Method and Metaphysics in Plato’s Sophist and Statesman

First published Thu Oct 6, 2005; substantive revision Wed Feb 26, 2020

The Sophist and Statesman are late Platonic dialogues, whose relative dates are established by their stylistic similarity to the Laws, a work that was apparently still “on the wax” at the time of Plato’s death (Diogenes Laertius 3.37). These dialogues are important in exhibiting Plato’s views on method and metaphysics after he criticized his own most famous contribution to the history of philosophy, the theory of separate, immaterial forms in the Parmenides. The Statesman also offers a transitional statement of Plato’s political philosophy between the Republic and the Laws. The Sophist and Statesman show the author’s increasing interest in mundane and practical knowledge. In this respect they seem more down-to-earth and Aristotelian in tone than dialogues dated to Plato’s middle period such as the Phaedo and the Republic. This entry will focus on method and metaphysics.

1. Introduction

The Sophist and Statesman represent themselves as the first two members of a trilogy, which was to include a third member, the Philosopher, a dialogue Plato never wrote. The conversations in the Sophist and Statesman take place sequentially on a single day and are dramatically linked to the Theaetetus, which occurred on the previous day, shortly before Socrates’ trial and death (Theaetetus 210d, Sophist 216a). The Theaetetus and Sophist are also linked more remotely to the Parmenides, a conversation Socrates says he had with the great philosopher of Elea, when Parmenides was old and he was very young (Theaetetus 183e–184a, Sophist 217c). Socrates plays a minor role in the conversations in the Sophist and Statesman, observing the proceedings but replaced as main speaker by a visitor from Elea, a follower of Parmenides, who converses with Theaetetus in the Sophist and with a young man named Socrates (the Younger) in the Statesman.

Although the Sophist and Statesman are dialogues, the interaction between the Stranger and his two young interlocutors seems rather different from that between Socrates and his interlocutors in the Socratic dialogues, including the Theaetetus. In that dialogue Theaetetus distinguished himself as a highly promising student, who answered Socrates’ questions resourcefully. The respondents in the Sophist and Statesman are docile by comparison, readily accepting the Stranger’s arguments and occasionally asking him to explain, but rarely raising tough objections or making good proposals of their own. Young Socrates in the Statesman is particularly prone to misunderstandings and mistakes. Of all the respondents in Plato’s dialogues, the interlocutors in the Sophist and Statesman most closely resemble the respondent in the second part of the Parmenides, a young man named Aristotle (not the famous philosopher), who never objects when he should, and who gives his most enthusiastic assents when Parmenides’ argument is most problematic or obscure.

These dramatic features raise questions of philosophical importance. Why does Plato connect the Sophist and Statesman with the Theaetetus and Parmenides, dialogues written in all probability a good deal earlier? Why do the speakers keep anticipating a third dialogue, the Philosopher (Sophist 216c–217b, 253c–254b; Statesman 257a–c, 258b), on a topic plainly dear to Plato’s heart, which he then never wrote? Why does Plato replace Socrates with the colorless visitor from Elea? Elsewhere Plato allows speakers to give long speeches (e.g., Timaeus’ cosmogony in the Timaeus), so why does the visitor engage in question and answer, given that he does most of the talking and his respondents seem unprepossessing and are chosen precisely because they are young and so likely to cause least trouble (cf. Sophist 217d with Parmenides 137b)?

The Sophist and Statesman strike many scholars as more dogmatic than other Platonic dialogues. The Stranger sets out to define the sophist, the statesman, and the philosopher, claiming that they are three distinct kinds (Sophist 217a–b); the two existing dialogues appear to give successful definitions of their target kinds and to present and defend significant methodological and metaphysical positions. The Sophist arguably solves the problem of false statement, one of a family of problems that had dogged other Platonic dialogues, including the Theaetetus.

Perhaps Plato replaces Socrates with the visitor from Elea because Elea was the hometown of Parmenides, and in the Sophist Plato plans to criticize Parmenides’ dictum that we cannot speak or think of what-is-not (Sophist 237a). Perhaps, too, readers are meant to recall the Parmenides, a dialogue staged some fifty years earlier, in which Parmenides himself led the conversation. After criticizing Plato’s middle period treatment of forms (inadequately defended by a youthful Socrates), Parmenides announced that before positing forms Socrates should undertake rigorous philosophical training. In the second part of the dialogue, Parmenides then demonstrated with a youthful respondent the sort of exercise he had in mind, focusing on another thesis for which he was famous, that there is only one thing (Parmenides 128a–b, 137b). By using a visitor from Elea, Plato invites his audience to recall Parmenides’ own positions and performance in that earlier dialogue. (For discussion of the dialogue form in these late works, cf. Frede 1996, Rowe 1996, and C. Gill 1996).

2. Purpose of the Sophist and Statesman

The Sophist and Statesman each undertake a particular task, the first to define a sophist, the second to define a statesman. But they have a larger purpose. The Statesman gives many indications that the investigation of the statesman is being undertaken not primarily for its own sake but for the sake of a greater project—our becoming better dialecticians (Statesman 285d, 286d–287a).

The Stranger makes this announcement, first reminding Young Socrates of a previous discussion about children learning their letters:

Suppose someone should ask us about the children sitting together learning their letters: when one of them is asked of what letters some word or other is composed, do we ever say that the inquiry is more for the sake of the one problem set before him or for the sake of his becoming a better speller in all such cases?—Clearly for the sake of his becoming a better speller in all such cases.—Now again what about our inquiry about the statesman? Is it posed more for the sake of that thing itself [the statesman] or for the sake of our becoming more dialectical about everything?—This too is clear, that it’s for the sake of our becoming more dialectical about everything. (Statesman 285c–d)

Next the Stranger talks about examples, such as weaving, for which there are perceptible likenesses, easy to understand, which an instructor can point to when an inquirer has trouble grasping a verbal account. But there are other things, described as greatest and most valuable, that cannot be observed or imaged. It is for the sake of those harder topics that the inquirers practice giving and receiving an account on simple examples, such as weaving, where they can fall back on perceptible instances. The Stranger says:

Hence it is necessary to practice being able to give and receive a verbal account of each thing. For immaterial things, being finest and greatest, are shown clearly by a verbal account alone and by nothing else, and all the things said now are for the sake of those. But in everything practice is easier in lesser things, rather than in greater things. (Statesman 286a–b)

We first practice giving and receiving a verbal account on easy examples like weaving, which can also be observed and imaged. Then we practice on difficult examples, such as the statesman. Here we must give and receive a verbal account without relying on visual aids. But the statesman is still part of the exercise. Our inquiry about him is itself undertaken to make us better dialecticians, able to deal with all such topics. If we can succeed with the statesman, we will have learned a technique, or how to find a technique, that can be applied to other difficult cases, such as the philosopher.

The Statesman chiefly aims to demonstrate how to undertake all such inquiries. Its own inquiry stimulates the participants (and us readers) to recognize what mistakes to avoid and what paths are worth pursuing and why. But significantly, as one sees from comparing the treatments of the sophist and statesman, different kinds of subject matter demand different sorts of methods. So we cannot simply extend the methods of the Sophist and Statesman in a mechanical way to the investigation of the philosopher and other great and difficult topics. These dialogues teach us how to go about philosophical investigations. They do not offer a formula that can be simply applied to further cases.

If the Sophist and Statesman are philosophical exercises, there may be a good reason why the final dialogue of the trilogy, the Philosopher, is missing. Plato would spoil the lesson if he wrote it for us (cf. Dorter 1994, 236). If we have learned how to investigate philosophical problems in the Sophist and Statesman, Plato may be challenging his audience to search for the philosopher themselves, using the techniques and recommendations these dialogues provide (M. L. Gill, 2012).

3. Method

The Sophist and Statesman search for definitions, and both dialogues focus on the search. The Sophist speaks often of the hunt in which we are engaged and of the sophist as our quarry. In this hunt the sophist time and again eludes us, taking cover in the darkness of not-being, reappearing occasionally to dispute the very existence of the kind to which we wish to assign him. How can we define the sophist at all, if we cannot get hold of him or coherently characterize the kind to which he belongs? The Statesman repeatedly notices the road traveled—longer roads and shorter roads that will take us to our destination or lead us astray. The dialogue often reflects on better and worse methods of seeking the goal. The Sophist and the first part of the Statesman represent the search by means of an elaborate tree-like system of roads. The inquirers travel down these branching roads; at each fork they must choose which branch to take in the hope of finding their quarry, and that quarry alone, at the terminus. This method of discovery is called division, and in its most usual form it is the repeated dichotomy of a general kind into two subordinate kinds. Inquirers use division to locate a target kind at the terminus of one branch of the division. A definition, when reached by this means, recounts the steps of the journey.

