Plato on Knowledge in the Theaetetus

First published Sat May 7, 2005; substantive revision Thu Nov 21, 2019

This article introduces Plato’s dialogue the Theaetetus (section 1), and briefly summarises its plot (section 2). Two leading interpretations of the dialogue, the Unitarian and Revisionist readings, are contrasted in section 3. Sections 4 to 8 explain and discuss the main arguments of the chief divisions of the dialogue. Section 9 provides some afterthoughts about the dialogue as a whole.

1. Introduction

The Theaetetus, which probably dates from about 369 BC, is arguably Plato’s greatest work on epistemology. (Arguably, it is his greatest work on anything.) Plato (c.427–347 BC) has much to say about the nature of knowledge elsewhere. But only the Theaetetus offers a set-piece discussion of the question “What is knowledge?”

Like many other Platonic dialogues, the Theaetetus is dominated by question-and-answer exchanges, with Socrates as main questioner. His two respondents are Theaetetus, a brilliant young mathematician, and Theaetetus’ tutor Theodorus, who is rather less young (and rather less brilliant).

Also like other Platonic dialogues, the main discussion of the Theaetetus is set within a framing conversation (142a–143c) between Eucleides and Terpsion (cp. Phaedo 59c). This frame may be meant as a dedication of the work to the memory of the man Theaetetus. Sedley 2004 (6–8) has argued that it is meant to set some distance between Plato’s authorial voice and the various other voices (including Socrates’) that are heard in the dialogue. Alternatively, or also, it may be intended, like Symposium 172–3, to prompt questions about the reliability of knowledge based on testimony. (Cp. the law-court passage (Theaetetus 201a–c), and Socrates’ dream (Theaetetus 201c–202c).)

The Theaetetus’ most important similarity to other Platonic dialogues is that it is aporetic—it is a dialogue that ends in an impasse. The Theaetetus reviews three definitions of knowledge in turn; plus, in a preliminary discussion, one would-be definition which, it is said, does not really count. Each of these proposals is rejected, and no alternative is explicitly offered. Thus we complete the dialogue without discovering what knowledge is. We discover only three things that knowledge is not (Theaetetus 210c; cp. 183a5, 187a1).

This matters, given the place that the Theaetetus is normally assigned in the chronology of Plato’s writings. Most scholars agree that Plato’s first writings were the “Socratic” dialogues (as they are often called), which ask questions of the “What is…?” form and typically fail to find answers: “What is courage?” (Laches), “What is self-control?” (Charmides), “What is justice?” (Alcibiades I; Republic 1), “What is holiness?” (Euthyphro), “What is friendship?” (Lysis), “What is virtue?” (Meno), “What is nobility?” (Hippias Major). After some transitional works (Protagoras, Gorgias, Cratylus, Euthydemus) comes a series of dialogues in which Plato writes to a less tightly-defined format, not always focusing on a “What is…?” question, nor using the question-and-answer interrogative method that he himself depicts as strictly Socratic: the Phaedo, the Phaedrus, the Symposium, and the Republic. In these dialogues Plato shows a much greater willingness to put positive and ambitious metaphysical views in Socrates’ mouth, and to make Socrates the spokesman for what we call “Plato’s theory of Forms.”

After these, it is normally supposed that Plato’s next two works were the Parmenides and the Theaetetus, probably in that order. If so, and if we take as seriously as Plato seems to the important criticisms of the theory of Forms that are made in the Parmenides, then the significance of the Theaetetus’s return to the aporetic method looks obvious. Apparently Plato has abandoned the certainties of his middle-period works, such as the theory of Forms, and returned to the almost-sceptical manner of the early dialogues. In the Theaetetus, the Forms that so dominated the Republic’s discussions of epistemology are hardly mentioned at all. A good understanding of the dialogue must make sense of this fact.

2. Summary of the Dialogue

At the gates of the city of Megara in 369 BC, Eucleides and Terpsion hear a slave read out Eucleides’ memoir of a philosophical discussion that took place in 399 BC, shortly before Socrates’ trial and execution (142a–143c). In this, the young Theaetetus is introduced to Socrates by his mathematics tutor, Theodorus. Socrates questions Theaetetus about the nature of expertise, and this leads him to pose the key question of the dialogue: “What is knowledge?” (143d–145e). Theaetetus’ first response (D0) is to give examples of knowledge such as geometry, astronomy, harmony, arithmetic (146a–c). Socrates objects that, for any x, examples of x are neither necessary nor sufficient for a definition of x (146d–147e). Theaetetus admits this, and contrasts the ease with which he and his classmates define mathematical terms with his inability to define knowledge (147c–148e). Socrates offers to explain Theaetetus’ bewilderment about the question “What is knowledge?” by comparing himself with a midwife: Theaetetus, he suggests, is in discomfort because he is in intellectual labour (148e–151d).

Thus prompted, Theaetetus states his first acceptable definition, which is the proposal that

“Knowledge is perception” (151d–e).

Socrates does not respond to this directly. Instead he claims that D1 entails two other theories (Protagoras’ and Heracleitus’), which he expounds (151e–160e) and then criticises (160e–183c). Socrates eventually presents no fewer than eleven arguments, not all of which seem seriously intended, against the Protagorean and Heracleitean views. If any of these arguments hit its target, then by modus tollens D1 is also false. A more direct argument against D1 is eventually given at 184–7.

In 187b4–8, Theaetetus proposes a second definition of knowledge:

“Knowledge is true belief.”

D2 provokes Socrates to ask: how can there be any such thing as false belief? There follows a five-phase discussion which attempts to come up with an account of false belief. All five of these attempts fail, and that appears to be the end of the topic of false belief. Finally, at 200d–201c, Socrates returns to D2 itself. He dismisses D2 just by arguing that accidental true beliefs cannot be called knowledge, giving Athenian jurymen as an example of accidental true belief.

Theaetetus tries a third time. His final proposal is:

Knowledge is “true belief with an account (logos)” (201c–d).

The ensuing discussion attempts to spell out what it might be like for D3 to be true, then makes three attempts to spell out what a logos is.

In 201d–202d, the famous passage known as The Dream of Socrates, a two-part ontology of elements and complexes is proposed. Parallel to this ontology runs a theory of explanation that claims that to explain, to offer a logos, is to analyse complexes into their elements, i.e., those parts which cannot be further analysed. Crucially, the Dream Theory says that knowledge of O is true belief about O plus an account of O’s composition. If O is not composite, O cannot be known, but only “perceived” (202b6). When Socrates argues against the Dream Theory (202d8–206b11), it is this entailment that he focuses on.

Socrates then turns to consider, and reject, three attempts to spell out what a logos is—to give an account of “account.” The first attempt takes logos just to mean “speech” or “statement” (206c–e). The second account (206e4–208b12) of “logos of O” takes it as “enumeration of the elements of O.” The third and last proposal (208c1–210a9) is that to give the logos of O is to cite the sêmeion or diaphora of O, the “sign” or diagnostic feature wherein O differs from everything else.

All three attempts to give an account of “account” fail. The day’s discussion, and the dialogue, end in aporia. Socrates leaves to face his enemies in the courtroom.

3. Overall Interpretations of the Theaetetus

The Theaetetus is a principal field of battle for one of the main disputes between Plato’s interpreters. This is the dispute between Unitarians and Revisionists.

Unitarians argue that Plato’s works display a unity of doctrine and a continuity of purpose throughout. Unitarians include Aristotle, Proclus, and all the ancient and mediaeval commentators; Bishop Berkeley; and in the modern era, Schleiermacher, Ast, Shorey, Diès, Ross, Cornford, and Cherniss.

Revisionists retort that Plato’s works are full of revisions, retractations, and changes of direction. Eminent Revisionists include Lutoslawski, Ryle, Robinson, Runciman, Owen, McDowell, Bostock, and many recent commentators.

Unitarianism is historically the dominant interpretive tradition. Revisionism, it appears, was not invented until the text-critical methods, such as stylometry, that were developed in early nineteenth-century German biblical studies were transferred to Plato.

In the twentieth century, a different brand of Revisionism has dominated English-speaking Platonic studies. This owes its impetus to a desire to read Plato as charitably as possible, and a belief that a charitable reading of Plato’s works will minimise their dependence on the theory of Forms. (Corollary: Unitarians are likelier than Revisionists to be sympathetic to the theory of Forms.)

Unitarianism could be the thesis that all of Plato’s work is, really, Socratic in method and inspiration, and that Plato should be credited with no view that is not endorsed in the early dialogues. (In some recent writers, Unitarianism is this thesis: see Penner and Rowe (2005).) But this is not the most usual form of Unitarianism, which is more likely to “read back” the concerns of the Phaedo and the Republic into the Socratic dialogues, than to “read forward” the studied agnosticism of the early works into these more ambitious later dialogues. Likewise, Revisionism could be evidenced by the obvious changes of outlook that occur, e.g., between the Charmides and the Phaedo, or again between the Protagoras and the Gorgias. But the main focus of the Revisionist/Unitarian debate has never been on these dialogues. The contrasts between the Charmides and the Phaedo, and the Protagoras and the Gorgias, tell us little about the question whether Plato ever abandoned the theory of Forms. And that has usually been the key dispute between Revisionists and Unitarians.

Hence the debate has typically focused on the contrast between the “the Middle Period dialogues” and “the Late dialogues.” Revisionists say that the Middle Period dialogues enounce positive doctrines, above all the theory of Forms, which the Late dialogues criticise, reject, or simply bypass. The main place where Revisionists (e.g., Ryle 1939) suppose that Plato criticises the theory of Forms is in the Parmenides (though some Revisionists find criticism of the theory of Forms in the Theaetetus and Sophist as well). The main places where Revisionists look to see Plato managing without the theory of Forms are the Theaetetus and Sophist.

Ryle’s Revisionism was soon supported by other Oxford Plato scholars such as Robinson 1950 and Runciman 1962 (28). Revisionism was also defended by G.E.L. Owen. More recently, McDowell 1976, Bostock 1988, and Burnyeat 1990 are three classic books on the Theaetetus of a decidedly Revisionist tendency. (McDowell shows a particularly marked reluctance to bring in the theory of Forms anywhere where he is not absolutely compelled to.)

