Luther’s Influence on Philosophy

First published Wed Jul 22, 2020

The aim of this entry is to outline the impact of Martin Luther (1483–1546) on the philosophical tradition which came after him. The Protestant Reformation as a whole undoubtedly had considerable influence in philosophy and not just theology, not least because many key philosophical figures were themselves part of this religious heritage in its various forms, as well as being caught up in the major social and political changes and conflicts that the Reformation unleashed. However, to trace the influence of Luther himself specifically is a more complex exercise, in part because other central Reformation figures such as Philip Melanchthon (1497–1560) and John Calvin (1509–64) had their own impact;[1] at the same time, the Reformation itself took on a range of different forms even in Luther’s own lifetime and more strongly afterwards, many of which departed from Luther himself on key issues, despite various attempts to arrive at some uniformity of doctrine. This complexity, combined with the feeling that Luther was in some sense an “anti-philosopher” because of his hostile remarks concerning the discipline, Aristotle, and reason, have led Luther’s influence within philosophy to be rather neglected.[2] Nonetheless, the impact of his thinking on “modernity” more generally has been much discussed (see §6), while recent scholarship has suggested it is a mistake to neglect Luther’s influence on philosophy more narrowly conceived, and that the discussion of his ideas (both positively and critically) can be seen to mark the philosophical tradition from the early modern period onwards in a distinctive way (see §§1–5). Naturally enough, this impact takes place most obviously in the countries of northern Europe, where the Reformation generally was spread most effectively.[3]

1. Luther and Early Modern Philosophy

At a general level, in this period Luther’s ideas had a role in shaping two key philosophical disputes of a broadly epistemological kind, one concerning the relation between philosophy and theology as disciplines, and the other concerning the possibility of religious certainty. The first can be illustrated by the so-called “Hofmann-streit” (or “Hofmann Controversy”) which took place at the University of Helmstedt in 1598, in which Daniel Hofmann (1538–1621) cited Luther to attack his philosophical colleagues, which brought a response from the Scottish mathematician and physician Duncan Liddel (1561–1613) amongst others (for further discussion, see Antognazza 1996 and Hunter 2006; for the link to Liddel, see Regier 2016). Throughout the seventeenth century, the controversy had a major impact on the debate between theology and philosophy and, in particular, on discussions surrounding the so-called doctrine of double truth (see Luther entry §2). Pierre Bayle (1647–1706) devoted an article of his Dictionaire historique et critique to the controversy, and Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716) discussed it repeatedly, including in the Nouveaux Essais and in the Theodicy.

A second epistemological issue was also raised by Luther’s claims for the priority of scripture over ecclesiastical authority, which Luther had argued (for example in The Bondage of the Will against Erasmus; see WA 18:603–14/LW 33:19–36) would make possible a certainty that such authority lacked—but which as a method had itself proved problematic in settling disputes between Luther and those who challenged his scriptural interpretations (see Luther entry §2). As Richard Popkin (1979) has argued, this impasse led to significant debates between subsequent Reformers and Catholics concerning which approach, if any, could avoid scepticism, or indeed if faith required accommodation with scepticism in some form (which Luther himself had vehemently denied against Erasmus: see Luther entry §4).

As well as providing an important context for these general debates, at a more individual level another prominent early modern philosopher who responded to Luther’s thought was not only Leibniz, but also Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679), where one concern that is central to both is the question of free will, but other issues are also relevant. This influence will now be considered in more detail, beginning with Hobbes and then turning to Leibniz.

While generally expressing admiration for Luther’s role in the Reformation against what Hobbes saw as the evils of the Catholic Church,[4] the most direct use Hobbes makes of Lutheran ideas is in his controversy with John Bramhall, Bishop of Derry, over the issue of free will. The two men were led into debate by the Marquess of Newcastle when the three were in exile in Paris in 1645, but following the unauthorized publication of Hobbes’s contribution in 1654 as On Liberty and Necessity, Bramhall himself published his own earlier strongly-worded contribution as A Defence of True Liberty from Antecedent and Extrinsical Necessity in the following year, to which Hobbes then replied in similarly strident terms, in his Questions Concerning Liberty, Necessity, and Chance of 1656, to which Bramhall published a further response in 1658: Castigations of Mr Hobbes His Last Animadversions in the Case Concerning Liberty, and Universal Necessity.[5]

Bramhall makes his objections to Hobbes abundantly clear in the following passage from his Defence of True Liberty:

I hate this Doctrin from my heart and I believe both I have reason so to do, and all others who shall seriously ponder the horrid consequences which flow from it. It destroyes liberty, and dishonours the nature of man. It makes the second causes and outward objects to be the Rackets, and Men to be but the Tennis-Balls of destiny. It makes the first cause, that is, God Almighty, to be the introducer of all evill, and sin into the world, as much as Man, yea more than Man, by as much as the motion of the Watch is more from the Artificer, who did make it and wind it up, than either from the springs, or the wheels, or the thred, if God by his special influence into the second causes, did necessitate them to operate as they did. (Bramhall 1655: 60)

Bramhall’s central concern was thus two-fold: first, Hobbes’s determinism “dishonours the nature of man” by making him into nothing more than a “Tennis-Ball of destiny”, while secondly it creates theological difficulties by entailing that God is as much the author of evil and sin as of good, a conclusion so abhorrent that if taken seriously, it could not but push right thinking people into atheism.

Faced with this challenge, and fully accepting that his position treated God as a first cause from which all else happens with necessity, Hobbes appealed in his defence to the Reformation tradition in general, and Luther in particular, thus fighting a theological critic with theological authorities. As we have seen from the discussion of The Bondage of the Will (Luther entry §4), Luther had faced similar forms of criticism from Erasmus, and so Hobbes was able to make use of some of Luther’s replies to Erasmus in responding to Bramhall. In particular, he employed Luther’s distinction between the necessity of immutability and the necessity of constraint to argued that while human beings lack free will, they are nonetheless not forced to sin against their will, and so can still have sin imputed to them (Hobbes 1656: §19(a), 1841: 259–60, 1999: 77–8; 1656: §20 (n), 1841: 298, 1999: 79–80; see also WA 18:616 note/LW 33:39). And in response to the question that if God has power over us and so can determine our will, why he does not just use this power to make us good, but instead punishes us when we are not, Hobbes makes the Lutheran point that this is to try to hold God to human standards of justice and rightness; but it is a mistake to assume that these can can be applied in this context.[6] While obviously dialectically effective to use Luther in this way to refute a Bishop, and while the question of the nature of Hobbes’s own religious commitments remains a matter of controversy,[7] Hobbes’s appeal to Luther in this manner is no mere opportunism, and shows an understanding of and familiarity with Luther’s writing on free will which is more than purely superficial.

However, it can still be questioned whether by transposing these Lutheran considerations into the context of his own mechanistic materialism, Hobbes could do them proper justice; and of course, for Luther the philosophical issues surrounding such materialism were of little concern, and nor is his conception of God merely that of the kind of “first mover” that he is taken to be by Hobbes.[8] There is thus no place in Hobbes’s account for what we have seen is so distinctive to Luther’s, namely that there is a kind of spiritual comfort to be found in the abandonment of the idea of free choice, both in the way that the predestination that comes with it can make us more certain of God’s promises, and in the way it liberates us from the kind of anxiety we would feel if salvation depended on our proper exercise of this choice. Moreover, as discussed in Luther entry §4, Luther has arguments against free choice that are independent of any commitment to materialism, which rest instead on his claim that there can be no “neutral” normative space for the free will to exercise its choices as Erasmus had claimed: for it is either a good will which will see the good as its only option and so not be faced with any choice, or a bad will which thinks that the bad is also an option it should consider, but then qua will it is always turned away from the good and so has no choice in this direction either.[9] As others have noted, these deeper aspects of Luther’s position, which have nothing to do with Hobbes’s materialism, in the end make their respective approaches to these questions very different (see Damrosch 1979, Overhoff 1997).

As well as this issue of free will, it is also intriguing to consider another point of connection between the two thinkers, namely the influence of Luther on Hobbes’s political and social philosophy, though this issue is less explicitly documented through Hobbes’s works than the previous one. Nonetheless, both shared a belief in the need for a powerful state if the precariousness of life in a state of nature is to be avoided, given the lack of community between fallen individuals, so that both can be said to offer similar justifications for state authority, while then perhaps as a result being guilty of tending towards authoritarianism in their political thought. (For further comparison, see Kodalle 1990.)

If Hobbes’s materialism and (consequently) suspected atheism adds an interesting complexity to his relation to Luther, in Leibniz’s case a complexity is added through the latter’s commitment to ecumenism (reflected in his Catholic Demonstrations project of 1668–69 and subsequent works), and his rationalism, on which some of his ecumenical plans were based, as he hoped that common ground between doctrinal differences might be based on fresh insights made possible by new developments in philosophy and the sciences. Nonetheless, as with Hobbes, notwithstanding these divergences in Leibniz’s case, a clear Lutheran influence and context is still to be found, traceable to his upbringing and education (see Goldenbaum 1988: 171; Antognazza 2009: Chap 1), which drew him towards Lutheranism in a moderate form.

