Inheritance Systems

First published Wed Jan 4, 2012; substantive revision Wed Nov 14, 2018

Organisms inherit various kinds of developmental information and cues from their parents. The study of inheritance systems is aimed at identifying and classifying the various mechanisms and processes of heredity, the types of hereditary information that is passed on by each, the functional interaction between the different systems, and the evolutionary consequences of these properties.

It is now common to identify heredity with the transmission of genes, or even more concretely with the transmission of DNA sequence, from parents to offspring. It is, however, clear on reflection that there are other ways in which offspring may receive from parents resources or cues that affect their development. This is particularly apparent in humans, and the suggestion that social and cultural cues may serve as an additional “inheritance system” has been made many times. These observations, and the models of dual inheritance of genes and culture (e.g., Boyd & Richerson 1985; Cavalli-Sforza & Feldman 1981; Durham 1991; for a recent overview see Mesoudi 2011, Lewens 2015), are a useful starting point from which to approach the more general project of elucidating the notion of inheritance system. Cultural inheritance, however, is a broad category, whereas the analysis of inheritance systems discussed below tends to be more fine-grained (see Sterelny 2001, p. 337). The term “inheritance systems” is used to describe different mechanisms, processes, and factors, by which different kinds of hereditary information and variation are stored and transmitted between generations.

We present the discussion of inheritance systems in the context of several debates. First, between proponents of monism about heredity (gene-centric views), holism about heredity (Developmental Systems Theory), and those stressing the role of multiple systems of inheritance. Second, between those analyzing inheritance solely in terms of replication and transmission, and views that stress the multi-generation reproduction of phenotypic traits. A third debate is concerned with different criteria that have been proposed for identifying and delimiting inheritance systems. A fourth controversy revolves around the evolutionary implications of the existence of the different inheritance systems, for example the significance of the “Lamarckian” aspects of some of the inheritance systems that have been identified, such as epigenetic inheritance and behavioral inheritance, as well as potentially the inheritance of microbial symbionts (i.e., the microbiome) that allow the transmission of environmentally induced characters (i.e., “soft inheritance”).

This entry is organized as follows: Sections 1 and 2 provide common ground and historical context for the discussion. Section 3 discusses specific accounts of inheritance systems. General evolutionary implications are presented in section 4. Finally, section 5 summarizes some of the open questions in the field.

1. Introduction

1.1 Heredity and Inheritance

It is useful to distinguish between the following terms. The terms heredity and hereditary will be used henceforth to refer to reliable resemblance relations between parents and offspring. Particular traits (phenotypic or genotypic), may be hereditary in this sense.[1] The term inheritance will be used to refer to causal processes of transmission between parents and offspring that account for heredity, and the mechanisms responsible for them. We might, for example, say that eye color is hereditary, and that genetic inheritance accounts for the heredity of eye color (or, more formally, for the heredity of variations in eye color). Multiple inheritance processes may be implicated in the heredity of a particular phenotypic trait. Inheritance is often construed as transmission of information, though this notion raises difficulties; this issue is discussed in section 2.4.

The terms parent and offspring are used in a general sense, since transmission may be from individuals other than the genetic parents of the organism (i.e., non-vertical). Multiple inheritance systems may lead to multiple “parent-offspring” relations.

1.2 Early Work On Non-Genetic Inheritance

Modern evolutionary theory equates inheritance with the transmission of genes from parents to offspring and as such focuses only on genetic inheritance (which will be further described in section 3.3.1). Nevertheless, biologists have long known of patterns of inheritance, and eventually of inheritance mechanisms, that go beyond genetic inheritance (Jablonka & Lamb 2005; Sapp 1987). Two fundamental types of arguments led to this conclusion: arguments based on observations regarding patterns of inheritance, and arguments concerned with the localization of hereditary factors inside cells. Arguments of the first kind were based on hereditary relations and inheritance patterns that fail to conform to the rules of Mendelian inheritance (e.g., maternal inheritance). If Mendelian inheritance patterns are the result of the way the chromosomes in the eukaryotic cell nucleus behave, non-Mendelian heredity must depend on separate inheritance processes, mechanisms, or systems (Beale 1966; Sager 1966). Second, there were observations of hereditary phenomena that seemed to depend on factors residing in the cytoplasm of cells, rather than their nucleus, where the genetic material is localized. The interpretation of these observations was highly contested (Darlington 1944; Sapp 1987).

Today, we know that some of these observations are related to the (maternal) inheritance of organelles residing in the cytoplasm, such as the mitochondria and chloroplasts, organelles which carry their own DNA. This however does not encompass all the mechanisms which underlie cytoplasmatic inheritance. Paradigmatic work on cytoplasmatic inheritance done by Sonneborn, Beale, Nanney, and their colleagues in the 1950s and 1960s, was concerned with patterns of inheritance in unicellular organisms, and in particular the protist genus Paramecium. It was suggested that the self-sustaining regulatory loops that maintain gene activity or inactivity in a cell would persist through cell division, provided the non-DNA components of the system (many of which reside in the cytoplasm in eukaryotic microogranisms) were shared among daughter cells. In this way, alternative regulatory phenotypic states would be inherited. Among the properties whose inheritance was studied were mating-type variations, serotype variations, and the structural or “surface inheritance” of ciliary structures. Remarkably, microsurgical changes to the ciliary structures on the surface of Paramecium cells are inherited by offspring. The stability of induced characters once the stimulus was removed (called “cellular memory”) and the number of generations characters were maintained varied widely. However, the results indicated that long-term stability and heritability need not be the result of changes to the DNA sequence (Nanney 1958).

During the 1950s to 1970s a growing set of observations indicated that determined and differentiated states of cells are transmitted in cell lineages. These observations concerned studies of Drosophila imaginal discs by Ernst Hadorn; Briggs and King’s cloning experiments with amphibians; Mary Lyon’s work on X-chromosome inactivation; and work establishing the in vitro clonal stability of cultured cell lines. Eventually, the term epigenetic inheritance came to refer to hereditary variation that does not involve changes to the DNA sequence.

The brief account of some of the early work on unicellular organisms given above illustrates some of the distinctions that are elaborated in the rest of this entry. One group of questions is concerned with the properties of hereditary relations, the sources of variations (in particular, whether they can be environmentally induced), the stability of variations and their regulation, and so on. A second class of questions is concerned with the way hereditary information is stored and transmitted. It is here that we can locate the debates about nuclear versus cytoplasmatic inheritance and about the primacy of DNA as the information store of the cell. Although the distinction between these two groups of questions is useful, many of the topics and controversies to be discussed in this entry involve both.

1.3 Monism, Holism, and Multiple Systems views

The increasing focus by biologists on DNA as a “master molecule” containing coded genetic information, after the discovery of the double helix structure in 1953, on the one hand, and the gene-selectionist view articulated in 1966 by George Williams in his book Adaptation and Natural Selection, which culminated in the “replicator” concept in philosophy of biology (Dawkins 1976; Hull 1980, see entry: Replication and Reproduction), on the other, led to a tendency to view biological inheritance as consisting of a single channel of transmission. This channel is understood to involve the inheritance of genetic information encoded in DNA (or, in some viruses in RNA), a view often referred to as “geno-centrism”. It should be noted that the replicator concept itself does not rule out non-genetic replicators (Dawkins 1976, see also the discussion by Sterelny, Smith, & Dickison 1996). The dual-inheritance model of biological and cultural evolution which is based on two types of replicators, genes and memes, is a paradigmatic example that is based on the replicator framework, and that involves both more than one channel of inheritance and non-genetic inheritance (for detailed discussion of the notion of cultural inheritance see the entry on cultural evolution). Accounts of heredity that are based on the notion of replicators may approach non-genetic inheritance by characterizing multiple kinds of replicators (e.g., memes), each of which is supposed to underlie a different channel of non-genetic inheritance. John Maynard Smith and Eörs Szathmáry’s account of Major Transitions in Evolution is organized around transitions to new kinds of ways in which information is stored and transmitted, understood as transitions to new kinds of replicating entities (Maynard-Smith & Szathmáry 1995), and multiple types of replicators are embraced by the notion of the extended replicator (Sterelny 2001; Sterelny et al. 1996, see entry: Replication and Reproduction) discussed below. More typically, however, non-genetic forms of inheritance, with the possible exception of cultural inheritance in a few groups of higher animals, are often ruled out as not fulfilling the requirements imposed by the definition of a replicator (regarding the debate whether human cultural evolution is best understood through applying a replicator framework to learning and imitation, see Lewens 2015, chps. 1 and 2). It should be emphasized that the replicator view posited replicators, typically genes, as the unit of selection; the work discussed in this entry is concerned with the biological processes and mechanisms involved in inheritance, and is not concerned directly with the debate about the unit of selection. Implications regarding selection are elaborated in section 4.1.

