# Truthlikeness

*First published Wed Jul 11, 2001; substantive revision Thu Jan 30, 2014*

*Truth* is widely held to be the constitutive aim of
inquiry. Even those who think the aim of inquiry is something more
accessible than the truth (such as the empirically discernible truth),
as well as those who think the aim is something more robust than
possessing truth (such as the possession of knowledge) still affirm
truth as a necessary component of the end of inquiry. And, other
things being equal, it seems better to end an inquiry by endorsing
truths rather than falsehoods.

Even if there is something to the thought that inquiry aims at
truth, it has to be admitted that truth is a rather coarse-grained
property of propositions. Some falsehoods seem to realize the aim of
getting at the truth better than others. Some truths better realize
the aim than other truths. And perhaps some falsehoods even realize
the aim better than some truths do. The dichotomy of the class of
propositions into truths and falsehoods needs to be supplemented with
a more fine-grained ordering — one which classifies propositions
according to their *closeness* to the truth, their degree
of *truthlikeness*, or their *verisimilitude*.

We begin with the logical problem of truthlikeness: the problem of
giving an adequate account of the concept and determining its logical
properties. In §1 we lay at the logical problem and various
possible solutions to it. In §1.1 we examine the basic
assumptions which generate the logical problem, which in part explain
why the problem emerged when it did. Attempted solutions to the
problem quickly proliferated, but they can be gathered together under
three broad lines of attack. The first two, the *content
approach* (§1.2) and the *consequence approach*
(§1.3), were both initiated by Popper in his ground-breaking work
and both deliver what he regarded as an essential desideratum for any
theory of truthlikeness — what we will call *the value of
content for truths*. Although Popper's specific proposals did not
capture the intuitive concept, the content and consequence approaches
are still being actively developed and refined. The third,
the *likeness approach* (§1.4), takes the *likeness*
in *truthlikeness* seriously. Assuming likeness relations among
worlds, the likeness of a proposition to the truth would seem to be
some function of the likeness of worlds that make the proposition true
to the actual world. The main problems facing the likeness approach
are outlined in §1.4.1 –§1.4.4.

Given that there are at least three different approaches to the logical problem, a natural question is whether there might be a way of combining the different desiderata that motivate them (§1), thereby incorporating the most desirable features of each. Recent results suggest that unfortunately the three approaches, while not logically incompatible, cannot be fruitfully combined. Any attempt to unify these approaches will have to jettison or radically modify at least one of the motivating desiderata.

There are two further problems of truthlikeness, both of which
presuppose the solution of the logical problem. One is
the *epistemological* problem of truthlikeness (§2). Even
given a suitable solution to the logical problem, there remains a
nagging question about our epistemic access to truthlikeness. The
other is the *axiological* problem. Truth and truthlikeness are
interesting, at least in part because they appear to be *cognitive
values* of some sort. Even if they are not cognitively valuable
themselves, they are closely connected to what is of cognitive
value. The relations between truth, truthlikeness and cognitive value
are explored in §3.

- 1. The Logical Problem
- 2. The Epistemological Problem
- 3. The Axiological Problem
- 4. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Logical Problem

Truth, perhaps even more than beauty and goodness, has been the target
of an extraordinary amount of philosophical dissection and
speculation. This is unsurprising. After all, truth is the
constitutive aim of all inquiry and a necessary condition of
knowledge. And yet (as the redundancy theorists of truth have
emphasized) there is something disarmingly simple about
truth. That *the number of planets is 8* is true just in case,
well, … *the number of planets is 8*. By comparison with
truth, the more complex and much more interesting concept of
truthlikeness has only recently become the subject of serious
investigation.The logical problem of truthlikeness is the problem of
giving a consistent and materially adequate account of the
concept. But before embarking on the project, we have to make it
plausible that there is a coherent concept in the offing to be
investigated.

