Philosophy of Microbiology

First published Wed Aug 12, 2020

Why should philosophers pay attention to microbes? Many philosophical topics seem quite obviously unmicrobial, insofar as they focus on issues concerning human capacities, activities, and interests. Even philosophers of biology used to focus almost exclusively on animals, meaning that the field neglected many lineages of life. But redressing that imbalance is underway, and fungi and plants as well as microbes are receiving some attention in philosophy of biology. However, such topics are a minority interest in philosophy at large, where the focus is mostly (if not exclusively) on humans and our minds, worldviews, reasoning, and other endeavors. Microbes are minute and mindless, which makes them hard to appreciate without a microscope. Nevertheless, paying attention to microbes is justified in broader philosophy of science as well as other general philosophical fields.

The entry begins with a discussion of the biology and biological uses of microbes, before expanding into more generally philosophical domains, which we discuss in detail in Sections 2–5:

  • Microbes carry out the bulk of biological activities on the planet. They were the Earth’s first lifeforms, and lie at the base of every major transition to new forms of life.
  • Microbiology is a science that has given rise to modern medicine, molecular biology, genomics, molecular evolution, and numerous other fields, all of which generate rich philosophical discussion.
  • Microbes have capacities to be used as material models of general phenomena in experimental settings.
  • Contemporary microbiome research shows how microbes and microbiology can inform broader philosophical discussions about human nature, individuality, and causality, among other topics.

1. Background

Philosophy of biology used not to pay a great deal of attention to microbes (aka microorganisms) and microbiology. This neglect occurred not because of active bias but simply because of habits gained from contingent influences on the development of the field. For example, the scientists most connected with the expansion of philosophy of biology in the 1960s and 1970s happened to be zoologists and evolutionists (e.g., Ernst Mayr and Richard Lewontin). Their interests and expertise naturally and productively shaped the way in which philosophy of biology made headway throughout the 1980s and 1990s (see the entry on philosophy of biology).[1]

But once the field was strong and thriving, a “zoocentric perspective” on philosophy of biology became hard to justify (O’Malley and Dupré 2007). In biology, ever-increasing molecular insight into life on Earth disclosed massive roles for microbes, both ecologically and evolutionarily. Philosophically, treating animals and particularly humans as paradigm organisms was recognized as indefensible, except for particular metazoan (i.e., animal) features of philosophical interest thought to have no microbial analogues (e.g., predation, ageing, kin recognition, cognition).[2]

The tide turned in the mid-2000s, when increasing numbers of philosophers began using microbes as examples, or microbiological science as a source of case studies. Evolutionary, classificatory and phylogenetic issues took up the bulk of this new attention (Franklin-Hall 2007; Ereshefsky 2010; Velasco 2010), which expanded to include questions about individuality (Dupré and O’Malley 2007; Ereshefsky & Pedroso 2013) and the origins and nature of life in its earliest microbial forms (Cleland 2007; Parke 2013). New topics that refer to microbes these days include even the evolution of mind and subjectivity (Godfrey-Smith 2016; Allen 2017). It is now fairly mainstream to mention microbes or use microbiological case material in philosophical discussions of any sort of biological phenomenon.

A clarification necessary at the outset is that none of this work depends on or justifies drawing a hard line between microbes and non-microbes. Life is not most effectively divided into two obvious groups of microbes and macrobes, nor unicellular and multicellular organisms (see Table 1). These are terms of pure convenience, with many exceptions (O’Malley 2014). Older “kingdom” perspectives identified at least two kinds of microorganisms (bacteria and protists), plus three kinds of multicellular organisms (plants, fungi, and animals) (Whittaker 1969). Subsequent classifications expanded the category to which bacteria belong, and sometimes continued to conflate them with a superficially similar group of organisms now called Archaea (e.g., Margulis 1996). From cell-biological and evolutionary perspectives, however, lumping Bacteria and Archaea together as one kind of life is seriously misleading (Woese 1994; Pace 2006; Embley & Williams 2015; Table 1).

Term Usage/definition Issues and context
Microorganism, microbe (informal) Unicellular organism; sometimes any organism viewed microscopically Many microbes form multicellular colonies or structured consortia; some single cells are visible (e.g., slime moulds); no classificatory or evolutionary basis
Macroorganism, macrobe (very informal) Multicellular organism; sometimes any organism visible without a microscope Most multicellular organisms are occupied by unicellular ones; some multicellular organisms are microscopic (e.g., tardigrades); no classificatory or evolutionary basis
Bacteria (informally bacteria (not in title case), singular bacterium), for a short while called eubacteria (still popular in some accounts); colloquially known as ‘germs’ Domain-level category of life that includes dozens of phyla of bacteria Takes off as a term for the smallest unicellular organisms in the mid-nineteenth century; included Archaea until their identification in the 1970s
Archaea (informally archaea (not in title case), singular archaeon), previously archaebacteria (still used in some accounts) Domain-level category of life that includes several major branches, of which eukaryotes are now widely believed to be one Considered by some systematists not to be sufficiently important to be a domain of equal status to eukaryotes; questions now about whether eukaryotes are part of Archaea or a new domain derived from it.
Prokaryote (informal) Older term of convenience often used to mean non-eukaryote; cells without classic nucleus and other compartments No evolutionary basis; obscures major evolutionary divergence of Bacteria and Archaea; potentially emphasizes the mere absence of eukaryote features
Eukaryote (informally eukaryote(s)), sometimes Eukaryota/Eucaryota or Eukarya/Eucarya Cells with nucleus and other compartments, including mitochondria (not obligatory to definition); includes kingdom-level groups of animals, plants and algae, fungi, and protists Not clear this distinctive cell type is best considered a domain; may be an important diversification within Archaea; traditional kingdom categories do not capture the mostly microbial nature of eukaryotes.
Protist (informal), previously Protista, Proctoctista etc (includes protozoa) Unicellular eukaryotes of mixed lineages; can include fungi and multicellular algae. Classic examples are pathogens (e.g., Giardia) and photosynthesizers (e.g., algae) Most eukaryotes are protists of one sort or another.
Virus Non-cellular replicators using either eukaryotic or archaeal cells to reproduce; not microorganismal, but often included in casual discussions of microbes Despite not being cellular or self-replicating without a host, and thus not ‘living’ by most accounts, it is difficult to understand microbial life without paying attention to viruses.
Bacteriophage, phage Non-cellular replicators using bacterial cells to reproduce; not microorganismal, but often included in casual discussions of microbes Despite not being cellular or self-replicating without a host, and thus not ‘living’ by most accounts, it is difficult to understand bacterial life without paying attention to phages.
‘Lower organism’: antiquated terminology for small and less apparently complex lifeforms Persists in non-microbiological discussions of microbes Not validated by any biological or evolutionary approach; tends to imply great-chain-of-being progressivism.
‘Higher organism’: similarly antiquated terminology for large and more obviously complex organisms Persists in zoology, botany, and some broader communication of biology (see Rigato & Minelli 2013) Not validated by any biological or evolutionary approach; tends to imply great-chain-of-being progressivism.