As Leibniz himself writes, from his “very tender youth onwards”, even before he went to university, he “came across a part of Luther’s book De servo arbitrio”, while going on to study works written on this issue not only by other Lutherans and by Reformed writers, but also those in the Catholic tradition (see Backus 2016: 257, notes 10 and 11). Leibniz’s interest in this debate was later to lead him to contribute belatedly to the controversy between Hobbes and Bramhall outlined above, which he discusses in an appendix to his Theodicy (1710): “Reflexions on the Work that Mr. Hobbes Published in English on ‘Freedom, Necessity and Chance’”. Leibniz notes that Hobbes’s view that “divine foreknowledge would be sufficient to establish an absolute necessity of events” resembles that of Luther in De servo arbitrio, or at least Luther there “spoke so”; but then Leibniz suggests this Lutheran position goes further than it needs to do, as

it is sufficiently acknowledged today that the kind of necessity which is termed hypothetical, and springs from foreknowledge or from other anterior reasons, has nothing in it to arouse one’s alarm: whereas it would be quite otherwise if the thing were necessary of itself, in such a way that the contrary implied contradiction. (Leibniz 1710 [1985: Appendix §3, p. 393])

In embracing and developing this Scholastic distinction, between a certainty based on the knowledge of causes, and a logical necessity that means that things could not have been otherwise, Leibniz is therefore arguing that it would have been quite possible for Luther to preserve his commitment to divine foreknowledge on the one hand, without playing into the hands of a hard determinist like Hobbes on the other.

The Theodicy also contains discussion of another key Lutheran issue, namely the relation between faith and reason, which is specifically raised in a “preliminary dissertation” at the start of the text. In reviewing the history of debates on this question, Leibniz admits that Luther “spoke sometimes as if [he] rejected philosophy and deemed it inimical to faith”, but he then seeks to qualify Luther’s position, arguing that by “philosophy” Luther meant our understanding of nature, or the philosophy of the schools, so that it is only philosophy in this narrow sense that cannot comprehend matters of faith. Leibniz likewise notes Luther’s early hostility to Aristotle, but that

at last he curbed his vehemence and in the Apology for the Augsburg Confession allowed [Melanchthon to include] a favourable mention of Aristotle and his Ethics. (1710 [1985: §12, p. 81])

Leibniz also offers a moderate reading of Luther’s claims concerning the differences between revealed truths and the mysteries of the Gospel on the one hand, and reason on the other (1710 [1985: §49, p. 101; §67, pp. 110–11]). Rather than attributing this view to Luther, therefore, Leibniz goes on to suggest that it is later theologians in various traditions, as well as figures such as Pierre Bayle, who had made the opposition of faith and reason into a sharp one. Leibniz himself tries to blunt this opposition by appealing to a distinction between what is above reason in the sense that reason cannot fully comprehend it, and what is contrary to reason, arguing that while matters of faith may fall into the former category, they cannot fall into the latter, so that

once a dogma has been disputed and refuted by reason, instead of its being incomprehensible, one may say that nothing is easier to understand, nor more obvious, than its absurdity. (1710 [1985: §23, p. 88])

(For further discussion of Leibniz’s approach, see Antognazza 2008: Introduction, 2018a; Goldenbaum 1998; Hillman 2013; Schweitz 2011.)

Leibniz’s writings on theology thus become focused on establishing what he seems to have viewed as this moderate Lutheran position, of showing across a range of issues that what might appear contrary to reason is often merely above it (see Antognazza 2018b).[10] One central theological issue which Leibniz deals with in this way, and which as we have seen concerned Luther (see Luther entry §2) and became a crucial matter of dispute within the later Reformation, was the question of the Eucharist. Unsurprisingly, therefore, this issue becomes central for Leibniz too, both in his ecumenical attempts to find common ground between the various Christian traditions, and to show how a reason informed by new developments in philosophical thinking (most especially his own) can find a way forward in these apparently intractable debates (see Backus 2016: Chapters 1 and 2; Mercer 2002: 82–89; Fouke 1992). Nonetheless, despite his ecumenical endeavours, it has been noted (Adams 1994: 354–5; Antognazza 2018b: 746–48) that Leibniz’s metaphysics works best as an attempt to make sense of the Eucharist when this is conceived along the lines of the Lutheran position of real presence rather than the Catholic conception of transubstantiation.[11] To this extent his metaphysics more generally may be said to operate within a broadly Lutheran outlook, though one which (thanks to the influence of Melanchthon and others) had more room in it than Luther himself may have liked for Aristotelian ideas of the sort Leibniz employed to deal with these issues, such as substantial form (see Mercer 2002: 101).[12]

2. Luther, Kant, and the Post-Kantians

By virtue of their education and background, Luther continues to have an impact on the thought of significant philosophers after Leibniz, such as Christian Thomasius (1655–1728) and Christian Wolff (1679–1754). However, a more interesting point of contact can be found with the crucial thinker who was not in fact brought up as a mainstream Lutheran but as a Pietist, namely Immanuel Kant (1724–1804).[13] This impact continues in the work of the Lutheran idealists who followed him, namely J. G. Fichte (1762–1814), F. W. J. Schelling (1775–1854) and G. W. F. Hegel (1770–1831), as well as in the work of those who responded to Kant in a different way, namely Gotthold Ephraim Lessing (1729–1781), J. G. Hamann (1730–1788), F. H. Jacobi (1743–1819) and J. G. Herder (1744–1803), in addition to Arthur Schopenhauer (1788–1860) and thinkers associated with Romanticism such as Friedrich von Hardenberg (aka Novalis) (1772–1801) and Friedrich Schlegel (1772–1829), and the convert Jewish writer and essayist Heinrich Heine (1797–1856). For reasons of space, it will not be possible to trace all these connections here, so I will focus mainly on Kant and Hegel, with a brief mention of Fichte and Schelling. (A more comprehensive study, which contains excerpts from key primary texts, can be found in Bornkamm 1955; a brief overview can be found in Assel 2014. For discussions that extend into the twentieth century, see Hampson 2017, Podmore 2017 and Rota 2017.)

While Kant’s upbringing and education came from within Pietism rather than the orthodox Lutheran Church,[14] Pietism was still a reform movement within the Lutheran tradition, and in certain respects saw itself as returning to the views of Luther himself, and away from what that Church had become (see Lindberg 2005 and Shantz 2013 for further discussion). One issue this re-opened was the role of reason in relation to faith, and the limitations of reason and hence academic theology in religious matters, while also taking seriously the fallenness of human beings, and the need for spiritual rebirth. As has been emphasised recently (see Kanterian 2017), Kant’s adoption of this so-called “weakness motif” may be seen as an importantly Lutheran theme in his work, and is reflected in the limitations he places on human reason and on our capacities for moral goodness; nonetheless, Kant does not use his claims concerning the constraints on reason to prioritise theology over philosophy, or to give revelation or scripture a special status, while he also departs from Luther over the issue of free will and of grace.

That the human intellect is limited is a central theme in what Kant called his “critical philosophy”, which precisely aims to set out those limits. Moreover, as is suggested by his famous claim to have “found it necessary to deny knowledge in order to make room for faith” (Critique of Pure Reason, Bxxx), there is a religious impetus behind this project of a sort that Luther might have recognized, which is also reflected in Kant’s hostility to rationalistic attempts to prove the existence of God. Kant may also be said to share Luther’s Augustinian pessimism regarding human nature, where he frequently remarks on our evident self-concern, and in Religion Within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (1793) attributes the propensity to radical evil to all human beings, namely

the propensity of the power of choice to maxims that subordinate the incentives of the moral law to others (not moral ones). (6:30)

This conception of human moral weakness may also be said to lead Kant to adopt a Lutheran conception of the law, which only becomes binding on us and takes the form of duty given our resistance to the good, whereas for the holy will there is no such necessitation or constraint (cf. Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, 4:412–4).

However, there are also limits on how far Kant is prepared to follow these Lutheran themes. Firstly, while he is willing to accept that theoretical reason may both lead itself astray and find itself cognitively impoverished in some respects, in a way that leaves room for faith, he is not willing to allow that this means that theology can eclipse philosophy, or that revelation or scripture can simply replace the latter, as he took it that religion must remain compatible with morality and thus stay within practical reason, out of which a philosophical theology can arise (see Religion, Preface, and The Conflict of the Faculties, Part 1). Secondly, Kant offers a distinctive conception of the idea of free choice (Willkür) as involving the choice or adoption of our maxims (see Metaphysics of Morals 6: 213–4, 226; Religion Within the Limits of Mere Reason 6:23–4), while he also argues for our freedom on the basis that “ought implies can”, which puts him at odds with Luther’s position as articulated in The Bondage of the Will (see, e.g., Religion 6:45, and White 1990 for more general discussion). Finally, in Religion Within the Limits of Mere Reason, Kant rejects the Lutheran conception of grace, again on moral grounds, arguing that we will be discouraged in our moral efforts unless we believe that we can do something to make ourselves deserving of grace and hence of divine assistance to be good, while again Kant appeals to the principle that “ought implies can” to argue that we must have some capacity in this direction, however limited (see Religion Part 1). Thus, while there are some affinities between Kant and Luther, there are important divergences too.

Hegel’s reception of Luther contrasts with Kant’s in various ways. First, Kant never offers any significant discussion of Luther in his writings, and is implicitly critical of him in important respects, while Hegel is more explicit in his engagement with Luther, and frequently lavish in his praise of the Reformer—though Hegel quickly dropped his youthful plans to be a Lutheran pastor, and was critical of aspects of the Lutheran education he received as a student at the seminary (or Stift) in Tübingen. Secondly, Kant’s relation to Luther is made more complex by his Pietistic upbringing; but while Hegel’s upbringing may also have involved some Pietistic aspects (see Macgee 2001: 71–72), in later life Hegel avowed his Lutheran orthodoxy, writing to the Pietistic theologian Friedrich August Tholuck in 1826: “I am a Lutheran, and through philosophy have been at once completely confirmed in Lutheranism” (Hegel 1984: 520). Thirdly, the two philosophers are almost diametrically opposed in what they accepted and what they rejected in Luther: while Kant followed Luther’s doubts concerning reason and our capacities for moral goodness, Hegel was more optimistic on both scores; but while Kant rejected Luther’s scepticism regarding free choice, Hegel used it to draw his dialectical connection between freedom and necessity. However, both Kant and Hegel agree in standing against any attempt to prioritise theology over philosophy on Lutheran grounds. After briefly outlining the key texts for understanding Hegel’s engagement with Luther, this third point will then be developed further.

