Hume’s Newtonianism and Anti-Newtonianism
David Hume’s philosophy, especially the positive project of his “science of man”, is often thought to be modeled on Newton’s successes in natural philosophy. Hume’s self-described “experimental method” (see the subtitle to Treatise) and the resemblance of his “rules of reasoning” (THN 1.3.15) with Newton’s are said to be evidence for this position (Noxon 1973; Stroud 1977; de Pierris 2002; Penelhum 2000; Bennett 2001; Beebee 2006; Hazony 2014; Demeter 2016 etc.). Hume encourages this view of his project by employing Newtonian metaphors: he talks of an “attraction” in the “mental world” on a par with that in the “natural world” (THN 220.127.116.11). Hume infers the existence of “habits” as a kind of mental “force” (EHU 5.22) analogous to gravity; the discovery of the “the principles of association”, which in the Abstract he calls his most important achievement (see the section on association in the entry on Hume), are, then, analogous to the laws of motion. Hume certainly appears to want his readers to feel that he is modeling his project on the successes of natural philosophy, exemplified by Newton. In the “Introduction” to the Treatise and even more explicitly in the opening pages of Enquiry (EHU 1.15), Hume suggests that his “science of man” can parallel recent achievements in natural philosophy (with rather obvious nods to Newton’s successes in planetary astronomy). And at the start of EPM (1.10), he echoes Newton’s rejection of “hypotheses”, and restates his allegiance to the experimental method in contrast with its speculative alternative (on the contrast see Anstey 2005). There is, thus, no doubt that Hume wants his readers to believe that Newton forms a kind of model.
Yet, in the totality of Hume’s oeuvre the technical details of Newton’s philosophy are rarely discussed explicitly. In fact, some of the most sophisticated analyses of the implications of Newton’s philosophy are attributed to Cleanthes, the spokesperson for the inductive argument from design in the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion (Dialogues). While in recent years many commentators have come to doubt that Philo should be considered a straightforward spokesperson of Hume’s views, few suggest that Hume endorses without qualification Cleanthes’s Newtonian argument from design—the foundations of which are undermined throughout Hume’s writings (e.g., Harris 2015: 447ff). But this raises further complications because Hume can be read as implying that criticism of the design argument can be generated on strictly Newtonian methodological grounds: the authority of “experience”—to which Hume and Newton both appeal—does not license an inference (supported by analogical reasoning) to a God-like designer of the universe. This would make Hume something of an internal critic of Newtonianism (Hurlbutt 1985). The same strategy—generate internal criticism to Newtonian natural philosophy—may be thought to operate in Hume’s Empiricist attack on the putative meaningfulness of invisible or theoretical entities (e.g., forces, powers, and masses) that made him a favorite of Logical Positivists early in the twentieth century (see the entry on Alfred Jules Ayer). This Positivist interpretation seemed to go well with Hume’s reputation for skepticism. Yet, as Positivism gave way to Naturalism as the dominant force in twentieth century Anglophone philosophy, scholarship on Hume has increasingly emphasized the naturalistic elements in Hume, while reinterpreting, even downplaying, his skeptical tendencies (Kemp Smith, 1941; Stroud 1977; Garrett 1997). But if by naturalism one (also) means that one is willing to accept the authority of science (see the section on Naturalism and Holism in the entry on indispensability arguments in the philosophy of mathematics) then one runs into a problem: it is by no means clear that Hume accepts the independent intellectual authority of natural philosophers (including Newton) to have the final word in interpreting Newton’s achievements.
Before, turning to discussion of Hume’s relationship to Newton and Newtonianism, one ought to emphasize three problems that beset the scholarly literature on this topic. First, much scholarship on Hume is still surprisingly ahistorical; especially among philosophers, it tends to favor rational reconstruction of arguments over attention to more contextual forms of interpretation. If such philosophers pay attention to historical figures, these tend to be other canonical philosophers: Descartes, Locke, Malebranche, and Berkeley. Second, even scholars that emphasize the historical Hume (e.g., Wright 1983; Broughton 1987; Bell 1997; Winkler 2000) do not tend to exhibit a working knowledge of the details of Newton’s natural philosophy (but see Demeter 2016; Slavov 2016; Biener & Schliesser 2014; Belkind 2019). Nearly all of the literature in this genre, most of it quite careful, compares the details of Hume’s philosophy to evidence from various text-books (often “Newtonian”) potentially available to Hume. Finally, even the most careful and insightful scholarship on Hume tends to ignore the recent scholarly literature generated by the renewed philosophic and historical interest in Newton’s philosophy (Cohen & Smith 2002; see also entry on Newton’s philosophy).
- 1. Hume’s Evaluation of Newton
- 2. Hume’s Scientific Education
- 3. Hume’s Berkeley-ian View of Newton’s Achievements
- 4. In What Sense Was Hume a Newtonian?
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1. Hume’s Evaluation of Newton
This section analyzes Hume’s relationship to the public Newton and other early interpreters of Newton as available to Hume. The analysis reveals that Hume is more critical of and less indebted to core elements of Newton’s philosophy than commonly thought. A benefit of this analysis is that many interpretive debates over how to understand Hume’s philosophy can be reformulated clearly and with fewer anachronisms.
Hume’s explicit reflections on Newton’s writings and character reveal a more ambivalent picture than commonly thought: Hume shows respect, even admiration for Newton’s achievements, but he also expresses reservations. Behind this ambivalence one can find serious philosophic objections to Newton’s life and project. This section looks, first, at Hume’s brief discussions of Newton’s life and achievements and, then, analyzes the aims behind Hume’s “science of man”.
Hume does not doubt the longevity of Newton’s intellectual achievement:
The severest scrutiny, which NEWTON’S theory has undergone, proceeded not from his own countrymen, but from foreigners; and if it can overcome the obstacles, which it meets with at present in all parts of Europe, it will probably go down triumphant to the latest posterity. (“Of the Rise and Progress of the Arts and Sciences”, EMPL 121)
But elsewhere, when Hume comments more directly on Newton, there are signs of ambivalence:
Were we to distinguish the Ranks of Men by the Genius and Capacity more than by their Virtue and Usefulness to the Public, great Philosophers would certainly challenge the first Rank, and must be plac’d at the Top of human Kind. So rare is this Character, that, perhaps, there has not, as yet, been above two in the World, who can lay a just Claim to it. At least, Galileo and Newton seem to me so far to excel all the rest. (“Of the Middle Station of Life”, EMPL 550)
According to Hume, Newton has unusual philosophic talent. Yet, the backhanded nature of Hume’s compliment is unmistakable. Newton’s work is not characterized by its virtue; the achievements of Newton’s philosophy are not very useful to the rest of mankind. For Hume there is a moral point of view from which Newton’s achievements may seem less than entirely praiseworthy.
This ambivalence about Newton is not an isolated incident in Hume’s writings. In the last volume of The History of England, Hume writes:
In Newton this island may boast of having produced the greatest and rarest genius that ever arose for the ornament and instruction of the species. From modesty, ignorant of his superiority above the rest of mankind; and thence, less careful to accommodate his reasonings to common apprehensions: More anxious to merit than to acquire fame: He was, from these causes, long unknown to the world; but his reputation at last broke out with a lustre, which scarcely any writer, during his own life-time, had ever before attained. (HE VI, 542)
In this passage, Hume singles out Newton as the “greatest genius” (no mention of Galileo this time). Hume is following Fontenelle’s interpretation of Newton as a modest genius not concerned with acquiring fame (Fontenelle 1728—see Other Internet Resources below). But again, Hume’s praise is not entirely straightforward. It turns out that part of Newton’s achievement is due to his failure to possess two kinds of self-knowledge: Newton did not understand how much smarter he was than others and Newton did not understand how far removed from ordinary people’s concerns his theories were. Hume implies that if Newton had been more self-aware and more attuned to the environment in which he was writing, he would have been more likely to adjust his mode of reasoning to public prejudice. On Hume’s account Newton did not properly understand his relationship to his readership and, paradoxically, this partly accounts for Newton’s success. It seems not to have occurred to Hume that Newton’s mode of presentation in the Principia was a deliberate one to avoid controversy with those who could not follow its intricate geometric arguments—an intention Newton makes explicit in the introduction to Book 3 of the Principia.
Moreover, Hume thinks that in certain other respects, Newton shares in the superstitious prejudices of his time. This shows another sense in which Hume’s admiration for Newton’s genius is limited. While defending the stylistic abilities of King James I, Hume comments:
[King James I] has composed a commentary on the Revelations, and proved the pope to be Antichrist; may not a similar reproach be extended to the famous writer Napier; and even to Newton, at a time when learning was much more advanced than during the reign of James? From the grossness of its superstitions, we may infer the ignorance of an age; but never should pronounce concerning the folly of an individual, from his admitting popular errors, consecrated by the appearance of religion. (HE V, 155)
However, Hume did not doubt Newton’s religious sincerity:
It is for the same reason, I maintain, that Newton, Locke, Clarke, etc. being Arians or Socinians, were very sincere in the creed they profest: And I always oppose this argument to some libertines, who will needs have it, that it was impossible, but that these philosophers must have been hypocrites. (NHR 12.23n78)
Thus, Hume has no doubts about the intellectual quality of Newton’s achievements. His reservations are moral even theological in nature. One can distinguish these along a private and a public dimension. Hume thinks that Newton’s life reveals a man with genuine limitations in understanding (let alone transcending) himself and his times. Hume calls into question the moral quality of Newton’s works because they do not serve the public interest and they, and the Newtonians that follow him, are infected with superstitious beliefs (this line of argument is pursued more fully in Russell 2008). While Hume’s criticism of Newton as a man are revealing of Hume’s understanding of what it is to be a philosopher, Hume’s criticism of the purpose behind Newton’s project ties directly to the anti-Newtonian aims of Hume’s “science of man”. This project is viewed by many contemporary scholars, who emphasize Hume’s “naturalism”, as Hume’s equivalent of what one today would call “cognitive science” (Garrett 1997).
While Hume admits that Newton was the “greatest genius” that “ever arose for the ornament and instruction of the species”, he is unwilling to acknowledge Newton’s “Virtue” or “Usefulness to the Public”. Moreover, Newton’s project lends cover for gross “superstition”. Instead, in the “Introduction” to the Treatise, Hume offers an ambitious alternative project: his “science of man”. (In EHU 1.12 he calls it a “true metaphysics”, which battles “abstruse philosophy and metaphysical jargon…mixed up with popular superstition”. Given Hume’s criticism of Newton, he may have Newton in mind here.) Hume emphasizes the foundational nature of this project:
There is no question of importance, whose decision is not comprised in the science of man; and there is none, which can be decided with any certainty, before we become acquainted with that science. In pretending, therefore, to explain the principles of human nature, we in effect propose a compleat system of the sciences, built on a foundation almost entirely new, and the only one upon which they can stand with any security. (THN “Introduction”, see Boehm 2016)
The success of Hume’s systematic “science of man” has a positive and a negative component. On the positive side,
In these four sciences of Logic, Morals, Criticism, and Politics [i.e., political economy], is comprehended almost everything, which it can any way import us to be acquainted with, or which can tend either to the improvement or ornament of the human mind.