3.1 Names, Kinds, and Collection

Where does an investigation into a topic such as sophistry or statesmanship begin? At the start of the search for the sophist, the Eleatic visitor remarks that he and Theaetetus may share merely the name “sophist” in common but may mean quite different things by the name. He aims to establish agreement about the kind to which they ascribe the name (Sophist 218b–c), and he wants to find a real definition—a definition that applies to all and only members of the kind, and one that explains why any instance is an instance of that kind: the inquirers seek the essence of the target kind, the property or collection of properties that make the kind what it is.

As a preliminary step in locating the essence of a kind, the inquirers must figure out what people understand by the name of that kind. This opening maneuver can occur in several ways: First, what does the name connote, and what associations does it conjure up? The word “sophist” is cognate with the word sophos, which means “wise man.”[1] That connection suggests that the sophist has some sort of wisdom (sophia) or expertise (technê) (Sophist 221c–d). This idea enables the inquirers to locate the sophist’s ability and practice at the outset in the wide kind art or expertise (technê). The word “statesman” in Greek (politikos) is cognate with the word “city” (polis), and so people associate the statesman’s activity with affairs of a city (Statesman 305e). In addition, the Stranger relates statesman and king (Statesman 258e) and relies on the Homeric epithet of Agamemnon as shepherd of the people (cf. Miller 2004, 40–43). The image of a herdsman quietly guides the initial attempt to define the statesman, whom the Stranger identifies in the opening division as herdsman of the human flock.

Second, what sorts of individuals does the name pick out, and what features do those individuals share? Readers of the Socratic dialogues will recall that when Socrates asks his “What is X?” question (e.g., “What is piety?” “What is courage?” “What is knowledge?”), the respondent frequently opens with some sort of list. Euthyphro, when asked what piety is, says: “I say that piety is doing what I’m doing right now, prosecuting the wrongdoer, be it about murder or temple robbery or anything else, whether the wrongdoer is your father or your mother or anyone else” (Euthyphro 5d–e). Theaetetus, when asked what knowledge is, first replies: “I think the things someone might learn from Theodorus are knowledge—geometry and the things you enumerated just now [arithmetic, astronomy, music]—and cobbling, too, and the arts (technai) of the other craftsmen; all of them together and each separately are simply knowledge” (Theaetetus 146c–d). Socrates regularly objects that the interlocutor has merely given him a list, whereas he wants to know what all the items on the list have in common and what makes them all instances of one kind. Although he complains about the list, it helps to orient the investigation, because reflection on the list equips the inquirers to see the common features shared by all the items enumerated.

The Phaedrus calls this technique collection, and it is used together with division (Phaedrus 265d–266b). A collection can occur at the beginning of an investigation and at any step of a division. By means of collection an inquirer brings together a number of disparate things or kinds of things, often called by different names, into one kind. The Statesman offers a good example of a collection at the outset of its inquiry. The visitor gathers together several kinds of things, called by different names, into one kind—the target kind to be defined:

Shall we posit the statesman, the king, the slave-master, and further the household manager, as one thing, although we call them all these names, or should we say there are as many arts as the names used? (Statesman 258e)

The visitor remarks that although we call these people by different names, they all have in common a power to maintain their rule by the strength of their understanding with little use of their hands and bodies (Statesman 259c). This is a rough and ready description of the target kind the inquirers hope to find at the terminus of their division. This crude description enables them to pick out a wide kind to divide (knowledge, epistêmê), and to take a number of steps in the division. The Stranger first divides knowledge into practical and theoretical and then seeks to locate the target kind at the terminus stemming from theoretical knowledge.

3.2 Paradigms and Division

At the beginning of the investigation into the sophist, the Stranger says they need to practice their investigation on a paradigm (paradeigma), before they embark on the difficult and controversial topic before them.

In the Parmenides and elsewhere Plato speaks of separate, immaterial forms as paradigms, and sensible particulars as likenesses of them, which somehow fall short of the original. This notion of a paradigm recurs in the Sophist, in the Stranger’s discussion of imitation (Sophist 235d–e), but the Sophist and Statesman use another conception as well. A paradigm involves a mundane example with a feature—sometimes an essential feature—relevant to the definition of the more difficult kind under investigation. In the Sophist, an angler, defined as a sort of hunter, guides the initial search for the sophist, who is also identified as a sort of hunter.

A paradigm is not merely an example (or paradigmatic example) of some general kind, as angling is an example of hunting and more generally of expertise. The search for the definition of the example reveals a procedure, which can be transferred to the harder case, independent of content. Different paradigms introduce different procedures. The angler introduces the method of dichotomous division, and the definition of the angler recounts the steps on one side of that division. Both the procedure and definitional structure are featured in the harder case. The Statesman’s main paradigm, weaving, is offered much later in the investigation, after an initial attempt to define the statesman by dichotomous division has led to an impasse. Again, the example shares properties in common with the target kind—both the weaver and the statesman engage in the art of intertwining, among other things. The paradigm also introduces a procedure that can be extended to the target. The Stranger calls the new procedure division “by limbs” (Statesman 287c). By means of such division he gradually marks off the kind to be defined (weaver or statesman) from other sorts of experts related to it in various ways and operating in the same domain. Plato’s paradigms in the Sophist and Statesman typically reveal a productive next move or series of moves in an investigation. A paradigm indicates how to go on—how to take the opening steps in an investigation or how to get beyond an impasse.

4. The Problem of the Sophist

The divisions in the Sophist and Statesman are divisions of arts (angling, sophistry, weaving, statecraft), and only secondarily of experts who possess those arts. The art makes the expert the sort of expert he is. The initial attempts to define the sophist and statesman, using the method of dichotomous division, each reveal a puzzle about the target kind, and that puzzle is then resolved in some other way, or at least in conjunction with some other method. The sophist is puzzling because his art turns up, not at a single terminus like angling, but at many different termini. Reflection on this peculiarity enables the inquirers to recognize something they had previously missed—the essence of the sophist—which ties together the various previous appearances.

4.1 The Angler and the Sophist

The paradigm of the angler demonstrates the method of dichotomous division and steers the first attempt to define the sophist. An angler has a humble profession, familiar to everyone (Sophist 218e): an angler hunts water creatures using a special sort of hook. The visitor arrives at his definition by first locating the angler’s profession in a wide kind, art or expertise (technê). He divides art into two subordinate kinds, productive and acquisitive, then continues to divide the acquisitive branch until he reaches the terminus, where he finds angling marked off as what it is, apart from everything else. The sophist resembles the angler in possessing expertise, but more intimately as well. He, too, is a sort of hunter, but one who hunts terrestrial creatures rather than aquatic. The Stranger first defines the sophist as a hired hunter of rich young men (Sophist 223b; 231d).

So far angling seems well suited to direct the inquirers toward their goal. Set on the right track, they readily complete the rest of the division. But at the end of the first division, the Stranger remarks that the sophist’s art is really quite complicated (Sophist 223c). He then turns his attention to a feature mentioned toward the end of that division. The sophist earns wages from those he hunts, and he has a product to sell. Returning to acquisitive art, the Stranger this time ignores the branch that leads to hunting, and instead follows the other branch, beginning from the art of acquisition by exchange, and defines the sophist as someone engaged in commerce, who sells products for the soul (Sophist 224c–d; 231d). In the pages following, the Stranger focuses on various activities of the sophist and defines him in five different ways. Each time the sophist turns up at the tips of branches stemming from acquisitive art. Then on a sixth round the Stranger makes a fresh initial division of art, marking off the art of separation, and finds the sophist at the terminus of a branch originating from there.