The majority of Hegel’s references to Luther occur in the lectures on the philosophy of religion, and on philosophy of history, and on the history of philosophy, where in the case of the last two, these are largely in the sections on the Reformation more generally. The context therefore means that in these explicit discussions, Hegel is considering Luther’s place in subsequent historical developments. In general, Hegel presents Luther as ushering in a new era of internality and individuality, as religion becomes less a matter of unthinkingly following established authorities and rituals that are external and alien, and more a matter of grasping the truth for oneself and feeling at one with it, thus ushering in a distinctive form of “Christian freedom”:

Subjective spirit comes to itself through this self-negation because it is absolutely at home with itself [bei sich]. Thus subjective spirit gains freedom in the truth, negates its particularity and comes to itself in its truth. In this way Christian freedom is actualized. (1822–23 [Hegel 2011: 505])

And in his “Address on the Tercentenary of the Submission of the Augsburg Confession” (1830), Hegel even goes so far as to present his own work as a “second reformation”: while Luther was the “trumpet which now proclaimed the wondrous sound of Christian freedom”, and that “the things which our Luther set in motion were truly new”, nonetheless “if religion is reformed, the political, legal, and ethical system [ratio civitatis et legum morumque] should also be reformed” (Hegel 1830 [1999: 189])—which thus connects Luther’s religious project to Hegel’s political one, as Hegel also did in the Preface to the Philosophy of Right.[15] Heine, in his account of the development of German philosophy written for a French audience in 1834 and published in book form a year later (Heine 1835 [2007]), tells a similar story, which begins with Luther and culminates in Hegel—indeed, its original title was De L’Allemagne depuis Luther. Heine’s work also reflects the role that Hegel gave Luther, as a quintessentially “German” figure, which was to become a common trope in his subsequent reception.[16]

As well as this focus on religious and political freedoms for the individual, the emphasis on the relation between Lutheranism and freedom in Hegel may be seen to have four more fundamental aspects, which reveal Luther’s influence on Hegel’s conception of freedom, which is a central theme in the latter’s philosophy. First, as we have seen Hegel took Christian freedom to involve finding oneself in the other, which may reflect Luther’s turn from God as an alien and forbidding judge, to God as forgiving and loving, in which a freedom as reconciliation can be achieved—albeit a unity that must be achieved through a prior sense of alienation. [17] In Luther this alienation involves an element of hiddenness which is not so evident in Hegel. Nonetheless, It could be added that just as Luther’s conception of divine hiddenness can involve the idea that God’s nature is concealed under its contrary (abscondita sub contrario) (such as his mercy under his wrath, his strength under his weakness and suffering in Jesus Christ),[18] so there is a further connection here to Hegel’s conception of the dialectic, where what appears one way to the understanding can be seen to be otherwise by reason, such as necessity really being freedom, in a way that the former will find incomprehensible. Moreover, Hegel’s conception of freedom and self-knowledge as requiring recognition by the other may be said to reflect Luther’s conception of our relational dependence on God.[19] Second, Hegel takes up the idea that this reconciliation with the other requires a kind of self-surrender, where he writes that:

Subjective certainty, i.e. the subject’s knowledge of the true, which should be for it an objective truth, subsisting in and for itself, only becomes authentic when, in relation to this content, particular subjectivity is surrendered; and this happens only by making the objective truth one’s own truth. (1822–23 [Hegel 2011: 505])

As Stephen Houlgate has noted,[20] this emphasis on the passivity is an important feature of Hegel’s own method of inquiry, for example where Hegel remarks that

[p]hilosophical thinking proceeds analytically in that it simply takes up its object, the Idea, and lets it go its own way, while it simply watches the movement and development of it, so to speak. To this extent, philosophising is wholly passive. (Encyclopaedia Logic §238 Addition)

Third, Hegel takes up the Lutheran (and Pauline) view concerning the relation between the Christian and the law, according to which the Christian should not require constraint by law, as

true freedom…is a freedom to do good with pleasure and to live well without compulsion of the law. (Preface to St Paul’s Epistle to the Romans, WA DB 7:18–19/LW 35:376)

It could be argued that this view is reflected in Hegel’s preference for love over law, which is a particular feature of his early writings.[21] Finally, in The Bondage of the Will, Luther questions a conception of freedom as free choice (see Luther entry §4), arguing instead that the presence of this choice involves a lack of freedom as the agent is no longer guided by the good; this view may also be said to be echoed in Hegel’s own critique of free choice (Willkür), which underpins his claim that there is a way in which true freedom and necessity can be reconciled, as the truly free agent only sees one option available to them, namely what is required by the good. In these respects, therefore, it can be argued that there is a fundamentally Lutheran cast to this fundamental aspect of Hegel’s thought. However, Hegel surely departs from Luther in championing the role of reason in his speculative philosophy (albeit reason of a distinctive kind, which goes beyond the understanding), which is able to “sublate” Christianity within it—but this very sublation means that his philosophy takes up structures of theological thinking, some of which are also Lutheran, so that in turn Hegel remains an important influence within Lutheran theology.[22]

There are interesting points of similarity and difference between Hegel’s response to Luther, and that of the other post-Kantian German idealists such as Fichte and Schelling. Like Hegel, Fichte treats Luther as a significant national figure, and associates him with freedom, giving him prominence in his Addresses to the German Nation which were written in 1808 as a rallying call in the wake of Napoleonic invasion. Both also praise Luther’s contribution to the German language through his translations of the Bible, though Fichte is critical of the doctrine of sola scriptura, which was to put too much value on “the printed letter”.[23] Moreover, if Luther can be said to have an influence of Hegel’s conception of recognition (see above), the same may be said of Fichte’s account of recognition which foreshadowed Hegel’s, though in neither case is this link made explicit. Schelling also gives Luther’s account of freedom a philosophical role, appealing to Luther’s Bondage of the Will in his Philosophical Investigations into the Essence of Human Freedom (1809), to draw a distinction between compulsion and necessity, and more broadly arguing that

religiosity does not permit any choice between opposites, and aequilibrium arbitrii (the plague of all morality), but rather only the highest resoluteness in favour of what is right without any choice. (1809 [2006: 57])

Moreover, in appealing in his later work to the significance of revelation, it has been argued that Schelling is more consistently Lutheran than Hegel, in thereby placing limits to the latter’s rationalism (see Wirth 2017).

3. Luther, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche

Two other significant nineteenth century philosophers who engaged with Luther are Søren Kierkegaard (1813–55) and Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900). For Kierkegaard, this engagement came in the context of his attempts to renew the nature of Christian faith, while for Nietzsche it came from someone standing outside that faith.

Kierkegaard’s relation to Luther and Lutheranism is complex, and remains a matter of some controversy.[24] On balance, though, it seems that while Kierkegaard was clearly a critic of the established Danish Lutheran Church, he was not so critical of Luther himself, and partly returned to him in order to challenge his Lutheran contemporaries, even suggesting that he might turn out to be Luther’s “true successor”.[25] At the same time, he held that some of Luther’s original doctrines were partly responsible for the contemporary malaise, and so must be re-thought in the context of new challenges to genuine Christian life and spirituality as conceived by Kierkegaard, thereby applying “a corrective to Luther’s own corrective”, as Kim and Rasmussen nicely put it (2009: 197). His attitude is therefore well-summarized in his remark:

I have wanted to prevent people in Christendom from existentially taking in vain Luther and the significance of Luther’s life. (1850 [1998: 17])[26]

Thus while by his own admission Kierkegaard was not a systematic reader of Luther,[27] his engagement with his writings nonetheless relates to deep themes in Kierkegaard’s own thinking, so that Luther provides an important context for his thought.

One such issue concerned the question of justification, and the central Lutheran view that this comes through unmerited grace as forgiveness rather than through works. While expressing sympathy with Luther’s central claim, Kierkegaard was fearful that in his contemporary world, it had become an excuse for an ethical and spiritual indolence, so that people now “applied grace in such a way that they freed themselves from works” (Kierkegaard 1851 [1990a: 17]). Relatedly, Kierkegaard acknowledged and respected the spiritual seriousness of the anxieties (Anfechtungen) and sense of sin which had led Luther himself to adopt this position (see Podmore 2006 and 2013); but this was a seriousness which Kierkegaard’s contemporaries had lost, so that for them the turn to grace becomes a superficial optimism rather than a renewal of hope in the face of anxiety and despair. Moreover, like Luther, Kierkegaard closely connected our relation to God in faith with our relation to the neighbour, so that it is through the former that the latter as works of love are made possible.[28] In this way, Kierkegaard could claim to be correcting an exaggeration of Luther’s position, which tried to do away with works altogether—much as Luther himself had rejected this exaggeration in his Treatise on Good Works. In re-affirming the importance of works, Kierkegaard gave a greater role to the imitatio Christi tradition, again arguing that while Luther had been rightly critical of this idea in his own context as feeding works righteousness and a kind of pseudo-piety, it nonetheless needs reviving in Kierkegaard’s context, to provide a challenge to the complacent self-conception of his contemporaries by raising Christ up as an ideal, and to re-focus our attention on him as a radical figure (Kierkegaard 1876 [1990: 192–209]).