Hume makes it absolutely clear where his priorities are:
Nor ought we to think, that this latter improvement in the science of man will do less honour to our native country than the former in natural philosophy, but ought rather to esteem it a greater glory, upon account of the greater importance of that science, as well as the necessity it lay under of such a reformation.
In short, according to Hume his “science of man” is far more valuable than Newton’s natural philosophy. This is why Hume ends the “Introduction” to the Treatise with the claim that
we may hope to establish…a science [of man], which will not be inferior in certainty, and will be much superior in utility to any other of human comprehension.
Moreover, the content of the “science of man” reveals that even the very Newtonian sciences of
Mathematics, Natural Philosophy, and Natural Religion, are in some measure dependent on the science of MAN; since they lie under the cognizance of men, and are judged of by their powers and faculties. (THN “Introduction”)
For Hume the “science of man” is the “foundational” science because it is presupposed to some degree by all the other sciences (see also Hazony 2014; Hazony & Schliesser 2016; Boehm 2016, 2019).
The details of Hume’s “science of man” show the weakness of our ordinary cognitive capacity; at the same time it offers an argument for staying within confines of (potential) ordinary experience. Hume’s cognitive science has a normative consequence in that knowledge of it is supposed to reduce the inclination toward intellectual overreaching. For, the practitioners of “mitigated scepticism” (cf. the “modest scepticism” of “Appendix” to the Treatise) will not
be tempted to go beyond common life, so long as they consider the imperfection of those faculties which they employ, their narrow reach, and their inaccurate operations. (EHU 12.3.25)
Hume’s “science of man” constrains the extent of our theorizing. In subsequent sections it will be illustrated how Hume reinterprets the limits and content of Newtonian natural philosophy in light of his “science of man” or “true metaphysics”.
2. Hume’s Scientific Education
There is surprisingly little direct evidence of Hume’s knowledge of Newton’s texts. Most of it is circumstantial. Recent archival and careful hermeneutic research by Michael Barfoot (1990) has increased our knowledge of the kind of education in different elements of natural philosophy Hume would have received as a student at Edinburgh (see also Emerson 2009; Stewart 2005; Wright 1990). This usefully supplements what can be gleaned from Hume’s writings and letters. While new material may show up one day, four important conclusions follow from his study.
First, it is very likely that Hume was exposed to many works in the new natural philosophy, medicine, and mathematics in Europe and Britain. Second, while Hume was a student, Boyle’s writings and methodology were emphasized at The University of Edinburgh. It appears that Boyle was favored as the pre-eminent exemplar of modern natural philosophy because of the theological uses of this form of knowledge in eighteenth century natural religion. Given the tenor of the education at Edinburgh and evidence derived from Hume’s oeuvre, it is very likely that Hume had a working knowledge of Boyle’s hydrostatics. Besides, if Hume’s project aims at an account of hidden processes underlying observed regularities (as Landy 2017 suggests), as opposed to inductively establishing those regularities, then Hume’s project is consonant with much of Boyle’s (see Sargent 1995).
Second, while at the Jesuit College at La Flèche (1735–37) Hume was certainly exposed to Cartesian and Malebranchian ideas (Perinetti 2018), and some of his most influential arguments, concerning, e.g., causation and natural theology had their origins in this intellectual environment. Some commentators (e.g., Wright 2009: 51ff) have argued that the proper interpretation of Hume’s methodological aspirations and his account of the mind should spring primarily from this Cartesian and Malebranchian context.
Third, Hume would have been reasonably familiar with Newton’s Opticks, especially his writings on colors. It is less clear how thorough his working knowledge of it was (see Schliesser 2004 for some concerns). However, it is less likely that he was exposed to most of the technically challenging parts of Principia. As the catalogue at La Flèche testifies, there was four entries directly related to Newton, of which only one, a 1720 French edition of Newton’s Opticks (but no edition of Principia), refers to an edition that could have been there during Hume’s stay (Perinetti 2018: 51). Moreover, if Hume never read the third edition of the Principia, then this could help explain his lack of interest in Newton’s fourth rule of reasoning which was added to the third edition (see section 4.5, Rules of Reasoning).
Fourth, it remains unclear how proficient Hume became in mathematics. There is manuscript evidence that he attended George Campbell’s extramural lectures on fluxions. These notes require careful study, but Barfoot reports that these manuscripts show “little evidence of the application of fluxions to natural philosophy as such” (1990: 190 fn76). Barfoot is correct to suggest that Hume’s treatment of mathematics shows debts to Berkeley’s criticism of Newton. There is less evidence for Barfoot’s claim that Hume would have had working knowledge of the most technical parts of the Principia.
It is likely that Hume did get to know the relevant editions of Opticks already during his years spent at the University of Edinburgh, and may well have been exposed to lectures on it as well, but it is uncertain how reliable his working knowledge of it was (Barfoot 1990, esp. 158 and 152). Although in general he was dissatisfied with university education, at least he found some satisfaction in his natural philosophy class taught by Robert Steuart (Stewart 2005: 21–25). A probably more important introduction to the outlook that has spread due to the influence of the Opticks came from Hume’s medical readings in relation to his mental breakdown at the age of 18. The most important document of this struggle is his 1734 “Letter to a Physician” (Letters 1:14–18.), in which the medical description of his condition, as M.A. Stewart (2005: 24n48) puts it, “seems to be consciously modelled on George Cheyne’s The English Malady”, published in 1733. A similarly likely source is Mandeville’s Treatise of the Hypochondriack and Hysterick Diseases (1st ed. 1711, 2nd ed. 1730, see Wright 2009: 8–9). In his latter life he probably benefitted from discussions with philosophical friends and colleagues, most notably with William Cullen and Joseph Black, these discussions, however, came only after the publication of Hume’s chief philosophical works. These friendships were indeed philosophical in the sense that they were founded, at least partly, on sympathies for Hume’s philosophical project (see, e.g., Hume’s letter to Cullen in Letters 1:163)
It should be emphasized, however, that archival evidence may radically change our picture of Hume’s formal education and continuing interest in Newton’s natural philosophy. In addition to the manuscript mentioned above, known marginal notes in Hume’s hand in a copy of the Edinburgh Review, where works in Newtonian natural philosophy were reviewed, may reveal further evidence about the nature and quality of his response to issues in Newtonian natural philosophy.
3. Hume’s Berkeley-ian View of Newton’s Achievements
In The History of England, Hume writes about Newton’s research methodology as follows:
there flourished during this period a Boyle and a Newton: men who trod with cautious, and therefore the more secure steps, the only road which leads to true philosophy…[Newton is] cautious in admitting no principles but such as were founded on experiment; but resolute to adopt every such principle, however new or unusual. (HE VI, 542)
While this is rather terse, Hume calls attention to three important elements in Newton’s natural philosophy: (a) Newton’s commitment to an experimental method; (b) the cautious nature of Newton’s methodology; (c) Newton’s boldness once experiments have established a “principle”. In eighteenth century terminology, a “principle” is akin to what we would call a “law” or a “fundamental/causal explanation”. In order to avoid misunderstanding, Hume equates Newton’s methodology with Boyle’s only on points (a) and (b), not point (c). Moreover, Hume is aware (as will be shown in section 4.1) that Newton rightly rejected Boyle’s conception of mechanism. So, Hume admires Newton’s methodology, and sees it as a source of progress.
So, for Hume, Newton uses experiment to arrive at explanations. Thus, he seems to echo and accept Newton’s claim about “hypotheses non fingo” (see the relevant section in the entry on Newton). Once such “principles” or explanations have been arrived at experimentally, Hume sees Newton as adopting them boldly, even if they are unusual or surprising. Hume appears to have assimilated the importance of Newton’s third rule of reasoning (see section 4.5 below). Moreover, Hume is discerning the (broad) outlines of Newton’s commitment to the method of analysis and synthesis (Newton’s Opticks, Query 31; for discussion, see section 4.7). But in Hume’s account there is no mention of the importance of mathematics in Newton’s methodology (see section 4.6). Hume lack of interest in this aspect of Newton’s methodology may be a consequence of his education (see section 2).
Nevertheless, Hume’s interpretation of the status of “principles” makes him deviate from Newton’s methodology in a fundamental fashion. In the Treatise, he uses the “science of man” to claim it is “beyond the reach of human understanding” to “penetrate into the nature of bodies, or explain the secret causes of their operations”. He cannot “approve” of the ambition to go beyond knowing bodies by their external properties (THN 18.104.22.168). This contradicts the final paragraph of the “General Scholium” of the Principia, where Newton promises a program of research, perhaps inspired by the success of Francis Hauksbee’s electrical experiments, to penetrate into the nature of matter. Although this program was by no means finished by the time of Newton’s death, Newton’s optical research had revealed, for example, that light has an internal constitution characterized by the proportions, in it, of the distinct homogeneal (or “uniform”) kinds, which have different degrees of refrangibility (Schliesser 2004).
To see why Hume cannot “approve”, going beyond external properties of bodies, let us take a brief detour through some core elements of Hume’s epistemology. For Hume, we build up our causal theories from experience of particular events (see, for instance, the demands at THN 22.214.171.124–15 and also the footnote at EHU 11.26). This is an important constraint for Hume because it allows him to ask who has ever perceived an instance of a power or force in action. This is crucial for Hume’s attack on theoretical and invisible entities.
For Hume all our simple ideas are derived from impressions (THN 126.96.36.199–3). Hume’s attacks on notions of substance, mode, essence, force, power, self, and—of course—God, all rely on his rhetorically powerful ability to ask to what impression such notions can be traced (e.g., THN 1.1.6; 188.8.131.52; 1.4.14, and 184.108.40.206–4; on idea of God, see EHU 2.6). For, “[I]deas always represent the objects or impressions, from which they are derived” (THN 220.127.116.11). In the scholarly literature, this has become known as the “copy principle” (Garrett 1997: chapter 2). If no such objects or impressions are to be found, then one must conclude that such ideas are the product of “passions and emotions” (THN 18.104.22.168), a “trivial suggestion of the fancy” (THN 22.214.171.124), or “some imperfection in [the] faculties [of mind]” (THN 126.96.36.199). The thrust of Hume’s account is to make talk of, say, substance or force (power, God, etc.) seem either meaningless or restricted to the particular qualities of bodies from which the idea is derived (THN 188.8.131.52; EHU 4.2.16). At best, they have reference to “an effect, or some other event constantly conjoined with” the cause (EHU 7.2.29; for a more detailed account, see the entry on Hume ). Thomas Reid, who saw what was at stake, described the strategy as “a tribunal of inquisition erected by certain modern philosophers before which every thing in nature must answer” (An Inquiry into the Human Mind: or the Principles of Common Sense, Chapter 6, Section VIII).
