: They require “tough-minded” opponents with whom they can “parry” in the classroom, so they can exhibit to the others what the “thrust” of philosophical argumentation is all about. This “battle of wits” is somewhat risky, however, and a “combatant” must take care always to “have the upper hand”, to “win thumbs down”, to “avoid being hoist by your own petard”. If you find yourself pressed for time at the end of a lecture, with your “back to the wall”, or as it is occasionally even more colorfully expressed, “between a rock and a hard place”, you may have to resort to “strong arm tactics”, to “barbed” comments, to “go for the jugular”, to “cut an opponent’s argument to pieces”, or to “bring out the big guns or heavy artillery”. If caught in the throes of a real dilemma, you many even have to “take the bull by the horns” or rebut the dilemma by advancing a “counter” dilemma. (Ayim 1988: 188)
Martial metaphors and competitive evaluation foster the eristic goal of defeating others and their views (Cohen 1995), even perhaps, Ayim suggests, for instructors in regard to their students. While this attitude may seem obviously inappropriate for instructors to take with students over whom they have authority, the available range of such language suggests a general disciplinary culture that enforces aggression through conflating it with success (Moulton 1983).
Admittedly, aggressive interaction may be comfortable for many women and uncomfortable for some men, and it may be inflected with class and race biases with similarly variable effect. Yet these may be merely exceptions to the “masculine” homosocial culture of hostility that many feminists maintain prevails in philosophical arguing. Rooney argues that culture reinforces male status in the discipline and resonates with narratives of opposition against not just ideas but also against people who present them, especially women (Rooney 2010: 229). Common ideals of masculinity and rationality coincide with the association of aggression with success, power, effectiveness, and vitality; they contrast with emotion, unreason, body, sexuality, instinct, nature, and rhetoric, all notions that Euro-American cultures regularly associate with femininity.
In the history of Euro-American philosophy, Rooney (2010) observes, masculine reason regularly appears in battle against feminine elements of unreason, a battle that occurs both within the knower and among aspects of thought. “Embattled reason” constantly struggles to subordinate feminine elements of unreason, and the suppression of perceived negative qualities that are gendered as “feminine” provides a central means for achieving the ideals of reason and rationality central to the discipline. That the discipline functions this way can discourage women’s participation. So, Rooney argues
that a full feminist accounting of the general cultural problem with gender, adversariality, and authority must include consideration of philosophy’s history and its lingering effects. (2010: 209, 217–219)
Otherwise the discipline may continue to perpetuate sexist standards of reason from the larger culture and its history.
Daniel Cohen (1995) suggests that antagonistic attitudes may not actually enhance competition and the knowledge it is supposed to serve, and that imposing the goal of agreement can silence rational discourse and undermine the goal of philosophy to further inquiry. The value of information that challenges our own beliefs can always be hard to recognize, a difficulty described as “confirmation bias”, and this problem can be exacerbated when the focus of arguing is winning rather than learning or ascertaining truth (Makau & Marty 2013: 39–40, 167; Linker 2015).
1.2 The Adversary Paradigm and the discipline of philosophy
Norms of masculine aggression may help a particular reasoning method to dominate the discipline of philosophy, Janice Moulton argues in an early article (1983). She describes the process of competitive reasoning through deductive refutation—typically by counter-example—as the “Adversary Method”. According to Moulton, the Method employs opposing views on a topic as tests for each other—the more severe the opposition, the better, and surviving the confrontation grants “objectivity” to a view. Winning at arguing in this fashion depends on defeating competing positions based on faults identified in them. Defeat of the opposite position becomes more decisive when the claims are very specific, as specificity aids deductive refutation.
Philosophy, at least in Moulton’s (1983) context of late twentieth century Anglo-American or “analytic” philosophy, may be so permeated by the combination of adversarial arguing and deductive logic that the Adversary Method operates as a disciplinary “paradigm”. Moulton argues that this “paradigm” for philosophy demands aggressive opposition to other people’s opinions, in the same way that Thomas Kuhn observed that mature scientific disciplines demand adherence to an overarching theory, an ideal, and a practice that together constitute a cultural paradigm. Philosophers’ technique of aiming to falsify each other’s claims reflects Karl Popper’s epistemology but adversarial reasoning in philosophy has taken many different forms and traces back at least to Aristotle. Descartes and Kant shifted the normative focus of the study of logic from dialogue to individual cognition, and the logic of opposition became internalized (Dutilh Novaes 2011, 2015). Yet, arguing as a dialogical form of reasoning retains the oppositional dynamic.
Moulton criticizes how the operation of the Adversary Method as a paradigm can hobble the progress of philosophical reasoning by narrowing the possibilities for discussion. Isolating claims maximizes their vulnerability and prepares them for Adversarial testing, forcing proponents to rely on ad hoc revisions, and prohibiting the systematic reconsiderations that encourage theories to evolve. For instance, ad hoc concessions “for the sake of argument” create common ground for discussion only by restricting the basis for disagreement; and so, Moulton maintains, they slow the development of philosophical thought (1983: 154–155).
Moulton (1983) argues that the narrow discourse of the Adversary Method seriously limits the relevance of philosophy to feminist concerns. She takes the example of Judith Jarvis Thomson’s classic philosophical defense of the moral permissibility of abortion that concedes a great deal (that the fetus is a full-fledged person with a right to life) to show that the right to life does not supersede the right to bodily autonomy. Moulton’s concern is that even though Thomson’s position supports feminist theoretical views, it employs reasoning so remote from the circumstances of pregnancy that it provides no guidance for people seeking to make decisions about actual abortions. Taking the purpose of arguing to be the defeat of a view limits the practical relevance of the argumentative exchange.
Moulton makes a further related point that forcing narrow theories to compete can make philosophy look quite absurd. Moral arguments are directed at egoists and epistemology is offered to skeptics. Debates over the existence of the external world and the existence of God occupy philosophers at the expense of attention to the character of the world we live in or the role of God in our religions. Philosophers rarely question the assumption that there must be a supreme moral principle, Moulton explains, because otherwise there would be little sense to making different theories compete for recognized supremacy (1983: 157–158). Losing sight of other reasons for arguing may have even resulted in the misinterpretation of key figures in the history of philosophy. Moulton suggests that interpreters often miss various purposes for which Socrates argued because they assume that his only goal was refutation (1983: 155–157). The assumption that the Adversary Method drives philosophical progress may distort philosophers’ understanding of the value of their own discipline.
The Adversary Method’s prevalence and constitution of a Kuhnian paradigm may be recognized in Rooney’s observation that philosophers tend to engage each other from a “default skeptical stance”. The skeptical stance challenges the quality of the components of another’s arguments, including the basis for premises, the support premises provide for the conclusion, and the possibility of counterexamples. The skeptical stance operates as a default without consideration of the appropriateness of the challenges for the topic under discussion. Rooney notes in particular,
skeptical argumentative responses that take necessary truths and valid arguments as the ideal poorly serve the variety of arguments and forms of argumentation that important philosophical works have presented and will continue to present. (2012: 321)
Inappropriate standards undermine the general epistemic aims of truth and understanding. They create specific problems for discussion of social justice issues which depends extensively on testimony and therefore on deft employment of the epistemology of testimony and sensitivity to the danger of testimonial injustice (see Section 4 on Credibility and argument interpretation). The unsuitability of the Adversary Method for discussions of social justice will stall social justice projects, Rooney concludes, including those within the discipline of philosophy.