Revisionists are committed by their overall stance to a number of more particular views. They are more or less bound to say that the late Plato takes the Parmenides’ critique of the theory of Forms to be cogent, or at least impressive; that the Sophist’s theory of “the five greatest kinds” (Sophist 254b–258e) is not a development of the theory of Forms; and that the Timaeus was written before the Parmenides, because of the Timaeus’ apparent defence of theses from the theory of Forms. Their line on the Theaetetus will be that its argument does not support the theory of Forms; that the Theaetetus is interesting precisely because it shows us how good at epistemology Plato is once he frees himself from his obsession with the Forms.

Some of these Revisionist claims look easier for Unitarians to dispute than others. For example, Plato does not think that the arguments of Parmenides 130b–135c actually disprove the theory of Forms. Rather, it is obviously Plato’s view that Parmenides’ arguments against the Forms can be refuted. See Parmenides 135a–d, where Plato explicitly says—using Parmenides as his mouthpiece—that these arguments will be refuted by anyone of adequate philosophical training. (Whether anyone “of adequate philosophical training” is available is, of course, another question.)

Another problem for the Revisionist concerns Owen 1965’s proposal, adopted by Bostock 1988, to redate the Timaeus to the Middle Period, thus escaping the conclusion that Plato still accepted the theory of Forms at the end of his philosophical career. The trouble with this is that it is not only the Timaeus that the Revisionist needs to redate. In quite a number of apparently Late dialogues, Plato seems sympathetic to the theory of Forms: see e.g., Philebus 61e and Laws 965c.

On the other hand, the Revisionist claim that the Theaetetus shows Plato doing more or less completely without the theory of Forms is very plausible. There are no explicit mentions of the Forms at all in the Theaetetus, except possibly (and even this much is disputed) in what many take to be the philosophical backwater of the Digression. The main argument of the dialogue seems to get along without even implicit appeal to the theory of Forms. In the Theaetetus, Revisionism seems to be on its strongest ground of all.

The usual Unitarian answer is that this silence is studied. In the Theaetetus, Unitarians suggest, Plato is showing what knowledge is not. His argument is designed to show that certain sorts of alternatives to Plato’s own account of knowledge must fail. Plato demonstrates this failure by the ‘maieutic’ method of developing those accounts until they fail. Thus the Theaetetus shows the impossibility of a successful account of knowledge that does not invoke the Forms.

The fault-line between Unitarians and Revisionists is the deepest fissure separating interpreters of the Theaetetus. It is not the only distinction among overall interpretations of the dialogue. It has also been suggested, both in the ancient and the modern eras, that the Theaetetus is a sceptical work; that the Theaetetus is a genuinely aporetic work; and that the Theaetetus is a disjointed work. However, there is no space to review these possibilities here. It is time to look more closely at the detail of the arguments that Plato gives in the distinct sections of the dialogue.

4. The Introduction to the Dialogue: 142a–145e

We should not miss the three philosophical theses that are explicitly advanced in the Introduction. They are offered without argument by Socrates, and agreed to without argument by Theaetetus, at 145d7–145e5:

  1. The wise are wise sophiai (= by/ because of/ in respect of/ as a result of wisdom:145d11).
  2. To learn is to become wiser about the topic you are learning about (145d8–9).
  3. Wisdom (sophia) and knowledge (epistêmê) are the same thing (145e5).

All three theses might seem contentious today. (1) seems to allude to Phaedo 100e’s notorious thesis about the role of the Form of F-ness in any x’s being F—that x is Fby the Form of F-ness.” (2) looks contentious because it implies (3); and (3) brings me to a second question about 142a–145e (which is also an important question about the whole dialogue): What is the meaning of the Greek word that I am translating as “knowledge,” epistêmê?

Much has been written about Plato’s words for knowledge. One important question raised by Runciman 1962 is the question whether Plato was aware of the commonplace modern distinction between knowing that, knowing how, and knowing what (or whom). Nothing is more natural for modern philosophers than to contrast knowledge of objects (knowledge by acquaintance or objectual knowledge; French connaître) with knowledge of how to do things (technique knowledge), and with knowledge of propositions or facts (propositional knowledge; French savoir). Runciman doubts that Plato is aware of this threefold distinction (1962, 17): “At the time of writing the Theaetetus Plato had made no clear distinction [between] knowing that, knowing how, and knowing by acquaintance.”

Against this, Plato’s word for knowing how is surely tekhnê, from which we get the English word “technique.” Plato obviously thinks tekhnê incidental to a serious discussion of epistêmê. This is part of the point of the argument against definition by examples that begins at 146d (cp. 177c–179b).

As for the difference between knowing that and knowledge by acquaintance: the Theaetetus does mix passages that discuss the one sort of knowledge with passages that discuss the other. This does not imply that Plato was unaware of the difference. Perhaps he wants to discuss theories of knowledge that find deep conceptual connections between the two sorts of knowledge.

A grammatical point is relevant here. The objectual “I know Socrates” in classical Greek is oida (or gignôskô) ton Sôkratên; the propositional “I know Socrates is wise” is oida (or gignôskô) ton Sôkratên sophon onta, literally “I know Socrates being wise” or, colloquially, just oida ton Sôkratên sophon, literally “I know Socrates wise”. Thus the Greek idiom can readily treat the object of propositional knowledge, which in English would most naturally be a that-clause, as a thing considered as having a quality. We might almost say that Greek treats what is known in propositional knowledge as just one special case of what is known in objectual knowledge. This suggests that the ancient Greeks naturally saw propositional and objectual knowledge as more closely related than we do (though not necessarily as indistinguishable). If so, Plato may have felt able to offer a single treatment for the two kinds of knowledge without thereby confusing them. The point will be relevant to the whole of the Theaetetus.

5. Definition by Examples: 146a–151d

At 145d Socrates states the “one little question that puzzles” him: “What is knowledge?” Theaetetus’ first response (D0) is to offer examples of knowledge (146c). Socrates rejects this response, arguing that, for any x, examples of x are neither necessary nor sufficient for a definition of x. They are not necessary, because they are irrelevant (146e). They are not sufficient, because they presuppose the understanding that a definition is meant to provide (147a–b). Moreover (147c), a definition could be briefly stated, whereas talking about examples is “an interminable diversion” (aperanton hodon).

Does Socrates produce good arguments against definition by examples? Many philosophers think not (McDowell 1976 (115), Geach 1966, Santas 1972, Burnyeat 1977). They often argue this by appealing to the authority of Wittgenstein, who famously complains (The Blue and Brown Books, 20) that “When Socrates asks the question, ‘What is knowledge?’, he does not regard it even as a preliminary answer to enumerate cases of knowledge.” For arguments against this modern consensus, see Chappell 2005 (36–37).

Some commentators have taken Socrates’ critique of definition by examples to be an implicit critique of the Republic’s procedure of distinguishing knowledge, belief, and ignorance by distinguishing their objects. The suggestion was first made by Ryle 1990 (23), who points out that “Socrates makes it clear that what he wants discussed is not a list of things that people know,” “but an elucidation of the concept of knowledge.” Ryle suggests that “Attention to this simple point might have saved Cornford from saying that the implicit conclusion of the dialogue is that ‘true knowledge has for its objects things of a different order’.” Ryle thinks it “silly” to suggest that knowledge can be defined merely by specifying its objects.

However, 145e–147c cannot be read as a critique of the Republic’s procedure of distinguishing knowledge from belief by their objects. 145e–147c is not against defining knowledge by examples of objects of knowledge; it is against defining knowledge by examples of kinds of knowledge. (See e.g., 146e7, “We weren’t wanting to make a list of kinds of knowledge.”) This is a different matter.

Why, anyway, would the Platonist of the Republic think that examples of the objects of knowledge are enough for a definition of knowledge? He is surely the last person to think that. The person who will think this is the empiricist, who thinks that we acquire all our concepts by exposure to examples of their application: Locke, Essay II.1, Aristotle, Posterior Analytics 100a4–9. For the Platonist, definition by examples is never even possible; for the empiricist, definition by examples is the natural method in every case. This suggests that empiricism is a principal target of the argument of the Theaetetus. More about this in sections 6–8.

Theaetetus is puzzled by his own inability to answer Socrates’ request for a definition of knowledge, and contrasts it with the ease with which he can provide mathematical definitions. He gives an example of a mathematical definition; scholars are divided about the aptness of the parallel between this, and what would be needed for a definition of knowledge. Socrates’ response, when Theaetetus still protests his inability to define knowledge, is to compare himself to a midwife in a long and intricate analogy.

Many ancient Platonists read the midwife analogy, and more recently Cornford 1935 has read it, as alluding to the theory of recollection. But it is better not to import metaphysical assumptions into the text without good reason, and it is hard to see what the reason would be beyond a determination to insist that Plato always maintained the theory of recollection. With or without this speculation, the midwife passage does tell us something important about how the Theaetetus is going to proceed. In line with the classification that the ancient editors set at the front of the dialogue, it is going to be peirastikos, an experimental dialogue. It will try out a number of suggestions about the nature of knowledge. As in the aporetic dialogues, there is no guarantee that any of these suggestions will be successful (and every chance that none of them will be).

So read, the midwife passage can also tell us something important about the limitations of the Theaetetus’ inquiry. The limitations of the inquiry are the limitations of the main inquirers, and neither (the historical) Socrates nor Theaetetus was a card-carrying adherent of Plato’s theory of Forms. Perhaps the dialogue brings us only as far as the threshold of the theory of Forms precisely because, on Socratic principles, one can get no further. To get beyond where the Theaetetus leaves off, you have to be a Platonist. (For book-length developments of this reading of the Theaetetus, see Sedley 2004 and Chappell 2005.)

6. First Definition (D1): “Knowledge is Perception”: 151e–187a

Between Stephanus pages 151 and 187, and leaving aside the Digression, 172–177 (section 6d), 31 pages of close and complex argument state, discuss, and eventually refute the first of Theaetetus’ three serious attempts at a definition of knowledge:

“Knowledge is perception.”

As before, there are two main alternative readings of 151–187: the Unitarian and the Revisionist. On the Unitarian reading, Plato’s purpose is to salvage as much as possible of the theories of Protagoras and Heracleitus (each respectfully described as ou phaulon: 151e8, 152d2). Plato’s strategy is to show that these theories have their own distinctive area of application, the perceptible or sensible world, within which they are true. However, the sensible world is not the whole world, and so these theories are not the whole truth. We get absurdities if we try to take them as unrestrictedly true. To avoid these absurdities it is necessary to posit the intelligible world (the world of the Forms) alongside the sensible world (the world of perception). When this is done, Platonism subsumes the theories of Protagoras and Heracleitus as partial truths. On this reading, the strategy of the discussion of D1 is to transcend Protagoras and Heracleitus: to explain their views by showing how they are, not the truth, but parts of a larger truth. In the process the discussion reveals logical pressures that may push us towards the two-worlds Platonism that many readers, e.g., Ross and Cornford, find in the Republic and Timaeus.