## 1.1 What's the problem?

The proposition *the number of planets in our solar system is
9* may be false, but quite a bit closer to the truth than the
proposition that *the number of planets in our solar system is 9
billion*. (One falsehood may be closer to the truth than another
falsehood.) The true proposition * the number of the planets is
between 7 and 9 inclusive* is closer to the truth than the true
proposition that *the number of the planets is greater than equal to
0*. (So a truth may be closer to the truth than another truth.)
Finally, with the demotion of Pluto to planetoid status, the
proposition that *the number of the planets is either less than or
greater than 9* may be true but it is arguably not as close to
the *whole* truth of this matter (namely, that there are
precisely 8 planets) as its highly accurate but strictly false
negation: *that there are 9 planets.*

This particular numerical example is admittedly extremely simple, but a wide variety of judgments of relative likeness to truth crop up both in everyday parlance as well as in scientific discourse. While some involve the relative accuracy of claims concerning the value of numerical magnitudes, others involve the sharing of properties, structural similarity, or closeness among putative laws.

Consider a non-numerical example, also highly simplified but quite
topical in the light of the recent rise in status of the concept
of *fundamentality*. Suppose you are interested in the truth
about which particles are fundamental. At the outset of your inquiry
all you know are various logical truths, like the tautology *either
electrons are fundamental or they are not*. Tautologies like these
are pretty much useless in helping you locate the truth about
fundamental particles. Now, suppose that the standard model is
actually on the right tracks. Then learning the that electrons are
fundamental (which we suppose, for the sake of the example, is true)
edges you a little bit closer to your goal. It is by no means the
complete truth about fundamental particles, but surely it is a piece
of it. If you go on to learn that electrons, along with muons and tau
particles, are a kind of lepton and that all leptons are fundamental,
you have presumably edged a little closer.

If this is right, then some truths are closer to the truth about fundamental particles than others.

The discovery that atoms are not fundamental, that they are in fact
composite objects, displaced the earlier hypothesis that *atoms are
fundamental*. For a while the proposition that *protons,
neutrons and electrons are the fundamental components of atoms* was
embraced, but unfortunately it too turned out to be false. Still,
this latter falsehood seems quite a bit closer to the truth than its
predecessor (assuming, again, that the standard model is true). And
even if the standard model contains errors, as surely it does, it is
presumably closer to the truth about fundamental particles than these
other falsehoods. At least, it makes sense to suppose that it might
be.

So again, some falsehoods may be closer to the truth about fundamental particles than other falsehoods.

As we have seen, a tautology is not a terrific truth locator, but if
you moved from the tautology that *electrons either are or are not
fundamental* to embrace the false proposition *that electrons are
not fundamental* you would have moved further from your goal.

So, some truths are closer to the truth than some falsehoods.

But it is by no means obvious that all truths about fundamental
particles are closer to the whole truth than any falsehood. If you
move from the tautology to the false proposition that *electrons,
protons and neutrons are the fundamental components of atoms*, you
may well have taken a step towards the truth.

If this is right, certain falsehoods may be closer to the truth than some truths.

Investigations into the concept of truthlikeness began in earnest with
a tiny trickle of activity in the early nineteen sixties; became
something of a torrent from the mid-seventies until the late eighties;
and is now a relatively steady stream. Why is *truthlikeness*
such a latecomer to the philosophical scene? The reason is simple. It
wasn't until the latter half of the twentieth century that mainstream
philosophers gave up on the Cartesian goal of infallible
knowledge. The idea that we are quite possibility, even probably,
mistaken in our most cherished beliefs, that they might well be
just *false*, was mostly considered tantamount to capitulation
to the skeptic. By the middle of the twentieth century, however, it
was clear that natural science postulated a very odd world behind the
phenomena, one rather remote from our everyday experience, one which
renders many of our commonsense beliefs, as well as previous
scientific theories, strictly speaking, false. Further, the
increasingly rapid turnover of scientific theories suggested that, far
from being established as certain, they are ever vulnerable to
refutation, and typically are eventually refuted, to be replaced by
some new theory. Taking the dismal view, the history of inquiry is a
history of theories shown to be false, replaced by other theories
awaiting their turn at the guillotine. (This is the “dismal
induction”.)