Hundleby presents as evidence for the paradigmatic operation of the Adversary Method an analysis of critical thinking textbooks in philosophy. Twenty-four textbooks of the thirty examined—four-fifths—revealed in their presentation of fallacies the norms of the Adversary Method: narrow discourse and decisive refutation. Most of these textbooks exhibiting the Adversary Paradigm have authors with no research expertise in argumentation more specific than doctoral training in philosophy, whereas the much smaller number of textbooks (six out of thirty) authored by scholars of argumentation do not show the same signs of the Adversary Method. Given this evidence that argumentation scholarship differently orients argument pedagogy, the prevalence of the Adversary Method in so many other textbooks seems to derive simply from the disciplinary culture of philosophy (Hundleby 2010).
Some empirical educational studies suggest, too, that while students learn a great deal from learning eristic practices of argument, it undermines their progress as learners by emphasizing winning over gaining understanding (Makau & Marty 2013: 13). People—including feminists—Moulton (1983) suggests, might expect more relevant advice from the discipline of philosophy. More practical philosophies addressing mundane problems also may be found outside Euro-American cultures (Olberding 2015).
2. Other Goals for and Styles of Arguing
Feminist philosophical models of arguing aim either to replace or to complement arguing practices and norms defined in terms of a contest between people or reasons. In addition to the goal of defeating an interlocutor or their reasons, arguments can serve many purposes. Explanation and explanatory argument (sometimes considered to be the same thing) already receive attention from argumentation theorists and philosophers of science. Other functions of arguing, such as educating the uninitiated or the undecided and discussing matters with like-minded people, remain neglected by theorists (Goodwin & Innocenti 2019). None of the alternatives need to take over as a new “paradigm”, but exploring various purposes, methods, and styles of arguing may help to scrutinize accepted procedures and purposes (Moulton 1983). Such questioning of methods deters their dogmatic acceptance.
According to Cohen, more important for the role of arguing in philosophy and education than to praise or condemn any particular norms of arguing may be the exploration of multiple approaches. Philosophers and arguers more generally might find means for innovation and constructive questioning in many new models and metaphors. Cohen finds that traffic metaphors seem to work especially well:
We can say that arguments are (i) conversational traffic jams—(ii) gridlock with a lot of honking and little movement; (iii) conversational traffic accidents; (iv) wrong turns, or (v) detours, or (vi) dead ends or (vii) roundabouts on the streets of discourse; or should we have said that they are (viii) short cuts to the truth at the end of the road; maybe (ix) they are long and winding roads to nowhere; or, instead, we can conceive of arguments as (x) intellectual one way roads to their conclusions although maybe they are really (xi) one-lane roads but with two-way traffic. More positively, they can be thought of as a case of (xii) a merging traffic of ideas or even better as (xiii) conceptual roads under construction. (Cohen 1995: 184)
The availability of so many traffic metaphors suggests something appropriate about this analogy. Another option identified by Keith Lloyd (2014) lies in perceptual metaphors, especially regarding what arguers can see. However, visual metaphors have a fraught history in feminist philosophy because ideal vision tends to be associated with abstraction, and to lean on a hierarchy of the senses (Keller & Grontkowski 1983). In any case it is likely that no metaphor or analogy can capture all the shapes that arguments take and the purposes they serve (Cohen 1995: 187).
Metaphors, models, and methods that tend to be “gendered” as feminine may carry connotations of subordination—and so they may seem inferior, yet they may be also especially useful for women and hence powerful for feminists. These approaches can provide a potent basis for generating alternatives to eristic standards and an understanding of the processes that may go alongside or support arguing as a contest. Metaphors and models based on collaboration fit with the work of physical and emotional care that regularly constitutes women’s roles and responsibilities. Yet collaboration also proves quite apt for many other contexts and functions of arguing such as explanation and deliberation. Rooney suggests that because people converse with rather than against each other, and because arguing is a species of conversation, we should speak of arguing with rather than against people and their views (2010: 221). This possibility suggests that the argument-as-war metaphor may not be so overwhelming as to make alternatives unimaginable in the way Lakoff and Johnson suggest (1980: 4). Alternative structures for argument can be found in our ordinary language.
Patterns that might seem to distinguish how women argue may not express deep cognitive differences between the genders. A range of communicative styles including gendered norms of polite discourse that have people constrain their public reasoning may equally serve cognitive functions common to men and women. Gendered roles may even complement each other’s epistemological operation. The most aggressive and disruptive behavior will not endure norms of politeness. However, some feminists consider that politeness can require conformity to structures of social authority that marginalize women, people of color, and others belonging to subordinated social categories.
2.1 Gendered Reasoning
The gendered associations of different styles of reasoning suggest that a source for alternative models of arguing might be found in what have been seen as “feminine” styles of reasoning. Whether or not women reason differently from men depends on what we count as reasoning (Verbiest 1995), and the evidence from psychology and sociology reveals no significantly gendered differences in the mental processes of inference and cognition (Fine 2010). Yet women’s communication practices often reflect distinct “values of intimacy, connection, inclusion, and problem sharing” (Burrow 2010: 247).
Ayim argues that in order to avoid reinforcing patterns of subordination, we must detect and examine how values and presuppositions play into the ways that we interpret argumentation (1988: 185). Rooney adds that cooperative and collaborative inclinations may involve a tendency to defer, a reluctance to take responsibility for a position, or a lack of confidence in one’s ideas (2010: 213–214). The need to appease those with greater power may explain why an open-ended and tentative quality sometimes distinguishes women’s style of arguing and practices of communication associated with femininity. Sylvia Burrow suggests that women may give others’ interests priority over their own in order to secure cooperation and connection (2010). This may characterize subordinate roles more generally, sometimes extending to marginalized races and ethnicities.
While styles of “femininity” and “masculinity” are neither wholly good nor bad, they both have inherent dangers. A danger for masculinity arises from its association with activity and aggression as apparently natural features of maleness. As a result, these masculine ideals constrain women’s communication, as has often been noted by feminist theorists, while feminine modes tend to be dismissed. Because masculine characteristics also operate as ideals of humanity or personhood (Hundleby 2016), men can over-identify with them and have no motivation to reflect on or problematize their gender identity (Bruner 1996).
The strategy of transgressing gender by adopting an aggressive masculine mode for arguing can seem useful to women and the temptation may be strongest in “masculine” discourses such as philosophical discussion, or wherever listeners treat an authoritative manner as valuable. Yet, when women adopt masculine discursive styles and adversarial techniques, they can garner criticism for being selfish, cold, and mean, which is criticism that men would not receive (Burrow 2010). Furthermore, such character challenges weaken women’s authority and their ability to participate in argumentation (Burrow 2010; Hundleby 2013a). Even when those challenges are not interpreted as a character fault, the effect may be to present women as merely requesting permission to participate, whereas men are not taken to need permission (Kukla 2014; Olberding 2014). When women decline to offer explanations, they are considered incompetent, whereas the same behavior reads as strength in men. Women’s attempts to defend their authority can easily backfire because the very nature of authority depends on not always having to defend what one says (Hanrahan & Antony 2005).
2.2 Caring and coalescent argumentation
The consideration that women may have a “different voice” in moral reasoning (Gilligan 1982) gave rise to care ethics as a feminist alternative to traditional accounts of morality. Ayim (1988) suggests that metaphors of nurturing could also replace violent ones describing arguing, especially because arguing can help to foster community (Makau & Marty 2013). Approaches to reasoning that presume interest in the flourishing of other people and that consider the needs of others may be common among girls and women in cultures that press them into practices of motherhood and related caring labor, such as teaching, nursing, and food service.
Attention to the unique audience and the speakers involved in a particular discussion forces consideration of its detailed situation. In one sense, this attention exhibits a bias toward certain sorts of evidence. That bias does not pretend to value-neutrality. Yet, Karen Warren argues that attention to detail provides a feminist sense of “open-mindedness” that enriches feminist reasoning with data in a way that entails a type of impartiality (1988: 38). Reasoners operate from specific locations that cannot be adequately addressed by an epistemology of generic or uniform knowers, as feminist epistemologist Lorraine Code argues (1991). And feminist communications scholars Josina M. Makau and Debian L. Marty note that “taking other people’s perspectives seriously is a basic requirement in peaceful coexistence” (2001: 11; 2013: 51).