On the Revisionist reading, Plato’s purpose is to refute the theories of Protagoras and Heracleitus. He thinks that the absurdities those theories give rise to, come not from trying to take the theories as unrestrictedly true, but from trying to take them as true at all, even of the sensible world. Anyone who tries to take seriously the thesis that knowledge is perception has to adopt theories of knowledge and perception like Protagoras’ and Heracleitus’. But their theories are untenable. By modus tollens this shows that D1 itself is untenable. On this reading, the strategy of the discussion of D1 is to move us towards the view that sensible phenomena have to fall under the same general metaphysical theory as intelligible phenomena.

This outline of the two main alternatives for 151–187 shows how strategic and tactical issues of Plato interpretation interlock. For instance, the outline shows how important it is for an overall understanding of the Theaetetus to have a view on the following questions of detail (more about them later):

  1. At 156a–157c, is Socrates just reporting, or also endorsing, a Heracleitean flux theory of perception?
  2. What is the date of the Timaeus, which seems (28–29, 45b–46c, 49e) to present a very similar theory of perception to that found in Theaetetus 156–7?
  3. What does Plato take to be the logical relations between the three positions under discussion in 151–184 (D1, Protagoras’ theory, and Heracleitus’ theory)? The closer he takes them to be, the more support that seems to give to the Revisionist view that the whole of 151–187 is one gigantic modus tollens. The more separate they are, the better for those versions of Unitarianism that suggest that Plato wants to pick and choose among the positions offered in 151–187.

So much for the overall structure of 151–187; now for the parts.

6.1 The Definition of Knowledge as Perception: 151d–e

At 151d7–e3 Theaetetus proposes:

“Knowledge is nothing other than perception” (aisthêsis).

Socrates immediately equates D1 with Protagoras’s thesis that

“Man is the measure of all things” (homomensura).

and takes this, in turn, to entail the thesis:

Things are to any human just as they appear to that human (phenomenal subjectivism).

Socrates then adds that, in its turn, PS entails Heracleitus’ view that “All is flux,” that there are no stably existing objects with stably enduring qualities.

The first of these deft exchanges struck the Anonymous Commentator as disingenuous: “Plato himself knew that Protagoras’ opinion about knowledge was not the same as Theaetetus’” (Anon, ad loc.). Certainly it is easy to see counter-examples to the alleged entailment. Take, for instance, the thesis that knowledge is awareness (which is often the right way to translate aisthêsis). Or take the thesis that to know is to perceive things as God, or the Ideal Observer, perceives them, and that we fail to know (or to perceive) just insofar as our opinions are other than God’s or the Ideal Observer’s. These theses are both versions of D1. Neither version entails the claim that “man is the measure of all things” (Hm)—nor the Protagorean view that lies behind that slogan.

So how, if at all, does D1 entail all the things that Socrates apparently makes it entail in 151–184? And does Plato think it has all these entailments? Evidently the answer to that depends on how we understand D1. In particular, it depends on the meaning of the word aisthêsis, “perception,” in D1. If the slogan “Knowledge is perception” equates knowledge with what ordinary speakers of classical Greek would have meant by aisthêsis, then D1 does not entail Protagoras’ and Heracleitus’ views. In the ordinary sense of aisthêsis, there are (as just pointed out) too many other possible ways of spelling out D1 for the move from D1 to Hm to be logically obligatory. But if the slogan “Knowledge is perception” equates knowledge with what Protagoras and Heracleitus meant by aisthêsis, D1 does entail Protagoras’ and Heracleitus’ views. Of course it does; for then D1 simply says that knowledge is just what Protagoras and Heracleitus say knowledge is.

6.2 The “Cold Wind” Argument; and the Theory of Flux: 152a–160e

At 152b1–152c8 Socrates begins his presentation of Protagoras’ view that things are to any human just as they appear to that human by taking the example of a wind which affects two people differently. Such cases, he says, support Protagoras’ analysis: “that the wind is cold to the one who feels cold, but not cold to the one who does not feel cold.

Some scholars (Cornford 1935, 33–4; Waterlow 1977) think that the point of the argument is that both “the wind in itself is cold” and “the wind in itself is not cold (but warm)” are true: “‘Warm’ and ‘cold’ are two properties which can co-exist in the same physical object. I perceive the one, you perceive the other.” The trouble with this suggestion is that much of the detail of the Protagorean/Heracleitean position in 151–184 seems to be generated by Protagoras’ desire to avoid contradiction. If Cornford thinks that Protagoras is not concerned to avoid contradicting himself, then he has a huge task of reinterpretation ahead of him.

Rather, perhaps, the point of the argument is this: Neither “The wind in itself is cold” nor “The wind in itself is warm” is true. If we had grounds for affirming either, we would have equally good grounds for affirming both; but the conjunction “The wind in itself is cold and the wind in itself is warm” is a contradiction. This contradiction, says Protagoras, obliges us to give up all talk about “the wind in itself,” and switch to relativised talk about the wind as it seems to me or to you, etc. (The same contradiction pushes the Plato of the Republic in the opposite direction: it leads him to place no further trust in any relativised talk, precisely because such talk cannot get us beyond such contradictions.)

So we have moved from D1, to Hm, to PS. At 152c8–152e1 Socrates adds that, in its turn, PS entails Heracleitus’ view that “All is flux,” that there are no stably existing objects with stably enduring qualities. The reason given for this is the same thought as the one at the centre of the cold-wind argument: that everything to which any predicate can be applied, according to one perception, can also have the negation of that predicate applied to it, according to an opposite perception with equally good credentials.

After a passage (152e1–153d5) in which Socrates presents what seem to be deliberately bad arguments, eight of them, for Heracleitus’ flux thesis, Socrates notes three shocking theses which the flux theory implies:

  1. Qualities have no independent existence in time and space (153d6–e1).
  2. Qualities do not exist except in perceptions of them (153e3–154a8).
  3. (The dice paradox:) changes in a thing’s qualities are not so much changes in that thing as in perceptions of that thing (154a9–155c6).

These shocking implications, Socrates says, give the phenomenal subjectivist his reason to reject the entire object/quality metaphysics, and to replace it with a metaphysics of flux.

In 155c–157c the flux theory is used to develop a Protagorean/Heracleitean account of perception, to replace accounts based on the object/property ontology of common sense. Socrates notes the subversive implications of the theory of flux for the meaningfulness and truth-aptness of most of our language as it stands. (He returns to this point at 183a–b.) The ontology of the flux theory distinguishes kinds of “process” (kinêsis), i.e., of flux, in two ways: as fast or slow, and as active or passive. Hence there are four such processes. On these the flux theory’s account of perception rests.

A rather similar theory of perception is given by Plato in Timaeus 45b–46c, 67c–68d. This fact has much exercised scholars, since it relates closely to the question whether Plato himself accepts the flux theory of perception (cp. Theaetetus 157c5). The question is important because it connects with the question of whether the Revisionist or Unitarian reading of 151–187 is right. (For more on this issue, see Cornford 1935 (49–50); Crombie 1963, II (21–22); Burnyeat 1990 (17–18); McDowell 1973 (139–140), Chappell 2005 (74–78).)

At 157c–160c Socrates states a first objection to the flux theory. This asks how the flux theorist is to distinguish false (deceptive) appearances such as dreams from the true (undeceptive) appearances of the waking world. The flux theorist’s answer is that such appearances should not be described as ‘true’ and ‘false’ appearances to the same person. Rather they should be described as different appearances to different people. According to the flux theorist, we have the same person if and only if we have the same combination of a perception and a perceiving (159c–d). So there is no need to call any appearances false. Thus we preserve the claim that all appearances are true—a claim which must be true if knowledge is perception in the sense that Socrates has taken that definition.

160b–d summarises the whole of 151–160. Socrates shows how the exploration of Theaetetus’ identification of knowledge with perception has led us to develop a whole battery of views: in particular, a Protagorean doctrine of the incorrigibility of perception, and a Heracleitean account of what perception is. Thus “perception has one of the two marks of knowledge, infallibility” (Cornford 1935, 58); “and, if we can accept Protagoras’ identification of what appears to me with what is, ignoring the addition ‘for me’ and the distinction between being and becoming, the case will be complete.”

6.3 The Refutation of the Thesis that Knowledge is Perception: 160e5–186e12

160e marks the transition from the statement and exposition of the definition of knowledge as perception (D1), to the presentation of criticism and refutation of that definition.

Scholars have divided about the overall purpose of 160e–186e. Mostly they have divided along the lines described in section 3, taking either a Revisionist or a Unitarian view of Part One of the Theaetetus.

Revisionists say that the target of the critique of 160e–186e is everything that has been said in support and development of D1 ever since 151. Unitarians argue that Plato’s criticism of D1 in 160e–186e is more selective. Obviously his aim is to refute D1, the equation of knowledge with perception. But that does not oblige him to reject the account of perception that has been offered in support of D1. And Plato does not reject this account: he accepts it.

Thus the Unitarian Cornford argues that Plato is not rejecting the Heracleitean flux theory of perception. He is rejecting only D1’s claim that knowledge is that sort of perception. It remains possible that perception is just as Heracleitus describes it. Likewise, Cornford suggests, the Protagorean doctrine that “man is the measure of all things” is true provided it is taken to mean only “all things that we perceive.”

If some form of Unitarianism is correct, an examination of 160–186 should show that Plato’s strategy in the critique of D1 highlights two distinctions:

  1. A distinction between the claim that the objects of perception are in flux, and the claim that everything is in flux.
  2. A distinction between bare sensory awareness, and judgement on the basis of such awareness.

One vital passage for distinction (1) is 181b–183b. If Unitarianism is right, this passage should be an attack on the Heracleitean thesis that everything is in flux, but not an attack on the Heracleitean thesis that the objects of perception are in flux. According to Unitarians, the thesis that the objects of perception are in flux is a Platonic thesis too. Readers should ask themselves whether this is the right way to read 181b –183b.

