‘Moral naturalism’ is a term with a variety of meanings in ethics, but it usually refers to the version of moral realism according to which moral facts are natural facts. That is the subject of this entry.
Naturalistic approaches to ethics are as old as moral theory itself. Both Aristotelian and Confucian ethics, for instance, contain recognizably naturalistic elements. But moral naturalism wasn’t articulated as a distinctive metaethical doctrine until 1903, with G.E. Moore’s Principia Ethica. Principia established metaethics as a branch of moral theory distinct from first-order ethics, and did so by arguing against moral naturalism as a metaethical doctrine. This rejection of naturalism shaped moral theory for nearly a century. Beginning in the 1980s, however, metaethicists began developing new ways of articulating and defending moral naturalism. It is now one of the most popular views in metaethics, perhaps the most popular.
This discussion will be organized in three parts. The first part, in Sections 1–2, will characterize moral naturalism together with two other views that are closely associated with moral naturalism, descriptivism and reductivism. The second part, in Sections 3–4, will look at arguments for and against moral naturalism. And the third part, in Sections 5–7, will examine the three most popular comprehensive naturalist doctrines in detail.
- 1. What is Moral Naturalism?
- 2. Descriptivism and Reductivism
- 3. Why be a Moral Naturalist?
- 4. Objections to Naturalism
- 5. Neo-Aristotelian Naturalism
- 6. Cornell Realism
- 7. Jackson’s Analytic Functionalism
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. What is Moral Naturalism?
Moral naturalism is the view that moral facts are stance-independent, natural facts. It can also be characterized as the view that moral properties are stance-independent, natural properties.
Fact Naturalism: Moral facts are natural facts.
Property Naturalism: Moral properties are natural properties.
These two views are subtly different because there are different kinds of moral facts. Particular facts are instantiations of some property; particular moral facts are instantiations of some moral property; particular natural facts are instantiations of some natural property. So Fact Naturalism entails Property Naturalism: if all moral facts are natural, then all particular moral facts are instantiations of natural moral properties. But not all moral facts are particular facts. General moral facts, like the fact that genocide is wrong, consist in either patterns of instantiations of moral properties or underlying lawlike moral principles which explain those patterns of instantiations. Underlying moral principles do not consist in instantiations of moral properties; it is possible that genocide is wrong but never committed, in which case there would be no instantiation of a moral property of wrongness to correspond to the principle that genocide is wrong. So while Property Naturalism entails that all particular moral facts are natural facts, Property Naturalism does not entail Fact Naturalism because it’s possible that moral principles are non-natural. For ease of exposition, I’ll mostly ignore this complication in what follows, and treat Fact Naturalism and Property Naturalism as interchangeable while focusing on Fact Naturalism as the stronger thesis. But moral principles will cause trouble at a few points.
A fact is stance-independent just in case it doesn’t depend on the beliefs or attitudes of any agent. Moral realism is the view that moral principles are stance-independent; this is a more precise way of capturing the common idea that, for a realist, morality is a matter of fact rather than a matter of opinion. But what does it mean for a fact (or property) to be natural? The usual answer is that natural facts/properties are the kinds of facts/properties that scientific methods tell us about (see, e.g., Shafer-Landau 2003, Chapter 3; Smith 1994, 17; Copp 2007, 27–28). To say that moral facts are natural facts, then, is to say that moral facts are part of the naturalistic picture of the world that is revealed by empirical science.
Moral naturalism is opposed to moral supernaturalism, which holds that moral facts are a kind of supernatural (typically, divine) facts. It is also opposed to moral non-naturalism, which holds that moral facts are neither natural nor supernatural, but are rather their own, third kind of thing. And as a version of moral realism, moral naturalism is opposed to all varieties of anti-realist views in metaethics, including constructivism, relativism, expressivism, and error theory. While anti-realists are usually naturalists in the sense that they want to account for morality in naturalistic terms, anti-realists hold that stance-independent moral facts can’t be reconciled with a naturalistic worldview. Moral naturalists hold that they can be.
For the naturalist, moral facts are the kinds of facts that can be investigated by (broadly) scientific methods. But what kinds of facts can be investigated by scientific methods? There is much less agreement on how to answer this further question. One common view is that facts can be empirically investigated just in case they are capable of entering into causal explanations of our experiences, and thereby be investigated through those experiences (e.g., Bedke 2009; Enoch 2010; Lutz 2020). And while most (perhaps all) moral naturalists would say that moral facts can feature in causal explanations, this may not be a good characterization of natural facts, since supernatural facts could, perhaps, also feature in causal explanations (Sturgeon 2009; McPherson 2015). We could try to solve this problem with brute force, by defining a natural fact as any fact that features in causal explanations that is not a supernatural fact. But this is ad hoc; and now we need to characterize supernatural facts. We might also worry about what it means for a fact to feature in a causal explanation, which is itself a vexed and controversial issue. Perhaps it is best, then, to just leave it at “natural facts are facts that are known scientifically.”
But even this minimal characterization faces difficulties. For one thing, it is extremely controversial which methods count as “scientific.” The “demarcation problem” of distinguishing science from non-science (or “pseudoscience”) is a perennial puzzle in the philosophy of science, with many philosophers doubting that there is any general way of characterizing scientific methodology (Feyerabend 1975). A second problem is that this is a methodological or epistemological characterization of the natural; rather say what kinds of facts moral facts are, moral naturalism would be a view about how moral facts are known. This is, in fact, how some characterize moral naturalism and non-naturalism. In Moral Realism: A Defense, Russ Shafer-Landau affirms a number of metaphysical theses that are commonly associated with moral naturalism, most notably saying that moral facts are entirely constituted by more fundamental natural facts (Shafer-Landau 2003, 74–8). Yet he still calls himself a non-naturalist, because he thinks that we have moral knowledge by intuition and reflective equilibrium rather than by scientific methods (Shafer-Landau 2003, 56–58ff). Some critics have argued that Shafer-Landau is actually a naturalist in virtue of his metaphysical commitments (Bedke 2012, fn 1). But if a methodological characterization of the natural is best, then Shafer-Landau has labeled his view correctly.
So far, we have characterized moral naturalism in terms of four claims:
Moral Realism: There are stance-independent moral facts.
Fact Naturalism: Moral facts are natural facts.
Property Naturalism: Moral properties are natural properties.
Methodological Naturalism: We know about moral claims in the same way that we know about claims in the natural sciences.
But moral naturalism is sometimes associated with a fifth, linguistic claim, about the nature of moral language. That claim is:
Analytic Naturalism: Our moral claims are synonymous with certain (highly complex) claims in the natural sciences.
It might be tempting to say that moral naturalism is the conjunction of these five claims, but there is a strong tension between Methodological Naturalism and Analytic Naturalism. If Analytic Naturalism is true, then it should be possible to analyze moral claims and show what claims in the natural sciences they are synonymous with. But if this is possible, then substantive moral principles are knowable not via scientific methods but via a priori conceptual analysis. Analytic Naturalism therefore seems to entail that Methodological Naturalism is false, and vice versa. Naturalists who accept Analytic Naturalism are called, appropriately enough, analytic naturalists. Naturalists who reject Analytic Naturalism are synthetic naturalists.
This distinction between analytic naturalism and synthetic naturalism creates further trouble for our ability to characterize moral naturalism. If moral naturalism is the view that moral facts are known by empirical methods, then analytic naturalism is not a version of naturalism at all (Flanagan, Sarkissian, and Wong 2016). Yet many would resist the suggestion that analytic naturalists aren’t naturalists, since the term “moral naturalism” was coined to refer to analytic naturalism; synthetic naturalism is a relatively recent entrant to the metaethical scene.
Perhaps we can resolve this conflict by recalling the difference between particular moral facts and moral principles. Analytic naturalists agree with synthetic naturalists that we should be able to investigate particular moral facts empirically. An analytic naturalist who held that ‘good’ was synonymous with ‘pleasurable’ (e.g.) would agree that whether or not a particular action instantiates goodness/pleasure is the sort of thing we can investigate empirically. And synthetic naturalists agree with analytic naturalists that certain claims about the relations between our moral concepts, like “if it is morally required to help others, then it is not morally forbidden to help others,” can be analytic and knowable a priori (although see Howard and Laskowski 2021). What is primarily at issue in the debate between analytic and synthetic naturalists is the status of claims about moral principles. Analytic naturalists hold that these claims are analytic; synthetic naturalists hold that they are not. So if we define moral naturalism in terms of Property Naturalism and remain neutral on Fact Naturalism, this sidesteps the question of the nature of moral principles; perhaps this can mend the rift between analytic and synthetic naturalists. But questions about the nature of moral principles seem awfully to the metaphysics of morality, so perhaps we don’t want to sidestep them. And Property Naturalism doesn’t help answer the earlier worries we had about how to characterize moral naturalism: What properties are the kinds of properties that can be investigated by scientific methods, and what methods for investigating those properties are the scientific ones?
One more characterization of moral naturalism is worth mentioning. It is increasingly popular to think that appeals to the notion of “grounding” can help clear up what is at stake in a variety of metaphysical debates, and so some believe that we can explain naturalism in terms of grounding:
Grounded Naturalism: All moral facts are fully grounded in non-normative facts (Rosen 2017a).
But it’s not clear if this draws the line between naturalism and non-naturalism in the right place. One problem is that it’s controversial what the relationship between “natural facts” and “non-normative facts” is (see Section 4.2 below). Another problem is that “grounding” is itself a highly contested notion. “Grounding” refers to some sort of asymmetric determination relation which is supposed to be “almost maximally intimate” (Rosen 2017a, 157). It is “almost” maximally intimate because the maximally intimate relation is identity, but grounding is not identity; unlike identity, grounding is asymmetric. Non-naturalists would reject the idea that moral facts are identical to non-normative facts. But grounding is not identity; so why can’t non-naturalists say that the relationship between the moral and the non-normative is almost maximally intimate? Some self-described non-naturalists say that moral facts are entirely grounded in non-normative facts (Moore 1942; Bader 2017; compare Leary ms – see Other Internet Resources). What’s wrong with that? What does it mean for a relation to be “almost” maximally intimate in the first place?
Sometimes philosophers clarify the notion of grounding by saying that the grounded facts are “nothing over and above” the grounding facts (Rosen 2017a, 157). But putting things this way threatens to show too much. If moral facts are “nothing over and above” the non-normative facts, then moral facts would apparently have to be non-normative facts; normativity seems to count as something “over and above” non-normativity. But many moral naturalists say that moral facts are normative (again, see Section 4.2). Perhaps it is coherent to say that the normative is “nothing over and above” the non-normative; many good philosophers speak this way and we shouldn’t write them off as confused. But “nothing over and above” is no more clear than “almost maximally intimate.” So we lack a clear picture of what grounding consists in, and it’s consequently unclear why non-naturalists can’t say that moral facts are fully grounded in non-normative facts but naturalists can.
