Replication and Reproduction

First published Wed Dec 5, 2001; substantive revision Tue Sep 25, 2018

The problem of replication and reproduction arises out of the history of genetics [see the entry gene for a historical review]. It is tied to the concept of the gene and its generalization in an evolutionary context [see the entry evolution]. Richard Dawkins introduced the notion of replicators—things that self-replicate—as a universalization of evolutionary understandings of genes. Dawkins argued that replicators are the sine qua non of evolution by natural selection [see the entry natural selection], while other accounts only require reproduction as one of its defining features. What exactly is a replicator? How are replicators different from genes? Can evolution by natural selection occur without the existence of replicators? Besides the biological domain, are there any other domains in which replicators have been postulated? To answer these questions, we will first provide some background for Dawkins’ notion of replicator and its ties with the concepts of the gene and information. We will then introduce the distinction between Replicators and Vehicles in the context of biological evolution and followed by the extension of this to other domains. Finally, we will discuss some of the challenges to the idea that replicators are necessary conditions for evolution by natural selection.

1. Background

The notion of replication arose as a concern in the period immediately after the second world war (see Figure 1), with the rise of information theory, communication theory, cybernetics, and Erwin Schrödinger’s 1944 book What is Life?. Biologists immediately began to consider the informational aspect of life, in each of these theoretical frameworks, in areas ranging from neurology to molecular biology, but especially the latter (Brookes 1956; Eigen & de Maeyer 1966; Gatlin 1972; Johnson 1970; Linschitz 1953; Margalef 1957 [1958]; Quastler 1953; Rashevsky 1955). It was only after the development of communications theory by Shannon (1948) and cybernetics by Wiener (1948) after it, that inheritance in biology took on a specifically informational tint (Griffiths & Stotz 2007). This is the case in particular of the work of Watson and Crick on the double helix structure of DNA (Watson & Crick 1953), as well as Crick’s Central Dogma, which states that information cannot flow from protein to DNA. The Central Dogma (Crick 1958) was initially cast in terms of structural information (Šustar 2007), Figure 2, and later recast by Crick as a more cybernetic or computational kind of information (Crick 1970). [See Eugene V. Koonin 2012 & 2015 for discussion of the nature of the Central Dogma in current biology.]

a graph with a y axis ranging from 0% to 0.000160% and an x axis from 1800 to 2000; line stays below 0.000020% until 1960 at which point it rapidly rises to hit 0.000130% at 2000

Figure 1. Yearly frequency of count for the word ‘replication’ in Google text’s English corpus from 1800–2000 with smoothing = 3. Data obtained from Google Ngram Viewer (see Other Internet Resources).

Structural information is effectively based on the transfer of molecular primary sequences (linear sequence) in the synthesis of polypeptides; that is, it is the literal sequence of basic groups (amino acids), before the protein folds into secondary and higher conformations. This is a physical and causal account of information: the new molecule has its sequence because it was templated in some way by the “information”-imparting molecule (in this case, DNA to proteins). Griffiths and Stotz (see below) call this, accordingly, “Crick information”.

However, in the late 1950s, after the structure of DNA had become more widely understood, chemist Homer Jacobson proposed a cybernetic model of reproduction (Jacobson 1958), going so far as to make a literal model out of train sets and electronic circuits. Later, von Neumann proposed a theory of self-reproducing automata (Neumann 1966) which has become a parallel but influential research program to the issue in biology (Mitchell 2009). Jacob (1973) cemented the logical description of heredity, but the ultimate classical source of the notion that genes are information comes from Williams’ classic 1966 book Adaptation and Natural Selection, in which he referred to genes as “cybernetic abstractions” (1966: 33).

The cybernetic notion of reproduction (and later, replication) rested on the notion that genes were controllers of phenotypes; later, this came to be identified (e.g., by Gatlin) as synonymous with the “communication” conception of information that Shannon proposed. In biology, genes came to be seen as “programs” for phenotypes [‘senders’] that passed themselves on to progeny [‘receivers’], around 1961 (Peluffo 2015).

Williams’ book was one inspiration for Dawkins’ Selfish Gene (1976), and much of what Dawkins proposed about replicators is an extension of Williams’ views, in conjunction with those of William D. Hamilton (1964) and various ethological ideas. This view is now known as the gene’s eyes view (for a review see Okasha 2006, Chapter 5)

Williams introduced the notion of a gene as a substrate neutral entity:

I use the term ‘gene’ to mean that which separates and recombines with appreciable frequency, (1966: 20)

and he further defined an evolutionary gene (that is, one that is selectively important):

[A] gene could be defined as any hereditary information for which there is a favorable or unfavorable selection bias equal to several or many times its rate of endogenous change. (1966: 25)

His answer to the question of what a gene is, is that a gene is evolutionary just insofar as it is something heritable that is subject to rates of selection that exceed the mutation rate. This is a definition, not a discovery. If it’s favorably or unfavorably selected and heritable, it’s an evolutionary gene. According to this definition, items that are not made of DNA can be classed as evolutionary genes so long as they match Williams’ definition (Lu & Bourrat 2018).

a rectangle divided into three horizontal regions, the first region has a purple background and is titled 'Replication' and has a diagram with the word 'DNA' and an arrow going from 'DNA' and circling back to it; the second region has a yellow background and is titled 'Transcription' and the diagram continues with an arrow from 'DNA' in the previous region to the word 'RNA' in this region; the third region has a green background and is titled 'Translation' and the diagram continues with an arrow from 'RNA' in the previous region going into this region and ending.

Figure 2. The Central Dogma of genetics as envisaged by Crick around 1965 (Thieffry & Sarkar 1998).

2. Genes and Information

The language of “codes” and “information” flows easily enough with respect to replication (see the entry biological information). Transcription, translation, punctuation, redundancy, synonymy, editing, proofreading, errors, repairing of errors, messages, copies, and information all sound natural enough. Yet, the literature dealing with information is both extensive and factious. Several different formal analyses of information can be found and very little agreement about which analysis is best for which subjects. On one point these scholars tend to agree—cybernetic information and communication-theoretic information will not do for replication in biological contexts. Some argue for semantic information (Godfrey-Smith 2000a; Sarkar 2000; Sterelny 2000b). The trouble is that no widely accepted version of semantic information exists. Winnie (2000) distinguishes between Classical and Algorithmic Information Theory and opts for a revised version of the Algorithmic Theory. But once again, the problem is that no such formal analysis currently exists.