What should we make of the fact that the sophist turns up all over the tree, and not at a single terminus like the angler? The angler differs from the sophist in two main respects. First, the essence of the angler is evident from his activity and is easy to spell out using dichotomous division. As the Stranger says in the Statesman (see above § 2), some things are easily pictured: we can perceive the angler’s essential activity, fishing by means of a special hook, and readily depict it. The essence of the sophist, too, might seem easy to picture from his activities. He engages in many observable activities, so it seems appropriate to define him in a number of ways. But the essence of the sophist, as we soon discover, is none of those things. His essential activity cannot be pictured, as angling can. Second, the nature of angling is uncontroversial, and the Stranger and Theaetetus mean the same thing by the name (Sophist 218e). By contrast, people have various conceptions of what sophistry is, witnessed by the numerous divisions. They may also disagree about what individuals fall under the kind. Because sophistry is a disputed notion, people may have different conceptions of it, and some conceptions may be simply mistaken.

4.2 Appearances

The sophist is not unique in his tendency to turn up all over a tree. Anything, including very simple things, can do the same, because people experience them in different ways and so have different conceptions of them. People tend to share the same concept of an angler, because he engages in a single observable activity. But anything of any complexity, engaged in several activities, is apt to be conceived in different ways by different people. Some of those conceptions may capture the entity by a feature or activity essential to it, but many others will capture it in some accidental way. Division does not itself guarantee that one attends to essential features. Furthermore, a dispute might arise about virtually any entity, but in many cases we can sort out disagreements by perception or by some straightforward decision-procedure (we can settle disputes about number by counting, disputes about size or weight by measuring or weighing: Euthyphro 7b–c; cf. Phaedrus 263a–b). In other cases there is no ready way to decide.

The anomalous sixth division of the sophist (Sophist 226b–231b) reveals sophistry as a disputed concept. Whereas the first five divisions locate the sophist somewhere under acquisitive art, the sixth division locates him in a quite different place, under the art of separation, marked off expressly from productive and acquisitive art, as a third kind under technê, to deal with this case. The sixth sophist purifies souls of beliefs that interfere with learning, and he looks a lot like Socrates. The Stranger queries using the label “sophist” in this case and calls the art he has just uncovered the “noble” art of sophistry. The sixth division exploits the fact that many people mistook Socrates for a sophist (cf. Aristophanes’ depiction of Socrates in the Clouds and Socrates’ defense against the charge in Plato’s Apology). This definition fails to capture the sophist by even an accidental feature, but instead snares a distinct kind called by the same name owing to a superficial resemblance.

The sophist is special not because he turns up in so many places, or because some conceptions pick out different kinds altogether that merely share the same name. The sophist is unique because the multiplicity in his case reflects not only something about us and our experience, but also something about him and his art. The Stranger restates the six definitions of the sophist (Sophist 231c–e), and then observes:

Do you know that, when someone appears to know many things, and is called by the name of one art, this appearance (phantasma) is not sound, but it is clear that the person experiencing it in relation to some art is unable to see that [feature] of it toward which all these sorts of learning look, and so he addresses the person having them by many names rather than one? (Sophist 232a)

The Stranger has defined the sophist as a hired hunter of rich young men, as engaged in selling his own and other people’s wares for the soul, as an expert in disputation about justice and injustice, and so on. Why is the appearance not sound, and why does it indicate that we, who experience that appearance, have failed to see that feature “toward which all these sorts of learning look”? People call all six conceptions by the name “sophist.” Why does the Stranger say that those who experience this unhealthy appearance call the entity by many names instead of one?

The Stranger will go on to point out that the sophist makes people think he knows things he doesn’t know (Sophist 232b–233c). The sophist’s pretense would certainly explain the unhealthiness of the appearance of manifold expertise, but the preceding discussion and definitions leading up to the quoted passage have not revealed the sophist’s pretense. One must look ahead in the dialogue to see that. Instead the unhealthy appearance seems to rest on the very fact that the sophist, as so far defined, has so many sorts of expertise—he knows how to hunt, how to make a profit, how to sell his own intellectual wares, how to dispute about justice and injustice, how to purify the soul of ignorance (cf. Notomi 1999, 80). Our judgment is unsound because we, who experience the sophist’s appearance of manifold expertise, fail to detect that feature of his art “toward which all these sorts of learning look”—something about the sophist that explains why he seems to know so much, something about him that would justify our calling him by one name: “sophist.”

What is that one thing still missing? As the discussion proceeds, the Stranger argues that we are missing the feature of sophists that explains how they can successfully appear wise to their students, when they are not in fact wise (Sophist 233b–c). He and Theaetetus carefully defined the sophist in terms of many of his activities but none of those makes him what he is. They have so far missed the essence of the sophist, and for that reason they mistakenly call him by many names instead of one.

The visitor introduces a new paradigm (Sophist 233d) to unmask the special nature of the sophist’s art: the art of imitation. By means of imitation a painter can make products with the same names as the originals and fool children into thinking he can make anything he wants (Sophist 234b–c). The sophist achieves the same result with statements (logoi), making large things appear small, and easy things hard, and could fool young people (Sophist 234c–235a). All the appearances are linked together by the sophist’s skill at imitating people who truly know the things he seems to know.

With that insight, the Stranger declares that they have nearly caught the sophist and sets out in pursuit (he finally completes this seventh division at the end of the dialogue). This time ignoring the entire branch of acquisitive art from which the first five divisions set out, he instead takes the branch of productive art down to image-making and divides it into two parts, copy-making (eikastikê) and appearance-making (phantastikê). Whereas a copy-maker preserves the proportions of the paradigm (paradeigma in its more usual sense), and keeps the appropriate colors and other details, an appearance-maker alters the true proportions of the original, so that the image appears beautiful from a distance (Sophist 235c–236c). The visitor’s proclaimed uncertainty about which kind includes the sophist takes him into the dialogue’s main project, the investigation of not-being, an investigation needed to make sense of appearances and false statement.

This appearing and seeming, but not being, and stating things, but not true [things], all these were always full of difficulty in the past and they still are. It is very difficult, Theaetetus, to find terms in which to say that there really is false stating or judging, and to utter this without being caught in a contradiction. (Sophist 236e–237a)

In essence the sophist produces appearances, and more precisely false appearances. So to understand the sophist, the inquirers have to make sense of appearances and their production. And to do that, the Stranger must take on Parmenides, who famously said:

Never shall this be proved, that things-that-are-not are. When you inquire, keep your thought from that route. (Sophist 237a; cf. Diels and Kranz 1951–52, 28B7.1–2)

5. Not-Being and Being

To define the sophist as an expert in deception, as someone who produces false appearances by means of statements, the Stranger needs to show that Parmenides was wrong; he needs to demonstrate that it is possible to say and to think that things-that-are-not are, and to do so without contradiction. He starts with a series of puzzles about not-being and then suggests that we may be in similar confusion about being.

5.1 Puzzles

A false assumption about negation makes it seem impossible to think or talk about not-being. The inquirers assume that a negation specifies the opposite of the item negated (Sophist 240b, 240d). Think of opposites as polar incompatibles—a pair of opposed terms that exclude each other. These include polar contraries, such as black and white, or hot and cold, which have some intermediate between them; and contradictories, such as odd and even, large and not-large, or beautiful and not-beautiful, which do not (see Keyt 1973, 300 n. 33). If not-being is the opposite of being, then not-being is nothing at all, and we cannot think about that. A second source of trouble about not-being infects being as well. The speakers mistakenly assume that there is a one-to-one correspondence between a name and a thing: a name picks out something, different names pick out different things, and each thing has one proper name. The Stranger later attributes the idea to some people he derisively calls Late-Learners, who urge that we call a thing only by its own name and not by any other. Thus they allow us to call a man “man” and the good “good,” but they do not allow us to call a man “good” (Sophist 251b–c) (for this interpretation of the Late-Learners, see Moravcsik 1962, 57–59; cf. Bostock 1984, 99–100, Roberts 1986, 230, and Malcolm 2006a, 278).

Given these assumptions, it seems impossible to talk about not-being coherently (on the puzzles about not-being, cf. Owen 1971, 241–44). The first puzzle (Sophist 237b–e) shows that we cannot meaningfully use the phrase “what-is-not,” because the phrase attempts and fails to pick out nothing. The second puzzle (Sophist 238a–c) shows that we cannot say anything meaningful about what-is-not (i.e., about nothing), because in using the words “what-is-not” we treat the referent as one thing (by using the singular). The third puzzle (Sophist 238d–239c) shows that we contradict ourselves even trying to state the puzzles. If not-being is the opposite of being (i.e., nothing), and if there is a one-to-one correspondence between a name and a thing, then Parmenides was right: we cannot coherently think or talk about not-being. The Stranger still finds these puzzles persuasive at the end of the dialogue, because he says: “If a statement is of nothing, it would not be a statement at all, for we have shown that a statement that is a statement (logos) of nothing cannot be a statement” (Sophist 263c). In a final pair of puzzles (Sophist 239c–240c; 240c–241b), the Stranger shows that Parmenides also provides the sophist a means to escape his pursuers (Sophist 241a–c). The sophist does not say what-is-not after all, because his images, while not the originals, are something—images like the originals—and not nothing. The speakers later recognize that they made a mistake in assuming that not-being is the opposite of being (Sophist 257b, 258e), but at this stage negation confounds them.