Approaches that rule out or ignore non-genetic inheritance might be characterized as “monist” in their treatment of the question of the existence and significance of multiple inheritance systems. Monist tendencies may be traced back already to Wilhelm Johannsen’s work at the beginning of the 20th century. While Johannsen invented the term “gene” in order to remain uncommitted to a specific view about the material constitution of hereditary factors, both this term and the notion of “genotype” that he developed suggest a monist view of inheritance. This tendency was reinforced by molecular genetics and the replicator framework.

How do monist views handle the other forms of inheritance that are known to exist? Consider the mitochondria. Monist accounts regard the maternal inheritance of organelles such as the mitochondria, which might conceivably be thought to constitute a separate inheritance channel, if not system, to be of marginal conceptual importance. First, it can be argued that being based on genetically coded information (DNA sequence), the similarities with nuclear inheritance allows it to be seen as not involving a distinct inheritance system, if this notion is understood to refer to the way hereditary information is stored and transmitted. Indeed, views that focus on multiple inheritance systems, may for the very same reason not consider the inheritance of plastids as based on a distinct inheritance system. Second, it is assumed that the evolution of complex organismal traits is to be explained by natural selection acting on variation in genetic information in the nucleus. Thus, mitchondrial inheritance, and plastid inheritance more generally, are considered to be of limited explanatory value when trying to give a general account of the evolution of the organism (beyond the early stages of endosymbiogenesis), and is of interest mainly when considering the evolution of the mitochonrdia themselves, in which case there is yet again a single inheritance system that is relevant, that of the mitochondrial genome. Similar reasoning is applied more generally to reject forms of supposedly extra-genetic inheritance that are not based on the transmission of DNA, by claiming either that the inheritance fails to be the transmission of information or that the information that can be transmitted is limited and thus not evolutionarily significant, and is merely the transmission of material resources or infrastructure. Cashed out in the terms of the replicator framework, arguments against supposed cases of extra-genetic inheritance are that they do not lead to the establishment of replicators, which are entities that are faithfully copied and passed down multiple generations, yet replicators are necessary for evolution by natural selection, or that extra-genetic inheritance leads to replicators that are limited in the repertoire of variants they support (see Godfrey-Smith 2000). Proponents of the multiple inheritance systems view and of holistic views about inheritance argue that these requirements are either unnecessary or too strong, and lead to a distorted understanding of evolution (see Griffiths & Gray 2001; Jablonka 2001).

In contrast to monist views, proponents of “Developmental Systems Theory” (DST) (Griffiths & Gray 1994, 2001) offer a radical reformulation of evolutionary theory, including the notion of inheritance and the treatment of extra-genetic inheritance. DST applies the notion of inheritance to any developmental resource that is reliably present in successive generations, and which is part of the explanation of the similarity between generations (Griffiths & Gray 2001). While embracing the existence of non-genetic inheritance, and its significance for evolutionary accounts, these researchers argue against separating these phenomena into multiple channels or systems of inheritance (Griffiths & Gray 2001): Inheritance phenomena are so intertwined in their effects on development, and each relies on others to have its developmental effect, that it is both more realistic and scientifically more productive not to separate them into distinct channels, systems, or replicator types. The DST approach might be characterized as “holistic” in its treatment of inheritance.

In contrast to monism and holism, the views discussed in this entry identify and classify various mechanisms and processes of inheritance, the types of hereditary information that are passed on by each, the function and interaction of the different systems, and the evolutionary consequences of these properties. Contemporary views on evolution that stress the role of multiple systems of inheritance have been greatly influenced by the work Eva Jablonka and Marion Lamb, in particular their arguments about the evolutionary role of epigenetic inheritance (Jablonka 2001, 2002; Jablonka & Lamb 1995, 2005/2014, 2006) . In addition to the line of work influenced by Jablonka and Lamb, extra-genetic inheritance is stressed by DST, albeit in the form of holism about inheritance, and in the “extended replicator” framework elaborated by Kim Sterelny et al. (Sterelny 2001; Sterelny et al. 1996).

Responding to pressure from DST, the extended replicator approach elaborates the account of non-genetic replicators provided by the replicator framework (Dawkins 1976; Hull 1980) to include non-genetic replicators, while retaining the replicator/interactor distinction which both the holism of DST and the multiple systems view of Jablonka and Lamb reject: Replicators form lineages, while interactors, through which replicators interact with the environment, are ephemeral (see section 2.2 for discussion). Sterelny et al. (1996) emphasize the distinction between genes as factors having “a distinctive informational role in inheritance” and other reliably present developmental resources. According to them, this distinctive informational role explains why genes, and not just any resource, represent the phenotype and have a special developmental role. They embrace other cases of biological replication if they can be informational in the strong sense their account demands. In a nutshell, the main requirements are that the replicator have the biofunction (i.e., proper function or evolutionarily selected function) of representing the phenotype (or aspects of it) and that it play a causal role in the production of the phenotype. Genes according to this view do not have a unique or privileged role in determining the phenotype; however, they do have a distinctive informational role (see section 2.4). Whether other types of replicators exist is an empirical matter, and viewing various biological processes as replication may be scientifically productive according to Sterelny et al. (1996). In more recent work, Griffiths appeals to casual specificity for roughly the same purpose. He frames the debate as being about the extent to which non-genetic inheritance is involved in the precise determination of the phenotype, or how specific the causal relation is (see section 2.4).

1.4 Variation, Hereditary Variation, and Inheritance Systems

A fundamental requirement for evolutionary change via natural selection is the existence of variation in the population. However, for variations to have evolutionary effect they need to be (at least partly) hereditary or heritable (see entry on heritability; I will here focus on hereditary variations and hereditary transmissibility as defined above, and will not discuss the notion of heritability which is a population term). It is hereditary variations that fuel evolution through natural selection (Lewontin 1970, 1985). Thus, if we aim to give a general account of possible evolutionary change we may start by examining and classifying hereditary variations (Jablonka & Lamb 2005). Hereditary variation, in turn, may be accounted for in terms of inheritance mechanisms, hence by accounts of inheritance systems. As a starting point we can understand the notion of inheritance system as referring to mechanisms, processes, and participating factors, that are involved in transmission between parents and offspring leading to hereditary relations. Several influential accounts of inheritance systems that are of philosophical interest are discussed in section 3.

2. Reproduction and Replication

Work on inheritance systems is often situated in the context of developmental evolutionary biology, and attaches great significance to the ways in which inheritance interacts with the development of phenotypes. This section contrasts this perspective on inheritance with views that focus on replication. James Griesemer’s reproducer notion which combines inheritance and development is presented. Finally, the relationship between inheritance systems and notions of biological information is discussed.

2.1 Multi-generation reproduction of phenotypes

In contrast to the replicator view that looks for reliably replicating entities that either produce copies of themselves, induce the production of such copies, or pass on their structure through replication processes (Dawkins 1976; Hull 1980), the views discussed in what follows see natural selection as depending on the reliable multi-generation reproduction or reconstruction of phenotypes, and conceptualize inheritance accordingly (for related discussion of the topics in this section and historical details see the entry on replication). This perspective opens up many questions that the discussion of inheritance systems attempts to address. First among these is how hereditary resources or inheritance processes affect the development of offspring so as to reliably reconstruct parental phenotypic characters; this question is shared more generally by developmental evolutionary biology (Evo-Devo) and Developmental Systems Theory. Reconstruction typically occurs during the development of the offspring, which is more or less independent from the parent, and may be a complex, multi-stage, and temporally drawn out process. It may involve more than one inheritance system and depend on interactions between inheritance systems, depend on persistent environmental resources such as sunlight and gravity as well as environmental conditions produced by organisms and interactions with them (niche construction), and depend on processes such as pattern formation that give rise to what might be characterized as emergent properties. We now turn to a discussion of inheritance thus construed vis-a-vis the notion of replication.

2.2 Inheritance and replication

As mentioned earlier, two major influences led to the emphasis on replication as a necessary condition for evolution via natural selection: the influence of the replicator framework and the discovery of the molecular basis of genetic inheritance, in particular DNA replication. In their 1953 paper on the structure of DNA, James Watson and Francis Crick famously noted that the properties of the double helix structure suggest a straightforward method for replicating the DNA sequence. It is now known that DNA replication is semiconservative: each of the strands of the double stranded DNA molecule is used as a template for constructing a complementary strand, and the replication process results in two DNA molecules, each containing one of the original strands and one newly constructed strand. In the absence of mutations, each of the new double stranded DNA molecules has the same sequence of base pairs (nucleotides) the original DNA molecule had. DNA replication explains how the information in the DNA sequence is copied, so that when the cell divides each daughter cell ends up with a complete copy of the original cell’s DNA. This is a critical element of genetic inheritance, though the genetic inheritance processes of mitosis and meiosis are far more involved than DNA replication, which is only one component of them.