Accounting for reasoners’ social situations in the way that Warren and Code advise provides part of the goal for Maureen Linker’s model of “intellectual empathy” (2015). This involves working to understand the history of social inequality and how it affects the reasoning and arguing of ourselves and others. Linker argues that
reason and understanding must be supplemented with emotion and experience so that we can know in the fullest possible sense. (2015: 13)
Attention to specific personal experiences that historically have been ignored provides a feminist standpoint with particular empirical and scientific value, and marks a place where the two general feminist epistemologies of science, feminist standpoint theory and feminist empiricism, coincide (Intemann 2010).
The same feminist epistemological concerns motivate Michael Gilbert’s model of “coalescent argumentation”, which treats arguing as communication that involves much more than a generic expression of a premise-conclusion complex. In coalescent argumentation, the views of speakers stand in opposition to each other without the people speaking being opposed to each other. Arguers’ orientation to other people requires that they account for their interconnection with those in conversation and how their decisions affect others. In this collaborative model, the defeat neither of ideas nor of an opponent provides the goal; instead the goal is to find mutual ground among people, which requires a broad view of relevant considerations (1994; 1997). The processes of coalescent argumentation demand more information than required simply to find fault with others’ arguments. The premise-conclusion complexes that logicians recognize as arguments become understood in coalescent arguing as standing in for “a position-cluster of attitudes, beliefs, feelings and intuitions” belonging to the arguer (Gilbert 1994: 96, original emphasis). Arguers’ motivations offer a basis for interpretation that provides greater room for recognizing middle ground among people who seem to disagree. Exploring this common territory also suggests ways in which alternative solutions may be developed. By emphasizing how divergent positions involve agreement among the proponents’ views and desires, points of disagreement can be distinguished from points of agreement and minimized. On Gilbert’s model, “one asks not, ‘What can I disagree with?’ but, ‘What must I disagree with?’” (1994: 109).
In light of the general feminist interest in collaborative and coalescent models of argumentation, Tempest M. Henning (2018) warns they may reflect certain cultural assumptions, and presumptions of universal culture. The norms recommended by what she identifies as “non-adversarial feminist argumentation models”, and attributes especially to Ayim, may run contrary to the cultures and needs of U.S. Black women. More generally, argumentation theory tends to prescribe a pleasantness of tone and directness of speech that connotes respect in some cultures but not others (Henning 2021; see Section 2.4 on Politeness and civility). Some feminist philosophers also value adversarial arguing or even identify personally as adversarial arguers. So, the resistance to forms of adversarial arguing that appears to provide a valuable commonality between some feminist concerns and accepted views in argumentation theory may reflect only the interests of certain white women. It may actually work against the interests of other groups of women and risk reinforcing racial marginalization.
2.3 Knowledge and criticism
Even feminists with concerns about adversarial reasoning recognize that it promotes criticism that may advance the goal of attaining knowledge and understanding. Knowledge is an important purpose among those that arguing serves and different styles of arguing can serve different purposes. Some efforts to build knowledge may benefit from the adversarial styles and models, especially if arguers can avoid automatically slipping into hostile, “ancillary” modes of aggression (Govier 1999). Arguers may also need to avoid reinforcing other epistemic cultures and subcultures that prioritize men’s interaction with each other (Rooney 2012). So feminists need norms for arguing that support criticism of such androcentric cultures and practices and the development of knowledge about how such systems function.
Non-adversarial models of reasoning such as coalescent argumentation may aid people’s understanding too, especially about others and their positions. Mutual understanding develops from coalescent arguing because it demands finding common ground. The remaining opposition among people and their beliefs constitutes a minimally adversarial orientation that Trudy Govier (1999) and Rooney (2010) argue may be valuable for both the development of arguments and the role of arguing in the processes that generate knowledge. Arguers can aid each other in achieving knowledge, which is the main goal in academic arguing, despite the fact that academics sometimes can be side-tracked by mundane power play.
Because of overarching epistemic purposes, Cohen suggests that the people whose ideas lose in eristic debate thus may benefit the most because they learn the most (1995: 182). People may also share an inquiry (Dutilh Novaes 2015: 598–599), and epistemic benefit may accrue to communities. The discursive practices in which individual scientists work together by testing each other’s claims may exhibit certain characteristics that Helen Longino’s (1990) model of scientific reasoning sees as supporting a form of objectivity. Longino’s account of objectivity addresses feminist concerns with about gender bias in scientific theories and involves both collaborative and adversarial elements.
Such shared epistemic projects among people might be understood as “arguing with” rather than “against” other reasoners (Rooney 2003). Rooney argues that readily available logical terms such as “contradictory” and “contrary” can adequately describe differing opinions without implicating opposition among the people holding divergent views (2003; 2010: 222). Such language may help reasoners move away from both the Adversary Method’s dominance as a Paradigm and eristic arguing that may be otherwise dysfunctional. The negative connotations of “argument” and “arguing” in the English language may be part of the problem. Related words in other Indo-European languages carry no such implication of verbal fighting (Hitchcock 2017: 449). Avoiding the English-language connotations is part of the reason theorists often speak instead of “argumentation” even though that terminology can be unclear or unnecessarily abstract.
Yet, criticism must be part of feminism, especially to direct it at sexism, and feminists may be no more skilled than anyone else at avoiding the pitfalls of arguing such as its tendency to aggravate conflict. Feminist models of arguing avoid levelling criticism against people and direct it toward the views they hold so as to better serve everyone’s understanding. Feminist models of arguing and some ways of arguing used by feminists and non-feminists alike exhibit a benevolent attentiveness to other arguers in the processes of arguing and yet they may also subject what other people say to extensive criticism and opposition.
According to Govier, the characteristic explicitness of reasoning when people argue enables them to learn from disagreement and doubt (1999). Explicitness also promotes honesty with ourselves and each other and respect for interpersonal differences:
an arguer, in actually or potentially addressing those who differ, is committed to the recognition that people may think differently and that what they think and why they think it matters. (1999: 8, 50)
Feminist criticism often involves anger, an emotion also regularly associated with arguing. Anger can be a distracting or even destructive influence on reasoning and it can signify harmful arrogance (Tanesini 2018). Moira Howes and Catherine Hundleby make a case that arguing can help derive cognitive benefit from anger because arguing encourages reasoners to express and to articulate their reasons (2018). It can reveal aspects of reasoning that otherwise would remain unconscious, a feature of arguing processes that Douglas Walton identifies as the “maieutic effect” (1992).
Styles for communicating and sharing reasons often distinguished as “feminine” also play roles in feminist epistemologies of argumentation: Gilbert assigns a fundamental role in coalescent argumentation to the values of attention to the speaker and seeking agreement, while Linker characterizes empathetic intellectuals as having the skills of cooperation and accepting vulnerability. Feminist ethical goals of accountability to women thus can benefit from the pursuit of knowledge. Not only for feminists but for all reasoners, the ethical value of understanding other people can enhance the standard philosophical treatment of arguments as logical premise-conclusion complexes. Coalescent and intellectually empathic reasoning complement critical analysis once we distinguish criticism from the eristic culture of aggressive fault-finding (Miller 1995).
2.4 Politeness and civility
As a remedy for some of the problems that women and other arguers face, some feminists champion politeness, while others stress that expecting etiquette to address abuses of power belies the realities of women and others who are socially marginalized. Norms of politeness function to minimize conflict and so can hold people in subordinate positions (Mayo 2001). Like “ideal theory” in philosophy (Mills 2005), politeness can exacerbate the oppression it ignores—in this case, discursive marginalization.