This entry skips over the puzzles about being, which aim to show that we are in as much confusion about being as we are about not-being, a situation that gives the Stranger hope: to the extent that he and Theaetetus get clear about being or not-being, they will get clear about the other as well (Sophist 250e–251a) (Owen 1971, 229–31, calls this claim the “Parity Assumption.”)[2]

5.2 Great Kinds

To show that we can call one thing by many names and that some names specify a thing but misdescribe it, the Stranger introduces some machinery. He proposes that some kinds can partake of, or blend or associate with, other kinds (these terms appear to be synonyms and to introduce an asymmetrical relation between an entity and a property it has (pace Cornford 1935, 255–57; see Ackrill 1957, 212–18), whereas some kinds cannot blend with each other (Sophist 251e–252e). Great kinds enable the blending of other kinds, much as vowels enable consonants to fit together (252e–253a). Just as one needs expertise to know how letters combine, so one needs expertise to know how forms combine—an expertise the Stranger calls dialectic and attributes to the philosopher (Sophist 253b–e). (For different interpretations of the brief vexed passage on dialectic in the Sophist, see Stenzel 1931 [1940], Gómez-Lobo 1977, and M. L. Gill 2012, ch. 7.)

The Stranger announces that there are five great kinds (Sophist 254b–c), and he will ask two questions about them: (1) Of what sort are they? and (2) what capacity do they have to associate with other things? (Sophist 254c). The five kinds are change, rest, being, sameness and difference, and he will eventually interpret not-being as difference (Sophist 257b, 258e–259a). He does not say that these five are the only great kinds. There are probably others, including likeness and unlikeness, oneness and multitude (cf. Parmenides 129d–e and 130b). The second part of the Parmenides investigates such kinds, especially oneness and multitude, being and not-being, but also sameness and difference, likeness and unlikeness, equality and inequality, and others. The visitor presumably selects the five he does in the Sophist, because for the present purpose he needs a pair of opposites that exclude each other (change and rest, described as “most opposite” [Sophist 250a], serve as mutually exclusive consonant forms) and three vowel forms—being, sameness, and difference—enabling kinds to fit together or to be marked off from others.

The central section of the Sophist has been much discussed and remains controversial. The distinction between consonant and vowel forms concerns the way kinds relate to other kinds, but different types of forms usually play these two roles. Consonant forms have categorial content—that is, they can be organized into genus-species trees, like entities in Aristotle’s Categories and like the kinds in the earlier divisions in the Sophist. Vowel forms are empty of categorial content but have structural content, and the greatest of the great kinds apply to everything. Philosophers in the Middle Ages would call such kinds transcendentals, since they transcend Aristotle’s ten categories (substance, quantity, quantity, and the other categories); Gilbert Ryle called them syncategorematic. These entities are not highly general kinds—viewed as such, they would be categorial, since highest genera have (very general) categorial content. In Ryle’s words, the vowel forms “function not like the bricks but like the arrangement of the bricks in a building” (Ryle 1939 [1965], esp. 131, 143–44). They structure other kinds and enable them to relate to one another. Let us call them structural kinds (do not take the label to suggest that categorial kinds lack structure, only that structural kinds are purely structural and derive categorial content through their applications).

Structural kinds apply to categorial individuals and kinds on the basis of other, ultimately categorial properties those entities have. For instance, two objects are equal or unequal if they have some definite size or duration, or if they are numerable. Two objects are like, if they have one or more properties in common. A red cube and a red ball are like because they share redness in common. They are unlike, because they have different shapes. The nature of a structural kind is determined by its functional role in enabling categorial kinds to be what they are and/or to associate with or differ from one another.

The great kinds change and rest are problematic, because they are sometimes treated as categorial kinds—for instance, in the Parmenides change is divided into the species alteration and locomotion, and locomotion is further divided into spinning in the same place and moving from one place to another (Parmenides138b–c, cf. Theaetetus 181c–d)—whereas sometimes they are listed along with other structural kinds, e.g., Parmenides 129d–e, 136a–c. (For alternative interpretations of change and rest in the Sophist, see Reeve 1985 and M. L. Gill 2012.) Whatever Plato ultimately thinks about the status of change and rest, in the second half of the Sophist his Stranger needs them to serve as opposed, mutually exclusive, consonant kinds and uses them repeatedly in his arguments marking off the five great kinds from one another. So we should construe them there as consonant/categorial kinds.

5.3 The Distinction of Great Kinds

In the first part of this section (Sophist 254d–255e), the Stranger addresses question (1): Of what sort is each of the great kinds? He distinguishes each of the five kinds from one another, starting with being, change, and rest. Change and rest, as opposites, do not associate with each other; but being applies to both, since we say that both of them are. Being must be a third kind distinct from them, for if being, which applies to both opposites, were the same as either of them—say change—then when being applies to rest, by substitution rest would partake of its own opposite, which is impossible (Sophist 254d, with 249e–250c). The Stranger uses a similar argument to show that sameness and difference are distinct from change and rest (Sophist 254d–255b). Furthermore, being is distinct from sameness. They have to be different, because if they were not, when we say that change and rest both are, we could substitute “are” with “the same,” and change would be the same as rest (Sophist 255b–c). (Much more can be said about sameness: for discussion see, e.g., Lewis 1976, and de Vries 1988.)

Finally, the Stranger distinguishes difference from being. This argument introduces a crucial distinction between two senses or uses of “is” and deserves a separate subsection.

5.4 The Distinction between Difference and Being

The Stranger uses an important distinction to mark off difference from being:

But I suppose you agree that whereas some things are themselves by themselves (auta kath’ hauta), others are always said in relation to other things (pros alla).—Of course.—But isn’t difference always in relation to something different (pros heteron)?—Yes.—And this would not be the case, if being and difference were not distinct. For if difference partook of both forms [i.e., auto kath’ hauto and pros alla], as being does, then something even among the different things could be different without being different in relation to something different. But in fact it has turned out for us that necessarily whatever is different is the very thing that it is [i.e., different] from something different. (Sophist 255c–d)

So the nature of difference is a fifth kind (Sophist 255d–e).

Furthermore, we shall say that it pervades all of them, since each one is different from the others not because of its own nature, but because it partakes of the form of the different. (Sophist 255e)

Difference is distinct from being, because difference is always relative to other things (pros alla), whereas being is both itself by itself (auto kath’ hauto) and relative to other things (pros alla).

What is it for something to be itself by itself and/or in relation to other things (for a detailed discussion of this distinction, see Dancy 1999)? The traditional understanding of the distinction relies on a passage from Diogenes Laertius (first half of the 3rd century CE). Diogenes uses the expression “in relation to something” (pros ti) in place of “in relation to other things” (pros alla):

Of things that are, some are by themselves (kath’ heauta), whereas others are said in relation to something (pros ti). Things said by themselves are ones that need nothing further in their interpretation. These would be, for instance, man, horse and other animals, since none of these gains through interpretation. All the things said in relation to something need in addition some interpretation, for instance, that which is greater than something and that which is quicker than something and the more beautiful and such things. For the greater is greater than something less and the quicker is quicker than something. So of things-that-are some are said themselves by themselves (auta kath’ hauta), whereas others are said in relation to something (pros ti). In this way, according to Aristotle, he [Plato] used to divide the primary things. (Diogenes Laertius 3.108–109)

Many scholars think that, in saying that being is said both itself by itself (auto kath’ hauto) and in relation to other things (pros alla), Plato distinguishes different senses of the verb “to be”—a complete or absolute sense (“exists,” as in “The sea is”) and an incomplete sense (the “is” of predication, as in “the sea is blue” and/or the “is” of identity, as in “the sea is the sea”) (Cornford 1935; Ackrill 1957). There is no separate verb “to exist” in classical Greek; existence was expressed by means of the verb “to be.”