However, another obstacle to a proper life of faith for Kierkegaard was the kind of worldliness to be found in his contemporaries, for which he claimed that Luther needed to take a more direct responsibility, insofar as he had allowed the Reformation to become a political programme (see Kierkegaard KJP: 3, frag. 2469 [p. 66, 1848]), and had also presented an account of social orders as a model of Christian life, which had been taken up by Hegelians and others as an ethic of vocation. For Kierkegaard, this had led to a relation between the religious on the one hand and the ethical and social on the other that tended to reduce the former to the latter, and which he sought to challenge in his own more radical conception of their relation, which could include the Christian having to live at odds with any social order, and suffering exclusion from it as a result—or at the very least, active faith may require feeling distanced from the world, while living within it. Again, while Kierkegaard acknowledges that Luther may have intended something similar,[29] the result of his teachings had led people in a different direction; as Sløk puts it:

Life, serving one’s neighbour through one’s calling, had been transformed into one of bourgeois complacency in which relative duties and relative rights had obliterated the awareness of an unconditional obligation upon man. (Sløk 1962: 100)

In this context, while recognizing that it could not be revived and critical of it in some respects,[30] Kierkegaard expresses some preference for the monastic life over that of the married life of the Lutheran pastor, and the worldliness that had come to involve.[31]

A final theme to note concerns the relation between reason and faith, which also forms part of Kierkegaard’s critical engagement with Hegelianism. As discussed above, Hegel may be seen to have taken Lutheranism in a more rationalistic and philosophical direction, to which Kierkegaard’s emphasis on the “paradox” of the incarnation, which underlies Christian faith, as well as his emphasis on divine hiddenness, may be seen as a corrective. For Kierkegaard, this was essential to properly appreciate Luther’s theology of the cross, which because it is alien to rational comprehension, makes religious commitment a matter of individual faith and existential risk, as typified in the story of Abraham to which he and Luther both refer[32]—though in his own way, Kierkegaard like Leibniz suggests that while this puts faith above reason, it does not put it contrary to it and so render it irrational in that sense.[33]

While Kierkegaard’s criticisms of Luther come from within the Christian tradition, those of Nietzsche come from a thinker who put himself outside it.[34] However, it took some time for this critique of Luther to develop, and in his earlier period until 1876 Nietzsche’s writings are highly favourable towards Luther himself and the Reformation generally; but from this point on, his view of both becomes increasingly negative and hostile (see Bluhm 1943, 1950, 1953 for a detailed account of this trajectory; this is also discussed in Large 2003). For Nietzsche, Luther came to represent the paradigm of the non-aristocratic man, who rather than accepting and overcoming himself, instead despised himself and tried to flee from himself by turning to God. Thus, while Nietzsche may have seen in Luther a prefiguring of his own attempts to get beyond a morality of law in the name of freedom,[35] ultimately he came to view this liberating impetus as something Luther himself betrayed. More positively, however, while no direct references to Luther are made, and while any such influence would be mediated by other figures such as Schopenhauer, it is arguable that some elements in Nietzsche’s rejection of the idea of the free will might be found in Luther, not with respect to Nietzsche’s causal determinism, but at the level of his doubts concerning the power of free choice to occupy a neutral position between the agent and their actions—for example, in Nietzsche’s well known criticism of “popular morality” which

separates strength from the manifestation of strength, as though there were an indifferent substratum behind the strong which had the freedom to manifest strength or not. (1887: First Essay, §13)

In a somewhat similar way (see Luther entry §4), Luther is critical of Erasmus’s conception of the idea that there is any “pure will” (purum velle) standing above desire (studium) or striving (conatus) which can thus decide whether to go one way or another (cf. WA 18:669/LW 33:114–5).

4. Luther, Feuerbach, and Marxism

In the nineteenth century, Luther also plays a prominent role in the thought of the key post-Hegelian thinker Ludwig Feuerbach (1804–1872), and to a lesser degree in that of Karl Marx (1818–1883) and Friedrich Engels (1820–1895), as well as in later thinkers in the twentieth century Marxist tradition such as Ernst Bloch (1885–1977), and Herbert Marcuse (1898–1979).[36]

Feuerbach’s primary engagement with Luther comes in the second edition of his The Essence of Christianity (1843), and in The Essence of Faith According to Luther (1844). Among his motivations was Feuerbach’s desire in the face of Protestant critics to establish that the view of religion proposed in the first edition of The Essence of Christianity applied not only to the Catholic faith (which such critics were happy to concede), but also to Protestantism—and of course there could be no better way for Feuerbach to establish this than to demonstrate that Luther himself could be encompassed within Feuerbach’s analysis, which is what he therefore proposed in these works (see Glasse 1972 and Erdozain 2016: 223–45 for further discussion). Put briefly, Feuerbach’s central thesis was that religious beliefs are nothing more than the expressions of human desires, and God is a being on whom our aspirations for ourselves are projected, so that in worshipping God we are worshipping ourselves. As Feuerbach allows at the outset of The Essence of Faith, this may seem not to apply to Luther’s conception, insofar as Luther insists on the fundamental discontinuity between God and human beings, placing all value in the former and none in the latter. On the surface, therefore,

Luther’s doctrine is divine but inhuman, indeed barbaric—a hymn to God, but a lampoon on man. (Feuerbach 1844 [1967: 41])

In response, however, Feuerbach argues that is a superficial reading, as the role of God is to restore to us what we have lost: “Man in himself is and can do nothing, but in God (that is through faith) he is and can do everything” (1844 [1967: 46]). This can be seen, Feuerbach argues, in the way that Luther (in his opposition to Catholicism) emphasises the way in which he takes Christ’s suffering to be for us, so that what appeared to be a divergence becomes a radical convergence. Feuerbach’s appropriation of Luther (which of course remains controversial) is therefore summarized when he writes:

“If God sat in heaven for Himself alone”, says Luther, “like a block, He would not be God”

from which Feuerbach takes Luther to be agreeing with him, that “God is a word the sole meaning of which is ‘man’” (1844 [1967: 50]), and thus to be foreshadowing Feuerbach’s own anthropological turn.

Turning now to Marx, Engels and others in the broadly Marxist tradition, their central concern was a focus on Luther’s historical impact as a revolutionary and social reformer, which seemed to be compromised by Luther’s role in the Peasants’ Revolt (see sections 1 and 5 of the entry on Luther). In his study of the Revolt, Engels in particular drew parallels with the situation leading up to the German revolutions of 1848–49, casting Luther as a “middle-class” reformer unable to sustain the radicalism he had unleashed, which Engels (and later Bloch) took to be better represented in “plebeian revolutionary” Thomas Müntzer (c. 1489–1525), who Luther had declared to be an instrument of Satan, and who was tortured and executed after the battle of Frankenhausen in 1525. A similar suspicion of Luther can also be found in Marcuse, in an essay from 1936 written after Marcuse’s exile from Germany to the United States, and so this time against the background of the growing authoritarianism of Nazism (which itself often glorified Luther). Without explicitly making the connection, in this context Marcuse accuses Luther of relegating Christian freedom to the inner sphere,[37] leaving the outer world of politics and society as a realm of unfreedom to which the Christian must submit, in deference to worldly authorities which Luther argued could not be challenged—a political quietism which in Marcuse’s context was of course particularly troubling, and which after the war became a source for much criticism (and self-criticism) directed towards the Lutheran Church.

5. Luther, Heidegger, and Løgstrup

While the other major twentieth century figures to engage with Luther were primarily theologians (such as Rudolf Bultmann (1884–1976), Karl Barth (1886–1968), Paul Tillich (1886–1965) and Friedrich Gogarten (1887–1967)), one significant philosopher in this period to often be associated with Luther is Martin Heidegger (1889–1976). Raised originally as a Catholic and aspiring initially to be a Catholic philosopher, after the First World War Heidegger shifted his allegiances and began to engage seriously with Luther’s works, as well as with Augustine, Schleiermacher, and Kierkegaard, though ultimately he was to break with theism and Christianity altogether. In this period in the 1920s, Heidegger took up Luther’s distinction between the “theology of glory” and the “theology of the cross”, and argued that original or “primordial” Christianity (Urchristentum) had been distorted into the former by an “ontotheology” wrongly influenced by the scholastic misappropriation of Aristotle; this now needed to be overturned in a way that was yet more radical than Luther himself, to avoid what Heidegger saw as the “Protestant scholasticism” of Luther’s later period and that of his followers. It can also be said that what he perceived as Luther’s struggle provided the inspiration for Heidegger’s own attempts to overturn the metaphysical tradition within philosophy. However, with the publication of Being and Time in 1927, this connection to Luther becomes obscured in the wake of other allegiances, and Luther is hardly mentioned in this text, though it can still be argued that certain Lutheran assumptions remain throughout this and later works—such that one commentator has called Being and Time a “Lutheran phenomenology of Dasein” (McGrath 2006: 12).[38]

Luther also plays a significant role in the thought of the Danish philosopher and theologian K. E. Løgstrup (1905–1981), who interacted with Heidegger and Bultmann both before and after the Second World War, as well as with contemporary Kierkegaardians in Denmark. Løgstrup used Luther to develop his own distinctive natural law position in ethics, while also incorporating in his ethics the fundamental Lutheran view that goodness is not achievable through our own efforts; but for Løgstrup, this goodness is brought about through the encounter with another person that is made possible through life itself, rather than divine grace, thereby secularizing this central aspect of the Lutheran position. At the same time, he allows that the very fact that life makes this possible may suggest that it is created. Løgstrup argued, moreover, that forgiveness must remain a theological matter, as our sinfulness means that human beings are in no position to forgive each other with any kind of authority, in this way retaining an important element of Luther’s theology of the cross.