We could say that naturalism is the view that moral facts are grounded in natural facts rather than in non-normative facts (Chilovi and Wodak 2022). It’s (arguably) clearer why this is the sort of thing that naturalists would want to say and non-naturalists wouldn’t, but this formulation doesn’t help us understand what natural facts are in the first place.
All moral naturalists will agree with the claim that morality is natural. But there’s depressingly little agreement on how to understand the “naturalness” of morality. It’s all a bit of a muddle.
2. Descriptivism and Reductivism
This section will look at two views closely associated with naturalism, descriptivism and reductivism. Many philosophers who call themselves descriptivists or reductivists also call themselves naturalists (or at least end up taking the same side as self-described naturalists in many metaethical debates). Perhaps we can usefully characterize naturalism in terms of either of these views.
Naturalism as Descriptivism: Moral facts are natural facts if and only if (and because) descriptivism is true.
Naturalism as Reductivism: Moral facts are natural facts if and only if (and because) reductivism is true.
More modestly, even if Naturalism as Descriptivism and Naturalism as Reductivism don’t pan out, we might prefer to just focus on descriptivism or reductivism as interesting views that capture many of the same ideas that incline philosophers toward naturalism.
Many philosophers have found it intuitive that there is a distinction between terms like ‘good,’ ‘bad,’ ‘right,’ ‘wrong,’ or ‘reason,’ on the one hand and terms like ‘pink,’ ‘shiny,’ ‘bigger than a bread box,’ or ‘pleasurable’ on the other. The terms on the first list are called normative terms while the terms in the second list are descriptive terms. It is (mostly) uncontroversial that moral terms are normative terms; so, if we refer to moral properties using moral terms (contra some expressivists and some error theorists), some normative terms refer to moral properties. Moral descriptivism is the view that some descriptive terms refer to moral properties as well (Heathwood 2009).
Moral descriptivism is closely related to moral naturalism. Let us assume, as seems plausible, that the things that scientists investigate are things that can be referred to with descriptive language. Good science doesn’t moralize, it just says how things are. If this assumption is correct, then analytic naturalism entails descriptivism. If moral claims are synonymous with scientific claims and scientific claims are made using descriptive language, then moral claims are synonymous with descriptive claims. Moral terms refer to moral properties; any synonymous terms would refer to those same properties; therefore, there are descriptive terms that refer to moral properties.
Synthetic naturalists can be descriptivists, too. According to synthetic descriptivism, there are descriptive terms that refer to moral properties, but this is not so in virtue of any analytic relation between normative and descriptive terminology. Rather, the synthetic descriptivist argues for the existence of synthetic property identity claims. The paradigm synthetic property identity is “water is H2O.” ‘Water’ and ‘H2O’ are just two different labels for the same thing. But ‘H2O’ is not the definition of ‘water;’ that water is H2O was not, and could not have been, discovered by pure conceptual analysis. It is a synthetic truth known a posteriori. Synthetic descriptivists hold that descriptive terms which refer to moral properties reveal synthetic property identities, just as in the case of water and H2O.
However, even though analytic naturalism entails descriptivism and synthetic naturalism is consistent with descriptivism, Naturalism as Descriptivism is false. The first problem is that many supernatural terms are descriptive. So it’s possible that moral properties are supernatural (e.g. divine) properties and descriptive terms refer to those moral, supernatural properties. In this case, descriptivism would be true and naturalism false (Sturgeon 2009).
Another serious problem for Naturalism as Descriptivism is that, while analytic naturalism entails descriptivism, synthetic naturalism doesn’t. There’s no reason why facts that can be empirically investigated and fit comfortably with a scientific worldview must be referred to with descriptive terminology. A naturalist can say that goodness is a natural property that is known via empirical methods and features in causal explanations, and the only term that refers to goodness is ‘goodness.’ Jonathan Dancy calls this non-descriptivist naturalism “one-term naturalism,” since one-term naturalists say that there is only one term – a moral term – that refers to moral properties (Dancy 2006).
Incidentally, because naturalism doesn’t entail descriptivism, one common challenge to naturalism fails: “You say that goodness (e.g.) is a natural property, but which natural property is it?” For a naturalist may reply: “Goodness is a natural property. The only natural property that goodness is identical to is itself: goodness.” This is a coherent and complete answer to the challenge (Sturgeon 2003). The challenger seems to be demanding that the naturalist pick out the property of goodness using descriptive terminology. This is an apt challenge to descriptivism but not to naturalism. One-term naturalists are not descriptivists (Väyrynen 2021).
But while Naturalism as Descriptivism seems like a non-starter, perhaps descriptivism is an interesting view in its own right. We might even prefer to talk about descriptivism rather than naturalism in light of our difficulties with characterizing naturalism. Unfortunately, there are also problems with characterizing descriptivism.
One problem is that it’s actually rather easy to refer to moral properties with descriptive terminology. Goodness was the primary subject of G.E. Moore’s Principia Ethica. So the phrase ‘the subject of Principia Ethica’ refers to goodness, and that phrase uses only descriptive terminology. But this isn’t a proof of descriptivism; descriptivists want some stronger relation between descriptive language and moral properties. But it’s hard to say what that stronger relation might be.
A second problem is the existence of “thick” normative terminology, which apparently expresses both descriptive and normative concepts, or perhaps concepts that are both descriptive and normative. Common examples include ‘brave’ (and other virtue terms), ‘cruel,’ or even, perhaps, ‘pleasurable’ (Roberts 2017, 212). Frank Jackson (1998) proposes that thick terminology, and any other terminology about which there could be doubt as to classification, should be considered normative. Perhaps that solves the problem.
A third problem concerns our method for characterizing normative and descriptive terminology. We started out with two contrasting lists of terminology, saying that one of the lists was a list of normative terminology and the other list, the “everything else” list, was a list of descriptive terminology. But our list of normative terminology was incomplete. Normative terminology includes everything on that list and all other terminology that is similar. But what does all this normative terminology have in common in the first place? What makes a term normative? One way of characterizing normative terminology is broadly functional: normative terminology expresses thoughts which regulate our actions in certain ways. But embracing a functional account of normative terminology cedes much ground to expressivists, who hold that the meaning of normative terminology just is to express action-regulating states. And characterizing normative terminology in functional terms also deprives moral realists (and thus moral naturalists) of one of their main arguments for realism, since the existence of moral facts may no longer be read directly off of the semantics of moral terms (Eklund 2017). For that reason, some realists prefer to characterize normative terminology in referential terms: normative terminology is terminology that refers to normative properties (Hernandez and Laskowski 2021). But if we give a referential characterization of normative terminology, it’s no longer obvious how to draw our distinction between normative and descriptive terminology. If a bit of terminology that we would intuitively put on the list of descriptive terminology ends up referring to a moral property (which happens, according to descriptivists!), then that terminology is ipso facto normative. So on a referential account, which terms count as normative and which count as descriptive is not discoverable by simple reflection on the meanings of the terms, but must instead involve substantial ethical and metaethical theorizing. A referential account of normative terminology would also threaten to render descriptivism incoherent, since any terminology which referred to a moral property would be normative rather than descriptive.
Another view that is often closely associated with naturalism is “reductivism.” The reductivist says that moral properties reduce to some other kind of property. Again, we might be interested either in Naturalism as Reductivism as an ambitious attempt to characterize moral naturalism, or just in reductivism as an interesting view in its own right. Unfortunately, it is unclear what it means for one property to reduce to another. ‘Reduce’ is a philosopher’s term of art, but it is used in very different ways by different philosophers. We’re in for another muddle; but let’s try to clear things up a bit.
We should note at the outset that there is a paradigm example of a reductive view, which is used almost every time a metaethicist discussing reductivism needs a toy example to play with. That paradigm is the hedonic reduction: that goodness is pleasure and therefore reduces to pleasure. This introduces a key desideratum of any account of reduction: that it should count the hedonic reduction as a reductive view.
That said, let’s begin with one of the clearest things written about reduction. Here’s Nicholas Sturgeon:
Naturalism is in one clear sense a ‘reductionist’ doctrine of course, for it holds that moral facts are nothing but natural facts. What I deny, however, is that from this metaphysical doctrine about what sort of facts moral facts are, anything follows about the possibility of reduction in another sense (to which I shall henceforth confine the term) more familiar from the philosophical literature: that is, about whether moral expressions can be given reductive definitions in some distinctive nonmoral vocabulary, in which any plausible moral explanations could then be recast (Sturgeon 1988, 239–240).
Sturgeon here distinguishes two distinct senses of the term ‘reduction.’ One is linguistic. A term can be reduced to another term just in case the first term can be defined in terms of the second. In this sense, reductivism is just another name for analytic naturalism. In later work, Sturgeon mentions the possibility of “synthetic reductions” (Sturgeon 2009), so I think it’s more accurate to say that Sturgeon’s reductivism is another name for descriptivism. Note that the hedonic reduction is a descriptivist view since it states that the descriptive term ‘pleasure’ refers to the moral property of goodness. So the linguistic sense of ‘reduction’ as another name for descriptivism satisfies our key desideratum.
Let’s pause for a second to clear up another perennial source of confusion about how metaethical terminology is used. Sturgeon and the other Cornell realists (see Section 6) call themselves “non-reductive” naturalists; but when they say this, they aren’t describing any distinctive metaphysical commitments of their view. They are simply rejecting descriptivism. Sturgeon, at least, is perfectly clear about this in the above quote. There are metaphysical doctrines associated with Cornell realism, of course, (again, see Section 6). But as the Cornell realists used that term, “non-reductive” naturalism is just naturalism without descriptivism, i.e. one-term naturalism.
If we understand ‘reduction’ in its linguistic sense, reductivism is synonymous with descriptivism, and so we have a redundant bit of terminology. That’s a good reason to understand reductivism as a distinct, metaphysical doctrine. So: what is a metaphysical reduction? We might look to general metaphysics for help here. Unfortunately, metaphysicians use the term ‘reduce’ in lots of different ways; there is no one standard account for us to borrow (Stoljar 2010, 161–162; McPherson 2015). But perhaps we can get a sense of the general idea. In recent years, there has been a proliferation of terms within metaphysics that all seem to be aimed at capturing the same idea: we can say what something is composed of, or what it is grounded in, or what it reduces to, or what the real definition of a thing is, and all of those locutions seem to be aimed at capturing the same thought (Rosen 2015). All of these locutions are ways of articulating what it is to be some thing by saying what it is made of (compare Schroeder 2005; Schroeder 2016). One key idea here is that if A reduces to B, then A is less fundamental than B (Laskowski 2020). Let’s call this the Fundamentality Platitude.