When considered from the perspective of accounting for the reliable reconstruction of parental phenotypes, replication of the kind found in genetic inheritance is seen to be neither sufficient nor necessary for heredity (Jablonka 2004, has a particularly clear discussion of these issues). The inheritance of cellular properties as a consequence of self-sustaining metabolic loops, one kind of cellular epigenetic inheritance, is an example of inheritance not involving replicators. Partly on the basis of cellular epigenetic inheritance and similar observations about other forms of extra-genetic inheritance, such as behavioral and linguistic transmission, that do not conform with the replicator framework, Jablonka has argued that the replicator/interactor distinction should be rejected (Jablonka 2001, 2004). More generally, she argued that “the replicator/vehicle dichotomy… is meaningless in all cases in which the transmission of information or the generation of new heritable information depends on development” (Jablonka 2001, p. 114). Godfrey-Smith (2009, sec. 2.4) discusses formal arguments showing that replicators are not a necessary condition for evolution by natural selection.

DNA replication is also not sufficient for explaining cellular heredity, since cellular heredity depends on support from epigenetic nuclear and cytoplasmatic inheritance mechanisms that maintain proper gene regulation. This point has been made during the historical debates about cytoplasmatic inheritance (Nanney 1958; Sapp 1987). Moreover, cellular epigenetic inheritance is essential for cell differentiation in multi-cellular organisms, which involves the establishment of lineages of cells that produce tissue specific phenotypes that are not due to differences in DNA sequence. Differentiated cells inherit their tissue-specificity, which they usually do not alter throughout their life-cycle. This means that in addition to its role in cellular heredity, cellular epigenetic inheritance is essential for the multi-generation reconstruction of phenotypes of multi-cellular organisms, regardless of any direct role transgenerational epigenetic inheritance plays in the transmission of characters from parent to offspring above the cellular level, though such effects are also well known (see Jablonka & Raz 2009).

2.3 The reproducer concept

James Griesemer has proposed the reproducer as a fundamental notion for thinking about reproduction in evolution. A reproducer is an entity that multiplies with material overlap between parent and offspring, transferring mechanisms conferring the capacity to develop the capacity to reproduce (Griesemer 2000a, p. S361, 2000b, 2000c, see also the entry on replication, section 8). By definition, being a reproducer is a property applicable to systems that have developmental capacities. In contrast with traditional accounts of natural selection that focus on heredity, Griesemer’s analysis of reproduction processes attempts to integrate heredity and development in a single conceptual scheme. Godfrey-Smith has argued that both requirements emphasized by Griesemer — material overlap between generations, and the capacity to develop — are too strong, and are not required for a formal account of evolution via natural selection per se (Godfrey-Smith 2009, pp. 83–84).

Based on the reproducer concept, Griesemer has proposed an analysis of modes of multiplication in which reproduction, inheritance, and replication are special cases of multiplication processes (Griesemer 2000a, p. S360, 2000c). According to this classification, inheritance processes are reproduction processes in which there are evolved mechanisms for producing hereditary relations in development. Replication processes in turn are inheritance processes with evolved coding mechanisms. Thus, replication (which is contrasted by Griesemer with mere copying) is a special case of inheritance, itself a special case of biological reproduction. Genetic inheritance is a replication process and as such it involves coding mechanisms. Since genes do not constitute mechanisms of development in their own right, but are pieces of mechanisms, Griesemer argues that they cannot have the privileged explanatory role often accorded to them (Griesemer 2000a, p. 364). According to Griesemer’s classification, epigenetic inheritance processes can be classified as inheritance processes which are not replication processes (Griesemer 2000c, p. 250).

Both Griesemer and Godfrey-Smith applied their respective notions of reproducers to the question of collective reproduction, involving entities that can reproduce but that contain other things than can also reproduce (see Godfrey-Smith 2012, Griesemer 2018; for further discussion see entry on the biological notion of individual). The paradigmatic test cases being multi-cellular organisms (arguably, collective reproducers) and animal groups (who are arguably not). Griesemer focuses on the role of scaffolding and levels of compositional organization, while Godfrey-Smith characterizes collective reproduction according to the degree of overall integration of the reproducer, the degree of reproductive (germ/soma) specialization, and the degree of a reproductive bottleneck. The properties characterizing collective reproducers are arguably related to the inheritance systems involved (for one intriguing suggestion concerned with the role of epigenetic inheritance in the origin of the germ-line see Lachmann & Libby 2016).

Griesemer’s classification of reproducers is an abstraction hierarchy. It provides a formal taxonomy of reproducers, arranging them in a series of nested classes. The classification of inheritance systems suggested by Jablonka and Lamb (Jablonka 2001; Jablonka & Lamb 2005/2014) discussed in the next section, in contrast, enumerates types of concrete inheritance systems found in the living world.

2.4 Inheritance systems and notions of information

It is tempting to try and apply the notion of information to the study of inheritance systems in general, and extra-genetic inheritance in particular, since on an abstract level inheritance may be thought of as transmission of information or informational resources from parent to offspring (as opposed to the transmission of material resources). However, it is notoriously difficult to come up with notions of information that are suitable for studying the various aspects of biological phenomena (see the entry on biological information for a survey) and a fair amount of skepticism may be in order.

A common argument in favor of treating genetic inheritance as having a unique developmental role is the claim that genes play an informational role, not shared by other hereditary developmental resources. The holistic view of inheritance articulated by Developmental Systems Theory downplays the significance of the idea that inheritance should be conceived as the transmission of information between generations (Griffiths & Gray 2001; Sterelny 2001, p. 334, see also the discussion in Sterelny et al. 1996, p. 379). In particular, DST uses the so-called parity argument to reject the view that DNA is uniquely informational while other inherited resources merely provide material support for reading or interpreting DNA (Griffiths & Knight 1998). In recent work Griffiths applies an information-theoretic measure of causal specficity to measure how a given factor contributes to the precise determination of the phenotype. This measure is produced by combining the classic notion of mutual information, as found in Shannon information theory, with Woodward’s notion of speficity of causes (Woodward 2010). Griffiths (2017) argues that this framework naturally extends to various epigenetic marks and non-coding regions of DNA that are causally specific, while at the same time distinguishing these cases from many other causes of the same outcomes, such as the presence of RNA polymerase, that lack such specificity.

Jablonka (Jablonka 2001, 2002) introduced her discussion of inheritance systems by characterizing them as systems that carry hereditary information, which in turn she defined as “the transmissible organization of an actual or potential state of a system” (cf. the different notion of information and representation favored by Sterleny et. al. 1996). A common framework for discussing hereditary information can then be used to compare and analyze various inheritance systems and expose their differences as well similarities (see section 3.3).

3. Classification of Inheritance Systems

It is now fairly common in biological discourse to talk about various forms of inheritance in addition to genetic inheritance. The two types of inheritance most often referred to are probably cellular epigenetic inheritance and cultural and behavioral inheritance in humans and various animals. There is however no standardized or de facto system or nomenclature used to classify inheritance systems and their properties. This is partly due to the wide range of hereditary phenomena and the debates described earlier. A principled taxonomy would provide a guide for identifying inheritance systems, delimiting them from one another, comparing their properties and possible functions, and so on.

This section begins by making clear the distinction between inheritance systems and channels of inheritance. Various criteria that have been proposed for identifying inheritance systems are then presented. The section concludes with a detailed discussion of the influential account of inheritance systems presented by Jablonka and Lamb and a discussion of ecological inheritance and niche construction.

3.1 Inheritance Channels

An important distinction between inheritance channels and inheritance systems should be made before classifying inheritance systems. This distinction plays a central role in controversies over classifying and delimiting inheritance systems. Simply put, inheritance channels refer to “routes across generations” (in the words of Sterelny et al. (Sterelny et al. 1996, p. 390)) through which hereditary resources or information pass from parent to offspring. The notion of inheritance system, in contrast, as used by Jablonka and Lamb in particular, is meant to classify inheritance factors, mechanisms, and processes, and the ways in which they store and carry hereditary information (Jablonka 2001; Jablonka & Lamb 2005).

Multiple inheritance channels may be involved in the reconstruction of the phenotype. For example, as noted in the discussion of cellular heredity, inheritance of organelles during cell division is required for the survival of daughter cells in addition to the inheritance of the nuclear genome. The role of multiple channels is particularly apparent in cases where phenotypes depend on symbiotic associations and thus on the transmission of symbionts. Examples of transmission of symbionts include: (1) The transmission of gut bacteria, which are required for digestion and for normal intestinal development, from mother to offspring. (2) Fungus-growing ants depend on the cultivation of fungus for food in underground gardens. When new queens leave their parent colonies, they carry a fragment of the fungus with them to the site of the new colony. (3) Various species of aphids, clams, and sponges allow some bacteria to pass through the oocytes from parent to offspring, leading to vertical transmission parallel to genetic transmission. As a final example of multiple channels of inheritance note that cultural transmission in humans and animals, which is required for the reconstruction of behavioral phenotypes such as bird songs, food preferences, and other cultural traditions (Avital & Jablonka 2000), may also be considered to constitute supplementary inheritance channels.