Govier argues that the discursive norm of politeness limits the problem of overt interpersonal aggression in arguing (1999). Respect for other people and careful consideration of their views ought to be part of persuasion, including rational persuasion, which scholars often take to be the central or even the sole purpose for arguing (1999: 58–59). On this view, aggressive styles of communication or “ancillary adversariality” can be dismissed as simple rudeness or hostility. These ought not to be tolerated in any context and may not impact much on the beliefs and attitudes of the audience (Govier 1999; Miller 1995).
The main difficulty with this ideal arises because norms of politeness tend to be gendered in ways that undermine women’s authority when people argue, affirming power and status for men but not for women. This dynamic can receive reinforcement when women adopt cooperative strategies that play into norms of “femininity”, according to Burrow (2010) and Hundleby (2013a). Securing cooperation and connection with other people provides the very purpose for politeness. Both “masculine” and “feminine” forms of politeness can reflect this purpose. However, the gendered dynamics of politeness in many cultures may entail that cooperative or collaborative argumentation serves women poorly. It contributes to their subordination and perhaps also the subordination of other people with marginalized social identities. For women, cooperating and connecting with others may entail deferring one’s interests and promoting dialogue through hedging, questioning intonation, and use of tag questions, for example, “You know?” “Right?” “Don’t you think?” These strategies generally imply powerlessness or conflict avoidance. In contrast, masculine norms of polite connection facilitate shared competition and encourage joint autonomy along with regard for each other’s needs (Burrow 2010).
Burrow argues that women often have no easy options for conforming with the etiquette demands that reinforce power differences among speakers. Deferential styles of dialogue are part of most subordinate positions and, for women, other aspects of social rank do not mitigate this much. Therefore, to negotiate politeness and to argue effectively, women need complex strategies tailored to their circumstances (2010).
Henning (2021) observes that what many feminist and not-specifically-feminist argumentation theorists count as rudeness may actually belong to politeness strategies in African-American Vernacular English (AAVE). In particular, “signifying” or “signification” within AAVE “utilizes exaggeration, irony, and indirection to partake in coded messages, riddled with insults”. To refuse to participate in signification is rude and politeness demands participation in speech that on the surface suggests disrespect. In some cultures, arguing not only performs pro-social functions, it provides such an important form of sociability that superficial or even insincere arguing may be an essential part of interaction and social bonding (Schiffrin 1984).
Because of the range of conflicting politeness strategies across different communities, it may serve better to seek an alternative to politeness as a norm and that may lie in an inclusive practice and ethic of civility in dialogue. Civility tends to be understood as deeper than politeness, sometimes considered itself to be a virtue or as involving such virtues as respect for other people (Calhoun 2000: 253; Bone et al. 2008; Laverty 2009; Reiheld 2013). Respecting others requires trying to understand them “as they wish to be known and understood” in the cooperative argumentation model developed by Makau and Marty (2013: 69). Others suggest that civil respect be parsed in ethical frameworks, such as deontology or consequentialism, because simple deference to existing social standards may be oppressive in assigning more restrictive practices to certain groups of people. Practices of respect may involve people’s adherence to oppressive social roles, just as they do for politeness, if common practice determines them. Ethically rich interpretations of civility must be shared among interlocutors in order that civility can fulfill its function to regulate disagreement. Such shared norms of civility not only aid the articulation of understandings that prejudiced and oppressive behavior are intolerable, they also aid people’s ability to challenge broader social problems (Calhoun 2000).
Civility may be distinguished from other virtues as “an essentially communicative form of moral conduct”, a display and expression of how one regards others (Calhoun 2000: 260). However, this virtue has limits and incivility can also perform important argumentative functions. Uncivil communication can create space for new forms of meaning and value:
The disruption entailed by incivility provides room for concerted reconstruction of social practices, identities, and spaces. (Mayo 2001: 79)
Uncivil communication and arguing may even be necessary for some social change (Lozano-Reich & Cloud 2009: 223–224). Because certain practices viewed as “civil” may depoliticize disagreement, incivility that highlights these political problems can prove to be as necessary as civility is to democratic decision-making (Mayo 2001). Which moral and political demands justify incivility remains, however, a complicated question that demands analysis of the discursive norms in operation in a particular context for their ability to sustain interpersonal respect.
3. Informal Logic and Argument Interpretation
Feminist philosophical work on argumentation as it emerged in the early 1980s coincides with the rise of informal logic, an approach that encompasses much of contemporary philosophical work done in argumentation theory (Johnson 1996 [2014: 12]). Many feminists and informal logicians share both a resistance to the idealization by some philosophers of formal deductive methods for reasoning and a desire to provide better tools for addressing real world contexts of reasoning and arguing (Govier 1999: 52).
Any interpretation or analysis of an argument omits some aspects of the reasoning involved in the surrounding discourse while it attends to others, and different forms of abstraction suit different purposes (Rooney 2001). Interpretations become problematic for feminists when they leave out salient details that would make possible other interpretations that account for social bias. For instance, interpreting an argument as a deductive inference may not allow for the sorts of analysis of social situation that a standard informal logic interpretation of ad hominem makes possible.
Even informal logicians may assume an equality among arguers that is more ideal than real and that may obstruct political progress. The problems that feminists find with assumed equality may be most visible in accounts of ad hominem arguing. Both feminist (Janack & Adams 1999; Yap 2013, 2015) and not-specifically feminist (Walton 1995) argumentation theorists recognize that appeals to the person may or may not be fallacious. The difference is that while the informal logic analysis informs an audience about the irrelevance of a personal attack, a feminist analysis also maintains that the line of reasoning may still succeed because of unconscious biases such as implicit sexism and racism that feminists find unacceptable. For this reason, feminist critiques of ad hominem arguments require more than logical analysis and also consider the epistemology of testimony (Yap 2013).
Addressing women’s more general concerns about arguing and assessing feminist arguments about women’s marginalization requires a richer and more diverse analysis than a logical analysis of inferences provides. Andrea Nye (1990) suggests ways that the language of logic, including both the artificial language of abstract ideals and the surrounding discourse of logicians, might convey the interests and purposes of people who hold social power. Logical models for argument, especially formal ones, are developed, according to Nye, to prioritize some people’s interests over others and to hide that prioritization by claiming generality and the dominance of such models can lead to systematic misinterpretations of women’s arguments.
Other feminists maintain that abstract interpretation causes trouble only when reasoners mistake it for a uniform authority. The trouble with abstract analysis, Ayim suggests, lies not in the models themselves, but in how people use them (1995: 806). Logical or argumentative ideals that involve abstract models may be partial in representing some people’s preferred inference forms without these models having an intrinsically universalizing character that makes them false. Ayim believes that any such problems in the disciplines of logic result from the practitioners’ failure to be realistic and humble. She says that
It is only when logic is seen as the exclusive avenue to truth and reason that problems arise—not when it is seen as an avenue to truth and reason. (Ayim 1995: 810, emphasis added)
Gilbert suggests that the practical concerns and interdisciplinary considerations of informal logic must be expanded and become more attuned to the specific social situations from which arguments arise (2007). Neglected aspects of argumentation may include the identities of speakers (Code 1991), the power relationships between speakers (Bondy 2010; Linker 2011, 2015; Rooney 2012), the emotions involved (Nye 1990; Gilbert 1994; Linker 2015), the social consequences of argumentation (Code 1991; Rooney 2012), and intersectional identities (Henning 2018, 2021). When feminine speech and writing styles are poorly received and misinterpreted, women will encounter difficulties getting their arguments heard or to taken seriously, let alone recognized as good reasoning. The demand from feminist philosophers to situate argumentative reasoning and to evaluate it in the larger discursive contexts (Burrow 2010; Lang 2010) can be met at least in part by the recent revival of rhetorical accounts of argumentation that address the role of audience (Perelman & Olbrechts-Tyteca 1958 ; Perelman 1977 ; Tindale 1999, 2007).