In the face of all this disagreement and unfinished business, biologists such as Maynard Smith (2000) maintain either that informal analyses of “information” are good enough or that some future formal version of information theory will justify the sorts of inferences that they make. The sense of “information” used in the Central Dogma of molecular biology is more like a fit of template, or the primary structure of the protein sequence compared to the sequence of the DNA base pairs. Attempts have been made in what is now known as bioinformatics to use Classical Information Theory (Shannon’s theory of communication) to extract functional and phylogenetic information (Brooks & Wiley 1988; Gatlin 1972; Maclaurin 1998; Rodrick Wallace & Wallace 1998), but they appear to have been unsuccessful in the main.

While the most likely conclusion is that no version of information theory as currently formulated can handle “information” as it functions in biology (Griffiths 2001), attempts have continued to be made to formulate just such a version (Bergstrom & Rosvall 2011; Sternberg 2008). However, this undercuts the motivation for appealing to information theory to elucidate genes in the first instance. Griffiths & Stotz (2013: 153) have argued for “Crick” information, which they define as “the specification of the order of amino acids in a polypeptide chain”. This specificity definition is more chemical than abstract (see the section below on Developmental Systems Theory).

The “informational gene” conception, as James R. Griesemer (2005) terms it, is a highly abstract concept of a process and the entities that comprise it. This is intentional, as it permits Darwinian dynamics to be applied to a range of phenomena, such as sociocultural, cybernetic, and medical processes. However, this raises a metaphysical concern, namely that the view that a gene is nothing but information is a version of Aristotelian hylomorphism (see the entry form versus matter). That is, information is a type of form, which can be used to explain physical processes. Classical hylomorphism was roundly demolished as a scientific hypothesis when Daltonian elements were named and investigated in the nineteenth century. By 1900, terms like “substance” (for matter that is propertyless apart from mass and extension in space) and “form” had taken on a largely philosophical sense that differed extensively from Aristotle’s own physical views. Griesemer notes:

We know that the informational genes are tied to matter and structure, but if evolutionary theory – to be general enough to cover cultural and conceptual change – must be devoid of all reference to concrete mechanism, it cannot follow from the theory, for example, that genes are inside organisms or are even parts of organisms, as Dawkins’s language suggests. Strictly, only the correlations between replicator and vehicle due to causal connections of a completely unspecified sort can be implied by such a theory. Striving to get matter and specific structure out of the theory in order to make it apply to immaterial realms may thus leave it bankrupt as an account of causal connection for the material, biological cases. (Griesemer 2005: 79)

And yet, this kind of hylomorphism has remained, even in science. Biologists have argued that form determined many properties of organisms in ways that could not be reduced to the actions of their parts, and this kind of thinking remained and was co-opted by the molecular biologists and geneticists. Thus, we get the Central Dogma of molecular biology:

The Central Dogma
This states that once ‘information’ has passed into protein it cannot get out again. In more detail, the transfer of information from nucleic acid to nucleic acid, or from nucleic acid to protein may be possible, but transfer from protein to protein, or from protein to nucleic acid is impossible. Information means here the precise determination of sequence, either of bases in the nucleic acid or of amino acid residues in the protein. (Crick 1958)

Read physically, this means only that the structure of the DNA molecule is not reproduced from the structure of proteins, a perfectly reasonable account of the molecular processes. But because Crick used the word “information”, some scientists, including Dawkins, took this to mean genes are informational entities, that “code” for organismic traits from the molecular level up to the entire organism and even beyond. This is striking in a purple passage of The Blind Watchmaker, where Dawkins describe genes the following way

It is raining DNA outside. [downy seeds from willow trees] … The cotton wool is mostly made of cellulose, and it dwarfs the tiny capsule that contains the DNA, the genetic information. The DNA content must be a small proportion of the total, so why did I say that it was raining DNA rather than cellulose? The answer is that it is the DNA that matters… whose coded characters spell out specific instructions for building willow trees… It is raining instructions out there, it’s raining programs; it’s raining tree-growing, fluff spreading, algorithms. That is not a metaphor, it is the plain truth. It couldn’t be any plainer if it were raining floppy disks. (1986: 111)

So we now turn to Dawkins’ view of genes as replicators, and the way in which he takes information to be cybernetic and physical at the same time.

3. Dawkins’ View

Richard Dawkins introduced the distinction between replicators and vehicles in his The Selfish Gene (1976). For his purposes Dawkins found the contrast between genes and organisms too restrictive and specific. Everyone agrees that genes are replicators, but genes may not be the only replicators. Dawkins also argued that perhaps more inclusive entities than single genes might also function as replicators. At the very least, the possibility should not be ignored. So, Dawkins adopted “replicator” as a more inclusive and general term than “gene”. In The Extended Phenotype he defined a replicator as “anything in the universe of which copies are made” (Dawkins 1982b: 83). He also introduced the term “vehicle” for those entities produced by replicators that help these replicators increase in numbers by interacting effectively with their environments. This distinction can be expressed in terms of either entities or processes. According to Dawkins, replicators function in replication, while vehicles function in environmental interaction.

3.1 Genes as Replicators

A long-standing dispute in evolutionary biology concerns the levels at which selection can occur (Bourrat 2015c, 2015b, 2016; Brandon 1996; Kerr & Godfrey-Smith 2002; Keller 1999; Lloyd 1988; Okasha 2006, 2016; Sober & Wilson 1998; Williams 1966) [see the entry on units and levels of selection]. Some authors see this dispute as concerning the levels at which replication can take place. Other authors take the levels of selection dispute to concern environmental interaction and insist that environmental interaction can take place at a variety of levels, from single genes, cells and organisms to colonies, demes and possibly entire species. Organisms certainly interact with their environments in ways that bias the transmission of their genes, but then so do entities that are both less inclusive than entire organisms (e.g., sperm cells) and more inclusive (e.g., beehives).