6. Luther and “Modernity”

Leaving aside Luther’s influence on individual philosophers, there has also been some philosophical interest in considering his wider cultural and historical impact on “modernity”, and his role in shaping the modern world as we now understand it.[39] Of course, this is a highly complex matter (for a helpful overview, see Zachhuber 2017), but broadly five approaches have been adopted. On some accounts (such as Hegel’s outlined above, as well as Heine’s) Luther’s impact is seen as both decisive and positive, alongside a largely positive conception of modernity itself, where here the emphasis might lie on his resistance to religious authority, and his prioritising of the conscience of the individual. On other accounts, this impact is accepted, but seen instead as an object of criticism, as the relevant features of modernity are deplored, so that for example Luther is blamed for the rise of modern individualism, of voluntarism, and of the secularism that is said to go along with both (see for example Maritain 1925). A third approach (as we also saw above in relation to the Marxist tradition and to Marcuse, for example) may also blame Luther for unequivocally problematic aspects of modernity, such as authoritarianism and anti-Semitism. A fourth approach is to see Luther as in fact standing in contrast to certain key positive features of modern thought, such as rationalism, freedom, and religious tolerance; for example, the juxtaposition between his views and those of Erasmus’s humanism is sometimes portrayed in this light (see for example Gillespie 2008; Massing 2018). And of course, if one adopts certain views of the development of Luther’s thought, one may attribute different influences as coming from different phases, and treat some as more positive than others (by distinguishing, for example, between a “radical” earlier Luther and a more “conservative” later Luther), so that Luther’s impact may be understood as taking more than one (and even contradictory) form (see for example Erdozain 2016). A final approach is to criticise all attempts to link Luther too closely with such debates concerning “the modern”, arguing that this is historically anachronistic, as he is more essentially a medieval figure, so that to focus myopically on his impact on modernity will be to distort our understanding of Luther himself, and also perhaps of his distinctiveness and originality, while also neglecting the way Luther’s own thinking changed over time (for a recent example of this approach, see Helmer 2019). This is not the occasion to adjudicate such debates, but it is hoped that the account of Luther given previously will make it possible to give proper consideration to some of the issues they raise. For in discussing how far Luther shaped the modern world, some consideration of how far he shaped philosophy surely deserves a place.


A. Abbreviations for references to Luther’s works

  • [WA] D. Martin Luthers Werke: Kritische Gesamtausgabe, 65 vols in 127. Weimar: Hermann Böhlau, 1883–1929, Abteilung 1: Schriften vols 1–56.
  • [WA TR] D. Martin Luthers Werke: Kritische Gesamtausgabe, 65 vols in 127. Weimar: Hermann Böhlau, 1883–1929, Abteilung 2: Tischreden vols 1–6.
  • [WA DB] D. Martin Luthers Werke: Kritische Gesamtausgabe, 65 vols in 127. Weimar: Hermann Böhlau, 1883–1929. Abteilung 3: Die Deutsche Bibel vols 1–12.
  • [LW] Luther’s Works, American edition, 55 vols. St Louis and Philadephia: Concordia and Fortress Press, 1958–86; new series, vols 56–75, 2009–.

B. Useful collections of some of Luther’s main writings

  • Martin Luther: Selections from his Writings, edited by John Dillenberger. Garden City: Anchor Books, 1961.
  • The Ninety-Five Theses and Other Writings, Trans William Russell. Harmondsworth: Penguin, 2017.
  • The Annotated Luther, edited by Timothy J. Wengert et al, 6 vols. Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 2015–17.

Translations have been modified where necessary.

C. Primary Literature by Others

References for Kant are to the Akademie edition given in the margins of most translations, by volume number and page number, except for references to the Critique of Pure Reason, which are given to the pages of the first (A) edition or second (B) edition, which are also given in the margins of translations of that text.

Translations have been modified where necessary.

  • Bloch Ernst, 1963, Thomas Münzer als Theologe der Revolution, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp.
  • Bramhall, John, 1655, A Defence of True Liberty from Ante-cedent and Extrinsicall Necessity, London: John Crook.
  • Engels, Friedrich, 1850 [1956], Der deutsche Bauernkrieg; translated as The Peasant War in Germany, Moissaye J. Olgin (trans.), Moscow: International Publishers. [First published as articles in Neue Rheinische Zeitung. Politisch-ökonomische Revue (Hamburg)].
  • Feuerbach, Ludwig, 1843, Das Wesen des Christentums (The Essence of Christianity), second edition, Leipzig: Otto Wigand.
  • –––, 1844 [1967], Wesen des Glaubens im Sinne Luthers, Leipzig: Otto Wigand; translated as The Essence of Faith According to Luther, Melvin Cherno (trans.), New York: Harper & Row, 1967.
  • Fichte, Johann Gottlieb, 1808, Reden an die deutsche Nation (Addresses to the German Nation), Berlin; translated as Addresses to the German Nation, Gregory Moore (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
  • Hegel, G. W. F., 1798–99 [1971], “Der Geist des Christentums und sein Schicksal”, unpublished manuscript; translated as “The Spirit of Christianity and its Fate”, T. M. Knox (trans.), in Hegel’s Early Theological Writings, Philadelphia, PA: University of Pennsylvania Press, 1971, 182–281 (originally published 1948).
  • –––, 1821 [1991], Grundlinien der Philosophie des Rechts, Berlin; translated as Elements of the Philosophy of Right, Allen W. Wood (ed.), H. D. Nisbet (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • –––, 1830 [1999], “Address on the Tercentenary of the Submission of the Augsburg Confession (25 June 1830)”; translated by H.B. Nisbet in Hegel: Political Writings, Laurence Dickey and H. B. Nisbet (eds), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 186–96.
  • –––, 1984, Hegel: The Letters, Clark Butler and Christine Seiler (trans), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • –––, 2009, Lectures on the History of Philosophy 1825–6, Volume III: Medieval and Modern Philosophy, revised edition, Robert F. Brown (ed./trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2011, Lectures on the Philosophy of World History, Volume 1: Manuscripts of the Introduction and the Lectures of 1822–1823, Robert F. Brown and Peter C. Hodgson (eds/trans), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Heidegger, Martin, 1924 [2010], “Das Problem der Sünde bei Luther”; translated as “The Problem of Sin in Luther”, Brian Hansford Bowles (trans.) in Becoming Heidegger: On the Trail of his Early Occasional Writings, 1910–1927, second edition, Theodore Kisiek and Thomas Sheehan (eds.), (The New Yearbook for Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy, 9), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 2010, 183–191.
  • Heine, Heinrich, 1835 [2007], Zur Geschichte der Religion und Philosophie in Deutschland; translated as On the History of Religion and Philosophy in Germany, Howard Pollack-Milgate (trans.), in On the History of Religion and Philosophy in Germany and Other Writings, Terry Pinkard (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007, pp. 3–120.
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1656 [1841], The Questions Concerning Liberty, Necessity, and Chance, reprinted in The English Works of Thomas Hobbes, Sir William Molesworth (ed.), vol 5. London: Bohn.
  • –––, 1688 [2008], Historia Ecclesiastica, Carmine Elegiaco Concinnata, London: Augustae Trinobantum. New edition with translation, Historia Ecclesiastica, Patricia Springborg, Patricia Stablein, and Paul Wilson (eds), Paris: Honoré Champion, 2008.
  • –––, 1722, A True Ecclesiastical History from Moses to the Time of Martin Luther: In Verse, London: E. Curll. An anonymous paraphrase of Hobbes 1688. [Hobbes 1722 available online]
  • –––, 1999, Selections from Hobbes 1656 [1841], in Hobbes and Bramhall 1999: 69–90.
  • Hobbes, Thomas and John Bramhall, 1999, Hobbes and Bramhall on Liberty and Necessity, Vere Chappell (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139164207
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1793 [1998], Religion innerhalb der Grenzen der bloßen Vernunft; translated as Religion Within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, Allen Wood and George di Giovanni (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Kierkegaard, Søren, 1843 [1983], Frygt og bæven; translated as Fear and Trembling, in Fear and Trembling; Repetition, Howard V. Hong and Edna H. Hong (trans.), (Kierkegaard’s writings, 6), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983.
  • –––, 1846 [1992], Afsluttende uvidenskabelig efterskrift; translated as Concluding Unscientific Postscript to “Philosophical Fragments”, two volumes, Howard V. Hong and Edna H. Hong (trans.), (Kierkegaard’s writings, 12), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1851 [1990], Til selvprøvelse; translated as For Self-Examination in Kierkegaard 1990: 1–88.
  • –––, 1859 [1998], Synspunktet for min Forfatter-Virksomhed, published posthumously; translated as The Point of View for My Work as an Author in The Point of View, Howard V. Hong and Edna H. Hong (trans.), (Kierkegaard’s writings, 22), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 21–126.
  • –––, 1876 [1990], Dømmer selv; translated as Judge for Yourself! in Kierkegaard 1990: 89–216.
  • –––, 1990, For Self-Examination; Judge for Yourself!, Howard V. Hong and Edna H. Hong (trans.), (Kierkegaard’s writings, 21), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, [KJP] 1999, Søren Kierkegaard’s Journals and Papers, 7 volumes, second edition, edited and translated by Howard V. and Edna H. Hong, assisted by Gregor Malantschuk; Index by N. Hong and C. Barker, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, 1710 [1985], Essais de théodicée; translated as Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man, and the Origin of Evil, Austin M. Farrer (ed.), E. M. Muggard (trans.), Peru, IL: Open Court.
  • –––, 1976, Philosophical Papers and Letters, second edition, Leroy E. Loemker (ed.), Dordrecht: Reidel. doi:10.1007/978-94-010-1426-7
  • Løgstrup, K. E., 1949 [2019], “Die Kategorie und das Amt der Verkündigung im Hinblick auf Luther und Kierkegaard”, Evangelische Theologie, 9(1–6): 249–269; translated as “The Category and the Office of Proclamation, with Particular Reference to Luther”, Christopher Bennett and Robert Stern (trans.), Graduate Faculty Philosophy Journal, 2019, 40(1): 183–209. doi:10.5840/gfpj20194019
  • –––, 1956 [2020], Den etiske fordring, Copenhagen: Gyldendal, reissued Aarhus: Klim, 2010. Translated as The Ethical Demand, Bjørn Rabjerg and Robert Stern (trans), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2020.
  • –––, 1971 [2020], Etiske begreber og problemer, originally published in the anthology Etik och Kristen Tro, reissued Aarhus: Klim, 2014; translated as Ethical Concepts and Problems, Kees van Kooten Niekerk and Kristian-Alberto Lykke Cobos (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2020.
  • Marcuse, Herbert, 1936 [1972], “Ideengeschichtlicher Teil”, in Studie über Autorität und Familie, Paris: Librairie Félix Alcan, pp. 136–228; translated as “A Study on Authority”, in his From Luther to Popper, Joris De Bres (trans.), London: Verso, 1972, pp. 49–156.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich, 1886 [1966], Jenseits von Gut und Böse: Vorspiel einer Philosophie der Zukunft, Leipzig: Naumann; translated as Beyond Good and Evil, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Vintage, 1966.
  • –––, 1887 [1998], Zur Genealogie der Moral: Eine Streitschrift, Leipzig: Naumann; translated as On the Genealogy of Morality, Maudemarie Clark and Alan Swensen (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1998.
  • Novalis, 1799 [1996], “Die Christenheit oder Europa”; translated as “Christianity or Europe: A Fragment”, in The Early Writings of the German Romantics, Frederick C. Beiser (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996, pp. 59–79.
  • Schelling, F. W. J., 1809 [2006], Philosophische Untersuchungen über das Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit und die damit zusammenhängenden Gegenstände; translated as Philosophical Investigations into the Essence of Human Freedom, Jeff Love and Johannes Schmidt (trans), Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 2006.