If the Stranger characterizes being as having two (or more) senses, we expect Plato to mention two (or more) forms of being, one for each sense. Note that the Stranger introduces sameness as a distinct kind, which should take care of the “is” of identity, so the real issue is whether Plato distinguishes two other senses of the verb “to be,” a complete existential sense and an incomplete predicative sense. Michael Frede (1967, 1992) and G. E. L. Owen (1971) argue that Plato does not mark off two senses of the verb “to be,” but only different uses. There are significant differences between these scholars’ views, but their common ground, that Plato uses “being” only as an incomplete predicate, has been queried. Sentences in the Sophist, such as “Change is, because it partakes of being” (Sophist 256a), are most naturally construed as using “is” as a complete predicate (existence).

But if Plato does use the verb “to be” as a complete predicate, why does he not mention two forms, existence and a form designated by the incomplete “is” of predication? Lesley Brown (1986) has argued that there is no sharp semantic distinction between the two syntactically distinct uses of the verb “to be” in “x is F” and “x is.” The “is” in “x is” is complete but allows a further completion. If Brown is right, Plato need not distinguish two senses of “is,” and claims in the Sophist, such as “Change is, because it partakes of being,” can also be accommodated. Change is (exists), because it is something—it has a property that makes it the very thing that it is: change.

Notice that on this view the complete use of “is” in Greek does not correspond to existence in our modern sense: we say that horses exist, whereas imaginary objects, such as Pegasus, do not. On the proposed interpretation, anything describable is (exists). So Pegasus is (exists), since we can describe him as a winged horse. On the other hand, what-is-not is nothing at all—indescribable. It was this notion of not-being—nothing—that was responsible for the earlier puzzles about not-being in the Sophist. (For criticisms of Brown’s view, see Malcolm 2006b, and for criticisms of Malcolm and Brown, see Leigh 2008.)

Supposing that being is a structural kind that functions in two ways, let us consider its operation with categorial and other structural kinds. Take some kind F-ness. F-ness is itself by itself (auto kath’ hauto), if being links F-ness to its own nature, to what F-ness is by (or because of) itself. For instance, change is changing by itself, largeness is large by itself, heat is hot by itself, the one is one by itself. The associated statements are self-predications of the sort Plato’s characters mention in earlier dialogues (“largeness is large,” “justice is just;” for self-predications in the Sophist, see 258b–c). Scholars disagree about how to understand self-predication in Plato. (For a view quite different from that articulated here, see the entry on Plato: middle period metaphysics and epistemology.) In self-predications the item specified by the subject-expression and the item specified by the predicate are identical, but the relation between them is participation (cf. Heinaman 1981). F-ness has its own nature by (or because of) itself. One might say that the property F-ness exhausts what F-ness is in its own right.

F-ness is in relation to other things, if being links F-ness to something other than itself. For instance, change is different from rest. Here being links change to difference, and difference relates change to something other than change. Or change is the same as itself: “When we say change is the same as itself, we speak in this way because of its participation in the same in relation to itself [pros heautên])” (Sophist 256a–b). Being links change to sameness, and sameness relates change to itself.

Notice that Plato speaks often of participation and blending but mentions no distinct form of participation. He mentions no distinct form, because being simply is the form that links a subject to a property it has.

Difference always operates in relation to something different (pros heteron) (Sophist 255d). Difference invariably relates the kind F-ness to something different from F-ness.

Although difference as a structural kind always relates an entity F-ness to something other than F-ness, difference can itself be a subject-kind and be related to itself (via being itself by itself). Difference is different by (or because of) itself (Sophist 259a–b, with 255e and 258b–c). Being and difference admit of self-predication like any other kind.

5.5 The Blending of Kinds

The second part of the treatment of great kinds takes up question (2): What capacity do the five kinds have to associate with one another? The Stranger carries out the analysis for one sample kind, change (Sophist 255e–256d), and argues systematically that change is non-identical with each of the other four kinds (change is not rest, not the same, and so on), but partakes of three of the four—all but rest (for comprehensive analysis of the section, see Brown 2008). Thus it turns out that change both is and is not each of the others (the Stranger even adds the counterfactual: if change could partake of rest there would be nothing strange about calling it resting [Sophist 256b]). The whole analysis is implemented with two relations: non-identity (F-ness is not G-ness, because F-ness partakes of difference from G-ness), and positive predication (F-ness is G, because F-ness partakes of G-ness). For example, change is not the same, because change partakes of difference from the same, but change is the same, because change partakes of sameness in relation to itself (Sophist 256a–b).

Scholars have noted that the Stranger’s machinery, as so far articulated, seems insufficient to address the upcoming problem of false statement. The visitor has provided an analysis of identity (via being and sameness), non-identity (via being and difference), and positive predication (via being). What about negative predication, needed for Plato’s analysis of false statements, such as “Theaetetus is flying”? Isn’t this statement false, precisely because the negative predication, “Theaetetus is not flying,” is true? Can Plato also handle negative predication?

6. False Statement

With the main machinery in place for his analysis, the Stranger will shortly turn to false statement. But two preliminary topics remain: (1) How does negation work? (2) What is a statement?

6.1 Negation

The Stranger made a serious mistake about negation in the puzzles about not-being earlier in the dialogue (highlighted at Sophist 240b, 240d), in supposing that the negation in “not-being” indicates the opposite (enantion) of being. The opposite of being is nothing, and Parmenides is right that we cannot speak or think about nothing: if we speak or think at all, we speak or think about something. But Parmenides mistakenly thought that all talk about not-being is attempted talk about nothing.

The Stranger solves the problem of not-being by recognizing two things: (1) the negation operates on the predicate, not the subject; (2) the negation need not specify the opposite of the item whose name is negated but only something different from it.

Some scholars think that the Stranger extends his machinery to include negative predication, as well as non-identity, at the end of the section on great kinds. He appears to switch his focus from the subject-kind to the attribute, since he speaks of being and not-being “about” the subject. He sums up his conclusions about change and generalizes to other kinds saying: “And so necessarily not-being applies to (epi) change and to (kata) all the other kinds” (Sophist 256d); and then: “So about (peri) each of the forms the being is much and the not-being is unlimited in multitude” (Sophist 256e). Some scholars take the not-being applicable to change to include negative features (e.g., not quick) as well as kinds it differs from (e.g., rest) (for interpretations of this sentence, see McDowell 1982 and Frede 1992).

The Stranger calls attention to the mistake about negation and offers a solution. Here too he focuses on the predicate:

When we say “not being” (mê on), as it seems, we don’t mean something opposite to being, but only different.—How?—For instance, when we call something “not large,” we don’t indicate by the expression the small any more than the equal.—Of course—So we won’t agree when someone says a negation signifies an opposite; we will agree only to this much, that the “not” when prefixed to the names following it reveals something different [from the names], or rather from the things which the names uttered after the negation designate. (Sophist 257b–c)

Apparently, when one says, “Simmias is not large,” one indicates by the “not” merely something different from large. Simmias could be equal or small in comparison with someone else.

Now there is a pressing interpretive question. Does the statement “Simmias is not large” assert that largeness is different from every attribute Simmias has (manhood, bravery, red-hair, blue-eyes, and so on)? (Keyt 1973 and Brown 2008 call this the “Oxford interpretation.” For a recent defense of it, see Crivelli 2012.) The discussion of “not large” itself suggests otherwise. “Different from large,” while not meaning the opposite of largeness (the polar contrary smallness), means some size other than largeness (smallness being one possibility among others). The negation designates something within a wider kind, and the predicate negated (say “large”) indicates that wider kind.

In characterizing the nature of difference, the Stranger compares it to knowledge (Sophist 257c–d) (on this analogy, cf. Lee 1972). Knowledge is a categorial kind, and many species of knowledge differ structurally from one another (cf. below § 7.2). Even so, the comparison is instructive because some branches of knowledge, such as applied mathematics, are distinguished from one another, not by intrinsic differences in the structure of the expertise, but simply by differences in the objects to which the same expertise applies (e.g., calculation in surveying and navigation). Like varieties of applied mathematics, whose content derives from the domain to which the knowledge applies, parts of difference acquire their content from the item whose name is negated.