If we understand reductivism as a metaphysical thesis about fundamentality, per the Fundamentality Platitude, we can make a plausible case for Naturalism as Reductivism. Any naturalist will say that the fundamental entities are the sorts of objects and properties that are the subject matter of fundamental physics: bosons and leptons (etc.) with their spin and mass (etc.). Goodness is not one of those fundamental physical properties; goodness is a higher-level property which is ultimately composed of fundamental physical properties, the same as any other natural property. Naturalists are, in this way, metaphysical reductivists. And because non-naturalists deny that moral properties are natural, their account of the nature of moral properties is not constrained by the physicist’s account of fundamental properties. A non-naturalist might well say that some moral properties are metaphysically fundamental. So naturalists say, whereas non-naturalists may deny, that all moral properties reduce to non-moral, physical properties. That’s Naturalism as Reductivism..
However, there are problems with this argument. First, supernatural properties cause trouble again. If moral properties are reducible to supernatural properties, then reductivism is true and naturalism false (Sturgeon 2009). As before, we could try to finesse this by talking about “reductive naturalism,” the view that moral properties reduce to natural properties, in particular. Many philosophers do speak this way. But we can’t characterize naturalism as the view that moral properties reduce to natural properties unless we already know what natural properties are. So talk of reductive naturalism means giving up on Naturalism as Reductivism.
So let’s set aside the more ambitious Naturalism as Reductivism and just focus on reductivism as a potentially interesting and important view in its own right. Unfortunately, there are problems with giving a useful metaphysical characterization of reductivism. Consider the hedonic reduction: that goodness reduces to pleasure in virtue of being identical to pleasure. Some philosophers defend the idea that pleasure is metaphysically fundamental. If we combine pleasure fundamentalism with the hedonic reduction, we end up with the view that goodness is both reducible and fundamental (McPherson and Plunkett forthcoming). So depending on what we say about the metaphysics of pleasure, the hedonic reduction may not be consistent with the Fundamentality Platitude..
There’s a larger problem lurking here. We’ve characterized two different ideas as key to contemporary discussions of reduction in metaethics: the Fundamentality Platitude and the hedonic reduction. The hedonic reduction counts as a reductive view because of another platitude about reduction: that identity entails reduction. Call that the Identity Platitude. Here’s Graham Oddie:
Exactly what is reduction? Take two kinds of entities, Type-A entities and Type-B entities. Although reduction is a contested notion, here is an undeniably sufficient condition for the reducibility of type-A entities to type-B entities: every type-A entity is identical to some type-B entity. (Oddie 2005, 15, italics in original)
The larger problem is that the Identity Platitude and the Fundamentality Platitude are inconsistent. Identity is a symmetric relation, but being-less-fundamental-than is an asymmetric relation, so nothing can satisfy both of those platitudes. If reduction is asymmetric, then reduction is not entailed by identity, and so the Identity Platitude is false. If reduction is not asymmetric, then the fact that A reduces to B doesn’t entail that A is less fundamental than B, and so the Fundamentality Platitude is false.
Here’s another way to demonstrate the point. Consider a close cousin of the hedonic reduction, the view that rightness is identical to conducing-to-pleasure. Conducing-to-pleasure is a complex property, composed of pleasure, conducing, and perhaps some abstract structural elements. On this view, rightness is identical to conducing-to-pleasure, and rightness is composed of and less fundamental than conducing and pleasure. So rightness stands in a different relation to the complex conducing-to-pleasure than it does to the simpler elements. Which of those two relations is the reduction relation? ‘Reduction’ is a term of art; it means whatever philosophers mean by it. And, unfortunately, philosophers use the term ‘reduction’ to refer to both of those relations. So not only is ‘reduction’ ambiguous between a linguistic and a metaphysical concept, there’s a further ambiguity in the metaphysical use of the term.
Let’s sum up the discussion thus far. We were looking for an apt characterization of moral naturalism, and had a hard time finding one. We then looked at two ways of characterizing naturalism in terms of other theses associated with naturalism: descriptivism and reductivism. We found that there are substantial problems with characterizing naturalism in terms of either descriptivism or reductivism, and that there are further problems with trying to characterize descriptivism and reductivism themselves. So while philosophers frequently use the terms ‘naturalism,’ ‘descriptivism,’ and ‘reductivism’ when describing various metaethical views, there’s no way to define those terms that isn’t highly controversial. In light of this depressing and distressing realization, there’s only one thing to be done: ignore all of this and press on as though we know what we’re talking about when we use these terms. That is, unfortunately, what philosophers in this area tend to do. So even though there’s little agreement about what naturalism is, let’s see what philosophers have said about naturalism.
3. Why be a Moral Naturalist?
Moral naturalism is a very popular view (although it might be more accurate to say that “moral naturalism” is a popular label…). That’s because moral naturalism is the conjunction of two views that are themselves very popular. The first is naturalism: that everything which exists is natural. The second is moral realism: that stance-independent moral facts exist. Combine these two, and we get the conclusion that moral facts (exist and) are stance-independent natural facts. Thus:
We’ll look at more technical arguments for moral naturalism shortly, but the Basic Argument is the reason why so many metaethicists have a default sympathy for moral naturalism. It’s a popular conjunction of two popular views. Naturalism has proven to be the most successful project, ever, for advancing human knowledge and understanding. The success of naturalism doesn’t entail that that nothing exists which can’t be accounted for naturalistically, nor does it entail that there are no other projects that could successfully advance human knowledge and understanding. But many philosophers suspect that empirical methods have been so dramatically successful in shedding light on so many different areas of inquiry because some version of naturalism is correct. (Non-naturalists disagree, of course!)
Similarly, moral realism is a popular view. There are many different moral claims – that rape and murder are wrong, for instance, or that helping others in need is good – that have the status of common sense. We treat these common sense moral claims, at least implicitly, as accurately describing reality and not being mere matters of opinion. Moral realism is popular precisely because it promises to do justice to this common attitude towards our moral commitments. (Anti-realists disagree, of course!)
3.1 Arguments from Supervenience
Let’s turn to the more technical arguments for naturalism. There are two distinct arguments for moral naturalism that begin from the premise that the moral supervenes on the natural.
Supervenience: There are no two metaphysically possible worlds where the natural facts are the same but the moral facts are different.
As we saw in Section 1, any two worlds that are identical with respect to the moral facts are identical with respect to both moral principles and instantiations of moral properties. So Supervenience entails the related claim that no two metaphysically possible worlds have the same distribution of natural properties and a different distribution of moral properties.
The first argument, the Direct Argument, comes from Frank Jackson (Jackson 1998, 118ff. See also Streumer 2008; Brown 2011; Clarke 2019). Supervenience is the first premise of the Direct Argument. The second is
Intensionalism: If it is metaphysically necessary that something has property F if and only if it has property G, then F and G are the same property.
Intensionalism and Supervenience together entail naturalism. Consider the moral property of wrongness. Every wrong action has some natural features; call the features of a given wrong action \(N_1\). Supervenience entails that any action with \(N_1\) is necessarily wrong. Of course, there is more than one action that is wrong, but the argument generalizes. Call the natural features of a second wrong action \(N_2\). Supervenience entails that any action with \(N_2\) is necessarily wrong. And so on, for all natural features of wrong actions \(N_1 \ldots N_n\). Now consider the disjunctive property (\(N_1\) or \(N_2\) or … \(N_n\)). Let’s call that disjunctive property \(N\). Because \(N\) is a disjunction of natural properties, it is itself a natural property. Any action that has \(N\) is necessarily wrong. And because \(N\) is the disjunction of the natural features of all morally wrong actions, any action that is wrong necessarily has \(N\). So, necessarily, an action is wrong if and only if it has \(N\). Therefore, by Intensionalism, wrongness is identical to \(N\). And because \(N\) is a natural property, wrongness is a natural property. QED.
The most obvious way to object to the Direct Argument is to reject Intensionalism (see, e.g., Bader 2017). A common example in the debate over Intensionalism is the pair of properties being triangular and being trilateral. Necessarily, anything that has one property has the other: if a figure has three angles, it also has three sides (Bealer 1982). Enemies of Intensionalism say the two properties aren’t the same: one property is a property figures have in virtue of the number of angles they possess, while the other is a property figures have in virtue of the number of sides they possess. Defenders of Intensionalism say that these are the same property: there’s no difference between being three-sided and being three-angled, and that’s precisely because those properties are necessarily co-instantiated. This is an ongoing debate in metaphysics.
The Direct Argument also relies on the assumption that disjunctions of natural properties are natural properties, but that’s a dubious assumption. Many would claim that disjunctions of properties aren’t properties at all, or at least not the right kind of properties (Kim 1993; Majors 2005; McPherson 2015; Klocksiem 2019). For other criticisms of the Direct Argument, see Wedgwood (2007, Ch. 9) and Dunaway (2015).
The second argument from Supervenience is the Explanatory Argument. This argument was developed by RM Hare and Simon Blackburn (Hare 1952; Blackburn 1993), but the contemporary canonical formulation comes from Tristram McPherson (2011). According to the Explanatory Argument, supervenience is a striking phenomenon that must be explained. An inability to explain supervenience counts strongly against a view. Naturalists are well-positioned to explain supervenience: if moral facts are natural facts, then, trivially, there can be no difference in the moral facts without a difference in the natural facts. But it’s not clear how other views – particularly non-naturalism, but perhaps also quasi-realist expressivism (Sturgeon 2009; Dreier 2015) – can explain supervenience.
The most obvious way to respond to the Explanatory Argument is to offer an explanation of supervenience that doesn’t trade on naturalist assumptions. For example, Russ Shafer-Landau (2003, Ch 4) and David Enoch (2011, Ch 6) have argued that supervenience can be explained by the fact that there are moral laws. Ralf Bader (2017) argues that there is a distinct sort of normative grounding relation which both explains supervenience and doesn’t entail property identity (but see Morton (2020)). And Stephanie Leary (2017) has argued that there are hybrid normative properties whose essences explain supervenience (but see Faraci (2017); Toppinen (2018)).
A bolder response denies supervenience altogether. Supervenience is widely accepted, but not uncontroversial (Roberts 2018). Sturgeon (2009) accepts supervenience, but his reasons for doing so are “parochial:” he is a naturalist and naturalism entails supervenience. But Sturgeon sees no reason why anyone who’s not a naturalist should accept the doctrine. Several non-naturalists, including, most notably, Gideon Rosen (2017b) and Kit Fine (2002), have shared this assessment of the dialectical situation and rejected Supervenience. Fine and Rosen argue that moral principles are not metaphysically necessary but are, instead, normatively necessary, where normative necessity is weaker than metaphysical necessity but still quite strong. It’s easy for non-naturalists to explain the normative necessity of moral principles, so non-naturalists can explain everything that needs to be explained. If Supervenience is false, then both the Direct Argument and the Explanatory Argument fail.