Table 1: serves as a glossary for subsequent sections. It shows some of the historical terminology and classifications of microbes, plus issues with various terms and categories.

Recognizing the looseness of the terms used to designate microbes does not mean, however, that either the study or impact of microorganisms is incoherent or disconnected. Unicellular life forms—organisms with the ability to live and reproduce as a single cell most (but not necessarily all) of the time[3]—are often argued to have large biological spheres of action and thus implications for all living things.

2. Reasons to Pay Attention to Microbes

This section marshals the main reasons for paying attention to microbes. It describes what microorganisms do, and how they lend themselves to philosophical investigation.

2.1 Biological reasons

Although “biological” can refer to a multitude of phenomena, the focus here is on the ecology and evolution of microbes. Ecology and evolution not only work together to explain the properties of particular microorganismal groups, but also reveal the broad biological relevance of microorganisms to all life, and to human quality of life.

2.1.1 Ecological reasons

A basic reason to pay attention to microbes can be inferred from claims that humans live in a fundamentally microbial world (e.g., Staley et al. 1997). Statements of this sort refer to the pervasiveness of microbes throughout the planet, and the fundamental contributions they make to every ecosystem. Two aspects of microbial processes in the world stand out to make this view possible: biogeochemical cycles and microbial symbiosis. Both matter a great deal to human existence, from the maintenance of the planet as we know it to the health of our own bodies.

Biogeochemical cycles are what make the planet “function” in any sense. On Earth today, carbon, oxygen, and nitrogen cycles are particularly obvious. These cycles are interdependent, and display a degree of stability over geological time (e.g., oxygen has made up 21% of the Earth’s atmosphere for almost half a billion years, despite extraordinary fluctuations in lifeforms and physical features of the planet such as temperature). Although geological processes sustain such cycles over very long timescales, the world humans experience is largely a product of far more rapid microbial interactions. Microbes “run” most of these cycles as they generate energy from chemical compounds and light (Falkowski et al. 2008; Jelen et al. 2016). Microorganisms prevail even when they comprise less of the biomass involved than macroorganisms participating in the same process. For example, plants form the physical bulk of organisms involved in carbon and oxygen cycles (Bar-On et al. 2018), but a large amount of that biomass is made up of non-living material in woody plants. This material is often called “heartwood”, and it does not contribute actively to biogeochemical cycles (Chattaway 1952).[4] In fact, the very tendency of microbes not to hoard elements in the form of biomass and instead, to have a high turnover of metabolizing populations (Strom 2008; Zimmerman et al. 2020), could explain in part why there are fairly rapid biogeochemical cycles on the planet rather than long-term chemical sinks.

Animals such as ourselves could not live without oxygen, which is a powerful electron acceptor that allows the energy investments permissive of large animal body size (Payne et al. 2011). Oxygen on this planet would not have become available were it not for pioneering oxygen-producing microbes, which are photosynthesizers called cyanobacteria. They not only began to excrete oxygen almost three billion years ago, but their very capacity to do so was forcibly captured by later eukaryotes and eventually led to algae, plants, and the planet we know today. In a distal causal sense, therefore, philosophy is possible because of bacterial photosynthesis.

The chemical cycling carried out by microbes occurs not only at a macroscale with planetary implications, but also internally, in our very own bodies. Symbiosis, the intimate “living together” of different organisms, is a key organizational motif of the microbial world, but it reaches far beyond microorganisms to encompass every (relatively) large living thing. Long recognized and conceptually debated, symbiosis is usually deemed to include a variety of relationship types: negative consequences for one of the organisms (parasitic), positive outcomes for both (mutualistic), and various mixes of beneficial and “non-harm, non-help” relationships (commensal) between microbes and their partners (Saffo 1992; Sapp 2004).

A classic symbiotic relationship is found in lichens, which are made of tightly integrated fungi and photosynthesizing microbes (algae, cyanobacteria or both). Although the contributing organisms reproduce separately, they form similarly organized units of lichen, generation after generation. Benefits are often thought to accrue for both partners, and are cashed out as higher reproductive fitness (Honegger 1998; however, cf. Hyvärinen et al. 2002). Many other symbioses are intimate and persistent, but more obviously manipulate at least one of the partners in the arrangement. A curious example is the bacterium Wolbachia in insects. This bacterium is obligately part of the insect reproductive process. It can “feminize” insect embryos and kill males to ensure its own reproduction (Werren et al. 2008). But despite Wolbachia hijacking the insect for its own reproductive requirements, there are variable fitness benefits for its host (e.g., Fry et al. 2004). In some host-symbiont systems, Wolbachia and the insect can benefit, despite the manipulation of the latter by the former.

All humans are involved in a range of ongoing stable symbioses with microbes living in and on our bodies. The majority of these microbes are in the gut, but the skin, lungs, and every bodily orifice are populated by multiple groups of interacting microorganisms. Many of the microbes in our gut are not really helping or harming us: they are there to take advantage of the nutritional resources that are so plentiful in the intestines. Our body’s immune response controls and manages them so they are at least not detrimental, even if they are ineliminable. Inescapable symbiosis implies, however, that human bodies are intrinsically and inseparably microbial ecosystems. Whether this is meaningful in any philosophical sense will be discussed in detail in Section 5. Human bodies are not where this question ends, however.