Dawkins argued that replication in biological evolution occurs exclusively at the level of the genetic material. The term “replication” refers first and foremost to copying, and genes are the self-replicating molecules of biology. Some critics (e.g., Lewontin 1991: 48) interpreted this to mean that a strand of DNA placed on a glass slide might start replicating all on its own. Of course, no biologist has ever held such view. Genes do replicate themselves, but only with the aid of highly complicated molecular machinery. Too often, however, the importance of this machinery has gone unnoticed. To be sure, when we make copies on a photocopier, we are interested in the texts, figures or just scrawls that appear on these sheets of paper. We are not interested in how the photocopier works, even if it does all the work.

In Dawkins’ early writings, replicators and vehicles played different but complementary and equally important roles in selection, but as he honed his view of the evolutionary process, vehicles became less and less fundamental. Initially, Dawkins was content to dethrone the organism from its pride of place in biology. It is an important focus of environmental interaction, but other entities, both below and above the organismic level, can also function as vehicles. In later writings, however, Dawkins went even further to argue that phenotypic traits are what really matter for evolution by natural selection to occur, and that they can be treated independently of their being organized into vehicles. More than that, features such as spider webs should be viewed as part of a spider’s phenotype. Hence, Dawkins titled his second book The Extended Phenotype (Dawkins 1982b).

Dawkins never lost his fascination with vehicular adaptations, a fascination that his critics denigrate as Panglossian adaptationism. He filled his books with adaptationist scenarios, some more firmly supported by data than others, but from the perspective of the structure of evolutionary theory, he held that replicators are much more important than vehicles. For example, Dawkins argued at some length that adaptations are always for the good of replicators, not vehicles (Lloyd 1992), see entry on units and levels of selection. Vehicles exhibit these adaptations, but ultimately all adaptations must be explicable in terms of changes in gene frequencies. Thus, it comes as no surprise when Dawkins (1994: 617) proclaims that he “coined the term ‘vehicle’ not to praise it but to bury it”. As prevalent as organisms might be, as definite as the causal roles that they play in selection are, reference to them can and must be omitted from any perspicuous characterization of selection in the evolutionary process. Although Dawkins is far from a genetic determinist, he is certainly a genetic reductionist. Whether reductionism itself is good or bad is a moot question (Sarkar 1998).

According to Dawkins, replicators have three basic properties—longevity, fecundity and copy-fidelity. Longevity means longevity of the gene type in the form of copies through descent (Dawkins 1982b: 84; Hull 1980), although the stability of gene tokens is included in the definition in The Selfish Gene (1976: 18). No gene as a physical body lasts all that long. In mitosis, a gene loses half of its substance at each replication. What endures, he says, is not the entity itself but the information incorporated in its structure. It is this information that is copied with such high fidelity. Mutations do occur, but at very low frequencies. Even so, in some organisms mutation rates must be too high because mechanisms have evolved that search out and repair such errors. The genotype is therefore an informational notion; information is equivalent to Aristotelian form. The type is the form of the tokens, in Dawkins’ view.

One source of variation in genes of sexual organisms supplementing mutation is crossover. Pairs of homologous chromosomes line up next to each other at meiosis, crossover and recombine. For stretches of DNA in which different alleles exist, the result can be a change in information. Quite obviously, the shorter the stretch of DNA involved, the less likely that crossover will occur and the message changed. Dawkins appeals to such dismantling of entities to argue against organisms functioning as replicators. In sexual organisms, organisms themselves are torn apart and repeatedly assembled each generation (Caporael 2003). If long stretches of DNA lack the necessary identity by descent to function as replicators, then sexual organisms certainly lack it. However, some other explanation has to be provided for asexual organisms because they pass on their overall structure largely unchanged from generation to generation. For example, R. A. Fisher, in his The Genetical Theory of Natural Selection (Fisher 1930) considered the entire genetic complement of asexual organisms to be a single gene, and this view has been repeated from time to time since. According to Dawkins, genes, and only genes, can function as replicators in biological evolution. How large these genetic units are depends on such things as the prevalence of sex, the frequency of crossover or lateral gene transfers, and the intensity of selection.

If there were sex but no crossing-over, each chromosome would be a replicator, and we should speak of adaptations as being for the good of the chromosome. If there is no sex we can, by the same token, treat the entire genome of an asexual organism as a replicator. But the organism itself is not a replicator. (Dawkins 1982a: 95)

Dawkins offered two reasons for organisms not being able to function as replicators. The first is the one he uses to delineate evolutionary genes. As is the case for long stretches of DNA, organisms are too easily and frequently broken up to be considered units of replication. A second reason is that they cannot pass on changes in their structure, although some phenotypic change may result in generational change. In fact, some epigenetic mechanisms have been shown to be passed on across generations (Jablonka & Raz 2009; see the entry on inheritance systems). The amount of DNA that counts as a replicator certainly varies, but according to Dawkins, nothing more inclusive than the genetic material functions as replicators in biological evolution.

In The Selfish Gene, although Dawkins wanted his definition of gene to be close to that of Williams’ (1966) “evolutionary gene”, it isn’t quite:

A gene is defined as any portion of chromosomal material which potentially lasts for enough generations to serve as a unit of natural selection. (Dawkins 1976: 30)

Where Williams’ definition is substrate neutral, Dawkins’ is explicitly chromosomal and DNA-based. Where William’s “gene” refers to any entity, which is the reason why it is an informational notion, Dawkins’ gene, by contrast, is tied to DNA; a view later heavily criticized by Stent (1977), an influential molecular biologist at the time.

On Dawkins’ account, the limits of genes need not be absolutely sharp. Nor must all genes be of the same length. The greater the selection pressure, the smaller the gene. At the most fundamental level, selection takes place between alternative alleles residing at the same locus.

As far as a gene is concerned, its alleles are its deadly rivals, but other genes are just a part of its environment, comparable to temperature, food, and predators, or companions. (Dawkins 1976: 40)

Alleles cannot cooperate with each other; only compete. That is where the “selfish” in “selfish gene” comes in. According to Dawkins (1976: 95), the selfish gene is not just one physical bit of DNA. It is “all replicas of a particular bit of DNA, distributed throughout the world” (for a recent defense of a similar approach, see Haig 2012). Hence, genes do not form classes of spatiotemporally unrelated individuals but trees. They must be replicas. But being a replica is not enough. The linear repetition of the “same gene” in the form of several hundred copies is quite common. These replicas, however, do not reside at the same locus. Although identical in structure, these genes do not compete with each other in the way that alleles at the same locus can. In the simplest and most basic sense, alleles compete with alternative alleles at the same locus. Any other sorts of competition and cooperation are merely extrapolations from this fundamental sense of allelic competition. Even though genes may cooperate with each other in very complicated ways in embryological development, in replication they can be treated as “separate and distinct”. In development the effects of genes blend. In replication replicators do not blend.