The visitor gives a second example of negation, and the example helps to clarify his proposal. A part of difference called “the not-beautiful” is set in opposition to the beautiful and differs from the nature of the beautiful (Sophist 257d). He says:

Doesn’t it turn out in this way that the not-beautiful, having been marked off from (aphoristhen) some one kind among beings, is also again in turn set in opposition (antitethen) to some one of the things that are? (Sophist 257e)

The Stranger mentions two kinds in addition to the not-beautiful, since he marks off the not-beautiful from some one kind among beings, and then sets it in opposition to the nature of the beautiful. The not-beautiful is not just anything other than beautiful, but something other than beautiful within a kind that covers both (call it “the aesthetic”). On this view a part of difference gets its categorial content in two ways from the item whose name is negated. First, the part falls within a wider kind (such as size, temperature, the aesthetic) determined by the positive attribute F-ness, and that wider kind is divided into subkinds which exclude one another and jointly exhaust the genus; and second, the part has an attribute different from F-ness within that genus. All individuals located under the genus occupy one and only one subkind. The subkinds can form an incompatibility range—an ordered continuum under a covering kind, such as degrees of coldness and heat under temperature or degrees of smallness and largeness under size—but they need not constitute an ordered series. They can instead constitute an incompatibility set, such as circle, square, triangle, and other species under shape; or man, ox, horse, and other species under animal. The earlier mistake about negation was the assumption that “the not-F” specifies the opposite of F-ness. According to the new proposal “the not-F” specifies the complement of F-ness under a wider kind—that is, all the disjoint subkinds under the wider kind other than F-ness. Any individual characterized as “not-F” falls under the complement of F-ness and has some feature other than F-ness within the wider kind. Thus, for example, when you say “Simmias is not large,” you indicate that Simmias has some definite size other than largeness, either the polar contrary smallness or some intermediate size. (Brown, 2008, calls this treatment of negation the “incompatibility range” interpretation; see also Ferejohn 1989, Szaif 1996, and M. L. Gill, 2012, ch. 5.)

6.2 Statement

Making a statement (true or false) requires three steps (cf. Frede 1992, who mentions two steps): first, the speaker must pick out an individual or kind to say something about, since a statement must be about something to be a statement at all; second, he must pick out an individual, kind, or feature to relate to the original entity; and third, he asserts a relation between the two items—identity, non-identity, attribution, or non-attribution. A statement consists minimally of two parts, with one part (the grammatical subject) referring to the entity the statement is about, and the other (the predicate) asserting something about that entity. Only if the predicate states something (that is or is not the case) about a subject is there a complex—a statement—that can be true or false (Sophist 262e–263d). The Stranger distinguishes between names and verbs (Sophist 261d–262a), saying that a verb is a sign set over actions, and a name a sign set over things that perform the actions. No statement consists simply of a string of names or a string of verbs but must minimally fit a name together with a verb (Sophist 262a–c).

The main idea about statements is simple: a statement has structure and its parts perform different functions. The name (grammatical subject) refers to something, and if it fails to pick out anything the statement does not come off (Sophist 262e). The verb (predicate) ascribes to that thing an action (or property). If someone asserts of a subject a predicate ascribing to it something that is (the case) about it (an action the thing is actually performing or an attribute it actually has), the statement is true; whereas if he asserts of it a predicate ascribing something that is not (the case) about it (something different from what is the case about it), then the statement is false (Sophist 263b). For instance, when the Stranger says of Theaetetus, who is currently sitting, “Theaetetus is sitting,” his statement is true because it asserts something that is the case about Theaetetus; but when he says of Theaetetus (still sitting), “Theaetetus is flying,” his statement is false, because “flying” specifies something different from what is the case about Theaetetus (namely, sitting).

6.3 Negative Predication

The statements the Stranger considers, “Man learns,” “Theaetetus is sitting,” and “Theaetetus is flying,” are all positive predications, the first two true, the third false. But as noted above (§ 5.5), we need negative predication to analyze the false statement, “Theaetetus is flying.” Since the statement is false, the statement “Theaetetus is not flying” is true.

Negative predication has received considerable attention in the scholarly literature on the Sophist (for helpful accounts of the various interpretations, and their advantages and disadvantages, see Keyt 1973 and Crivelli 2012). Some scholars think that Plato needs a second notion of negation in addition to difference (understood as distinctness or non-identity), such as incompatibility, to accommodate negative predication. On this view, flying is incompatible with one of Theaetetus’ properties (namely sitting). The incompatibility interpretation requires Plato to change the meaning of heteron from “different” to “incompatible,” and there is no evidence in the text that he does. The Oxford interpretation (mentioned above § 6.1) has the advantage of keeping a single meaning for heteron but calls for universal quantification over properties: to analyze the statement “Theaetetus is not flying,” one must show that flying is different from everything that Theaetetus is—a man, snub-nosed, sitting, and so on. The Sophist does not provide evidence of such an approach (see Wiggins 1971; Bostock 1984, 113; White 1993, §§ 10, 11).

If Plato construes difference as a structural kind that operates in the way we have discussed (the incompatibility range interpretation), he can handle negative predication without introducing a second meaning of heteron. We need not consider all of Theaetetus’ properties to explain the falsehood of “Theaetetus is flying.” The analysis of negative predication is complex: the item negated in “Simmias is not large” indicates a division of the genus size, and the negation designates something different (non-identical, distinct) from largeness within that genus. In the case of Theaetetus’ imagined flight, we must find that activity different from flying within the relevant incompatibility set, a set apparently consisting of our pair of consonant forms: change/rest. Since Theaetetus is currently sitting (a species of rest), his current rest excludes flying (a species of change). One can explain his not flying by appeal to his sitting.

7. Method and Metaphysics in the Statesman

Like the Sophist, the opening division in the Statesman locates a problem with its target kind. Whereas the sophist turned up all over the tree, the statesman turns up at a single terminus, but he is not alone, since many rivals have a claim to be there too. Just as the puzzle about the sophist revealed by the opening divisions indicated something significant about the essence of a sophist, so the competition at a single terminus indicates something significant about the essence of a statesman.

7.1 The Statesman and the Herdsman

The Statesman embarks on its division without a new paradigm. Apparently the angler from the previous dialogue serves as a viable guide for the method of dichotomous division itself. As we noted in § 3.1, the Statesman opens its investigation with a collection of kinds (king, statesman, household manager, slave-owner) that share salient features in common, and this collection allows a crude description of the kind to be defined, which guides the inquiry. Since instances of the target kind can direct and control other people by means of their understanding without physical manipulation, the Stranger starts his division from the wide kind knowledge and immediately divides it into practical and theoretical, and then looks for the statesman down the branch originating from theoretical knowledge. The opening division takes place in two stages—a first stage focusing on the statesman’s knowledge, followed by a lecture on method, and a second stage focusing on the object of that knowledge. Both phases of the division are peculiar but in different ways.

Consider stage one. Having set off down the theoretical branch of knowledge in search for the statesman, the Stranger divides theoretical knowledge into two sub-kinds. One kind recognizes difference, judges things recognized and then leaves off (the art of calculation is here); the other kind recognizes difference and judges things recognized, and then directs on the basis of that judgment (statecraft is here) (Statesman 259d–260c). Directing suggests practical, if not hands-on, knowledge, so keep in mind that practical knowledge was marked off from theoretical knowledge and abandoned at the start. Next he divides directive knowledge into two sorts, of which one passes on the directions of others (heralds are here), while the other passes on its own directions for the sake of generation (the statesman is here) (Statesman 260c–261b). Knowledge for the sake of generation/production again suggests practical expertise, and the statesman’s knowledge looks ever more practical as the division continues. At the next division one kind passes on its own directions to generate inanimate things (the master-builder belongs here), while the other does so to generate animate things (the statesman belongs here) (Statesman 261b–d). The Stranger then divides this latter kind into those who generate and rear single animate things (ox-drivers and grooms are here), and those who generate and rear them in herds (the statesman and herdsman are here) (Statesman 261d). Once the statesman merges with the herdsman, the theoretical branch has become thoroughly mixed up with the practical branch originally discarded, since the knowledge of horse-breeders, cowherds, shepherds, and swineherds is practical and scarcely theoretical. No wonder the statesman will prove to have company at the terminus: farmers, millers, physical trainers, doctors, and other experts also take care of practical aspects of human life (Statesman 267e–268a).