Because symbiotic microorganisms are tiny and pervade all ecosystems, and because such symbioses contribute so much metabolically to the overall biochemical activity on the Earth, some theorists have been moved to suggest what is known as the Gaia hypothesis of the living Earth. In this view, Gaia is the total complex of “atmosphere, biosphere, oceans and soils” that is regulated by “a feedback or cybernetic system which seeks an optimal physical and chemical environment for the biota” (Margulis & Lovelock 1974: 473). Microorganisms are given primary mechanistic responsibility for such regulatory effects, even though all life participates in self-maintenance of the wider system. Many biologists and philosophers remain unpersuaded by the Gaia hypothesis (see Resnik 1992; Pigliucci 2014); nevertheless, it is worthy of mention as an instance in which the versatility, abundance, minuteness and pervasiveness of microbes lead to them being given a powerful ecological status for their roles in determining the way life works on Earth.

2.1.2 Evolutionary reasons

Another way in which microbes have a dominating role in biology is because so very much of Earth’s evolutionary history is devoted to them. Stephen Jay Gould, a microbiologically aware zoologist, is often quoted to capture the historical saturation of life on Earth by “bacteria” (which probably include Archaea in the sense he means—see Table 1):

The most salient feature of life has been the stability of its bacterial mode from the beginning of the fossil record until today and, with little doubt, into all future time so long as the earth endures. This is truly the “age of bacteria”—as it was in the beginning, is now and ever shall be. (Gould 1994: 87)

In whatever way life began approximately 3.8 billion years ago, the first cells were something recognizably microbial, most probably bacterial. The next two billion years were also exclusively microbial, with Bacteria and Archaea manipulating the planet’s geochemistry to their own metabolic advantage, except when those unable to adjust to rising oxygen levels were wiped out by the cyanobacterial excretion of it. Another accidental consequence of microbial diversification was the formation of eukaryotic microbes, which fewer than a billion years ago diversified into the ancestral forms of the various multicellular groups we recognize today. Most of that diversification has in fact happened just in the last half billion years, in conjunction with ongoing microbial activities, hence Gould’s epithet.

2.2 Philosophical reasons

All very well, you might say: biologists certainly should think microbes are important. But what about philosophers? What can microbes tell them? There are numerous debates in philosophy of biology in which neglecting microbes would seriously weaken, or at least bias, any philosophical conclusions that might be reached. This entry will focus on three connected philosophy of biology topics: views about species, the tree of life, and major transitions in evolution. A discussion of a broader philosophy of science topic, philosophy of modelling, follows in Section 3.

2.2.1 Species concepts

Species concepts might be of little philosophical interest if the only organisms that needed classifying were animals. The most applicable and conceptually well-founded species concept for animals—and the most familiar species concept to those outside biology—is the biological species concept (BSC). It says that a species is a group of organisms that can breed only within that group. Even though there are some well-recognized problems in applying a single species concept to all animal life (see Dupré 2001), problem cases are usually seen as exceptions that do not fundamentally trouble the BSC (Mayr 1982; Coyne & Orr 1998; however, cf. Mallet 2008). Plants introduce additional but probably surmountable problems, argue many zoologists (e.g., Mayr 1982); unfortunately, fungi might be beyond the pale by virtue of resisting any such “universal” species concept (see Petersen & Hughes 1999). But since many fungi are unicellular, and exhibit all kinds of reproductive oddities, it might just be safest to accept the old assertion that unicellular and particularly asexual organisms do not and cannot form species, and thus are not exceptions to a universal species concept (e.g., Mayr 1987). These are just some of the issues that arise when venturing beyond animals in attempts to apply species concepts. In response to these sorts of issues, a range of other species concepts have been proposed, drawing on morphological, molecular, or evolutionary characteristics such as forming lineages of a certain sort (see the SEP entry on species).

Microbes, and particularly Bacteria and Archaea, provide a treasure trove of problems for species concepts. They do not sexually reproduce, they are not morphologically rich for the most part (protists are, so morphology has been a large part of their historic classification), and they do not form the right sort of reproductively isolated lineages. Importantly, whatever lineage-like interpretations can be made of their descent relationships are confounded by major and promiscuous episodes of gene transfer between these otherwise distinct lineages (Doolittle 1999; Martin 1999; Gogarten et al. 2002). As soon as philosophers consider microbes, especially Bacteria and Archaea, they usually default to a pluralistic view of species concepts. It is one thing to find a concept that mostly works for animals and even plants, but it is more or less universally admitted that no single concept works across the entirety of the diversity of the tree of life, on any reconstruction of that tree (Dupré 2001; Ereshefsky 1998, 2010; Doolittle & Zhaxybayeva 2009).

2.2.2 The tree of life

The tree of life is a representation of species in the form of lineage relationships, or at least that is how it is commonly interpreted (Ragan 2009; O’Malley et al. 2010). By making inferences from present-day data back to ancestral states, including common ancestry and divergence points, evolutionary biologists can build phylogenies, which not only capture evolutionary relationships but also give them approximate dates. Phylogenies have traditionally been constructed on the basis of morphological data, including fossils, but the last few decades have seen the rapid rise of molecular phylogenies. The use of gene and protein sequences, plus computational methods, has allowed far finer grained and more extensive reconstructions of all life on the tree (including organisms with limited morphological characters, such as microbes and fungi).

However, one unanticipated consequence of such a proliferation of data and trees has been the repeated finding that many prokaryotic organisms exchange genes between lineages, including genes of major lineage-defining importance. The extent and significance of such transfers is such that the standard method of constructing a phylogeny, in the form of a graph-theoretic representation of lineages admitting only vertical descent, is violated. In addition, molecular data reveals the extent of hybridization in multicellular organisms (Mallet et al. 2016). The tree of life therefore becomes a questionable construct (Doolittle & Bapteste 2007; Dagan & Martin 2009), both metaphysically and pragmatically. At the very least, any philosopher reflecting on the tree of life and what it represents will have to consider microbial evolution (Velasco 2010).