D. Secondary Literature

D.1 General

  • Antognazza, Maria Rosa, 1996, “Hofmann-Streit: Il Dibattito Sul Rapporto Tra Filosofia e Teologia All’università Di Helmstedt”, Rivista Di Filosofia Neo-Scolastica, 88(3): 390–420.
  • Assel, Heinrich, 2014, “The Uses of Luther’s Thought in the Nineteenth Century and the Luther Renaissance”, in Kolb, Dingel, and Bakta 2014: 551–572.
  • Bauch, Bruno, 1917, “Unser philosophisches Interesse an Luther”, Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik, 164: 128–48.
  • Beck, Lewis White, 1969, Early German Philosophy: Kant and his Predecessors, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, Part Two.
  • Bornhamm, Heinrich, 1955, Luther im Spiegel der deutschen Geistesgeschichte: Mit ausgewälten Texten von Lessing bis zur Gegenwart, Heidelberg: Quelle & Meyer.
  • Erdozain, Dominic, 2016, The Soul of Doubt: The Religious Roots of Unbelief from Luther to Marx, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gillespie, Michael Allen, 2008, The Theological Origins of Modernity, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Hampson, Daphne, 2017, “Luther, Lutheranism, and Post-Christianity”, in Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Religion, John Barton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199340378.013.507
  • Helmer, Christine, 2019, How Luther Became the Reformer, Louisville, KY: Westminster John Knox Press.
  • Hunter, Ian, 2006, “The University Philosopher in Early Modern Germany”, in The Philosopher in Early Modern Europe, Conal Condren, Stephen Gaukroger, and Ian Hunter (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 35–65. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511490460.003
  • Kolb, Robert, Irene Dingel, and L’ubomír Batka (eds.), 2014, The Oxford Handbook of Martin Luther’s Theology, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199604708.001.0001
  • Maritain, Jacques, 1925 [1928], Trois Réformateurs: Luther, Descartes, Rousseau, Paris: Librairie Plon; translated as Three Reformers: Luther, Descartes, Rousseau, London: Sheed and Ward.
  • Massing, Michael, 2018, Fatal Discord: Erasmus, Luther, and the Fight for the Western Mind, New York: Harper.
  • Melloni, Alberto (ed.), 2017, Martin Luther: A Christian Between Reforms and Modernity (1517–2017), Berlin: De Gruyter. doi:10.1515/9783110499025
  • Metzke, Erwin, 1934–35, “Lutherforschung und deutsche Philosophiegeschichte”, Blätter für deutsche Philosophie, 8: 355–82.
  • Pelikan, Jaroslav, 1950, From Luther to Kierkegaard, Saint Louis, MO: Concordia.
  • Podmore, Simon D., 2017, “Martin Luther in Modern European Philosophy”, in Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Religion, John Barton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199340378.013.317
  • Popkin, Richard H., 1979, The History of Scepticism from Erasmus to Spinoza, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Regier, Jonathan, 2016, “Logic, Mathematics and Natural Light: Liddel on the Foundations of Knowledge”, in Duncan Liddel (1561-1613), Pietro Daniel Omodeo (ed.), Leiden: Brill, 113–129. doi:10.1163/9789004310667_006
  • Rota, Giovanni, 2017, “Luther in Nineteenth and Twentieth Century Philosophy”, in Melloni 2017: 883–910. doi:10.1515/9783110499025-051
  • Smith, Leonard S., 2009, Religion and the Rise of History: Martin Luther and the Cultural Revolution in Germany, 1760–1810, Eugene, OR: Cascade.
  • Tessitore, Fulvio, 2017, “The Universalgeschichtlich Role of the Reformation According to Idealism and Historicism within German Culture”, in Melloni 2017: 911–932. doi:10.1515/9783110499025-052
  • Weber, Max, 1905, Protestantische Ethik und der Geist des Kapitalismus, Archiv für Sozialwissenschaft und Sozialpolitik, 20(1): 1–54, 21(1): 1–110; translated as The Protestant Ethic and the Spirit of Capitalism, Talcott Parsons (trans.), London: Routledge, 1992. Revised version of the 1930 edition.
  • Zachhuber, Johannes, 2017, “Martin Luther and Modernity, Capitalism, and Liberalism”, in Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Religion, John Barton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199340378.013.301
  • Zeeden, Ernst Walter, 1950 [1954], Martin Luther und die Reformation im Urteil des deutschen Luthertums, volume 1, Freiburg: Herder; translated as The Legacy of Luther, Ruth Mary Bethell (trans.), London: Hollis & Carter, 1954.

D.2 Hobbes

  • Cromartie, Alan, 2018, “Hobbes, Calvinism, and Determinism”, in Hobbes on Politics and Religion, Laurens van Apeldoorn and Robin Douglass (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 95–115.
  • Damrosch, Leopold, 1979, “Hobbes as Reformation Theologian: Implications of the Free-Will Controversy”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 40(3): 339–352. doi:10.2307/2709241
  • Jackson, Nicholas D., 2007, Hobbes, Bramhall and the Politics of Liberty and Necessity: A Quarrel of the Civil Wars and Interregnum, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511495830
  • Kodalle, Klaus-Michael, 1990, “Sterbliche Götter: Martin Luthers Ansichten zu Statt, Recht und Gewalt als Vorgriff auf Hobbes”, in Hobbes oggi, Andrea Napoli (ed), Milan: Franco Angeli, pp. 122–142.
  • Overhoff, Jürgen, 1997, “The Lutheranism of Thomas Hobbes”, History of Political Thought, 18(4): 604–623.

D.3 Leibniz

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew, 1994, Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Antognazza, Maria Rosa, 2008, Leibniz on the Trinity and the Incarnation: Reason and Revelation in the Seventeenth Century, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • –––, 2009, Leibniz: An Intellectual Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2018a, “Faith and Reason” in The Oxford Handbook of Leibniz, Maria Rosa Antognazza (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 717–34.
  • –––, 2018b, “Philosophical Theology and Christian Doctrines” in The Oxford Handbook of Leibniz, Maria Rosa Antognazza (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 735–55
  • Backus, Irena, 2016, Leibniz: Protestant Theologian, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fouke, Daniel C., 1992, “Metaphysics and the Eucharist in the Early Leibniz”, Studia Leibnitiana, 24(2): 145–159.
  • Goldenbaum, Ursula, 1998, “Leibniz as a Lutheran”, in Leibniz, Mysticism and Religion, A. P. Coudert et al. (eds), Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 169–192.
  • Hillman, T. Allan, 2013, “Leibniz and Luther on the Non-Cognitive Component of Faith”, Sophia, 52(2): 219–234. doi:10.1007/s11841-012-0310-8
  • Hinlicky, Paul R., 2009, Paths Not Taken: Fates of Theology from Luther Through Leibniz, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • Mercer, Christia, 2002, Leibniz’s Metaphysics: Its Origins and Development, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Pichler, Alois, 1869–70, Die Theologie des Leibniz, 2 vols., Munich: Gotta Buchhandlung.
  • Schweitz, Lea F., 2011, “Reasoning Faithfully: Leibniz on Reason’s Triumph of Faith and Love”, in The Devil’s Whore: Reason and Philosophy in the Lutheran Tradition, Jennifer Hockenbery Dragseth (ed), Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press, pp. 79–85.