Hume’s “science of man” will not permit a realist interpretation of forces as real causes (see, for different arguments, Broughton 1987; Bell 1997). When the sciences talk about forces or powers, these words must be reinterpreted (for example, the note to EHU, 4.2.16 tells us to look for this in section 7 of EHU). According to Hume, word’s like “force” and “power” have, at best, a reference to “an effect, or some other event”. And
Force, Power, Energy…[these] words, as commonly used, have very loose meanings annexed to them; and their ideas are very uncertain and confused. (EHU 7.2.29; cf. THN 184.108.40.206)
Hume denies here the fundamental achievement of the Principia. Rather, he offers a reinterpretation of Newton (Hazony & Schliesser 2016).
This is made very clear by his addition to the Treatise: I must, he writes,
confine our speculations to the appearances of objects to our senses, without entering into disquisitions concerning their real nature and operations.
Hume is willing to grant that Newton has experimentally discovered various “principles”. But given Hume’s aversion to talk of forces, it is likely that he thinks these principles must be understood at best as a means to keep track of the phenomena. This is, in fact, for Hume the
Newtonian philosophy … rightly understood … Nothing is more suitable to that philosophy, than a modest skepticism to a certain confession of ignorance in subjects that exceed all human capacity. (THN 220.127.116.11n12; emphasis in original)
In context, Hume re-describes the Newtonian commitment to a vacuum. So when, elsewhere, Hume describes the “philosopher” [i.e., Newton] who had “determined the laws and forces, by which the revolutions of the planets are governed and directed”, (EHU 1.8) his language of “forces” must be interpreted in light of his deflationary commitments.
One may think that Hume’s use of “Newtonian philosophy” in the addition to the Treatise suggests that Hume has described Newton’s natural philosophy as Newton understood it (as understood by Hume). But this is not likely because elsewhere he writes,
It was never the meaning of Sir ISAAC NEWTON to rob second causes of all force or energy; though some of his followers have endeavoured to establish that theory upon his authority. (footnote at the end of EHU 7.1.25: a note on Hume’s Terminology: God is the “first cause;” “second causes” are ordinary finite causes that operate in nature)
So, first, Hume’s Newton accepts some real causes in nature; Hume’s Newton is neither a skeptic about causation nor an occasionalist (Leibniz had raised this concern in his exchange with Clarke). Second, Hume is careful to distinguish Newton from the Newtonians (for more evidence on this, see section 4.2).
Thus, a more likely interpretation is that Hume believes he has offered a prescriptive interpretation of how Newtonian philosophy should be viewed in light of the results of his “science of man” (which shows the limitations of our cognitive capacity), and his restrictive form of Empiricism which contribute to his “modest” (or “mitigated”) skepticism. Hume may well have thought himself as an internal critic or “cautious Newtonian”. For Hume and Newton both appeal to the authority of experience. Nevertheless, the “copy principle” guides how Hume believes how “experiment” or “experience”—authoritative for Newton as well as Hume—should be analyzed. This may be why Hume claims that Boyle and Newton have shown the road to the “true philosophy”, not that they completed it. One way to understand Hume’s “science of man” is to see it, then, as the fulfillment of the Newtonian philosophy, “rightly understood”, that is, by Hume.
While Hume does not match Berkeley’s detail in offering arguments or in explaining how to reinterpret Newtonian invisible entities, Hume does not accept that we can know that invisible causal forces operate in a largely empty universe as anything other than useful means to track the appearances. In fact, there is no room in Hume’s explanatory model for invisible forces acting as causes. This becomes clear if we reflect on a passage that has received intense scrutiny in the context of the problem of induction (which we ignore for present purposes; for Hume’s skepticism see section 4.2):
We are determined by custom alone to suppose the future conformable to the past. When I see a billiard-ball moving towards another, my mind is immediately carry’d by habit to the usual effect, and anticipates my sight by conceiving the second ball in motion. There is nothing in these objects, abstractly considered, and independent of experience, which leads me to form any such conclusion: and even after I have had experience of many repeated effects of this kind, there is no argument, which determines me to suppose, that the effect will be conformable to past experience. The powers, by which bodies operate, are entirely unknown. We perceive only their sensible qualities: and what reason have we to think, that the same powers will always be conjoined with the same sensible qualities?
Tis not, therefore, reason, which is the guide of life, but custom. That alone determines the mind, in all instances, to suppose the future conformable to the past. However easy this step may seem, reason would never, to all eternity, be able to make it. (THN Abstract 15–16)
Hume here is calling attention to the (terse) argument of Treatise 1.3.6. Our interest is in his claim that
[t]he powers, by which bodies operate, are entirely unknown. We perceive only their sensible qualities: and what reason have we to think, that the same powers will always be conjoined with the same sensible qualities?
In dialectical context, Hume is here presupposing (i) an explanatory model familiar from Locke (and Spinoza, Aristotle, Boyle, etc.) in which hidden powers (insensible qualities) of an entity are (causally) responsible for the sensible qualities. So, it is completely natural for early modern natural philosophers to say that these sensible qualities express the essence. These hidden powers may be (part of) the essence of the entity or (as Newton suggests about gravity in the third rule of reasoning) universal qualities of an entity. So, Hume’s implied targets accept something akin to (i). That is not insignificant because (i) is the main explanatory template of early modern science.
Now, if one accepts (i), then the problem of induction reveals two (related) problems: (a) one concerns the connection among sensible qualities, and (b) the other concerns the connection between hidden qualities and the visible qualities. So, if one accepts (i), one might have thought, for example, that routinely (if not exception-less) conjoined sensible qualities must always presuppose the same combination of hidden/invisible qualities that produce them. So, one could solve the problem associated with (a) by an appeal to hidden qualities. In thinking this one could, in fact, appeal to a same effect/same cause principle of the sort Newton articulates in the second rule of reasoning: “to the same natural effects we must, as far as possible, assign the same causes”. To be sure, Newton’s version of the rule recognizes exceptions and is clearly regulative (“as far as possible”) and it does not rely on (i). Rather, in Newton the rule is a direct consequence of a parsimony principle (“admit no more causes of natural things than such as are both true and sufficient to explain their appearances”).
But as Hume discerns, the explanatory model of (i) lacks resources to secure anything like “same visible effect/same hidden cause”. That’s because Hume thinks there is always a barrier in moving from sensible qualities to the structure of hidden qualities. (In the literature on Newton, who also rejects (i), this is called the “transduction problem” since an influential article by McGuire 1970a.) Hume makes this point fully explicit in the first Enquiry: “he has not, by all his experience, acquired any idea or knowledge of the secret power, by which the one object produces the other” (EHU 5.4).
This is why Hume’s philosophy of science is so deflationary: all any science can show is the relations that obtain among visible qualities, and perhaps those that can be represented on an analogy with them (see Landy 2017). These relations can be grouped together and given names (“elasticity, gravity, cohesion of parts, communication of motion by impulse”) and be treated as “causes” of the phenomena, but these names do not signify or explain features of hidden powers. In Hume’s philosophy of science, science remains at the surface. Hume made the point explicit in a note added to the Treatise:
If the Newtonian philosophy be rightly understood it will be found to mean no more. A vacuum is asserted: That is, bodies are said to be plac’d after such a manner, as to receive bodies betwixt them, without impulsion or penetration. The real nature of this position of bodies is unknown. We are only acquainted with its effects on the senses, and its power of receiving body. (THN 18.104.22.168n12 (App.))
This barrier between visible and hidden qualities/powers is independent of the more fundamental problem of induction that even when one grasps, in some way, the structure of the hidden qualities ordinarily responsible for conjunction of sensible qualities, one cannot feel secure about their presence and role in any claim one makes about sensible qualities. For, a different set of hidden qualities may be responsible for any ordinarily conjoined set of sensible qualities. (Hume here discerns the outlines of the problem of multiple realization as a general metaphysical problem.) That, in addition, nature may change its course (and so change the configuration of hidden qualities that produce sensible qualities) means that the main explanatory framework of early modern science (i) is without foundation (see also Belkind 2019).
4. In What Sense Was Hume a Newtonian?
It is often argued that the subtitle of the Treatise, “Attempt to Introduce the Experimental Method of Reasoning into Moral Subjects”, shows Hume’s self-conscious debt to Newton. Experiments certainly play an important role in Newton’s science. But only after 1712 does Newton refer to his own philosophy as “experimental” (in the context of his polemic with Leibniz; see Shapiro 2004). In general, Newton emphasizes the mathematical nature of his philosophy; he calls attention to this in the full title of the Principia: Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy.
However one interprets Hume’s “experimental method”, it is in no sense mathematical. Hume’s so-called “experiments” do not have the tacit logic of Newtonian experiments; they almost never offer measurements (which are very important for Newton’s focus on successive approximation); they do not connect to a tight mathematical structure (Smith 2002). Moreover, by the standards of Newtonian natural philosophy, many of Hume’s so-called “experiments”, for all their ingenuity (see, e.g., the eight experiments at THN 2.2.2), have a rather simple structure. They are more akin to systematic observations (cf. THN I.8, 22.214.171.124, 126.96.36.199, 188.8.131.52). In fact, there is (almost) nothing to distinguish Humean “experiment” from normal, daily experience. In Hume the word “experiment” seems to be nearly synonymous with “experience”, which is not uncommon in the period. This interpretation is also suggested by Hume’s description of his experiments as being based on “a cautious observation of human life” (THN “Introduction”). This is why Hume can claim that
experimental inference and reasoning concerning the actions of others enters so much into human life, that no man, while awake, is ever a moment without employing it. (EHU 8.1.17)
Even if we allow for some hyperbole, it would betray considerable ignorance to confuse Newton’s “experimental method” with ordinary human “experimental inference and reasoning”.