The same inheritance system may be used in multiple inheritance channels. For example, the genetic inheritance system as defined by Jablonka and Lamb is responsible for the inheritance of the information in the DNA in the eukaryotic nucleus and in the DNA of mitochondria. Horizontal gene transfer more generally is considered by Jablonka and Lamb to belong to the genetic system (Jablonka & Lamb 2005, p. 233), though it typically involves additional vectors or transmission channels. Conversely, a single inheritance channel may involve multiple inheritance systems, in the sense used by Jablonka and Lamb. For example, DNA methylation, an epigenetic mark, copied in cellular epigentic inheritance, is tied to the copying and transmission of DNA. This arguably constitutes a single channel. Epigenetic mechanisms and heredity play a role in various properties of the genetic system, affecting things such as mutation and recombination rates and hence genetic variation. Perhaps more fundamentally, epigenetic mechanisms are part of the mechanisms ‘operating’ the genetic channel. The inheritance of the genome, when cells divide, involves recreation of mother cell’s epigenetic state, a process that goes beyond copying (Lamm 2011, 2014; Lamm & Jablonka 2008).

While many interesting cases involve identifying new inheritance channels which are based on new inheritance systems, and discussions are often ambiguous as to which of the two notions they refer to. The study of inheritance systems is a separate endeavor from the analysis of the inheritance channels affecting individual organisms or traits. The holistic view about inheritance, found in Developmental Systems Theory, rejects both the analysis of inheritance in terms of multiple systems and in terms of multiple channels, arguing that both distinctions are at most convenient idealizations (Griffiths & Gray 2001), and it is not unusual for debates about holism to conflate the discussion of the two issues. DST proponents argue that some developmental resources are not easily represented as channels, especially persistent resources, that holism is more heuristically productive, and that channels are not statistically independent information carriers (Griffiths and Gray 2001). (See also the useful discussion by Griesemer et al. (2005, p. 526)).

In response to the DST rejection of multiple channel accounts of inheritance, Griesemer et al. (2005) note the multiple ways in which channels can be independent from one another. Channels may be individuated as separate channels physically, chemically, or biologically, regardless of whether they are statistically independent information channels. Additionally, causal independence should not be required for individuating inheritance channels. While Jablonka and Lamb use a notion of biological information to characterize inheritance systems, they are not individuated based on statistical independence, but rather mechanistically (or, more more accurately, mechanismically, that is by identifying classes of inheritance mechanisms) and by biological function.

3.2 Identifying and delimiting inheritance systems

As it is hereditary variations that are needed for evolution via natural selection, Jablonka and Lamb set out to study different inheritance systems (where system is understood roughly to mean a set of interacting factors and mechanisms) by identifying different kinds of hereditary variation (Jablonka 2001; Jablonka & Lamb 1995, 2005/2014). Their approach can be described as focused on the mechanismic basis for different types of hereditary phenotypic variation. They have identified multiple inheritance systems, each with several modes of transmission, that have different properties, and that interact and coevolve (Jablonka 2001, p. 100; Jablonka & Lamb 2005/2014). The systems are said to carry information, defined as the transmissible organization of an actual or potential state of a system. A detailed account of their mechanismic classification is presented in section 3.3.

A different approach to characterizing and possibly for identifying and delimiting inheritance systems posits that to count as an inheritance system a system has to have evolved for the purpose of transmitting hereditary information, i.e., to have the “meta-function” of producing heritable phenotypes (Shea 2007). In this respect this approach is reminiscent of the extended replicator approach of Sterelny et al. (1996). Other requirements that have been proposed in the literature are the demand for “unlimited” heredity, i.e., unlimited repertoire of variants the system can store and transmit, needed for sustained or cumulative evolution (see discussion in Godfrey-Smith 2000; Maynard-Smith & Szathmáry 1995, p. 43), and the ability to generate fine-grained response to selection (see Griffiths 2001, p. 460). Both these requirements regard genetic inheritance as having a privileged role in development and evolution in comparison with epigenetic inheritance processes. Jablonka and Lamb address these concerns with evolvability by noting that multiple instances of limited systems of inheritance may exist within one cell (e.g., multiple self-sustaining metabolic cycles), thus extending the repertoire of hereditary variations, and by emphasizing the effects limited hereditary systems can have on the evolution of genetic variations (see the discussion of genetic assimilation below). Jablonka also argues that the requirement for high fidelity of replication (e.g., Sterelny 2001) is not as necessary for inheritance systems that employ filtering mechanisms that ensure that transmitted variations are typically adaptive (Jablonka 2002). For further discussion of the requirement for evolvability see the discussion of Sterelny’s Hoyle conditions in section 4.6.

It should be noted that all the properties discussed above are properties of systems, not properties of particular hereditary relations, of particular transmission events, or of replicator tokens.

3.3 Mechanismic Classification of Inheritance Systems

Jablonka and Lamb characterize four broadly defined inheritance systems: two fairly specific inheritance systems — the genetic inheritance system and the symbolic inheritance system found in human languages — and two classes of inheritance systems — cellular and organismal epigenetic inheritance systems and behavioral inheritance systems. The systems are classified and grouped according to the way they store and transmit variations and by the properties of the hereditary relations they give rise to.

Jablonka and Lamb’s classification of inheritance systems on the basis of their mechanismic differences is not the only classification approach which focuses on hereditary variations. Recently, Helanterä & Uller (2010) analyzed the inheritance systems Jablonka and Lamb identified based on their evolutionary consequences. They claim that Jablonka and Lamb’s mechanismic classification does not match a classification of means of inheritance according to their evolutionary properties, and suggested classifying them into three categories: vertical transmission which covers cases in which traits are transmitted from parent to offspring such as genetic inheritance and some epigenetic phenomena; induction which covers cases in which the environment determines change between parent and offspring such as induced genetic mutations and maternal effects; and acquisition which covers cases in which traits originate from non-parental individuals or other sources, for example horizontal gene transfer and various forms of learning. Similarly, Day and Bonduriansky (2011), using a unified framework based on the Price Equation, have argued that while the diversity of inheritance mechanisms is very large they give rise to a much more limited set of inheritance patterns, characterized as unique combinations of reproductive transmission rules.

The properties of the inheritance systems that Jablonka and Lamb chose to study are those they deemed to be most pertinent for understanding inheritance, and its evolutionary consequences (Jablonka 2001, p. 100). In more recent work Jablonka and Lamb (2005/2014) distinguish between properties of the way information is reproduced, and properties related to whether variation is targeted, responsive to the environment, or otherwise biased (the so-called “Lamarckian dimension”). Among the properties of reproduction of information that they identify are whether reproduction results from ordinary cellular activity and relies on general purpose cellular mechanisms or whether a dedicated copying system (i.e., cellular machinery) exists; whether the inheritance system can transmit latent (unexpressed) information or is information necessarily expressed phenotypically; and whether information is transmitted solely to offspring (referred to as vertical transmission) or to neighbors as well (horizontal transmission).

The properties related to targeting, constructing, and planning of transmitted variation that Jablonka and Lamb identify are:

  1. Is variation targeted, in the sense that the production of variants is biased towards producing some possible variants (i.e., “non-random”)?
  2. Is variation subject to developmental filtering and modification before transmission, as found for example in behavioral inheritance?
  3. Is variation constructed through direct planning by the organisms?
  4. Can variations change the selective environment, for example by changing the environmental niche the organism occupies?

We now describe in more detail each of inheritance systems Jablonka and Lamb identified. Jablonka’s and Lamb’s analysis of inheritance systems is summarized in tables 1 and 2.