3.2 Hull’s Interactors

Dawkins introduced the general notions of replicator and vehicle so that selection need not be limited exclusively to gene-based biological evolution. However, as the preceding discussion indicates, his later revisions to his general theoretical outlook were influenced strongly by the traditional perspective of genes and organisms. Genes contain the information necessary to produce organisms and their adaptations. Genes “ride around” in and “guide” organisms. As Dawkins describes them, vehicles are relatively discrete entities that “house” replicators and which can be regarded as machines programmed to preserve and propagate the replicators that ride inside them. Although these terms may be appropriate for the relations between genes and organisms, they interfere with a more general analysis of replication and selection. What really matters in selection is that entities at various levels of organization interact with their environments in such a way that the relevant replicators increase in relative frequency. The actual causal chain that connects replicators and vehicles need not be limited to development.

For example, Dawkins argues at some length that genes and only genes can function as replicators in biological evolution. He adds that “all adaptations are for the preservation of DNA; DNA itself just is” (Dawkins 1982a: 45). But DNA itself exhibits adaptations. Anyone who has spent much time examining the molecular structure of DNA soon realizes that it is adapted to replicate. In addition, the proliferation of junk DNA, transposons, and meiotic drive are three examples in which the only phenotypes that matter are phenotypic characteristics of genes (Brandon 1996; Sterelny 1996: 388). Dawkins’ characterizations of replicators, vehicles and the relations between the two are too closely tied to genes, organisms and development. DNA can certainly replicate itself, but it can also function as a “vehicle” even though it cannot code for, ride around in or direct itself. In sum, a more general characterization of selection is needed, a characterization that does not assume that the only causal connection between replicators and vehicles is development from embryo to maturity. Such a generalization was offered by Hull (1980, 1981, 1988) who proposed that the relevant notion is “interactor” rather than “vehicle”, as interactors are causal and active while vehicles are passive entities.

4. Other Examples of Replicators

Although Dawkins finds it desirable to replace genes with replicators in his general characterization of the evolutionary process, he says very little about this more general notion in his The Selfish Gene. Only one chapter (11) is dedicated to “memetic” evolution. Instead, as we saw, he discusses the special case of genes as replicators. The primacy of the genetic perspective in the characterization of replicators is claimed by some (Griesemer 2000b) to be one of the chief weaknesses not only in Dawkins’ discussions but also in the work of his successors [see the section below on Reproducers]. Hull and his colleagues (Hull, Langman, & Glenn 2001) claim to be providing a general notion of replication, adequate to handle all different sorts of replication, when too often we are simply reading peculiarities of genetic replication into our general analysis of replication.

4.1 The Immune System

Does replication play the same role in other sorts of selection that it plays in gene-based biological evolution? The reaction of the immune system to antigens is closest to the standard biological example of replication and selection (Hull et al. 2001). Certainly immune systems arose through the same process as other functional systems. The basic structure of the human immune system is “built into our genes”, and the only genes that count in evolution are the ones that we received from our ancestors and can subsequently pass on to our progeny. In Dawkins’ (1982b: 83) terminology, the genes that code for our immune system are active, germ-line replicators. They are active because they influence their probability to be copied; they are germ-line, because they can potentially have an infinity of descendants.

However, the genes that function in the reaction of the immune system to antigens have two peculiarities. First, they incorporate mechanisms designed to produce very high frequencies of mutation, and second, none of the genes involved in the functioning of the immune system are germ-line. The genes that give rise to B-cells for instance are designed to mutate extensively until one of these cells identifies an invader as foreign. It then proliferates extensively as it attacks the invader. As an organism matures, it accumulates more and more of the B-cells that have been successful in its past. More than this, as the process of proliferation continues, the strength of the affinities to binding sites increases. Initially the primary antibodies almost always exhibit a weak affinity for their targets, but as the reaction to the antigen continues, these affinities become stronger.

Within the confines of a single organism, the reaction of the immune system to antigens has all the characteristics of selection processes, but when the organism dies all of these adaptations are lost. In some species, females pass on not only the genes for the basic structure of their immune systems but also some of the machinery that past invasions of antigens have produced in her. However, these cells are rapidly removed from the offspring as it develops its own immune system. The reaction of the immune system to antigens departs from gene-based selection in biological evolution in two ways. First, from the organismal perspective, the genes that function in protecting an organism from invaders are not germ-line. They are somatic. Second, the relevant mutation rates are much, much higher in the immune system than in ordinary gene-based selection. Instead of mechanisms existing to discover mutations and repair them, mechanisms exist that encourage mutations—massively so. If the functioning of the immune system is to count as an adaptive process, then some changes must be made. One possibility is to clarify what counts as a “germ-line” replicator and a rejection of the notion that extremely low mutation rates are inherent in all selection processes [see the section below on Challenges to the Replicator].

4.2 Sociocultural Evolution

The temptation to regard cultures and societies as evolving entities in a way analogous to organism has a long tradition. In The Selfish Gene (Chapter 11), Dawkins proposes a version of it that makes use of the concept of the replicator. He chose the word “meme” for a sociocultural replicator because of its similarities with the word gene:

We need a name for the new replicator, a noun that conveys the idea of a unit of cultural transmission, or a unit of imitation. ‘Mimeme’ comes from a suitable Greek root, but I want a monosyllable that sounds a bit like ‘gene’ (Dawkins 1976: 192).

The basic idea, underlying Dawkins’ proposal is that since evolution by natural selection in the biological domain requires replication, it must also be the case in the sociocultural domain, and that imitation, at least in many cases, is the way through which sociocultural entities, the memes, replicate.

