The Limits of Law
[Editor’s Note: The following entry is not just an update but a rewrite of the previous entry on this topic by the same author.]
A central—perhaps the central—question of the philosophy of law concerns the relationship between law and morality. The concern breaks down into many issues, both conceptual and evaluative. Among the evaluative issues is the question of obedience to law: does the fact that some norm is a legal norm provide any reason to obey it? (Green 2004 ; Delmas & Brownlee 2021). By contrast, conceptual or analytical issues include the identification of conditions necessary for the existence of a legal system, irrespective of the system’s goodness or otherwise. Must some reference to morality enter into an adequate definition of law or legal system? (Hart 1963 ; Dickson 2012). And so on.
The present topic, the question of the limits of law, is widely understood to be one of the important evaluative questions, revolving around the legal enforcement of morality. In the nineteenth century John Stuart Mill proposed “the harm principle” as his answer; in the late twentieth century H.L.A Hart adopted a significantly modified version of Mill’s principle and further important versions of the harm principle followed in the hands of Joel Feinberg and Joseph Raz (Sections 4–6 below). The harm principle in all its manifestations has encountered strong resistance, most notably from “legal moralists” (Sections 1–3) and remains in the eyes of many the focus of debate, the view to adopt, supplement or modify (as some would say), or to beat and replace (as others would say).
A more recent strand to the question of the legal enforcement of morality is Rawlsian in origin, most notably the claim that constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice should be subject to a constraint of public reason (Section 7). An alternative perspective challenges the assumption that the limits of law is simply an evaluative question focussed on law as a neutral instrument put to good ends and bad. It takes the limits of law as in part a conceptual question. Law of its nature has an internal morality of its own, so it is claimed, with its own built-in limits (Section 8). A further question relates to the deployment by the law of techniques beyond coercion (Section 8).
- 1. Legal Moralism: Formulation and Structure
- 2. Legal Moralism: Restrictive Factors that Can Defeat Prima Facie Wrongs
- 3. The Morality of Legal Moralism
- 4. The Harm Principle
- 5. What is Harm?
- 6. Foundations of the Harm Principle
- 7. Public Reason
- 8. Other Directions: Legality, a “Modal Kind” and Coercion
- 9. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Legal Moralism: Formulation and Structure
Legal moralism is an initially simple and natural position to take in delineating the legitimate boundaries of the legal use of coercion. At its heart is a strong link between moral wrongdoing and legal (especially criminal) wrongdoing. In the 1960s Herbert Hart applied the label “legal moralist” to his intellectual sparring partner, Lord Patrick Devlin, and the label stuck (Hart 1963; Devlin 1965). Devlin’s account, which we come to below, has led to numerous responses; beyond Hart himself a sample might include: Rostow (1960), Ronald Dworkin (1965), Ten (1972), Feinberg (1987), Kane (1994), Jeffrie Murphy (1999), Gerald Dworkin (1999), Kekes (2000), Nussbaum (2004, 2010), Wall (2013). While many of the responses to Devlin have been heavily critical, the approach is alive and well and continues to develop in the hands, among others, of self-declared legal moralists, such as Michael Moore and Antony Duff (Duff 2016: 96, 2018; Moore 1997, 2014) and in writers who seem at least broadly favourably disposed (Tadros 2016a: 169–170). Something akin to it is also found implicit in a vast range of legal writing.
Legal Moralism is often formulated in terms of immorality as a sufficient condition for legal coercion. Hart asks whether the fact that conduct is immoral is “sufficient to justify making that conduct punishable by law?” (Hart 1963 [1982:4]). Larry Alexander similarly defines legal moralism as “the position that immorality is sufficient for criminalization” (Alexander 2003: 131). Joel Feinberg—mindful of the possibility that a legal moralist might want to excise from the picture certain kinds of immorality—defines legal moralism without mention of sufficient conditions:
it can be morally legitimate to prohibit conduct on the ground that it is inherently immoral, even though it causes neither harm nor offence to the actor or to others. (Feinberg 1984: 27, emphasis added)
However, Hart’s and Alexander’s formulations are at best misleading as characterizations of legal moralism; and Feinberg’s is incomplete by the measure of his own formulations of rival positions. What both leave out is the important point that immorality or wrongdoing is generally taken by legal moralists to be a prima facie or pro tanto ground for the imposition of legal coercion, subject to potential defeat by other factors. That certain conduct is by common standards immoral gives the society, in Devlin’s view, “prima facie right to legislate” (Devlin 1965: 11). The immorality is certainly a valid reason for criminalization, but such a reason will fail to be conclusive if unable to override a series of potential defeating factors that Devlin outlines. Accordingly, the
appointed law makers of society have the duty to balance conflicting values…and to form a judgement according to the merits of each case. (Devlin 1965: 117)
Devlin identifies a series of “factors which should restrict the use of the criminal law”, even where an immorality or moral wrong has been identified (Devlin 1965: viii). Balances must be struck as between “factors of principle” and “factors of expediency” (we examine some of these in the next section). Hence it will often be the case that the posited wrongness or immorality will not be a sufficient ground for legal coercion.
As far as Feinberg’s formulation is concerned, it is perhaps revealing to contrast his formulation of the harm principle (which we discuss below in section 4) with his formulation of legal moralism cited above.
Harm to others: It is always a good reason in support of penal legislation that it would be effective in preventing (eliminating, reducing) harm to persons other than the actor (the one prohibited from acting) and that there is probably no other means that is equally effective at no greater cost to other values. (Feinberg 1984: 26, emphasis added)
In formulating his harm principle, Feinberg is careful to qualify his central claim with conditions relating to what would be “effective” and of what the “cost” may be to “other values”. Not so, however, when he formulates legal moralism. This may be no more than an oversight. However, considerations of the sort—potential “effectiveness”, “cost to other values”—are central to legal moralists as will be seen in the next section (Devlin 1965; Moore 1997: 663–665). Stressing these, as regards the harm principle, but omitting them, as regards legal moralism, leaves the unfair impression that the former has a subtlety and a realism that the latter lacks. Furthermore, Feinberg’s formulation makes wrongdoing or immorality sound like something of an afterthought or a factor of only marginal importance to the criminalization question. The legal moralist by contrast sees wrongdoing or immorality not as marginal or in play only after harm and offence have had their due, but as central or pivotal. Wrongs, as Devlin would have it, “shape” crimes. Of the best known—murder, rape, battery, theft, fraud, arson—so called mala in se—we should say “a moral idea shapes the content of the law” (Devlin 1965: 27). It is true, the moralist will say, that while these crimes are shaped by morality, the criminal offence of, say, murder is not identical to the moral wrong of murder as law will import various other requirements, of legality and so on; for example the law
must trim the edges so that they present a line sharp enough for the clear acquittal or condemnation which the administration of justice requires. (Devlin 1965: 27)
The wrongdoing is, however, essential. Hence the legal moralist takes murder, fraud etc as ripe for criminalization because they are wrongful. They may (or may not) be wrongful because harmful; but from the fact that harms form a significant subset of wrongs, we should not be tempted to put the cart before the horse. Harms matter a great deal, but this is because they are often a kind of wrong. As Devlin’s fellow legal moralist Michael Moore puts it
we care about harm to non-consenting victims because to cause such harms (and sometimes, to fail to prevent them) breaches our moral obligations. (Moore 1997: 649)
If one were to revise Feinberg’s definition of legal moralism so as to be symmetrical with his definition of the harm principle one would get something closer to the essence of the position: It is (always or sometimes) a good reason in support of penal legislation that it would be effective in preventing (eliminating, reducing) wrongs and that there is probably no other means that is equally effective at no greater cost to other values.
Legal moralism, then, broadly comes in two parts, first, a wrong or immorality is identified and, second, a set of countervailing factors are considered; and considered with the aim of reaching an all-things-considered-judgement on whether legal coercion should be deployed. The wrong may be strong enough to see off the countervailing factors, as the case may be, or the factors may be powerful enough to defeat the wrong, all things considered. Thus, some wrongs will be tolerable, according to this position, and some will be intolerable. Beyond this core of the position, legal moralist accounts diverge significantly. Moore takes a specific philosophy of punishment, a form of retributivism, as an essential component of his account (Moore 1997). Duff argues that only a subset of moral wrongs should be criminalizable—public, not private wrongs (Duff 2016, 2018). Tadros, whose relationship to legal moralism is complex, also excludes a subset of moral wrongs as potentially criminalizable, for example “less serious wrongs committed in families” (Tadros 2016a: 131). Against this Moore accepts there is initially reason to criminalize all kinds of morally wrongful conduct—even breach of contract or treachery among friends—and leaves it to the second part of the structure mentioned above, the countervailing factors, to block the absurdity of criminalizing such conduct (Moore 1997, 2016). There is also considerable variation between legal moralists as to how “morality” is to be understood. Notably, Devlin’s understanding of morality is widely rejected by his successors. Below the flexibility of the approach will be emphasized. We return to the question of how the “morality” in “legal moralism” is to be understood in section 3.