Distinction (2) seems to be explicitly stated at 179c. There also seems to be clear evidence of distinction (2) in the final argument against D1, at 184–187. Distinction (2) is also at work, apparently, in the discussion of some of the nine objections addressed to the Protagorean theory. Some of these objections can plausibly be read as points about the unattractive consequences of failing to distinguish the Protagorean claim that bare sense-awareness is incorrigible (as the Unitarian Plato agrees) from the further Protagorean claim that judgements about sense-awareness are incorrigible (which the Unitarian Plato denies).

The criticism of D1 breaks down into twelve separate arguments, interrupted by the Digression (172c–177c: translated and discussed separately in section 6.4 below). There is no space here to comment in detail on every one of these arguments, some of which, as noted above, have often been thought frivolous or comically intended (cp. 152e1–153d5). Some brief notes on the earlier objections will show what the serious point of each might be.

The first objection to Protagoras (160e–161d) observes that if all perceptions are true, then there is no reason to think that animal perceptions are inferior to human ones: a situation which Socrates finds absurd.

If this objection is really concerned with perceptions strictly so called, then it obviously fails. Protagoras just accepts this supposedly absurd consequence; and apparently he is right to do so. If we consider animals and humans just as perceivers, there is no automatic reason to prefer human perceptions. Many animal perceptions are superior to human perceptions (dogs’ hearing, hawks’ eyesight, dolphins’ echolocatory ability, most mammals’ sense of smell, etc.), and the Greeks knew it, cf. Homer’s commonplace remarks about “far-sighted eagles”, or indeed Aristotle, in the Eudemian Ethics, 1231a5–6. The objection works much better rephrased as an objection about judgements about perceptions, rather than about perceptions strictly so called. Humans are no more and no less perceivers than pigs, baboons, or tadpoles. But they are different in their powers of judgement about perceptions.

This distinction between arguments against a Protagorean view about perception and a Protagorean view about judgement about perception is relevant to the second objection too (161d–162a). This objection (cp. Cratylus 386c) makes the point that Protagoras’ theory implies that no one is wiser than anyone else. Notably, the argument does not attack the idea that perception is infallible. Rather, it attacks the idea that the opinion or judgement that anyone forms on the basis of perception is infallible (161d3). (This is an important piece of support for Unitarianism: cp. distinction (2) above.)

A third objection to Protagoras’ thesis is very quickly stated in Socrates’ two rhetorical questions at 162c2–6. Since Protagoras’ thesis implies that all perceptions are true, it not only has the allegedly absurd consequence that animals’ perceptions are not inferior to humans. It also has the consequence that humans’ perceptions are not inferior to the gods’. This consequence too is now said to be absurd.

As with the first two objections, so here. If we consider divinities and humans just as perceivers, there is no automatic reason to prefer divine perceptions, and hence no absurdity. Plato may well want us to infer that the Greek gods are not different just in respect of being perceivers from humans. But they are different in their powers of judgement about perceptions.

The next four arguments (163a–168c) present counter-examples to the alleged equivalence of knowledge and perception. The fourth observes that, if perception = knowledge, then anyone who perceives an utterance in a given language should have knowledge of that utterance, i.e., understand it—which plainly doesn’t happen. The fifth raises a similar problem about memory and perception: remembering things is knowing them, but not perceiving them. The sixth (the “covered eye”) objection contrasts not perceiving an object (in one sensory modality) with not knowing it. If perception = knowledge, seeing an object with one eye and not seeing it with the other would appear to be a case of the contradictory state of both knowing it and not knowing it. The seventh points out that one can perceive dimly or faintly, clearly or unclearly, but that these adverbial distinctions do not apply to ways of knowing—as they must if knowing is perceiving.

In 165e4–168c5, Socrates sketches Protagoras’s response to these seven objections. Protagoras makes two main points. First, he can meet some of the objections by distinguishing types and occasions of perception. Second, teaching as he understands it is not a matter of getting the pupil to have true rather than false beliefs. Since there are no false beliefs, the change that a teacher can effect is not a change from false belief to true belief or knowledge. Rather, Protagoras’ model of teaching is a therapeutic model. What a good teacher does, according to him, is use arguments (or discourses: logoi) as a good doctor uses drugs, to replace the state of the soul in which “bad things are and appear” with one in which “good things are and appear.” While all beliefs are true, not all beliefs are beneficial.

A difficulty for Protagoras’ position here is that, if all beliefs are true, then all beliefs about which beliefs are beneficial must be true. But surely, some beliefs about which beliefs are beneficial contradict other beliefs about which beliefs are beneficial; especially if some people are better than others at bringing about beneficial beliefs. (For example, no doubt Plato’s and Protagoras’ beliefs conflict at this point.) This means that Protagoras’ view entails a contradiction of the same sort as the next objection–the famous peritropê—seems to be meant to bring out.

The peritropê (“table-turning”) objection (171a–b) is this. Suppose I believe, as Protagoras does, that “All beliefs are true,” but also admit that “There is a belief that ‘Not all beliefs are true’.” If all beliefs are true, the belief that “Not all beliefs are true” must be true too. But if that belief is true, then by disquotation, not all beliefs are true. So I refute myself by contradicting myself; and the same holds for Protagoras.

The validity of the objection has been much disputed. Burnyeat, Denyer and Sedley all offer reconstructions of the objection that make it come out valid. McDowell and Bostock suggest that although the objection does not prove what it is meant to prove (self-contradiction), it does prove a different point (about self-defeat) which is equally worth making.

Socrates’ ninth objection presents Protagoras’ theory with a dilemma. If the theory is completely general in its application, then it must say that not only what counts as justice in cities, but also what benefits cities, is a relative matter. As Protagoras has already admitted (167a3), it is implausible to say that benefit is a relative notion. But the alternative, which Protagoras apparently prefers, is a conceptual divorce between the notions of justice and benefit, which restrict the application of Protagoras’ theory to the notion of justice. Socrates obviously finds this conceptual divorce unattractive, though he does not, directly, say why. Instead, he offers us the Digression.

6.4 The Digression: 172c1–177b7

An obvious question: what is the Digression for? One answer (defended in Chappell 2004, ad loc.) would be that it is a critique of the society that produces the conceptual divorce between justice and benefit that has just emerged. Socrates draws an extended parallel between two types of character, the philosophical man and the man of rhetoric, to show that it is better to be the philosophical type.

The Digression is “philosophically quite pointless,” according to Ryle 1966: 158. Less dismissively, McDowell 1976: 174 suggests that the Digression serves “a purpose which, in a modern book, might be served by footnotes or an appendix.” Similarly, Cornford 1935 (83) suggests that Plato aims to give the reader some references for anti-relativist arguments that he presents elsewhere: “To argue explicitly against it would perhaps take him too far from the original topic of perception. Instead, he inserts [the Digression], which contains allusions to such arguments in other works of his.”

Perhaps the Digression paints a picture of what it is like to live in accordance with the two different accounts of knowledge, the Protagorean and the Platonist, that Plato is comparing. Thus the Digression shows us what is ethically at stake in the often abstruse debates found elsewhere in the Theaetetus. Its point is that we can’t make a decision about what account of knowledge to accept without making all sorts of other decisions, not only about the technical, logical and metaphysical matters that are to the fore in the rest of the Theaetetus, but also about questions of deep ethical significance. So, for instance, it can hardly be an accident that, at 176c2, the difference between justice and injustice is said to be a difference between knowledge (gnôsis) and ignorance (agnoia).

Another common question about the Digression is: does it introduce or mention the Platonic Forms? Certainly the Digression uses phrases that are indisputably part of the Middle-Period language for the Forms. If Plato uses the language of the theory of Forms in a passage which is admitted on all sides to allude to the themes of the Republic, it strains credulity to imagine that Plato is not intentionally referring to the Forms in that passage.

On the other hand, as the Revisionist will point out, the Theaetetus does not seem to do much with the Forms that are thus allegedly introduced. But perhaps it would undermine the Unitarian reading of the Theaetetus if the Forms were present in the Digression in the role of paradigm objects of knowledge. For the Unitarian reading, at least on the version that strikes me as most plausible, says that the aim of the Theaetetus is to show that, in the end, we cannot construct a theory of knowledge without the Forms—a claim which is to be proved by trying and failing, three times, to do so. So if the Forms were there in the Digression, perhaps that would be a case of “giving the game away.”

6.5 Last Objection to Protagoras: 177c6–179b5

After the Digression Socrates returns to criticising Protagoras’ relativism. His last objection is that there is no coherent way of applying Protagoras’ relativism to judgements about the future.

How might Protagoras counter this objection? Protagoras has already suggested that the past may now be no more than whatever I now remember it to have been (166b). Perhaps he can also suggest that the future is now no more than I now believe it will be. No prediction is ever proved wrong, just as no memory is ever inaccurate. All that happens is it seems to one self at one time that something will be true (or has been true), and seems to another self at another time that something different is true.

But these appeals to distinctions between Protagorean selves—future or past—do not help. Suppose we grant to Protagoras that, when I make a claim about how the future will be, this claim concerns how things will be for my future self. It is just irrelevant to add that my future self and I are different beings. Claims about the future still have a form that makes them refutable by someone’s future experience. If I predict on Monday that on Tuesday my head will hurt, that claim is falsified either if I have no headache on Tuesday, or if, on Tuesday, there is someone who is by convention picked out as my continuant whose head does not hurt.

Similarly with the past. Suppose I know on Tuesday that on Monday I predicted that on Tuesday my head would hurt. It is no help against the present objection for me to reflect, on Tuesday, that I am a different person now from who I was then. My Monday-self can only have meant either that his head would hurt on Tuesday, which was a false belief on his part if he no longer exists on Tuesday; or else that the Tuesday-self would have a sore head. But if the Tuesday-self has no sore head, then my Monday-self made a false prediction, and so must have had a false belief. Either way, the relativist does not escape the objection.

Moreover, this defence of Protagoras does not evade the following dilemma. Either what I mean by claiming (to take an example of Bostock’s) that “The wine will taste raw to me in five years’ time” is literally that. Or else what I mean is just “It seems to me that the wine will taste raw to me in five years’ time.”

Suppose I mean the former assertion. If the wine turns out not to taste raw five years hence, Protagoras has no defence from the conclusion that I made a false prediction about how things would seem to me in five years. Or suppose I meant the latter assertion. Then I did not make a prediction, strictly speaking, at all; merely a remark about what presently seems to me. Either way, Protagoras loses.