3.1 Formal logic
Formal logic employs artificial abstract languages generally understood to address particular types of inference. Formal symbolism is also used to interpret arguments from natural language so as to assess the strength of an argument’s inference, in particular, whether the argument has deductive validity. So, the argument, “It is icy outside and therefore I will not travel today” might fail to be translatable into a deductively valid form, although people easily recognize its good reasoning. (“Missing premises” might be added to make the argument deductive but that requires more than formal interpretation.)
Nye’s work on formal logic, especially Words of Power: A Feminist Reading of the History of Logic (1990), provides the point of departure for many of the initial feminist philosophical discussions of argument and arguing. Nye considers certain historical points when deductive logic’s operation as the default interpretive mechanism for arguments may have had an oppressive influence. Rather than arguing for this interpretation, she adopts a practice of “reading” that includes attention, listening, understanding, and responding (1990, 183), approaches that are traditionally associated with rhetoric (Keith 1993). Her feminist “reading” of episodes in the history of Euro-American logic suggests ways in which abstract logical systems may have helped to justify social dominance at different moments in time. Her “reading” purposefully aims to consider the personal and political desires behind logic that might motivate its prescription of rules for thought (Nye 1990: 9).
Nye begins her study with Parmenides’ logic of “what is”, what exists beyond sensuous existence and human communities. The ensuing silence among the ancient Greeks was broken by Plato who addressed “what is not” through using rational discussion to reveal the existence of differences. For Aristotle, this dialectic involved only men from the upper classes, making the exclusive nature of the logic most explicit. As a result, in Nye’s view, a silence regarding a lot of reasoning surrounds logic. Nye notes that
once rationality is defined as what is not emotional, and emotionality established as the characteristic of women understood as what is only a body, there could be no discussion of institutions of slavery and sexism. (1990: 50)
She traces through medieval formulations of logic ways in which the claims of logic’s universal application may have discouraged criticism of social institutions that authorized those accounts of logic. These institutions include patriarchy in general, sometimes underwritten by God, the Roman Empire, and the Catholic Church.
Logical restriction on what counts as reasoning culminates, on Nye’s reading, when Gottlob Frege moves logic out of human discourse to formulate it in a symbolic language. Frege’s functionalist notation promises to express all forms of truth with the aim, Nye suggests, “that thought will be unified and logical errors in science, mathematics, and philosophy exposed” (1990: 131). Using Frege’s approach, how a concept refers to the world becomes “an objective fact:…one cannot invent its value” (1990: 135). As a result, the institutions that render concepts meaningful, including the social institution of language, stand beyond question, creating a new form of muteness that harkens back to Parmenides. The surrounding silence breaks again when the Vienna Circle adds empirical input in place of the concepts on which the Fregean functions work. Nye indicates that this theoretical development places science above meaningful criticism, and so allows scientific reasoning to be co-opted by authoritarian regimes (1990: 163–171).
As an alternative to logic, Nye suggests building confidence for women and developing new concepts aided by a concrete (natural, not artificial) “women’s language”. Discourse that is for or about women might provide inclusion, bonding, and ways to share power. Women have relied historically on the skills needed for reading:
We have listened and read to survive, we have read to predict the maneuvers of those in power over us, to seduce those who might help us, to pacify bullies, to care for children, to nurse the sick and the wounded. (1990: 184)
The next step lies in developing the language to respond.
Nye’s experiment in avoiding argument falters in two ways observed by feminists and other scholars who have not been convinced by her socio-historical reading. Some cite errors in her historical interpretation (Keith 1993; Weiner 1994). Others find that in Words of Power, Nye does argue, but fails to persuade and so fails to provide the alternative to logic she seeks (Gilbert 1994; Ayim 1995).
Gilbert offers a related but distinct criticism of formal logic for its role in the “Critical-Logical” approach that he characterizes as extracting text from utterances for the purposes of applying a competitive or eristic process to the stylized text (1994). He suggests, like Moulton (1983), that such abstraction serves the competitive functions and standard practice of Euro-American academic philosophy. Because arguing need not adhere to the Critical-Logical model, it remains possible that feminine styles of reasoning may ground effective interpretive practices for arguers. Arguing also may find natural corollaries in other styles of communication and other values that operate within communication.
Reasoners appeal to logic and to other abstract accounts of what other arguers say partly so they might avoid bias as they interpret natural language. Yet such abstract interpretation may favor forms of argument evaluation unsuited to the context of utterance. For instance, if the Critical-Logical model of argument evaluation provides the basis for legal procedures, then it may compromise access to justice for people who are socially marginalized based on gender, race, class, and education. Gilbert echoes Nye’s concern that logical systems can reflect the lingua franca of the ruling class that captures their own interests (1994: 105). Applying it to other contexts risks distorting and disenfranchising other people and their modes of communication.
Nye concedes that a women’s language cannot stand up to the power and authority of logic but believes that perhaps reasoners may gain something different from a replacement for logic. It may be that
her notion of reading teaches that the circumstances in which something is said and the person who says it are relevant considerations. (Tindale 1999: 196)
The appeal of Nye’s “reading” may be that
currently popular theories of reading, unlike traditional logic, highlight rather than diminish the interests, personality, and motives that the reader brings to the task of reading. (Ayim 1995: 807)
Arguers can emphasize the moral goals behind an argument through their emotional language. Likewise, an explanatory purpose for an argument would mean that the speaker offers it up as a truthful description rather than as a subject for debate (Gilbert 1994). Such purposes and values can fall away with the abstraction of a premise-conclusion complex from its context of utterance. When the Critical-Logical model grounds decision-making processes, the authority it carries creates problems for anyone using other styles of reasoning and communication.
Note that Nye is the only feminist philosopher to date suggesting a substitute for arguing and logic. Ayim (1995) and Gilbert (1994) stress that different styles of communication and value-systems can be natural corollaries for each other. Govier (1993) further suggests that the power of universal logic may be indispensable, and that feminist concerns can be addressed through a better understanding of the interpretation and application of logical norms.
3.2 Rhetorical approaches and power differences
Rhetorical studies attend to argument audiences in a way that can help to address feminist concerns about the emotional and gendered aspects of argument (Tindale 1999: 201). They may also help to resolve a dilemma of feminist arguing practice by demonstrating how the advancement of feminist affirmative projects, such as acknowledging the significance of women’s experience, may require adversarial forms of argumentation often associated with masculinity. Communication styles identified as rhetoric create both problematic and constructive aspects of social identity, including feminine identity. Rhetorical analysis of the situational specifics can reveal how communication helps to produce social identities and can suggest ways to address particular power differences among reasoners (Bruner 1996; Palczewski 2016).
M. Lane Bruner argues that some aspects of gender stereotypes make it harder to argue, while other aspects make it easier (1996). Distinguishing the empowering from the disempowering aspects of social identity depends on examining the ways in which “masculine” identity is tied up with ideals of arguing and the ways in which identity politics can counteract the power of dominant identities. Although speakers must suppress each of their unique differences from others in order to communicate explicitly in regard to their own social positions, the resulting feminine and masculine identifications do not become fixed. Because identities are created, they must be maintained and they remain subject to transformation. That flux in identity gives feminists strategic opportunities for developing women’s argumentation and giving credit to it.