*Realism* holds that the constitutive aim of inquiry is the
truth of some matter. *Optimism* holds that the history of
inquiry is one of progress with respect to its constitutive aim. But
*fallibilism* holds that, typically, our theories are false
or very likely to be false, and when shown to be false they are
replaced by other false theories. To combine all three ideas, we must
affirm that some false propositions better realize the goal of truth
— are closer to the truth — than others. So the
optimistic realist who has discarded infallibilism has a problem
— the logical problem of truthlikeness.

Before exploring possible solutions to the logical problem a couple of common confusions should be cleared away. Truthlikeness should not be conflated with either epistemic probability or with vagueness.

One common mistake is to conflate truthlikeness with vagueness.
Suppose vagueness is not an epistemic phenomenon, and that it can be
explained by treating truth and falsehood as extreme points on a scale
of distinct truth values. Even if there are vagueness-related
“degrees of truth”, ranging from *clearly true*
through to *clearly false*, they should not be confused with
degrees of closeness to the truth. To see this, suppose Alan is
exactly 179 cm tall. Then the proposition that *Alan is exactly
178.5 cm tall* should turn out to be *clearly false* on any
good theory of vagueness. Nevertheless it is pretty close to the
truth. That *Alan is tall*, on the other hand, is a vague claim,
one that in the circumstances is neither clearly true nor clearly
false. However, since it closer to the clearly true end of the
spectrum, it has a high (vagueness-related) degree of truth.
Still, *Alan is tall* is not as close to the truth as the quite
precise, but nevertheless clearly false proposition that *Alan is
exactly 178.5 cm tall*. So closeness to the truth and
vagueness-related degrees of truth (if there are such) can also pull
in different directions.

Neither does truthlikeness — likeness to the *whole
truth* of some matter — have much to do with high
probability. The probability that *the number of planets is greater
than or equal to 0* is maximal but not terribly close to the whole
truth. Suppose some non-tautological true propositions can be known
for certain — call their conjunction *the evidence*. Then
any truth that goes beyond the evidence will be less probable than the
evidence. However truths that go beyond the evidence might well be
closer to the whole truth than the evidence is. The true proposition
which goes most beyond the evidence is the strongest possible truth
— it is *the truth, the whole truth and nothing but the
truth*. And that true proposition is clearly the one that is
closest to the whole truth. So the truth with the least probability on
the evidence is the proposition that is closest to the whole
truth.

What, then, is the source of the widespread conflation of
truthlikeness with probability? Probability — at least of the
epistemic variety — measures the degree of *seeming to be
true*, while truthlikeness measures the degree of *being similar
to the truth*. *Seeming* and *being similar* might
at first strike one as closely related, but of course they are very
different. *Seeming* concerns the appearances whereas
*being similar* concerns the objective facts, facts about
similarity or likeness. Even more important, there is a difference
between being true and being the truth. The truth, of course, has the
property of being true, but not every proposition that is true is the
truth in the sense of the aim of inquiry. The truth of a matter at
which an inquiry aims is ideally the complete, true answer to its
central query. Thus there are two dimensions along which probability
(seeming to be true) and truthlikeness (being similar to the truth)
differ radically.

While a multitude of apparently different solutions to the problem
have been proposed, they can be classified them into three main
approaches, each with its own heuristic — the *content*
approach, the *consequence* approach and the *likeness*
approach.

## 1.2 The content approach

Karl Popper was the first philosopher to take the logical problem of truthlikeness seriously enough to make an assay on it. This is not surprising, since Popper was also the first prominent realist to embrace a very radical fallibilism about science while also trumpeting the epistemic superiority of the enterprise.