3.2 Arguments from Anti-Skepticism
A second family of arguments for naturalism are epistemic. Scientific methods (broadly construed) are very powerful tools for coming to have knowledge of the world so, if moral facts are the kinds of facts that we can know about by scientific methods, then we have powerful tools for obtaining moral knowledge. Non-naturalists, by contrast, say that we know about moral facts via non-empirical methods, typically intuition. This seems like a much less firm footing for our moral knowledge than the scientific method. This is controversial, of course. Intuitionist moral epistemology is popular (Huemer 2005; Chudnoff 2013; Bengson, Cuneo, and Shafer-Landau 2020). And it’s not clear how we can use empirical methods to learn about moral facts (although we’ll look at some proposals in Sections 5–7) (Shafer-Landau 2003, Ch 3). But it’s widely believed that moral naturalists have an easier time answering moral skeptics than non-naturalists, and that’s a reason to be a moral naturalist.
Let’s sharpen this point by looking at one influential family of skeptical challenges: explanationist challenges. Explanationist challenges begin from the premise that our moral beliefs are explained by something other than the moral facts. What else? Different versions of the explanationist challenge focus on different things. According to the traditional version of the challenge from Gilbert Harman, our moral beliefs are explained by our personal psychological attitudes (Harman 1977, Ch 1). Other versions of the explanationist challenge focus on more distant causes of our moral beliefs. Disagreement arguments note that moral beliefs tend to cluster along cultural lines, which suggests that our moral beliefs are explained by cultural pressures (Mackie 1977, 37). Evolutionary debunking arguments posit that our moral beliefs are ultimately explained by evolutionary pressures (Joyce 2006; Street 2006). The common thought is that our moral beliefs are not explained by the moral facts; they’re explained by a tangle of other naturalistic factors. Exactly why this would lead to a skeptical conclusion is controversial, but many philosophers think that explanationist challenges make a strong case for skepticism. (For critical discussion, see, e.g., Enoch 2009; FitzPatrick 2015; Vavova 2015; Schechter 2017).
Naturalists have an easy way to answer explanationist challenges. The naturalist claims our moral beliefs are indeed explained by a tangle of naturalist facts, but they hold that some of those natural facts are the moral facts. For instance, Sturgeon argues that we think Hitler was evil because Hitler was evil. Hitler’s evil is a natural feature of his character, and that feature both explains why Hitler did the things that he did and why we judge him harshly as a result (Sturgeon 1988). Similarly, David Copp argues that to be good just is to be conducive to social cooperation. So when the evolutionary debunker claims that we are naturally inclined, by evolution, to think that things which are conducive to social cooperation are good, this just amounts to the observation that we judge that things are good because they’re good (Copp 2008). This is a compelling enough response that many advocates of explanationist challenges construe them as challenges for non-naturalists, but not for naturalists (Joyce 2006; Bedke 2009; Lutz 2018).
4. Objections to Naturalism
We’ve just seen that there is some reason to think that, if there are any moral properties, those properties are natural. In this section, we’ll look at the most prominent objections to moral naturalism.
4.1 The Open Question Argument
I said at the beginning of the article that contemporary metaethics began with G.E. Moore’s rejection of moral naturalism. The argument that he deployed against naturalism is known as the Open Question Argument (OQA). The OQA is perhaps the most influential argument in metaethics, although today it is widely held to have crippling flaws. Inevitably, this has inspired many critics of naturalism to find ways to fix up or extend Moore’s argument in one way or another.
Explaining Moore’s argument is complicated by the fact that his original statement of the argument, in Sections 5–15 (particularly 13–14) of Principia Ethica, is famously unclear. Moore himself admitted as much, in an unfinished forward to a second edition (Sinclair 2019). I won’t engage in Moore exegesis here. I’ll just give a version of the OQA that most contemporary metaethicists would recognize as “the Open Question Argument.”
Moore’s OQA takes aim at theories of the form “Everything that is N is good,” where ‘N’ is a bit of descriptive terminology that refers to a natural property, and where claims like this are true in virtue of the meanings of ‘good’ and ‘N.’ Moore is concerned with goodness because he regards goodness as the most fundamental moral concept, and holds that all moral inquiry is, in the end, inquiry into what sorts of things are good. And he’s concerned with theories that are true in virtue of meaning because he believes that there are true claims of the form “Everything that is N is good” (for some potentially rather complicated N). He just denies that it is analytic that being N is the same thing as being good. “If I am right, then nobody can foist upon us such an axiom as that ‘Pleasure is the only good’ or that ‘The good is the desired’ on the pretense that ‘this is the very meaning of the word.’” (Moore 1903, Sec 6.)
The OQA relies on a test for theories of the form “All As are Bs.” The first step is to turn the statement of the theory into a question: “All As are Bs” becomes “Given that x is A, is x also B?” Some questions of this kind are closed questions: one can know the answer simply by understanding the question. “Given that x is a bachelor, is x unmarried?” is a closed question. Anyone who understands the meanings of ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried’ is in a position to see that the answer to that question must be yes. Anyone who expressed doubt about that question must be incompetent with either the concept of bachelor or of unmarried. So “All bachelors are unmarried” passes the test. That claim is true in virtue of the meanings of ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried,’ and so being unmarried is part of the essence of what it is to be a bachelor. Now consider the theory that pleasure is goodness. We can ask “Granted that x is pleasurable, is x good?” And this question is open. Someone can understand it perfectly and still reasonably doubt the answer. So the theory that pleasure is goodness fails the open question test; pleasure cannot be identical to goodness. The argument generalizes: For any natural property N and any moral property M, “Granted that x is N, is x M?” will be an open question. Therefore, no moral property M is identical to any natural property N.
The most obvious problem with this argument is that it’s not really an argument against naturalism at all. It is, instead, an argument against analytic descriptivism. That is, it’s an argument against the claim that there is some descriptive term ‘N’ that necessarily refers to a moral property M in virtue of the fact that there is a normative term ‘M’ that refers to M, and ‘N’ follows from a conceptual analysis of ‘M’ (Feldman 2005; Vessel 2020). But as we saw in Section 2.1, analytic descriptivism is not the same thing as naturalism. Some naturalists are synthetic descriptivists, who hold that ‘N’ necessarily refers to M, but that this is established empirically rather than by conceptual analysis (Brink 1989, Ch 6; Brink 2001). And one-term naturalists hold that there is no descriptive term that necessarily refers to any moral property (Sturgeon 2003; Väyrynen 2021). The OQA has no force against either of these views. For these reasons, the common verdict today among metaethicists is that – unless it can be substantially modified or extended in some way – the OQA has no force against naturalism.
In Moore’s defense, even though he overlooked the possibility of synthetic descriptivism and one-term naturalism, those views were not yet developed at the time he first outlined the OQA. Indeed, they were developed by naturalist philosophers who recognized the force of the OQA against analytic descriptivism and so set out looking for other naturalistic views that could evade the OQA. Rather than thinking of these other naturalistic views as an oversight of Moore’s, we could just as easily give him credit for pointing others in their direction.
Most philosophers think that the OQA does succeed in refuting analytic descriptivism, yet analytic descriptivists have developed several responses to the OQA. One traditional response, from William Frankena (1939), says that the OQA begs the question. To an analytic descriptivist who sincerely holds that, e.g., pleasure is the definition of goodness, the question “Given that X is pleasurable, is it good?” will seem closed. So whether that question is open or closed is precisely what is at issue, so Moore shouldn’t claim that it is open without further argument. Another traditional response appeals to the idea of the Paradox of Analysis: if all analytic claims are obvious, then it’s impossible for there to be an interesting, informative conceptual analysis. Since some conceptual analyses are interesting and informative (we philosophers tell ourselves, desperately), not all analytic claims are obvious. The OQA is a test of obvious analyticity, but the correct definitions of moral terms might just be non-obvious (Smith 1994, 37–39). Another response begins from the observation that Moore gives only a handful of examples of naturalistic analyses and generalizes to the conclusion that any proposed analysis of moral terms must be wrong. That’s an awfully hasty generalization. It’s not clear that this worry can be addressed by providing any finite number of additional failed analyses. If ‘goodness’ (e.g.) can be analyzed, it can presumably be analyzed in one correct way, and all of the infinite other possible analyses are false. So the hypothesis that ‘goodness’ can be analyzed predicts that there are an infinite number of incorrect analyses of ‘goodness.’ A hypothesis can’t be refuted by data that it predicts, so even an infinite number of incorrect analyses doesn’t refute analytic descriptivism (Finlay 2014, Ch 1).
4.2 The Normativity and Triviality Objections
Although Moore’s version of the Open Question Argument today has few defenders, there have been a number of recent attempts to refashion it into a more compelling form. One popular version of the Open Question Argument, called the Normativity Objection (see, e.g., Parfit 2011; Scanlon 2014), sidesteps questions about the cognitive significance of moral and descriptive terminology and appeals to considerations regarding the natures of natural and normative facts. Moral facts are normative. They concern what is good and what we have reasons or obligations to do. Natural facts – the kinds of facts that scientists study – are facts about the innate physical structure of the universe and the causal principles that govern the interaction of matter. Those are obviously just two different kinds of facts; moral facts are normative but natural facts are not. In trying to give a naturalistic account of morality, naturalists forgot the most important thing: that moral facts aren’t purely facts about the way the world is; they are facts about what matters.
There are, generally, two ways in which a naturalist might respond to this objection. First, a naturalist could say that moral facts aren’t essentially normative; it may be the case that we typically have reasons to act morally, but reason-giving force is not part of the essence of moral facts. That suggestion might have the feeling of an absurdity – of course moral facts are the kinds of things that provide reasons; if an action is morally required, that’s a good reason to do it! But according to some “reforming definitions” of morality (Brandt 1979; Railton 1986), this thought is a defect in our conception of morality. It would be more accurate and fruitful to define moral facts in terms that are typically reason-providing but not necessarily reason-providing.