Rooney notes that an artificial severing of arguing from narrative and rhetorical practices helps to dissociate arguments from femininity and frustrates feminist practices of philosophical arguing (2010; Le Doeuff 1980 ). Research that attends to rhetoric and its influences may go under the name of “rhetorical studies” (often in English or literature departments) but may also be found in communications studies, psychology, and interdisciplinary fields such as women’s and gender studies or argumentation studies. Rhetorical studies give attention to the perspective of a particular audience and that concern with the audience and the various interests audiences may have challenges the view—especially in the discipline of philosophy—that reasoning and argumentation must be a constant battle. Rooney argues that philosophical practice itself involves rhetoric and narrative through myths, thought experiments, and metaphors. These rhetorical practices make theories more attractive to specific audiences. Philosophers commonly portray reason as in battle against feminine forces which “primarily makes sense to men among men in cultural contexts where sexism or misogyny is a cultural given” (2010: 227).
Rhetorical studies of speakers, audiences, their purposes, and their social contexts were revived in twentieth century argumentation theory by Chaim Perelman and Lucie Olbrechts-Tyteca (1958 ). Perelman, writing on his own, advocates that instead of appealing to “the rational” as a standard for argumentation, scholars should consider a “reasonable” person in terms of the standards of a particular community (1977 ).
The discipline of rhetorical studies typically takes persuasion to be the goal of arguing. Some feminists resist this assumption. Concern that persuasion may be intrinsically an act of domination of one person over another and even an act of violence (Gearhart 1979) led feminist rhetoricians to develop an alternative in “invitational rhetoric” that makes understanding the goal of arguing (Foss & Griffin 1995; Bone et al. 2008). This approach resonates with rhetoric’s Aristotelian history, Christopher Tindale observes, which does not involve intentions to change another person that some feminists consider violent, because Aristotle conceives change as an internal process. On Tindale’s model of “rhetorical argumentation”,
the audience, when persuaded, is persuaded by its own deliberations, after reflection on reasoning that it has understood in its own terms and may even have had a hand in completing. (1999: 191)
However, at the same time, invitational rhetoric demands a civility that may presume social equality (Lozano-Reich & Cloud 2009) and thus it faces the same problems as politeness (addressed in Section 2).
Linker suggests that reasoning across power differences can be aided by speakers employing a process of “intellectual empathy”; other people’s claims, especially if these people are relatively disadvantaged, can help reflect on one’s own interpretive assumptions in order to move past unreflective bias (2011; 2015). Relatedly, an attitude of playfulness may facilitate consideration of another’s perspective, that is, “travelling” to the person’s “world” as described by Maria Lugones (1987). Perhaps this attitude will help philosophers appreciate the viewpoints presented in feminist epistemology (Lang 2010). However, Mariana Ortega (2006) warns that the radical potential of playfulness demands a deep engagement with work by women of color. Superficial citation of women of color by white feminists only replicates oppressive gatekeeping in philosophical argumentation.
Assuming the goal of arguing to be persuasion invokes a limited context and one that poses problems for some feminists, especially regarding power differences among speakers. Nevertheless, rhetorical analysis offers many resources for feminist analysis because its attention to the audience provides valuable details about the situations in which people argue. As we will see next, recent work in philosophy concerning credibility and developing the concept of “argumentative injustice” articulates persistent concerns for feminists about arguing, as does both regular and feminist philosophical scholarship about fallacies and critical thinking education.
4. Credibility and Argumentative Injustice
Credibility granted to speakers and their testimony affects processes of arguing and may adhere to social categories following lines of gender and other axes of oppression (Govier 1993). Miranda Fricker (2007) describes the case of testimonial injustice, which is a species of epistemic injustice, and identifies when a listener gives diminished credibility or epistemic authority to a speaker based on that speaker’s social identity. Patrick Bondy (2010) defines analogous “argumentative injustice” as consisting in a related harm done to the processes of arguing when people wrongly assess an arguer’s credibility. We can underestimate or overestimate an arguer’s credibility by using social stereotypes to assess it (2010). Bondy explains that both overestimation and underestimation can result from viewing testifiers through social stereotypes—typically men’s credibility becomes overestimated whereas women’s becomes underestimated. Additionally, testimony from people with social identities different from our own may be difficult to accept simply because their experiences contrast with our own and those experiences with which we identify. This second problem when considered as a fallacy goes by the name of “provincialism” (Kahane & Cavender 2001) and is sometimes attributed to the psychology of in-group bias (Brewer 1979; Rudman & Goodman 2004). Whether due to stereotypes or to in-group bias, being discounted as a participant in discussion amounts to an epistemic injustice that Christopher Hookway (2010) describes as “participant injustice”.
Bondy argues that an underestimated testifier loses at least some capacity for critical engagement with other people. This capacity might progressively deteriorate, or the person might internalize its diminished form. Underestimating a testifier undermines the rationality of arguing processes with the result that the audience tends to lose potentially valuable information and insight. On the other hand, an overestimated testifier also can fail to gain valuable information from others, derailing the argumentative exchange by preventing the success of the better line of reasoning. After the particular discussion, the overestimated person can come to be viewed as beyond scrutiny, thus losing (at least on occasion) the benefits of engaging in discursive argumentation. By contrast, Fricker’s original conception of testimonial injustice accounts for the harmful effects on knowers only when their testimony is underestimated, and she argues that epistemic injustice does not accrue from overestimating credibility.
The solution to argumentative injustice might be simply for the listener to take care to treat arguers on their own terms. This would avoid viewing people in terms of group membership, a practice that leaves reasoners vulnerable to stereotype-thinking (Govier 1993, 1999). However, sometimes people’s social identities are relevant to the credibility of what they say, when, for instance, it concerns their personal experience of discrimination. Also, social stereotypes influence our thinking unconsciously, in a way that earns the label “implicit bias”. This bias differs from in-group bias but works alongside it, sometimes reinforcing it and sometimes conflicting with it. As a result, women often hold prejudices against other women (and even themselves) just as men do, and people of color may hold unconscious biases against their own ethnicity. When such bias persists despite conscious beliefs to the contrary, psychologists describe it as “aversive bias” (Greenwald & Banaji 1995; Jost, Banaji, & Nosek 2004; Kay & Zanna 2009).
Implicit social biases work like other cognitive biases, such as those that encourage us to generalize from small samples and personal experience and can affect many of our best intentions in reasoning and argumentation. Insofar as these biases undermine our ability to manage our own confidence, they frustrate the virtue of intellectual humility that otherwise might offset adversarial inclinations and momentum when people argue (Kidd 2016; Aberdein 2016). Ian James Kidd considers ways in which arguing can foster humility, and suggests that ideally, arguing
is also a route to other intellectual and ethical goods such as truth, knowledge, and enlightenment, as the ancient philosophers maintained. (2016: 399)
The challenge remains to bridge the real and the ideal.
Bondy argues that because social bias may be inevitable in people’s perception of speakers’ credibility, we need to counteract it actively. He recommends that we adopt a general attitude of “metadistrust” in which we exercise skepticism about our credibility judgments regarding testimony from people belonging to marginalized social groups.
Alternatively, we might try “intellectual empathy” based on mutual compassion, which is the approach that Linker develops. She argues that compassion must involve consciousness of how oppression operates through specific intersecting social matrices, including social privileges that can be very difficult to recognize. Such intersectional intellectual empathy may especially help us realize that it is our own biases or limited experiences that lead us to dismiss others’ testimony by interpreting them as whining, complaining, or “playing the gender (or race, etc.) card” (Linker 2011, 2015).
Achieving epistemic justice when we argue requires some sort of accounting for the identities of arguers, and might include appeal to the “epistemic privilege” described in feminist standpoint epistemology. Some standpoint theorists maintain that epistemic privilege can accrue to people who oppose oppression. Their engagement with the lives of oppressed people and their resistance to the oppression structuring those lives provides a unique and valuable awareness of the social structures of power. Thus a “feminist standpoint” and those who achieve it may gain epistemic advantage from fighting the oppressed condition of women’s lives. Although it is not necessary to be a woman to achieve this standpoint and its advantage, women themselves may most easily achieve it (Harding 1991; Intemann 2010).