Table 1: The reproduction of information
Inheritance system Organizations of information Dedicated copying system? Transmits latent (nonexpressed) information? Directions of transmission Range of variation
Genetic Modular Yes Yes Mostly vertical Unlimited
Self-sustaining loops Holistic No No Mostly vertical Limited at the loop level, unlimited at the cell level
Structural templating Holistic No No Mostly vertical Limited at the structure level, unlimited at the cell level
RNA silencing Holistic Yes Sometimes Vertical and sometimes horizontal Limited at the single transcript level, unlimited at the cell level
Chromatin marks Modular and holistic Yes (for methylation) Sometimes Vertical Unlimited
Organism-level developmental legacies Holistic No No Mostly vertical Limited
Behavior-affecting substances Holistic No No Both vertical and horizontal Limited at the single behavior level, unlimited for lifestyles
Nonimitative social learning Holistic No No Both vertical and horizontal Limited at the single behavior level, unlimited for lifestyles
Imitation Modular Probably No Both vertical and horizontal Unlimited
Symbolic Modular and holistic Yes, several Yes Both vertical and horizontal Unlimited
Table 2: Targeting, constructing, and planning transmitted variation
Inheritance system Variation is targeted (biased generation)? Variation subject to developmental filtering and modification? Variation constructed through direct planning? Variation can change the selective environment?
Genetic Generally not, except for the directed changes that are part of development and the various types of interpretive mutation Usually not, although expressed genetic changes may have to survive selection between cells prior to sexual or asexual reproduction No Only insofar as genes can affect all aspects of epigenetics, behavior, and culture
Epigenetic Yes, a lot of epigenetic variations are produced as specific responses to inducing signals Yes, selection can occur between cells prior to reproduction; epigenetic states can be modified or reversed during meiosis and early embryogenesis No Yes, because the products of cellular activities can affect the environment in which a cell, its neighbors, and its descendants live
Behavioral Yes, because of emotional, cognitive, and perceptual biases Yes, behavior is selected and modified during the animal’s lifetime No Yes, new social behavior and traditions alter the social and sometimes also the physical conditions in which an animal lives
Symbolic Yes, because emotional, cognitive, and perceptual biases Yes, at many levels, in many ways Yes, at many levels, in many ways Yes, very extensively, by affecting many aspects of the social and physical conditions of life

(The tables above are reproduced with permission from Eva Jablonka and Marion J.Lamb, Evolution In Four Dimensions: Genetic, Epigenetic, Behavioral, and Symbolic Variation In The History Of Life, MIT Press 2005.)

3.3.1 The Genetic Inheritance System (GIS)

The genetic inheritance system (GIS) uses the nucleotide sequence in nucleic acids, typically DNA, to store and transmit information (i.e., hereditary variation), and includes the machinery responsible for DNA replication, error correction etc. The GIS uses encoded information, as nucleotide sequences code for amino acids that form proteins using the genetic code which specifies which amino acid corresponds to each triplet of nucleotides (called a codon). The DNA sequence also specifies functional RNA molecules. DNA nucleotides can be modified independently of each other, a property referred to as modular organization; it has been argued that coded information requires modular replication (Szathmáry 2000). Generally speaking, the genetic system provides unlimited heredity, since the nucleotide sequence is not limited in size, and each position in it can contain any nucleotide. These, particularly the claim that the sequence length is unconstrained, are of course idealized assumptions. Unlimited heredity and modularity are most often attributed to the genetic system as a whole, not only to protein coding regions, and it is often argued that they are unique to it. Like the GIS, the symbolic inheritance system (discussed below), which is restricted to human beings, exhibits unlimited and modular heredity.

Various kinds of regulatory regions in DNA are spread throughout most genomes. They comprise “non-coding” sequences, in the sense that they do not code for proteins and do not depend on the genetic code. Regulatory regions affect gene expression and chromatin dynamics. It is still debated in the scientific community whether there are general properties of sequence organization that determine these functions, which would suggest a high-order code. It should be noted that various non-coding sequences interact in specific ways with epigenetic mechanisms (such as DNA methylation and histone modifications) in order to produce their regulatory effects. The genome which is the seat of genetic information is also a focal point for the operation of critical epigenetic mechanisms, and it may turn out not to be possible to fully understand the properties of the genetic inheritance system and its evolution in isolation from epigenetic inheritance (Jablonka & Lamb 2008; Lamm 2011, 2014).

Some mechanisms that generate variation in DNA are invoked in particular conditions (e.g., stress conditions), and produce variation that is non-random in location and/or pattern (e.g., Levy & Feldman 2004; reviewed in Jablonka & Lamb 2005, chap. 3). However, it is widely perceived that most genetic variations are the result of non-directed processes that are not responsive to specific inducing conditions.

3.3.2 Epigenetic Inheritance Systems (EISs)

Epigenetic inheritance occurs when environmentally-induced and developmentally-regulated variations, or variations that are the result of developmental noise, are transmitted to subsequent generations of cells or organisms (Jablonka & Lamb 2005). The term epigenetic inheritance is used in a broad sense and in a narrow sense. The narrow sense refers to the systems that underlie cellular heredity. Four EISs in the narrow sense are discussed by Jablonka and Lamb (2005/2014): (1) Self-sustaining steady-states of metabolic cycles. Transmission of the components of the cycle, such as proteins and metabolites, can lead to reconstruction of the cycle in the daughter cell. Self-sustaining loops can also maintain the transcription levels of genes. For example, a transcriptional self-sustaining loop is most likely responsible for white-opaque switching in Candida albicans, a change in phenotypic state that involves a change in cell appearance, mating behavior, and preferred host tissues that is heritable for many generations. (2) Structural inheritance of cell structures, such as cellular membranes and the cilia on the cell surface of ciliates. (3) Chromatin marking of various kinds that consists of molecular marks on chromosomes (specifically, DNA methylation and histone modifications, which involve chemical groups attached to DNA and to proteins around which the DNA molecules are wrapped in eukaryotic cells). Some of these marks are copied by dedicated copying machinery, others seem to be reconstructed as a result of regular genome dynamics from partial markings transmitted to daughter cells (e.g., Henikoff, Furuyama, & Ahmad 2004; reviewed in Lamm 2014). (4) Inheritance of small RNA molecules that affect gene expression. The most well-known case involves RNA silencing (RNAi), a post-transcriptional silencing mechanism, though more and more classes of regulatory RNA molecules and related pathways are being identified and characterized.

Epigenetics in the broad sense refers to two kinds of inheritance. (1) Cellular epigenetic inheritance through mitotic cells and transgenerational epigenetic inheritance through meiotic cells. Transgenerational heredity of DNA methylation has been observed in unicellular organisms, plants, and mammals, suggesting that transgenerational epigenetic inheritance may be more prevalent than often suspected (Jablonka & Raz 2009). (2) Hereditary effects that by-pass the germline, for example through early developmental inputs that lead to regeneration of previous developmental conditions (e.g., hormonal and neural conditions) and other forms of phenotypic transmission, such as the transmission of symbionts and parasites, e.g., gut bacteria (Jablonka & Raz 2009).

In transgenerational epigenetic transmission, alternative phenotypes can persist for several, possibly many, generations, though their persistence may be more limited than that of genetic changes. They may thus have evolutionary effects in addition to the role played by cellular epigenetic inheritance in the development of multi-cellular organisms that was noted above. Generally, epigenetic inheritance piggybacks on general developmental and physiological mechanisms of cells, and is a by product of other physiological functions, not the result of an independent copying system that is content neutral, though this is not their defining property; DNA methylation is a notable exception. Epigenetic inheritance typically is holistic rather than modular in its storage and transmission (i.e., it is not comprised of units of information that can be changed independently of one another), and supports a limited repertoire of hereditary variants (e.g., the steady-states of a metabolic cycle). However, one cell may include many instances of independent self-sustaining metabolic cycles and structurally transmitted cellular components, for example, increasing the repertoire of cellular variations that can be inherited via these forms of inheritance. Typically, EISs (with some exceptions, such as DNA methylation) cannot transmit unexpressed (latent) information, although the transmission of partial factors or marks, which are not sufficient for expression, may be reliably sufficient when additional developmental factors are added.

3.3.3 Behavioral Inheritance Systems (BISs)

Jablonka and Lamb (Jablonka 2001; Jablonka & Lamb 2005) focus on three types of behavioral inheritance: (1) Inheritance of behavior-affecting substances. The inducing substances bias the behavior of offspring leading to limited behavioral heredity. A paradigmatic case is the “transmission” of food preferences from mother to offspring via molecular cues passed through the placenta. (2) Non-imitative social learning that leads to similarity in behavior. Here, naive organisms learn through interaction with environmental circumstances that elicit particular behavior and by observing the behavior of experienced adults, though not by copying or imitating their behavior. A famous case of non-imitative social learning involved the spread of milk-bottle opening behavior in blue tits and great tits. It appears that the behavior spread through the contact of birds with open milk-bottles or with experienced birds using bottles as food sources, not by imitating the method of opening the bottles. (3) Imitation and instruction. In contrast with the other behavioral inheritance systems, imitation is modular (behavioral patterns are imitated independently of other patterns in the same behavioral sequence) and may depend on a dedicated copying system or systems.

While the GIS and EISs transmit information mostly from parent to offspring (i.e., vertically), all behavioral inheritance systems are directly or indirectly influenced by the social environment, and are thus capable of transmitting information to neighbors as well, that is horizontally. A second property shared by behavioral forms of inheritance is that for a behavior to be transmitted it has to be expressed.

