Karl Popper

First published Thu Nov 13, 1997; substantive revision Wed Sep 21, 2016

Karl Popper is generally regarded as one of the greatest philosophers of science of the 20th century. He was also a social and political philosopher of considerable stature, a self-professed critical-rationalist, a dedicated opponent of all forms of scepticism, conventionalism, and relativism in science and in human affairs generally and a committed advocate and staunch defender of the ‘Open Society’. One of the many remarkable features of Popper’s thought is the scope of his intellectual influence: he was lauded by Bertrand Russell, taught Imre Lakatos, Paul Feyerabend and the future billionaire investor and philanthropist George Soros at the London School of Economics, numbered David Miller, Joseph Agassi, Alan Musgrave and Jeremy Shearmur amongst his research assistants there and had reciprocally beneficial friendships with the economist Friedrich Hayek and the art historian Ernst Gombrich. Additionally, Peter Medawar, John Eccles and Hermann Bondi are amongst the distinguished scientists who have acknowledged their intellectual indebtedness to his work, the latter declaring that “There is no more to science than its method, and there is no more to its method than Popper has said.”

1. Life

Karl Raimund Popper was born on 28 July 1902 in Vienna, which at that time could make some claim to be the cultural epicentre of the western world. His parents, who were of Jewish origin, brought him up in an atmosphere which he was later to describe as ‘decidedly bookish’. His father was a lawyer by profession, but he also took a keen interest in the classics and in philosophy, and communicated to his son an interest in social and political issues which he was to never lose. His mother inculcated in him such a passion for music that for a time he seriously contemplated taking it up as a career, and indeed he initially chose the history of music as a second subject for his Ph.D. examination. Subsequently, his love for music became one of the inspirational forces in the development of his thought, and manifested itself in his highly original interpretation of the relationship between dogmatic and critical thinking, in his account of the distinction between objectivity and subjectivity, and, most importantly, in the growth of his hostility towards all forms of historicism, including historicist ideas about the nature of the ‘progressive’ in music. The young Karl attended the local Realgymnasium, where he was unhappy with the standards of the teaching, and, after an illness which kept him at home for a number of months, he left to attend the University of Vienna in 1918. However, he did not formally enroll at the University by taking the matriculation examination for another four years. 1919 was in many respects the most important formative year of his intellectual life. In that year he became heavily involved in left-wing politics, joined the Association of Socialist School Students, and became for a time a Marxist. However, he was quickly disillusioned with the doctrinaire character of the latter, and soon abandoned it entirely. He also discovered the psychoanalytic theories of Freud and Adler (he served briefly as a voluntary social worker with deprived children in one of the latter’s clinics in the 1920s), and listened entranced to a lecture which Einstein gave in Vienna on relativity theory. The dominance of the critical spirit in Einstein, and its total absence in Marx, Freud and Adler, struck Popper as being of fundamental importance: the pioneers of psychoanalysis, he came to think, couched their theories in terms which made them amenable only to confirmation, while Einstein’s theory, crucially, had testable implications which, if false, would have falsified the theory itself.

Popper had a rather melancholic personality and took some time to settle on a career; he trained as a cabinetmaker, obtained a primary school teaching diploma in 1925 and qualified to teach mathematics and physics in secondary school in 1929. He undertook a doctoral programme with the department of psychology at the University of Vienna the under the supervision of Karl Bühler, who, with Otto Külpe, was one of the founder members of the Würzburg school of experimental psychology. Popper’s project was initially designed as a psychological investigation of human memory, on which he had conducted initial research. However, the subject matter of a planned introductory chapter on methodology assumed a position of increasing pre-eminence and this resonated with Bühler, who, as a distinguished Kantian scholar, a professor of philosophy as well as psychology, had famously addressed the issue of the contemporary ‘crisis in psychology’. This ‘crisis’, for Bühler, related to the question of the unity of psychology and had been generated by the proliferation of then competing paradigms within psychology which had undermined the hitherto dominant associationist one and problematized the question of method. Accordingly, under Bühler’s direction, Popper switched his topic to the methodological problem of cognitive psychology and received his doctorate in 1928 for his dissertation “Die Methodenfrage der Denkpsychologie”. In extending Bühler’s Kantian approach to the crisis in the dissertation, Popper critiqued Moritz Schlick’s physicalist programme for a scientific psychology based ultimately upon the transformation of psychology into a science of brain processes. This latter ideal, Popper argued, was misconceived, but the issues raised by it ultimately had the effect of refocusing his attention from Bühler’s question of the unity of psychology to that of its scientificity, and this philosophical focus on questions of method, objectivity and claims to scientific status was to become a principal life-long concern for him. This also brought the orientation of his thought into line with that of such contemporary ‘analytic’ philosophers as Frege and Russell as well as that of many members of the Vienna Circle and led him to effectively abandon psychology for philosophy of science.

Popper married Josephine Anna Henninger (‘Hennie’) in 1930, and she oversaw his welfare with unflagging support and devotion, serving additionally as his amanuensis until her death in 1985. At an early stage of their marriage they decided that they would never have children, a decision which Popper was able to look back on in later life with apparent equanimity. In 1937 Popper took up a position teaching philosophy at the University of Canterbury in New Zealand, where he was to remain for the duration of the Second World War, though he had a rather tense relationship with his head of department. Additionally, Hennie had difficulty adapting to life away from her native Vienna and homesickness made her increasingly unhappy; this was exacerbated by the sheer relentlessness of Popper’s personal work ethic, which they both found exhausting.

The annexation of Austria in 1938 became the catalyst which prompted Popper to refocus his writings on social and political philosophy and he published The Open Society and Its Enemies, his critique of totalitarianism, in 1945. In 1946 he moved to England to teach at the London School of Economics, and became professor of logic and scientific method at the University of London in 1949. From this point on his reputation and stature as a philosopher of science and social thinker grew enormously, and he continued to write prolifically—a number of his works, particularly The Logic of Scientific Discovery (1959), are now widely seen as pioneering classics in the field. However, he combined a combative personality with a zeal for self-aggrandisement that did little to endear him to professional colleagues at a personal level. He was ill-at-ease in the philosophical milieu of post-war Britain which was, as he saw it, fixated with trivial linguistic concerns dictated by Wittgenstein, whom he considered to be his nemesis. Popper was a somewhat paradoxical man, whose theoretic commitment to the primacy of rational criticism was counterpointed by hostility towards anything that amounted to less than total acceptance of his own thought, and in Britain—as had been the case in Vienna—he became increasingly an isolated figure, though his ideas continued to inspire admiration.