6.6 Last Objection to Heracleitus: 179c1–183c2

Socrates argues that if Heracleitus’ doctrine of flux is true, then no assertion whatever can properly be made. Therefore (a) Heracleitus’ theory of flux no more helps to prove that knowledge is perception than that knowledge is not perception, and (b) Heracleiteans cannot coherently say anything at all, not even to state their own doctrine.

There are two variants of the argument. On the first of these variants, evident in 181c2–e10, Socrates distinguishes just two kinds of flux or process, namely qualitative alteration and spatial motion, and insists that the Heracleiteans are committed to saying that both are continual. On the second variant, evident perhaps at 182a1, 182e4–5, Socrates distinguishes indefinitely many kinds of flux or process, not just qualitative alteration and motion through space, and insists that the Heracleiteans are committed to saying that every kind of flux is continual.

Now the view that everything is always changing in every way might seem a rather foolish view to take about everyday objects. But, as 182a2–b8 shows, the present argument is not about everyday objects anyway. Plato does not apply his distinction between kinds of change to every sort of object whatever, including everyday objects. He applies it specifically to the objects (if that is the word) of Heracleitean metaphysics. These items are supposed by the Heracleitean to be the reality underlying all talk of everyday objects. It is at the level of these Heracleitean perceivings and perceivers that Plato’s argument against Heracleitus is pitched. And it is not obviously silly to suppose that Heracleitean perceivings and perceivers are constantly changing in every way.

The argument that Socrates presents on the Heracleiteans’ behalf infers from “Everything is always changing in every way” that “No description of anything is excluded.” How does this follow? McDowell 1976: 181–2 finds the missing link in the impossibility of identifications. We cannot (says McDowell) identify a moving sample of whiteness, or of seeing, any longer once it has changed into some other colour, or perception.

But this only excludes reidentifications: presumably I can identify the moving whiteness or the moving seeing until it changes, even if this only gives me an instant in which to identify it. This point renders McDowell’s version, as it stands, an invalid argument. If it is on his account possible to identify the moving whiteness until it changes, then it is on his account possible to identify the moving whiteness. But if that is possible, then his argument contradicts itself: for it goes on to deny this possibility.

Some other accounts of the argument also commit this fallacy. Compare Sayre’s account (1969: 94): “If no statement, either affirmative or negative, can remain true for longer than the time taken in its utterance, then no statement can be treated as either true or false, and the cause of communicating with one’s fellow beings must be given up as hopeless.”

Sayre’s argument aims at the conclusion “No statement can be treated as either true or false.” But Sayre goes via the premiss “Any statement remains true no longer than the time taken in its utterance.” If there are statements which are true, even if they are not true for very long, it is not clear why these statements cannot be treated as true, at least in principle (and in practice too, given creatures with the right sensory equipment and sense of time).

McDowell’s and Sayre’s versions of the argument also face the following objection. It is obvious how, given flux, a present-tense claim like “Item X is present” can quickly cease to be true, because e.g., “Item Y is present” comes to replace it. But it isn’t obvious why flux should exclude the possibility of past-tense statements like “Item X flowed into item Y between t1 and t2,” or of tenseless statements like “Item X is present at t1, item Y is present at t2.” As Bostock 1988: 105–6 points out, “So long as we do have a language with stable meanings, and the ability to make temporal distinctions, there is no difficulty at all about describing an ever-changing world.”

“So long as”: to make the argument workable, we may suggest that its point is that the meanings of words are exempt from flux. If meanings are not in flux, and if we have access to those meanings, nothing stops us from identifying the whiteness at least until it flows away. But if meanings are in flux too, we will have the result that the argument against Heracleitus actually produces at 183a5: anything at all will count equally well as identifying or not identifying the whiteness. “Unless we recognise some class of knowable entities exempt from the Heracleitean flux and so capable of standing as the fixed meanings of words, no definition of knowledge can be any more true than its contradictory. Plato is determined to make us feel the need of his Forms without mentioning them” (Cornford 1935, 99).

6.7 The Final Refutation of D1: 183c4–187a8

Socrates completes his refutation of the thesis that knowledge is perception by bringing a twelfth and final objection, directed against D1 itself rather than its Protagorean or Heracleitean interpretations. This objection says that the mind makes use of a range of concepts which it could not have acquired, and which do not operate, through the senses: e.g., “existence,” “sameness,” “difference.” So there is a part of thought, and hence of knowledge, which has nothing to do with perception. Therefore knowledge is not perception.

Unitarians and Revisionists will read this last argument against D1 in line with their general orientations. Unitarians will suggest that Socrates’ range of concepts common to the senses is a list of Forms. They will point to the similarities between the image of the senses as soldiers in a wooden horse that Socrates offers at 184d1 ff., and the picture of a Heracleitean self, existing only in its awareness of particular perceptions, that he drew at 156–160.

Revisionists will retort that there are important differences between the Heracleitean self and the wooden-horse self, differences that show that Heracleiteanism is no longer in force in 184–187. They will insist that the view of perception in play in 184–187 is Plato’s own non-Heracleitean view of perception. Thus Burnyeat 1990: 55–56 argues that, since Heracleiteanism has been refuted by 184, “the organs and subjects dealt with [in the Wooden Horse passage] are the ordinary stable kind which continue in being from one moment to the next.” On the other hand, notice that Plato’s equivalent for Burnyeat’s “organs and subjects” is the single word aisthêseis (184d2). On its own, the word can mean either “senses” or “sensings”; but it seems significant that it was the word Plato used at 156b1 for one of the two sorts of Heracleitean “offspring.” Plato speaks of the aisthêseis concealed “as if within a Wooden Horse” as pollai tines (184d1), “indefinitely many.” But while there are indefinitely many Heracleitean sensings, there are not, of course, indefinitely many senses. Indeed even the claim that we have many senses (pollai), rather than several (enioi, tines), does not sound quite right, either in English or in Greek. This is perhaps why most translators, assuming that aisthêseis means “senses,” put “a number of senses” for pollai tines aisthêseis. Perhaps this is a mistake, and what aisthêseis means here is “Heracleitean sensings.” If so, this explains how the aisthêseis inside any given Wooden Horse can be pollai tines.

If the aisthêseis in the Wooden Horse are Heracleitean sensings, not ordinary, un-Heracleitean senses, this supports the Unitarian idea that 184–187 is contrasting Heracleitean perceiving of particulars with Platonic knowing of the Forms (or knowing of particulars via, and in terms of, the Forms).

Another piece of evidence pointing in the same direction is the similarity between Plato’s list of the “common notions” at Theaetetus 186a and closely contemporary lists that he gives of the Forms, such as the list of Forms (likeness, multitude, rest and their opposites) given at Parmenides 129d, with ethical additions at Parmenides 130b. There are also the megista genê (“greatest kinds”) of Sophist 254b–258e (being, sameness, otherness, rest and change); though whether these genê are Forms is controversial.

7. Second Definition (D2): “Knowledge is True Judgement”: 187b–201c

151–187 has considered and rejected the proposal that knowledge is perception. Sometimes in 151–187 “perception” seems to mean “immediate sensory awareness”; at other times it seems to mean “judgements made about immediate sensory awareness.” The proposal that “Knowledge is immediate sensory awareness” is rejected as incoherent: “Knowledge is not to be found in our bodily experiences, but in our reasonings about those experiences” (186d2). The proposal that “Knowledge is judgement about immediate sensory awareness” raises the question how judgements, or beliefs, can emerge from immediate sensory awareness. Answering this question is the main aim in 187–201.

Empiricists claim that sensation, which in itself has no cognitive content, is the source of all beliefs, which essentially have cognitive content—which are by their very nature candidates for truth or falsity. So unless we can explain how beliefs can be true or false, we cannot explain how there can be beliefs at all. Hence Plato’s interest in the question of false belief. What Plato wants to show in 187–201 is that there is no way for the empiricist to construct contentful belief from contentless sensory awareness alone. The corollary is, of course, that we need something else besides sensory awareness to explain belief. In modern terms, we need irreducible semantic properties. In Plato’s terms, we need the Forms.

In pursuit of this strategy of argument in 187–201, Plato rejects in turn five possible empiricist explanations of how there can be false belief. In the First Puzzle (188a–c) he proposes a basic difficulty for any empiricist. Then he argues that no move available to the empiricist circumvents this basic difficulty, however much complexity it may introduce (the other four Puzzles: 188d–201b). The Fifth Puzzle collapses back into the Third Puzzle, and the Third Puzzle collapses back into the First. The proposal that gives us the Fourth Puzzle is disproved by the counter-examples that make the Fifth Puzzle necessary. As for the Second Puzzle, Plato deploys this to show how empiricism has the disabling drawback that it turns an outrageous sophistical argument into a valid disproof of the possibility of at least some sorts of false belief.

Thus 187–201 continues the critique of perception-based accounts of knowledge that 151–187 began. Contrary to what some—for instance Cornford—have thought, it is no digression from the main path of the Theaetetus. On the contrary, the discussion of false belief is the most obvious way forward.

As Plato stresses throughout the dialogue, it is Theaetetus who is caught in this problem about false belief. It is not Socrates, nor Plato. There is clear evidence at Philebus 38c ff. that false belief (at least of some sorts) was no problem at all to Plato himself (at least at some points in his career). Plato’s question is not “How on earth can there be false judgement?” Rather it is “What sort of background assumptions about knowledge must Theaetetus be making, given that he is puzzled by the question how there can be false judgement?”

Is it only false judgements of identity that are at issue in 187–201, or is it any false judgement? One interpretation of 187–201 says that it is only about false judgements of misidentification. Call this view misidentificationism. The main alternative interpretation of 187–201 says that it is about any and every false judgement. Call this view anti-misidentificationism. The present discussion assumes the truth of anti-misidentificationism; see Chappell 2005: 154–157 for the arguments.

I turn to the detail of the five proposals about how to explain false belief that occupy Stephanus pages 187 to 200 of the dialogue.

7.1 The Puzzle of Misidentification: 187e5–188c8

The first proposal about how to explain the possibility of false belief is the proposal that false belief occurs when someone misidentifies one thing as another. To believe or judge falsely is to judge, for some two objects O1 and O2, that O1 is O2.

How can such confusions even occur? Plato presents a dilemma that seems to show that they can’t. The objects of the judgement, O1 and O2, must either be known or unknown to the judger x. Suppose one of the objects, say O1, is unknown to x. In that case, O1 cannot figure in x’s thoughts at all, since x can only form judgements using objects that he knows. So if O1 is not an object known to x, x cannot make any judgement about O1. A fortiori, then, x can make no false judgement about O1 either.

