Notes to Luther’s Influence on Philosophy

1. Just to give one telling example: Max Weber’s central text The Protestant Ethic and the Spirit of Capitalism (1905), which perhaps did more than any other to encourage an awareness of the intellectual and cultural significance of Protestantism, famously gives Calvin the key role rather than Luther: see, for example, Weber 1992: 56: “Now Calvinism was the faith over which the great political struggles of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries were fought in the most highly developed countries, the Netherlands, England, and France”. Philosophical thinkers who come under Calvin’s influence more specifically would include Thomas Reid (1710–1796) and Jonathan Edwards (1703–1758), as well as contemporary so-called “Reformed epistemology”.

2. See, for example, Beck 1969: 101:

Since neither a science of nature not a science of man was called for [by Luther], and philosophical instruments were not developed to adjust the deep tension between the secular and sacred powers, Luther’s immediate effect on the content of philosophizing was negligible. Philosophy grows from a conflict of values and a conflict of opinions only when these conflicts are examined in the light of reason. When they are not, there is no dialectic; there is heresy-hunting but no philosophy. For the latter, Germany had to turn to others, and it turned first to Luther’s lieutenant [Melanchthon].

3. I will not here consider what might be called Luther’s “negative” influence: namely, his influence on those thinkers who saw him as simply an object of critique, where such thinkers are naturally enough primarily to be found in the Catholic tradition: see for example Maritain 1925 [1928].

4. See Hobbes 1688:

The persecuted faith recovered strength with the proclamations of Luther
who, speaking with a great voice, reached the people,
And cut the net of the Pope in more than a hundred places; nets that
had been woven, but badly woven, by the famous Schools (1688 [2008: 573])

not want Faith to be a slave…
So, as it rose, the new doctrine of the Saxon Luther shook off the spiritual yoke of the Pope. (1688 [2008: 577])

In an anonymous 1722 paraphrase, which departs from the text of 1688, these lines are made even more dramatic:

But Luther once from German coasts will come,
To blast the honours, and the pomp of Rome;
He’ll fetch their pious frauds to public show,
And with his Saxon thunder strike them low; (Hobbes 1722: 130–31)

When Luther first, in Saxon realms, arose,
To rouse the faith, in many parts, he rends,
Their frauds exposes, and the faith defends;
Explodes their old prevaricating rules,
Taught by the Fathers and upheld by Schools; (1722: 181)

So when the morning of the Gospel shone,
And mists of Roman ignorance were flown,
Luther (great man) the Papal fetters broke,
And rescued Lands threw off the heavy yoke. (1722:184)

5. For a full discussion of this debate, which sets it in historical context, see Jackson 2007. Selections from works on both sides can be found in Hobbes and Bramhall 1999.

6. Hobbes 1656, §12 [1841: 115]:

That which men make amongst themselves here by pacts and covenants, and call by the name of justice, are accordingly whereunto men are counted and termed rightly just and unjust, is not that by which God Almighty’s actions are to be measured or called just, no more than his counsels are to be measured by human wisdom.

Cf. WA 18:729–30/LW 33:206–7.

7. See Overhoff 1997: 606–7 for a summary of this debate, with further references.

8. See WA 18:711/LW 33:179, where Luther speaks of “the omnipotent mover” [omipotens actor].

9. See Heidelberg Disputation WA I:354/LW 31:40: “Free will, after sin, exists in name only, and as long as it does what it is able to do, it commits a mortal sin”.

10. In a letter to Duke Johann Friedrich in 1679, Leibniz identifies this as the second part of a theological project with three parts, the first of which is to demonstrate the existence of God, and the third is to establish the divine ordination of the church:

The second part was to be about the Christian religion, or revealed theology, where I sought to demonstrate the possibility of our mysteries and to meet all the objections of those who claim to show the absurdity and the contradictions in the Trinity, the Incarnation, the Eucharist, and the resurrection of the body… We must reply to objections in order to satisfy ourselves entirely, since a single impossibility proved of our mysteries would destroy the whole structure. (Leibniz 1976: 260)

11. The doctrine of transubstantiation claims that there is a change of substance from bread and wine to the body and blood of Christ while the accidents of bread and wine remain; the doctrine of real presence makes no such claim about a change of substance and merely holds that the body and blood of Christ is substantially present when the Eucharist is celebrated.

12. For a recent attempt to argue for the significance of Leibniz to Lutheran theology, see Hinlicky 2009.

13. Pietism had also had an influence on Thomasius, and would have an impact on some of those who came after Kant, such as Hamann, Jacobi and Novalis, as well as Kierkegaard. For further discussion see Barnett 2011.