In later years Popper came under philosophical criticism for his prescriptive approach to science and his emphasis on the logic of falsification. This was superseded in the eyes of many by the socio-historical approach taken by Thomas Kuhn in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962), who—in arguing for the incommensurability of rival scientific paradigms—reintroduced the idea that change in science is essentially dialectical and is dependent upon the establishment of consensus within communities of researchers.

Popper was knighted in 1965, and retired from the University of London in 1969, though he remained active as a writer, broadcaster and lecturer until his death in 1994. (For more detail on Popper’s life, cf. his Unended Quest).

2. Backdrop to his Thought

A number of biographical features may be identified as having a particular influence upon Popper’s thought. In the first place, his teenage flirtation with Marxism left him thoroughly familiar with the Marxist view of economics, class-war, and history. Secondly, he was appalled by the failure of the democratic parties to stem the rising tide of fascism in his native Austria in the 1920s and 1930s, and the effective welcome extended to it by the Marxists. The latter acted on the ideological grounds that it constituted what they believed to be a necessary dialectical step towards the implosion of capitalism and the ultimate revolutionary victory of communism. This was one factor which led to the much feared Anschluss, the annexation of Austria by the German Reich, the anticipation of which forced Popper into permanent exile from his native country. The Poverty of Historicism (1944) and The Open Society and Its Enemies (1945), his most impassioned and brilliant social works, are as a consequence a powerful defence of democratic liberalism as a social and political philosophy, and a devastating critique of the principal philosophical presuppositions underpinning all forms of totalitarianism. Thirdly, as we have seen, Popper was profoundly impressed by the differences between the allegedly ‘scientific’ theories of Freud and Adler and the revolution effected by Einstein’s theory of relativity in physics in the first two decades of this century. The main difference between them, as Popper saw it, was that while Einstein’s theory was highly ‘risky’, in the sense that it was possible to deduce consequences from it which were, in the light of the then dominant Newtonian physics, highly improbable (e.g., that light is deflected towards solid bodies—confirmed by Eddington’s experiments in 1919), and which would, if they turned out to be false, falsify the whole theory, nothing could, even in principle, falsify psychoanalytic theories. These latter, Popper came to feel, have more in common with primitive myths than with genuine science. That is to say, he saw that what is apparently the chief source of strength of psychoanalysis, and the principal basis on which its claim to scientific status is grounded, viz. its capability to accommodate, and explain, every possible form of human behaviour, is in fact a critical weakness, for it entails that it is not, and could not be, genuinely predictive. Psychoanalytic theories by their nature are insufficiently precise to have negative implications, and so are immunised from experiential falsification.

The Marxist account of history too, Popper held, is not scientific, although it differs in certain crucial respects from psychoanalysis. For Marxism, Popper believed, had been initially scientific, in that Marx had postulated a theory which was genuinely predictive. However, when these predictions were not in fact borne out, the theory was saved from falsification by the addition of ad hoc hypotheses which made it compatible with the facts. By this means, Popper asserted, a theory which was initially genuinely scientific degenerated into pseudo-scientific dogma.

These factors combined to make Popper take falsifiability as his criterion for demarcating science from non-science: if a theory is incompatible with possible empirical observations it is scientific; conversely, a theory which is compatible with all such observations, either because, as in the case of Marxism, it has been modified solely to accommodate such observations, or because, as in the case of psychoanalytic theories, it is consistent with all possible observations, is unscientific. For Popper, however, to assert that a theory is unscientific, is not necessarily to hold that it is unenlightening, still less that it is meaningless, for it sometimes happens that a theory which is unscientific (because it is unfalsifiable) at a given time may become falsifiable, and thus scientific, with the development of technology, or with the further articulation and refinement of the theory. Further, even purely mythogenic explanations have performed a valuable function in the past in expediting our understanding of the nature of reality.

3. The Problem of Demarcation

As Popper represents it, the central problem in the philosophy of science is that of demarcation, i.e., of distinguishing between science and what he terms ‘non-science’, under which heading he ranks, amongst others, logic, metaphysics, psychoanalysis, and Adler’s individual psychology. Popper is unusual amongst contemporary philosophers in that he accepts the validity of the Humean critique of induction, and indeed, goes beyond it in arguing that induction is never actually used in science. However, he does not concede that this entails the scepticism which is associated with Hume, and argues that the Baconian/Newtonian insistence on the primacy of ‘pure’ observation, as the initial step in the formation of theories, is completely misguided: all observation is selective and theory-laden—there are no pure or theory-free observations. In this way he destabilises the traditional view that science can be distinguished from non-science on the basis of its inductive methodology; in contradistinction to this, Popper holds that there is no unique methodology specific to science. Science, like virtually every other human, and indeed organic, activity, Popper believes, consists largely of problem-solving.

Popper accordingly repudiates induction and rejects the view that it is the characteristic method of scientific investigation and inference, substituting falsifiability in its place. It is easy, he argues, to obtain evidence in favour of virtually any theory, and he consequently holds that such ‘corroboration’, as he terms it, should count scientifically only if it is the positive result of a genuinely ‘risky’ prediction, which might conceivably have been false. For Popper, a theory is scientific only if it is refutable by a conceivable event. Every genuine test of a scientific theory, then, is logically an attempt to refute or to falsify it, and one genuine counter-instance falsifies the whole theory. In a critical sense, Popper’s theory of demarcation is based upon his perception of the logical asymmetry which holds between verification and falsification: it is logically impossible to conclusively verify a universal proposition by reference to experience (as Hume saw clearly), but a single counter-instance conclusively falsifies the corresponding universal law. In a word, an exception, far from ‘proving’ a rule, conclusively refutes it.

Every genuine scientific theory then, in Popper’s view, is prohibitive, in the sense that it forbids, by implication, particular events or occurrences. As such it can be tested and falsified, but never logically verified. Thus Popper stresses that it should not be inferred from the fact that a theory has withstood the most rigorous testing, for however long a period of time, that it has been verified; rather we should recognise that such a theory has received a high measure of corroboration. and may be provisionally retained as the best available theory until it is finally falsified (if indeed it is ever falsified), and/or is superseded by a better theory.