3.3.4 The Symbolic Inheritance System (SIS)

The symbolic inheritance system refers to all symbolic communication, but mainly to linguistic communication, and is unique to humans. The symbolic inheritance system shares some properties with the genetic inheritance system, notably modularity, unlimited variability, the use of coded information, and the capacity to transmit latent information. Its origins are in behavioral inheritance and it shares some of the properties of behavioral inheritance, in particular the capacity for horizontal transmission and developmental filtering of variation prior to transmission.

Jablonka and Lamb’s account of cultural evolution in humans appeals to the properties of symbolic inheritance, most critically that variations are not blindly copied but rather reconstructed by learners in ways that are sensitive to meaning, social context, and the history of the individuals involved (Jablonka & Lamb 2005/2014). They contrast their view with the meme based account of cultural evolution presented by Dawkins and Blackmore (e.g., Blackmore 1999), which takes cultural items to be stored in human brains and transmitted to other human agents in the form of faithful replication, and cultural change to involve the differential success of replication of the different cultural items. Jablonka and Lamb argue that focusing on replication and selection rather than on the generation of variants and on reconstruction processes is particularly harmful for understanding cultural evolution.

3.4 Niche Construction Theory and Ecological Inheritance

Niche construction theory (Odling-Smee, Laland, & Feldman 2003) espouses the notion of ecological inheritance through which previous generations as well as current neighbors can affect organisms by altering the external environment or niche that they experience. This purportedly creates an inheritance channel that operates in parallel with genetic inheritance. Ecological inheritance is defined as the inheritance of selection pressures that were modified by niche construction activities (Odling-Smee 2010, p. 176). Niche construction leads to ecological inheritance if changes to the ecological niche persist or accumulate and establish modified selection pressures. Note that while the notion of ecological inheritance suggests viewing niche construction as a transmission process, the focus on the modifications done to the niche highlights persistence. Extending the notion of ecological inheritance to the realm of development, Odling-Smee (2010, p. 181) defines niche inheritance as the inheritance of an initial organism-environment relationship, or “niche,” from ancestors. Niche inheritance can thus affect organisms’ development directly, rather than through selection. For a recent discussion of the differences between selective niche construction and developmental niche construction see Stotz (2017).

Odling-Smee et al. (2003) note that ecological inheritance “more closely resembles the inheritance of territory or property than it does the inheritance of genes.” In particular, it includes transmission of material resources that are difficult to construe as informational. Odling-Smee (2010, p. 181) enumerates fundamental differences between ecological inheritance and genetic inheritance: (1) Ecological inheritance is transmitted through an external environment. It is not transmitted by reproduction. (2) Ecological inheritance need not depend on the transmission of discrete replicators (though this mechanism is not ruled out). (3) Ecological inheritance is continuously transmitted by multiple organisms, to multiple other organisms, within and between generations, throughout the lifetime of organisms. (4) Ecological inheritance is not always transmitted by genetic relatives. It should be noted that some of these properties of ecological inheritance are shared by extra-genetic inheritance more generally.

Odling-Smee (2010) distinguishes two transmission channels: transmission through direct connection during reproduction between the internal environments of parent and offspring and transmission through an external environment. In channel 1, the internal environment, Odling-Smee includes Jablonka’s and Lamb’s genetic and epigenetic inheritance systems, and some kinds of maternal effects. In channel 2, transmission through an external environment, he includes the inheritance of modified selection pressures in the external environments of organisms as a consequence of prior communicative niche construction, and includes Jablonka’s and Lamb’s behavioral and symbolic inheritance systems. All the inheritance systems just mentioned transmit semantic information, according to Odling-Smee. In addition, both transmission channels are used to transmit energy and matter. Cytoplasmatic inheritance of various kinds, and some kinds of maternal effects, are considered by Odling-Smee to be energy and material resources transmitted through the internal environment, and traditional ecological inheritance of selection pressures is non-semantic inheritance that is passed through an external environment.

4. Developmental and Evolutionary Implications

One of the best arguments for studying heredity through the perspective afforded by multiple inheritance systems is that this perspective opens up questions about the evolutionary and developmental relations and interactions between the various inheritance systems that are characterized. Among these questions are questions about whether each system creates new targets of selection, about the ways in which inheritance systems may provide developmental scaffolding for other inheritance systems, about the regulatory role they may have in relation to one another, and about the evolution of inheritance systems. We now turn to these issues.

Non-genetic inheritance can have an effect on the ecological conditions an organism faces by affecting or determining behavior and activities, thus increasing or dampening selection. The result is a feedback loop between actions of the organism and selection that leads to what Conrad Waddington referred to as the cybernetic nature of evolution (Waddington 1961). Behavioral and symbolic inheritance, in particular, can reinforce this process. By thus affecting the selective challenges faced by the organism, the evolutionary feedback loop can turn short-term hereditary effects, that would not survive many generations, into long term evolutionary change. Section 4.4 further discusses the ramifications of this phenomenon.

Jablonka and Lamb (2005/2014) present a general account of biological evolution based on the multiple inheritance systems perspective. They argue that evolution can occur through any of the inheritance systems they identify (e.g., the behavioral) without necessarily involving genetic changes. This can happen through natural selection operating on non-genetic hereditary variations. Epigenetic changes are usually generated at a higher rate than genetic changes, often as a result of changes in environmental conditions, and the variation that is generated may have a higher chance of being beneficial than blind variation. This may allow rapid adaptation to changing conditions. These claims apply to behavioral inheritance and symbolic inheritance as well. Shea, Pen, & Uller (2011) distinguish between adaptation resulting from selection on epigenetic variations, which they term selection-based effects, and the adaptation resulting from induced response to the environment, which they term detection-based effects, and discuss their evolutionary and developmental consequences. Selection-based effects lead to adaptation via natural selection operating on reliably transmitted epigenetic variations and are analogous to the selection-based effects of genetic inheritance, though epigenetic variation may occur more rapidly and its frequency may increase due to environmental challenges. Detection-based effects, in contrast, are the result of directional variation and are a form of phenotypic plasticity.

While Jablonka’s and Lamb’s approach is similar to that of Maynard-Smith & Szathmáry (Maynard-Smith & Szathmáry 1995), in that Maynard Smith and Szathmáry focus on changes in the way hereditary information is stored and transmitted, Jablonka and Lamb argue that Maynard Smith and Szathmáry neglect the evolutionary role played by distinct information-transmitting systems. In particular, they argue that Maynard Smith and Szathmáry’s approach neglects the role of instructive processes, of the sort typically found in EISs, BISs, and the SIS, which lead to induced hereditary changes that are acted upon by natural selection (Jablonka & Lamb 2005, p. 343). Maynard Smith and Szathmáry, in contrast, argue that even with the existence of epigenetic inheritance processes, natural selection working on mutations that are typically not adaptive (i.e., non-directed) remains the fundamental evolutionary process (Maynard-Smith & Szathmáry 1995, p. 249).

4.1 Units of Selection

Once it is accepted that more than one inheritance system or, alternatively, more than one independently inherited replicator may be involved in the reproduction of organisms (let alone multiple kinds of replicators), questions about units of selection have to be addressed. As each inheritance system can lead to hereditary variations, there may be multiple lineages related to the production of a single organism and even single phenotypic traits. Evolution may happen in each lineage, and, in particular, each lineage may be “tracked” by natural selection.

According to the traditional view in evolutionary theory selection operates on individual organisms. This view can incorporate multiple inheritance systems and channels within a single evolutionary process by viewing each inheritance system or channel as providing developmental resources for the construction of individual organisms, leading to a single evolutionary process operating on lineages of organisms (qua interactors). Alternatively, lineages of phenotypic traits that may be affected by more than one inheritance system or channel may be subject to selection. According to this view phenotypic traits are the targets or units of selection (Jablonka 2004).

According to views that explain evolution in terms of replicators, multiple kinds of replicators can support multiple and distinct evolutionary processes. The most prominent example of this line of thought concerns the view that genes are supplemented by memes that are units of cultural transmission, and each is manifested in a separate evolutionary process: biological evolution operating on lineages of genes and cultural evolution operating on lineages of memes. The extended replicator framework, in contrast, accepts the possibility of multiple kinds of replicators, but considers a single evolutionary process that determines the fate of lineages of different kinds of replicators by the success of their associated interactors and extended phenotypic effects (Sterelny et al. 1996, p. 378).

4.2 Scaffolding

William Wimsatt and James Griesemer (2007) discuss multi-channel inheritance using the notion of scaffolding from developmental psychology. Scaffolding refers to structures and functional processes that provide a supporting framework for development (see Caporael et al. 2013). Traits inherited through one inheritance system can provide scaffolding for other inheritance systems. Wimsatt and Griesemer suggest that if the flow of information must be scaffolded in such a way that carriers develop in appropriate conditions in order to assimilate, use, and carry the information, then the scaffolding must propagate or persist alongside the information in the channel — leading to multi-channel inheritance (Wimsatt & Griesemer 2007, p. 286). They suggest that this applies to any information that is sufficiently complex. As a consequence it applies essentially to all biological and cultural phenomena.