So it is not so much the production of data that makes Hume’s method experimental rather than his way of “processing” the data gathered in various forms of experiments. This method can be reconstructed as a version of analysis and synthesis inspired by Newton’s Opticks (see section 4.8 below), that begins with phenomena from the historical and everyday observation of human behavior, and its analysis proceeds by such “experiments … judiciously collected and compar’d” (THN I.10), in order to arrive at analogies among various instances “from the observation of several parallel instances” (EHU 8.13). The products of comparative analysis so conducted are the principles of various faculties, like perception, imagination, reason, etc., whose interaction results in ideas and impressions causing behaviour, but their contribution can hardly be measured and the principles of their interaction can hardly be quantified—not even in principle (see also Hume’s anti-mathematicism discussed in section 4.7). So their relations cannot be represented in an algebraic way, in terms of relations of quantities, so they cannot be mathematized either. Instead, they remain qualitatively different principles of human nature, and the explanation of human phenomena consists in a description of how these principles with their distinctive characteristics figure in producing them.
These findings are generalized by induction: “What I discover to be true in some instances, I suppose to be so in all” (THN 184.108.40.206), and consequently, they are fallible, and the account of human nature founded on them may be misconstrued (THN 220.127.116.11). Even if it is sometimes possible
to attain what natural philosophers, after Lord BACON, have affected to call the experimentum crucis, or that experiment which points out the right way in any doubt or ambiguity. (EPM 5.17)
It is rarely so. Therefore, inquiry into moral matters is just as open-ended as inquiry into natural matters, and the cure is the same here as there, pretty much as Newton envisaged: it is in further enquiry (Smith 2002: 160–161). So, for Hume experimental findings can and need to be further refined by methods that rightly belong to the family of Newtonian successive approximations: by exploring exceptions and limitations, or by eliminating superfluous conditions in order to identify the efficacious one (Demeter 2019b). One could see this feature of Hume’s method as anticipating Mill’s method of difference as much as resembling Newton of Opticks (see Section 3.3 of the entry on John Stuart Mill).
In our analysis of Hume’s “science of man”, we have already encountered Hume’s claim that we are unable to penetrate into the internal constitution of matter (section 3). So, however else Hume’s skepticism is understood—and it has been the subject of intense scholarly discussion (including the so-called “New Hume” debate, see Read & Richman 2000) during the last three decades—the science of man has skeptical implications with regard to his interpretation of Newton’s philosophy. Hume’s evaluation of Newton is an additional source of evidence in understanding the nature of Hume’s skepticism. This evidence reveals that in evaluating Newton’s achievement Hume is pessimistic about the extent and possibility of knowledge of nature. It also shows that Hume rejected important Newtonian standards/criteria in evaluating the claims of natural philosophy.
In The History of England, Hume writes:
Boyle was a great partizan of the mechanical philosophy: a theory, which, by discovering some of the secrets of nature, and allowing us to imagine the rest, is so agreeable to the natural vanity and curiosity of men…While Newton seemed to draw off the veil from some of the mysteries of nature, he shewed at the same time the imperfections of the mechanical philosophy; and thereby restored her ultimate secrets to that obscurity, in which they ever did and ever will remain. (HE VI, 542; emphasis added)
This quote reveals crucial details about Hume’s position in three areas: a) Hume’s understanding of the relative merits of Newton’s philosophy and the mechanical philosophy of Boyle; b) Hume’s attitude toward criteria of intelligibility; c) Hume’s skepticism.
First, Hume treats Newton’s account as a refutation of the mechanical philosophy. Yet, while as we have seen (section 3), Hume certainly saw it as part of the road to “true philosophy”, he does not view Newton’s achievement as a decisive advance in knowledge of nature but, instead, as decisive evidence for the claim that nature will remain unknowable in principle. Hume understands Newton’s success as a double-edged sword: even if Newton removed a source of error and/or enlarged our knowledge, he did so at the cost of undermining any hope of establishing what we might call a “final theory” (see the entry on physicalism). Moreover, it is by no means clear whether Hume is willing to accept Newtonian natural philosophy as a form of knowledge. A natural reading of the passage is to conclude that Hume views Newton as successfully (to use an anachronistic term) falsifying the mechanists’ program, while Hume hedges his bets on offering any evaluation of the positive side of Newton’s system (notice also the grudging use of “seemed”).
The way to make sense of Hume’s remarks in The History of England is that they reveal that he implicitly accepts the Mechanists’ insistence—explicitly associated with Boyle—that theirs was the only program that offered the possibility of intelligible explanation (even if in the hands of many of its practitioners it only offered hope of post-facto rational reconstruction; see also Hume on Causation in section 4.4). Hume’s treatment of Boyle reveals that he thought it was a good thing Newton falsified the mechanical philosophy. Hume acknowledges that the mechanical philosophy could offer some successful explanations. But he emphasizes that its practitioners were likely to overestimate—on psychological and methodological grounds—its potential. Hume appears to have assimilated Newton’s devastating criticisms of the mechanical philosophy.
Furthermore, the passage in The History of England, lends support for a skeptical interpretation of Hume’s philosophy. Hume thinks the Newtonian project will enable some knowledge of nature at the cost of keeping a “final theory” permanently unavailable to human inquiry. Earlier Hume had offered a positive account of the explanatory principles knowable to mankind:
Elasticity, gravity, cohesion of parts, communication of motion by impulse; these are probably the ultimate causes and principles which we shall ever discover in nature; and we may esteem ourselves sufficiently happy, if, by accurate enquiry and reasoning, we can trace up the particular phenomena to, or near to, these general principles. (EHU 4.1.12)
Let’s leave aside, for the moment, the ultimate metaphysical status of “ultimate causes and principles” in Hume’s thought. He is willing to accept that some limited set of fundamental scientific laws (i.e., “ultimate causes and principles”) are available to human researchers. (Hume hedges his bets a bit; note his use of “probably”.) Moreover, these four principles are all associated with Newton’s project; the mechanical philosophy had only accepted communication of motion by impulse as an explanatory principle. Of course, Hume treats these laws not so much as describing genuine “causes” or “powers” of nature, but rather—in opposition to Newton’s own view which insisted on the reality and causal nature of forces (Janiak 2007)—as a way to keep track of the appearances (recall section 3 above).
Finally, these passages show that Hume rules out that we could ever hope to explain the causes of these laws (or unify them in some more ultimate principle). Newton would agree he did not know the cause of these laws (“General Scholium”, Principia), but he would treat it as a question open to further research and speculation. In the context of a discussion of the doctrine of occasionalism, Hume shows he is aware of this:
Sir Isaac Newton (tho’ some of his Followers have taken a different Turn of thinking) plainly rejects it, but substituting the Hypothesis of an Aetheral Fluid, not the immediate Volition of the Deity, as the Cause of Attraction. (“A Letter From a Gentleman to his Friend in Edinburgh”, THN p. 429)
This quote is revealing in two more ways: besides showing that Hume may have been aware of some of Newton’s attempts at articulating a mechanism for the operation of attraction (i.e., Newton’s letters to Bentley or Boyle; see Newton 2004), Hume recognizes that Newton’s followers can deviate from Newton (recall section 3).
In light of the text of The History of England (VI, 542) quoted at the start of this sub-section, it is clear Hume thinks that Newton’s laws are not sufficient for explaining all of nature. So without (yet) taking a stance on how to interpret Hume’s treatment of induction or his account of causation, one can distinguish two further strands of Hume’s skepticism: i) Hume treats Newton as showing conclusively that the domain of possible knowledge will leave parts of nature unknown forever; ii) in particular, this will include the cause(s) behind our fundamental principles. The combination of (i–ii) entails that Newtonian natural theology—a very popular eighteenth century intellectual enterprise (see the entry on natural theology and natural religion)—is based on shaky foundations.
Together with Hume’s emphasis on accounting for the phenomena in his interpretation of Newtonian philosophy, Hume is far removed from Newton’s realist ontology of interacting forces (Janiak 2007; Smeenk & Schliesser 2013). Two further sources for this difference are revealed when we analyze Hume’s departure from Newton’s account of causation (§4.4) and Newton’s rules of reasoning (§4.5).
One of Hume’s great claims to fame is his articulation of what has come to be known as the “problem of induction”, or, to use language closer to Hume’s: the problematic status of inferences. An informal way to express his insight is that no claim to knowledge of matters of fact ought to be thought of as definitive because in all of our inductive reasoning (or inferences) we presuppose that the future will be the same as the past. But we can never be certain that the future will be the same as the past because the evidence for the assumption is based on the uniformity of nature in the past. The uniformity of nature is presupposed in our knowledge, but our belief in it cannot be secured by reason. Infamously, Hume claimed the source of the belief is not reason but habit and our confidence in it is derived from instinct (see Millican 1995). While there is ongoing scholarly debate over the extent of Hume’s skepticism that follows from this insight, it is less controversial that for Hume knowledge of matters of fact, whatever its ultimate status in Hume’s thought, is always tentative, subject to revision. This is known as fallibilism. While Hume’s argument appears unique to him (although elements of it are prefigured in Berkeley and the Dutch Newtonian, Willem ’s Gravesande), the position is anticipated by Newton.
Newton’s fourth rule of reasoning reads:
In experimental philosophy, propositions gathered from phenomena by induction should be considered either exactly or very nearly true notwithstanding any contrary hypotheses, until yet other phenomena make such propositions either more exact or liable to exceptions. (Newton 2004, Principia, Book III, Rule IV)
The rule is that we should treat well-confirmed propositions as true (or nearly true) until there are deviations that promote new research, which, in turn, lead us to refine our original propositions or reject them for new ones (Smith 2002). But while one has a theory, one must not be distracted by possible differing explanations for the found regularities until one has empirical reason. One accepts a theory as true as a means to developing a better theory. As Newton writes in the “Preface” to the Principia, “the principles set down here will shed some light on either this mode of philosophizing or some truer one” (emphasis added). Thus, Newton accepts that physical inquiry is forward-looking and may be open-ended; not only its theories may evolve, but also its methods. Rule IV implicitly accepts that the future may bring surprises and new evidence, and, thus, anticipates Hume’s fallibilistic insights. As commentators on Hume have noted, this strand of Hume’s skepticism is shared by Newton. It is less clear if Hume learned it from Newton because there is no evidence that he was acquainted with Newton’s fourth rule of reasoning (added to the third edition of the Principia); there is no equivalent in Hume’s rules of reasoning to Newton’s fourth rule. In the section on Hume’s Rule of Reasoning (§4.5), the significance of the absence of an equivalent to Newton’s rule 4 in Hume’s thought is explored.
In section 3, we saw that Hume rejected Newtonian forces as real causes; he argues that we must reinterpret forces and powers as being ideas about effects (see also Hazony 2014; Hazony & Schliesser 2016). In that section no reference to Hume’s widely discussed views on causation was made. In this section Hume’s account of causation is analyzed. Given our focus on the Hume-Newton relationship no stance on the most controversial issue in Hume scholarship are taken: are causes mere (psychological) regularity or are they found in nature. However, recall that Hume insists that
It was never the meaning of Sir ISAAC NEWTON to rob second causes of all force or energy; though some of his followers have endeavoured to establish that theory upon his authority. (footnote at EHU 7.1.25)
So Hume’s Newton accepts some real causes in nature.