Popper has always drawn a clear distinction between the logic of falsifiability and its applied methodology. The logic of his theory is utterly simple: if a single ferrous metal is unaffected by a magnetic field it cannot be the case that all ferrous metals are affected by magnetic fields. Logically speaking, a scientific law is conclusively falsifiable although it is not conclusively verifiable. Methodologically, however, the situation is much more complex: no observation is free from the possibility of error—consequently we may question whether our experimental result was what it appeared to be.

Thus, while advocating falsifiability as the criterion of demarcation for science, Popper explicitly allows for the fact that in practice a single conflicting or counter-instance is never sufficient methodologically to falsify a theory, and that scientific theories are often retained even though much of the available evidence conflicts with them, or is anomalous with respect to them. Scientific theories may, and do, arise genetically in many different ways, and the manner in which a particular scientist comes to formulate a particular theory may be of biographical interest, but it is of no consequence as far as the philosophy of science is concerned. Popper stresses in particular that there is no unique way, no single method such as induction, which functions as the route to scientific theory, a view which Einstein personally endorsed with his affirmation that ‘There is no logical path leading to [the highly universal laws of science]. They can only be reached by intuition, based upon something like an intellectual love of the objects of experience’. Science, in Popper’s view, starts with problems rather than with observations—it is, indeed, precisely in the context of grappling with a problem that the scientist makes observations in the first instance: his observations are selectively designed to test the extent to which a given theory functions as a satisfactory solution to a given problem.

On this criterion of demarcation physics, chemistry, and (non-introspective) psychology, amongst others, are sciences, psychoanalysis is a pre-science (i.e., it undoubtedly contains useful and informative truths, but until such time as psychoanalytical theories can be formulated in such a manner as to be falsifiable, they will not attain the status of scientific theories), and astrology and phrenology are pseudo-sciences. Formally, then, Popper’s theory of demarcation may be articulated as follows: where a ‘basic statement’ is to be understood as a particular observation-report, then we may say that a theory is scientific if and only if it divides the class of basic statements into the following two non-empty sub-classes: (a) the class of all those basic statements with which it is inconsistent, or which it prohibits—this is the class of its potential falsifiers (i.e., those statements which, if true, falsify the whole theory), and (b) the class of those basic statements with which it is consistent, or which it permits (i.e., those statements which, if true, corroborate it, or bear it out).

4. The Growth of Human Knowledge

For Popper accordingly, the growth of human knowledge proceeds from our problems and from our attempts to solve them. These attempts involve the formulation of theories which, if they are to explain anomalies which exist with respect to earlier theories, must go beyond existing knowledge and therefore require a leap of the imagination. For this reason, Popper places special emphasis on the role played by the independent creative imagination in the formulation of theory. The centrality and priority of problems in Popper’s account of science is paramount, and it is this which leads him to characterise scientists as ‘problem-solvers’. Further, since the scientist begins with problems rather than with observations or ‘bare facts’, Popper argues that the only logical technique which is an integral part of scientific method is that of the deductive testing of theories which are not themselves the product of any logical operation. In this deductive procedure conclusions are inferred from a tentative hypothesis. These conclusions are then compared with one another and with other relevant statements to determine whether they falsify or corroborate the hypothesis. Such conclusions are not directly compared with the facts, Popper stresses, simply because there are no ‘pure’ facts available; all observation-statements are theory-laden, and are as much a function of purely subjective factors (interests, expectations, wishes, etc.) as they are a function of what is objectively real.

How then does the deductive procedure work? Popper specifies four steps (Logic of Scientific Discovery, 1.3, 9):

(a) The first is formal, a testing of the internal consistency of the theoretical system to see if it involves any contradictions.

(b) The second step is semi-formal, the axiomatising of the theory to distinguish between its empirical and its logical elements. In performing this step the scientist makes the logical form of the theory explicit. Failure to do this can lead to category-mistakes—the scientist ends up asking the wrong questions, and searches for empirical data where none are available. Most scientific theories contain analytic (i.e., a priori) and synthetic elements, and it is necessary to axiomatise them in order to distinguish the two clearly.

(c) The third step is the comparing of the new theory with existing ones to determine whether it constitutes an advance upon them. If it does not constitute such an advance, it will not be adopted. If, on the other hand, its explanatory success matches that of the existing theories, and additionally, it explains some hitherto anomalous phenomenon, or solves some hitherto unsolvable problems, it will be deemed to constitute an advance upon the existing theories, and will be adopted. Thus science involves theoretical progress. However, Popper stresses that we ascertain whether one theory is better than another by deductively testing both theories, rather than by induction. For this reason, he argues that a theory is deemed to be better than another if (while unfalsified) it has greater empirical content, and therefore greater predictive power than its rival. The classic illustration of this in physics was the replacement of Newton’s theory of universal gravitation by Einstein’s theory of relativity. This elucidates the nature of science as Popper sees it: at any given time there will be a number of conflicting theories or conjectures, some of which will explain more than others. The latter will consequently be provisionally adopted. In short, for Popper any theory $$X$$ is better than a ‘rival’ theory $$Y$$ if $$X$$ has greater empirical content, and hence greater predictive power, than $$Y$$.

(d) The fourth and final step is the testing of a theory by the empirical application of the conclusions derived from it. If such conclusions are shown to be true, the theory is corroborated (but never verified). If the conclusion is shown to be false, then this is taken as a signal that the theory cannot be completely correct (logically the theory is falsified), and the scientist begins his quest for a better theory. He does not, however, abandon the present theory until such time as he has a better one to substitute for it. More precisely, the method of theory-testing is as follows: certain singular propositions are deduced from the new theory—these are predictions, and of special interest are those predictions which are ‘risky’ (in the sense of being intuitively implausible or of being startlingly novel) and experimentally testable. From amongst the latter the scientist next selects those which are not derivable from the current or existing theory—of particular importance are those which contradict the current or existing theory. He then seeks a decision as regards these and other derived statements by comparing them with the results of practical applications and experimentation. If the new predictions are borne out, then the new theory is corroborated (and the old one falsified), and is adopted as a working hypothesis. If the predictions are not borne out, then they falsify the theory from which they are derived. Thus Popper retains an element of empiricism: for him scientific method does involve making an appeal to experience. But unlike traditional empiricists, Popper holds that experience cannot determine theory (i.e., we do not argue or infer from observation to theory), it rather delimits it: it shows which theories are false, not which theories are true. Moreover, Popper also rejects the empiricist doctrine that empirical observations are, or can be, infallible, in view of the fact that they are themselves theory-laden.