One way that arguers might try to address the effects of social position on arguing is through meta-debate—a background argument may address arguers’ biases operating in the central discussion (Kotzee 2010). However, Linker (2014) argues that regardless of what the meta-debate yields, the person with social privilege will continue to benefit from debates that are adversarial. Arguers have difficulty recognizing when their biases reflect their own social privilege at any level of debate because social identity frequently affects testimonial authority unconsciously.
Linker suggests that we treat epistemic privilege as a form of expertise about arguing. This allows feminists and other anti-oppression advocates to set the bounds for ending inquiry (2014). Such advocates operate as the authority and determine the place where explanation stops (Hanrahan & Antony 2005). Rooney argues that this kind of expertise should be accorded to women philosophers whose lived experience tends to ground their feminist philosophy. Arguers should recognize expertise in situations
where A’s minority status relative to B (with respect to some locally salient status or power differential) makes it likely that A has insights and understandings relating to P that are less available to B. (2012: 322)
Rooney says that speaking from personal experience becomes important for arguing because of the “hermeneutical injustices” (Fricker 2007) facing women. Hermeneutical injustice, according to Fricker, means that women’s experiences may not receive adequate consideration because the language to describe them is underdeveloped. Men may therefore have trouble recognizing evidence that women provide, and they
are not in the same position as women to confidently assert whether they find it plausible or not because they do not have access to the evidence in the way women are likely to have. (Rooney 2012: 328)
5. The Fallacies Approach to Argument Evaluation
Argumentation theory has a tradition of taking fallacies as an operational concept for identifying problems with arguments. The types of deficiency identified as fallacies emerge from disparate points in the history of philosophy, and, as Charles Hamblin (1970) first recognized, the fallacies approach to argument evaluation tends to lack consensus regarding what constitutes a fallacy. Further, many theorists find that “fallacy” fails as both an analytic category (Massey 1995) and a pedagogical tool (Hitchcock 1995), and yet the scholarly controversy has not put a stop to the regular use of fallacies for evaluating arguments and for teaching reasoning. Feminists share the ambivalence of other philosophers regarding fallacies, adding their own criticisms and developments, but a specific controversy emerges in regard to the adversarial nature of fallacies.
Some feminists decry the inadequacy of traditional fallacies for addressing problems women face in argument exchanges (Al Tamimi 2011) and others point out how some philosophers use fallacy labels to dismiss and silence feminist philosophers. In particular, when feminist philosophers employ arguments concerning the history of philosophy, they have been charged with committing the genetic fallacy (e.g., Levin 1988). That fallacy results from taking the significance of a claim or theory to depend on its origin and history—its genesis—and thereby dismissing that view without attention to its current meaning and context. Feminist philosophers consider how the fact that mostly men developed certain theories, including many philosophical theories, may undermine the justification for applying these theories to women. In doing so, feminists also attend to how those theories currently operate.
The difficulty some philosophers have in recognizing the sophistication of feminist historical criticism regarding philosophical theories may be due, first, to feminist use of certain theories that were the target for philosophers who developed the category “genetic fallacy”. Margaret Crouch explains that the concept of the genetic fallacy was developed only in the early twentieth century by some philosophers in the analytic tradition with the explicit intention of discounting the scientific status of Marxist and Freudian accounts. Given that Marxist and Freudian accounts from the continental European tradition have influenced a good deal of feminist theory, Crouch argues that it is unsurprising that feminist analysis might seem at first glance to commit the genetic fallacy (1991; 1993).
Moreover, Crouch argues, employing the label of “genetic fallacy” against feminist criticisms of the historically masculine sources for popular views in the discipline of philosophy relies on a misunderstanding of what constitutes a fallacy at a point where reasonable consensus has emerged: not every instance of a pattern of reasoning associated with a fallacy label—here genetic appeals—constitutes that fallacy; there may be exceptions and even highly reasonable practices that employ the same pattern. So, some appeals to personal characteristics are relevant and do not commit the ad hominem fallacy and some appeals to authority are perfectly reasonable and not cases of the ad verecundiam fallacy (Walton 1995). Scholarship on the genetic fallacy likewise recognizes that the way a theory developed historically only sometimes affects the value of the reasoning now supporting it. In particular, Crouch explains that the genesis of a claim affects its justification when testimony provides its only support, or when a claim involves the speaker as a subject, and whenever the source of information has an objective connection supporting the statement’s truth or falsity (1991; 1993).
The charge that feminist epistemology commits the genetic fallacy in asking such questions about the origins of the canon not only depends on a misunderstanding of that fallacy, the criticism itself also commits the fallacy of begging the question. Critics of some feminist philosophy make the epistemological assumption that the origins of a belief are irrelevant to its justification, which is the very claim that these feminists reject (see Crouch 1991). For instance, standpoint theorists argue that women’s material situation affects and can advantage the types of understanding that women and feminists have (Harding 1991). Critics of feminist epistemology cannot simply assume that the use of a certain type of premise makes a line of reasoning unjustified.
This kind of exchange between feminists and their critics—one that involves each party accusing the other of committing fallacies—illustrates how arguers may use fallacy labels to characterize their disagreements. Some feminists advocate fallacy analysis as a contextualized form of epistemology (Janack & Adams 1999) and some suggest the development of new fallacy labels to help address feminist epistemological concerns. Code suggests a counterpart for ad hominem be known as ad feminam to address how listeners and audiences discount women’s testimony (1995: 58–82). Also, androcentrism, the assumption of a masculine standard, can be named as a typical problem arising in argumentation by using the fallacies approach. More generally, Hundleby (2016) argues that assuming the desirability of stereotypic qualities of people who tend to be systematically granted social authority, such as men and white people, may be identified as the “status quo fallacy”. Better education about fallacies in argumentation may help to address the implicit bias that can underlie the “status quo fallacy”. The proposal of new fallacy labels, for example, ad stuprum or the appeal to sex (Anger & Hundleby 2016), is by no means unique to feminism, but it offers special power for social justice projects in providing language to account for socially marginalized experience, thus addressing hermeneutical injustices.
Proficiency with the fallacies approach can be empowering even though any claim that a fallacy has been committed makes disagreement explicit and that involves an adversarial quality which can make it difficult for socially marginalized people to use. It entails at least a minimal level of adversariality of the sort described by Govier (1999): “minimal adversariality” is opposition to another person’s view but not to the person. The involvement of even this minimal level of adversariality may make the fallacies approach a form of argument analysis difficult for members of subordinated classes to employ in contexts where socialization and norms of politeness discourage subordinates from expressing dissent (Rooney 2003). Yet, some individual women find success in adversarial engagement, some take pleasure in the heightened opposition of debate, and adversarial conversation is key to some women’s culture and identity (Schiffrin 1984; Henning 2018, 2021). Moreover, opposition is necessary for feminist resistance, struggle, and change. In these ways, women, feminists, and others with related liberatory projects can find unique resources in the adversariality of the fallacies approach.
6. Critical Thinking and Argument Pedagogy
Fallacies remain a popular way to teach reasoning, as does argument analysis more generally. Both play central roles in the content of Canadian, US, and UK post-secondary education as part of the set of skills regularly taught under the name “critical thinking” in philosophy departments. Education allows cultures of reasoning to reinforce and reproduce themselves and these cultures affect the prospects for feminist transformation of the larger society. Educational institutions have authority and grant authority to systems of thought and to individuals and in this way critical thinking education provides opportunities for conformity or for social transformation, starting at the level of individual reasoning and interpersonal discourse. In many ways, the ideal and practice of critical thinking serves social progress but in other ways it needs reform.