14. For more on the role of Pietism in Kant’s upbringing and education, see Kuehn 2001: 34–41 and 65–85. Kuehn’s view is that

it is unlikely that Pietism had any fundamental and lasting influence on Kant’s philosophy. It is even doubtful that the Pietism of his parents left any significant traces on Kant’s intellectual outlook, even if Kant’s earliest biographers suggest that it did. (2001: 39)

15. Hegel 1821 [1991: 22]

It is a great obstinacy, the kind of obstinacy which does honour to human beings, that they are unwilling to acknowledge in their attitudes [Gesinnung] anything which has not been justified by thought—and this obstinacy is the characteristic property of the modern age, as well as being the distinctive principle of Protestantism. What Luther inaugurated as faith in feeling and in the testimony of the spirit is the same thing that the spirit, at a more mature stage of its development, endeavours to grasp in the concept so as to free itself in the present and find itself therein.

16. See Hegel 2011: 503:

This principle of spiritual freedom was preserved in the inwardness of the German spirit. All the other peoples ventured forth to the East Indies, to India, and to America, to achieve worldly sovereignty, as for example, did Spain. Whereas in Germany there emerged a simple monk who was conscious that the this is to be found in the deepest recesses of the heart, in the absolute ideality of inwardness….

17. See Assel 2014: 553:

[Hegel] could not have known essential documents from Luther’s early theology of the cross (Romans commentary, Operationes in Psalmos, “Anti-Latomas”), but his early writings and his Phänomenologie des Geistes present dialectical models (e.g. the reconciliation through Jesus’ crucifixion and the ontology of the person crucified) which objectively, and properly, claim to be a legacy of Luther’s theology.

18. See Heidelberg Disputation, theses 19 and 20:

The man who looks upon the invisible things of God as they are perceived in created things does not deserve to be called a theologian. But the man who perceives the visible rearward parts of God [visibilia et posteriora Dei] as seen in suffering and the cross does, however, deserve to be a theologian. (WA 1:354/LW 31:40, translation modified in line with McGrath 1985: 148)

19. See Hampson 2017: 5:

Conceiving of the person relationally, Luther knows himself as the other reflects him back to himself, that “other” being in his case God. Hegel will come out of this tradition.

See also Hampson 2017: 7:

In the Preface to his Phenomenology, Hegel conceives of the self as in itself a relation, formed in a social context, rather than persons being possessed of a substantial, ontological nature. His metaphor of the master and the slave posits that it is through the “other” (whether the individual or the social context) that self-identity is achieved.

As Susanne Herrmann-Sinai has mentioned to me, Hegel’s language of “master” or “lord” [Herr] and “slave” or “servant” [Knecht] used in that dialectic in the Phenomenology is also to be found in Luther’s own famously dialectical claim in the Freedom of the Christian:

A Christian is a perfectly free lord [ein freier Herr] of all, subject to none. A Christian is a perfectly dutiful servant [ein deinstbarer Knecht] of all, subject to all. (WA 7:21 (German), 7:49 (Latin)/LW 31:344)

20. Houlgate makes this general claim about Hegel in Houlgate 2006: 60–66. He makes the connection to Luther in 2015: 26.

21. See Hegel 1798–99 [1971: 244]:

To complete subjection under the law of an alien Lord, Jesus opposed not a particular subjection under a law of one’s own, the self-coercion of Kantian virtue, but virtues without lordship and without submission, i.e. virtues as modifications of love.

22. To mention some that have been relevant to considerations of Hegel’s philosophy of religion and his philosophy more generally: the Lutheran claim that “finitum capax infinitii” (“the finite bears the infinite”); Luther’s translation of Philippians 2:7 as relating to Hegel’s conception of “self-emptying” (Entäußerung); that the priesthood of all believers implies “God existing as community”; the relation between the theology of the cross and the death of God, and its relation to Hegel’s portrait of the “unhappy consciousness”. For some further discussion of theological themes in Hegel, and how some relate to Luther, see Asendorf 1982, Jaeschke 1986 [1992], Maurer 1996, Merklinger 1993, O’Regan 1994, and Thaidigsmann 1983.

23. See also Novalis 1799 [1996: 66]:

Luther generally treated Christianity in an arbitrary manner, misunderstood its spirit, and introduced another law and another religion, namely the universal authority of the Bible. In this manner another alien, earthly science—philology—interfered with religious concerns, and its corrosive influence has been unmistakable ever since. From the dark feeling of his error, a large part of the Protestants elevated Luther to the rank of an evangelist and canonized his translation./This decision was fatal for the religious sense, since nothing destroys its sensibility as much as the dead letter.

24. For further discussion, see Fabro 1984; Hampson 2001: Chapter 7; Barrett 2002, 2015; Hinkson 2001; and Kim & Ramussen 2009.