The general picture of Popper’s philosophy of science, then is this: Hume’s philosophy demonstrates that there is a contradiction implicit in traditional empiricism, which holds both that all knowledge is derived from experience and that universal propositions (including scientific laws) are verifiable by reference to experience. The contradiction, which Hume himself saw clearly, derives from the attempt to show that, notwithstanding the open-ended nature of experience, scientific laws may be construed as empirical generalisations which are in some way finally confirmable by a ‘positive’ experience. Popper eliminates the contradiction by rejecting the first of these principles and removing the demand for empirical verification in favour of empirical falsification in the second. Scientific theories, for him, are not inductively inferred from experience, nor is scientific experimentation carried out with a view to verifying or finally establishing the truth of theories; rather, all knowledge is provisional, conjectural, hypothetical—we can never finally prove our scientific theories, we can merely (provisionally) confirm or (conclusively) refute them; hence at any given time we have to choose between the potentially infinite number of theories which will explain the set of phenomena under investigation. Faced with this choice, we can only eliminate those theories which are demonstrably false, and rationally choose between the remaining, unfalsified theories. Hence Popper’s emphasis on the importance of the critical spirit to science—for him critical thinking is the very essence of rationality. For it is only by critical thought that we can eliminate false theories, and determine which of the remaining theories is the best available one, in the sense of possessing the highest level of explanatory force and predictive power. It is precisely this kind of critical thinking which is conspicuous by its absence in contemporary Marxism and in psychoanalysis.

5. Probability, Knowledge and Verisimilitude

In the view of many social scientists, the more probable a theory is, the better it is, and if we have to choose between two theories which are equally strong in terms of their explanatory power, and differ only in that one is probable and the other is improbable, then we should choose the former. Popper rejects this. Science, or to be precise, the working scientist, is interested, in Popper’s view, in theories with a high informative content, because such theories possess a high predictive power and are consequently highly testable. But if this is true, Popper argues, then, paradoxical as it may sound, the more improbable a theory is the better it is scientifically, because the probability and informative content of a theory vary inversely—the higher the informative content of a theory the lower will be its probability, for the more information a statement contains, the greater will be the number of ways in which it may turn out to be false. Thus the statements which are of special interest to the scientist are those with a high informative content and (consequentially) a low probability, which nevertheless come close to the truth. Informative content, which is in inverse proportion to probability, is in direct proportion to testability. Consequently the severity of the test to which a theory can be subjected, and by means of which it is falsified or corroborated, is all-important.

For Popper, all scientific criticism must be piecemeal, i.e., he holds that it is not possible to question every aspect of a theory at once. More precisely, while attempting to resolve a particular problem a scientist of necessity accepts all kinds of things as unproblematic. These things constitute what Popper terms the ‘background knowledge’. However, he stresses that the background knowledge is not knowledge in the sense of being conclusively established; it may be challenged at any time, especially if it is suspected that its uncritical acceptance may be responsible for difficulties which are subsequently encountered. Nevertheless, it is clearly not possible to question both the theory and the background knowledge at the same time (e.g., in conducting an experiment the scientist of necessity assumes that the apparatus used is in working order).

How then can one be certain that one is questioning the right thing? The Popperian answer is that we cannot have absolute certainty here, but repeated tests usually show where the trouble lies. Even observation statements, Popper maintains, are fallible, and science in his view is not a quest for certain knowledge, but an evolutionary process in which hypotheses or conjectures are imaginatively proposed and tested in order to explain facts or to solve problems. Popper emphasises both the importance of questioning the background knowledge when the need arises, and the significance of the fact that observation-statements are theory-laden, and hence fallible. For while falsifiability is simple as a logical principle, in practice it is exceedingly complicated—no single observation can ever be taken to falsify a theory, for there is always the possibility (a) that the observation itself is mistaken, or (b) that the assumed background knowledge is faulty or defective.

Popper was initially uneasy with the concept of truth, and in his earliest writings he avoided asserting that a theory which is corroborated is true—for clearly if every theory is an open-ended hypothesis, as he maintains, then ipso facto it has to be at least potentially false. For this reason Popper restricted himself to the contention that a theory which is falsified is false and is known to be such, and that a theory which replaces a falsified theory (because it has a higher empirical content than the latter, and explains what has falsified it) is a ‘better theory’ than its predecessor. However, he came to accept Tarski’s reformulation of the correspondence theory of truth, and in Conjectures and Refutations (1963) he integrated the concepts of truth and content to frame the metalogical concept of ‘truthlikeness’ or ‘verisimilitude’. A ‘good’ scientific theory, Popper thus argued, has a higher level of verisimilitude than its rivals, and he explicated this concept by reference to the logical consequences of theories. A theory’s content is the totality of its logical consequences, which can be divided into two classes: there is the ‘truth-content’ of a theory, which is the class of true propositions which may be derived from it, on the one hand, and the ‘falsity-content’ of a theory, on the other hand, which is the class of the theory’s false consequences (this latter class may of course be empty, and in the case of a theory which is true is necessarily empty).

Popper offered two methods of comparing theories in terms of verisimilitude, the qualitative and quantitative definitions. On the qualitative account, Popper asserted:

Assuming that the truth-content and the falsity-content of two theories $$t_1$$ and $$t_2$$ are comparable, we can say that $$t_2$$ is more closely similar to the truth, or corresponds better to the facts, than $$t_1$$, if and only if either:

(a) the truth-content but not the falsity-content of $$t_2$$ exceeds that of $$t_1$$, or

(b) the falsity-content of $$t_1$$, but not its truth-content, exceeds that of $$t_2$$. (Conjectures and Refutations, 233).

Here, verisimilitude is defined in terms of subclass relationships: $$t_2$$ has a higher level of verisimilitude than $$t_1$$ if and only if their truth- and falsity-contents are comparable through subclass relationships, and either (a) $$t_2$$’s truth-content includes $$t_1$$’s and $$t_2$$’s falsity-content, if it exists, is included in, or is the same as, $$t_1$$’s, $$or$$ (b) $$t_2$$’s truth-content includes or is the same as $$t_1$$’s and $$t_2$$’s falsity-content, if it exists, is included in $$t_1$$’s.