2.2.3 Major transitions in evolution

Major transitions have been a focal topic in philosophy of biology since John Maynard Smith and Eörs Szathmáry’s book, The Major Transitions in Evolution (1997). They focused on key transitions in the history of life on Earth ranging from the origin of cells to the origin of sex to the origin of language. Philosophical discussion of the major transitions in evolution largely revolves around efforts to find a unifying theme to bind major transitions into a single theory (the same aspiration that drives many species and tree of life discussions). A common choice for that theme has been individuality, meaning any major transition in evolution is understood to involve most centrally a transition in evolutionary individuality (e.g., Ratcliff et al. 2017; Michod 2011; however, cf. O’Malley and Powell 2016). But irrespective of any particular theoretic commitment to the nature of evolutionary transitions, microbial evolution is crucial for understanding the various transformations life on Earth made on the way to its current state. This is very much the case even if theorists want to understand only the evolution of eukaryotes, or even if they care exclusively about the origin of metazoa—the “kingdom” within eukaryotes to which humans belong.[5]

Eukaryotes are organisms characterized by intracellular complexity, and in particular, by the compartmentalizing organelles within their cells. Most prokaryotes do not exhibit the same degree of compartmentalization (however, cf. Murat et al. 2010). The majority of eukaryotes are unicellular (Burki et al. 2020), but the macroscopic ones are almost all multicellular and often conspicuous. It is very common for scientists and philosophers to consider bodily bulk and multipart complexity as phenomena of evolutionary importance (e.g., Carroll 2001). Although there can be many ecological reasons that sustain that impression (i.e., the sheer impact large organisms have on environments; see Enquist et al. 2020), recent findings about the origins of eukaryotes might temper that view at least a little.

The long-standing view on the origin of eukaryotes is: A. That they arose from a merger of a bacterium and an archaeon; and B. That this unique lineage flourished and carved out its own “domain” space in phylogeny (see Table 1). Being a domain is at least partly justified by the diversity and complexity of the organisms that comprise eukaryotes (Butterfield 2014): plants, animals, fungi and protists. Recently, however, discoveries have been made of a diverse group of Archaea, known as the Asgard clade. Theoretically important eukaryotic features have been inferred from their genes (Eme et al. 2017). These gene-based inferences indicate that eukaryotes fit firmly within the domain of Archaea, where they form a rather morphologically heterogeneous group, but nevertheless remain subordinated to their basic archaeal identity (Williams et al. 2020). The same inferences also suggest that eukaryotes originated gradually, driven by gene diversification of various sorts (including gene transfers), and that the endosymbiotic acquisition of the bacterium that became the mitochondrion possibly occurred late in the evolutionary story (Pittis & Gabaldón 2016). In other words, this “transition” is not primarily driven by a transformation in individuality, and is first and foremost a story about diversification within Archaea. Many details are still to be divulged about the extant relatives of the group of Archaea closest to eukaryotes, but a clear message is already available: understanding the origin of eukaryotes requires understanding the evolution of Archaea.

A similar lesson can be learned even when moving further along the historic branches of a schematic tree of life to gain insight into the origin and diversification of metazoans. Although classic schemes do not include the origin of metazoans as a major transition, it is nevertheless a diversification of particular importance from a human perspective (Carroll 2001). Even if the origin of eukaryotes is thought to be uninteresting, because their original state is necessarily unicellular, nobody would disagree that the origin of metazoans is highly pertinent to understanding human evolution, since all metazoans are multicellular and humans are a group within them.

Interestingly, however, much of the recent progress in understanding the origin of metazoans depends on findings about close unicellular relatives of animals, particularly choanoflagellates as well as slightly more distant protists called filastereans and ichthyosporeans. Genomic and experimental analyses of these organisms have allowed evolutionary inferences about genes and features once thought to be exclusively metazoan. It turns out that the genetic bases of many characteristics once thought of as unique to metazoan evolution are also found in closely related unicellular organisms. Adhesion capacities, developmental signalling pathways, and “metazoan-specific” gene regulatory factors—all features not normally thought of as properties of unicellular organisms—long pre-existed metazoan origins (King et al. 2008; Sebé-Pedrós et al. 2017). Moreover, many of these extant unicellular relatives of metazoans turn into different cell types as they transition to different stages in their life cycles. Some stages form sophisticated multicellular arrangements, which may sometimes be driven by interactions with bacteria (Alegado et al. 2012; Woznica et al. 2016). The moral of this story is thus becoming familiar: even the evolutionary divergence of the organisms considered the most complex (because of giving rise to ourselves) needs a microbial perspective.

So far, this entry has discussed microbes from a “microbes-eye perspective” of biological classification, ecology and evolution. But of course there is a whole scientific field called microbiology, which is a collection of methods designed specifically to reveal what is going on in the microbial world. We now examine more directly that science and some of its philosophical implications.

3. Microbiological Science

Microbiology of the future will become the primary biological science, the base upon which our future understanding of the living world rests, and the font from which new understanding of it flows. (from journal summary of Woese 1994[6])

Although it can be argued that microbiology began with microscopy in the early seventeenth century (e.g., Gest 2004; Lane 2015), the disciplinary starting point for bacteriology and eventually microbiology is usually bestowed on its experimental turn a couple of centuries later (Bulloch 1938). Early microscopy allowed observational microbiology for sure, but it gave rise to limited classification, and even more limited insights into what microbes could do consistently. The second half of the nineteenth century is when experimentation on microbes was codified, with the aim of understanding the specific and stable effects of particular microorganisms on disease in animals and plants. A central part of this emerging tradition involved pure culture techniques, Koch’s postulates, and germ theory. Each of these has ongoing philosophical ramifications.

Medicine changed fundamentally in the later part of the nineteenth century, and many historians of medicine locate the scrutiny of microorganisms via experimental laboratory methods at the heart of this transformation (e.g., Worboys 2000; Kreuder-Sonnen 2016). Pure culture, in which isolated and putatively causal microorganisms are grown in laboratories, was the first step. Normally, bacteria and other microbes live in complex multispecies communities. Such communities, however, are useless for identifying and intervening on the causes of diseases. Various innovations of nineteenth-century laboratory science (glassware, growth media, identification methods, micrography) enabled verifiable pure cultures of single species to be grown independently of their host organisms. Such cultures in turn allowed Koch’s postulates for causality to be implemented.

Koch’s postulates are a general method to identify causal outcomes from specific bacteria. Microorganisms isolated and grown from diseased hosts are introduced to non-diseased hosts to see if the same disease obtains. Cultures from that new disease site then confirm the presence and activity of the suspect microbe (Ross & Woodward 2016; Gillies 2016). Once it could be established that these causal effects are highly specific and stable, the germ theory of disease could then draw all such findings into one common framework with predictive power (e.g., tuberculosis will always be caused by a particular bacterium, then known as the tubercle bacillus). The systematicity and experimentality underlying germ theory thus began the transformation of medicine from a purely observational and often anecdotal activity to an increasingly experimental and scientifically robust programme of research that had therapeutic and preventive successes (Worboys 2000; Vernon 1990). As a consequence, the investigation of bacteria and other microbes was integrated into a range of established disciplines in universities, hospitals and independent institutions (including industry) from the late nineteenth century onwards (Vernon 1990).