Important differences exist between sociocultural evolution and biological evolution (Claidière & André 2012) [see the entry on cultural evolution]. For example, Dawkins (1976) admits that he is on shaky ground when it comes to the high-fidelity copying required of replicators. Memes seem to get changed much more frequently than genes (see Sterelny (2006) for a review). In general, however, it is fair to say that the standards used to evaluate sociocultural transmission are not on par with those used to evaluate biological transmission. An overly idealized view of Mendelian genetics is contrasted to a much more realistic view of cultural change. So the criticism goes, one problem with memes is that they do not have discrete boundaries, do not all come in the same size, and in their functioning are strongly influenced by their environments. Genes, so the critics claim, have sharp boundaries, are all of the same size, and are immune to environmental influences. If sociocultural evolution is to be evaluated fairly, the same level of criticism must be applied to all putative examples of selection from gene-based selection in biological evolution and the reaction of the immune system to antigens to the development of the central nervous system and social learning (Hull et al. 2001). The collection of articles in Aunger (2000) present the arguments pro- and against a memetic approach to culture and a more recent discussion is available in Lewens (2015).

Dawkins (1976) also places considerable emphasis on human brains as the “vehicles” for memetic evolution. He defines “meme” as an entity capable of being transmitted from one brain to another. Computers are also plausible vehicles for memes, as well as artifacts more generally which can ‘store’ and then release information when a copy of the artifact is made by emulation (mimesis), that is without the presence of a demonstration. Dawkins’ discussion of memes is, however, marred by the pervasiveness of the gene-organism perspective. For example, he defines “replicator” in terms of transmission of information—memes leaping from brain to brain or from brains to computers and back again. But memes do not leap from brain to brain or from computer to computer. Their content is transmitted in a variety of ways, including books, audiotapes, conversations and the like. As much as the physical basis changes, the message remains sufficiently unchanged. All instances of this message are equally memes, not just the ones residing in human brains and computers.

Several accounts of memetic replication have been proposed in the literature. Some consider that there is no replication in cultural evolution, but that memes are “attractor points” in culture (Atran 1998). Others consider that the interactor is the meme itself (Blackmore 1999) or that the meme is the selected cultural heritable information just as Williams’ “evolutionary gene” is the selected genetic heritable information, and the memetic interactor is the repertoire of behaviors it elicits (Wilkins 1998). One view that has been offered several times is that memes are active neural structures (Aunger 1998, 2002; Delius 1991).

All the objections to the gene-meme analogy to one side, Dawkins (1976: 211) finds the chief difference between genetic and memetic change is that biological evolution is at bottom a war between alleles residing at the same locus. “Memes seem to have nothing equivalent to chromosomes and nothing equivalent to alleles”. First, the usual depiction of alleles residing at the same locus on homologous chromosomes so central to Mendelian genetics is an oversimplification, but more importantly, for at least half of the history of life on earth, replication and selection took place in the absence of chromosomes, meiosis and the like. If gene-based biological evolution took place for so long in the absence of the Mendelian apparatus and still does so in many extant organisms, then demanding that memetic evolution proceed by this very special and possibly aberrant sort of inheritance seems too strong. The cost of meiosis remains a serious problem in ordinary biological evolution. Demanding that cultural evolution incorporates this same highly problematic element in its own makeup seems strange in the extreme. If we are to develop a general analysis of selection, then we must distinguish between essential and contingent features of this process..

Numerous evolutionary biologists question how fundamental to selection the perspective of alleles at a locus actually is. Almost everyone agrees that evolution involves changes in gene frequencies. However, few go on to add that evolution is nothing but changes in gene frequencies. When one looks at evolutionary biology, one discovers that it involves much more than changes in gene frequencies. To be successful, memetic evolution must be fleshed out.

In 2000, Aunger summarized the disputes between proponents and skeptics of the memetic approach, as revolving around three levels:

  1. whether culture is properly seen as composed of independently transmitted information units;
  2. whether these so-called memes have the necessary qualifications to serve as replicators; and
  3. whether a Darwinian or selectionist approach such as memetics is the most feasible or desirable form for a science of culture to take. (Aunger 2000: 11)

Nearly 20 years after the diagnosis, it seems however that the memetic approach has, by and large, been abandoned, with some of its insights incorporated into other evolutionary approaches to culture. Perhaps the most successful is dual-inheritance theory (Richerson & Boyd 2008), also known as gene-culture coevolution. A very general characterization of the sociocultural evolution has been attempted by El Mouden, André, Morin, & Nettle (2014). This approach which relies on the most abstract formalism used by evolutionary theorists, namely the Price equation (for an introduction to the Price equation see Okasha 2006: Chap. 1), highlights some of the differences between biological and sociocultural evolution, and why a pure memetic approach seems difficult to implement as a general framework.

4.3 The Extended Replicator

Some of Dawkins’ critics think that genes play too important of a role in his notion of replication. Replication, so they argue, can occur at other levels of organization as well. Just as Dawkins extended the notion of the phenotype, these authors propose to make the notion of replicators more general as well—to extend the replicator so to speak. Dawkins introduced his Extended Phenotype conception for two reasons. First, he wanted to extend the notion of a “phenotypic trait”. The sort of nest that a bird builds or the song that it sings can count as phenotypic traits just as much as the shape of its bill. Second, as mentioned earlier, Dawkins wanted to break the hold that organisms have over how we conceptualize the living world. Traits do tend to come bundled into reasonably discrete entities, but for making inferences about the evolutionary process, traits can be treated as separate and distinct. However, as he proceeded, Dawkins eventually decided that extending the phenotype was not enough. He had to bury it. All sorts of fascinating mechanisms to one side, what really matters in selection takes place at the level of replicators.

Although such critics of Dawkins as Sterelny, Smith, & Dickison (1996) declined to join with Dawkins in his demotion of environmental interaction, they did agree with him that replicators are special. They play a special role in development. However, they do not limit replicators to genes even in biological evolution. Sterelny et al. propose to extend the replicator to include nonstandard entities: “the set of developmental resources that are adapted from the transmission of similarity across the generations” (Sterelny 2001: 338). For example, the sort of burrow that a particular organism digs is influenced by its genetic makeup, but if these burrows are used over and over again, characteristics of these burrows can themselves be viewed as replicators. The effects of these burrows get passed on from generation to generation, but not via the DNA.