The way that argument education works its way from the academy into ordinary reasoning practices may be rather indirect and slow but academic philosophy is not merely one discourse among others and it has a central role in validating or authorizing other discourses (Alcoff 1993), especially in the epistemological assumptions conveyed through critical thinking pedagogy. Courses in critical thinking became stock components of the undergraduate curriculum during the late twentieth century and so the standards for reasoning implicit in “critical thinking” as an educational goal for students directly impact on countless students every year. Critical thinking operates as a specifically Western practice and ideal that provides alternatives to patterns of reasoning that enforce male dominance in various cultures, Western culture included (Norris 1995). The appeals to individual rationality and independent reasoning in the critical thinking curriculum contrast with appeals to tradition and with prioritizing community and personal relationships.
Systems of thinking, such as theories or logics, and speech acts, such as arguments, can hold authority that is not attached to a specific speaker or type of speaker, even though people may be paradigmatic holders of authority. The authority of social institutions, especially in their claims to be objective, Code argues (1995: 21, 181), may be likewise justified or not justified. Granting the justification of depersonalized authorities that include institutions of postsecondary education becomes second nature in a technological society, while those who lack social status and expertise have heightened dependence on the authority of expertise. This authority actually lies in the hands of people who have social privilege and yet people who are socially marginalized have a serious stake in the institutions that develop knowledge, from the legal system and the media to the pedagogy of argumentation in the form of “critical thinking” education (Hundleby 2013b).
Hundleby makes a case that critical thinking courses provided by philosophy departments currently tend to reinforce disciplinary biases because they invoke an authority that lacks the monitoring and evaluation that justifies authority (Hanrahan & Antony 2005). The typical way that textbooks present fallacies exhibits ignorance of the current informal logic scholarship, which would provide the appropriate source of expertise. There are few textbooks written by scholars who have published even one article in argumentation or logic and these same textbooks written by non-specialists are most likely to evince the Adversary Method described by Moulton (1983). The unreflective nature of dependence on that Method suggests that it remains authoritative—as well as “paradigmatic”—in philosophy (Hundleby 2010).
Gilbert argues that critical thinking education ought to affirm a range of considerations that do not enter into traditional logic (Gilbert 1994: 111). Contemporary philosophical theorizing tends to treat arguments as premise-conclusion complexes, merely as “products” of the discourse that generates them (Wenzel 1980 ), without considering the processes that give rise to them. The focus on premise-conclusion complexes obscures factors relevant to the feminist goal of preventing harm (Lang 2010) and such a lack of appropriate “rhetorical spaces” or conceptual frameworks in philosophy impedes the education of people about the problems that women face (Code 1995). The standard Euro-American philosophical practices of the Adversary Paradigm or the Critical-Logical model sideline important aspects of arguing that indicate the significance and cogency of feminist claims about things like the social identities of arguers. Argument has a testimonial dimension, as Audrey Yap explains (2013; 2015). Consciousness of such situational aspects of reasoning and philosophical argumentation facilitates the appreciation of feminist perspectives. It also provides for more rigorous analysis and more thoroughly critical thinking.
Bucking the large trend of textbooks that fail to reflect the argumentation scholarship, Linker (2015) follows in a minor tradition of textbooks by expert authors that also advance scholarly theorizing about argumentation (e.g., Govier 1985; Johnson & Blair 1977; Makau & Marty 2001, 2013). Her Intellectual Empathy aims to provide reasoners with skills for understanding how social inequalities affect people’s lives and how those structures are maintained. The first three skills involved in “intellectual empathy” are: (i) understanding the invisibility of privilege; (ii) knowing that social identity is intersectional; and (iii) using models of cooperative reasoning. Linker argues that social identity lies at the center of what Quine calls the “web of belief”, which is to say it is deeply connected with many of a person’s beliefs; and for Linker that involves it in their self-esteem. The personal stake people have in their social identities means that discussion that engages our identities can be emotionally fraught. We “take it personally”. When people are arguing about aspects of social identity, they often fall into feelings of blame or guilt. Linker suggests that reasoners can find alternatives to such destructive responses by consideration of the complexities of everyone’s individual situation regarding social privilege. Attending to the specificities of each other’s perspectives allows us to better understand each other and set up reasoners for more cooperative and less adversarial arguing (Linker 2015: 98).
According to Linker, intellectual empathy also requires that when encountering a view that seems biased or stereotypical reasoners (iv) apply a principle of conditional trust, treating the person holding the view as reasonable and well-intentioned. This assumption allows us better to learn about the real reasons the person holds the view, and generally improves the audience’s ability to gather and share evidence (2015: 156–158).
Finally, Linker advises (v) recognizing our mutual vulnerability to bias and stereotype, while at the same time allowing ourselves to be responsive and accommodating to new information. This demands courage and strength. Linker’s five skills thus provide a way to address the testimonial dimensions of arguing with special attention to their operation when people argue from very different social locations. This vision of critical thinking steps forward in addressing feminist concerns with the cultures and practices of argumentation.
7. Feminism, the Discipline of Philosophy, and Argumentation Scholarship
In conclusion, as we see especially in the discussions of fallacies and argument pedagogy as well as in the dominance of the Adversary Method, feminist philosophical work on argumentation reveals a need for philosophers to attend to argumentation scholarship. Outdated or unscholarly conceptions of how different modes and styles of arguing serve the advancement of knowledge can undermine the value of philosophical reasoning and specifically how philosophers respond to feminist philosophy. Yet, the work by interdisciplinary argumentation scholars and feminist philosophers to explore these tensions receives little uptake in the discipline of philosophy.
Among the feminist topics in argumentation scholarship that remain in need of philosophical attention are: the range and complexity of values that arguing can serve, including social justice, social bonding, dispute resolution, and knowledge; and more thorough representations of arguing practices that account for how discursive norms code power and privilege, such as through politeness and testimonial authority. Feminist research on these topics will be important for scholarship on argumentation and also for the discipline of philosophy, given the centrality of arguing to its practice. Interdisciplinary vantage points on argumentation provide resources useful for feminist purposes and promise a broader perspective that might unify different feminist concerns; at the same time, other disciplines can face their own challenges from a feminist perspective, as rhetorical studies does for taking persuasion to provide the only purpose for arguing.
Feminist concerns about argumentation pull in different directions and create a great deal of room for further research. Feminists regularly oppose practices and theories central to the discipline of philosophy and some such form of opposition is intrinsic to feminist work. Yet feminists criticize overemphasis on the opposition that occurs in the default adoption of adversarial styles of reasoning in philosophy and in the assumption that arguers must oppose each other or that they must have contrary beliefs. Appeals to politeness do not provide the easy resolution to these concerns that some argumentation theorists often presume. In addition, although some of the worst tendencies in argumentation scholarship may be passed on generation to generation in critical thinking classes taught by philosophers, these classes have potential to create progress toward social justice. Let us note that, overall, feminist perspectives on argumentation challenge broad social and epistemological norms as well as attend to the ways the norms play out in the culture of critical thinking, academic philosophy, and other accepted standards for shared reasoning.
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- Janack, Marianne, (n.d.), “Feminist Epistemology”, The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Linker, Maureen, (n.d.), Intellectual Empathy: Critical Thinking for Social Justice (Facebook page)
- Palczewski, Catherine H., (n.d.), Suffrage Postcard Archive, Cedar Falls, IA: University of Northern Iowa.
- The Implicit Association Test provides recent research evidence of implicit bias. The portal allows you to take classic versions of the test, e.g., regarding race and gender, or participate in new studies. The significance of the test has been subject to some controversy explored at The Brains Blog.
- “Open for Debate”, Blog at Cardiff University about public debate including the problem of arrogant and aggressive behaviors.
- Proceedings of conferences organized by the Ontario Society for the Study of Argumentation (OSSA).
- The American Philosophical Association Newsletter on Feminism and Philosophy.
[Please contact the author with additional suggestions.]