2. Legal Moralism: Restrictive Factors that Can Defeat Prima Facie Wrongs
The defeating factors most heavily stressed by Devlin and Moore are privacy and liberty (Devlin 1965: 16–20; Moore 1997: 76–78). As far as privacy is concerned, consider adultery and fornication. Adultery remains a criminal offence in parts of the world including certain US states (Rhode 2016). Devlin takes the wrongfulness of adultery for granted, but nevertheless holds it inappropriate to criminalize it. Jeffrie Murphy reaches the same conclusion despite saying, along the same lines as Devlin:
It does not strike me as absurd…to suggest that the sexual revolution of the 60s, and the resulting freedom many men felt to abandon their marriages and family responsibilities for sexual and other forms of so-called self-fulfilment, generated considerable social harm—particularly for women and children. (J. Murphy 2006 [2012: 70])
From considerations like this there may be a prima facie ground to criminalize in some circumstances such moral wrongs, but the conduct—all things considered—should not be criminal in Devlin’s view or Murphy’s. The clumsy tool of legal coercion is hardly likely to help remedy any wrongs here, not to mention the undesirability of official surveillance of intimate relationships.
The privacy concerns defeat any prima facie right. A legal moralist position must attend closely to what is known about the potential effects on privacy of the criminal law. Such a view would find pertinent Lawrence Tribe’s suggestion as to what the question should be in Bowers v Hardwick—that is: not the question of what Hardwick “was doing in the privacy of his bedroom, but what the State of Georgia was doing there” (quoted in Suk 2009a: 689). More recently Jeannie Suk has explored the relationship between the criminal law and the value of privacy and intimate relationships. Though not writing from any self-declared legal moralist perspective the ideas illustrate the kind of balanced exploration that the legal moralist seeks. The criminal law in many jurisdictions—Suk’s focus is largely on New York County—showed, historically, a reluctance to enter the intimate space of the home at the heavy cost of enabling domestic abuse against women. This has been replaced in many jurisdictions, such as New York County, by the criminalization in various guises of domestic abuse. An improvement to be sure. However, Suk points to some complex resulting tensions “between protecting women from intimate violence” and respecting their “self-determination” (Suk 2009a: 690). Certain criminal law techniques, such as protection orders that seek the end of an intimate relationship can amount, she claims, to “state-imposed de facto divorce” (Suk 2009a: 685; 2009b) and to various contexts in which “the particular desires of individual women” do not “control” a particular area of their intimate lives (Suk 2009a: 690). Suk’s aim is not to deny that the criminal law should be used to criminalize and enforce specific laws against domestic abuse; the wrong (and harm) of domestic abuse remains a ground for such intervention. It is rather to focus on the delicate balances implied by legal enforcement of such wrongdoing against the value of privacy, intimacy, and self-determination and to evaluate certain specific legal techniques in the light of such a focus. It has led to numerous responses (see Suk 2009a, which contains reactions from eight commentators; on domestic abuse see also Friedman 2003, Dempsey 2009).
This approach to privacy is not one accepted by all legal moralists. The usual two-part structure of legal moralism—the wrongs and the countervailing factors—was noted above. Devlin and Moore treat privacy as a potentially defeating countervailing factor, an aspect of the second part of that structure as we have just seen. Duff, however, treats it as a criterion to determine what counts as a wrong before even reaching the question of countervailing factors, in other words as an aspect of the first part of that structure. For Duff, the criminal law is, or should be, limited to the definition and declaration of public wrongs; wrongness, for him, “is a reason for criminalization—but only if it is committed within the public realm” (Duff 2018: 100). In insisting on this, Duff is departing from Devlin’s claim:
that it is not possible to set theoretical limits to the power of the State to legislate against immorality. It is not possible to settle in advance exceptions to the general rule or to define inflexibly areas of morality into which the law is in no circumstances to be allowed to enter. (Devlin 1965: 12–13)
The “private realm” for Duff—which he aspires to define in advance, albeit not “inflexibly”—is precisely an area of morality into which the (criminal) law is not to be allowed to enter.
As for liberty, “there must be”, says Devlin, “toleration of the maximum individual freedom that is consistent with the integrity of society” (Devlin 1965: 16). “Toleration” only arises in relation to conduct of which one disapproves: toleration is not approval (Devlin 1965: 18; cf. Oberdiek 2001; Green 2008). He gives two examples—cruelty to animals and –the issue with which his view is most famously associated—homosexual sex and, as he puts it, the “general abhorrence of homosexuality” in the UK in the late 1950s and early 1960s (Devlin 1965: 17). As regards both, his question is: are they beyond toleration by the criminal law? Devlin’s answer is yes to the first and—although there is a widespread erroneous view on this in the literature—no to the second. In other words, liberty or freedom of human choice cannot defeat the prima facie right of society to criminalize cruelty to animals on grounds of its wrongfulness, but, in the case of consensual homosexual sex in private, it can (Devlin, Birmingham et al. 1965; cf. Devlin 1965: ix). On the latter issue, one might certainly disagree (to put it mildly) with the claim that the reason gay sex ought not to be criminalized is that it is within the bounds of toleration, for that implies that such conduct is morally wrongful in the first place. And one might also strongly doubt the plausibility of Devlin’s means of discerning where the boundary of maximum individual freedom lies—turning both on how widespread a moral belief is and on how intensely it is felt and believed. We will return below to these points when we consider how “morality” should be best understood in legal moralism (section 3). The point for now is to illustrate the structure of a legal moralism such as that of Devlin. In short Devlin took both animal cruelty and homosexuality to be prima facie morally wrong, but took the former all things considered to hold firm against liberty as a potential defeating condition, and the latter to be defeated by liberty (and other factors) when all things are considered. Moore in his brand of legal moralism also stresses the place of liberty. In his view, “there is always some reason not to legally coerce behaviour, namely, that to do so diminishes the opportunities of those coerced, diminishes the likelihood of autonomously chosen rightful behaviour etc.” (Moore 1997: 749; 2014).
There is a controversy here as to whether the negative liberty which Moore explicitly invokes (and which Devlin assumes) can ground the requisite prima facie reason against legal coercion (for scepticism see Tadros 2016b: 79–82 and the response in Moore 2016: 352). This raises the issue much explored in the philosophical literature of the extent to which liberty should be understood as “negative liberty” or “positive liberty” or some combination of the two (Carter 2019). Negative liberty, as Ian Carter puts it,
is the absence of obstacles, barriers or constraints. One has negative liberty to the extent that actions are available to one in this negative sense. Positive liberty is the possibility of acting—or the fact of acting—in such a way as to take control of one’s life and realize one’s fundamental purposes. (Carter 2019)
Amy Baehr blocks out how the negative/positive liberty distinction takes shape in liberal feminist writing, labelling approaches of the former kind “classical-liberal feminism”, and approaches of the latter kind as “egalitarian-liberal feminism” (Baehr 2021). As we saw in the previous subsection in relation to privacy, it is a sign of the potential flexibility of a broad legal moralist approach, that liberal-feminist accounts of freedom could potentially be deployed so as to yield potential defeating conditions for all-things-considered determinations in given cases of whether legal coercion can legitimately be deployed to counter an identified wrong. We touch on this issue again below (section 6.2).
2.3 The Crime Tariff
The legal moralist notion of defeaters—the conditions that can potentially defeat a prima facie reason to impose legal coercion on the basis of moral wrongdoing—should not be thought of as closed, but rather as flexible and subject to evolution or change. The notion fits comfortably with an established set of considerations that have been developed since the 1960s, based on the “crime tariff” and other mechanisms at work in the criminal law (Packer 1964, 1968; Moore 1997: 664). The idea of the crime tariff is that certain kinds of (perceived) wrongful behaviour will be engaged in, one way or another, whether it is criminal or not. That, of course, is not a conclusive objection to criminalization. If it were, the criminalization of murder or theft would be ruled out. However, if one looks at the predictable effects of criminalization of given wrongful conduct, it may make matters still worse than staying the hand of the criminal law. For one effect of criminalization is that the price of products (for example dangerous drugs) or services (for example sex work) will go up and will attract suppliers willing to break the law systematically and introduce a plethora of criminal gangs into societies, among other effects. The result may be worse than leaving well (or quite bad) alone. Michael Moore, for example, writes:
Prostitution… does not go away by being legislated against, as the experience of all societies has shown. By making it criminal, however, the supply is artificially restricted to those willing to engage in criminal behaviour, so that prices and profits are such as to draw in organized criminal activity. (Moore 1997: 664; cf. Flanigan & Watson 2020).
Devlin appeared to be anticipating this argument when pointing out a factor that needed to be weighed in considering whether abortion (which he appeared to assume was morally wrongful) should be, or should remain, criminal. Abortions, in certain circumstances, will be sought irrespective of whether the conduct is criminal. But, if criminal, they will be performed by amateur, unskilled “backstreet” practitioners, operating outside of legal regulation. This renders the procedure dangerous in a way it would not be if properly attested professionals were undertaking the procedure; and punishment may seem appropriate for anyone causing or risking such danger. However, the dangerousness of this conduct, said Devlin, is “largely” based on the facts that “it is illegal and therefore performed only by the unskilled” (Devlin 1965: 24). This again yields a factor of potential relevance—even to those who, like Devlin, believe abortion to be morally wrong. Whatever the conclusion, such a consideration is a factor to be weighed in the balance.