If, on the other hand, both O1 and O2 are known to x, then x can perhaps make some judgements about O1 and O2; but not the false judgement that “O1 is O2.” If x knows O1 and O2, x must know that O1 is O1 and O2 is O2, and that it would be a confusion to identify them. So apparently false belief is impossible if the judger does not know both O1 and O2; but also impossible if he does know both O1 and O2.

I cannot mistake X for Y unless I am able to formulate thoughts about X and Y. But I will not be able to formulate thoughts about X and Y unless I am acquainted with X and Y. Being acquainted with X and Y means knowing X and Y; and anyone who knows X and Y will not mistake them for each other.

Why think this a genuine puzzle? There seem to be plenty of everyday cases where knowing some thing in no way prevents us from sometimes mistaking that thing for something else. One example in the dialogue itself is at 191b (cp. 144c5). It is perfectly possible for someone who knows Socrates to see Theaetetus in the distance, and wrongly think that Theaetetus is Socrates. The First Puzzle does not even get off the ground, unless we can see why our knowledge of X and Y should guarantee us against mistakes about X and Y. Who is the puzzle of 188a–c supposed to be a puzzle for?

Some authors, such as Bostock, Crombie, McDowell, and White, think that Plato himself is puzzled by this puzzle. Thus Crombie 1963: 111 thinks that Plato advances the claim that any knowledge at all of an object O is sufficient for infallibility about O because he fails to see the difference between “being acquainted with X” and “being familiar with X.” But to confuse knowing everything about X with knowing enough about X to use the name ‘X’ is really a very simple mistake. Plato would not be much of a philosopher if he made this mistake.

If (as is suggested in e.g. Chappell 2004, ad loc.) 187–201 is an indirect demonstration that false belief cannot be explained by empiricism (whether this means a developed philosophical theory, or the instinctive empiricism of some people’s common sense), then it is likely that the First Puzzle states the basic difficulty for empiricism, to which the other four Puzzles look for alternative solutions. The nature of this basic difficulty is not fully, or indeed at all, explained by the First Puzzle. We have to read on and watch the development of the argument of 187–201 to see exactly what the problem is that gives the First Puzzle its bite.

7.2 Second Puzzle About False Belief: “Believing What is Not”: 188c10–189b9

The second proposal says that false judgement is believing or judging ta mê onta, “things that are not” or “what is not.” Socrates observes that if “what is not” is understood as it often was by Greek thinkers, as meaning “nothing,” then this proposal leads us straight into the sophistical absurdity that false beliefs are the same thing as beliefs about nothing (i.e., contentless beliefs). But there can be no beliefs about nothing; and there are false beliefs; so false belief isn’t the same thing as believing what is not.

Some think the Second Puzzle a mere sophistry. Bostock 1988: 165 distinguishes two versions of the sophistry: “On one version, to believe falsely is… to believe what is not ‘just by itself’; on the other version, it is to believe what is not ‘about one of the things which are’”. The argument of the first version, according to Bostock, “is just that there is no such thing as what is not (the case); it is a mere nonentity. But just as you cannot perceive a nonentity, so equally you cannot believe one either.” Bostock proposes the following solution to this problem: “We may find it natural to reply to this argument by distinguishing… propositions [from] facts, situations, states of affairs, and so on. Then we shall say that the things that are believed are propositions, not facts… so a false belief is not directed at a non-existent.”

This raises the question whether a consistent empiricist can admit the existence of propositions. At least one great modern empiricist, Quine 1953: 156–7, thinks not. Plato agrees: he regards a commitment to the existence of propositions as evidence of Platonism, acceptance of the claim that abstract objects (and plenty of them) genuinely exist. So an explanation of false judgement that invoked entities called propositions would be unavailable to the sort of empiricist that Plato has in his sights.

Bostock’s second version of the puzzle makes it an even more transparent sophistry, turning on a simple confusion between the “is” of predication and the “is” of existence. As pointed out above, we can reasonably ask whether Plato made this distinction, or made it as we make it.

If the structure of the Second Puzzle is really as Bostock suggests, then the Second Puzzle is just the old sophistry about believing what is not (cp. Parmenides DK 29B8, Euthydemus 283e ff., Cratylus 429d, Republic 477a, Sophist 263e ff.). Moreover, on this interpretation of the Second Puzzle, Plato is committed, in his own person and with full generality, to accepting (at least provisionally) a very bad argument for the conclusion that there can be no false belief. It would be nice if an interpretation of the Second Puzzle were available that saw it differently: e.g., as accepted by him only in a context where special reasons make the Second Puzzle very plausible in that context.

One such interpretation is defended e.g., by Burnyeat 1990: 78, who suggests that the Second Puzzle can only work if we accept the “scandalous analogy between judging what is not and seeing or touching what is not there to be seen or touched”: “A model on which judgements relate to the world in the same sort of unstructured way as perceiving or (we may add) naming, will tie anyone in knots when it comes to the question ‘What is a false judgement the judgement/ name of?’. The only available answer, when the judgement is taken as an unstructured whole, appears to be: Nothing.”

Notice that it is the empiricist who will most naturally tend to rely on this analogy. It is the empiricist who finds it natural to assimilate judgement and knowledge to perception, so far as he can. So we may suggest that the Second Puzzle is a mere sophistry for any decent account of false judgement, but a good argument against the empiricist account of false judgement that Plato is attacking. The moral of the Second Puzzle is that empiricism validates the old sophistry because it treats believing or judging as too closely analogous to seeing: 188e4–7. For empiricism judgement, and thought in general, consists in awareness of the ideas that are present to our minds, exactly as they are present to our minds. It cannot consist in awareness of those ideas as they are not; because (according to empiricism) we are immediately and incorrigibly aware of our own ideas, it can only consist in awareness of those ideas as they are. Nor can judgement consist in awareness of ideas that are not present to our minds, for (according to empiricism) what is not present to our minds cannot be a part of our thoughts. Still less can judgement consist in awareness of ideas that do not exist at all.

The old sophists took false belief as “judging what is not”; they then fallaciously slid from “judging what is not,” to “judging nothing,” to “not judging at all,” and hence concluded that no judgement that was ever actually made was a false judgement. The empiricism that Plato attacks not only repeats this logical slide; it makes it look almost reasonable. The point of the Second Puzzle is to draw out this scandalous consequence.

7.3 Third Puzzle About False Belief: Allodoxia: 189b10–190e4

Literally translated, the third proposal about how to explain the possibility of false belief says that false belief occurs “when someone exchanges (antallaxamenos) in his understanding one of the things that are with another of the things that are, and says is” (189b12–c2).

Perhaps the best way to read this very unclear statement is as meaning that the distinctive addition in the third proposal is the notion of inadvertency. The point of Socrates’ argument is that this addition does not help us to obtain an adequate account of false belief because thought (dianoia) has to be understood as an inner process, with objects that we are always fully and explicitly conscious of. If we are fully and explicitly conscious of all the objects of our thoughts, and if the objects of our thoughts are as simple as empiricism takes them to be, there is simply no room for inadvertency. But without inadvertency, the third proposal simply collapses back into the first proposal, which has already been refuted.

The empiricist conception of knowledge that Theaetetus unwittingly brings forth, and which Socrates is scrutinising, takes the objects of thought to be simple mental images which are either straightforwardly available to be thought about, or straightforwardly absent. The First Puzzle showed that there is a general problem for the empiricist about explaining how such images can be confused with each other, or indeed semantically conjoined in any way at all. The Second Puzzle showed that, because the empiricist lacks clear alternatives other than that someone should have a mental image or lack it, he is wide open to the sophistical argument which identifies believing with having a mental image, and then identifies believing what is with having a mental image, too—and so “proves” the impossibility of false belief. The Third Puzzle restricts itself (at least up to 190d7) to someone who has the requisite mental images, and adds the suggestion that he manages to confuse them by a piece of inadvertency. Socrates’ rejoinder is that nothing has been done to show how there can be inadvertent confusions of things that are as simple and unstructured, and as simply grasped or not grasped, as the empiricist takes mental images to be. Just as speech is explicit outer dialogue, so thought is explicit inner dialogue. What the empiricist needs to do to show the possibility of such a confusion is to explain how, on his principles, either speech or thought can fail to be fully explicit and fully “in touch” with its objects, if it is “in touch” with them at all.

In the discussion of the Fourth and Fifth Puzzles, Socrates and Theaetetus together work out the detail of two empiricist attempts to explain just this. It then becomes clearer why Plato does not think that the empiricist can explain the difference between fully explicit and not-fully-explicit speech or thought. Plato thinks that, to explain this, we have to abandon altogether the empiricist conception of thought as the concatenation (somehow) of semantically inert simple mental images. Instead, we have to understand thought as the syntactic concatenation of the genuine semantic entities, the Forms. Mistakes in thought will then be comprehensible as mistakes either about the logical interrelations of the Forms, or about the correct application of the Forms to the sensory phenomena.

7.4 Fourth Puzzle About False Belief: the Wax Tablet: 190e5–196c5

The Wax Tablet passage offers us a more explicit account of the nature of thought, and its relationship with perception. The story now on offer says explicitly that perception relates to thought roughly as Humean “impressions” relate to Humean “ideas” (191d; compare Hume, First Enquiry II). The objects of perception, as before, are a succession of constantly-changing immediate awarenesses. The objects of thought, it is now added, are those objects of perception to which we have chosen to give a measure of stability by imprinting them on the wax tablets in our minds. (The image of memory as writing in the mind had currency in Greek thought well before Plato’s time: see e.g. Aeschylus, Eumenides 275.)

This new spelling-out of the empiricist account of thought seems to offer new resources for explaining the possibility of false belief. The new explanation can say that false belief occurs when there is a mismatch, not between two objects of thought, nor between two objects of perception, but between one object of each type.

This proposal faces a simple and decisive objection. No one disputes that there are false beliefs that cannot be explained as mismatches of thought and perception: e.g., false beliefs about arithmetic. The Wax Tablet does not explain how such false beliefs happen; indeed it entails that they can’t happen. Such mistakes are confusions of two objects of thought, and the Wax Tablet model does not dispute the earlier finding that there can be no such confusions. So the Wax Tablet model fails.