A related notion is suggested by Peter Godfrey-Smith, who defines scaffolded reproducers as “entities which get reproduced as part of the reproduction of some larger unit (a simple reproducer), or that are reproduced by some other entity” (Godfrey-Smith 2009, p. 88). This notion is more restricted than Wimsatt’s and Griesemer’s appeal to scaffolding, as it only refers to scaffolding of reproduction. Godfrey-Smith classifies genes as scaffolded reproducers since they rely on cellular machinery for their reproduction (p. 130).

4.3 The ontogeny of inheritance systems

Inheritance systems themselves develop so as to be able to store, transmit, and receive hereditary information. Put differently, the inheritance of the capacity for inheritance may itself involve developmental reconstruction processes. These developmental processes may depend on two types of resources: resources and cues from other inheritance channels (e.g., the genetic system specifies elements of the brain, which are required for behavioral inheritance), and cues that are transmitted through the same channel and affect its further development (e.g., linguistic cues affecting linguistic abilities). Recent research on chromatin dynamics makes it clear that genetic inheritance relies on multiple epigenetic mechanisms, and suggests that we should be cautious with the distinction between a genetic inheritance system and cellular epigenetic inheritance systems (Lamm 2011, 2014).

An interesting example from recent research is the suggestion that sensorimotor experience plays a role in the development of the capacity for imitation in the human brain (Catmur, Walsh, & Heyes 2009). It is argued that if this model is correct, then “human imitation is not only a channel, but also a product of cultural inheritance” (Catmur et al. 2009, p. 2376), since imitation not only takes part in cultural inheritance, it is shaped by it as well. Thus, cultural inheritance may provide scaffolding for the development of imitation abilities in humans, which further affect behavioral and cultural inheritance.

4.4 Assimilation

One of the most interesting ways in which multiple inheritance systems can interact evolutionarily is through processes such as the Baldwin Effect and genetic assimilation. These notions purport to explain how selection can drive developmental responses to environmental demands to become less dependent on the presence of the external stimuli, and become increasingly hereditary (see Ancel 1999, 2000; Crispo 2007; Scheiner 2014, Weber & Depew 2003). In these processes, non-genetic variants affect the selection of genetic variations in favor of those that produce congruent phenotypic results (Jablonka & Lamb 2005/2014, chap. 7). In the simplest case, originally discussed by Baldwin, a developmental response to the environment allows organisms to survive and reproduce for enough generations for genetic mutations to accumulate through natural selection and make the developmental accommodation to the external stimulus unnecessary. The genetic mutations that are favored are those that act in tandem with the developmental response. Conrad Waddington characterized a process he termed genetic assimilation leading to similar results, but emphasized the role played by changes in combinations of genes and reorganization of genetic networks following the reshuffling of genes during the sexual process. The developmentally produced variants that lead the assimilation process need not be hereditary, and may be the result of recurrent plastic developmental responses in each generation. When they are hereditary, however, their inheritance can reinforce their spread in the population.

A similar phenomenon can result from processes of niche construction, which affect the selective environment faced by organisms and their descendants (Odling-Smee et al. 2003). A particularly well known example of the possible effects of cultural niche construction on genetic evolution is the relationship between a history of dairy farming in a culture and the prevalence of adults with a genetic variant enabling them to continuously produce lactase, the enzyme needed to digest fresh milk (Durham 1991; Mace 2009). This example illustrates how cultural evolution can drive genetic evolution, a element of gene-culture coevolution.

Phenomena such as these may be characterized as being “Lamarckian” in flavor, even though they operate according to traditional Darwinian theory, since they provide room for instructive or induced processes in evolution. The epigenetic, behavioral, and symbolic dimensions in evolution discussed by Jablonka and Lamb produce induced variation which may affect evolution through processes of assimilation as well as through their hereditary affects. In this way various inheritance systems other than the genetic can indirectly affect the evolution of genetic traits.

Assimilation may typically result in the response being partially rather than entirely independent of external stimuli. In other words, the response may become less dependent on external stimuli, and more biased in favor of particular results, without becoming automatic. Jablonka and Lamb call this phenomenon partial assimilation (Jablonka & Lamb 2005, p. 290), and see it as particularly important for understanding the way behavior (BISs) and language (the SIS) affect the evolution of mind. A further mechanism, identified by Avital and Jablonka, is assimilate and stretch. Here, given a limited and fixed capacity for learning, new learned elements may be recruited, when part of a behavioral sequence that formerly depended on learning becomes genetically assimilated (Avital & Jablonka 2000).

Alexander Badyaev suggests an evolutionary continuum of inheritance systems that reflect the extent or stage of assimilation from epigenetic (in the broad sense of Jablonka and Lamb) to genetic inheritance. Parental effects may be a transient stage along this continuum, whose assimilation depends on the dynamics of the environment, and other constraints (Badyaev 2009; Badyaev & Uller 2009; Helanterä & Uller 2010; see also: Yona et al. 2015).

The overall picture that emerges from the consideration of assimilation is of evolution driven by developmental capacities and biases that affect which genetic mutations are selected. Mary-Jane West-Eberhard summarized this observation with the claim that genes are typically followers in evolution rather than the ones leading the way (Jablonka 2006; West-Eberhard 2003).

4.5 Regulation and control

Already in 1958 David Nanney suggested that the difference between genetic and what we would now call cellular epigenetic inheritance lies not in their physical location (i.e., whether they lie in the nucleus or the cytoplasm), but rather that the genetic system maintains a set of “library specifications” while the epigenetic control system (to use his terminology) determines which specificities are expressed in each particular cell, accounting for cell differentiation (Nanney 1958). Thus, according to Nanney, the epigenetic inheritance system plays a regulatory role in relation to the genetic system.

Considering epigenetic control systems as providing a regulatory function allowed Nanney to suggest that they may be expected to be (1) less stable, (2) more susceptible to extrinsic control than genetic systems, and (3) exhibit a limited number of “states”, since they are constrained by the information available in the genetic system at each particular time (Nanney 1958). These properties are indeed exhibited by the cellular epigenetic systems that have since been identified, which play a role in cellular (e.g., genomic) regulation. DNA methylation and histone modifications can lead to gene silencing, for example. The transgenerational hereditary properties of epigenetic markings may be subsequent to their regulatory function; however, in multicellular organisms, transgenerational heredity of epigenetic marks is constrained by their developmental role, since parental epigenetic markings may have to be reset in gametes so that they can fulfill their developmental function anew in offspring (Shea et al. 2011; see also Lachmann & Libby 2016).

4.6 Evolution of Inheritance Systems

Various suggestions have been made about the evolutionary history underlying the multiple systems of inheritance that have been identified and about their role in the evolution of life. In general, epigenetic inheritance allows rapid response to inducing stimuli and may be more advantageous than mutation/selection cycles in specific types of fluctuating environments. This may be particularly important in small populations and diploid organisms, in which mutations are typically recessive (Nanney 1960). Maynard Smith and Szathmáry argued that evolution typically moves from limited to unlimited systems of inheritance or, to use their conceptual framework, from limited to unlimited hereditary replicators, and from holistic to modular replication (Maynard-Smith & Szathmáry 1995; Szathmáry 2000, 2015). This evolutionary trend is manifested in the major transitions in evolution to new levels of individuality (and new kinds of inheritance) that they have characterized. However, the co-existence of multiple systems of inheritance and its evolutionary significance is downplayed by such an account. Jablonka and Lamb (Jablonka 1994; Jablonka & Lamb 2006), in contrast, emphasize the role played by inheritance systems other than the genetic, in particular by epigenetic inheritance, in evolutionary transitions. They place particular importance on the role of epigenetic inheritance in the evolution of multi-cellularity (see also Maynard-Smith 1990; Nanney 1958, 1960; Shea et al. 2011) and in the evolution of the chromosome (Jablonka & Lamb 2006). Nanney (1960) suggested that epigenetic inheritance played a role in cell specialization in unicellular populations (colonies), which conferred economic benefits to individual cells and enabled populations to survive environmental traumas due to their heterogeneity, prior to the emergence of true multi-cellularity. In addition, Jablonka (Jablonka 2001, p. 113) argues that with the evolution of repair and compensatory mechanisms inheritance systems become more limited. Two ways around the evolutionary stasis that would result are the move to higher levels of individuality (Jablonka 1994), and the transition to coded information. Ruth Sager (1966) suggested it may be adaptive to use inheritance systems minimizing variability to control traits that are crucial for survival.