The biggest problem for reforming definitions is that reason-giving normativity is (arguably) essential to morality. As Joyce (2000, Ch. 1) argues, normativity is a non-negotiable commitment of our moral discourse. If the only kinds of facts that exist are natural, and natural facts are not a source of reasons for everyone, then this amounts to a proof that moral facts don’t exist (see also Luco 2016). Reformers may respond by calling into question Joyce’s notion of “non-negotiable” commitments. It is controversial whether any of our concepts have commitments that are non-negotiable in this way (compare Prinzing 2017). Reformers may also reply by pointing out that they’re not entirely giving up on normativity. If moral facts are the kinds of facts that we typically have reason to care about, and there are strong forces in human society and psychology that lead us to care about moral facts, then they’re normative enough for all practical purposes.
The second way to respond to the Normativity Objection is to say that normativity is itself a natural phenomenon. The most popular strategy for substantiating natural normativity proceeds in two steps. First, show that all normative concepts can be analyzed in terms of one, fundamental normative concept. Second, show that that fundamental normative concept picks out a natural property. There are a number of ways that such an account could proceed: here are two recent, influential examples:
- Mark Schroeder (2005; 2007) accepts the “buck-passing” or “reasons first” account of normativity (Scanlon 1998), which says that all normative concepts can be analyzed in terms of the concept of a reason. Schroeder also accepts the “Humean” theory of reasons (as a substantive, synthetic truth), which says that, roughly, S has a reason to Φ just in case Φ-ing will promote the satisfaction of one of S’s desires. If the Humean theory is correct, then being a reason is a natural property. And, if all other moral facts are to be analyzed in terms of reasons, then all moral facts are natural facts.
- Phillipa Foot (2001) accepts a “value first” account of normativity, which says that goodness is the fundamental normative concept. She also accepts a neo-Aristotelian account of goodness (see Section 5 below for more on neo-Aristotelianism.) If neo-Aristotelianism is correct, goodness is a natural property. And if all moral facts are to be analyzed in terms of goodness, then all moral facts are natural facts.
This two-step strategy is popular but controversial. Those moved by the Open Question Argument and the Normativity Objection are skeptical that the second step of the naturalizing strategy could ever be completed. Non-naturalists doubt that it could ever be shown that the fundamental normative concept picks out some natural property because normative properties and natural properties just seem to obviously be different kinds of properties. Wittgenstein claimed to “see clearly, as it were in a flash of light, not only that no description that I can think of would do to describe what I mean by absolute value, but that I would reject every significant description that anybody could possibly suggest, ab initio, on the ground of its significance” (Wittgenstein 1965). David Enoch (2011) is more pithy, saying simply that natural properties and normative properties are just too different for any natural account of a fundamental normative property to be satisfying.
But it’s unclear what this “just too different” intuition amounts to (Laskowski 2019). In what sense are the natural and the normative “just too different?” Schroeder thinks that the intuition has force only if there is “a perfectly general single truth about which any reductive view would be forced into error” (Schroeder 2005, 14). The existence of such a truth would be the proof that the natural and normative are just too different; without such a truth, the non-naturalist hasn’t really offered an argument against naturalism. But because all normative claims conceptually reduce to claims about reasons, argues Schroeder, there will be no such truth, provided that we have a coherent account of the foundational notion of a reason. So a coherent account of normative reasons can explain all normative claims. These fundamental normative facts about reasons are themselves explained by the natural facts to which reasons reduce. But because this reduction of reasons will take the form of a synthetic reduction, there end up being no conceptual connections between the normative and the natural. This general lack of conceptual connections between the normative and the natural is what explains the “just too different” intuition, and it is fully compatible with moral naturalism as a synthetic metaphysical truth (see also Copp 2020).
Schroeder’s response may succeed in providing a naturalist-friendly explanation of the “just too different” intuition, but it seems strange to say that the existence of numerous analytic relations between different normative concepts, combined with a lack of analytic relations between normative and natural concepts, supports the thesis that the normative is natural. The lack of conceptual connections between the natural and normative may be better explained by non-naturalism (Enoch 2011).
Derek Parfit’s Triviality Objection (Parfit 2011) is another contemporary extension of the Open Question Argument. If moral naturalism is true, says Parfit, then it will be possible to make moral claims and natural claims and have those two claims be about the same fact. Parfit worries that if the two claims are about the same fact, then those two claims must contain all the same information. And a statement of equivalence between any two claims that contain the same information must be trivial. But moral claims that describe the relationships between moral facts and natural facts are not trivial at all – they are highly substantive.
Derek Parfit’s Triviality Objection (Parfit 2011) is another contemporary extension of the Open Question Argument. If moral naturalism is true, says Parfit, then it will be possible to make moral claims and natural claims and have those two claims contain all the same information. And a statement of equivalence between any two claims that contain the same information must be trivial. But moral claims that describe the relationships between moral facts and natural facts are not trivial at all – they are highly substantive. So moral naturalism is false. However, it is not clear that this Triviality Objection is any more forceful than the Open Question Argument. Parfit’s central motivating thoughts are that natural-moral identity claims are substantive rather than trivial, and therefore moral claims concern a different kind of fact than natural claims. These are exactly the central thoughts behind Moore’s Open Question Argument, and so naturalists to respond to this objection in largely the same way that they respond to the Open Question Argument. Naturalists typically respond by adopting a version of synthetic naturalism, and arguing that moral-natural identities are informative in the same way that other synthetic property identity claims (like water = H2O) are (Copp 2017).
Having discussed moral naturalism in general terms, we’ll now examine three of the most popular naturalistic metaethical views in detail. As we go, it will be worth keeping the normativity objection in mind. A version of the normativity objection will end up being one of the most pressing objections to all of these views.
5. Neo-Aristotelian Naturalism
Aristotelianism has had adherents since… well, since Aristotle. Even in the dark times of the mid-20th century, when naturalism was in disrepute, post-Moore, Aristotelians like Elizabeth Anscombe kept the flame alive (Anscombe 1958). Neo-Aristotelianism has both ethical and metaethical commitments. We’ll primarily be looking at the metaethical aspects of neo-Aristotelian naturalism, but first-order ethics will make an appearance as well.
We can characterize Aristotelian naturalism by four major ideas. The first is that there is no one property of goodness. The goodness of a good toaster is different from the goodness of a good movie, which is different from the goodness of a good time to dance, which is different from the goodness of a good person. To be a good thing is to be a good thing of its kind. The second is that this fact is mirrored in our language. The semantics for goodness is attributive rather than predicative (more on this shortly). The third is that the most fundamental ethical concept is the concept of a good person. Good actions are the actions a good person will do, good things are the things that good people will desire or pursue, and good practical reasoning is reasoning in the way that good people reason. And the fourth is that the standards that make something good are derivable from the nature of the kind of thing it is. So what makes someone a good person is derivable from the kind of thing a human person is. This implies that morality is derivable from biology – although this biological conception of human goodness is quite controversial, even among Aristotelians.
Let’s start by looking what Aristotelians say about the semantics of ‘good.’ Contemporary Aristotelians follow Peter Geach (1956) in distinguishing between two different kinds of adjective: attributive and predicative. The difference between the two comes from whether they validate the following inference pattern:
- X is an F G.
- X is an H.
- Therefore, X is an F H.
If F is a predicative adjective, that inference will be valid. If F is an attributive adjective, then it won’t. To make this concrete, consider the following instances of this schema:
- Jerry is a brown mouse.
- Jerry is an animal.
- Therefore, Jerry is a brown animal.
4–6 is valid. If Jerry is a brown mouse, then he’s a brown animal. Therefore, ‘brown’ is a predicative adjective. Predicative adjectives refer to the same property in all contexts. Compare this to:
- Jerry is a large mouse.
- Jerry is an animal.
- Therefore, Jerry is a large animal.
7–9 is not valid. A large mouse is still a very small animal. Therefore, ‘large’ is an attributive adjective. The meaning of an attributive adjective in any given context is determined by the noun that it is modifying. “Large mouse” means (something like) “Large for a mouse.”
With this in mind, consider the following argument:
- Frank is a good tennis player.
- Frank is a husband and father.
- Frank is a good husband and father.
This is clearly invalid. Frank might have a powerful serve and a wicked backhand, yet neglect his family. This indicates that ‘good’ is attributive (although see Szabó 2001). ‘Good’ does not refer to the same property of goodness in all contexts. Instead, ‘good K’ means something like ‘good-for-a-K.’
Judith Jarvis Thomson has influentially expanded on Geach’s basic idea. According to Thomson, there is a property of being a good K only if K is a goodness-fixing kind (Thomson 2008, 21). For instance, “knife” is a goodness-fixing kind; thus, there is the property of being a good knife. Goodness need not always be understood in terms of goodness-fixing kinds. Things can be good in other respects, such as “good for use in making cheesecake” or “good for Alfred” (Thomson 1997, 278). Thomson calls things that are good in this way “good-modified.” There is no such thing as “a good smudge,” full stop, because “smudge” is not a goodness-fixing kind in the way “knife” is. But there might be a smudge that is good for using in a Rorschach test, because “being used in a Rorschach test” is a way that smudges can be good-modified (Thomson 2008, 21–22).
Thomson holds that it makes no sense to ask whether an act is good or not, because “act”, like “smudge”, is not a goodness-fixing kind. Accordingly, acts can only be good-modified; they can be good in some respect – e.g., a moral respect. Acts are morally good when they spring from an agent’s morally virtuous traits. A moral virtue is any trait such that an individual of a kind K is as morally good as a K can be only if it has that trait (and it’s possible for to either have or lack that trait) (Thomson 2008, 79).
So what makes a person as good as a person can be? The fourth major Aristotelian idea is that the standards of goodness for a thing are determined by the kind of thing it is. But how can a thing’s kind determine the standards for that thing? The traditional answer, from Aristotle, says that kinds of things have a particular form, or shape. The form of hammers is just their hammer-shape. The form of a thing determines its function: the function of a hammer is to hammer because hammers are shaped in a way that makes them good for hammering. And function thus determines the telos (purpose or end) of the thing: hammers are for hammering, and a good hammer is one that hammers well. All of this can be understood in unmysterious, naturalistic terms. We can apply this same model to human beings. The form of a human determines what the specific human function is. And a good person is, therefore, someone who performs that function well by satisfying the characteristic ends of human life.
The most influential account of human ends comes from Rosalind Hursthouse. Hursthouse says that human life is characterized by four ends: survival, reproduction, characteristic enjoyment and freedom from pain, and the good functioning of the group. Survival and reproduction are common to all living things, including plants. But the manner in which these ends should be pursued are characteristic of the species. Penguins have one characteristic way of reproducing and lions have another (Hursthouse 1999, Ch 9). The characteristically human way of pursuing these four human ends is by the use of rationality. Humans alone among the animals act not from mere instinct, but from a rational capacity of deliberation and choice. So good, “flourishing” humans are those who pursue the four ends in accordance with reason. Like many other neo-Aristotelians, Hursthouse uses the word “flourishing” as an English translation of Aristotle’s eudaimonia, since it nicely captures the analogy with other kinds of living organism that is central to Aristotelian naturalism. But ‘flourishing’ might not be the best word, since it may misleadingly imply an untroubled life (Foot 2001, Ch 6).