D.4 Kant

  • Bauch, Bruno, 1904, Luther und Kant, Berlin: Reuther & Reichard.
  • Bohatec, Josef, 1938, Die Religionsphilosophie Kants in der “Religion innerhalb der Grenzen der blossen Vernunft”, mit besonderer Berücksichtigung ihrer theologisch-dogmatischen Quellen, Hamburg: Hoffmann und Campe.
  • Dienst, Karl, 2004, “Kant als ‘Philosoph des Protestantismus?’”, Journal für Religionskultur, 194: 1–8.
  • Ebbinghaus, Julius, 1927, “Luther und Kant”, Luther-Jahrbuch, 9: 119–155.
  • Eiben, Jürgen, 1989, Von Luther zu Kant: Der deutsche Sonderweg in die Moderne, Wiesbaden: Springer.
  • Kanterian, Edward, 2017, Kant, God and Metaphysics: The Secret Thorn, Abingdon: Routledge.
  • Kuehn, Manfred, 2001, Kant: A Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lindberg, Carl (ed), 2005, The Pietist Theologians, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Lötzsch, Frider, 1976, Vernunft und Religion im Denken Kants: Lutherisches Erbe bei Immanuel Kant, Köln: Böhlau Verlag.
  • Paulsen, Friedrich, 1900, “Kant der Philosoph des Protestantismus”, Kant-Studien, 4: 1– 31.
  • Raffelt, Albert, 2005, “Kant als Philosoph des Protestantismus – oder des Katholizismus?” in Kant und der Katholizismus: Stationen einer wechselhaften Geschichte, Nobert Fischer (ed.), Freiburg: Herder, pp. 139–159.
  • Shantz, Douglas H., 2013, An Introduction to German Pietism, Baltimore, MD: John Hopkins University Press.
  • Vanden Auweele, Dennis, 2013, “The Lutheran Influence on Kant’s Depraved Will”, International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 73(2): 117–134. doi:10.1007/s11153-011-9331-4
  • Wand, Bernard, 1971, “Religious Concepts and Moral Theory: Luther and Kant”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 9(3): 329–348. doi:10.1353/hph.2008.1268
  • White, Roger, 1990, “‘Ought’ Implies ‘Can’: Kant and Luther, a Contrast”, in Kant and His Influence, G. M. Ross and T. McWalter (eds), Bristol: Thommes, pp. 1–72.

D.5 Fichte

  • La Vopa, Anthony J., 2001, Fichte: The Self and the Calling of 1762–1799, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

D.6 Hegel

  • Asendorf, Ulrich, 1982, Luther und Hegel: Untersuchungen zur Grundlegung einer neuen systematischen Theologie, Wiesbaden: Steiner.
  • Duquette, David A., 1984, “Comment on Merold Westphal’s ‘Hegel and the Reformation’”, in History and System: Hegel’s Philosophy of History, Robert L. Perkins (ed), Albany, NY: SUNY Press, pp. 92–99.
  • Houlgate, Stephen, 2006, The Opening of Hegel’s “Logic”: From Being to Infinity, West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press.
  • –––, 2015, “Glaube, Liebe, Verzeihung: Hegel und die Religion”, Hegel-Studien, 49: 13–38.
  • Jaeschke, Walter, 1986 [1992], Die Vernunft in der Religion: Studien zur Grundlegung der Religionsphilosophie Hegels, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt : Frommann-Holzboog; translated as Reason in Religion: The Foundations of Hegel’s Philosophy of Religion, J. Michael Stewart and Peter C. Hodgson (trans.), Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1992.
  • Macgee, Glenn Alexander, 2001, Hegel and the Hermetic Tradition, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Maurer, Ernstpeter, 1996, Der Mensch im Geist: Untersuchungen zur Anthropologie bei Hegel und Luther, Gütersloh: Gütersloher Verlagshaus.
  • Merklinger, Philip M., 1993, “Unveiling Faith and Spirit: Hegel’s Criticism of Schleiermacher in the Foreword”, in his Philosophy, Theology, and Hegel’s Berlin Philosophy of Religion: 1821–1827, Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 75–113 (chapter 3).
  • Mure, G. R. G., 1966, “Hegel, Luther, and the Owl of Minerva”, Philosophy, 41(156): 127–139. doi:10.1017/S0031819100058502
  • Olson, Alan M., 1992, Hegel and the Spirit: Philosophy as Pneumatology, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • O’Regan, Cyril, 1994, The Heterodox Hegel, New York: SUNY Press.
  • Ritter, Joachim, 1975 [1982], “Hegel und die Reformation”, in Unbefangenes Christentum. Deutsche Repräsentanten und Interpreten des Protestantismus. Eine Sendereihe des Deutschlandfunks, W. Schmidt (ed.), Munich; translated as “Hegel and the Reformation”, in Ritter’s Hegel and the French Revolution: Essays on the Philosophy of Right: Essays on the Philosophy of Right, Richard Dien Winfield (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1982, pp. 183–91.
  • Rotstein, Abraham, 2018, Myth, Mind and Religion: The Apocalyptic Narrative, New York: Peter Lang, Chapters 7 and 8.
  • Thaidigsmann, Edgar, 1983, Identitätsverlangen und Widerspruch: Kreuzestheologie bei Luther, Hegel und Barth, Munich: Kaiser.
  • Westphal, Merold, 1984, “Hegel and the Reformation”, in History and System: Hegel’s Philosophy of History, Robert L. Perkins (ed), Albany, NY: SUNY Press, pp. 73–92.

D.7 Schelling

  • Hatem, Jan, 2013, Liberté humaine et divine ironie: Schelling avec Luther, Paris: Orizons.
  • Laughland, John, 2007, Schelling versus Hegel: From German Idealism to Christian Metaphysics, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Wirth, Jason M., 2019, “Schelling and Luther”, Theological Research. The Journal of Systematic Theology, 5: 93–105. doi:10.15633/thr.3303

D.8 Kierkegaard

  • Barnett, Christopher B., 2011, Kierkegaard, Pietism and Holiness, London: Routledge.
  • Barrett, Lee, 2002, “Faith, Works, and the Uses of the Law: Kierkegaard’s Appropriation of Lutheran Doctrine”, in For Self-Examination and Judge for Yourself!, Robert L. Perkins (ed), Macon, GA: Mercer University Press, pp. 77–109.
  • –––, 2015, “Kierkegaard’s Appropriation and Critique of Luther and Lutheranism”, in A Companion to Kierkegaard, Jon Stewart (ed), Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, pp. 180–92.
  • Bragstad, William R., 1976, “Luther’s Influence on Training in Christianity”, The Lutheran Quarterly, 28; 257–271.
  • Burgess, Andrew, 2000, “Kierkegaard’s Concept of Redoubling and Luther’s Simul Justus”, in Works of Love, Robert L. Perkins (ed), Macon, GA: Mercer University Press, pp. 39–55.
  • Fabro, Cornelio, 1984, “Kierkegaard e Lutero: incontro-scontro”, Humanitas, 39: 5–12.
  • Hall, Amy Laura, 2002, “The Call to Confession in Kierkegaard’s Works of Love”, in Kierkegaard and the Treachery of Love, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 11–50 (chapter 1).
  • Hampson, Daphne, 2001, “Kierkegaard’s Odyssey”, in Christian Contradictions: The Structures of Lutheran and Catholic Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 249–284 (chapter 7).
  • –––, 2013, Kierkegaard: Exposition and Critique, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hinkson, Craig, 2001, “Luther and Kierkegaard: Theologians of the Cross”, International Journal of Systematic Theology, 3(1): 27–45. doi:10.1111/1463-1652.00049
  • –––, “Will the Real Martin Luther Please Stand Up! Kierkegaard’s View of Luther versus the Evolving Perceptions of the Tradition”, in For Self-Examination and Judge for Yourself!, Robert L. Perkins (ed), Macon, GA: Mercer University Press, pp. 41–76.
  • Hughes, Carl S., 2017, “Søren Kierkegaard: Protesting the Lutheran Establishment”, in Radical Lutherans/Lutheran Radicals, Jason A. Mahn (ed), Eugene, OR: Cascade Books, pp. 43–69.
  • Kim, David Yoon-Jung and Joel Rasmussen, 2009, “Martin Luther: Reform, Secularization, and the Question of His “True Successor””, in Kierkegaard and the Renaissance and Modern Traditions, Tome II Theology, Jon Stewart (ed), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 173–217.
  • Koenker, Ernst B., 1968, “Søren Kierkegaard on Luther”, in Interpreters of Luther: Essays in Honor of Wilhelm Pauck, Jaroslav Pelikan (ed), Philadelphia, PA: Fortress Press, pp. 234–48.
  • Løkke, Håvard and Arild Waaler, 2009, “Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Traces of Kierkegaard’s Reading of the Theodicy” in Kierkegaard and the Renaissance and Modern Traditions, Tome I Philosophy, Jon Stewart (ed), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 51–76.
  • Palmer, Elizabeth, 2017, Faith in a Hidden God: Luther, Kierkegaard, and the Binding of Isaac, Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press.
  • Podmore, Simon D., 2006, “The Lightning and the Earthquake: Kierkegaard on the Anfechtung of Luther”, The Heythrop Journal, 47(4): 562–578. doi:10.1111/j.1468-2265.2006.00298.x
  • –––, 2013, Struggling With God: Kierkegaard and the Temptation of Spiritual Trial, Cambridge: James Clarke.
  • Prenter, Regin, 1981, “Luther and Lutheranism”, in Kierkegaard and the Great Traditions, Niels Thulstrup and Marie Mikulová Thulstrup (eds), Copenhagen: C.A. Reitzel, pp. 121–72.
  • Sløk, Johannes, 1962, “Kierkegaard and Luther”, in A Kierkegaard Critique, Howard A. Johnson and Niels Thulstrup (eds), New York: Harper, pp. 85–101.
  • Thulstrup, Maria Mikulová, 1967, Kierkegaard og Pietismen, Copenhagen: Munksgaard.