At the end of the first stage of the division, when the inquirers have reached herd-rearing, the Stranger invites Young Socrates to make the next division himself. By now the boy sees where the division is heading and proposes to mark off the rearing of humans (statecraft) from the rearing of other animals (ordinary herding) (Statesman 262a). The Stranger stops him, objecting that such a division is like dividing the human race into Greek and barbarian: barbarian is not a proper kind because its members share only a negative feature, being non-Greek speakers. The mistake is like marking off all numbers other than 10,000 (Statesman 262c–263a). The Stranger advises Young Socrates to divide through the middle of things and not break off one small part from a large part without a form (e.g., he should divide number into even and odd, and human into male and female [Statesman 262e]). Someone hoping to encounter forms should, he says, make divisions into parts that also have a form (Statesman 262a–c).

Although the Stranger admits that he is wandering from the topic and should put off discussion of method until another occasion, he tarries a little longer to give a lecture on the difference between mere parts of a kind and parts that are themselves genuine kinds (Statesman 263b). Apparently, real kinds include only members with some positive feature in common, while other parts allow members sharing only a negative feature. Scholars have taken the Stranger’s lecture very seriously as indicating Plato’s views about proper procedure and the metaphysics on which division relies, and they appeal especially to Plato’s Phaedrus, where the elder Socrates announces that someone engaging in correct procedure should divide kinds at their natural joints, not hack off bits like a bad butcher (Phaedrus 265e) (see Moravcsik 1973, Cohen 1973, and Wedin 1987). Before we assess Young Socrates’ mistake and the Stranger’s lecture, we ought to consider the second stage of the division, since it purports to demonstrate correct procedure.

First the visitor retraces his steps and points out that in speaking of rearing animate things, he and Young Socrates had already in effect divided living creatures into wild and tame (Statesman 264a). All rearing deals with tame animals, and some of that rearing devotes itself to tame animals in herds. He then divides herd-rearing into aquatic and terrestrial (the branch he pursues), next marks off the winged from the footed (the branch he pursues), then the horned (oxen, sheep) from the hornless (the branch he pursues), then the interbreeding (horses, donkeys) from the non-interbreeding (the branch he pursues), and finally the four-footed (just pigs are left) from the two-footed (humans). He now defines statecraft as rearing the two-footed, non-interbreeding, hornless, terrestrial, tame herd: humans (Statesman 267a–c).

This division has given Platonic division a bad name, and there is much to query (see Dorter 1994: 181–91), but perhaps the most obviously dubious move comes at the end: according to the division, the swineherd has more in common with the statesman than with the cowherd and shepherd. Later in the dialogue the visitor says that the statesman differs from all other herdsman (including the swineherd) in a crucial respect. No one disputes with the cowherd his claim to look after all aspects of the life of his herd—he rears them; he is their doctor, their match-maker, their breeder and trainer—and the same is true of all other herdsmen, with one exception: the herdsman of humans, the statesman. In his case alone many rivals compete for the title of caretaker—farmers produce their food, doctors cure their diseases, physical trainers guide their exercise, and other experts attend to other human needs (Statesman 267e–268d). Given this difference, would it not have been better to distinguish humans from other herded animals at the outset, as Young Socrates proposed?

Young Socrates’ division into the herding of humans and the herding of other animals seems in retrospect to have considerable merit and indeed to apply two lessons from earlier in the day (cf. § 6.1 above). First, the Stranger said in the Sophist that parts of knowledge derive their names from the objects they are set over (Sophist 257c–d), and that claim justifies identifying statecraft—a mode of herding—as human herding. Second, a negation specifies the complement of a form within a wider kind, and that thesis justifies distinguishing herded animals into humans and other animals. In the Sophist, kinds designated by negations, such as the not-large and the not-beautiful, have their own distinctive feature (not-large, not-beautiful), and one might construe them as forms, though the Stranger does not explicitly identify them as such (Sophist 257e–258c). Evidence from the Sophist thus encourages a division of animals herded into humans and other animals, especially since the negative kind has a positive name: “beast.”

Young Socrates has in fact made an error, but the nature of his error becomes evident only later in the dialogue. In his zeal to reach the destination he makes two related mistakes, one about the objects of human herding, and the other about the associated art. The Stranger exploits the first mistake in the second stage of the division by relying on the boy’s assumption that herding is a single undifferentiated activity with branches marked off by the physical traits of the animals herded. But is statecraft concerned with humans as biological specimens? Human biology studies our physical traits, but the upcoming Myth in the Statesman reveals that the aspect of humans salient to statecraft is our way of life, our culture and expertise (Statesman 274b–d).[3] Young Socrates seems to view the objects of statecraft from the wrong perspective. Second, in focusing on the objects of statecraft, he ignores the art itself and fails to notice that many arts—farming, medicine, physical training, as well as statecraft—look after the needs of human beings (Statesman 267e–268a). As caretaker of humans, the statesman has lots of competition. The manner of the statesman’s care, rooted in the structure of his expertise, distinguishes statecraft from other arts that look after human beings (Statesman 274e–275a; cf. Lane 1998, 44).

What should we make of the Stranger’s lecture on parts and kinds, given that it overlooks the real faults in Young Socrates’ proposal and that the second stage of the division yields such odd results? The Stranger probably suspects the nature of the boy’s confusion and adopts an approach to help him see his mistake. His lecture assumes the boy’s point of view (that statecraft differs from other modes of herding because of the physical traits of the animals herded), advises him to divide kinds into sub-kinds with roughly equal extension, and then demonstrates in hilarious detail the results of that assumption. According to this interpretation, we should not take the Stranger’s lecture to reveal Plato’s views on metaphysics and method. In the lecture itself the visitor appears to warn Young Socrates and the audience to beware of his advice (Statesman 263b: “But be absolutely on your guard against ever thinking that you have heard this [i.e., the difference between kind and part] clearly distinguished by me”).

Our suspicions should increase when we reflect on the Stranger’s practice in the dichotomous divisions in the Sophist and earlier in the Statesman. At the beginning of the Statesman the visitor declares that his search for the statesman will start from the same genus used in the search for the sophist, but he will cut it in a different place (Statesman 258b–c). No one remarks on the fact that in the Sophist the visitor divided the genus art or expertise (technê), whereas now he calls the genus “knowledge” (epistêmê); he blurs the difference further by using the terms technê and epistêmê interchangeably in the Statesman. In the Sophist he cut the genus at step one into productive and acquisitive (later he added separative), and this time cuts it at step one into practical and theoretical. Recall that in the Phaedrus the elder Socrates advises his interlocutor to divide kinds at the natural joints: dividing at the natural joints mattered in that dialogue, because Socrates was classifying kinds in order to sort out an ambiguity between two senses of the word “love” (eros), a vulgar love on the left and a heavenly love on the right (Phaedrus 265e–266b). The Sophist and Statesman use dichotomous division for a different purpose and consequently ignore parts on the left once marked off: the Stranger aims to define a single kind at the bottom of the right-hand branch of a tree. The target (however vague or even misguided the initial conception of it) determines what genus to divide at the start, then a useful first cut and relevant next steps. Different targets (the angler, the sophist, the noble sophist, the statesman) prompt the investigators to carve up kinds in different ways (cf. Ackrill 1970, 384; Cavini 1995, 131; Lane 1998, 34–38), and what counts as an appropriate cut depends on the target of the investigation. We should not expect genuine kinds at intermediate steps on either the left- or right-hand side of the division.

The Stranger’s lecture on parts and kinds and the second stage of the dichotomous division contribute to the overall impression that the Statesman is a philosophical exercise designed to train students to recognize, diagnose, and correct mistakes. The dialogue is full of trial and error, with many mistakes noticed and corrected along the way, while others go unremarked. This strategy provokes the interlocutor and audience to see for themselves what has gone wrong and why. In this way they learn the methods of Platonic dialectic.

7.2 Weaving and Statecraft

Earlier we observed (§ 4.2) that the problems of definition to which the Sophist calls attention, though not unique to the sophist, are in his case partially explained by his essence. The same is true of the statesman. Why does the statesman have so many rivals? That is the puzzle of the statesman. Reflection on the shortcomings of the first division and the Myth eventually suggests a way forward. What is the special manner of the statesman’s care as opposed to theirs? We have noticed that the inquirers tangle the threads of theoretical and practical knowledge. This difficulty arises, because statecraft, as we finally learn, involves both theoretical and practical knowledge (cf. Statesman 284c, 289c–d, 305c–d, 311b–c). Because of the nature of his expertise, the statesman is intimately connected with everyone engaged in the care of humans; he oversees and directs their activities and uses their products and services in his own higher-order activity. Perhaps the statesman somehow combines theoretical and practical knowledge in managing the interactions of the members of his flock. Indeed, perhaps his essence is or includes the art of combining, like weaving (Statesman 279a–b). The last part of the dialogue recognizes this connection and takes weaving as its paradigm.