2.4 Self-Defeat and Other Forms of Defeat
There has been much research in the intervening decades on how norm-subjects will respond to any potential use of the criminal law. Will they endorse it, ignore it, seek to undermine it? All of this can make a difference to the wisdom of criminalizing in the first place. Tom Tyler has argued that to a large extent obedience to the law is based on what is perceived by people to be legitimate and to be respected. The extent to which people obey because threatened by legal sanctions is, by contrast, exaggerated (Tyler 2006). Paul Robinson stresses the need for laws to be made that do not stray too far from the norms already accepted by the people. For if they do, the people will not stigmatize the conduct, which may blunt or compromise the effectiveness of the norms in question (Robinson 2000). Similarly, legal officials may find various ways of underenforcing norms if they stray too far from those generally accepted, again blunting their efficacy. Bill Stuntz points to the phenomenon of “self-defeating crimes” (Stuntz 2000). A series of factors of the sort have most recently been examined by Jacob Barrett and Gerald Gaus (Barrett & Gaus 2020). The idea of potential defeating conditions is a highly flexible one, not a once-for-all set of conditions with any rigidity; the list will inevitably change and develop. A further issue of potential relevance to the question of what conduct should be criminalized (and how) focusses on the consequences of applying the criminal law in given areas. There is, for example, a differential impact of the criminal law on some races in many jurisdictions (Yankah 2019). One might add to a list of potential defeaters the problem that enforcement of a given proposed or current offence is not possible under current conditions in any tolerably fair way. In the United Kingdom, for example, the politician David Lammy has written a report on racial disparities across the criminal justice system and proposed a principle for government of “explain or reform”: if governments cannot provide an evidence-based explanation for apparent disparities, then reforms should be introduced to address them (Lammy 2017).
The above discussion emphasized the legal moralist’s defeating factors because of their importance to the position and because, as we have seen, legal moralism is sometimes misleadingly characterized without reference to them. It was also noted that Feinberg holds such factors to be of crucial importance to the version of the harm principle he endorses. Such factors will surely be largely ecumenical as between the rival approaches.
3. The Morality of Legal Moralism
As we have seen, Devlin took homosexuality and animal cruelty to be morally wrongful and therefore his reason for supporting the decriminalization of the first and the continued criminalization of the second was that they, respectively, ought to be tolerated and ought not to be tolerated (see footnote 5). Notably neither Devlin nor Hart addressed the question of why—in virtue of what—can it be asserted or denied that homosexuality is morally wrongful. For Devlin that is hardly to the point, for “what the law maker has to ascertain is not the true belief but the common belief”(Devlin 1965: 94). By contrast Devlin’s fellow legal moralist, Moore, would take Devlin’s support for decriminalization of homosexual sex to be the right result for the wrong reason; homosexuality, not being in any way morally wrong, should not be criminalized for that straightforward reason; the question of toleration should never arise (Moore 1997: 756; Corvino 2013; Pickett 2020).
Devlin’s account is a moral relativist one. He relativizes what is morally good to the beliefs of a given society (where “deeply felt and not manufactured”; Devlin 1965: 17). The attraction for Devlin of moral relativism was his belief that it would yield a morality generally of the society subject to it, without conceding “moral expertise” to any (elite) group of persons. He seemed to assimilate the “rationalist morality” he rejected to the views of an educated elite (Devlin 1965: 91–92). Since Hart’s critique, few have found the relativist aspect of Devlin’s account convincing (Hart 1963 [1982: 17–24]). Devlin’s view appears to exemplify what Bernard Williams styled as “vulgar and unregenerate” relativism (B. Williams 1972: 34, cf. Fricker 2013). Such relativism—as Williams paints it—is composed of three propositions:
- “right” means … “right for a given society” [also presumably by the same token: “wrong” means “wrong for a given society”];
- right[/wrong] “for a given society” is to be understood in the functionalist sense’ [i.e., for the persistence of that society]; and that
- (therefore) it is wrong for people in one society to condemn, interfere with, etc., the values of another society.
- (B. Williams 1972: 34–39, numbering added; cf. the distinction between “positive morality” and “critical morality” in Hart 1963 [1982: 17–24])
As noted above, Devlin affirmed the first of William’s propositions. In industrialized societies, Devlin tells us, it is generally true that monogamy “is built into the house in which we live and could not be removed without bringing it down” (Devlin 1965: 10). But this is merely a contingent truth and if our houses were built differently—around polygamy—the content of the law to be enforced could legitimately be the opposite of what it is (Devlin 1965: 114). As for the second, it is equally clear that Devlin understood wrongness “for a given society” in “the functional sense” of what threatened the persistence of that society. A society is constituted by its “common morality” or “moral structure” or “public morality” and its morality is as necessary to it as “a recognised government”, If a society’s morality is not sufficiently enforced the society will “disintegrate”; and the society accordingly has a right to defend itself against attacks on that morality (Devlin 1965: 10).
Devlin’s “disintegration argument” appears fatally wounded by Hart’s initial criticism of it. As Hart puts it, Devlin moves
from the acceptable proposition that some shared morality is essential to the existence of any society to the unacceptable proposition that a society is identical with its morality as that is at any given moment of its history, so that a change in its morality is tantamount to a destruction of society. (Hart 1963 [1982: 51])
The former claim is plausible if restricted to what Hobbes and Hume characterized as the moral minimum essential for social life:
rules restraining the free use of violence and minimal forms of rules regarding honesty, promise-keeping, fair dealing, and property. (Hart 1967 [1983: 258])
If these ceased to be enforced, it is likely that a different and more dangerous state-of-affairs would ensue; one might well say the original society had disintegrated. Hart can afford to concede this. Such a Hobbesian-Humean minimum is accounted for by the harm principle Devlin rejects. Devlin’s argument, however, needs the disintegration thesis to apply more widely, potentially to every crime of a community, be that to homosexuality, animal cruelty, bigamy, incest etc (to “every jot and tittle” as Hart puts it: Hart 1967 [1983: 258]). These need to be protected on pain of the disintegration of society. Since Devlin gives no empirical evidence linking the destruction of past societies with the non-enforcement of their rules, this appears not to be an empirical claim. But as a conceptual argument it is highly dubious. For as Hart says
Taken strictly, it would prevent us saying that the morality of a given society has changed, and would compel us instead to say that one society had disappeared and another one taken its place (Hart 1963 [1982: 51–52])
Only a claim of this strength seems able to support Devlin’s belief that any deviation from a society’s shared morality is an existential threat to it.
A different objection is this: to assimilate right and wrong with the question of a society’s survival assumes that the survival of a specific society is necessarily good. It may be true that if certain steps are not taken, the society will disintegrate. Apartheid in South Africa disintegrated. What if by a more sustained enforcement of its central racist elements it had managed to persist longer? Would this continued existence be underwritten by a moral right? Does anyone now owe the society the duty to restore the system or did such a duty lie for a period after its disintegration? The suggestions are absurd. The point of course is that some societies are so lacking in legitimacy that it may be for the best that they disintegrate and are replaced. Devlin goes too far when he says “What is important is not the quality of the creed but the strength of the belief in it” (Devlin 1965: 114). While his concern was the use of legal coercion within a specific society rather than with criticism of other societies, Devlin also appeared to hold to the third of Williams’ propositions above in seeking to exclude standards external to the beliefs of the society. Legal moralism, then, surely needs foundations other than those Devlin sought to provide.
This impression is buttressed by another concern about his account. For what is the status and basis of liberty and privacy, for example, in Devlin’s account? As we have seen he took them to be powerful enough to override certain immoralities in determining what should be criminalized. But what if the ordinary jury member or person on the Clapham omnibus just does not care that much about privacy or liberty? What if, say, they take the view that adultery should be criminalized never mind the very high cost to privacy? Should privacy and liberty be simply downgraded as a result? There is no indication that Devlin would accept such a conclusion or even that the possibility occurred to him. Similarly, Devlin took it that the law should be “perfectly impartial in matters of religion” and this seems in no way sensitive to whether or not the ordinary member of society endorses such impartiality (Devlin 1965: 62). He appears to take liberty and privacy and other defeaters as safeguards applicable independently of whether ordinary people would accept their validity. In this he appears to have been simply inconsistent.