This tendency of microbiology to pervade and transform other fields is a hallmark of the science’s development. Molecular microbiology, a product of the mid-twentieth century, amply illustrates this trend. Following the successes of germ-theoretic accounts of microbes and disease, microbial biochemistry flourished as microbiologists focused on the precise causal pathways by which microbes achieved their effects (whether in hosts or other environments). The laboratory tractability of microbes and versatility of their metabolic accomplishments gave rise to a vast experimental literature on bacterial biochemistry (e.g., Kluyver 1936; Stephenson 1939). In the 1940s, this background lent itself to the emerging field of what became molecular biology, in which all the initial major discoveries were made in microbial systems. The bacterium Escherichia coli (E. coli) in particular had epistemic

primacy in forging our picture of the fundamentals of life—the physical and chemical underpinnings of gene structure, replication, and expression … [these and other] prokaryotes gave us the language and much of the knowledge of molecular biology relevant to all organisms to this day. (Davis 2003: 154; see also Brock 1990)

The very identification of DNA as the material of heredity was carried out in bacterial and viral experimental systems (Avery et al. 1943; Hershey & Chase 1952). Subsequently, the expansion of molecular biology into genome sequencing and metagenomics (the sequencing and analysis of whole community genomes) began and flourished in microorganisms. This broader molecular scope enabled not only methodological and technological advances (see SEP entry on genomics and postgenomics), but also major evolutionary and ecological insights into the evolutionary history and community dynamics of large swathes of the biosphere (Davis 2003; Handelsman 2004). Most new empirical insights into major evolutionary transitions (as discussed in Subsection 2.2.3) are based on these genomic and metagenomic microbial investigations.

Both in the early and later developments of molecular biology, microbes functioned in many respects as general molecular models for biological insight and technological development. The very fact that microbes can play this stand-in role for life in general drove many successes in the field. However, it might be a concern that microbes are useful only for what they tell researchers about microbial life, and that the knowledge generated by microbiological investigations will always be restricted to aspects of microbial biology. For instance, gene regulation in the form of operons (modules of genes treated as genetic regulatory units) was discovered in the bacterium E. coli, as well as in one of their viruses, in the 1950s (Jacob & Monod 1961). But although there are now known to be many important differences between bacterial and eukaryotic gene regulation, and different modes of gene regulation within just bacteria (Beckwith 2011), the E. coli operon model launched a whole field of investigation driven by general expectations about how gene expression could be effectively controlled (Brenner et al. 1990). Ultimately, eukaryotic gene regulation had to be studied in tractable multicellular organisms in order to ascertain the additional complexities and differences of eukaryote gene regulation from the bacterial model.

4. Microbes as Models

The lesson to be learned from the above historical discussion is that even though there are clear limits to the applicability of any model system, it is equally clear that microbes are remarkable in their capacity to model living processes in general. This section elaborates on the various ways this is the case.

4.1 Virtues of microbial models

While physical models of various sorts are used throughout the sciences, model organisms are a kind of model system particular to the life sciences. “Model organism” typically refers to the organisms that are bred, propagated, and studied in laboratories in the biomedical and life sciences. Classic animal examples include nematodes (“worms”), Drosophila (fruit flies) and mice. An important plant model is Arabidopsis (mustard cress). Fungi are represented by yeast, which is also used to model all eukaryotes (Botstein & Fink 2011). While a wealth of important model organism research is carried out on relatively large organisms, microbes are regarded as especially tractable model systems. This is very much the case in experimental evolution and ecology, where microbial systems allow researchers to study dynamical processes in large populations over many generations. These modelling capacities have general philosophical implications.

The methodology and epistemology of modelling with model organisms is a topic of increasing discussion in the history and philosophy of science (Ankeny & Leonelli 2011; Endersby 2007; see also the SEP entry on experiment in biology). These discussions include recent debates about what sorts of models model organisms are, and whether they qualify as genuine models. A number of philosophers of modelling classify model organisms in the same category as other physical analogue models, such as the model airplanes used in studies of aerodynamics or the sandboxes used to model geological processes in laboratories (Weisberg 2013; McClay and Dooley 1995; SEP entry on models in science). However, Levy & Currie (2015) object to this practice, arguing that model organisms are not theoretical models in the sense of interpreted structures studied as analogues of target systems in the natural world. Instead, they see organismal models as specimens of (and thereby bases for extrapolation about) broader classes of organisms. Levy and Currie do, however, concede that in some contexts, such as experimental evolution and ecology, organismal models can play a very similar role to that of theoretical models. Microbes are common choices for this role as analogue systems in experimental settings.

An early illustration of how such organismal analogues work can be found in Georgii Gause’s work in the 1930s modelling interspecies competition. Gause wanted a simple, easily manipulable laboratory system that would allow him to “eliminate the complicating influence of numerous secondary factors” and “understand the mechanism of the elementary process of the struggle for existence” (Gause 1934a: 92, 6). In order to represent in physical terms the logistic equation that models carrying capacities for populations, Gause set up an experimental system of populations of two species of paramecia, Paramecium caudatum and P. aurelia, both of which eat bacteria. Gause anticipated that indirect competition between the species would modify one species’ carrying capacity. When the paramecia were physically separated, each population reached growth equilibrium, but when they were put together and made to compete for the same limiting bacterial resources, one species drove the other extinct. This extrapolation from the logistic equation is nowadays known as the competitive exclusion principle, and has become a central principle in ecology (Hardin 1960). The mathematical and experimental model reached the same conclusions.