On the quantitative account, verisimilitude is defined by assigning quantities to contents, where the index of the content of a given theory is its logical improbability (given again that content and probability vary inversely). Formally, then, Popper defines the quantitative verisimilitude which a statement ‘a’ possesses by means of a formula:

$Vs(a) = Ct_T (a) - Ct_F (a),$

where $$Vs(a)$$ represents the verisimilitude of $$a$$, $$Ct_T (a)$$ is a measure of the truth-content of $$a$$, and $$Ct_F (a)$$ is a measure of its falsity-content.

The utilisation of either method of computing verisimilitude shows, Popper held, that even if a theory $$t_2$$ with a higher content than a rival theory $$t_1$$ is subsequently falsified, it can still legitimately be regarded as a better theory than $$t_1$$, and ‘better’ is here now understood to mean $$t_2$$ is closer to the truth than $$t_1$$. Thus scientific progress involves, on this view, the abandonment of partially true, but falsified, theories, for theories with a higher level of verisimilitude, i.e., which approach more closely to the truth. In this way, verisimilitude allowed Popper to mitigate what many saw as the pessimism of an anti-inductivist philosophy of science which held that most, if not all scientific theories are false, and that a true theory, even if discovered, could not be known to be such. With the introduction of the new concept, Popper was able to represent this as an essentially optimistic position in terms of which we can legitimately be said to have reason to believe that science makes progress towards the truth through the falsification and corroboration of theories. Scientific progress, in other words, could now be represented as progress towards the truth, and experimental corroboration could be seen an indicator of verisimilitude.

However, in the 1970s a series of papers published by researchers such as Miller, Tichý, and Grünbaum in particular revealed fundamental defects in Popper’s formal definitions of verisimilitude. The significance of this work was that verisimilitude is largely important in Popper’s system because of its application to theories which are known to be false. In this connection, Popper had written:

Ultimately, the idea of verisimilitude is most important in cases where we know that we have to work with theories which are at best approximations—that is to say, theories of which we know that they cannot be true. (This is often the case in the social sciences). In these cases we can still speak of better or worse approximations to the truth (and we therefore do not need to interpret these cases in an instrumentalist sense). (Conjectures and Refutations, 235).

For these reasons, the deficiencies discovered by the critics in Popper’s formal definitions were seen by many as critical, precisely because the most significant of these related to the levels of verisimilitude of false theories. In 1974, Miller and Tichý, working independently of each other, demonstrated that the conditions specified by Popper in his accounts of both qualitative and quantitative verisimilitude for comparing the truth- and falsity-contents of theories can be satisfied only when the theories are true. In the crucially important case of false theories, however, Popper’s definitions are formally defective. For while Popper had believed that verisimilitude intersected positively with his account of corroboration, in the sense that he viewed an improbable theory which had withstood critical testing as one the truth-content of which is great relative to rival theories, while its falsity-content (if it exists) would be relatively low, Miller and Tichý proved, on the contrary, that in the case of a false theory $$t_2$$ which has excess content over a rival theory false $$t_1$$ both the truth-content and the falsity-content of $$t_2$$ will exceed that of $$t_1$$. With respect to theories which are false, therefore, Popper’s conditions for comparing levels of verisimilitude, whether in quantitative and qualitative terms, can never be met.

Commentators on Popper, with few exceptions, had initially attached little importance to his theory of verisimilitude. However, after the failure of Popper’s definitions in 1974, some critics came to see it as central to his philosophy of science, and consequentially held that the whole edifice of the latter had been subverted. For his part, Popper’s response was two-fold. In the first place, while acknowledging the deficiencies in his own formal account (“my main mistake was my failure to see at once that … if the content of a false statement $$a$$ exceeds that of a statement $$b$$, then the truth-content of $$a$$ exceeds the truth-content of $$b$$, and the same holds of their falsity-contents”, Objective Knowledge, 371), Popper argued that “I do think that we should not conclude from the failure of my attempts to solve the problem [of defining verisimilitude] that the problem cannot be solved” (Objective Knowledge, 372), a point of view which was to precipitate more than two decades of important technical research in this field. At another, more fundamental level, he moved the task of formally defining the concept from centre-stage in his philosophy of science, by protesting that he had never intended to imply “that degrees of verisimilitude … can ever be numerically determined, except in certain limiting cases” (Objective Knowledge, 59), and arguing instead that the chief value of the concept is heuristic and intuitive, in which the absence of an adequate formal definition is not an insuperable impediment to its utilisation in the actual appraisal of theories relativised to problems in which we have an interest. The thrust of the latter strategy seems to many to genuinely reflect the significance of the concept of verisimilitude in Popper’s system, but it has not satisfied all of his critics.

6. Social and Political Thought—The Critique of Historicism and Holism

Given Popper’s personal history and background, it is hardly surprising that he developed a deep and abiding interest in social and political philosophy. However, it is worth emphasising that his angle of approach to these fields is through a consideration of the nature of the social sciences which seek to describe and explicate them systematically, particularly history. It is in this context that he offers an account of the nature of scientific prediction, which in turn allows him a point of departure for his attack upon totalitarianism and all its intellectual supports, especially holism and historicism. In this context holism is to be understood as the view that human social groupings are greater than the sum of their members, that such groupings are ‘organic’ entities in their own right, that they act on their human members and shape their destinies, and that they are subject to their own independent laws of development. Historicism, which is closely associated with holism, is the belief that history develops inexorably and necessarily according to certain principles or rules towards a determinate end (as for example in the dialectic of Hegel, which was adopted and implemented by Marx). The link between holism and historicism is that the holist believes that individuals are essentially formed by the social groupings to which they belong, while the historicist—who is usually also a holist—holds that we can understand such a social grouping only in terms of the internal principles which determine its development.

These beliefs lead to what Popper calls ‘The Historicist Doctrine of the Social Sciences’, the views (a) that the principal task of the social sciences is to make predictions about the social and political development of man, and (b) that the task of politics, once the key predictions have been made, is, in Marx’s words, to lessen the ‘birth pangs’ of future social and political developments. Popper thinks that this view of the social sciences is both theoretically misconceived (in the sense of being based upon a view of natural science and its methodology which is totally wrong), and socially dangerous, as it leads inevitably to totalitarianism and authoritarianism—to centralised governmental control of the individual and the attempted imposition of large-scale social planning. Against this Popper strongly advances the view that any human social grouping is no more (or less) than the sum of its individual members, that what happens in history is the (largely unplanned and unforeseeable) result of the actions of such individuals, and that large scale social planning to an antecedently conceived blueprint is inherently misconceived—and inevitably disastrous—precisely because human actions have consequences which cannot be foreseen. Popper, then, is an historical indeterminist, insofar as he holds that history does not evolve in accordance with intrinsic laws or principles, that in the absence of such laws and principles unconditional prediction in the social sciences is an impossibility, and that there is no such thing as historical necessity.