What alternative foundations could legal moralism have if Devlin’s brand of moral relativism is to be rejected? In the light of Devlin’s stress on wrongdoing as a prima facie ground for legal coercion, one possibility might be an ethics of prima facie duty associated with W.D Ross (Ross 1930; Skelton 2012). And of course, any of the other numerous theories of what makes wrong action wrong—consequentialist, Kantian, natural law, rights-based, virtue ethics—could potentially form such a foundation (Timmons 2013). Michael Moore combines his legal moralism with a strong version of metaphysical realism (Moore 1997). Presumably, however, such strong metaethical commitments can be bracketed for the more specific questions raised by legal moralism. Jeremy Waldron for example suggests that an anti-realist or quasi-realist view, positing moral truth, albeit based ultimately on subjective sources “inside our own attitudes, desires, and natures”, could serve as well as an out-and-out realist view of Moore’s variety (Waldron 1999: 171). Again, while a legal moralist must surely reject a “vulgar” relativist view of Devlin’s stripe, it may not follow that a more sophisticated moral relativist grounding for legal moralism could not be attempted (Wong 2006; Rovane 2013; Velleman 2015; cf. Fricker 2013). Indeed Duff’s legal moralism is alleged by others to contain moral relativist commitments, a claim he himself rejects (Moore 2014: 199; Tadros 2016a: 121–128; Duff 2018: 232)
4. The Harm Principle
Far and away the best-known proposal for a principled limit to the law is the “harm principle” from John Stuart Mill’s On Liberty. The pivotal sentence of its most famous passage reads:
the only purpose for which power can rightfully be exercised over any member of a civilised community against his will is to prevent harm to others. (Mill On Liberty, Ch. 1, para 9)
Harm to others, can be contrasted with moral wrongfulness or immorality—the legal moralist’s starting point; with offence to others; and with harm to persons choosing to engage in, or consenting to, the relevant conduct (anti-paternalism). At least as far as Mill’s canonical statement is concerned, moralism, offence and paternalism are ruled out as legitimate bases for legal coercion. The State may legitimately stop A from beating up B, thereby limiting his freedom of action, because this prevents harm to B. And it may stop A from stealing from B for the same reason. But the State oversteps its proper limits on this view if it purports to stop A smashing up his own property; or to protect C from the distaste she will feel knowing that A is doing this. And it may not treat the wrongfulness of conduct, in the absence of any unconsented-to harm, as a basis for legal coercion: it may not for example prevent “bloody gladiatorial contests presented by voluntary performers before consenting audiences” (Feinberg 1984: 13). For the harm principle, says Mill, is “entitled to govern absolutely the dealing of society with the individual in the way of compulsion and control” (Mill On Liberty, Ch. 1, para 9)
In his four-volume work, the Moral Limits of the Criminal Law Joel Feinberg sets out to defend a version of the harm principle that he takes to be firmly in the spirit of Mill (Feinberg 1984, 1985, 1986, 1990).
The Liberal Position: The harm and offense principles, duly clarified and qualified, between them exhaust the class of good reasons for criminal prohibitions.
This is compounded, first, of Feinberg’s “harm to others” principle stating, as we saw in section 1:
Harm to others: It is always a good reason in support of penal legislation that it would be effective in preventing (eliminating, reducing) harm to persons other than the actor (the one prohibited from acting) and that there is probably no other means that is equally effective at no greater cost to other values. (Feinberg 1984: 26)
But Feinberg goes beyond Mill’s officially stated position in adding, secondly, the offense principle:
Offense to others: It is always a good reason in support of a proposed criminal prohibition that it is probably necessary to prevent serious offense to persons other than the actor and would probably be an effective means to that end if enacted. (Feinberg 1984: 26)
Though this “offense to others principle” goes beyond Mill’s canonical position, Feinberg believed there to be support in Mill’s writings for the addition of offense as a ground and in any case argued that there are independent grounds for thinking the addition of the offense principle strengthens the Millian position. The place of offense and relatedly “moral distress” remains controversial and has inspired an extensive literature (Feinberg 1985; Hart 1963 [1982: 46]; Waldron 1987 ; Simester & von Hirsch 2011: 99–140; Edwards 2019)
There is an important qualification to be made to Feinberg’s “harm to others” principle. One reason why one might want to treat harm as special is the yearning for a concept for practical use that is “simple, determinate” and “purely empirical” (Feinberg 1984: 214). Such a determinate empirical concept, if it exists, could function free of the controversies that usually attend normative concepts. Everyone, from vastly diverse cultures, philosophies and opinions could get behind it, without fear of compromising what they hold dear. It is clear, however, that Feinberg abandons any hope, if this ever was a feasible ambition, of blocking out any such purely empirical notion. Instead he builds into his harm principle a strong element of moral wrongfulness. As we have observed, his harm principle is designed to reject moral wrongfulness as a legitimating ground for legal coercion, but the crucial qualification here is that it rejects wrongfulness without more as a legitimate basis for legal coercion. Moral wrongs, however, remain highly significant to the account. For harms “produced by justified or excused conduct (‘harms that are not wrongs’)” are said by him not to count as “harms” for the sake of his harm principle. It is thus not any harm to others that constitutes a good reason in support of legal coercion. It is the harms that are produced by “morally indefensible conduct” that matter (Feinberg 1984: 215). In other words, the proponent of Feinberg’s harm principle must be highly concerned with moral wrongs and immorality, perhaps almost as concerned as the legal moralist.
On the one hand, this allows Feinberg to deal satisfyingly with a raft of potential counterexamples. Since, for him, a good reason for coercion will present itself only if the harm in question is wrongful, he can avoid designating as harmful setbacks to persons of the order of losing a professional tennis competition or of being driven out of business by a rival’s superior product, even if the consequences feel like, and are, terrible events in the lives of the individuals concerned. Be they so terrible they are not harms in the relevant sense for Feinberg, as they do not spring from any wrongdoing. On the other hand, the necessity of a moral wrong in his account of harms opens him up to potential criticism. For example, it might be claimed that it is the wrongs that are doing the essential explanatory work, while harm is a redundant or near-redundant addition. Or the strong moral wrongness element in the account might be taken as a tacit admission that the reason the relevant harms matter in the first place is that they are morally wrongful; and if that point goes through, the next question may be: why, then do wrongs that are not harms not also matter enough to form, on occasion (and subject to potential defeating conditions), a valid reason for legal coercion?
Feinberg, however, is clearly Millian in his rejection of paternalism.
Paternalism: It is always a good reason in support of a prohibition that it is probably necessary to prevent harm (physical, psychological, or economic) to the actor himself and that there is probably no other means that is equally effective at no greater cost to other values. (Feinberg 1984: 26–27; Feinberg 1986)
His strong anti-paternalism is not equally hostile to everything that might be described as legal paternalism. He distinguishes “soft paternalism” from “hard paternalism”. In many cases the forcible implementation of a person’s will can accord with his personal autonomy. Feinberg describes such cases as involving “soft paternalism” and contrasts them with those involving “hard paternalism” (Feinberg 1986: 26). It is the “hard” variety that Feinberg sets himself against, the forcible coercion of a person against her will for her own good. This he rules out on grounds of legitimacy. In fact, he does not believe that “soft” paternalism is really paternalism at all properly so-called and so stops short of adding it to his list of potentially legitimating reasons for legal coercion (G. Dworkin 2020).
Whether or not Feinberg broke significantly with Mill on the question of offense, a much larger break with Mill is evident in the respective defences of the harm principle offered by H.L.A Hart and Joseph Raz. Speaking of Hart, Devlin observed that he “mutinied” against Mill and “ran paternalism up the mast” (Devlin 1965: 132). Hart indeed accuses Mill of carrying “his protests against paternalism to lengths that may now appear to us fantastic” (Hart 1963 [1982: 32]). Furthermore, anticipating parts of the “Nudge” movement that emerged fully this century (Sunstein 2014), Hart speaks of
a general decline in the belief that individuals know their own interests best, and to an increased awareness that a great range of factors which diminish the significance to be attached to an apparently free choice or consent. (Hart 1963 [1982: 32–33])
Raz in turn speaks of his “ready embrace of various paternalistic measures”, asserting it is “senseless to formulate either a general pro- or a general anti-paternalistic conclusion” (Raz 1986: 422: Simester & von Hirsch 2011: Part IV; Stanton-Ife 2020: 211–220). The issue of paternalism is of considerable importance to the limits of the law, but for a deeper discussion beyond the brief remarks just made see the entry on paternalism (G. Dworkin 2020; cf. Hurd 2018; De Marneffe 2018; Conly 2018).
Hence Hart and Raz defend a “harm principle”, not a “harm to others” principle. Both nevertheless argue that it will often be the case that the state should not act paternalistically, only not in such a way that an exclusionary principle is merited. The dramatic differences between major proponents of the harm principle makes it misleading to speak of the harm principle as one principle, although one suspects the term is too far embedded in the debate to be dislodged. Therefore we continue to speak of the harm principle, though strictly speaking, there is more than one. The table below illustrates the divergence in the views of the leading thinkers associated with the harm principle. No one of them has an account with conclusions identical to any of the others (see also Edwards 2014). What unites them all is the rejection of legal moralism.
|Legitimate basis for coercion?||Harm to Others?||Offence to Others?||Harm to Self?||Legal Moralism?|
|Hart||Yes||Yes, can be||Yes, can be||No|
|Raz||Yes||No||Yes, can be||No|
5. What is Harm?
Proponents of the harm principle often proceed without supplying any definition or understanding of “harm”. Mill himself gives no explicit general definition of what he means by the word, satisfying himself with various examples, contextual stipulations and hints:
he seems throughout to think no further explanation is necessary, and to count on any literate speaker of English to accept his application of the word or of some proxy for it. (Brown 2017: 411)
As we will see, other writers consider they can detect in Mill one or more ways to define or understand the term. Perhaps, as well as relying on general linguistic intuitions, one can simply cite paradigm cases. These come easily to mind; harm as “broken bones and stolen purses” as Joel Feinberg puts it (Feinberg 1984: 214). Certainly, one harms others, on any folk understanding of the term, by killing, raping, beating, defrauding, or stealing. But the ordinary sense of harm may also suggest that a transitory pain is a harm and may also have rather porous borders with other normative concepts such as “wrong”, May there, then, be trouble ahead developing a sufficiently determinate, discriminating, and workable conception of harm for purposes of applying the harm principle?