However, Gause then tried to use a microbial model to demonstrate the basic mechanisms represented in another mathematical model of direct interspecies competition (in the form of predator-prey relationships), the Lotka-Volterra equations. In this case, his experimental system repeatedly failed to capture the oscillating dynamics of the equations. This time he used one of the paramecia (P. caudatum) and its unicellular predator, Didinium nasutum. Both species went extinct, unless Gause introduced additional physical parameters or modified the mathematics (Gause 1934b). Does this suggest that microbes simply cannot capture the appropriate dynamics and are unreliable as experimental representations of mathematical models? In fact, an extensive history of subsequent experimentation found that the long-term oscillations predicted by the Lotka-Volterra equations are unrealized in any organismal model system unless major alterations are made to the basic variables. Only very recently have these oscillations been achieved over numerous generations, in an experimental model consisting of unicellular algae and a microscopic metazoan predator (Blasius et al. 2020).[7]

An iconic contemporary example of microbial modelling is Richard Lenski’s long-term evolution experiment (Fox & Lenski 2015). Lenski’s group used a single ancestral genome of E. coli to found twelve initially genetically identical populations in identical flask environments. They began propagating the populations, by transferring a population sample from a well-mixed flask to a fresh flask (to replenish their resources) every 24 hours. Lenski’s group began this experiment in 1988 and it is still going today, which in early 2020 means more than 70,000 generations of microbial evolution have occurred.[8] These numbers are due to E. coli populations regenerating just over six times per day, with resource constraints keeping this number steady.

A key original motivation of the experiment was to learn more about the long-term dynamics of adaptation and diversification by studying evolution in real time, in a controlled setting. Because the populations started out exactly the same and live in identical environments, any differences in fitness, physiology or morphology that arise over time are due entirely to new mutations in clonal lineages (not prone to recombination). Many insights have arisen from the long-term evolution experiment, including inferences about the dynamics of mutation, the role of chance in evolutionary trajectories, and the evolutionary origin of complex novel features (Fox and Lenski 2015). While in a few cases these findings are restricted to inferences specifically about E. coli and similar bacteria (e.g., Sniegowski et al. 1997), most are considered to apply to the processes and dynamics of long-term evolution in general. In other words, the microbes in the laboratory are not modelling microbes exclusively, but rather serving as a lens through which to understand more generally the phenomena of evolving life. In some important respects, these experimental systems are run like algorithms: exact iterative procedures that lead to various outcomes, and which can be looped and rerun at various points in the overall procedure.

Algorithms are of course the basis for computational simulations. Perhaps inspired by these structural similarities, Lenski’s group and other collaborators turned their attention to an agent-based simulation model called Avida (Lenski et al. 2003). In this computational model, self-replicating “digital organisms” compete for resources in the form of computer memory, and can accumulate mutations over time in their “genomes” (strings of computer code). Lenski and colleagues are very clear that when they study Avida, just as when they study their E. coli in the flasks, the aim is to infer something about the evolving world at large: “When we study this tractable system, we aim to shed light on principles relevant to any evolving system” (2003: 139). Because Avida allows for open-ended exploration of evolutionary trajectories via an algorithmic procedure, this way of modelling evolution turns out to be highly complementary to studying bacteria in the laboratory.

To give an example: perhaps the most famous result from Lenski’s long-term evolution experiment is the origin of citrate utilization in just one of the twelve E. coli lineages (Blount et al. 2008). Citrate is present in the bacterial growth medium and is a potential energy source, but one that E. coli lack the ability to use aerobically (i.e., in the presence of oxygen)—or, at least they were unable to, until around 31,500 generations into the experiment when one strain accumulated the mutations relevant to growing on citrate. This new capacity gave the population a relative advantage over non-citrate-eating strains.

To work out how this had occurred, the researchers reconstructed the particular evolutionary trajectory that led to this multi-step innovation (Blount et al. 2012). They were able to do this step-by-step reconstruction because of the tractability of the model system, and in particular because they had frozen regular time points in the evolutionary history of each bacterial lineage. Large bacterial populations can be frozen and later revived; researchers can thus maintain a “frozen fossil record” (Lenski 2011) and compare a current population’s features (such as fitness or morphology) to those of its ancestral population, or reconstruct steps in its evolutionary trajectory. In this case, frozen population samples could be sequentially analyzed to infer the order of mutational steps. A very similar sort of reconstruction could be carried out on the complex mutations occurring in the Avida simulation (Lenski et al. 2003). The researchers were able to rerun the computer model many times to understand every step along the way towards the accumulation of a complex mutation, in this case, a logic function more complicated than any of the basic instructions in the digital organisms computer-code genomes. This allowed researchers to study the accumulation of mutations leading to complex novel traits in two complementary and comparable sorts of model systems.

Many other small organisms have been used experimentally as living models of mathematical equations or simulations (e.g., mites, beetles). But microbes are particularly tractable in that they are easy to maintain and propagate in a laboratory, especially compared to other classic model organisms like mice. This is partly because they are so small: huge populations of them can be kept in tiny spaces. It is also because some species do not need much looking after compared to other laboratory organisms; pop them into a flask of growth medium (a simple mix of a few chemicals) or smear them on an agar plate, and their populations will grow exponentially. Many laboratory cultured microbes have very short generation times compared to larger organisms. Some bacteria can produce tens of generations a day if not resource constrained, which allows for long-term evolutionary studies over reasonable human research timescales.

Beyond these practical benefits, however, are epistemic advantages that allow bacterial models to be compared very readily to mathematical and computational models. Population size has theoretical virtues on top of the practical ones. Evolutionary theory predicts very different outcomes for small versus large populations (Charlesworth 2002), and key theoretical tools assume infinite populations (see the SEP entry on population genetics). The very large population sizes of most bacteria mean they are good proxies for these idealized equations. Microbial experimental systems can not only serve as proxies for theoretical models, but also show when something is fundamentally wrong with the mathematical assumptions. In the case discussed above, Gause wanted to model the Lotka-Volterra equations with a microbial analogue experiment. But the mathematical model assumes that both populations can rebound continuously from extremely low numbers, and that stochastic processes do not affect these deterministic outcomes. In many actual populations, the growth curves simply cannot rebound from very low values and the stable oscillations do not occur, just as Gause found. Computational simulations of the Lotka-Volterra equations similarly find that extinction of predators or both predator and prey is inevitable unless additional resource limitations are introduced (Wilensky & Reisman 2006; Weisberg & Reisman 2008). The actual details of which models do better on what dimensions do not matter here. The emphasis is on how modellers can shift back and forth from mathematics to computational simulations to microbial experiments because of basic structural similarities that are not overwhelmed by organismal complications (O’Malley & Parke 2018).