As more and more non-DNA replicators, including epigenetic inheritance, are acknowledged, Dawkins’ view began to grade into the conception of the Extended Replicator, which Sterelny et al. (1996) specify as any non-genetic as well as genetic replicators where ‘genetic’ refers to DNA. These two views are so general that any case that can be described in one can be redescribed in the other. Differences lie in ease of description. According to Sterelny et al. (1996), the burrows that some organisms dig can function as replicators—extended replicators—while Dawkins portrays them as instance of extended phenotypes. The contrast is between selfish burrows and selfish genes for burrowing.

In the version of replication formulated by Sterelny et al. (1996) both copying and biofunction are crucial. Copying is quite obviously a causal phenomenon, but not any old causal connection will do. Similarity of copies is necessary, but not sufficient. These copies must be copies of copies. One copy must produce another copy and that copy produce still another copy and so on. For one entity to be a copy of another, it must be the output of a process whose biofunction is to conserve function. The function of copying is to produce from one token another token which is similar in the relevant respects. Genes fit this definition, but so do lots of examples of non-genetic transmission; e.g., habitat stability resulting from nest site imprinting, the song that a bird learns, various microorganism symbionts, not to mention sociocultural transmission.

5. Challenges to the Replicator

5.1 Developmental Systems Theory

In the wake of Oyama’s The Ontogeny of Information (1985, 2000) and other work, notably that of Daniel Lehrman (1953) and Patrick Bateson (2001), a view of biological evolution has arisen that emphasizes development (see also Griffiths & Gray 1994a). In the nineteenth century development was an extremely active research program. The next great discoveries in biology were going to be in the area of development. It was not to be. First Mendelian genetics and then a version of evolutionary theory centered on population genetics took over biology, and they did so while avoiding development. Everyone knew that development was central to both evolution and reproduction, but no one could see how to integrate the masses of developmental data available into the emerging synthesis of evolutionary biology and genetics. As a result, development was left out of the Modern Synthesis (Beurton, Falk, & Rheinberger 2000; Gilbert 1991). Considering how central development actually is in metazoan and metaphyte biology, the advances made while ignoring it are staggering.

Even so, developmental biology continued on its course until at long last we seem to understand development well enough to begin integrating it into the rest of biology. On the most conservative view, current versions of evolutionary theory can remain largely unchanged as development is grafted onto them. On a second view, both perspectives are likely to require some modification to bring off this integration. Our understanding of development may have to be modified, but so too for evolutionary theory (Pigliucci & Müller 2010). Finally, at the other extreme, development will all but replace evolutionary theory. In their more exuberant moments, some advocates of Developmental Systems Theory (hereafter DST) seem to be claiming just that. Just as some molecular biologists think that molecular biology is rapidly replacing all the rest of biology, some advocates of DST argue that developmental theories will simply replace current versions of evolutionary theory.

On some versions of the DST view, genes have no uniquely privileged role in repeated cycles of development (Griffiths 2001; Griffiths & Gray 1994b). In fact, no element of the developmental matrix plays any privileged causal role—not genes, not organisms, not the environment, not anything. Everything counts as a resource, albeit in particular situations certain resources will play more important roles than other resources. In rejecting any privileged role for genes, advocates of DST are especially skeptical of one particular role supposedly played by genes—the transmission of information. According to some, information is central to developmentalism, but genes are not the only mechanisms for information transfer. According to others, information plays no role in the emerging developmentalist perspective. The developmental system as a whole is the unit of selection [see the entry on units and levels of selection]. If genes have no special role and whole developmental cycles are replicators, as some developmental- systems theorists argue, the distinction between replicator and interactor becomes blurred .

In the continuing debate over developmental versus traditional theories of evolutionary biology, Sterelny et al. (1996) hold a fairly conservative position. They agree with the developmentalists that genes play no privileged role in the development of phenotypes from genotypes. Genes do play a role in this process, only simply not a privileged role. Genes can serve as a causal bridge from phenotype to phenotype, but other entities can do so as well. Genes are not the only replicators in biological evolution. The repeated cycles in inheritance include many different sorts of constancies and repetitions—genes, cellular machinery, phenotypic traits including behaviors, and social structures. Information remains central to selection processes, but genes are not the only carriers of such information. Genes predict phenotypic characters only in the same sense that environmental factors predict them. Sterelny (2000a) has argued that developmental considerations require no fundamental reevaluation of evolutionary conceptions along the lines of DST.

5.2 Evolution by Natural Selection without Replication

Godfrey-Smith (2009; see also Godfrey-Smith 2000b; Griesemer 2005) contrasts the replicator/interactor approach to natural selection with a more classical approach. This latter approach is usually given as a “recipe” for evolution by natural selection to use Godfrey-Smith’s terminology (see also Brandon 1990: 3.1). Ever since Darwin, a number of authors have proposed that for evolution by natural selection to occur three conditions or ingredients are necessary. A population should exhibit (1) variation, that (2) leads to differences in fitness between the entities forming the population [see the entry on fitness], (3) which are heritable (reviewed in Godfrey-Smith 2007). The most famous version of these recipes is the one provided by Lewontin 1970.

There is a difference in emphasis between the two approaches in that the replicator/interactor approach focuses on the entities forming the population, while the classical approach provides a population description of evolutionary change. Another difference between the two approaches, is that under the classical approach replication is not required for evolution by natural selection to occur. In fact, as long as heritability is positive, and the two other conditions are satisfied, then evolution by natural selection can occur (but will not necessarily so, cf. Godfrey-Smith 2009: 25). An abstract definition of heritability (\(h^2\))—although by no means fully general (see Bourrat 2015a)—is that it represents the slope of the regression of average offspring character on parent or mid-parent (in case of sexual species) character (see the entry on Heritability). Given a positive heritability does not entail replication of character between parent and offspring, but is rather a special case, in which heritability would be exactly 1 in the absence of environmental variation, the replicator/interactor perspective is subsumed by the classical approach. Godfrey-Smith concurs:

From this point of view, we can see the replicator analysis as picking out a special case of what is covered (or supposed to be covered) by the classical view. (2009: 36; see also Godfrey-Smith 2000b)

To see why a lack of replication does not prevent evolution by natural selection from occurring, suppose a population of entities exists with different sizes, as presented in Figure 3(a), in which there is selection for larger entities. We assume that the entities reproduce asexually in discrete generations and that there is no environmental variation. At the parental generation, there are two types of individuals, with respective sizes of \(\frac{3}{4}\) and 1. Because of the selection for size, entities of size \(\frac{3}{4}\) produce 3 offspring while entities of size 1 produce 4 offspring. Suppose now that there is a positive heritability, as defined above, so that, on average, offspring resemble more their parent than they resemble other entities of the parental generation, as is displayed on Figure 3(a), but only slightly so (\(h^2 = 0.2\)). After one generation, although there is no high-fidelity replication, the average size of the population has changed, due to the effect of natural selection. This simple example, demonstrates quite straightforwardly that replication is not required for evolution by natural selection to occur.