The link between Popper’s theory of knowledge and his social philosophy is his fallibilism—just as we make theoretical progress in science by deliberately subjecting our theories to critical scrutiny, and abandoning those which have been falsified, so too, Popper holds, the critical spirit can and should be sustained at the social level. More specifically, the open society can be brought about only if it is possible for the individual citizen to evaluate critically the consequences of the implementation of government policies, which can then be abandoned or modified in the light of such critical scrutiny—in such a society, the rights of the individual to criticise administrative policies will be formally safeguarded and upheld, undesirable policies will be eliminated in a manner analogous to the elimination of falsified scientific theories, and differences between people on social policy will be resolved by critical discussion and argument rather than by force. The open society as thus conceived of by Popper may be defined as ‘an association of free individuals respecting each other’s rights within the framework of mutual protection supplied by the state, and achieving, through the making of responsible, rational decisions, a growing measure of humane and enlightened life’ (Levinson, R.B. In Defense of Plato, 17). As such, Popper holds, it is not a utopian ideal, but an empirically realised form of social organisation which, he argues, is in every respect superior to its (real or potential) totalitarian rivals. But he does not engage in a moral defence of the ideology of liberalism; rather his strategy is the much deeper one of showing that totalitarianism is typically based upon historicist and holist presuppositions, and of demonstrating that these presuppositions are fundamentally incoherent.

7. Scientific Knowledge, History, and Prediction

At a very general level, Popper argues that historicism and holism have their origins in what he terms ‘one of the oldest dreams of mankind—the dream of prophecy, the idea that we can know what the future has in store for us, and that we can profit from such knowledge by adjusting our policy to it.’ (Conjectures and Refutations, 338). This dream was given further impetus, he speculates, by the emergence of a genuine predictive capability regarding such events as solar and lunar eclipses at an early stage in human civilisation, which has of course become increasingly refined with the development of the natural sciences and their concomitant technologies. The kind of reasoning which has made, and continues to make, historicism plausible may, on this account, be reconstructed as follows: if the application of the laws of the natural sciences can lead to the successful prediction of such future events as eclipses, then surely it is reasonable to infer that knowledge of the laws of history as yielded by a social science or sciences (assuming that such laws exist) would lead to the successful prediction of such future social phenomena as revolutions? Why should it be possible to predict an eclipse, but not a revolution? Why can we not conceive of a social science which could and would function as the theoretical natural sciences function, and yield precise unconditional predictions in the appropriate sphere of application? These are amongst the questions which Popper seeks to answer, and in doing so, to show that they are based upon a series of misconceptions about the nature of science, and about the relationship between scientific laws and scientific prediction.

His first argument may be summarised as follows: in relation to the critically important concept of prediction, Popper makes a distinction between what he terms ‘conditional scientific predictions’, which have the form ‘If $$X$$ takes place, then $$Y$$ will take place’, and ‘unconditional scientific prophecies’, which have the form ‘$$Y$$ will take place’. Contrary to popular belief, it is the former rather than the latter which are typical of the natural sciences, which means that typically prediction in natural science is conditional and limited in scope—it takes the form of hypothetical assertions stating that certain specified changes will come about if particular specified events antecedently take place. This is not to deny that ‘unconditional scientific prophecies’, such as the prediction of eclipses, for example, do take place in science, and that the theoretical natural sciences make them possible. However, Popper argues that (a) these unconditional prophecies are not characteristic of the natural sciences, and (b) that the mechanism whereby they occur, in the very limited way in which they do, is not understood by the historicist.

What is the mechanism which makes unconditional scientific prophecies possible? The answer is that such prophecies can sometimes be derived from a combination of conditional predictions (themselves derived from scientific laws) and existential statements specifying that the conditions in relation to the system being investigated are fulfilled. Schematically, this can be represented as follows:

$[\mathrm{C.P.} + \mathrm{E.S.}]= \mathrm{U.P.}$

where $$\mathrm{C.P.} =$$ Conditional Prediction; $$\mathrm{E.S.} =$$ Existential Statement; $$\mathrm{U.P.} =$$ Unconditional Prophecy. The most common examples of unconditional scientific prophecies in science relate to the prediction of such phenomena as lunar and solar eclipses and comets.

Given, then, that this is the mechanism which generates unconditional scientific prophecies, Popper makes two related claims about historicism: (a) That the historicist does not in fact derive his unconditional scientific prophecies in this manner from conditional predictions, and (b) the historicist cannot do so because long-term unconditional scientific prophecies can be derived from conditional predictions only if they apply to systems which are well-isolated, stationary, and recurrent (like our solar system). Such systems are quite rare in nature, and human society is most emphatically not one of them.

This, then, Popper argues, is the reason why it is a fundamental mistake for the historicist to take the unconditional scientific prophecies of eclipses as being typical and characteristic of the predictions of natural science—in fact such predictions are possible only because our solar system is a stationary and repetitive system which is isolated from other such systems by immense expanses of empty space. The solar system aside, there are very few such systems around for scientific investigation—most of the others are confined to the field of biology, where unconditional prophecies about the life-cycles of organisms are made possible by the existence of precisely the same factors. Thus one of the fallacies committed by the historicist is to take the (relatively rare) instances of unconditional prophecies in the natural science as constituting the essence of what scientific prediction is, to fail to see that such prophecies apply only to systems which are isolated, stationary, and repetitive, and to seek to apply the method of scientific prophecy to human society and human history. The latter, of course, is not an isolated system (in fact it’s not a system at all), it is constantly changing, and it continually undergoes rapid, non-repetitive development. In the most fundamental sense possible, every event in human history is discrete, novel, quite unique, and ontologically distinct from every other historical event. For this reason, it is impossible in principle that unconditional scientific prophecies could be made in relation to human history—the idea that the successful unconditional prediction of eclipses provides us with reasonable grounds for the hope of successful unconditional prediction regarding the evolution of human history turns out to be based upon a gross misconception, and is quite false. As Popper himself concludes, “The fact that we predict eclipses does not, therefore, provide a valid reason for expecting that we can predict revolutions.” (Conjectures and Refutations, 340).