The comparability of these very different media can be taken further, because of the capabilities discussed already for maintaining a “frozen fossil record” by reviving ancestral populations and studying their evolutionary trajectories. This allows researchers to “back up” a population’s evolutionary trajectory and “rerun” it an arbitrary number of times from an earlier timepoint, by defrosting and reviving (repeatedly) a frozen ancestral population sample (e.g., Travisano et al. 1995). This backing up and re-running of population trajectories is very similar to the recursivity of algorithms in computer simulations. It also resonates with thought experiments such as Gould’s (1989) famous idea about “replaying the tape of life”. While Gould originally presented the thought experiment as a metaphor, and had in mind rewinding and replaying all of life on earth, long-term microbial evolution experiments show how at least a subset of “life”s tape’ can actually be replayed (see Beatty 2006 for discussion of the extent to which this sort of experimental work fits Gould’s ideas about his thought experiment).

Thought experiments such as replaying the tape of life have also been considered “mental models” (see SEP entry on thought experiments; Nersessian 2018), and philosophers are very fond of constructing and manipulating such models to generate new insights. That microbial experimental models, which are very concrete, can potentially be compared to mental models, which are very abstract, might seem surprising at first glance. But if comparability is central to modelling practice (O’Malley & Parke 2018), and if we recognize a range of model media—including mental constructs—then perhaps comparing abstract and idealized thought experiments with material models of unicellular life more often might be a fruitful philosophical approach. Now of course empirically inclined philosophers thinking about cognition or the evolution of behavior might choose instead to compare their mental models to models based on animals or plants. But just as Gause wanted the maximum reduction in extraneous complexity in order to compare basic mathematical structures with living population structures, then so might philosophers who manipulate mental structures want a stripped-down living model analogue. Whether or not philosophers feel encouraged to carry out such comparisons is not the main point of this section, however, which is primarily to note that abstract modelling efforts with mathematics and algorithms (and potentially mental constructs) can effectively be compared with microbial model systems. Such comparability then raises a whole slew of additional questions for philosophical inquiry. One of the main questions is about just how far such comparisons can be taken.

4.2 Limits of microbial models?

Even if philosophers concede that microbes might be good models for some very basic biological processes (e.g., genetic pathways), they might still believe that many phenomena of relevance to humans and other animals are too far from any microbial analogue. Because of initially being defined by animal characteristics, phenomena such as predation, ageing, and kin recognition have often been thought to be outside the purview of microbes. However, it turns out that microbes are, in fact, productive objects of study for many of these phenomena.

Predation, for example, is commonly thought of as a process that involves one animal killing and consuming another. Nibbling on plants counts only as herbivory, and bacteria consuming other microbes used to be considered parasitic or perhaps even herbivorous, depending on whether their “prey” photosynthesized (Guerrero et al. 1986). Early discoveries of explicitly predatory behavior in bacteria announced them as “the first parasitic organism that attacks [other] bacteria in a recognizably predatory fashion”, despite being smaller than their prey (Stolp & Starr 1963: 242). Nowadays, a large range of predatory behaviors are acknowledged in bacteria as more is discovered about microbial diversity in behavior and feeding mode (Pérez et al. 2016). These discoveries have broadened the category of predation, and provide means by which to investigate the general phenomenon of predation and its ecological impact. For many research purposes, bacterial predators and prey function as models for more general relationships of this sort, and can even show the limitations of current theory (e.g., Gause’s experience with his eukaryotic microbes).

Phenomena such as ageing were also believed to apply only to multicellular organisms. Bacteria and other unicellular life were thought of as ageless and “immortal”, due to symmetrical cell division leading to new offspring replacing the progenitor cell and removing any opportunity for ageing (Nyström 2002). Because ageing used to be defined as something that happened to organisms with distinctions between germ and soma, it was assumed that “unicellular bacteria are clearly not members of the exclusive club of aging creatures” (Nyström 2002: 596). However, a large body of research now investigates just how bacteria age, the differences between death and ageing, and what bacterial death means for the very evolution of senescence (Baig et al. 2014). In other words, bacterial ageing can model the core phenomena of what it means to grow old.

Likewise, kin recognition was once defined on the basis of sensory capacities that are not normally imputed to bacteria and other microbes (e.g., Hepper 1986). But kin recognition on the basis of chemical “sensing” is now a well-known phenomenon in microorganisms, and has broadened what is known about the process in general. In bacteria, recognition mechanisms are biochemical and have molecular underpinnings, which means the process can be analyzed and broken down to its components relatively straightforwardly. In animals, inferences about recognition mechanisms are broader and less defined, due to the behavioral level at which kin recognition must be investigated (Wall 2016). Protist kin recognition researchers argue that the phenomena, origins and evolution of kin recognition in eukaryotes is best studied in diverse unicellular eukaryotic microbes (e.g., Paz-y-Miño-C & Espinosa 2016). Nobody is saying that microbes directly represent the complex phenomena going on in animals. Bacterial models of kin recognition in general are indirect and simplified representations of more complex processes of perception in other domains of life (Wall 2016). However, it is well established in philosophy that this sort of indirect representation is key to the very practice of modelling (e.g., Weisberg 2013).

Sceptics might think there must surely be phenomena in complex animals, such as humans, that resist such modelling. They might suggest that cognitive activities are something that simply cannot be modelled by microbes of any kind because there is no basic analogue with which to work. But even for cognition, unicellular organisms have been extensively studied for decision optimization, efficiency calculations, memory, anticipation and self-awareness (Westerhoff et al. 2014; Beekman & Latty 2015). Not only do these microbes (eukaryotic and prokaryotic) undergo direct examination for their own cognitive capacities, but they also stand in for the more complex and hard-to-access capacities of organisms such as animals. Again, the claim here is not that microbes’ cognitive capacities are the same as those of animals. The claim is that microbes have capacities that include key aspects of cognition, and these capacities can be studied as analogues for cognition in general (including cognition in animals). Just as for kin recognition, the quest to understand the underlying foundations of cognition makes microorganisms such as slime moulds and E. coli valuable models for cognitive capacities of a general kind that are not dependent on brains (Beekman & Latty 2015; Allen 2017). Whether this is best discussed as minimal cognition (e.g., Godfrey-Smith 2016; see Lyon forthcoming for criticism) or as another facet of a general capacity that is diversely distributed across the tree of life (e.g., Allen 2017) is irrelevant here: the point is simply that an examination of microbial research can challenge, enrich and potentially reform how philosophers think about classic subjects. Indeed, some new research in microbiology, which we turn to in Section 5, even claims that microbes in the human body are influencing the mind.