5.1 Other-Regarding Conduct
Various definitions and understandings of “harm” have been offered. One derived from Mill takes harmful conduct to be “other-concerning” or “other-regarding conduct” and, conversely, harmless conduct is “self-regarding” (Mill On Liberty, ch. 1, para 9). Accordingly, if some actions have no social consequences, they affect only the actor and are therefore harmless. Hart seems discomforted enough by “critics” of this Millian suggestion to have been unwilling to adopt it himself across the board. He surely had James Fitzjames Stephen’s critique of Mill in mind among others (Stephen 1873 ). These critics, he says,
have urged that the line which Mill attempts to draw between actions with which the law may interfere and those with which it may not is illusory. “No man is an island”; and in an organised society it is impossible to identify classes of actions which harm no one or no one but the individual who does them. (Hart 1963 [1982: 5])
Despite seeming to take Stephen’s point against Mill, however, Hart goes on to adopt the other-regarding/self-regarding understanding in a limited context: so far, he says, as the “special topic of sexual morality” is concerned there may exist a realm or area of conduct that is harmless; here it does seem, “prima facie plausible that there are actions immoral by accepted standards and yet not harmful to others” (Hart 1963 [1982: 5]). It is not, however, clear how this understanding of harm is to be reconciled with Hart’s other uses of the term. For example, he discusses (sceptically) whether the “moral distress” of persons occasioned by the moral wrongdoing of others should count as harm to them (Hart 1963 [1982: 46]); cf. Waldron 1987 ); and he asserts that animal cruelty should be criminal, not pace Devlin to “enforce a moral principle”, but on account of animal suffering. If there is a coherent way of bringing these various understandings of harm together, Hart does not himself supply it.
5.2 A Setback to Interests
Another understanding of “harm” again takes its cue from Mill, this time from his many references to the “interests” of persons—for example: “insofar as these concern the interests of no person but himself” and “such actions as are prejudicial to the interests of others” (Mill On Liberty, ch. 5, para 2). The important distinction is not that which regards others versus that which regards oneself. It is that which is in the interests of others versus that which is in the interests of oneself. The seminal essay for this reading is from 1960 by John Rees (Rees 1960; cf. Saunders 2016), though Hart appears not to have been aware of it. Rees paved the way for Feinberg’s development of harm as “the setback of interests”. Hence, in addition to Feinberg’s addition of wrongfulness commented on above, Feinberg’s defines harm as “those states of set-back interest that are the consequence of wrongful acts or omissions by others” (Feinberg 1984: 215).
This Mill-inspired move of Rees and Feinberg, of defining harm in terms of interests, smacks of defining one unclear concept in terms of another unclear concept (Miller 2010: 119). The question of what is in a person’s interests—what is at stake for her—is itself a question that requires considerable elucidation. In Derek Parfit’s terms should we understand “interests” in “desire-fulfilment” terms, in “hedonistic” terms, or in accordance with an “objective list” which holds
certain things are good or bad for people, whether or not the people would want to have the good things, or to avoid the bad things? (Parfit 1984: 499)
Might one reasonably think that adjudicating the conflict between hedonistic, desire-fulfilment and objective list understandings of interests is an undertaking no less complex than the harm principle/legal moralism conflict itself? Take an “objective list” understanding of a person’s interests. According to Parfit this might include—as good for a person—“moral goodness, rational activity, the development of one’s abilities” and so on; and it might include—as bad for a person—being “deprived of dignity” (Parfit 1984: 499). If this is always or sometimes the best account of interests, the whole question of “moral harm” that the harm principle aims to expel is potentially reintroduced. The question of which account, or combination of accounts, is the most compelling is very much a live issue (Fletcher 2016).
5.3 A Setback to Autonomy/Prospect Harm
Another influential understanding of “harm” is that initially proposed by Raz: “To harm a person is to diminish his prospects, to affect adversely his possibilities” (Raz 1986: 414; Gardner & Shute 2000; Simester & von Hirsch 2011; Edwards 2014, 2019). Harm is essentially understood not as a setback to interests, but a setback to autonomy. Autonomy is essentially understood as the ability to choose between an adequate range of valuable options, while in possession of the appropriate capacities to make such choices and while sufficiently independent of others. There are plainly numerous ways one can set back such autonomy. The problem of explaining why pain is harmful raises its head again. Many would take the infliction of pain on another to be harmful, without waiting to ask if the victim has suffered any setback in her ability to choose between an adequate range of valuable options, which surely, she will often not have done. And what of Devlin’s case of harm to animals? Devlin is likely to pop up at this point to repeat his view that the reason we criminalize cruelty to animals is that it is morally wrong and no potential defeating factor is strong enough to overturn that judgement for purposes of criminalization. There is no need to establish any harm in the first place. Hart, as touched on above, while accepting harm must be part of the story, offered the avoidance of “suffering” as the ground for criminalizing animal cruelty. Setback to autonomy or prospect-harm, however, looks like a non-starter, for animals, though beings that can be harmed, are not autonomous beings, at least on any standard account. Similarly, severely mentally disordered persons may in some cases lack the capacity for autonomy, but it is plain as day that they can be harmed, something the “setback to autonomy” or “prospect harm” conception seems ill equipped to account for (Stanton-Ife 2010: 157–162; Tadros 2011).
One upshot of the varying, sometimes implicit, understanding of harm is surely that anyone propounding an argument based on the harm principle needs to be clear about how they are using the term “harm”. For the term may hide a host of questions that themselves need to be resolved.
6. Foundations of the Harm Principle
6.1 Utilitarian/Consequentialist Foundations
Moving on from questions of definition, what are the foundations of the harm principle? Mill, together with Jeremy Bentham and Henry Sidgwick, was one of three giants of nineteenth century utilitarianism. He declared utility to be the ultimate appeal on all ethical questions. Speaking of his harm principle, he also declared:
I forego any advantage which could be derived to my argument from the idea of abstract right, as a thing independent from utility. (Mill On Liberty, ch. 1.11 [1993: 79])
The harm principle sounds rather like the (foregone) stuff of abstract right, so how is utility to give any support to the harm principle? At first sight, the principle of utility looks like a straightforward rival to the harm principle, not its sturdy foundation. Mill held of the principle of utility that
actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. (Mill Utilitarianism, ch. 2.2 [1993: 7]
This last formulation seems to counsel states to keep their options open in their law-making. “Do what you can to reverse unhappiness”, the advice seems to be, “and do what you can to promote happiness”,
Coerce to prevent harm to others if that will reverse unhappiness; coerce for some other end if that will equally do the trick.
But as we have just seen, coercion to prevent harmless wrongdoing is ruled out by Mill, irrespective of whether such an action is the state’s best bet for reversing unhappiness.
The path to reconciling the harm principle with utilitarianism is often thought to be some form of indirect utilitarianism (Gray 1996; Mulgan 2007: 117–119). The distinction is drawn between a criterion of rightness and a decision procedure (Mulgan 2007: 117–119). Thus, on this indirect view the words “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness” is not any part of a decision procedure; it is a criterion of rightness. Sometimes, perhaps often, a criterion of rightness will itself feature heavily in a decision procedure. But at other times a decision procedure will not contain the supreme criterion of rightness. Acting always to promote happiness or minimize unhappiness may be self-defeating for various reasons or impossible in the practical circumstances of ignorance that ordinary people face. Over the course of a lifetime and across all the activities of a legal system, more utility will be produced and disutility avoided if the harm principle has the place Mill argues it has, despite the fact that this will repeatedly require the sacrifice of some utility in day to day legal dealings. Much of this, for Mill, relates to the importance of human liberty to happiness (Gray 1996: 136). Demonstrating that one can really derive something as strong as the harm principle (“to govern absolutely”) in this way is a formidable challenge. It is subject, among other things, to scepticism about the workability of the distinction between criterion of rightness and decision procedure (Griffin 1994; Mulgan 2007). John Gray’s book-long attempt to spell out how the harm principle can be underpinned by indirect utilitarianism came to be repudiated by Gray himself (Gray 1996: postscript) . Contemporary consequentialism, however, continues to flourish (Sinnott-Armstrong 2019); and many accounts of the harm principle still see a form of utilitarianism as the best grounding for the harm principle (Sumner 2004, 2011). Moreover, there are non-utilitarian writers making related arguments in support of the harm principle. Les Green for example argues that
There can be reasons to promulgate, and attempt to conform to, an absolute norm even if the reasons that justify having a norm in that field are defeasible. (Green 2013: 191)
Other accounts of criminalization maintain utilitarianism or a broad consequentialism but conclude the harm principle must be rejected (Petersen 2020a,b).