There is of course plenty more that Plato could have said in criticism of the Wax Tablet model. Most obviously, he could have pointed out the absurdity of identifying any number with any individual’s thought of that number (195e9 ff.); especially when the numerical thought in question is no more than an ossified perception. In the present passage Plato is content to refute the Wax Tablet by the simplest and shortest argument available: so he does not make this point. But perhaps the point is meant to occur to the reader; for the same absurdity reappears in an even more glaring form in the Aviary passage.

7.5 Fifth Puzzle About False Belief: the Aviary: 196d1–200d4

If we had a solution to the very basic problem about how the empiricist can get any content at all out of sensation, then the fourth proposal might show how the empiricist could explain false belief involving perception. The fifth and last proposal about how to explain the possibility of false belief attempts to remedy the fourth proposal’s incapacity—which Plato says refutes it, 196c5–7—to deal with cases of false belief involving no perception, such as false arithmetical beliefs.

It attempts this by deploying a distinction between knowledge that someone merely has (latent knowledge) and knowledge that he is actually using (active knowledge). (Perhaps Plato is now exploring “the intermediate stages between knowing and not knowing” mentioned at 188a2–3.) The suggestion is that false belief occurs when someone wants to use some item of latent knowledge in his active thought, but makes a wrong selection from among the items that he knows latently.

If this proposal worked it would cover false arithmetical belief. But the proposal does not work, because it is regressive. If there is a problem about the very possibility of confusing two things, it is no answer to this problem to suppose that for each thing there is a corresponding item of knowledge, and that what happens when two things are confused is really that the two corresponding items of knowledge are confused (200a–b).

The Aviary rightly tries to explain false belief by complicating our picture of belief. But it complicates in the wrong way and the wrong place. It is no help to complicate the story by throwing in further objects of the same sort as the objects that created the difficulty about false belief in the first place. What is needed is a different sort of object for thought: a kind of object that can be thought of under different aspects (say, as “the sum of 5 and 7,” or as “the integer 12”). There are no such aspects to the “items of knowledge” that the Aviary deals in. As with the conception of the objects of thought and knowledge that we found in the Wax Tablet, it is this lack of aspects that dooms the Aviary’s conception of the objects of knowledge too. Like the Wax Tablet, the Aviary founders on its own inability to accommodate the point that thought cannot consist merely in the presentation of a series of inert “objects of thought.” Whether these objects of thought are mental images drawn from perception or something else, the thinking is not so much in the objects of thought as in what is done with those objects (186d2–4).

We may illustrate this by asking: When the dunce who supposes that 5 + 7 = 11 decides to activate some item of knowledge to be the answer to “What is the sum of 5 and 7?,” which item of knowledge does he thus decide to activate? At first only two answers seem possible: either he decides to activate 12, or he decides to activate 11. If he decides to activate 12, then we cannot explain the fact that what he actually does is activate 11, except by saying that he mistakes the item of knowledge which is 11 for the item of knowledge which is 12. But this mistake is the very mistake ruled out as impossible right at the beginning of the inquiry into false belief (188a–c). Alternatively, if he decides to activate 11, then we have to ask why he decides to do this. The most plausible answer to that question is: “Because he believes falsely that 5 + 7 = 11.” But as noted above, if he has already formed this false belief, within the account that is supposed to explain false belief, then a regress looms.

In fact, the correct answer to the question “Which item of knowledge does the dunce decide to activate?” is neither “12” nor “11.” It is “that number which is the sum of 5 and 7.” But this answer does not save the Aviary theorist from the dilemma just pointed out; for it is not available to him. To be able to give this answer, the Aviary theorist would have to be able to distinguish “that number which is the sum of 5 and 7” from “12.” But since “12” is “that number which is the sum of 5 and 7,” this distinction cannot be made by anyone who takes the objects of thought to be simple in the way that the Aviary theorist seems to.

At 199e1 ff. Theaetetus suggests an amendment to the Aviary. This is that we might have items of ignorance in our heads as well as items of knowledge. As Socrates remarks, these ignorance-birds can be confused with knowledge-birds in just the same way as knowledge-birds can be confused with each other. So the addition does not help.

7.6 The Final Refutation of D2: 200d5–201c7

At 200d–201c Socrates argues more directly against D2. He offers a counter-example to the thesis that knowledge is true belief. A skilled lawyer can bring jurymen into a state of true belief without bringing them into a state of knowledge; so knowledge and true belief are different states.

McDowell 1976: 227–8 suggests that this swift argument “contradicts the most characteristic expositions of the Theory of Forms, which indicate that the title ‘knowledge’ should be reserved for a relation between the mind and the Forms untainted by any reliance on perception.” By contrast Plato here tells us, quite unambiguously, that the jury are persuaded into a state of true belief “about things which only someone who sees them can know” (201b8). This implies that there can be knowledge which is entirely reliant on perception. (One way out of this is to deny that Plato ever thought that knowledge is only of the Forms, as opposed to thinking that knowledge is paradigmatically of the Forms. For this more tolerant Platonist view about perception see e.g. Philebus 58d–62d, and Timaeus 27d ff.)

The jury argument seems to be a counter-example not only to D2 but also to D3, the thesis that knowledge is true belief with an account (provided we allow that the jury “have an account”).

A third problem about the jury argument is that Plato seems to offer two incompatible explanations of why the jury don’t know: first that they have only a limited time to hear the arguments (201b3, 172e1); and second that their judgement is second-hand (201b9).

8. Third Definition (D3): “Knowledge is True Judgement With an Account”: 201d–210a

Theaetetus’ third proposal about how to knowledge is (D3) that it is true belief with an account (meta logou alêthê doxan).

D3 apparently does nothing at all to solve the main problems that D2 faced. Besides the jurymen counter-example just noted, 187–201 showed that we could not define knowledge as true belief unless we had an account of false belief. This problem has not just evaporated in 201–210. It will remain as long as we propose to define knowledge as true belief plus anything. Significantly, this does not seem to bother Plato—as we might expect if Plato is not even trying to offer an acceptable definition of knowledge, but is rather undermining unacceptable definitions.

One crucial question about Theaetetus 201–210 is the question whether the argument is concerned with objectual or propositional knowledge. This is a basic and central division among interpretations of the whole passage 201–210, but it is hard to discuss it properly without getting into the detail of the Dream Theory: see section 8a.

A second question, which arises often elsewhere in the Theaetetus, is whether the argument’s appearance of aporia reflects genuine uncertainty on Plato’s part, or is rather a kind of literary device. Is Plato thinking aloud, trying to clarify his own view about the nature of knowledge, as Revisionists suspect? Or is he using an aporetic argument only to smoke out his opponents, as Unitarians think?

The evidence favours the latter reading. There are a significant number of other passages where something very like Theaetetus’ claim (D3) that knowledge is “true belief with an account” is not only discussed, but actually defended: for instance, Meno 98a2, Phaedo 76b5–6, Phaedo 97d–99d2, Symposium 202a5–9, Republic 534b3–7, and Timaeus 51e5. So it appears that, in the Theaetetus, Plato cannot be genuinely puzzled about what knowledge can be. Nor can he genuinely doubt his own former confidence in one version of D3. If he does have a genuine doubt or puzzle of this sort, it is simply incredible that he should say what he does say in 201–210 without also expressing it.

What Plato does in 201–210 is: present a picture (Socrates’ Dream) of how things may be if D3 is true (201c–202c); raise objections to the Dream theory which are said (206b12) to be decisive (202c–206c); and present and reject three further suggestions about the meaning of logos, and so three more versions of D3 (206c–210a). But none of these four interpretations of D3 is Plato’s own earlier version of D3, which says that knowledge = true belief with an account of the reason why the true belief is true. If what Plato wants to tell us in Theaetetus 201–210 is that he no longer accepts any version of D3, not even his own version, then it is extraordinary that he does not even mention his own version, concentrating instead on versions of D3 so different from Plato’s version as to be obviously irrelevant to its refutation.

Unitarians can suggest that Plato’s strategy is to refute what he takes to be false versions of D3 so as to increase the logical pressure on anyone who rejects Plato’s version of D3. In particular, he wants to put pressure on the empiricist theories of knowledge that seem to be the main target of the Theaetetus. What Plato wants to show is, not only that no definition of knowledge except his own, D3, is acceptable, but also that no version of D3 except his own is acceptable.

8.1 The Dream of Socrates: 201d8–202d7

Rather as Socrates offered to develop D1 in all sorts of surprising directions, so now he offers to develop D3 into a sophisticated theory of knowledge. This theory, usually known as the “Dream of Socrates” or the “Dream Theory,” posits two kinds of existents, complexes and simples, and proposes that “an account” means “an account of the complexes that analyses them into their simple components.” Thus “knowledge of x” turns out to mean “true belief about x with an account of x that analyses x into its simple components.”

Taken as a general account of knowledge, the Dream Theory implies that knowledge is only of complexes, and that there can be no knowledge of simples. Socrates attacks this implication.

A common question about the Dream Theory is whether it is concerned with objectual or propositional knowledge. Those who take the Dream Theory to be concerned with propositional knowledge include Ryle 1990: 27–30: “from 201 onwards Plato concentrates on ‘know’ (connaître): [Socrates’ Dream] is a logician’s theory, a theory about the composition of truths and falsehoods.” Those who take the Dream Theory to be concerned with objectual knowledge include White 1976: 177, and Crombie 1963: II: 41–42; also Bostock 1988. A third way of taking the Dream Theory, which may well be the most promising interpretation, is to take it as a Logical Atomism: as a theory which founds an account of propositional structure on an account of the concatenation of simple objects of experience or acquaintance such as “sense data.”

The Logical-Atomist reading of the Dream Theory undercuts the propositional/objectual distinction. On this reading, the Dream Theory claims that simple, private objects of experience are the elements of the proposition; thus, the Dream Theory is both a theory about the structure of propositions and a theory about simple and complex objects. It claims in effect that a proposition’s structure is that of a complex object made up out of simple objects, where these simple objects are conceived in the Russellian manner as objects of inner perception or acquaintance, and the complexes which they compose are conceived in the phenomenalist manner as (epistemological and/ or semantic) constructs out of those simple objects.

This supposition makes good sense of the claim that we ourselves are examples of complexes (201e2: “the primary elements (prôta stoikheia) of which we and everything else are composed…”). If the Dream theorist is a Logical Atomist, he will think that there is a clear sense in which people, and everything else, are composed out of sense data. He will also think that descriptions of objects, too, are complexes constructed in another way out of the immediately available simples of sensation.