Hume’s account of causality covers at least five related issues: (1) how we acquire an idea of cause; (2) what we mean by “cause;” (3) how we reason about causes; (4) whether causes are in the mind or in nature; (5) how we could infer the existence of causes. In this section, we explore how Hume’s treatment of what we mean by “cause” illustrates Hume’s critical response to and departure from Newton’s philosophy (see also Schliesser 2007). Hume’s treatment of causation straightforwardly rejects at least two kinds of causes that appear in Newton’s philosophy: final causes and simultaneous causes (Schliesser 2009). Moreover, we show that the structure of Humean causes is deeply indebted to the Pre-Newtonian mechanical philosophy associated with Boyle.
Hume analyzes how “our” notion of causality—one applying to events that are contiguous, exhibit temporal priority of the cause, and have constant conjunction (THN 1.3, Sections 2, 6, and 15)—is derived from experiencing constant conjunction of objects that produce a union in the imagination (THN 18.104.22.168). Hume’s account is causal in its own terms, that is, his two definitions of the meaning of “cause” (THN 22.214.171.124) are patterned on the chain of events that he thinks lead people to acquire the idea of cause. Hume’s analysis is a first approximation of and unifies what “Moderns” tend to mean by “causation”. In his hands, a redefined version of Aristotelian “efficient causation” is the only kind of causation available for use (THN 126.96.36.199). There is, thus, a stipulative quality to Hume’s discussion (see also the treatment of his Rules of Reasoning, THN 1.3.15 discussed in section 4.5). One of the tacit targets of Hume’s approach is Newton. For Hume’s treatment of causation rules out the permissibility of Newton’s appeal to “final causes” in the justification of the (inductive and probable) argument from design in the “General Scholium” of the Principia: “we know [the Deity] only by his most wise and excellent contrivances of things, and final causes” (for discussion, see Stein 2002).
Moreover, while Hume and Newton both appeal to the authority of “experience”, there are further serious tensions between Hume’s account of causation and the contents of Newton’s natural philosophy. For Newton, the behavior of the moon in its orbit and that of, say, apples falling on the earth have the same cause: namely, the force of gravity, or weight, towards the earth (Principia, Book III, Scholium to Proposition IV, Theorem IV). This conflicts with the contiguity requirement, which Hume considers “essential” to “causation” (THN 188.8.131.52). It is hard to see how contiguity could be made consistent with the universal nature of attraction. The most distant particles of the universe attract each other. (The contiguity requirement notably disappears in EHU.) More important, according to Newton the acceleration produced by the exercise of a force is simultaneous with that exercise—thus defying temporal priority (Smeenk & Schliesser 2013). Hume claims that temporal priority of the cause is “of no great importance” (THN 184.108.40.206), yet it appears explicitly or implicitly throughout his treatment of causation. Be that as it may, Hume explicitly attacks the possibility of an effect being simultaneous with its cause (THN 220.127.116.11–8; Ryan 2003).
Finally, there is a fundamental structural similarity between Humean causes and the causes favored by pre-Newtonian Mechanical philosophers (i.e., Boyle, Huygens, etc; for a different argument, see McGuire 1972). They have the same structure: i.e., priority of the cause over the effect, contiguity, and constant conjunction. Now, to be sure, Hume is aware that Newton decisively refuted the Mechanical Philosophy’s program which insisted that explanations be cast in terms of the impact of colliding bodies (section 4.2). Hume rejects the ontological and explanatory reductionism of the Mechanical philosophy. Hume introduces eight “rules by which to judge of causes and effects” (see section 4.5 below) because it is “possible for all objects to become causes or effects to each other” (THN 1.3.15). This is why Hume’s list of “ultimate causes” and “general principles”—“Elasticity, gravity, cohesion of parts, communication of motion by impulse” (EHU 4.1.12)—is more inclusive than the Mechanical philosophy would allow.
So, even if we leave aside the controversial question to what degree Hume would allow the existence and our potential knowledge of real causes in nature (as discussed in the “new Hume” debate), his analysis of what we mean by “cause” is hostile to Newtonian natural philosophy. Hume rules out final and simultaneous causes. The former play only a role in Newton’s theology and natural religion, but the latter are an integral part of what we could his “science”.
4.5 Rules of Reasoning
Consider these passages:
- The cause and effect must be contiguous in space and time.
- The cause must be prior to the effect.
- There must be a constant union betwixt the cause and effects. It is chiefly this quality, that constitutes the relation.
- The same cause always produces the same effect, and the same effect never arises but from the same cause. This Principle we derive from experience, and is the source of most of our philosophical reasonings. For when by any clear experiment we have discovered the causes or effects of any phaenomenon, we immediately extend our observation to every phenomenon of the same kind, without waiting for that constant repetition, from which the first idea of this relation is derived.
- There is another principle, which hangs upon this, viz. that where several different objects produce the same effect, it must be by means of some quality, which we discover common amongst them. For as like effects imply like causes, we must always ascribe the causation to the circumstance, wherein we discover the resemblance.
- The following principle is founded on the same reason. The difference in the effects of two resembling objects must proceed from that particular, in which they differ. For as like causes always produce like effects, when in any instance we find our expectation to be disappointed, we must conclude that this irregularity proceeds from some difference in the causes.
- When any object encreases or diminishes with the encrease or diminution of its cause, it is to be regarded as a compounded effect, derived from the union of the several different effects, which arise from the several different parts of the cause. The absence or presence of one part of the cause is here supposed to be always attended with the absence or presence of a proportionable part of the effect. This constant conjunction sufficiently proves, that the one part is the cause of the other. We must, however, beware not to draw such a conclusion from a few experiments. A certain degree of heat gives pleasure; if you diminish that heat, the pleasure diminishes; but it does not follow, that if you augment beyond a certain degree, the pleasure will likewise augment; for we find that it degenerates into pain.
- The eight and last rule I shall take notice of is, that an object, which exists for any time in its full perfection without any effect, is not the sole cause of that effect, but requires to be assisted by some other principle, which may forward its influences and operation. For as like effects necessarily follow from like causes, and in a contiguous time and place, their separation for a moment shews, that these causes are not compleat ones. (THN 1.3.15)
In Treatise 1.3.15, Hume states eight “rules by which to judge of causes and effects” (see the block-quote above) because it is “possible for all objects to become causes or effects to each other”. The source of these rules is ambiguous. Although they “might have been supply’d by the natural principles of our understanding” (THN 18.104.22.168), Hume provides no evidence for this. Nevertheless, Hume thinks it is “proper” to employ them in his “reasoning” (THN 22.214.171.124; 126.96.36.199). Earlier in the Treatise, he was even more adamant about the regulative character of these rules:
We shall afterwards take notice of some general rules, by which we ought to regulate our judgment concerning causes and effects; and these rules are form’d on the nature of our understanding, and on our experience of its operations in the judgments we form concerning objects. (emphasis added, THN 188.8.131.52; see de Pierris 2001)
So, while these rules may be derived from reflection on how our minds work or some may be derived “from experience” (THN 184.108.40.206), they prescribe how we should ascribe causes to “objects” in the world, especially in “most of our philosophical reasonings”. But on Hume’s definition of a cause (rules 1–3), rules 4–8 are at most useful stipulations (Hume uses “to fix” at THN 220.127.116.11) that help one identify causal relations. This is not the place to resolve how Hume is entitled to the normative character of these rules (see Martin 1993). Now we examine these rules and their debt to Newton’s.
The first three rules define what it is to be cause and effect: as we have seen, they must be contiguous in space and time; the cause must be a prior to the effect; there must a constant union between cause and effect (THN 18.104.22.168–5). With the exception of these first three (see section 4.4), Hume’s rules of reasoning have a strong resemblance to Newton’s four “Rules for the Study of Natural Philosophy” outlined at the start of Book 3 of the Principia (third edition). For example, Hume’s fourth rule, “The same cause always produces the same effect, and the same effect never arises but from the same cause”, is explained by
[F]or when by any clear experiment I have discover’d the causes or effects of any phænomenon, I immediately extend our observation to every phenomenon of the same kind.
This echoes Newton’s second rule of reasoning, especially in its generalizing tendency, which Newton explicitly asserts in his third rule. That is to say, in his fourth rule, Hume makes explicit what is implied by the simplicity of nature assumption in Newton’s first rule: that the same cause always produces the same effect. Also, Hume’s fifth rule is an articulation of Newton’s first and third rules. Hume’s sixth rule is itself an extension of Hume’s fifth.
Hume’s seventh and eighth rules do not directly echo Newton’s four rules. Hume admits, however, that one should be cautious in applying and extending the seventh rule because one cannot extrapolate from a “few experiments” (THN 22.214.171.124; he appeals to the rule at 126.96.36.199). The example Hume offers (on the relationship between heat and pleasure/pain) is about a mental phenomenon. Even so we think there is an important critical relationship between Hume’s Rule VII and Newtonian gravitation (what follows is taken over from Hazony & Schliesser 2016). This relationship is not explicit in his text, it is established by Hume’s wording, which closely follows Newton’s phrasing in discussing gravity in the Principia: In his Book 3, Proposition 7, Corollary 1, Newton describes gravitation as an action in which “every attraction toward a whole arises from the attractions toward the individual parts”. In Rule VII, Hume speaks in these same terms, arguing that a quality that “encreases or diminishes with the encrease or diminution of its cause”, should be “regarded as a compounded effect, deriv’d from the union of the several different effects, which arise from the several different parts of the cause”. And, elsewhere in the Treatise, Hume writes explicitly of the force of gravitation using just this language (THN 188.8.131.52). On the face of it, then, Hume’s Rule VII seems to adopt Newtonian language in order to provide an alternative description of the kind of extrapolation involved in establishing Newtonian gravitation.
But only the first half of Rule VII is compatible with Newton’s science. In the latter half, Hume turns against Newton, warning against the attempt to “draw such a conclusion from a few experiments” (THN 184.108.40.206). Indeed, we know quite well that effects can vary proportionately within a certain range of experience and yet behave completely differently outside of this range. Hume gives the example of our experience of fire.
A certain degree of heat gives pleasure; if you diminish that heat, the pleasure diminishes; but it does not follow, that if you augment it beyond a certain degree, the pleasure will likewise augment; for we find that it degenerates into pain.
This argument, made with respect to heat, is no less applicable to the Newtonian force of gravitation: what appears to be a strictly proportional relation over a given range of experience can turn into something quite different when one strays from this range.