6.2 Perfectionist/Value-Pluralist Foundations
In recent years, value-pluralist perfectionism has been more influential than utilitarianism as a foundation for the harm principle, whether argued for explicitly or assumed (Raz 1986; Gardner & Shute 2000; Simester & Von Hirsch 2011; Edwards 2014, 2018 ). Joseph Raz’s classic work The Morality of Freedom contains a defence of the harm principle (Raz 1986; cf. Raz 1989—other leading accounts of perfectionism include Hurka 1993 and Sher 1997). Raz claims that
the autonomy-based principle of freedom is best regarded as providing the moral foundation for the harm principle. (Raz 1986: 400)
At first sight this may be surprising, given the openness of perfectionists to moral reasons in general, an openness that might suggest legal moralism is its natural home so far as the limits of law are concerned. Raz asserts that there is “no fundamental principled inhibition on governments acting for any moral reason” (Raz 1989: 1230, emphasis added). Even reasons that are not “neutral”, or not “public” or some such are not in principle excluded by perfectionism (cf. G. Dworkin 2007). Again: “It makes no sense to say of a state of affairs that it is good, but that fact is no reason to do anything about it” (Raz 1989: 1230). By the same token, presumably, one could substitute the word “bad” for “good” in the previous sentence and the proposition would remain accurate. Thus our starting point is that the law should have available to it any moral reason and has the function to promote the quality of life, including the moral quality of life, of those whose lives and actions the government can affect (Raz 1986: 415). This aspect of perfectionism is apt to make some fear the oppressive imposition of styles of life on unwilling individuals (Sher 1997: 106).
However, such alarmism cannot fairly be applied to a perfectionist view such as Raz’s. It is not that anything one might describe, rightly or wrongly, as a moral reason will do. Raz’s concern is limited to states with “autonomy-respecting cultures” and with what it is to live a good life in such societies. The key, as the phrase “autonomy-respecting culture” would suggest, is autonomy. It is a state’s primary duty in the relevant kind of society to promote, protect and foster the autonomy of all citizens. This requires—on Raz’s account—furnishing all with, or preserving for all, an “adequate range of valuable options”. It also requires seeing to it that persons have the appropriate mental and other capacities to be genuine choosers in conditions of freedom and independence (Raz 1986: 372–373).
Given, then, that Raz’s starting point is that there is no principled inhibition to the law deploying any valid moral reason, an account is plainly needed of how that can be reconciled with his support for the harm principle, a large part of the point of which is to rule out certain moral reasons. But before coming to that, it will be helpful to dwell on autonomy a little longer. In section 2.2 above, the familiar distinction between two kinds of liberty, negative and positive, and a similar distinction within liberal feminist writing, were noted. Autonomy-based accounts plainly go beyond negative liberty as the absence of obstacles, barriers or constraints, and embrace the notions of positive liberty, in terms of authorship (or part-authorship) of one’s own life, ability to choose between options, realize purposes within bounds as the case may be. Furthermore, autonomy is often contrasted with heteronomy. As Marilyn Friedman puts it,
heteronomy…involves behaving or living in accord with what is in some important sense not, or other than, one’s own. (Friedman 2005: 155, author’s emphasis)
There are at least two senses, as she continues, of heteronomy, one whose sources “arise within the self, considered in abstract social isolation;” the other whose sources “derive from interpersonal relations and the treatment of a self by others” (Friedman 2005: 155). The first sense is of course important. It relates, for one thing, to the very real problems that can emerge when an agent’s “desires, emotions, passions, inclinations, drives” are not in good order, or where the agent is addicted or in the grip or a compulsion (Friedman 2005: 155). However, for all its importance, Friedman argues that heteronomy in this sense has been the “almost exclusive” focus in mainstream philosophy. The sorts of heteronomy that are by contrast based on interpersonal relations and the way some agents are treated by others, has been largely neglected outside of liberal feminist circles, where “relational autonomy” has received considerable attention (Friedman 2005: 171; cf. Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000; Friedman 2003; Stoljar 2018). This has led to the underplaying of such phenomena of considerable importance to autonomy as male dominance. Interestingly, Friedman explicitly cites Raz’s account of autonomy as a rare exception to the neglect by the mainstream of the social or interpersonal aspects of autonomy ((Friedman 2005: 171).
Thus the criticism sometimes levelled at perfectionist accounts of the good life, government or law, that they imply the oppressive imposition of styles of life, looks unlikely to get much traction on a form of liberal perfectionism, such as Raz’s, with autonomy for all so embedded in it. This, however, does not explain how an account such as Raz’s can explain its adoption of an anti-moralist harm principle in tandem with its in-principle openness to all valid moral reasons. In other words, how can one derive an anti-moralist harm principle from a position that takes any valid moral ground as in principle available to the state and the law?
Raz’s answer focusses on the coercive means at the law’s disposal:
- There are no principled limits to the pursuit of moral goals by the law or the enhancement of the well-being of individuals on the part of the law.
- There are (nevertheless) limits to the means that can legitimately be adopted in promoting the well-being of people and in the pursuit of moral ideals (Raz 1986: 420; George 1993: 161–188).
His autonomy principle “permits and even requires governments to create morally valuable opportunities, and to eliminate repugnant ones” (Raz 1986: 417). It must, however, respect the harm principle in doing this. It must not use coercion to eliminate repugnant, wrongful opportunities if they are not also harmful in the relevant sense. Coercive interference is a special threat to autonomy. It often violates autonomy in two ways:
First it violates the condition of independence and expresses a relation of domination and an attitude of disrespect for the coerced individual. Second, coercion by criminal penalties is a global and indiscriminate invasion of autonomy. (Raz 1986: 418)
Let us consider both points, beginning with the second. In what sense is the use of coercion a “global and indiscriminate invasion of autonomy”? There is no doubt that sometimes it is. “Depriving a person of opportunities or of the ability to use them is”, as Raz says, “a way of causing him harm”. Again “frustrating [a person’s] pursuit of projects and relationships he has set upon” can cause harm (Raz 1986: 413). Raz alludes to the most common context for the invocation of the harm principle, namely the criminal law. Much behaviour that is criminalized is done under the threat of imprisonment and imprisonment can cut off a very large range of options; or it can reduce them considerably by various forms of disruption or destruction: of family life, deep personal relations, work opportunities, pursuit of valuable outdoor activities, political participation and so on. Richard Lippke distinguishes between the material and the symbolic dimensions of imprisonment. The symbolic dimensions relate to what message the fact of imprisonment conveys to the public and to the prisoner. The material dimensions break down into
- restrictions on freedom of movement,
- low levels of comfort and amenity
- idleness, especially a paucity of opportunities for labour,
- relative isolation from family members, friends, and the larger community,
- significant diminution of autonomy especially insofar as prisons subject their inhabitants to a degree of bureaucratic control which might be categorised as the “subservience of youth” and
- diminishment of privacy (Lippke 2008: 408; cf. Lippke 2007).
Though only one of Lippke’s six material dimensions explicitly mentions autonomy, all have some significant effect on it. Moreover, a similar point applies to the compulsory detention in certain circumstances of mentally disordered persons under the civil law. All of Lippke’s material dimensions can be present there too; and, while the symbolic dimensions of a criminal conviction and punishment are absent, the often-attendant stigma can compromise the autonomy of the detained mentally disordered person in question still further (Stanton-Ife 2012).
Raz, then, is right that coercion by criminal penalties can be “a global and indiscriminate invasion of autonomy”, However, there seem to be two problems with this as a basis for reconciling perfectionism and the harm principle. First, the scope of the justification seems significantly limited; while the criminal penalties can have such an effect, they often will not. For there are many more forms of criminal law coercion in regular use than imprisonment: fines, community service orders and electronic tagging orders are three examples. These methods short of imprisonment can affect options, without necessarily leaving the convicted criminal short of an adequate range of valuable options—in Raz’s terminology; the assault on autonomy will not in most be total or near-total. Take the last-mentioned example: the mandatory wearing of electronic tagging devices. There have been several high-profile cases of sports stars and other celebrities being required to wear such devices. An early example is the English soccer player, Jermaine Pennant. He broke into the first team of a top professional team—the stuff that most English lads’ dreams are made of!—but, soon after, was convicted of a drunk-driving offence. His sentence required him to wear an electronic tag but allowed him to play in top division games with his tag under his sock. Despite the cloud he was under he certainly did not appear to have an inadequate range of valuable options. The argument at best seems to support the deployment of the harm principle only where lengthy periods of incarceration are deployed or threatened.