D.9 Nietzsche

  • Bluhm, Heinz, 1943, “Das Lutherbild der jungen Nietzsche”, Publications of the Modern Languages Association of America, 58(1): 264–288. doi:10.2307/459044
  • –––, 1950, “Nietzsche’s Idea of Luther in Menschliches, Allzumenschliches”, Publications of the Modern Languages Association of America, 65(6): 1053–1068. doi:10.2307/459719
  • –––, 1953, “Nietzsche’s View of Luther and the Reformation in Morgenröthe and Die fröhliche Wissenschaft”, Publications of the Modern Languages Association of America, 68(1): 111–127. doi:10.2307/459910
  • –––, 1956, “Nietzsche’s Final View of Luther and the Reformation”, Publications of the Modern Languages Association of America, 71(1): 75–83. doi:10.2307/460193
  • Fraser, Giles, 2002, Redeeming Nietzsche: On the Piety of Unbelief, London: Routledge.
  • Hirsch, Emanuel, 1920–21, “Nietzsche und Luther”, Jahrbuch der Luther-Gesellschaft, 2–3: 61–106; reprinted in Nietzsche-Studien, 15 (1986): 398–439.
  • Hollingdale, Richard, 1961, “Introduction” to Nietzsche’s Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Richard Hollingdale (trans.), Harmondsworth: Penguin.
  • Large, Duncan, 2003, “‘Der Bauernaufstand des Geistes’: Nietzsche, Luther and the Reformation”, in Nietzsche and the German Tradition, Nicholas Martin (ed), Bern: Peter Lang, pp. 111–137.
  • Pernet, Martin, 1995, “Friedrich Nietzsche and Pietism”, German Life and Letters, 48(4): 474–486. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0483.1995.tb01647.x
  • Westall, Joseph, 2004, “Zarathustra’s Germanity: Luther, Goethe, Nietzsche”, Journal of Nietzsche Studies, 27: 42–63.

D.10 Feuerbach and Marxism

  • Adamson, Walter Luiz, 2013, “Gramsci, Catholicism and Secular Religion”, Politics, Religion & Ideology, 14(4): 468–484. doi:10.1080/21567689.2013.829047
  • Adorno, Theodor W., 1933 [1989], Kierkegaard: Konstruktion des Ästhetischen, Tübingen, Mohr; translated as Kierkegaard: Construction of the Aesthetic, Robert Hullot-Kentor (trans.), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
  • –––, 1951 [2005], Minima Moralia: Minima Moralia: Reflexionen aus dem beschädigten Leben, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp; translated as Minima Moralia: Reflections From Damaged Life, E. F. N. Jephcott (trans.), London: Verso, 2005.
  • –––, 1970 [1984], Ästhetische Theorie, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp; translated as Aesthetic Theory, C. Lenhardt (trans.), London: Routledge, 1984.
  • Barth, Karl, 1957, “An Introductory Essay”, James Luther Adams (trans.), to Ludwig Feuerbach, The Essence of Christianity, George Elliot (trans.), New York: Harper and Row, pp. x–xxxii.
  • Bayer, Oswald, 1972, “Gegen Gott für den Menschen: Zu Feuerbachs Lutherrezeption”, Zeitschrift für Theologie und Kirche, 69: 34–71.
  • –––, 1981, “Marcuses Kritik an Luthers Freiheitsbegriff”, in Umstrittene Freiheit: Theologisch-philosophische Kontroversen, Tübingen: Mohr, pp. 13–38.
  • Boer, Roland, 2017, “Luther and Marxism”, in Melloni 2017: 953–964. doi:10.1515/9783110499025-054
  • –––, 2019, “From Luther to Marx and Engels”, in his Red Theology: On the Christian Communist Tradition, Leiden: Brill, pp. 61–103.
  • Brady, Thomas A. Jr., 2014, “Marxist Evaluations of Luther’s Thought”, in Kolb, Dingel, and Bakta 2014: 573–583.
  • Brendler, Gerhard, 1991, Martin Luther: Theology and Revolution, Claude R. Foster Jr (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brunvoll, Arve, 1996, “Gott ist Mensch”: Die Luther-Rezeption Ludwig Feuerbachs und die Entwicklung seiner Religionskritik, Frankfurt: Peter Lang.
  • Chino, Taido J., 2020, “Reforming Promeity: Feuerbach’s Misreading of Luther”, International Journal of Philosophy and Theology, 81(1): 71–86. doi:10.1080/21692327.2019.1597756
  • Glasse, John, 1972, “Why Did Feuerbach Concern Himself With Luther?”, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 26(101): 364–385.
  • –––, 1975, “Feuerbach und die Theologie: Sechs Thesen über den Fall Luther”, in Atheismus in der Diskussion: Kontroversen um Ludwig Feuerbach, Hermann Lübbe and Hans-Martin Sass (eds), Munich: Kaiser, pp. 28–35.
  • Harvey, Van A., 1998, “Feuerbach on Luther’s Doctrine of Revelation: An Essay in Honor of Brian Gerrish”, The Journal of Religion, 78(1): 3–17. doi:10.1086/490120
  • Kern, Udo, 1984, “Zu Ludwig Feuerbachs Lutherverständnis”, Neue Zeitschrift für Systematische Theologie und Religionsphilosophie, 26: 29–44.
  • Lehmann, Hartmut, 2004, “Das marxistische Lutherbild von Engels bis Honecker”, in Luther zwischen den Kulturen: Zeitgenossenschaft – Weltwirkung, Hans Medick and Peer Schmidt (eds), Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, pp. 500–516.
  • –––, 2004, “The Rehabilitation of Martin Luther in the GDR, or Why Thomas Müntzer Failed to Stabilise the Moorings of Socialist Ideology”, in Religion in the Cold War, Dianne Kirby (ed), New York: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, pp. 200–210.
  • Lindberg, Carter, 1970, “Luther and Feuerbach”, Sixteenth Century Essays and Studies, 1: 107–125. doi:10.2307/3003687
  • Rotstein, Abraham, 2018, Myth, Mind and Religion: The Apocalyptic Narrative, New York: Peter Lang: Chapter 9.

D.11 Heidegger

  • Armitage, Duane, 2016, Heidegger’s Pauline and Lutheran Roots, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Clifton-Soderstrom, Karl, 2009, “The Phenomenology of Religious Humility in Heidegger’s Reading of Luther”, Continental Philosophy Review, 42(2): 171–200. doi:10.1007/s11007-009-9102-4
  • Crowe, Benjamin, 2006, “Luther’s Theologia Crucis” in Heidegger’s Religious Origins, Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, pp. 15–43 (chapter 2).
  • McGrath, S. J., 2006, The Early Heidegger and Medieval Philosophy: Phenomenology for the Godforsaken, Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Pöggeler, Otto, 2004, “Heideggers Luther-Lektüre im Freiburg Theologenkonvikt”, Heidegger-Jahrbuch, 1: 185–196.
  • Schlink, Edmund, 1955, “Weisheit und Torheit”, Kerygma und Dogma, 1: 1–22.
  • Sommer, Christian, 2005, Aristote, Heidegger, Luther: Les sources aristotéliciennes et néo-testamentaires d’Être et temps, Paris: PUF.
  • Stanley, Timothy, 2007, “Heidegger on Luther on Paul”, Dialog: A Journal of Theology, 46(1): 41–45. doi:10.1111/j.1540-6385.2007.00306.x
  • Van Buren, John, 1994, “Martin Heidegger, Martin Luther”, in Reading Heidegger from the Start: Essays in His Earliest Thought, Theodore J. Kisiel and John Van Buren (eds), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, pp. 159–74.

D.12 Løgstrup

  • Andersen, Svend, 2007, “In the Eyes of a Lutheran Philosopher: How Løgstrup Treated Moral Thinkers”, in Concern for the Other: Perspectives on the Ethics of K. E. Løgstrup, Svend Andersen and Kees van Kooten Niekerk (eds), Notre Dame, IN: Notre Dame University Press, pp. 29–53.
  • –––, 2017, Løgstrup og Luther, Aarhus: Klim.
  • Bennett, Christopher, Paul Faulkner, and Robert Stern, 2019, “Indirect Communication, Authority, and Proclamation as a Normative Power: Løgstrup’s Critique of Kierkegaard”, Graduate Faculty Philosophy Journal, 40(1): 147–179. doi:10.5840/gfpj20194018
  • Rabjerg, Bjørn and Robert Stern, 2018, “Freedom from the Self: Luther and Løgstrup on Sin as ‘Incurvatus in Se’”, Open Theology, 4(1): 268–280. doi:10.1515/opth-2018-0020
  • Stern, Robert, 2019, The Radical Demand in Løgstrup’s Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 308–329 (chapter 11).

Other Cited Works

  • Hegel, G. W. F., 1830 [2010], Enzyklopädie der philosophischen Wissenschaften I: Die Wissenschaft der Logik, translated as Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences, Part I: Science of Logic, Klaus Brinkmann and Daniel O. Dahlstrom (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • McGrath, Alister E., 1985, Luther’s Theology of the Cross, Oxford: Blackwell.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I am grateful to the following for extremely useful comments on previous versions of this entry, and for general discussions of Luther that have helped shape the views expressed herein: Maria Rosa Antognazza, David Bagchi, David Batho, Ryan Byerly, Sophie Grace Chappell, Benjamin Crowe, Theodor Dieter, Fabian Freyenhagen, Josh Furnal, Daphne Hampson, Susanne Hermann-Sinai, Iona Hine, Bo Christian Holm, Stephen Houlgate, Roderick Howlett, Volker Leppin, Wayne Martin, Alister McGrath, John Monfasani, Kees van Kooten Niekerk, Rory Phillips, Simon Podmore, Bjørn Rabjerg, Richard Rex, Daniel Roche, Joe Saunders, and Dan Watts.

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