We said earlier that replication would imply a heritability of exactly 1 in the absence of environmental variation. Although this is correct, the reverse is not true. In fact, take again a similar population as in Figure 3(a), but this time assume a different pattern of inheritance for the two types of entities as displayed in Figure 3(b). With this pattern of inheritance, although there is no replication, entities, on average, have the exact same character as their parent. In the case of the entities of size \(\frac{3}{4}\), some offspring have the exact same character as their parent, but that is not required either, as is the case with the entities of size 1, of which none of the offspring has the same character as their parent.

One possible response against regarding the classical approach to evolution by natural selection as unconditionally superior to the replicator/interactor approach, is to argue that although evolution by natural selection can occur without replication, when this happens, the evolutionary change resulting is not a pure case of evolution by natural selection. Rather, it is evolution by natural selection mixed with some other evolutionary processes. A rationale for this claim is that the fact offspring do not resemble their parent introduces some variation in the population of which the origin is not natural selection. In abstract terms, the introduction of variation can be regarded as a form mutation.

Under this interpretation, the classical approach on the one hand, and the replicator/interactor approach, on the other hand, just emphasize different aspects of evolutionary explanations. The classical approach gives us evolutionary explanations in the context of other evolutionary processes occurring, while the replicator/interactor approach gives us evolutionary explanations of what the effect of natural selection would be in the absence of any other evolutionary process acting in the population, that is, in its pure form. Understood that way, the two approaches do not necessarily need to be opposed.

5.3 Origins of Replicators

Another challenge to the replicator/interactor approach to evolution by natural selection is to see replicators themselves as a product of natural selection rather than as a necessary starting point. One premise of this argument is that some form of natural selection must have occurred on entities that initially were not replicating, perhaps not even reproducing. This is recognized by Dawkins, who notes in passing in the second chapter of the Selfish Gene that “Darwin’s ‘survival of the fittest’ is really a special case of a more general law of survival of the stable” (Dawkins 1976: 13) and that life originated from selection of molecules for stability. The idea that evolution by natural selection can occur without reproduction has been argued by Bouchard (2008, 2011; see also Doolittle 2014, Bourrat 2014).

a diagram with two parts, the first consists of a black circle labeled '0.75' with arrows pointing to three black circles below labeled respectively '0.8', '0.8', and '0.95', below this is a legend stating 'Average: 0.85'. The second part consists of a black circle labeled '1' with arrows pointing to four black circles below labeled respectively '0.8', '0.8', '1', and '1', below is a legend stating 'Average: 0.9'. below all is an equation \(h^2 = 0.2\)

(a) Population in which there is no replication and a low heritability (\(h^2\)), yet, evolution by natural selection occurs.

a diagram with two parts, the first consists of a black circle labeled '0.75' with arrows pointing to three black circles below labeled respectively '0.5', '0.75', and '1', below this is a legend stating 'Average: 0.75'. The second part consists of a black circle labeled '1' with arrows pointing to four black circles below labeled respectively '0.75', '0.75', '1.25', and '1.25', below is a legend stating 'Average: 1'. below all is an equation \(h^2 = 1\)

(b) Population in which there is no replication, yet heritability is 1. Evolution by natural selection occurs.

Figure 3. Illustration of the idea that evolution by natural selection can occur without replication.

The idea that selection can occur without there being replicators was first introduced as “chemical selection” in line with the views of Oparin, who proposed that coascervates (colloidal droplets) could encapsulate protobiological chemicals and self-replicate without genes through mechanical fission, a view also independently proposed by Haldane (Oparin 1936 [1938], Haldane 1929; see Kolb 2016). This was later extended by the work of Sidney Fox, who showed that proteinoid spheres could mechanically reproduce stably (Hsu & Fox 1976).

If modern biological systems evolved from molecules that did not have the ability to reproduce, let alone replicate, one might ask, what is the simplest case of evolution by natural selection? It is a case in which different types of entities have different persistences but do not produce any offspring. In this model, the types with the property of persisting longer represent an increasing frequency of the total population over time. One problem though in a model of persistence alone, is that each time one entity goes out of existence, it is not replaced by another entity, so that over time the population size tends towards zero. Although this does not mean that evolution by natural selection cannot occur in such populations, this poses important constraints on the evolutionary dynamics of this population. Furthermore, it is possible to regard the ability for a population to maintain its size or increase its size as a primordial form of adaptation. To see this one can imagine different populations of entities at different locations, some with the ability to produce some entities or multiply, others without. It is clear that the populations with the ability to maintain or increase their size would out-compete those that are unable to do so. The ability for a population to sustain its population size might thus be regarded as a primordial form of adaptation.

A next ‘stage’ in the evolution from primordial entities unable to reproduce to modern biological systems might thus have been for entities to produce new offspring entities (or multiply) without the ability to pass on their properties reliably. In such a situation the size of a population could be maintained. The most extreme form of that would be to imagine a population of two types in which each type has the same probability to produce an offspring of the other types than its own type. With entities of the two types having different persistence, a modest form of evolution by natural selection is still possible. Versions of this model have been proposed by Wilkins, Stanyon, & Musgrave (2012), Earnshaw-Whyte (2012) and Bourrat (2014). Since there is, on average, no more resemblance between an offspring with its parent than any other entity of the parental generation, and evolution by natural selection is still observed in such a scenario, one might think that heritability is, strictly speaking not a necessary condition for evolution by natural selection.