Kim Sterelny (2001) presented a set of requirements that an inheritance system (“replication system,” in his words) should meet if it is to support evolvability. Three fundamental properties are necessary: (1) blocking outlaws; (2) stable transmission of phenotypes; (3) generation of variation. Using these high-level desiderata, Sterelny articulates a series of nine conditions, called the Hoyle-conditions after Sterelny’s thought experiment: a vertical, i.e., “only to offspring and from parents” (C1), simultaneous (C2), and unbiased transmission (C3) of components (or replicators) that are irreversibly committed to their biological role as replicators (C4). Further, to ensure stability, replication has to be high-fidelity (C5), and the mapping between replicators and system organization (i.e, “the genotype-phenotype map”) has to be robust (C6). The requirement to support the generation of variation is cashed out in terms of being able to support a large, if not unlimited, set of variants or, in Sterelny’s framework, replicators (C7), having a “smooth” (quasi-continuous) mapping between replicators and system organization, i.e., small changes should result in small effects on organization (C8). Finally, the generation of biological organization from replicators should be modular (C9), in the sense that each replicator or small group of replicators should be responsible for only one or a few traits. Whether an inheritance system fulfills the Hoyle conditions is a matter of degree. Clearly, the genetic system comes closest to meeting the full set of Hoyle conditions. Responding to Sterelny’s arguments, Griesemer et al. argue that we should direct our attention to the evolution of inheritance systems (Griesemer et al. 2005). They note that the Hoyle conditions are a product of evolution, not a necessary precondition for inheritance that can support evolvability. In addition, they point out that the Hoyle conditions may be met in a distributed manner, that is by multiple inheritance systems each of which fails to meet the criteria on its own but that together give rise to the required properties. Griesemer et al. also argue that the Hoyle conditions may conflict: satisfying one may limit the ability to satisfy others.

A significant aspect of the evolution of inheritance systems that is neglected by most contemporary accounts is the relationship between properties of populations and fine-grained properties of inheritance systems, in particular the relationship between the properties of inheritance systems and the mating strategies of species. The phenotypic variations produced by an inheritance system depend on population level considerations such as these which determine, in the genetic case, the frequency of heterozygotes (and hence the significance of dominance and recessivity) and the probability that calibrated gene networks will not be disrupted by sexual reproduction (e.g., because genes are adjacent on the chromosome or because the alleles are fixed in the relevant population). Population-level considerations also apply to the analysis of epigenetic variation and inheritance. For example, population size may affect the evolutionary consequences of induced epigenetic variation (Rapp & Wendel 2005). Population level considerations are not typically addressed by contemporary accounts of inheritance systems, yet clearly have evolutionary implications.

This issue was central to Cyril Darlington’s analysis in his 1939 book The Evolution of Genetic Systems (Darlington 1939). Darlington noted that the organization of the karyotype, or the “genetic system” to use his terminology, and its dynamics throughout the mating group, affect the hereditary combinations that are produced, and hence hereditary variation, and can lead to reproductive isolation and speciation. The following quote gives the general flavor of Darlington’s line of thought,

There must be a relationship between the hereditary materials, and their behaviour, throughout the whole group or species; and it is on this relationship the genetic system depends for its character. Hybridity optimum, segregation, and recombination must all be related throughout the group. Furthermore, they must be related not merely amongst themselves, but also to the mating habits of the individuals which compose the group, and to the barriers which make that group by separating or isolating it from others. (Darlington and Mather 1949, 237; their italics).

Darlington argued that the genetic system of a species is connected to its preference for inbreeding or outbreeding, since together they affect the frequency of heterozygosity (Darlington 1939; Darlington & Mather 1949). He noted that Mendelian inheritance establishes a cycle between free and potential (latent) genetic variability (Darlington & Mather 1949, p. 276): Potential variability is contained by heterozygotes, while free variability is exhibited by the phenotypes of their offspring as a result of segregation.

5. Conclusions

The study of inheritance systems attempts to synthesize recent discoveries about inheritance mechanisms and processes in nature with reflection about the nature and dynamics of evolutionary processes. The term “inheritance system” is typically used to refer to both mechanisms and factors involved in inheritance, but the term lacks a standard definition which goes beyond enumerating various purported inheritance systems, and it is unclear if a single definition can capture the different uses of the term. A principled definition that determines how inheritance systems are individuated and delimited -- if indeed they can be -- may be essential for addressing many conceptual issues that remain open (see Griesemer et al. 2005). The lack of a universally accepted definition may explain the fruitfulness of the term but also suggests approaching the literature with caution.

The discussion above tried as much as possible to present a unified framework for the discussion of inheritance systems that is not tied to any particular account. It contrasted the multiple inheritance systems view with monist (i.e., geno-centrism) and holistic views (i.e., DST) about inheritance (section 1.3) and stressed the developmental, mechanism-oriented, perspective on reproduction that underlies many discussions of inheritance systems (see section 2).

The multiple inheritance system perspective highlights a variety of questions (see section 4) and many fundamental questions remain open. Some of them depend on empirical work, perhaps most importantly determining the prevalence and stability of transgenerational epigenetic inheritance (Helanterä & Uller 2010; Jablonka & Raz 2009; Shea et al. 2011). The developmental aspects of many of the inheritance systems discussed in this entry, in particular behavioral inheritance, are still not fully understood. Generally, many open questions remain about the interactions between the various systems and about their evolution, in particular the evolution of social learning and the evolution of language. A crucial element downplayed by most contemporary accounts is the connection between population level issues, such as population size, mating strategies, etc., and the properties of inheritance systems. Addressing these issues requires quantitative modeling, and eventually the integration of multiple inheritance systems with their different characteristics into population genetics (see Day & Bonduriansky 2011, Geoghegan & Spencer 2012).

Several topics that are receiving significant attention in the biology research community are directly related to the discussion of inheritance systems. One is the invigorated field of cultural evolution and social learning (see Whiten 2017). A second area is the discussion of inheritance of regulatory RNA molecules, an epigenetic inheritance process that goes beyond the transmission of RNA and involves developmental re-production (see Veigl 2017). A third area, already receiving significant attention from philosophers, is the hereditary properties and function of the microbiome. This is tied to the recent interest in holobionts, a term that refers to assemblages of multiple species, notably multi-cellular organisms and bacteria, that form ecological and potentially evolutionary units. It has been argued by some researchers that holobionts are units of selection and that the combined genome of the host and symbionts, dubbed ‘the hologenome’, is conceptually analogous to the genome, with the bacteria being analogous to genes. Arguably, this inheritance system has Lamarckian dimensions. Other researchers argue that the degree of vertical transmission of symbionts is typically too low to qualify the holobionts as units of selection. For discussion of these issues see Hurst (2017), Opstal & Bordenstein (2015), and section IV of Gissis, Lamm & Shavit (2018). Finally, increasing knowledge of the genetic system itself, in particular the role of chromatin shape and dynamics in gene expression as well as in mutation, recombination, and other fundamental processes, may lead to new perspectives on the relation between the genetic system and epigenetic mechanisms, and improve our understanding of the transmission of chromatin state. Arguably, the DNA and non-DNA components of the genome should be seen and studied as a dynamic and responsive developmental system (Lamm 2011, 2014). Moreover, better understanding of how genetic adaptation is reached under experimental conditions suggests how physiological and epigenetic responses may facilitate adaptation via other means, making a fitness improving response increasingly more robust, up to potentially becoming established via appropriate mutations (Yona et al. 2015). These results may lead to rethinking the dichotomy between plasticity and evolvability (Lamm & Jablonka 2008) and support the idea of “natural genetic engineering” systems (see Shapiro 2011).

Non-genetic inheritance can have short term evolutionary effects and can affect genetic evolution (e.g., through genetic assimilation). However, the long-term and macro-evolutionary significance of non-genetic inheritance, and in particular its effects on the way populations respond to selection is still being debated (e.g., Helanterä & Uller 2010, p. 4). Jablonka’s and Lamb’s evolutionary views stress the role of “soft inheritance,” or the inheritance of acquired characters, which is exhibited by many of the non-genetic inheritance systems. Partly on account of this they are among those who raise the need to revise and extend the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis (Pigliucci & Müller 2010). The Modern Synthesis marginalized soft inheritance and viewed significant evolutionary change to be solely the result of gradual selection working on random variations. The assumptions underlying this view are challenged by work on non-genetic inheritance.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Tetrahymena Biogeography, David L. Nanney’s archive of historical and autobiographical texts about epigenetic inheritance in Tetrahymena.
  • Epigenomics, Links to resources on epigenetics and epigenomics, from U.S. Department of Health and Human Services, National Library of Medicine.
  • Cultural Evolution Society, lists resources and people in the multi-disciplinary field of cultural evolution.
  • Extended Evolutionary Synthesis: a website of a multinational, interdisciplinary consortium, putting the predictions of the Extended Evolutionary Synthesis (EES) to the test. Includes many useful summaries and resources.


The author thanks Adam Krashniak for help with the 2018 revision.

Copyright © 2018 by
Ehud Lamm <>

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