A common objection at this point is that the notion of an end or telos, while central to Aristotle’s conception of biology, is much more controversial in a Darwinian biological paradigm (Millum 2006; compare Moosavi 2022a). This is particularly true if we are talking about the telos of an organism as a whole; many philosophers of biology will still be happy to say that the purpose of the heart is to pump blood, but it’s not clear that it makes sense to talk about the purpose of a human being. For this reason, many neo-Aristotelians prefer to avoid (or at least de-emphasize) the idea of a human telos and instead talk in terms of what Michael Thompson has called “Aristotelian categoricals” (Thompson 2008, Ch 4). These are claims like like “Oak trees have deep, sturdy roots” or “Humans have 32 teeth.” Aristotelian categoricals are not necessarily true of all, or even most, members of a species; most humans have less than 32 teeth (Anscombe 1958). Rather, they describe something important about the nature, or the characteristic form of life, of different kinds of living things (McDowell 1998). They say what “should” be the case for a member of a species, or what will be true of an organism insofar as it is flourishing. In this way, Aristotelian categoricals are both descriptive biological claims but also, in a way, evaluative.
Aristotelian categoricals allow us to evaluate organisms in a straightforwardly naturalistic way. An oak tree with deep, sturdy roots is (at least in this respect) flourishing, while one without deep, sturdy roots is defective. Similarly, then, a good person is flourishing insofar as they participate in characteristically human ways of life, and bad people are defective in the same sense that an oak without deep, sturdy roots is defective. “A bad tree.” The only difference is that humans and oak trees participate in very different ways of life. The aptness of the comparison is better illustrated by looking at other social animals, like wolves. Wolves hunt in packs; that is their characteristic way of life. A wolf that hunts in a pack flourishes, while a wolf that hunts by itself is defective. A good life for a wolf is partly a matter of cooperating with others of its kind to achieve further ends which are constitutive of a flourishing life (Foot 2001, 16). So, too, with humans. The characteristic ways of life for any given thing are what we might call the virtues of that thing; deep, sturdy roots are virtues in an oak. The distinctively human virtues are the virtues that are particular to human life, which is a social life governed by rational deliberation. And those are just the traditional virtues of moral philosophy: courage, humility, generosity, and so on (Foot 2001, Ch 5). Humans with those virtues are, in that respect, flourishing. Those that lack the virtues are defective.
Let’s turn to some objections. First, consider the Aristotelian’s claim that goodness is an attributive adjective. It’s quite plausible that goodness functions like an attributive adjective sometimes: a good tennis player might be a bad father. But there might also be a predicative use of the word ‘good.’ For instance, consider the idea of a “good state of affairs.” It is hard to give the ‘good’ in “good state of affairs” an attributive reading: states of affairs aren’t what Thomson calls a good-fixing kind. Thomson argues that this means that it’s incoherent to say that there could be such a thing as a good state of affairs; she takes this to be a strong challenge to consequentialism (Thomson 2008, 62). But if the notion of a good state of affairs is intelligible, perhaps “good” sometimes serves as a predicative adjective that refers to a property of (moral) goodness (Sturgeon 2010).
Second, whether we evaluate human organisms in terms of a telos or a characteristic form of life, it’s not clear how these kinds of evaluations are relevant to ethics. Even if there is a characteristic way of human life, why should we live that way ourselves? What is normative about “natural goodness” (Prinz 2009)? Living a characteristic human life might be a very bad way to live. There are some characteristic ways of human life that seem to be quite bad: for example, destroying the environment, fighting ideological wars, and having a sense of altruism that is limited to a relatively small circle of family and friends. Neo-Aristotelians seem to assume a rather rosy picture of human nature that’s hard to square with a serious study of history or sociology (Williams 1972; Millgram 2009).
Neo-Aristotelians typically answer this worry by appealing to the role of reason (Hacker-Wright 2009; Lott 2012; Jordan 2020). The supreme human virtue that characterizes a flourishing human life is phronesis, the virtue of being able to reason well about how to act (Hursthouse 1999, Ch 4). So fighting ideological wars is not characteristic of human life because it’s not reasonable to fight ideological wars; that’s not how a good person, one with phronesis, would act. This way of operationalizing Aristotelianism throws out the idea that discerning natural goodness is a matter of applied biology (Hursthouse 1999, 178–191). The characteristic form of human life is defined ethically, not biologically (Nussbaum 1995).
One might well worry that this abandons the naturalistic character of Aristotelianism. Aristotelians typically reply that to be a good person is just to be a certain sort of human organism with certain mental characteristics (which amounts to having a brain that is functionally organized in a certain way). So (recalling our distinctions from Section 1), while neo-Aristotelians accept Property Naturalism and most accept Fact Naturalism, many end up rejecting Methodological Naturalism (Hursthouse 1999, Ch 10; Moosavi 2022b). But John McDowell has argued that the human virtues are “natural” only insofar as they relate to the “nature” of human beings, and human nature is not a subject for scientific investigation (McDowell 1998). Micah Lott has argued that neo-Aristotelians should give up on pretensions to naturalism (Lott 2020).
Three further problems linger. First, appealing to practical reason to solve the problem of normativity seems to undermine the core Aristotelian idea that we can define a good person in terms of what is distinctive of human life. Kant argued that Aristotle was wrong to ground ethics in the form of a human life, since what matters for ethics is the form of pure practical reason. Contemporary Aristotelianism seems to concede this point to Kant (Woodcock 2018; but see Jordan 2020 or McKracken 2021). Second, neo-Aristotelianism looks circular. One of the main ideas of Aristotelianism is that the goodness of a good person is the fundamental moral concept, but if we define a good person in ethical terms, we’ve gone in a circle. Brown (2016) responds that a good person is defined in teleological rather than ethical terms, but this just raises the question of how we define teleology. Biological definitions seem inadequate, but normative definitions make the account circular once again. Third, even if the circularity concerns can be answered, we might worry that a larger epistemological problem remains. How can we identify virtuous agents? Abandoning Methodological Naturalism might create more problems than it solves (but see Jordan 2016).
6. Cornell Realism
If moral naturalism is the view that moral facts are the kinds of facts that can be investigated in a broadly scientific way, then no view captures the spirit of naturalism better than Cornell realism. Cornell realism was developed in the 1980s by Richard Boyd (1988), David Brink (1986), Nicholas Sturgeon (1985), and Peter Railton (1986a; 1986b); the view gets its name from the fact that Boyd, Brink, and Sturgeon were working or studying at Cornell University at the time. It is a comprehensive metaethical system, with interrelated linguistic, metaphysical, and epistemological commitments, that deliberately mirrors scientific methodology in ethics as closely as possible.
It might seem odd to suggest that we can know things about morality by using scientific methodology. Scientific methods are all, ultimately, grounded in an epistemology of observation. And as Gilbert Harman (1977, Ch. 1) famously argued, it does not seem that we can observe moral facts in anything like the same way that we can observe other kinds of natural facts. It’s rather obvious how we can have empirical knowledge of natural properties such as redness or roundness; they are directly observable. But goodness doesn’t seem to be directly observable, and that looks like an important disanalogy between moral properties and natural properties.
But not all natural properties are directly observable. Some kinds of natural properties are complex, and knowable only through the functional role they occupy. Consider, for instance, the property of being healthy. Being healthy isn’t like being red; there’s no one way that healthy people look. Of course, there may be some characteristic visual signs of healthiness – rosy cheeks, a spring in one’s step – but these visual signs are neither necessary nor sufficient for healthiness. These directly observable properties are only indications of healthiness. Healthiness is a complex natural property, wholly constituted by an organism’s body being in the “proper” configuration, with a robust causal profile. There are many things that can cause or impede health by their presence or absence: food, water, disease, etc. And there are many things that will result from health in typical circumstances: energy, long life, etc. Rosy cheeks and a spring in one’s step are indications of healthiness because these are properties that are – typically – caused by health. Our awareness of the causal profile of healthiness thus gives us a way of figuring out which things have or do not have the complex property of healthiness.
Cornell realists hold that goodness is exactly like healthiness in all of these ways (Boyd 1988). Like healthiness, goodness is a complex natural property that is not directly observable, but nonetheless has a robust causal profile. Like “healthiness,” “goodness” is not synonymous with any simpler empirical description. Instead, “goodness” describes the functionally complex natural property that is the effect of certain characteristic causes, and the cause of certain characteristic effects. Many different things contribute to or detract from goodness – things like pleasure or pain, honesty or untruthfulness – and there are many things that will result from goodness in typical circumstances – things like human flourishing, or political peace. Because goodness is a natural property with a complex causal profile, the property of goodness can enter into explanatory relations. Thus, contra Harman, it is possible for goodness to explain our observations (Sturgeon 1985). We can, accordingly, observe whether something is good by looking for indications of goodness. This is exactly the same way that we observe whether something is healthy.
Another way that goodness is like healthiness is that both are multiply realizable. We could, perhaps, give a more or less complete description of what it takes for a human body to be healthy, although such a description might be quite long and complicated. But it’s also possible that aliens with a very different biology exist, and for those aliens to be healthy, even though a healthy alien body is nothing like a healthy human body. But despite their radical physical differences, both a healthy alien and a healthy human are healthy. The same might be true of goodness, or other moral properties. As a natural property, any particular instance of goodness is fully constituted by a complex of more fundamental physical properties. But goodness might be constituted by an indefinitely large number of radically distinct physical configurations: the goodness of a promise kept is quite different from the goodness of a delicious and nutritious meal. This motivates the Cornell realists to call themselves non-reductive naturalists (by which they mean that they are one-term naturalists rather than descriptivists). Goodness is realizable in too many physical structures to give a usable definition of morality in descriptive terms.
The great asset of Cornell realism is that it directly adopts widely accepted views about the nature of natural properties and scientific knowledge in order to answer the foundational questions of moral metaphysics and moral epistemology. What are moral properties? Highly complex natural properties, multiply realizable in more fundamental structures, and individuated by their causal profiles. Are there, generally, properties like this? Yes; these are known as “homeostatic cluster properties.” Healthiness is one; moral properties are properties like that. How do we know about moral properties? By looking for directly observable properties that are characteristically functionally upstream or downstream from the moral property that we are interested in (provided that we have justified background beliefs about the functional roles of moral properties). Do we, generally, have knowledge like this? Yes: this is how we have scientific knowledge; moral knowledge is knowledge like that. In this way, the theoretical resources of scientific realism also turn out to support moral realism (Boyd 1988).