25. Kierkegaard KJP: 3, frag. 2518 (p. 82, 1850):

Luther’s true successor will come to resemble the exact opposite of Luther, because Luther came after the preposterous overstatement of asceticism; whereas he will come after the horrible fraud to which Luther’s view gave birth.

26. Kierkegaard KJP: 2, frag. 1904 (p. 349, 1851):

O Luther, Luther, alas, the Reformation went as easily as it did because the “secular mentality” understood “this is something for us”. O, you honest man, why did you not suspect how sly we human beings are!

27. Kierkegaard claimed in 1847 never to have previously “really read” anything by Luther (KJP: 3, frag. 2463 [p. 64, 1847]), and thereafter when he did, he seems to have concentrated on the sermons.

28. The Freedom of the Christian WA 7:69/LW 31:371:

a Christian lives not in himself, but in Christ and in his neighbour. Otherwise he is not a Christian. He lives in Christ through faith, [and] in his neighbour through love. By faith he is caught up beyond himself into God. By love he descends beneath himself into his neighbour.

29. Kierkegaard 1876 [1990: 169]:

… Luther, the superb teacher of our Church, continually points [this] out as belonging to true Christianity: to suffer for the doctrine, to do good and suffer for it, and that suffering in this world is inseparable from being a Christian in this world.

30. See Kierkegaard 1992: 416: “In our time, a person would be regarded as a lunatic if he entered a monastery, were one established”. But also:

There is no doubt that our age and Protestantism especially may need the monastery again or that it should exist. “The monastery” is an essential dialectical element in Christianity; therefore we need to have it out there like a buoy at sea in order to see where we are, even though I myself would not enter it. (Kierkegaard KJP: 3, frag. 2750 [p. 211, 1847])

31. Kierkegaard KJP: 3, frag. 2503 (p. 76, 1849):

I also wonder if Luther ever dreamed when he got married that this would eventually go so far that a pastor would almost think that if he only married he then would have done all that God required of him.

32. For more detailed discussion of the latter, see Palmer 2017.

33. Kierkegaard KJP: 1, frag. 7 (p. 5, 1850):

[T]he concept of the absurd is precisely to grasp the fact that it cannot and must not be grasped. This is a negatively determined concept but is just as dialectical as any positive one. The absurd, the paradox, is composed in such a way that reason has no power at all to dissolve it in nonsense and prove that it is nonsense; no, it is a symbol, a riddle, a compounded riddle about which reason must say: I cannot solve it, it cannot be understood, but it does not thereby follow that it is nonsense.

Kierkegaard explicitly refers to Leibniz on this point at KJP: 3, 3073 (p. 399–400), from his notes on the Theodicy which he recorded in 1842–43. For further discussion of the relation between Kierkegaard and Leibniz, see Løkke and Waaler 2009.

34. For discussion of Nietzsche’s Lutheran (and Pietist) upbringing, see Pernet 1995 and Fraser 2002: 31–44. Richard Hollingdale has claimed that six key ideas later to be found in Thus Spake Zarathustra can be traced back to this upbringing: amor fati, eternal recurrence, will to power, live dangerously, great noontide, and superman (Hollingdale 1961: 27–9). For some criticism of Hollingdale’s claims, see Fraser 2002: 40–1.

35. Nietzsche, Beyond Good and Evil (1886: §164 [1966: 91]:

Jesus said to his Jews: “The law was for servants—love God as I love him, as his son! What are morals to us sons of God!”

36. There is also some reflection on Luther in the work of Antonio Gramsci (1891–1937), though this is largely from the perspective of the historical impact of the Reformation more generally. For some further discussion, see Adamson 2013.

37. Theodor Adorno (1903–1969) also accuses Luther of being the “inventor of inwardness” (1951 [2005: 135]), an invention which was ultimately to lead to

a mock image of an inner realm in which the silent majority tries to get compensation for what it misses out for in society

so that

[a]ll this tends to make interiority increasingly shadowlike and insubstantial. (1970 [1984: 169])

In the same passage, Adorno also calls Kierkegaard “the founder of inwardness” (1970 [1984: 170]), which was a central theme of his early work Kierkegaard: Construction of the Aesthetic (1933 [1989]). This implies that Adorno saw Kierkegaard as standing in this Lutheran tradition.

38. See also Edmund Schlink 1955: 6: “Heidegger’s existential analytic of human Dasein is a radical secularization of Luther’s anthropology” (cited Van Buren 1994: 159).

39. See Hampson 2017: 1:

It may be contended that the Reformation—and specifically Luther’s thought—both arose from and helped to bring about a paradigm shift in Western history to modernity.

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