What we have, therefore, is as follows. Newton’s Rule III, which is the basis for the claimed universality for his law of gravitation, is met and replaced by Hume’s Rule VII, whose intent is in a certain sense precisely the opposite: The so-called universal law of gravitation must be regarded only as characterizing a certain range of human experience and no more. Extension of this law beyond our experience (or beyond what “perceptible models” allow for, see Landy 2017), whether into the heavens or the microworld, cannot be admitted into science (except as “hypothesis”). And the same will have to be said for all other qualities that are attributed to bodies significantly outside of the bounds of our actual experience. What to Newton is nothing less than the “foundation of all natural philosophy”—his Rule III—is in Hume’s philosophy shown to be unnecessary for scientific reasoning and of questionable validity.
This suggests that it is Newton’s Rule II that Hume considers to be “Newton’s chief rule of philosophizing”—an interpretation that fits well with what Hume writes about method in both the Treatise and in his later writings. It also reinforces the view that Hume rejects Rule III as being that part of Newton’s philosophy that is worthy of being adopted and imitated. Indeed, Hume’s point is precisely that it is Newton’s Rule II, chiefly, that we should be interested in. Rule III, with its extravagant claims concerning the presence of supposedly essential qualities in every body in the universe far from common life is one we can afford to set aside. The view we have presented here is at odds with that of Graciela de Pierris, who builds her discussion of Hume’s debt to Newton around Hume’s putative embrace of Newton’s Rule III as the cornerstone for his philosophical method (de Pierris 2006: 306–310, 312; for detailed criticism see Hazony & Schliesser 2016).
Hume’s eighth rule is, as Hume himself implies, a refinement of Hume’s fourth rule; it prevents over-zealous causal ascription to an object. (In his explanation of the rule, Hume presupposes the spatial and temporal contiguity requirement of cause and effect, but it is not an essential feature of the rule.) But the first part of it (“an object, which exists for any time in its full perfection without any effect”) appears to target non-Newtonian theological or Spinozistic arguments, so will not be discussed here.
On Hume’s interpretation, Newton’s second rule is the only rule that is said to be derived (un-controversially) “from experience” (THN 220.127.116.11). It is a crucial rule because the fifth and sixth rules are, by Hume’s lights, extensions of the fourth (THN 18.104.22.168–8). Moreover, the conjunction of Hume’s fourth and seventh rules produces a new rule: “An effect always holds proportion with its cause” (“Of Interest”, EMPL 297). We can call this Hume’s ninth rule. If one assumes (or prescribes) that linear causal relationships are the only possible ones, this new rule allows Hume to rule out competing claims that posit the existence of causal relationships that are not “proportional”. Hume can use the rule as a constraint on theory. It plays a prominent role in Hume’s political economy when he rejects Mercantilism and, more important for our present purposes, in his criticism of the use of analogy in the Newtonian argument from Design (see EHU XI, and Dialogues Parts V–VII).
Hume’s ninth rule also has Newtonian debts. Since the time of Aristotle, many philosophers have asserted proportionality between cause and effect in one fashion or another. Hume’s ninth rule echoes, for instance, a principle Leibniz uses quite frequently: the principle of the equality of cause and effect. It is the basis of arguments Leibniz gives for his conservation principles (e.g., Specimen Dynamicum). But Leibniz’s formulation is in terms of equality and not proportionality. Unlike Leibniz and other Cartesians, Newton preferred to reason in terms of proportionality. Although Hume’s ninth rule is not derived from any of Newton’s official Rules of Reasoning, Newton does implicitly use a rule like Hume’s ninth throughout the Principia. For example, the importance of a proportion between cause and effect is emphasized throughout the treatment of the behavior of bodies in resisting fluids (e.g., the Scholium to Proposition 40, Book 2, Section 7, especially Experiment 14), which, given the importance, for Hume, of treating money as a fluid (“Of the Balance of Trade”, EMPL 312–315; see Schabas 2001) may have caught Hume’s attention. Hume also treats resistance in his footnote to the EHU, 7.1.15. Moreover, there is a prominent place in the Principia (the Scholium following Proposition 69, Book I, Section 11), where Newton implicitly transforms a version of Hume’s seventh rule into Hume’s ninth rule in which proportionality is emphasized. In this Scholium, Newton starts employing the language and emphasizing the importance of proportionality. This is not ruled out by Newton’s own “rules”, but it was not emphasized there. This passage could have attracted Hume’s attention for two reasons: it is one of the few explicit methodological passages in the Principia, and it offers an account of what Newton means by “attraction”. Hume was almost certainly aware of this passage because the proper meaning of “attraction” is discussed, with explicit appeal to Newton’s intentions, in Hume’s footnote to EHU 7.1.25. Hume makes the ninth rule explicit and uses it as a constraint with which competing theories (in political economy, the argument from design, etc) can be ruled out. Hume’s use of it in his attack on the design argument is an instance where Hume attacks Newton with Newtonian tools.
Moreover, there are two connected, important further differences between Hume’s and Newton’s rules. First, Hume never quite endorses the universal reach implied by Newton’s third rule. For Newton we extend the known qualities of bodies within our experimental reach to all bodies in the universe. While it could be compatible with Newton’s third rule, Hume’s fourth rule does not go that far. There is one instance where Hume appears to accept an implication of Newton’s rule: “The production of motion by impulse and gravity is an universal law, which has hitherto admitted of no exception” (EHU 6.4). Leaving aside the fact that this would a very puzzling way to express the inverse-square law, the context makes clear that Hume has in mind causes that “are entirely uniform and constant” on Earth, not their universal reach; this is why in context his other examples involve the burning of fire and the suffocation of every human creature by water. There is textual support to suspect that Hume would deny the universal scope implied by Newton’s third rule. Hume states a “maxim” in a footnote to section XI of EHU which argues against inferring new effects from any cause only “known only by its particular effects”. This denies Newton’s strategy of making ever more audacious inferences (about planetary motions, the tides, the shape of the Earth, comets, etc) based on the acceptance of universal gravity (recall Hume’s treatment of Newton’s methodology in HE, VI, 542, discussed in section 3). The argument in favor of the “maxim” reveals the tension with Newton’s third rule:
To say, that the new effects proceed only from a continuation of the same energy, which is already known from the first effects, will not remove the difficulty. For even granting this to be the case (which can seldom be supposed), the very continuation and exertion of a like energy (for it is impossible it can be absolutely the same), I say, this exertion of a like energy, in a different period of space and time, is a very arbitrary supposition. (EHU 11.26)
Newton’s first three rules offer a bold methodological program that attempts to unify science across different periods of space and time; it is a bet on the causal unity of nature. The maxim cautions against overconfidence in this regard. Hume’s caution is prophetic because it turns out that sub-atomic entities behave very differently than macroscopic bodies. However, it is not entirely certain if one should ascribe the “maxim” in the footnote to Hume because it is offered in the voice of a “friend”, who is pretending to be Epicurus.
Second, Hume lacks an equivalent to Newton’s Rule 4. Hume is not alone in ignoring rule 4. Even Reid and Priestley, who have much to say about the authority of Newton’s Rules of Reasoning, tend to ignore the fourth rule (Tapper 2002). Adam Smith seems to have been one of few eighteenth century figures to have taken it seriously (Schliesser 2005a and 2005b). Recall (from section 4.2) that Newton’s Rule IV can be viewed as (1) an encouragement to find and exploit known deviations from the regularities one has established in order to make them “more exact”. (2) A proposal about how to treat a theory, that is, as true until proven otherwise. Hume seems to have not appreciated the first point at all (Schliesser 2004). On the second point, we have seen that Hume shares Newton’s commitment to fallibilism. But this common commitment also hides an important difference between Hume and Newton which is connected to the observation just made about the contrast between Newton’s third rule and the maxim in the footnote to section XI of EHU. Newton’s fallibilism includes commitment to the truth of the propositions within one’s scientific theory until it is proven to be false. Newton realizes that induction can never be certain for all time; he does anticipate Hume in this respect. But it is also an expression of Newton’s “scientific naturalism”. Empirical science is authoritative until one has empirical reason to refine theory. This means that at any time one risks the danger of going beyond one’s evidence, but this is the methodological price one must pay to make further progress. In his eagerness to combat Newtonian superstition, Hume is willing to be more cautious.
Hume’s omission of an equivalent rule has several implications for his philosophy and its relationship to Newton’s. First Hume replaces the authority of natural philosophy by his own criterion, the “copy principle”, when it comes to existence claims (see section 2, of the entry on Hume). Only the ideas that can be traced to a distinct impression will be permissible. Thus, Hume’s “science of man”, or “true philosophy”, offers to evaluate the claims of natural philosophy from a privileged position. This is the sense in which Hume is not a scientific naturalist.
Second, without commitment to the truth of a “scientific” theory, Hume has conceptual elbow room for a distinction between the provable, experimental claims of common life (including some parts of natural philosophy) and the lesser, probable commitments of the more abstract parts of natural philosophy. This, too, is a result of Hume’s “science of man”. Recall (from section 1) that the Humean practitioners of “mitigated scepticism” will not
be tempted to go beyond common life, so long as they consider the imperfection of those faculties which they employ, their narrow reach, and their inaccurate operations.
The distinction between a provable common life and the far less probable parts of natural philosophy runs through all of Hume’s major works. Yet, its implications for Hume’s attitude toward Newtonian natural philosophy are not discussed until the Dialogues. There, Cleanthes, the spokesperson for a Newtonian natural religion, attacks the Humean position:
They are even obliged to acknowledge, that the most abstruse and remote objects are those, which are best explained by philosophy. Light is in reality anatomized: The true system of the heavenly bodies is discovered and ascertained. But the nourishment of bodies by food is still an inexplicable mystery: The cohesion of the parts of matter is still incomprehensible…In reality, would not a man be ridiculous, who pretended to reject Newton’s explication of the wonderful phenomenon of the rainbow, because that explication gives a minute anatomy of the rays of light; a subject, forsooth, too refined for human comprehension? And what would you say to one, who having nothing particular to object to the arguments of Copernicus and Galileo for the motion of the earth, should withhold his assent, on that general principle, That these subjects were too magnificent and remote to be explained by the narrow and fallacious reason of mankind?… In vain would the sceptic make a distinction between science and common life, or between one science and another. The arguments, employed in all, if just, are of a similar nature, and contain the same force and evidence. Or if there be any difference among them, the advantage lies entirely on the side of theology and natural religion. Many principles of mechanics are founded on very abstruse reasoning; yet no man, who has any pretensions to science, even no speculative sceptic, pretends to entertain the least doubt with regard to them. The Copernican system contains the most surprising paradox, and the most contrary to our natural conceptions, to appearances, and to our very senses: yet even monks and inquisitors are now constrained to withdraw their opposition to it. (Dialogues Part I)
Cleanthes points out that if philosophy asserts the distinction between common life and science, philosophy would set itself against some of the best supported parts of natural philosophy which are often most removed from common life. We may naturally think that the Sun is in motion, but the reality behind the appearances can be very surprising. Cleanthes’s point is that philosophy cannot hope to argue against the authority of science without looking as backward as monks and inquisitors (who attacked Copernicanism).