Raz does acknowledge that “other forms of coercion may be less severe”. However, he adds that
they all invade autonomy, and they all, at least in this world, do it in a fairly indiscriminate way. That is, there is no practical way of ensuring that the coercion will restrict the victims’ choice of repugnant options but will not interfere with their other choices. (Raz 1986: 418–419)
Leaving the criminal law to one side, there are other legal contexts where Raz intends the harm principle to apply where this argument appears overstated. Consider tax. Of the operation of the harm principle in relation to taxation, Raz writes:
the measures I [support] avoid direct coercion for perfectionist causes. The coercion that they involve can be fully justified on the grounds of protecting and promoting individual autonomy. The simplest example is that of taxation. Taxation is coercive. It is justified in my view only inasmuch as it is useful for the promotion and protection of autonomy for all. (Raz 1989: 1232)
Raz takes taxation to be coercive (indirectly) and argues it should be raised only subject to the terms of the harm principle. But the derivation of a perfectionist harm principle here cannot be based on any “global and indiscriminate” invasion of autonomy, because tax—except in extreme cases where imposed oppressively—does not attack autonomy that hard and, if suitably progressive, should leave the person taxed with her abilities to choose between an adequate range of valuable options intact (Stanton-Ife 2017). Of course, taxation, conceived in this way, does not imply what Raz elsewhere describes as “a coercive imposition of a style of life” (Raz 1986: 161). This seems to reveal that a much more nuanced account of coercion, in its various manifestations, is required, not that coercion “in this world” is always “global and indiscriminate”,
The second problem with Raz’s (correct) observation that coercion by criminal penalties can on occasion be “a global and indiscriminate invasion of autonomy”, is summarized in the question “what follows when it is?” What does follow, surely, is that such coercion must shoulder a large burden of justification. What does not appear to follow is anything to do with what kind of valid moral reason—be it harm-based or wrong-based—should be doing the needed justificatory work. The perfectionist starting point, as we have seen, is that there are no principled limits to the pursuit of moral goals by the law. It is the job of the harm principle to provide them if the harm principle can be successfully derived. Pointing to global and indiscriminate coercion points us to something that requires justification, but not yet to what kind of justification is needed.
As noted above Raz has another argument for liberal perfectionism’s right to claim the harm principle for its own: namely coercion
violates the condition of independence and expresses a relation of domination and an attitude of disrespect for the coerced individual. (Raz 1986: 418)
Might this argument make up the slack? Gerald Dworkin counters that coercing someone based on their wrongful or immoral behaviour need not show disrespect for such a person, “but merely for his conduct” (G. Dworkin 2007: 447). Alternatively, if it be accepted that coercion is disrespectful and expresses a relation of domination, one might again ask why that is not true of someone one coerces out of harming others as much as it is true of coercing someone out of some morally wrongful conduct? In both cases, does the legitimacy of the coercion not turn on the presence of sufficient justification, be that harm-based or wrong-based? Furthermore, if the key argument for the harm principle is really based on respect for independence and opposition to domination, it may seem particularly puzzling to identify how it is really a harm-based argument at all. It is true that independence, is for Raz, part and parcel of his understanding of autonomy (Raz 1986: 377–378); and it is also true that he understands harm in terms of setbacks to autonomy. However, if the argument turns on independence alone, the question arises of whether it does not collapse into—or keep sufficient distance from—certain principles devised in explicit opposition to the harm principle, such as Arthur Ripstein’s “sovereignty principle”? Ripstein argues that conduct should not be legally coerced if it does not wrongfully interfere with the sovereignty of others (Ripstein 2006: 231; for critique, see Tadros 2011).
Raz’s “one simple reason” why “the harm principle is defensible in the light of the principle of autonomy”, viz. that “the means used, coercive interference, violates the autonomy of its victim” (Raz 1986: 418) runs into the difficulty that often coercion does not do that or does not do that very significantly, let alone globally and indiscriminately. Furthermore, where coercion does violate autonomy globally and indiscriminately, it is either wrongful all things considered or justifiable only on the basis of strong valid reasons, which may include (exclusively) wrongness-based reasons for all that is as yet established. Finally, to the extent that the argument turns on independence it is not clear that harm is really doing the work.
7. Public Reason
As we have seen, several leading legal writers—be they in favour or against—continue to take Mill’s harm principle in original or modified form to be “the dominant theory as to what limits on criminal legislation should be observed by liberal democratic states” (Moore 2017: 461). Katrina Forrester’s post-war history of liberal political thought, however, emphatically puts John Rawls, rather than Mill, at the centre (Forrester 2021); and Piers Norris Turner, in an essay on Mill and modern liberalism, opines that public reason liberalism—whose leading light is Rawls—has become the dominant tradition within liberal thought “over the past three decades” (Turner 2017: 576; cf. Turner and Gaus 2017; Rawls 1999; Quong 2018; Hartley & Watson 2018; Freeman 2020). However, the growing and highly sophisticated literature on public reason among specifically political philosophers has not yet—at least not to the extent that it has in relation to legal moralism and the harm principle—received the sustained study of writers as heavily steeped in the law as Feinberg, Hart or Devlin. Specific legal applications of the public reason approach are, however, already in existence (for example Flanders 2016) and the approach continues to develop.
The approach suggests a different limit of the law: that laws must in some sense be based on public reasons, not reasons harvested from, or based on, comprehensive moral, ethical or religious theories. We saw above that while Devlin, Moore and Hart all supported the decriminalization of gay sex, they did so on very different understandings. Devlin did not rule out circumstances, admittedly extreme ones, in which criminalization might be justifiable in virtue of the intensity and comprehensiveness of the beliefs of ordinary persons in a society. Moore and Hart, by contrast, did implicitly rule out criminalization in such circumstances. Moore because the moral truth of the matter is highly pertinent, indeed decisive—there being nothing morally wrong with gay sex—Hart, despite assuming the moral truth of the matter to be irrelevant—gay sex is not harmful, so the conclusion goes through whether such conduct is wrongful or not. Rawls for his part would no doubt agree with all three on the correctness of decriminalization. But he would seek to exclude, as did Hart and Devlin, any Moore-style or perfectionist appeal to a comprehensive moral understanding to determine the issue. Devlin for his part would have had Moore down as one of the “moral rationalists” whose views he wanted side-lined in favour of the reasonable citizen.
In one way, then, Devlin anticipates a major preoccupation of Rawls. Rawls did not, to be sure, take Devlin’s apparent view that the moral beliefs of a society constitute (its) moral truth. His was not a scepticism about the existence of moral truth, merely a determination to avoid “the zeal to embody the whole truth in politics” (Rawls 1999: 132–133, emphasis added). But both Devlin and Rawls demanded that political power and legal coercion should be justifiable to those subject to them, provided they are reasonable. Thomas Nagel similarly insists a state’s law must do better than just tell those with certain conceptions of the good that they are mistaken, which seems the implication of Moore’s and of the perfectionist view; something more must be offered to them relating, he argues, to the point of view of such persons. According to him we must support:
… the exclusion of certain values from the admissible grounds for the application of coercive state powers. We must agree to refrain from limiting people’s liberty by state action in the name of values that are deeply inadmissible in a certain way from their point of view. (Nagel 1991: 155)
Devlin and Rawls, however, differed in how justification to reasonable citizens should be spelt out and it is here that Rawls develops much of his account. Devlin’s model of the reasonable person was the jury. To the question how the lawmaker is to ascertain the moral judgements of society, Devlin answered,
the moral judgement of society must be something about which any twelve men or women drawn at random might after discussion be expected to be unanimous. (Devlin 1965: 15).
To insist, as both do, that justification must be targeted at the reasonable citizen is to idealize the agreement on which their views were based (Raz 1990 ; Enoch 2013; Billingham & Taylor forthcoming), since neither is saying one should simply seek the acceptance of (all) the citizens as they are, reasonable or not. Insisting on the actual agreement of citizens as they actually are is likely to prove excessively demanding, since too much of the rough must be taken with the smooth, accommodating misanthropic, misogynistic, egotistical, anarchic etc views. Devlin does not idealize a great deal, or at least he does not spell out in any detail how he understands what “reasonable” means, beyond insisting the reasonable jury-member must not hold “irrational” beliefs, such as “homosexuality is the cause of earthquakes” (Devlin 1965: viii). In stating one can notionally pick “twelve men or women at random” he appeared to think that a sample of the population is an adequate pointer to the appropriate morality. Here there is a stark contrast with Rawls. For taking a random sample of the population is to underemphasise moral disagreement, as Rawls would see it. It is not reasonable to think that moral disagreement will disappear in the medium- or even the long-term. And much of this disagreement cannot simply be blamed on the bloody-mindedness of some or on those biased in favour of themselves, their families, or groups. Some of the disagreement is based, rather, on differences over what evidence is appropriate, how much weight should be given to the evidence where it can be agreed upon, how priorities and choices should be made among the vast range of possible values and so on. Rawls describes factors such as these as “the burdens of judgment” (Rawls 1993: 56–57). Hence Rawls idealizes the constituency to whom legal coercion must be justified inter alia as the persons who accept the burdens of judgement and the resulting fact of reasonable pluralism.
The idealization involved in the public reason approach is controversial. There is scepticism in some quarters that there really is any genuine “middle way” between “actual (including implied) agreement and rational justification” (Raz 1990: 46). If too many constraints are built in, the very idea of justification-to a given constituency disappears. The leading natural law theorist John Finnis, writes:
Natural Law theory is nothing other than the account of all the reasons-for-action which people ought to be able to accept, precisely because these are good, valid and sound as reasons. (Finnis 1996: 10–11).
Natural law, theory, is a paradigm “comprehensive” doctrine, however, precisely what is to be avoided in Rawls’ view. If justification-to ends up meaning only giving good reasons to a certain constituency, the idea has all but evaporated.