8. Immutable Laws and Contingent Trends

This argument is one of the strongest that has ever been brought against historicism, cutting, as it does, right to the heart of one of its main theoretical presuppositions. However, it is not Popper’s only argument against it. An additional mistake which he detects in historicism is the failure of the historicist to distinguish between scientific laws and trends, which is also frequently accompanied by a simple logical fallacy. The fallacy is that of inferring from the fact that our understanding of any (past) historical event—such as, for example, the French Revolution—is in direct proportion to our knowledge of the antecedent conditions which led to that event, that knowledge of all the antecedent conditions of some future event is possible, and that such knowledge would make that future event precisely predictable. For the truth is that the number of factors which predate and lead to the occurrence of any event, past, present, or future, is indefinitely large, and therefore knowledge of all of these factors is impossible, even in principle. What gives rise to the fallacy is the manner in which the historian (necessarily) selectively isolates a finite number of the antecedent conditions of some past event as being of particular importance, which are then somewhat misleadingly termed ‘the causes’ of that event, when in fact what this means is that they are the specific conditions which a particular historian or group of historians take to be more relevant than any other of the indefinitely large number of such conditions (for this reason, most historical debates range over the question as to whether the conditions thus specified are the right ones). While this kind of selectivity may be justifiable in relation to the treatment of any past event, it has no basis whatsoever in relation to the future—if we now select, as Marx did, the ‘relevant’ antecedent conditions for some future event, the likelihood is that we will select wrongly.

The historicist’s failure to distinguish between scientific laws and trends is equally destructive of his cause. This failure makes him think it possible to explain change by discovering trends running through past history, and to anticipate and predict future occurrences on the basis of such observations. Here Popper points out that there is a critical difference between a trend and a scientific law, the failure to observe which is fatal. For a scientific law is universal in form, while a trend can be expressed only as a singular existential statement. This logical difference is crucial because unconditional predictions, as we have already seen, can be based only upon conditional ones, which themselves must be derived from scientific laws. Neither conditional nor unconditional predictions can be based upon trends, because these may change or be reversed with a change in the conditions which gave rise to them in the first instance. As Popper puts it, there can be no doubt that “the habit of confusing trends with laws, together with the intuitive observation of trends such as technical progress, inspired the central doctrines of … historicism.” (The Poverty of Historicism, 116). Popper does not, of course, dispute the existence of trends, nor does he deny that the observation of trends can be of practical utility value—but the essential point is that a trend is something which itself ultimately stands in need of scientific explanation, and it cannot therefore function as the frame of reference in terms of which anything else can be scientifically explained or predicted.

A point which connects with this has to do with the role which the evolution of human knowledge has played in the historical development of human society. It is incontestable that, as Marx himself observed, there has been a causal link between the two, in the sense that advances in scientific and technological knowledge have given rise to widespread global changes in patterns of human social organisation and social interaction, which in turn have led to social structures (e.g. educational systems) which further growth in human knowledge. In short, the evolution of human history has been strongly influenced by the growth of human knowledge, and it is extremely likely that this will continue to be the case—all the empirical evidence suggests that the link between the two is progressively consolidating. However, this gives rise to further problems for the historicist. In the first place, the statement that ‘if there is such a thing as growing human knowledge, then we cannot anticipate today what we shall know only tomorrow’ is, Popper holds, intuitively highly plausible. Moreover, he argues, it is logically demonstrable by a consideration of the implications of the fact that no scientific predictor, human or otherwise, can possibly predict, by scientific methods, its own future results. From this it follows, he holds, that ‘no society can predict, scientifically, its own future states of knowledge’. (The Poverty of Historicism, vii). Thus, while the future evolution of human history is extremely likely to be influenced by new developments in human knowledge, as it always has in the past, we cannot now scientifically determine what such knowledge will be. From this it follows that if the future holds any new discoveries or any new developments in the growth of our knowledge (and given the fallible nature of the latter, it is inconceivable that it does not), then it is impossible for us to predict them now, and it is therefore impossible for us to predict the future development of human history now, given that the latter will, at least in part, be determined by the future growth of our knowledge. Thus once again historicism collapses—the dream of a theoretical, predictive science of history is unrealisable, because it is an impossible dream.

Popper’s arguments against holism, and in particular his arguments against the propriety of large-scale planning of social structures, are interconnected with his demonstration of the logical shortcomings of the presuppositions of historicism. Popper points out that such planning (which actually took place, of course, in the USSR, in China, and in Cambodia, for example, under totalitarian regimes which accepted forms of historicism and holism) is necessarily structured in the light of the predictions which have been made about future history on the basis of the so-called ‘laws’ which historicists such as Marx and Mao claimed to have discovered in relation to human history. Accordingly, recognition that there are no such laws, and that unconditional predictions about future history are based, at best, upon nothing more substantial than the observation of contingent trends, shows that, from a purely theoretical as well as a practical point of view, large-scale social planning is indeed a recipe for disaster. In summary, unconditional large-scale planning for the future is theoretically as well as practically misguided, because, again, part of what we are planning for is our future knowledge, and our future knowledge is not something which we can in principle now possess—we cannot adequately plan for unexpected advances in our future knowledge, or for the effects which such advances will have upon society as a whole. The acceptance of historical indeterminism, then, as the only philosophy of history which is commensurate with a proper understanding of the nature of scientific knowledge, fatally undermines both historicism and holism.