For such a theorist, epistemology and semantics alike rest upon the foundation provided by the simple objects of acquaintance. Both thought and meaning consist in the construction of complex objects out of those simple objects. Philosophical analysis, meanwhile, consists in stating how the complexes involved in thought and meaning are constructed out of simples. This statement involves, amongst other things, dividing down to and enumerating the (simple) parts of such complexes.

What then is the relation of the Dream Theory to the problems posed for empiricism by the discussion of D2 in 187–201? The fundamental problem for empiricism, as we saw, is the problem how to get from sensation to content: the problem of how we could start with bare sense-data, and build up out of them anything that deserved to be called meaning. Plato thinks that there is a good answer to this, though it is not an empiricist answer. Sense experience becomes contentful when it is understood and arranged according to the structures that the Forms give it. So to understand sense experience is, in the truest sense, “to give an account” for it.

The empiricist cannot offer this answer to the problem of how to get from sensation to content without ceasing to be an empiricist. What the empiricist can do is propose that content arises out of sets of sense experiences. We get to the level of belief and knowledge only when we start to consider such sets: before that we are at the level only of perception. Our beliefs, couched in expressions that refer to and quantify over such sets, will then become knowledge (a) when they are true, and (b) when we understand the full story of their composition out of such sets.

If this is the point of the Dream Theory, then the best answer to the question “Whose is the Dream Theory?” is “It belongs to the empiricist whom Plato is attacking.”

8.2 Critique of the Dream Theory: 202d8–206c2

The Dream Theory says that knowledge of O is true belief about O plus an account of O’s composition. If O is not composite, O cannot be known, but only “perceived” (202b6).

Socrates’ main strategy in 202d8–206c2 is to attack the Dream’s claim that complexes and elements are distinguishable in respect of knowability. To this end he deploys a dilemma. A complex, say a syllable, is either (a) no more than its elements (its letters), or (b) something over and above those elements.

202d8–203e1 shows that unacceptable consequences follow from alternative (a), that a complex is no more than its elements. If I am to know a syllable SO, and that syllable is no more than its elements, then I cannot know the syllable SO without also knowing its elements S and O. Indeed, it seems that coming to know the parts S and O is both necessary and sufficient for coming to know the syllable SO. But if that is right, and if the letter/syllable relation models the element/complex relation, then if any complex is knowable, its elements will be knowable too; and if any complex’s elements are unknowable, then the complex will be unknowable too. This result contradicts the Dream Theory.

203e2–205e8 shows that unacceptable consequences follow from alternative (b), that a complex is something over and above its elements. In that case, to know the syllable is to know something for which knowledge of the elements is not sufficient. The syllable turns out to be “a single Idea that comes to be out of the fitted-together elements” (204a1–2). But then the syllable does not have the elements as parts: if it did, that would compromise its singularity. And if the elements are not the parts of the syllable, nothing else can be. So the syllable has no parts, which makes it as simple as an element. Thus if the element is unknowable, the syllable must be unknowable too. This result contradicts the Dream Theory too.

Finally, in 206a1–c2, Plato makes a further, very simple, point against the Dream Theory. Our own experience of learning letters and syllables shows that it is both more basic and more important to know elements than complexes, not vice versa as the Dream Theory implies. The thesis that the complexes are knowable, the elements unknowable, is false to our experience, in which “knowledge of the elements is primary” (Burnyeat 1990:192).

8.3 Three Attempts to Understand Logos: 206c2–210a9

The refutation of the Dream Theory’s attempt to spell out what it might be like for D3 to be true is followed by three attempts to give an account of what a logos is. The first attempt to give an account of “account” takes logos just to mean “speech” or “statement.” This is deemed obviously insufficient (206c1–206e3).

A second attempted explanation of “logos of O” takes it as “enumeration of the elements of O.” The logos is a statement of the elements of the object of knowledge. You have knowledge of something when, in addition to your true belief about it, you are able also to “go through the elements” of that thing.

Plato’s objection to this proposal (208b) is that it leaves open the possibility that someone could count as having knowledge of the name “Theaetetus” even if they could do no more than write out the letters of the name “Theaetetus” in the right order. Since such a person can enumerate the elements of the complex, i.e., the letters of the name (207c8–d1), he has an account. Since he can arrange those letters in their correct order (208a9–10), he also has true belief. For all that, insists Plato, he does not have knowledge of the name “Theaetetus.”

Why not, we might ask? To see the answer we should bring in what Plato says about syllables at 207d8–208a3. Suppose someone could enumerate the letters of “Theaetetus,” and could give their correct order, and yet knew nothing about syllables. This person wouldn’t count as knowing “Theaetetus” because he would have no understanding of the principles that get us from ordered letters to names. Those principles are principles about how letters form syllables, and how syllables form names. A person who can state only the letters of “Theaetetus” and their order has no awareness of these principles.

To put it a modern way, a robot or an automatic typewriter might be able to reproduce or print the letters of “Theaetetus” correctly and in order. It might even be able to store such a correct ordering in its electronic memory. That would not show that such a machine understood how to spell “Theaetetus,” any more than the symbol-manipulating capacities of the man in Searle’s Chinese Room show that he understands Chinese. What is missing is an awareness of bridging or structuring principles, rules explaining how we get from strings of symbols, via syllables, to representations of Greek names.

Knowledge of such bridging principles can reasonably be called knowledge of why the letters of “Theaetetus” are what they are. So it is plausible to suggest that the moral of the argument is to point us to the need for an account in the sense of an explanation “Why?,” and so to the version of D3 that Plato himself accepts.

The third proposed account of logos says that to give the logos of O is to cite the sêmeion or diaphora of O. In the Wax Tablet passage, sêmeion meant ‘imprint’; in the present passage, it means the ‘sign’ or diagnostic feature wherein x differs from everything else, or everything else of O’s own kind. So, presumably, knowledge of (say) Theaetetus consists in true belief about Theaetetus plus an account of what differentiates Theaetetus from every other human.

Socrates offers two objections to this proposal. First, if knowledge of Theaetetus requires a mention of his sêmeion, so does true belief about Theaetetus. Second, to possess “an account of Theaetetus’ sêmeion” must mean either (a) having true belief about that sêmeion, or else (b) having knowledge of it. But it has already been pointed out that any true belief, if it is to qualify as being about Theaetetus at all, must already be true belief about his sêmeion. So interpretation (a) has the result that knowledge of Theaetetus = true belief about Theaetetus’ sêmeion + true belief about Theaetetus’ sêmeion. As for (b): if we want to know what knowledge is, it is no help to be told that knowledge of O = something else + knowledge of the sêmeion of O. We still need to know what knowledge of the sêmeion of O is. Nor will it help us to be launched on a vicious regress: as we will be if we are told that knowledge of the sêmeion of O = something else + knowledge of the sêmeion of the sêmeion of O.

This is where the argument ends, and Socrates leaves to meet his accusers.

9. Conclusion

The Theaetetus is an extended attack on certain assumptions and intuitions about knowledge that the intelligent man-in-the-street—Theaetetus, for instance—might find initially attractive, and which some philosophers known to Plato—Protagoras and Heracleitus, for instance—had worked up into complex and sophisticated philosophical theories. Basic to all these assumptions and intuitions, which here have been grouped together under the name “empiricism,” is the idea that knowledge is constructed out of perception and perception alone.

The first part of the Theaetetus attacks the idea that knowledge could be simply identified with perception. Perceptions alone have no semantic structure. So if this thesis was true, it would be impossible to state it.

The second part attacks the suggestion that knowledge can be defined as true belief, where beliefs are supposed to be semantically-structured concatenations of sensory impressions. Against this Plato argues that, unless something can be said to explain how impressions can be concatenated so as to give them semantic structure, there is no reason to grant that the distinction between true and false applies to such beliefs any more than it does to perceptions.

Finally, in the third part of the Theaetetus, an attempt is made to meet this challenge, and present some explanation of how semantic structures can arise out of mere perceptions or impressions. The proposed explanation is the Dream Theory, a theory interestingly comparable to Russellian Logical Atomism, which takes both propositions and objects to be complexes “logically constructed” out of simple sensory impressions. On this conception, knowledge will come about when someone is capable not only of using such logical constructions in thought, but of understanding how they arise from perception.

Socrates’ basic objection to this theory is that it still gives no proper explanation of how this logical construction takes place. Without such an explanation, there is no good reason to treat the complexes that are thus logically constructed as anything other than simples in their own right. We need to know how it can be that, merely by conjoining perceptions in the right way, we manage to achieve a degree of semantic structure that (for instance) makes it possible to refer to things in the world, such as Theaetetus. But this is not explained simply by listing all the simple perceptions that are so conjoined. Nor—and this is where we reach the third proposal of 208b11–210a9—is it explained by fixing on any of those perceptions in particular, and taking it to be the special mark of Theaetetus whereby reference to Theaetetus is fixed.

The third proposal about how to understand logos faces the difficulty that, if it adds anything at all to differentiate knowledge of O from true belief about O, then what it adds is a diagnostic quality of O. If there is a problem about how to identify O, there is a problem about how to identify the diagnostic quality too. This launches a vicious regress.

One way of preventing this regress is to argue that the regress is caused by the attempt to work up a definition of knowledge exclusively out of empiricist materials. Hence there is no way of avoiding such a vicious regress if you are determined to try to define knowledge on an exclusively empiricist basis. The right response is to abandon that attempt. Knowledge is indeed indefinable in empiricist terms. In those terms, it has no logos. In those terms, therefore, knowledge itself is unknowable.

The official conclusion of the Theaetetus is that we still do not know how to define knowledge. Even on the most sceptical reading, this is not to say that we have not learned anything about what knowledge is like. As Theaetetus says (210b6), he has given birth to far more than he had in him.

And as many interpreters have seen, there may be much more to the ending than that. It may even be that, in the last two pages of the Theaetetus, we have seen hints of Plato’s own answer to the puzzle. Perhaps understanding has emerged from the last discussion, as wisdom did from 145d–e, as the key ingredient without which no true beliefs alone can even begin to look like they might count as knowledge. Perhaps it is only when we, the readers, understand this point—that epistemological success in the last resort depends on having epistemological virtue—that we begin not only to have true beliefs about what knowledge is, but to understand knowledge.


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Other Internet Resources


The authors and SEP editors would like to thank Branden Kosch for noticing a point of Greek grammar in need of correction.

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Sophie-Grace Chappell

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