Another contrast with Devlin’s members of the jury, is that Rawlsian public reason is not simply a matter of getting a sample of the people into a notional room and waiting for them to agree, however that is to be done. Public reason is itself a substantive framework to be shared by everyone, a module, “a complete political conception” whose principles and ideals are to be elaborated and whose arguments are to be deployed in legal argument (Rawls 1999: 138). It has content, in other words, “given by a family of reasonable conceptions of justice” (Rawls 1999: 132). While, as we have just noted, a natural law or Roman Catholic world view cannot itself be adopted under public reason, its conception of the common good or solidarity when “expressed in terms of political values” can be one grounding for a political conception that gives content to public reason (Rawls 1999: 142). For interesting explorations of the relationship between religious comprehensive doctrines and public reason, see, e.g., An-Na’im 2015, Billingham 2021.
Two kinds of issue of special concern to questions of the limits of law concern, first, the scope of public reason and, secondly, its capacity to account convincingly for certain apparently easy cases of legitimate legal coercion. As for the first, Rawls restricts public reason to “constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice” (Rawls 1999: 133). Is it convincing to thus limit public reason? In the eyes of some Rawls is too permissive about important matters of (non-basic) justice and fairness beyond the constitutional essentials and the basic aspects of justice. Jonathan Quong for example objects to Rawls’ openness to perfectionist values so far as “large resources to grand projects in the arts and sciences” are concerned (Quong 2011: 281; Stanton-Ife 2020).
Secondly, how well does the public reason view handle certain obviously legitimate uses of legal coercion, such as the criminalization of murder and rape? While there is no doubt that a Rawlsian public reason module, duly developed, would straightforwardly deliver the bare bones of coercive laws against murder and rape, can this be done fully and satisfactorily without the sort of recourse to comprehensive moral and metaphysical doctrines Rawls wishes to rule out? Take murder as an example. Standardly murder requires proof of at least causation of death with an intention to kill and penalties are among the severest, stretching in various jurisdictions to mandatory life imprisonment or, in some, to capital punishment. But how is “death” in “causation of death” to be understood? It is common to understand it in terms of the cessation of brain stem functioning. But why this understanding? For some putative victim may have irrevocably lost the capacity for consciousness while his or her brain stem continues to function. Is not the wrong of murder truly captured not only when the brain stem ceases functioning, but (possibly before that) when there is such “irrevocable loss of the capacity of consciousness” (Persson 2002; De Grazia 2017: 4.3)? For, one might say, it is the latter that explains what is horrific about murder. Someone who intentionally brings about the permanent cessation of the brain stem functioning of another should not be thought of as a murderer, the argument goes, where the capacity for consciousness of the victim is already known to have been irrevocably lost. Perhaps such conduct ought still to be criminal and labelled as such, only not as murder meriting the mandatory life sentence. The point for present purposes is not to settle the question of what the best understanding of murder should be, or whether the imaginary case should count as murder, only to suggest that these issues are likely to turn, implicitly or explicitly, on comprehensive moral and metaphysical understandings. Public reason will be insufficient-or so the challenge would run (Tadros 2012: 77). Somewhat relatedly is Rawls’ account of abortion—he argues for a “duly qualified right” on the part of a woman “to decide whether or not to end her pregnancy during the first trimester” (Rawls 1993: 243). Whether Rawls is entitled to this conclusion on the basis of public reason has been hotly contested (see the varying perspectives of George 1997 [1999: 209–213]; J. Williams 2015; Kramer 2017: 92–155; Laborde 2018; Chambers 2018; Arrell 2019).
8. Other Directions: Legality, a “Modal Kind” and Coercion
In the Introduction a distinction was drawn between conceptual and evaluative questions about the relationship between law and morality; and it was said that the limits of law is generally taken to be a strictly evaluative question. The term “law” is generally left largely unanalysed, with the emphasis on the law’s coercive means and the extent to which it may legitimately be deployed in the pursuit of moral ends. But will be seen, there are some approaches sceptical of the distinction’s importance to our understanding of the limits of law.
It is uncontroversial to say that a (further) kind of limit of law is that contained in the idea of legality. Lon Fuller famously identified eight “desiderata” for laws. Laws should be general; they should be promulgated to their norm-subjects; and they should be prospective. They should be understandable (perhaps with professional help); the obligations they impose should be susceptible to being jointly fulfilled; and they should not require anything beyond the capacities of their norm-subjects. Laws should be tolerably stable and, finally, they should actually be upheld by the relevant legal officials, rather than ignored, bypassed or replaced by what the officials applying them consider more congenial standards (Fuller 1964; Rundle 2012: Ch. 4; Waldron 2016 ; Sunstein & Vermeule 2020). Kristen Rundle and Jeremy Waldron both argue that the legal positivism of Hart and Raz, as well as a broader instrumentalism that would take in Devlin, is too casual and accommodating in allowing the designation “legal system” and “law” to systems and norms that fall short on the criteria of legality (Waldron 2008: 14; Rundle 2012: 202). This implies that one cannot simply take the question of the limits of law to be an evaluative question. This would underestimate the extent to which supposedly conceptual questions about the existence of legal systems and laws are themselves evaluative questions. Hence the limits of the law should be seen squarely as both an evaluative and a conceptual question. Against this, while granting that conceptual questions matter and are themselves a large focus in the philosophy of law, one might wonder how far they matter to the specific issue of the limits of the law. If it is accepted for example that Fuller’s desiderata for legality or something close to them are indeed desiderata as well as to some extent conceptual features of the law (as does Raz 1977), does it greatly matter that one might conceive of such features as conceptual to a still greater extent?
It is widely said by those sympathetic to the instrumentalist understanding of law that law is a “modal kind” rather than a “functional kind”, distinguished by its means (or techniques) rather than its ends; the moral legitimacy of such ends being contingent (Green 1996: 1711). In the words of John Gardner:
[T]o say that law is a modal as opposed to a functional kind is merely to say that law is not distinguished by its functions—by the purposes it is capable of serving. It is distinguished rather by the distinctive means that it provides for serving whatever ends it serves. Law is what Kelsen memorably called a “specific social technique” (Gardner 2012: 195–220, 207; cf. Kelsen 1941; Summers 1971).
The idea of the legal techniques, developed by Robert Summers, from both the positivism of Hans Kelsen and the anti-positivism of Fuller, points however to a line of thought about the limits of the law that is surely due a revival. The debate as it is mostly prosecuted is too dominated by the one “technique” of coercion. While giving coercion its due Summers also emphasized
educational effort, rewards and other incentives, symbolic deployment of legal forms, publicity (favourable or adverse), continuous supervision, public signs and signals, recognized statuses and entities
grants with strings attached. (Summers 1977: 126)
There is also growing awareness at a theoretical level of the importance of expressive values in the law (McAdams 2015). It is something of a loss that the schema developed by Summers and his collaborators, dividing legal techniques into “grievance-remedial”, “penal-corrective”, “administrative-regulatory”, “public-benefit conferral”, “facilitator of private arrangements”, appears to have fallen largely into disuse (Summers et al. 1986). For it allowed various areas of potential legal concern to be examined against a background of various legal techniques, coercive and beyond. Rawls’ question of how far such techniques should be subject to public reason is a further issue that might helpfully be pressed.
The law’s task, put abstractly, is to secure a situation whereby moral goals which, given the current social situation in the country whose law it is, would be unlikely to be achieved without it, and whose achievement by the law is not counter-productive, are realized. (Raz 2003 [2009: 178])
This remark could be taken as the essence of legal moralism. The basic core of legal moralism, as we have seen, is a two-part structure, compounded of a wrong and a set of countervailing and potentially defeating factors, such as liberty and privacy. From within legal moralism there are controversies over how morality should itself be conceived and controversies over how the first part of the structure should be conceived—all moral wrongs or only a subset of them?—and the second part—which countervailing factors, for example, make the list? And what, if anything, unifies them? While Raz’s remark may serve as a pithy statement of legal moralism, Raz himself rejected legal moralism, in favour of a version of the harm principle. Mill’s original harm principle was based on a monistic utilitarianism. There remain adherents of such a utilitarianism, but more influential today is some version of value-pluralism, such as Raz’s liberal perfectionism. The derivation of the harm principle from such pluralistic premises, is as we have seen, a far from straightforward task. Adherents of the harm principle also manifest a strong divide between those who broadly inherit Mill’s principled anti-moralism without his anti-paternalism, such as Hart and Raz and those who inherit both Mill’s principled anti-moralism and his anti-paternalism, such as Feinberg. Into the mix comes Rawlsian public reason. Like one kind of legal moralist, there is an emphasis on steering the justification of legal coercion to the citizens subject to the coercion themselves and from this an aspiration to develop a “module” of political practical reasoning, the public reason of all subjects of a given legal system independent of the comprehensive ethical or religious commitments of some of their number. For the proponent of public reason it is the “zeal to embody the whole truth” that is anathema (Rawls 1999: 132–133). To legal moralists such as Moore, the moral truth, with due sensitivity to the countervailing factors, should rather be the point. The idea that the law has sometimes no limits to hold back the moral truth—which of necessity must lie in the mouth of some (fallible) human—can induce a feeling of vertigo. Perhaps the question ultimately turns on whether there is a genuine alternative.
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- Stanton-Ife, John, “The Limits of Law”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2021 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2021/entries/law-limits/>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
I am very grateful to Les Green, Julie Dickson and the SEP editors for various kinds of invaluable help and to Joseph Raz, Liam Murphy, Grant Lamond, Dori Kimel and Alan Bogg for their helpful comments on the original version.