For our purposes, there are three important features in Cleanthes’s discussion. First, he claims that the same kind of correct reasoning applies to all domains. This is a very popular argument among religious Newtonians (e.g., Reid). So just because science deals with uncommon domains and obscure topics, it can still contain “just reasoning”. This is, in fact, one of the major assumptions behind Hume’s own Rules of Reasoning. So, Cleanthes uses Hume’s philosophy to undercut part of Hume’s anti-Newtonian strategy. Even if Philo were not bound by Hume’s philosophy (and there is no evidence he should be considered a strict spokesperson for Hume), as a defender of the epistemic priority of common life he has no resources to claim that there is a different, correct form of reasoning for areas beyond common life. Second, if there is a debate between science and common life, the advantage is with science. No skeptic, who at least pretends to be informed, is seriously willing to doubt the results of natural philosophy. That is, by the last third of the eighteenth century natural philosophy has an authoritative claim to knowledge even if it is founded on very uncommon, “abstruse” principles. Third, Cleanthes assimilates the success of natural philosophy to theology and natural religion; he does not recognize a principled distinction between science and religion. If Philo attacks natural religion he attacks science itself. Contemporary advocates of “intelligent design”, who claim that it should be treated as a scientific theory (see the entry on teleological arguments for God’s existence), follow the same strategy as Cleanthes.
Initially it seems that Cleanthes’s argument is left without a response. So there appears no room for a principled difference between common life, on the one hand, and natural philosophy and natural religion, on the other hand. In the remainder of the Dialogues, Philo makes sure not to be thought of as attacking natural philosophy again. In the context where the intellectual authority of science has become unchallengeable, Philo’s best hope lies in driving a wedge between natural philosophy and natural religion. This may explain why in undermining Newtonian natural religion, Philo does not draw on some core elements of Hume’s philosophy: the “copy principle” or Hume’s attack on the permissibility of final causes. Rather, throughout the Dialogues, Philo offers more narrow arguments attacking the content of natural religion. So, while in Part I of the Dialogues Philo has no immediate response to Cleanthes’s argument, later in the Dialogues he continues to use some distinction between the secure reasoning available in common life and those too far removed from it. For example, by using Hume’s ninth rule, Philo is critical of the use of analogy in making claims about the nature of the first cause. Philo relies on common sense to formulate the problem of evil—if God is all powerful then he is responsible for natural and moral evil (see Part XI). At the end of the Dialogue, Philo is willing to grant Cleanthes “that the cause or causes of order in the universe probably bear some remote analogy to human intelligence” (Part XII; emphasis in original). So, while Philo is unable to draw a conclusive, principled distinction between natural philosophy and natural religion, he reduces the latter to a very minimal thesis.
It may, of course, be possible that by the end of his life, Hume had limited his aims to removing the “superstitious” elements in Newtonianism (recall his criticism of Newton in Section 1). Perhaps he had given up on claiming the priority of the science of man over natural philosophy. But it would be a mistake to identify the posthumous Dialogues as Hume’s final, definitive philosophy. Hume appended an “advertisement” to EHU, which was printed at the start of the posthumous 1777 edition. After distancing himself (to some degree) from his “juvenile work”, the Treatise, he says about EHU: “Henceforth, the Author desires, that the following Pieces may alone be regarded as containing his philosophical sentiments and principles”. EHU contains, of course, Hume’s copy principle and the attack on final causes. Perhaps, the closing remarks of Philo, where he apologizes for
intervening in the education and instruction of his [i.e., Cleanthes’s] pupil [i.e., Pamphillus—the official narrator of (and witness to) the dialogues among Philo, Cleanthes, and Demea],
should be taken more seriously by more of Hume’s readers. The Dialogues are Hume’s efforts to educate the students of natural religion; they are not a statement of Hume’s positive “science of man” or “true metaphysics”.
There has been a persistent strain of criticism of David Hume that has insinuated that he simply did not understand Newton or lacked mathematical competence. But when Hume (or any other historical figure) deviates from Newton this need not entail lack of understanding, it can, depending on other evidence, also be taken as informed criticism (Schliesser 2011). In Hume’s case, critical scholars also draw on a (1772) letter to William Strahan in which he mentions a 1755 draft essay “On the Metaphysical Principles of Geometry” that he withdrew upon the advice of his friend the mathematician Lord Stanhope, “who convinced me that either there was some defeat in the argument or in its perspicuity” (Newman 1981). This remark is taken as evidence of Hume’s acknowledged lack of competence in mathematics. But it could also be taken at face value and an expression of scholarly integrity: he accepted a compelling criticism.
However far his understanding of complex mathematics reached, he advanced a radical sceptical challenge for mathematics, and thereby he also undermined knowledge claims associated with demonstrative reasoning (Meeker 2007). The sceptical problem arises from the inexactness of geometrical ideas and the fallibility of our reasoning processes. Geometry for Hume is about actual figures and shapes whose ideas cannot be perfectly exact because our perceptual abilities are limited, and reasoning based on these ideas inherits this inexactness. Ideas relevant for arithmetic, i.e., numbers, do not suffer from this imprecision, but arithmetical reasoning is just as fallible as human reasoning in general. The outcome of our demonstrative reasoning must be judged by a probabilistic judgment on the reliability of our reasoning faculties, which in turn must be judged by a further probabilistic judgment on the probabilistic judgment on the reliability of our faculties. The apparent demonstrative certainty of our mathematical reasoning degenerates into probability, and we are left with fallible and uncertain conclusions even in our demonstrative sciences (THN 22.214.171.124–6).
But Hume does not stop there: he offers a sceptical solution to this challenge (Demeter 2019a). First he offers an individual remedy for the mathematician: to go back and to check again his reasoning, because “[e]very time he runs over his proofs, his confidence increases” (THN 126.96.36.199). Secondly, social processes are more effective in reducing doubt, because his certainty is increased “still more by the approbation of his friends; and is rais’d to its utmost perfection by the universal assent and applauses of the learned world” (THN 188.8.131.52). Even if all demonstrative knowledge remains probabilistic in this approach too, the certainty of mathematical reasoning reaches its peak due to the acknowledgment of epistemic peers.
The popularity of a mathematical proof (or demonstration) among experts in the field naturally speaks in favor of the proof. This feature is not peculiar to mathematical conclusions, because as Hume points out: “I feel all my opinions loosen and fall of themselves, when unsupported by the approbation of others” (THN 184.108.40.206). What makes mathematics peculiar is that, in addition to individual reasoning, the approbation of the mathematician’s close circle of “friends”, and the approval of the scholarly community seem to be the only sources of justification in matters of mathematics.
By connecting mathematical certainty to the approbation of others Hume gives an essentially social character to mathematical knowledge. No matter the different metaphysical and epistemic pedigree of its branches, it is their practices that determine the certainty of mathematical conclusions (THN 220.127.116.11). In practice geometrical reasoning is elevated to the same level of certainty as our reasoning in arithmetic and algebra—and his may be one way to explain why the Enquiry (EHU 4.1, 7.1–2, 12.20) lists all of them as demonstrative. The limitations of our practices, arising from human nature, condemn all branches of mathematics to eventual fallibility and uncertainty. But that is not the main lesson we should draw here. What really matters is that despite this fallibility we generate certainty through our predominantly social practices. So geometry in practice can be as certain and demonstrative as arithmetic is in principle demonstrative, but in practice, fallible. Taken together, the metaphysics and practice of mathematics leads us to pretty much the same epistemic grounds in all branches of mathematics.
Hume’s reservations about the demonstrability of mathematics imply a critique of Newton’s programme of mathematizing natural philosophy (for details see Hazony & Schliesser 2016). This criticism is not wholly implicit; rather Newton is very clearly the target of remarks made in the context of Hume’s discussion of the principle of “infinite divisibility” in the paragraphs subsequent to THN 18.104.22.168:
we are not possess’d of any instrument or art of measuring, which can secure us from all error and uncertainty… we therefore suppose some imaginary standard of equality, by which the appearances and measuring are exactly corrected, and the figures reduc’d entirely to that proportion… But tho’ this standard be only imaginary, the fiction however is very natural; nor is any thing more usual, than for the mind to proceed after this manner with any action, even after the reason has ceas’d, which first determin’d it to begin. This appears very conspicuously with regard to time; where tho’ ’tis evident we have no exact method of determining the proportions of parts, not even so exact as in extension, yet the various corrections of our measures, and their different degrees of exactness, have given us an obscure and implicit notion of a perfect and entire equality. The case is the same in many other subjects. A painter forms the same fiction with regard to colours. A mechanic with regard to motion. (THN 22.214.171.124)
Instead of introducing certainty into natural philosophy as Newton claimed, mathematics, albeit a useful device “in almost every art and profession” (THN 126.96.36.199), is thus grounded in natural fictions. It has a limited contribution to the advancement of knowledge. Mathematics in Hume’s eyes is only another human cognitive enterprise that has no potential to make other fields of knowledge immune to human fallibility. This is in sharp contrast with the cognitive optimism Newton expresses in the Preface to the Principia and several other passages about the role of mathematics in natural inquiry (see Guicciardini 2009, esp. ch. 13 & 14; Zemplén & Demeter 2010). Newton is confident that by making the method of inquiry mathematical, natural philosophy can be infused with certainty and demonstrativity. This confidence is undermined by Hume’s account of how mathematical knowledge is possible at all.
4.7 Analysis and synthesis
What is distinctive about the method of the Principia is what I.B. Cohen termed the “Newtonian style”. Its constitutive feature is the mathematization of nature, i.e., “dealing mathematically with the realities of the external world”. This meant much more than deriving numerical results from experiments, or a focus on measurement, or a commitment to a means of exposition that proceeded from definitions and axioms. Instead, it meant taking mathematics as the model of reality: constructing “the mathematical analogue of a natural situation” and then to advance from this idealized case by the addition of further conditions toward more accurate mathematical analogues of actual situations (Cohen 1980: 51, 151, see also Smith 2002; Smeenk & Schliesser 2013). There are no traces of this approach in Hume, so if one takes the Principia’s “Newtonian style” as the essence of Newton’s method, then one should also conclude that Hume’s experimental method is not Newtonian. (For a contrasting view see de Pierris 2015 who credits Hume with a Principia-style Newtonian inductive methodology, and for a critique of her views see Landy 2017.)