A skeptic might object that it’s impossible to have justified background beliefs about the functional profile of moral properties. But this objection would prove too much. We are entitled to rely on background beliefs in moral theory development because we’re entitled to do so in science, generally (Boyd 1988, 189–191). Our theories and background beliefs are justified together, by their overall coherence and empirical adequacy, in both science and ethics.
It is not essential to Cornell realism that goodness be identified with any particular complex natural property – different Cornell realists have different first-order normative commitments. The most influential of these accounts is due to Railton (1986a; 1986b). Railton, like Thomson, holds that moral goodness is defined in terms of what is non-morally good for agents. Whereas Thomson, as a neo-Aristotelian, defines what is good for a human in terms of human biology, Railton defines non-moral goodness for an agent as what a fully-informed counterpart would advise us to desire, or, (perhaps) equivalently, what a fully-informed counterpart of ourselves would desire if they were in our actual position (see also Brandt 1979; Smith 1994). To illustrate, Railton asks us to imagine a traveler, Lonnie, who feels terrible because he is badly dehydrated. Lonnie does not know that he is dehydrated, and so is not taking appropriate steps to make himself feel better. But imagine a fully-informed version of Lonnie – “Lonnie-Plus” – who knows about his dehydration and knows that drinking clear liquids will make him feel better. Lonnie-Plus, who (like Lonnie) desires to feel better but who (unlike Lonnie) knows the best means to that end, would recommend that Lonnie drink clear fluids, and would drink clear fluids himself if he were in Lonnie’s position. The fact that Lonnie-Plus would advise Lonnie to want to to drink clear fluids means that drinking clear fluids is good for Lonnie. This is not a relativist view of goodness, because the fact that Lonnie-Plus would choose to drink clear liquids is determined by Lonnie’s circumstances and constitution, and facts about Lonnie’s circumstances and constitution are objective facts. In general: the complex natural property of being good for an agent is identical to the complex natural property that agent’s fully-informed counterpart would choose. This makes goodness “objective, though relational” (Railton 1986b, 167).
This account is highly controversial. Railton’s case of Lonnie-Plus presents a counterpart who knows just a few more salient bits of information than Lonnie. But a counterpart who is truly fully-informed will know vastly more than we ourselves do, and would, accordingly, be quite different from us. A fully-informed counterpart might be suicidally depressed, or made neurotic by their full awareness of all the oddities and dangers in the world, or might in some other way have been driven quite mad by the process of becoming omniscient. It’s far from clear what a fully informed person would desire, and, given that fully-informed individuals are so radically different from ourselves, it’s not clear why we should think that the advice of such an agent would have anything to do with our own personal well-being (Loeb 1995). It might also be impossible to be fully-informed in this way. It’s plausible that our knowledge affects the nature of our experiences, and so a “fully-informed” agent would be incapable of knowing what it is like to have experiences in a condition of ignorance, and thus could not be truly fully informed (Sobel 1994; Rosati 1995). We might also worry that full information accounts get things backwards; advice attends to our interests, our interests don’t attend to advice, even ideal advice (see Risberg 2018 and citations therein). Railton heads off this objection by denying that personal good depends on an ideal advisor’s advice: “the existence of an individual’s objective interest can explain why his ideally informed self would pick out for his less-informed self a given objectified subjective interest, but not vice versa” (Railton 1986b, fn 17). This answers the worry, but leaves us somewhat adrift. If the advice of a fully-informed counterpart doesn’t make a certain complex of natural properties count as good for an agent, what does?
With this account of personal, non-moral goodness in hand, Railton then defines a moral standard as a standard that takes all agents’ interests equally into account. To act rightly is to act in accordance with this standard. Railton’s moral standard is “consequentialist, aggregative, and maximizing, [but it] is not equivalent to classical utilitarianism,” since Railton does not assume that personal, non-moral goodness consists in happiness (Railton 1986, fn. 31). This moral standard has explanatory power; for instance, if a society does not take the interests of all into account, it might be more prone to revolution, and so a revolution in an immoral society might be explained by that immorality. Because the moral standard is one that takes the interests of all into account, the right thing for an agent to do may fail to serve her interests. Assuming that practical reasons are grounded solely in self-interest (as Railton does), people who don’t care about the moral standard might have no reason to act morally. As we saw in Section 4.2, Railton accepts a “reforming definition” of morality that sacrifices the intrinsic normativity of moral standards. As we also saw in Section 4.2, many consider this to be an unacceptable consequence of the view.
There may, in practice, be substantial overlap between the metaphysical commitments of neo-Aristotelianism and Cornell realism. Cornell realists say that the good is a certain higher-order natural property. Neo-Aristotelians say that goodness has something to do with human flourishing, which is also a higher-order natural property. Both Cornell realists (Boyd) and neo-Aristotelians (Thomson) have found the analogy with healthiness illuminating when explaining the nature of moral properties (see also Bloomfield 2001). So Cornell realists and neo-Aristotelians do tend to be similar in the way that they conceive of normative properties. But they differ with respect to what they say about language.
While neo-Aristotelians favor an attributive semantics for ‘good,’ Cornell realists accept causal regulation semantics for moral terms, which is the view that moral terms refer to whatever property causally regulates their use. Adopting causal regulation semantics is a sensible thing for the Cornell realists to do, for two reasons. First, it continues their foundational commitment to treating moral properties as natural properties that we know and talk about in the same way that we know and talk about other natural properties. Causal regulation semantics are the standard semantic account for natural kind terms. And second, it helps them evade the Open Question Argument (Brink 2001). According to causal regulation semantics, moral terms cannot be defined in any verbal way. They simply refer to the (complex higher-order natural) property that causally regulates their use. This makes Cornell realism a form of synthetic naturalism. As we saw in 1.2, Moore’s Open Question Argument shows, at most, that analytic descriptivism is false.
But the Cornell realist’s semantics is also the source of the most influential objection to Cornell realism. According to this objection – Horgan and Timmons’s Moral Twin Earth Objection (Horgan and Timmons 1991) – we do not use moral terms in the way that the Cornell realist predicts. To understand the Moral Twin Earth Objection, we need to first understand how causal regulation semantics are supposed to work. The following thought experiment, from Putnam (1975), has been highly influential: Imagine a world – Twin Earth – where there is no H2O, but there is another substance called XYZ. This substance XYZ, while distinct from H2O, fills the rivers and lakes, is clear and tasteless, etc. XYZ even has the property of being called ‘water’ – when residents of Twin Earth fill up a glass with XYZ from the tap, they will say “I have a cup of water.” Yet for all this, we would not say that Twin Earth is a planet where water is XYZ. We would say that this is a planet where there is no water. There is, instead, another substance – XYZ – that plays the same functional role. Yet when the person on Twin Earth fills a cup from the tap and declares “I have a cup of water”, we shouldn’t say they’re mistaken. What could account for that? Putnam argues that the word ‘water’ just means something different on Twin Earth than it does in the actual world. In the actual world, ‘water’ means H2O because, in the actual world, H2O is the stuff that causally regulates our use of the term ‘water.’ But on Twin Earth, ‘water’ means XYZ because, on Twin Earth, it is XYZ that causally regulates Twin Earthlings use of the term ‘water.’ That is why the word ‘water’ literally means something different on Twin Earth than it does on Earth.
According to the Moral Twin Earth Objection, things don’t work this way for moral terms. Imagine a world – Moral Twin Earth – that is exactly like the actual world, except on Moral Twin Earth, people’s use of moral terminology is causally regulated by different properties from those in the actual world. People use moral terminology to praise and blame and to guide action, but they take different kinds of actions to be worthy of praise or blame and they guide their actions in different ways. Thus, if causal regulation semantics is true for moral terms, the word ‘right’ literally means something different on Moral Twin Earth than it does in the real world – this is the intuition that drives Putnam’s original Twin Earth case. But we do not have the same judgment about how people use moral language on Moral Twin Earth! If people on Moral Twin Earth take different actions to be worthy of praise or blame, we don’t conclude that our words ‘right’ and ‘wrong’ mean different things. We conclude that there is a substantive moral disagreement between the denizens of Moral Twin Earth and the people in our world, and that such disagreement is possible only because we and the Twin Earthers mean the same thing by our moral terms. Horgan and Timmons argue that this proves that moral terms like ‘right’ and ‘wrong’ do not refer to whatever it is that causally regulates their use. So much the worse for Cornell realism. See Copp (2000), Dowell (2016), Dunaway and McPherson (2016), and Väyrynen (2018) for recent criticisms of this argument. Wisdom (2021) criticizes the whole debate on the grounds that our intuitions about Twin Earth and Moral Twin Earth are not stable enough to draw any meaningful conclusions one way or the other.
The deep problem here is that causal regulation semantics implies a kind of relativism. Indeed, some relativists, like Prinz (2007) and Wong (2006), have argued that their view follows from the Cornell realists’ empirical methodology and moral semantics. If words refer to whatever causally regulates their use, and the same word is regulated by different things in different communities, then that word refers to different things in different communities. So if ‘wrong’ refers to whatever causally regulates its use, and if two communities have a word ‘wrong’ that is causally regulated by different things, then ‘wrong’ means different things in those communities. This saddles Cornell realists with a classical problem for relativism. If ‘wrong’ just means something like ‘whatever my community disapproves of,’ as the relativist says, then “My community disapproves of this act, but they shouldn’t, because there’s nothing wrong with it at all” is self-contradictory. But that’s not self-contradictory; so much the worse for relativism (see, e.g., Schroeder 2010, Ch 1). Similarly, if words refer to whatever causally regulates their use within a community, then “This action regulates the use of the term ‘wrong’ in my community, but it shouldn’t, since there’s nothing wrong about that action” would be self-contradictory. But that’s not self-contradictory; so much the worse for Cornell realism (Sinhababu 2019).
One might think that Cornell realists can respond by offering a new account of moral language. But this response faces difficulties on two fronts. First, causal regulation semantics is the Cornell realists’ way of avoiding a commitment to analytic naturalism and the accompanying Open Question Argument. If the causal reference theory is false for moral terms, the naturalist may be forced to accept a theory of moral semantics that would re-introduce the Open Question Argument. Second, the causal reference theory for moral language is essential to the Cornell realists’ methodological and epistemological commitments. If moral goodness is the thing that regulates our use of moral terminology, then the terms of our empirical investigation are simple: we just investigate what regulates the use of our moral language. But if the moral facts are not (necessarily) the facts that regulate the use of our moral language, then we need a new methodology for moral investigation.