Popper’s critique of both historicism and holism is balanced, on the positive side, by his affirmation of the ideals of individualism and market economics and his strong defence of the open society—the view, again, that a society is equivalent to the sum of its members, that the actions of the members of society serve to fashion and to shape it, and that the social consequences of intentional actions are very often, and very largely, unintentional. This part of his social philosophy was influenced by the economist Friedrich Hayek, who worked with him at the London School of Economics and who was a life-long friend. Popper advocated what he (rather unfortunately) terms ‘piecemeal social engineering’ as the central mechanism for social planning—for in utilising this mechanism intentional actions are directed to the achievement of one specific goal at a time, which makes it possible to monitor the situation to determine whether adverse unintended effects of intentional actions occur, in order to correct and readjust when this proves necessary. This, of course, parallels precisely the critical testing of theories in scientific investigation. This approach to social planning (which is explicitly based upon the premise that we do not, because we cannot, know what the future will be like) encourages attempts to put right what is problematic in society—generally-acknowledged social ills—rather than attempts to impose some preconceived idea of the ‘good’ upon society as a whole. For this reason, in a genuinely open society piecemeal social engineering goes hand-in-hand for Popper with negative utilitarianism (the attempt to minimise the amount of misery, rather than, as with positive utilitarianism, the attempt to maximise the amount of happiness). The state, he holds, should concern itself with the task of progressively formulating and implementing policies designed to deal with the social problems which actually confront it, with the goal of eliminating human misery and suffering to the highest possible degree. The positive task of increasing social and personal happiness, by contrast, can and should be should be left to individual citizens (who may, of course, act collectively to this end), who, unlike the state, have at least a chance of achieving this goal, but who in a free society are rarely in a position to systematically subvert the rights of others in the pursuit of idealised objectives. Thus in the final analysis for Popper the activity of problem-solving is as definitive of our humanity at the level of social and political organisation as it is at the level of science, and it is this key insight which unifies and integrates the broad spectrum of his thought.

9. Critical Evaluation

While it cannot be said that Popper was a modest man, he took criticism of his theories very seriously, and spent much of his time in his later years trying to show that such criticisms were either based upon misunderstandings, or that his theories could, without loss of integrity, be made compatible with new and important insights. The following is a summary of some of the main criticisms which he has had to address. (For Popper’s responses to critical commentary, see his ‘Replies to My Critics’, in P.A. Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of Karl Popper, Volume 2, and his Realism and the Aim of Science, edited by W.W. Bartley III.)

1. Popper professes to be anti-conventionalist, and his commitment to the correspondence theory of truth places him firmly within the realist’s camp. Yet, following Kant, he strongly repudiates the positivist/empiricist view that basic statements (i.e., present-tense observation statements about sense-data) are infallible, and argues convincingly that such basic statements are not mere ‘reports’ of passively registered sensations. Rather they are descriptions of what is observed as interpreted by the observer with reference to a determinate theoretical framework. This is why Popper repeatedly emphasises that basic statements are not infallible, and it indicates what he means when he says that they are ‘theory laden’—perception itself is an active process, in which the mind assimilates data by reference to an assumed theoretical backdrop. He accordingly asserts that basic statements themselves are open-ended hypotheses: they have a certain causal relationship with experience, but they are not determined by experience, and they cannot be verified or confirmed by experience. However, this poses a difficulty regarding the consistency of Popper’s theory: if a theory $$X$$ is to be genuinely testable (and so scientific) it must be possible to determine whether or not the basic propositions which would, if true, falsify it, are actually true or false (i.e., whether its potential falsifiers are actual falsifiers). But how can this be known, if such basic statements cannot be verified by experience? Popper’s answer is that ‘basic statements are not justifiable by our immediate experiences, but are … accepted by an act, a free decision’. (Logic of Scientific Discovery, 109). However, and notwithstanding Popper’s claims to the contrary, this itself seems to be a refined form of conventionalism—it implies that it is almost entirely an arbitrary matter whether it is accepted that a potential falsifier is an actual one, and consequently that the falsification of a theory is itself the function of a ‘free’ and arbitrary act. It also seems very difficult to reconcile this with Popper’s view that science progressively moves closer to the truth, conceived of in terms of the correspondence theory, for this kind of conventionalism is inimical to this (classical) conception of truth.

3. Scientific laws are expressed by universal statements (i.e., they take the logical form ‘All $$A$$s are $$X$$’, or some equivalent) which are therefore concealed conditionals—they have to be understood as hypothetical statements asserting what would be the case under certain ideal conditions. In themselves they are not existential in nature. Thus ‘All $$A$$s are $$X$$’ means ‘If anything is an $$A$$, then it is $$X$$’. Since scientific laws are non-existential in nature, they logically cannot imply any basic statements, since the latter are explicitly existential. The question arises, then, as to how any basic statement can falsify a scientific law, given that basic statements are not deducible from scientific laws in themselves? Popper answers that scientific laws are always taken in conjunction with statements outlining the ‘initial conditions’ of the system under investigation; these latter, which are singular existential statements, do, when combined with the scientific law, yield hard and fast implications. Thus, the law ‘All $$A$$s are $$X$$’, together with the initial condition statement ‘There is an $$A$$ at $$Y$$’, yields the implication ‘The $$A$$ at $$Y$$ is $$X$$’, which, if false, falsifies the original law.

This reply is adequate only if it is true, as Popper assumes, that singular existential statements will always do the work of bridging the gap between a universal theory and a prediction. Hilary Putnam in particular has argued that this assumption is false, in that in some cases at least the statements required to bridge this gap (which he calls ‘auxiliary hypotheses’) are general rather than particular, and consequently that when the prediction turns out to be false we have no way of knowing whether this is due to the falsity of the scientific law or the falsity of the auxiliary hypotheses. The working scientist, Putnam argues, always initially assumes that it is the latter, which shows not only that scientific laws are, contra Popper, highly resistant to falsification, but also why they are so highly resistant to falsification.

Popper’s final position is that he acknowledges that it is impossible to discriminate science from non-science on the basis of the falsifiability of the scientific statements alone; he recognizes that scientific theories are predictive, and consequently prohibitive, only when taken in conjunction with auxiliary hypotheses, and he also recognizes that readjustment or modification of the latter is an integral part of scientific practice. Hence his final concern is to outline conditions which indicate when such modification is genuinely scientific, and when it is merely ad hoc. This is itself clearly a major alteration in his position, and arguably represents a substantial retraction on his part: Marxism can no longer be dismissed as ‘unscientific’ simply because its advocates preserved the theory from falsification by modifying it (for in general terms, such a procedure, it now transpires, is perfectly respectable scientific practice). It is now condemned as unscientific by Popper because the only rationale for the modifications which were made to the original theory was to ensure that it evaded falsification, and so such modifications were ad hoc, rather than scientific. This contention—though not at all implausible—has, to hostile eyes, a somewhat contrived air about it, and is unlikely to worry the convinced Marxist. On the other hand, the shift in Popper’s own basic position is taken by some critics as an indicator that falsificationism, for all its apparent merits, fares no better in the final analysis than verificationism.

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Primary Literature: Works By Popper

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