The Stranger quickly presents a dichotomous division that yields the art of weaving and defines it as the art in charge of clothes (Statesman 279c–280a). Like the definition of the statesman reached in the first part of the dialogue, this definition, for all its detail, is too general, since many arts compete for the same title: carding, spinning, spindle-making, mending, clothes-cleaning, and others. The dichotomous division fails to isolate the mode of clothes-working peculiar to weaving.

The paradigm of weaving serves two main functions (on the paradigm of weaving, cf. El Murr 2002 and Blondell 2005). First, it introduces a new procedure allowing the inquirers to differentiate the target from other arts akin to it, all located in the lowest kind reached by the previous dichotomous division. As earlier noted (§ 3.2), the new procedure is division “by limbs, like a sacrificial animal” (Statesman 287c) (for a different view of the Stranger’s strategy, see El Murr 2005). Whereas dichotomous division separates a kind into two parts, and then ignores at each step the part that does not lead to the goal, division by limbs breaks off pieces of an original whole, whose members are interrelated and cooperate in tending their common object. All the arts of clothes-working have clothes as their object. Many of the kindred arts provide weaving with its tools or materials (these contributing arts are characterized as sunaitiai, “helping causes”). The differentiation of weaving from various subsidiary arts reveals a procedure to define statecraft in relation to the subordinate arts.

Second, weaving exemplifies an essential feature shared with the target: both weaving and statecraft engage in intertwining. The statesman weaves in a number of ways, and in particular weaves together into one fabric the virtues of courage and moderation, often at odds in a city. The statesman and the weaver have many other features in common. Both are experts in measurement, measuring the more and the less not merely in relation to each other but more importantly in relation to some practical goal they aim to achieve (Statesman 284a–e) (on the arts of measurement, see Lane 1998, Delcomminette 2005, Lafrance 2005, and Sayre 2006). Furthermore, the arts of both experts control the subsidiary arts, whose products they use in their own activity (Statesman 308d–e). The statesman directs the experts who are, as it were, the practical arms of his expertise and especially those identified as his closest kin: the orator, the general, the judge, and the teacher. The statesman, an expert in timing (see Lane 1998), determines when the general should go to war, though he leaves it to the general to work out military strategy and carry it out. He determines the good that rhetoric will serve but leaves the techniques and practice of persuasion to the rhetorician. He decides what is just and lawful but leaves it to the judges to implement his decisions (Statesman 303e–305d). The statesman must further determine what mix of courage and moderation will most advance the good in the city, but he calls on the teachers to instill in the youth the right belief about what is good (Statesman 308e–310a). The visitor tells us that the statesman cares for every aspect of things in the city, weaving them together in the most correct way (Statesman 305e).

8. Metaphysics and Dialectic in the Sophist and Statesman

In the first part of the Parmenides, the youthful Socrates sets out a theory of forms reminiscent of forms in the Phaedo and the Republic, and the main speaker, Parmenides, puts his theory to the test by focusing on two chief questions: What forms are there? and what is the nature of the relation between sensible things and their features and forms—the relation known as participation? At the end of the interrogation in Part I, when Socrates has failed to rescue his theory, and we might think that Plato should simply junk it, Parmenides comes to its defense, saying that if someone with an eye on all the difficulties denies that there are stable forms, he will have nowhere to turn his thought and will destroy the power of dialectic entirely (Parmenides 135b–c). Scholars look to the Sophist and Statesman and other late dialogues in the hope of finding Plato’s answer to the problems posed in the Parmenides. Does Plato continue to treat forms as he did in the Phaedo and Republic, despite the objections? Are the objections answerable and was Socrates simply too inexperienced to answer them adequately? Do the late dialogues record Plato’s on-going perplexity? Or do they seriously modify Plato’s earlier positions?

Our investigation of the Sophist and Statesman prompts two observations. First, these two dialogues are engaged in dialectic from beginning to end, and the Statesman explicitly claims that the exercise aims to make us better dialecticians (Statesman 285d, 286d–287a). So Plato clearly thinks that dialectic remains possible, and his Stranger seems actively engaged in helping his young interlocutors practice and learn the techniques. Many scholars think that the method of dichotomous division is the method of dialectic in Plato’s late dialogues. Certainly this method serves a valuable heuristic purpose, often revealing what makes a particular concept (e.g., sophist, statesman) puzzling, but once the puzzle has come to light, the main speaker reorients the discussion and introduces new tools and techniques (e.g., five great kinds, division by limbs). Platonic dialectic employs numerous and varied techniques adjusted to the special topic being explored.

Second, the Sophist and Statesman say a lot about forms, and yet the forms discussed in these dialogues seem different in some key respects from those discussed in the Phaedo and first part of the Parmenides. Both the Sophist and Statesman search for the essence of their target kinds, the stable feature or collection of features that makes its possessor what it is. Each dialogue succeeds in revealing the essence of the kinds investigated. Are the sophist, the statesman, the angler, the weaver, and their arts separate forms of the sort discussed in the first part of the Parmenides? Strange if they were, since the arts are human inventions. The visitor does say (as noted in § 2 above) that “immaterial things, being finest and greatest, are revealed clearly only by means of a verbal account (logos) and by nothing else,” and that “all things now said are for the sake of those” (Statesman 285e–286b). The sophist and the statesman rank among great and difficult things (Sophist 218c–d, Statesman 278e; cf. 279a–b), and their arts are immaterial, though immanent in their possessors. So the visitor’s statement need not refer to separate forms. Still, the Timaeus (widely regarded as a late dialogue) speaks of separate immaterial forms, and such forms would be included in the Stranger’s statement. Whatever one makes of the treatment of forms in the Timaeus, separate forms are absent from the Sophist and Statesman, with one notable exception: at Sophist 245e–249d (the Battle of Gods and Giants), the Stranger tries to reconcile two extreme positions about being, one of which features separate, immaterial and unchanging forms.

What should we think about forms of negations, such as the not-large and the not-beautiful? Aristotle criticized Plato for commitment to such forms (Metaphysics A.9, 990b), but notoriously Aristotle was not always fair in his criticisms. The Sophist explicitly speaks of the form of not-being (Sophist 258d: to eidos…tou mê ontos), and a number of scholars regard the not-large and the not-beautiful as forms (e.g., Moravcsik 1962, Frede 1967, 92–94, Szaif 1996, 439–45, Crivelli 2012, 204–14). The Stranger’s lecture on parts and kinds in the Statesman, rejecting forms of barbarian and numbers other than 10,000, poses a well-known problem for that view, yet as we saw (§ 7.1 above) the lecture and second stage of the dichotomous division are themselves puzzling. Not only that: the Stranger warns Young Socrates not to think he has heard anything clear from him about the difference between a kind and a part (Statesman 263b). This warning could strengthen the hand of those who attribute to Plato a commitment to forms of negations. One question we should be asking, though: what function(s) do Platonic forms perform? Does Plato need a form whenever people call several things by the same name (as stated perhaps at Republic 10.596a)? Or does he invoke only those forms needed to explain the features of things? In the latter case, perhaps he can do without a form of the not-large, because he can explain that range of sizes by appeal to the form of largeness and the form of not-being. Perhaps he needs no form of mud/clay (rejected by Socrates as a separate form at Parmenides 130c–e), since he can explain the mixture by appeal to forms of its ingredients, earth and water, and the ratio of their combination (Parmenides 130c, with Theaetetus 147a–c). Questions about the scope of forms in Plato remain far from settled.

In addition to categorial kinds such as the sophist and statesman, there are also the great kinds discussed in the Sophist—change, rest, being, sameness, and difference. These kinds were embraced in the Parmenides (esp. Parmenides 130b), but they seem markedly different from ordinary kinds like the sophist and statesman. The vowel forms—being, sameness, and difference—appear to structure other kinds, enabling them to be what they are and to relate to one another. Dialectic aims to discover and articulate those structures. Structural kinds are closely tied to dialectic, as Parmenides foretold, but both forms and dialectic seem to have developed apace since the Phaedo and the Republic.


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