5. The Long Reach of Microbiome Research

A recent microbiology topic of growing interest for philosophers is microbiome research, which examines all the microbial communities living in host organisms. In humans, the gut microbiome in particular is associated with many health and disease states experienced by the host, including mental health. There are two foci of philosophical attention given to these heterogeneous microbial consortia in host systems, namely individuality (e.g., Skillings 2016) and causality, specifically the causal role large mixed communities of microbes might play in host health (Lynch et al. 2019).

5.1 Individuality issues

Perhaps the most basic philosophical issue that awareness of microbes leads to is that of individuality: individuating where one biological entity starts and another begins. Are microbes in and on human bodies part of those bodies or not? If they are deemed a part, in what way is that parthood conceptualized? Rather than answering this question with traditional tools of mereology (see SEP entry on mereology), philosophers of biology have focused on biological and evolutionary criteria. In particular, the question of whether hosts and their microbes evolve as one Darwinian unit has become central to the discussion (e.g., Clarke 2013; Booth 2014; Godfrey-Smith 2015; Pradeu 2016; Roughgarden et al. 2018). Criteria for evaluating when symbiotic biological units have become a single evolutionary unit of selection are still disputed and promise considerably more philosophical discussion (see SEP entry on individuality). What is central to this entry is that such debates are rarely inspired by relationships between macroorganisms. The smallness and ability of microbes to invade host bodies and even cells is what marks out microorganisms as the relevant focus of philosophical attention. Their systemic effects on their environments is the other aspect that makes them such important research foci. For example, microbes in the intestines are repeatedly linked to host brain states such as emotional well-being and depression (e.g., Valles-Colomer et al. 2019).

We note, however, that the sheer excitement and novelty of unexpected findings can also lead to exaggerated views of the relationship between human hosts and their microbes. Exactly how responsible microbiomes are for human experiences such as anxiety, depression, learning and memory is uncertain and at least sometimes dubious (for discussion see Hooks et al. 2019). A similarly inflated claim is that knowledge of microbiomes necessitates a new view of self, or of what it means to be human (e.g., Rees et al. 2018; Ironstone 2018). While dozens of microbiome authors have made claims to this effect, with some attempting to explain what it actually means for the microbiome to challenge or change our sense of self (e.g., Rees et al. 2018), this claim still needs a great deal of clarification and substantiation (Parke et al. 2018). A vast range of things could be meant by “self” or “what it means to be human” in the context of these microbiome claims, ranging from something controversial about the nature of human biological individuality (see discussion above), to something factual about the composition of human bodies (i.e., people used to think their bodies were made of only human cells but now know they are made of microbial cells as well), to something phenomenological about first-person human experience (to date, there is no evidence that microbes influence this). So, these claims about the influence of microbiomes on “who we are” are at best speculative and exaggerated. Some of these conceptual problems probably come about because of unclarity about how to investigate the causal powers of microbiomes, and more generally about causal explanation in microbiome research.

5.2 Causality issues

Although philosophers drawing on microbiome research have tended so far to focus on metaphysical issues of individuality, issues associated with microbiome explanations are probably more pressing for the science and are now undergoing philosophical scrutiny. These investigations can work in two directions: using philosophical frameworks to explore the nature of microbiome causality or even whether it occurs (e.g., Lynch et al. 2019), then using the insights gained to reflect further on the philosophy of causal explanation. For example, Gillies (2019) examines treatment regimes arising out of microbiome research and proposes a “causal law” account of explanation to account for such phenomena. Other approaches take frameworks for causal explanation such as interventionism (see SEP entry on causation and manipulability) and propose refinements that arise from examinations of putative microbiome causality (Attah et al. 2020; Oftedal 2020). A particularly strong finding of such analyses is that tradeoffs between key dimensions of causal explanation (stability, specificity, proportionality) require further philosophical attention.

Obviously, microbiome research is only one aspect of microbiology, but it illustrates nicely the general point of the philosophical richness of microbiological science. The occupation of humans by trillions of microbes means that traditional views of health, bodies, and even minds (according to some emerging research) need supplementing by microbial and microbiological perspectives. Because some of this new knowledge has only recently been revealed by large-scale molecular techniques, many of the strongest and most “revolutionary” claims require more rigorous conceptualization and analysis. But this is not exclusively a feature of microbe-associated science. Nor is the occupation of human bodies unique to microbes: helminths (worms) are historical human passengers, and are frequently argued to have system-wide benefits for their hosts that outweigh any harms (e.g., Lukeš et al. 2015). Nevertheless, we do not expect to see anytime soon a SEP entry on helminths. To clarify why, this essay will conclude by reiterating the several angles from which microbes and microbiology can be considered philosophically valuable.

6. Why Microbes and Microbiology Warrant Philosophical Attention

Philosophy of microbes and microbiology goes beyond both its organismal and scientific bases. As discussed above, whether microbes are used as models or as sources of data about biogeochemistry, their implications go much further. They constitute many of the material aspects of human lives, from individual bodies to every process in the biosphere. Although there are many ways in which general lessons are taken from large organisms, broad swathes of biology depend on microbes in numerous ways, and this influences how researchers understand and theorize about organisms such as humans. For philosophers of biology interested primarily in human or other animal biology, there will always be some sort of philosophical payoff if microbiological angles are included. Philosophers of science more generally may find that understanding models or experimentation carried out with living systems can be enhanced by attention to microbial modelling practices.

Even for philosophers who are not philosophers of science, microbiology can be brought to bear on issues such as identity, selfhood, human nature, and mind, to generate broader insights and surprising conclusions. Not all such conclusions are defensible, but examining the ways in which microbes might contribute to humanness could be a valuable exercise. Consider why, for example, trillions of microbes living inside human bodies seem more easily regarded as part of that body, whereas the handful of helminths that do likewise are usually (but not always) distinguished as separate and ideally evicted. Microbes also offer philosophers tractable ways to study big questions about the nature of life, causation, and representation in general. For example, microbial experimental systems may be seen as material equivalents of the mental structures philosophers manipulate in thought experiments. There is also something to learn about the ways microbial and other modelling activities differ.


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