According to Popper, Hume had shown not only that we can't verify any
interesting theory, we can't even render it more probable. Luckily,
there is an asymmetry between verification and falsification. While no
finite amount of data can verify or probabilify any interesting
scientific theory, they can falsify the theory. According to Popper,
it is the falsifiability of a theory which makes it scientific, the
more falsifiable the better. In his early work, he implied that the
only kind of progress an inquiry can make consists in falsification of
theories. This is a little depressing, to say the least. What it lacks
is the idea that a succession of falsehoods can constitute genuine
cognitive progress. Perhaps this is why, for many years after first
publishing these ideas in his 1934 *Logik der Forschung* Popper
received a pretty short shrift from the philosophers. If all we can
ever .say with confidence is “Missed again!” and “A
miss is as good as a mile!”, and the history of inquiry is a
sequence of such misses, then epistemic pessimism pretty much
follows. Popper eventually realized that this naive falsificationism
is compatible with optimism provided we have an acceptable notion of
verisimilitude (or truthlikeness). If some false hypotheses are closer
to the truth than others, if verisimilitude admits of degrees, then
the history of inquiry may well turn out to be one of progress towards
the goal of truth. Moreover, it may be reasonable, on the basis of the
evidence, to conjecture that our theories are indeed making such
progress even though we know they are all false, or highly likely to
be false.

Popper saw clearly that the concept of truthlikeness should not be confused with the concept of epistemic probability, and that it has often been so confused. (See Popper 1963 for a history of the confusion.) Popper's insight here was undoubtedly facilitated by his deep but largely unjustified antipathy to epistemic probability. He thought his starkly falsificationist account favored bold, contentful theories. Degree of informative content varies inversely with probability — the greater the content the less likely a theory is to be true. So if you are after theories which seem, on the evidence, to be true, then you will eschew those which make bold — that is, highly improbable — predictions. On this picture, the quest for theories with high probability is simply wrongheaded.

To see this distinction clearly, and to articulate it, was one of Popper's most significant contributions, not only to the debate about truthlikeness, but to philosophy of science and logic in general. As we will see, however, his deep antagonism to probability combined with his passionate love affair with boldness was both a blessing and a curse. The blessing: it led him to produce not only the first interesting and important account of truthlikeness, but to initiate a whole approach to the problem — the content approach (Zwart 2001). The curse: content alone is insufficient to characterize truthlikeness.

Popper made the first real assay on the logical problem of
truthlikeness in his famous collection *Conjectures and
Refutations*. Since he was a great admirer of Tarski's assay on
the concept of truth, he strove to model his theory of truthlikeness
on Tarski's theory. First, let a matter for investigation be
circumscribed by a formalized language *L* adequate for
discussing it. Tarski showed us how the actual world induces a
partition of sentences of *L* into those that are true and those
that are false. The set of all true sentences is thus a complete true
account of the world, as far as that investigation goes. It is aptly
called the Truth, *T*.
*T* is the target of the investigation couched in L. It is the
theory that we are seeking, and, if truthlikeness is to make sense,
theories other than *T*, even false theories, come more or
less close to capturing *T*.

*T*, the Truth, is a theory only in the technical Tarskian
sense, not in the ordinary everyday sense of that term. It is a set of
sentences closed under the consequence relation: a consequence of some
sentences in the set is also a sentence in the set. *T* may not
be finitely axiomatizable, or even axiomatizable at all. Where the
language involves elementary arithmetic it follows (from Gödel's
incompleteness theorem) that *T* won't be
axiomatizable. However, it is a perfectly good set of sentences all
the same. In general we will follow the Tarski-Popper usage here and
call any set of sentences closed under consequence a *theory*,
and we will assume that each proposition we deal with is identified
with the theory it generates in this sense. (Note that when theories
are classes of sentences, theory *A* logically entails theory
*B* just in case *B* is a subset of *A*.)

The complement of *T*, the set of false sentences *F*,
is not a theory even in this technical sense. Since falsehoods always
entail truths, *F* is not closed under the consequence
relation. (This is part of the reason we have no complementary
expression like *the Falsth*. The set of false sentences does
not describe a possible alternative to the actual world.) But
*F* too is a perfectly good set of sentences. The consequences
of any theory *A* that can be formulated in L will thus divide
its consequences between *T* and *F*. Popper called the
intersection of *A* and *T*, the *truth content*
of *A* (*A _{T}*), and
the intersection of

*A*and

*F*, the

*falsity content*of

*A*(

*A*). Any theory

_{F}*A*is thus the union of its non-overlapping truth content and falsity content. Note that since every theory entails all logical truths, these will constitute a special set, at the center of

*T*, which will be included in every theory, whether true or false.