As McGuire (1970b: 182) points out “Newton did not see any dichotomy in method between that used in the Principia and that found in the Opticks”. But even if he considered his methodology fundamentally the same in both works, and he treated mathematical and experimental analyses as contributing to inquiry in the same manner, this was perceived differently by subsequent generations. In Query 31 Newton himself introduces two different ways of analysis that “may proceed from compounds to ingredients, and from motions to the forces producing them” (Opticks, Query 31 added in 1718, Newton 2004: 139; for a discussion see e.g. Ducheyne 2012; Demeter 2016): the first way allows for a qualitative analysis that does not require the centrality of a mathematical framework of analysis. The crucial element is indeed common to their methodology, namely the idea of causal analysis—this is the core of Newtonian analysis, and these are the terms in which Colin Maclaurin (1775: 8–10) introduces the Newtonian method to his contemporaries. Nevertheless, it is immediately clear from this passage that an analysis “from compounds to ingredients” must proceed differently and find different causes from an analysis “from motions to the forces producing them”: they will be different with respect to both the method of analysis, and the nature of the causes that can be so analysed.
From the angle of Newton’s Preface to the first edition of the Principia,
the basic problem of philosophy seems to be to discover the forces of nature from the phenomena of motions and then to demonstrate the other phenomena from these forces. (Newton 2004: 41)
So its method is focused on analysing the causes of motions in terms of forces, a quantifiable natural kind that is defined in terms of other quantities. So defined, the problem cries out for a mathematical apparatus, and so it fosters what I.B. Cohen termed “the Newtonian style” in philosophy: taking mathematics as the model of reality, constructing “the mathematical analogue of a natural situation”, and then producing from this idealized case by the addition of further conditions more and more accurate mathematical analogues of actual situations (Cohen 1980: 51, 151). Through this series of “successive approximations”, Newton’s axioms or laws of motion function as “inference tickets” that allow for drawing conclusions from motions to forces and vice versa, and also from macrophysical to microphysical forces composing them (Smith 2002: 143, 155–159; Smeenk & Schliesser 2013).
The analysis of compounds to ingredients, followed in the Opticks, looks for parts, components, constituents etc., and accompanies the mathematical methods of analysis where they prove to be inadequate in themselves. The qualitative component of analysis is intended to reveal the composition of optical and, especially in the Queries, chemical phenomena. The paradigmatic cases are, of course, Newton’s prism experiments that revealed the composition of white light. In the first two books of the Opticks Newton himself uses the method of analysis of compounds into ingredients “to discover and prove the original differences of rays of light” (Query 31, Newton 2004: 140), that is to discover qualitative differences that persist due to the lack of their analysis in the “Newtonian style”. Most notable among them, as the experimentum crucis had revealed, are colours that
are not Qualifications of Light, derived from Refractions, or Reflections of natural Bodies (as ’tis generally believed,) but Original and connate properties, which in divers Rays are divers. (Newton 1671/72: 3081; for discussion and context see Ducheyne 2012: 190–192)
In this vein, the Opticks provides a more appropriate setting for understanding the character of Hume’s experimentalism than the context of the Principia. As Colin Maclaurin put it in his 1748 account of Newton’s discoveries: while the Principia inquires into forces acting between bodies in great distance, the Opticks explores the “hidden parts of nature”, which are not so easily “subjected to analysis” because of the subtlety and minuteness of the agents (Maclaurin 1775: 21). The principles of human nature that Hume endeavours to explore also belong to the hidden parts of nature that can be explored by a method of qualitative analysis and synthesis similar to the one advertised in Query 31. (Landy 2017 offers a consonant reconstruction of Hume’s philosophy of science as aiming at the exploration of hidden processes of the mind.)
The Treatise begins with setting up a “scheme of fundamental ‘elements’” for analyzing human phenomena in terms of ideas and impressions. Humean analysis begins with phenomena from the historical and everyday observation of human behavior, and the analysis proceeds by “experiments … judiciously collected and compar’d” (THN I.10), in order to arrive at analogies among various instances “from the observation of several parallel instances” (EHU 8.13). The products of comparative analysis so conducted are the principles of various faculties, like perception, imagination, reason, etc., whose interaction results in ideas and impressions causing behaviour, but their contribution can hardly be measured and the principles of their interaction can hardly be quantified—not even in principle, so they cannot be mathematized either (see also section 4.6 above). Instead, they remain qualitatively different principles of human nature, and the explanation of human phenomena consists in a description of how these principles with their distinctive characteristics figure in producing them (Demeter 2016).
The methodological core thus consists in collecting relevant phenomena, finding analogies between them, and ascribing those analogies to similar causes, thereby reducing a variety of phenomena to regular principles underlying them (THN App.3, Abs.1, EHU 4.12)—while knowing that our knowledge cannot transcend what we can infer on an analogical basis from the effects themselves (THN I.8). Just as comparing rays of light reveals their determinable properties which, once determined, can be used in constructing explanations, the comparison of instances of human behavior reveals the principles of human nature with increasing generality and exactness. Salient human phenomena are collected from history and observation, then compared; if analogies and similarities are found, they are ascribed to some principle of human nature that are also compared, grouped and resolved into more general ones (see also Section 4.8 below). This process results in determinable properties of human nature like the faculties of reason, sympathy, moral sense etc.; determining how these properties are actually instantiated in different social, historical, individual, etc. circumstances provides the explanatory raw material for singular phenomena (EHU 8.7, 8.9). Thus we reach the principles of human nature that are the proper aim of inquiry in the science of man. These principles can be used, at the stage of synthesis, to explain why our impressions and ideas follow one another in the order they do.
The outcome of these procedures is the refinement of the theory of human nature. While exploring exceptions and eliminating superfluous conditions it turns out, for example, that some principles of human nature are universal, some others are particular (THN 188.8.131.52). Some principles of imagination are then constitutive of human nature, but some others are just contingent on culture or history, or even idiosyncratic, and can lead to local superstitions or philosophical chimeras, like presupposing “substance” as the bearer of properties in scholastic metaphysics. The universal principles provide the fundamental framework of determinable human properties that are actually determined by social and historical circumstances. This explains why certain virtues, like courage, are evaluated differently in different historical periods (EPM 7.11–14), and also why a creature without sympathy, however contingent its degree and direction may be, would count as a “monster” and not a “man” (EPM 6.1–2). Sympathy is a universal principle of human nature, but the principles of the degree and direction of its sensitivity are determined by the conditions within which it is developed and refined through social interaction (EPM 5.41–42). This amounts to saying that Hume’s account of human nature has both universalistic and contextualist elements, and this is the outcome of his experimental methodology: it is through a series of successive approximation through a comparative study of changing circumstances that the universal and contingent principles of human nature can be distinguished.
Analysis and synthesis so understood constitutes the core of “the experimental method of reasoning” that distinguishes Hume’s enterprise from the alternative approach that Newton (2004: 121) had termed “hypothetical philosophy”. Hume is aware of this distinction and explicitly sides with the experimentalist camp. His methodological pronouncements and commitments situate him in the context of “methodological Newtonianism” characteristic to Scottish moral and natural philosophers, who “dealt with aspects of philosophy for which Newton had not laid down the specific postulates upon which future theories were to be built” (Donovan 1975: 29, see also Demeter 2016).
As Hume repeatedly emphasizes, it is impossible to reveal the “ultimate causes of our mental actions”, and we have to be content with “experience and analogy” in explaining any act of the mind “by producing other instances, which are analogous to it, and other principles, which facilitate its operation” (THN 184.108.40.206). Finding analogies between different instances gives one the chance to explain causes and reduce them to “more general principles” (THN App. 3). For Hume, analogical reasoning is the key to most of our everyday and philosophical conclusions in empirical matters. Causal reasoning is partly but crucially founded on our capacity to recognize resemblances among different instances, and to extend our inferences based on previous observations to similar but unobserved instances. Thus, the recognition of resemblances is at the heart of our reasoning concerning any matter of fact, and the limits of this kind of reasoning are exactly where our capacity to recognize resemblances ends (THN 220.127.116.11). The proper method of both natural and moral philosophy is
to reduce the principles, productive of natural phaenomena, to a greater simplicity, and to resolve the many particular effects into a few general causes, by means of reasonings from analogy, experience, and observation. (EHU 4.12, 11.30; THN 18.104.22.168)
It is history—natural and civil as well—that provides the pool of observations from which philosophers—natural and moral ones as well—relying on analogies can establish explanatory principles. Finding analogies between different instances gives one the chance to explain causes and reduce them to “more general principles” (THN App.3).
In the Dialogues, and especially in the sections criticizing the design argument, Hume seems to be more critical of analogical reasoning than he is in his other passages of similar methodological relevance; nevertheless, Philo pronounces “analogies and resemblances” reliable enough to serve as the “sole proofs of the Copernican system” (Dialogues 2.26). Given that in Hume’s epistemology the category of proof provides the highest level of epistemic certainty available for any piece of empirical knowledge, analogical reasoning is a highly esteemed way of reaching theoretical conclusions in exploring the principles of nature and human nature (EHU 6n10). Hume’s doubts in the Dialogues concerning analogical arguments from design primarily do not arise from the weaknesses of analogical reasoning, but mainly from the uniqueness of the world, which does not provide a sufficient pool of instances among which analogies can be found (EHU 11.26).
Although the cognitive role of analogy is central, it relies on subjective judgment and so it can have idiosyncratic manifestations. Things are similar in an infinite number of ways, and only some of these similarities can be exploited with the hope of cognitive benefit (THN 22.214.171.124). As any thing may resemble any other in an infinite number of ways only some resemblances can explain associative relations between ideas. Resemblances of cognitive relevance are therefore not passively detected, but they are actively produced by memory: we remember past instances as resembling (THN 126.96.36.199). Depending on the resemblances one recognizes among particular instances, one can end up with different and potentially conflicting conclusions concerning the causes of phenomena. Therefore, as Hume puts it:
No questions in philosophy are more difficult, than when a number of causes present themselves for the same phaenomenon, to determine which is the principal and predominant. There seldom is any very precise argument to fix our choice, and men must be contented to be guided by a kind of taste or fancy, arising from analogy, and a comparison of similar instances. (THN 188.8.131.52n71)
This is one reason why “Tis not solely in poetry and music, we must follow our taste and sentiment, but likewise in philosophy” (THN 184.108.40.206). And while the subjectivity of analogical reasoning is a source of creativity and insight, it also puts the objectivity and certainty of Newton’s epistemic ideal beyond reach.
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