Because of this, the Moral Twin Earth objection is often presented as a kind of extension of Moore’s Open Question Argument. The Open Question Argument is, in Moore’s formulation, an attack on the idea that there can be analytic natural-normative property identity claims. But in a larger sense, the Open Question Argument picks out a kind of epistemic shortcoming for moral naturalists. Moral naturalists are committed to the idea that moral facts are a kind of natural fact – but which natural facts are the moral facts? More simply, how do we know good from bad? If moral claims are synonymous with certain natural claims, we can know by conceptual analysis which things are good. And if moral facts are the facts that causally regulate our use of moral terminology, that provides us with another way of investigating which facts are the moral facts. But if neither of those stories is available, it seems that we have no way of identifying which natural facts are the moral ones (Huemer 2005, chapter 4; Bedke 2012). This would be a serious methodological problem for moral naturalists, and would also mark a critical disanalogy between moral epistemology and scientific epistemology. This disanalogy would be crippling to Cornell realists, who hold that there is no such disanalogy.
7. Jackson’s Analytic Functionalism
The final version of naturalism that we’ll look at is Frank Jackson’s moral functionalism. Jackson is an analytic descriptivist. While his is not the only contemporary version of analytic descriptivism (see Smith 1994; Finlay 2014; Rawlette 2020), it is the most influential. This view is typically described as Jackson’s, and the canonical statement of the view comes from his book From Metaphysics to Ethics, though many of the ideas in that book were developed with Philip Pettit (Jackson and Pettit 1995).
As we saw in Section 3.1, Jackson endorses the Direct Argument from supervenience to naturalism. Because moral facts supervene on natural facts, they are identical to natural facts. (Jackson talks about “descriptive” facts rather than “natural” facts, but I’ll continue to use “natural” for the sake of consistency.) The problem now is to say which natural facts the moral facts supervene on and are therefore identical to. Jackson calls this the “location problem.” The location problem isn’t unique to ethics. Jackson expresses sympathy for physicalism, the view that we could, in principle, give a complete account of everything that exists in terms of the kinds of things that physics does (or could) tell us about. Everything else that exists supervenes on (and is therefore identical to) complexes of these fundamental physical things. But which complexes of fundamental physical things are the various non-fundamental things identical to? Location problems abound. Solving them is the task of “serious metaphysics” (Jackson 1998, 1–8).
So how can we solve location problems? What is the method of serious metaphysics? The first step is conceptual analysis. If we want to know what the Fs are, we need to have some idea of what we’re talking about when we’re talking about “the Fs,” and this understanding will frame our subsequent investigation. The first step in figuring out that water is H2O was understanding that water is the clear, tasteless stuff that fills the rivers and lakes and falls from the sky as rain, rather than the intoxicating stuff found in beer, wine, and liquor. If you thought that water was the intoxicating stuff in wine, you’d end up drawing a very different – and incorrect – conclusion about the composition of water (Jackson 1998, 28–31ff).
But wait! Putnam’s Twin Earth thought experiment is supposed to show that we can’t discover the meaning of ‘water’ by a process of conceptual analysis; the people on Twin Earth have the same concept of ‘water’ as we do, but their word means something different. Jackson responds that Putnam and his followers have drawn the wrong lesson from the Twin Earth case. The Twin Earth thought experiment doesn’t show us that the concept of water can’t be analyzed; it shows that the concept can be analyzed, since the Twin Earth thought experiment is itself a nice bit of conceptual analysis. Twin Earth – and all other thought experiments – are nothing more than ways to elicit intuitions about how to deploy our concepts in a variety of counterfactual circumstances. The intuitions that we elicit from thought experiments are the stuff that conceptual analyses are made of. Putnam’s conclusion that ‘water’ refers to whatever causally regulates the use of the term ‘water’ within a linguistic community is itself a partial analysis of the concept of water (Jackson 1998, 39–79). Of course, merely having a conceptual analysis like this in hand is not the end of our investigation. Now that we know what we’re looking for, empirical investigation takes over and we investigate what the stuff is that causally regulates the use of the term ‘water’ within our linguistic community. It turns out that that stuff is H2O. That’s how we solved the location problem for ‘water.’
Now we have a general outline for how to solve location problems. First, consider cases where we would, on reflection, deploy some concept (e.g. ‘water.’) The result of this reflection will be some set of platitudes about that concept. Next, we turn this set of platitudes into a “Ramsay sentence.” Take every instance of the word ‘water’ (or whatever), and replace it with a variable, X. So instead of “Water falls from the sky as rain,” we will have a collection of sentences that say things like “X falls from the sky as rain.” This collection of Ramsay sentences is a description of a functional role; in this case, the water-role. Finally, we empirically investigate what, if anything, fulfills that role. We know that water is H2O because we found, through empirical investigation, that H2O is the stuff that satisfies the water-role. In general, we know what Fs are by using conceptual analysis to figure out what the F-role is, and then empirically investigating what, if anything, satisfies the F-role (Jackson 1998, Ch 2–3).
We can perform this process to solve the location problem in ethics. Begin with some moral concept, say “goodness.” Then consider a variety of cases where we would judge that something is good. The result will be some set of platitudes about goodness. We can then take those platitudes about goodness and turn them into a Ramsay sentence which describes the goodness-role. Finally, we investigate what, if anything, satisfies the goodness-role. That thing is goodness (Jackson 1998, Ch 5–6).
What about multiple realizability? Jackson is attempting to provide a conceptual analysis of our moral concepts, but the Cornell realists thought that no such analysis is possible in part because goodness (e.g.) is realizable in a large number of very different things. Jackson is unconcerned by this. If goodness supervenes on a large number of different descriptive properties, then goodness is identical to the disjunction of all of those descriptive properties on which it supervenes. Goodness might be identical to a disjunction – perhaps an infinitely large disjunction! – of other natural properties (see also Sinhababu 2018).
Many have found the suggestion that goodness is identical to an infinite disjunction of natural properties to be metaphysically and epistemologically suspicious. Can an infinite disjunction of natural properties really be a property? And how could we have knowledge of an ugly gerrymandered property? Jackson replies that excessively disjunctive properties are suspect, because they cannot play a causal role (Jackson 1998, 106). But not all disjunctive properties – even infinitely disjunctive properties – are excessively disjunctive. Consider the property of baldness. Baldness supervenes on (and is therefore identical to) having a certain distribution of hair on one’s head. Well-known vagueness concerns about the predicate ‘bald’ may prevent us from giving a more compact description of what it takes for someone to be bald. But there is some large – perhaps infinitely large – set of hair distributions which we would, on reflection, definitely consider to be bald. Baldness is therefore identical to an infinitely large disjunction of hair distributions. But that doesn’t mean that there’s anything metaphysically or epistemically weird about being bald. Many people are bald, many claims to the effect that someone is bald are true, and in most cases it is not particularly difficult to ascertain whether or not someone is bald. Jackson urges us to say precisely the same thing about moral properties (124).
A second worry: When we assemble the platitudes about our concept of “goodness,” we will find that many of them implicate other moral concepts. “If something is good, then you have a reason to pursue it.” “Virtuous character traits are good.” And so on. So we can’t analyze the concept of goodness into platitudes and then investigate what satisfies those platitudes, since many of those platitudes will concern moral concepts that are equally in need of analysis. Jackson’s solution to this problem is to analyze all of the moral concepts together. Take all of the platitudes concerning goodness or value or wrongness or virtue, etc. Replace every instance of “good” with a variable (g), replace every instance of “value” with another variable (v), replace every instance of “wrong” with another variable (w), etc. The result is the functional role description of the network of our moral concepts. Goodness and value and wrongness are then the g, the v, and the w (etc.) that satisfy all of the platitudes concerning g, v, and w (etc.).
A final worry: Which platitudes are we to select as the platitudes that appear in our analysis? The ones that we endorse on reflection? But who is the “we” who would endorse these platitudes on reflection? How much reflection must we undergo? Jackson answers this worry by appeal to the concept of a mature folk morality. A folk morality is “the network of moral opinions, intuitions, principles and concepts whose mastery is part and parcel of having a sense of what is right and wrong, and of being able to engage in meaningful debate about what ought to be done” (130). This folk morality is then revised by hunting out inconsistencies within one’s moral commitments and engaging in moral discussion with others, identifying disagreements, and hammering out any differences. The resulting mature moral theory will be both individually and interpersonally coherent. That’s the final statement of the view: The moral properties are whatever satisfies the network analysis of the platitudes that make up mature folk morality.
Jackson’s appeal to a mature folk morality is his main ward against the Open Question Argument. To ask “X is pleasurable, but is X good?” is, in effect, to ask whether “Pleasure is good” is one of the platitudes that will feature in our mature folk morality. But we don’t have a mature folk morality yet – we may not have one for a very long time – and we have no way of knowing at this point what platitudes will feature in it. Of course the question remains open.
The fact that we don’t know what the mature folk morality looks like also shows that Jackson’s idea of an infinitely disjunctive property isn’t a core commitment of the view. If our mature folk morality is a vast, heterogeneous collection of principles and cases, then only an infinitely disjunctive property could satisfy it. But our mature folk morality could well be simple and compact. Whether we end up with a compact formulation or an infinite disjunction depends on the outcome of a process we have not yet seen the end of.
Now to some harder objections. One objection holds that Jackson’s view isn’t really a version of analytic naturalism, because the process of refining our mature folk morality will be the result of not just moral discussion and reflection, but also our observations of the real world (Lane 2018). Relatedly, one might worry whether the platitudes of mature folk morality are really conceptual truths. Someone might disagree with a mature consensus not as a result of conceptual confusion but as a matter of genuine moral disagreement (Zangwill 2000).
A second objection concerns how we should understand “mature” folk morality. We don’t want any endpoint of moral theorizing to count as “mature;” if mature folk morality is just the theory we end up with in the future, whatever that might be, then why should we care about it? Maybe people in the future will have the wrong moral beliefs! But if we define maturity in normative terms, as the outcome of a good process of deliberation (or something similar), Jackson hasn’t really succeeded in providing the reductive naturalistic account of normativity that he was hoping for (Yablo 2000).
We might also worry that no mature folk morality will ever emerge. If moral disagreement persists into the indefinite future, just as it has persisted throughout human history, there is no mature folk morality and thus no set of platitudes that determines the moral facts. Jackson concedes that this is a real problem: if there is no convergence in moral attitudes, his methodology would imply moral relativism. He can only offer hope that convergence will occur some day (137–8). And so Jackson’s ambitious metaethical project turns out to rest on an appeal to optimism.
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Many thanks to Spencer Case, Steve Finlay, Nick Laskowski, Tristram McPherson, Tim Perrine, Russ Shafer-Landau, and Pekka Väyrynen for helpful discussion and comments. The structure of this article was adapted from an earlier version by James Lenman.