Wilkins et al. (2012) argue that over time in a reactor with limited incoming chemical species, hypercycles (as defined by Eigen, Biebricher, Gebinoga, & Gardiner 1991) of reactions will tend to include reaction types that are more stable and capture more source molecules and energy than variant reaction types, leading to the evolution by natural selection of replicator-like molecules as well as energetically efficient “metabolic” molecules. Recent work in biochemistry has added strength to that suggestion (Altstein 2015). Hence, given that no replicator is required for selection (in this case, chemical), replicator molecules can be seen as the outcome of selective evolution, not a necessary prior condition for it. In effect, the evolution of replicators is the first major transition of evolution, despite the view of Szathmáry and Maynard Smith that replicators needed to come first (Maynard Smith & Szathmáry 1995; Szathmáry & Maynard Smith 1997). Bourrat (2014), further developed this idea into a series of agent-based models. He showed that replication is an attractor in populations lacking heritability once small random mutations increasing or decreasing the fidelity of character inheritance is introduced.

5.4 Reproducers

The works on the origins of replicators ties in with the notion of the reproducer proposed by Griesemer (2000a,b, 2002, 2005; Wimsatt & Griesemer 2007), although it was published first, based on a circulated manuscript by Griesemer, by Szathmáry and Maynard Smith (1997). A reproducer is an entity that develops and has a material overlap between the “parent” and “progeny”. This causal relationship between parents and progeny is called “progeneration”, the “increase in numerically distinct objects of a given kind”. Reproduction is a composite process of development and progeneration, leading to objects that are themselves capable of development and progeneration. Thus, the reproducer concept extends the notion of a developmental system.

Here inheritance is a system property, not a property of parts, unless they are also reproducing systems, and is developmentally acquired. Organisms do not arise already capable of reproduction in the main, but must undergo orderly transitions before they may reproduce.

The relation between reproducers, and replicators and interactors, varies according to author. Griesemer treats replication as the terminal form of reproduction, once coding mechanisms have been evolved, which is itself an evolved form of multiplication (Griesemer 2000a: 76). Unlike Dawkins’ replicator concept, which Griesemer believes is based on a similarity relationship of “copying”, a reproducer requires material overlap of systems. However, replication arises when material overlap evolves progeneration, and progeneration evolves a codical inheritance system, as Figure 4 indicates.

title is 'Modes of Multiplication'. This is a tree diagram. At the top is a node labeled 'Multiplication' below and to the left is a node labeled 'Copying' with the line connecting labeled 'nonmaterial overlap (property transmission)'. Below and to the right is 'Progeneration' with the line connecting labeled 'material overlap (parts transfer)'. Below 'Progeneration' is 'Reproduction' with the line connecting labeled 'material overalp of mechanisms of development'. Below 'Reproduction' is 'Inheritance' with the line connecting labeled 'material overlap of evolved mechanisms of development'. Below 'Inheritance' is 'Replication' with the line connected labeled 'material overlap of evolving coding mechanisms of development'.

Figure 4. Wimsatt and Griesemer’s reproducer concept (Wimsatt & Griesemer 2007, 268).

Others, particularly Jablonka and Lamb (2005, 2007), think that reproducers are distinct from replication, and that some epigenetic inheritance systems are reproducers without being replicators. For them, a reproducer is the “target of selection” (see the entry on inheritance systems).

Godfrey-Smith (2009: 83; see also Okasha 2006: 14) takes issue with Griesemer’s requirement of “material overlap” as being too narrow a definiendum of reproducers. He thinks that reproducers need not contribute actual material to their progeny (where they template for sequences, as in the case of viruses). Griesemer believes Godfrey-Smith has over-interpreted the requirement; he is primarily concerned with the idea that parents cause progeny (Griesemer 2014). Charbonneau (2014) furthers the move made by Godfrey-Smith. He argues that the existence of parent-offspring lineages is necessary for evolution by natural selection to occur.

An aspect of reproducers sensu lato that has fascinated some is that it does not imply a particular level of reproduction or progeneration, and indeed Szathmáry and Maynard Smith consider that the major transitions of evolution each involve an evolved mode of progeneration that is more inclusive or novel than what it evolved from (Maynard Smith & Szathmáry 1995; Szathmáry & Maynard Smith 1997).

Godfrey-Smith also proposed a taxonomy of reproducers, dividing them into simple, collective and scaffolded (Godfrey-Smith 2009, 87ff). Simple reproducers are

entities that can reproduce … using their own machinery, in conjunction with external sources of energy and raw materials.

He gives an example of a bacterial cell. Collective reproducers

… are reproducing entities with parts that themselves have the capacity to reproduce, where the parts do so largely through their own resources rather than the coordinated activity as a whole.

And scaffolded reproducers

are entities which get reproduced as part of the reproduction of some larger unit (a simple reproducer), or that are reproduced by some other entity.

Examples here includes viruses and chromosomes. Godfrey-Smith applies the scaffolded reproducer category to sociocultural evolution.

The notion of reproducers has also been applied to speciation and cladogenesis (A. Hamilton & Haber 2006). While it may apply to populations, given that taxa do not share the kind of causal unity found in populations and organisms, it is unlikely to apply to species or supraspecific taxa, and macroevolution in general.

6. Conclusion

The idea that evolution by natural selection requires the existence of replicators has been a very useful heuristics in evolutionary biology, but also a way of motivating the application of an evolutionary thinking beyond the boundaries of evolutionary biology. We started by showing how the notion of gene can be abstracted away from its physical basis and characterized in purely informational terms. We then showed how Dawkins and Hull pursued this abstraction and attempted to free the gene from its biological substrate. This motivated responses both from proponents of the replicator concept who furthered the abstraction but also critics. As successful and inspiring such an abstraction has been, it should not be reified: evolution by natural selection and adaptation can occur even in the absence of replicators. High fidelity certainly facilitates adaptive evolution, but this might be because replicators are themselves the product of evolution rather than necessary for it.


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Other Internet Resources


The original version of this article, entitled “Replication” was written by the late David Hull. In January 2005, John Wilkins became a co-author, with the responsibility for revising and updating the entry, so as to keep it current. Thus, revisions on or after January 2005 were introduced by Wilkins, and from October 2018, by Wilkins and Pierrick Bourrat. Although the current version includes some of Hull’s original essay, it does not represent his final views.

The authors would like to thank Peter Godfrey-Smith and James Griesemer for their suggestions and comments, and the reviewers who made many useful comments and suggestions.

Copyright © 2018 by
John S. Wilkins <>
Pierrick Bourrat <>

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