Diagram 1: Truth and falsity contents of false theoryA

A false theory will cover some of *F*, but because every false
theory has true consequences, it will also overlap with some of
*T* (Diagram 1).

A true theory, however, will only cover *T* (Diagram 2):

Diagram 2: True theoryAis identical to its own truth content

Amongst true theories, then, it seems that the more true sentences
that are entailed, the closer we get to *T*, hence the more
truthlike. Set theoretically that simply means that, where *A*
and
*B* are both true, *A* will be more truthlike than
*B* just in case *B* is a proper subset of *A*
(which for true theories means that *B _{T}* is a proper subset of

*A*). Call this principle:

_{T}*the value of content for truths*.

Diagram 3: True theoryAhas more truth content than true theoryB

This essentially syntactic account of truthlikeness has some nice
features. It induces a partial ordering of truths, with the whole
Truth *T* at the top of the ordering: *T* is closer to
the Truth than any other true theory. The set of logical truths is at
the bottom: further from the Truth than any other true theory. In
between these two extremes, true theories are ordered simply by
logical strength: the more logical content, the closer to the Truth.
Since probability varies inversely with logical strength, amongst
truths the theory with the greatest truthlikeness (*T*) must
have the smallest probability, and the theory with the largest
probability (the logical truth) is the furthest from the Truth.
Popper made a bold and simple generalization of this. Just as truth
content (coverage of *T*) counts in favor of truthlikeness,
falsity content (coverage of *F*) counts against. In general
then, a theory A is closer to the truth if it has more truth content
without engendering more falsity content, or has less falsity content
without sacrificing truth content (diagram 4):

Diagram 4: False theoryAcloser to the Truth than false theoryB

The generalization of the truth content comparison also has some nice
features. It preserves the comparisons of true theories mentioned
above. The truth content *A _{T}*
of a false theory

*A*(itself a theory in the Tarskian sense) will clearly be closer to the truth than

*A*(diagram 1). More generally, a true theory

*A*will be closer to the truth than a false theory

*B*provided

*A*'s truth content exceeds

*B*'s.

Despite these nice features the account has a couple of disastrous
consequences. Firstly, since a falsehood has some false consequences,
and no truth has any, it follow that no falsehood can be as close to
the truth as a logical truth — the weakest of all truths. A
logical truth leaves the location of the truth wide open, so it is
practically worthless as an approximation to the whole truth. So on
Popper's account a falsehood is never more worthwhile than a worthless
logical truth. (We could call this result *the absolute
worthlessness of falsehoods*.

Furthermore, it is impossible to add a true consequence to a false
theory without thereby adding additional false consequences (or
subtract a false consequence without subtracting true
consequences). So the account entails that no false theory is closer
to the truth than any other. We could call this result *the
relative worthlessness of all falsehoods*. These worthlessness
results were proved independently by Pavel Tichý and David
Miller (Miller 1974, and Tichý 1974).

It is instructive to see why this latter result holds. Let us suppose
that *A* and *B* are both false, and that *A*'s
truth content exceeds *B*'s. Let *a* be a true sentence
entailed by
*A* but not by *B*. Let *f* be any falsehood
entailed by A. Since *A* entails both *a* and
*f* the conjunction, *a*&*f* is a falsehood
entailed by *A*, and so part of *A*'s falsity content.
If *a*&*f* were also part of *B*'s falsity
content *B* would entail both *a* and *f*. But
then it would entail *a* contrary to the assumption. Hence
*a*&*f* is in *A*'s falsity content and not
in *B*'s. So *A*'s truth content cannot exceeds
*B*'s without *A*'s falsity content also exceeding
*B*'s. Suppose now that *B*'s falsity content exceeds
*A*'s. Let *g* be some falsehood entailed by *B*
but not by *A*, and let *f*, as before, be some
falsehood entailed by *A*. The sentence
*f*→*g* is a truth, and since it is
entailed by *g*, is in *B*'s truth content. If it were
also in *A*'s then both *f* and
*f*→*g* would be consequences of
*A* and hence so would *g*, contrary to the assumption.
Thus *A*'s truth content lacks a sentence,
*f*→*g*, which is in *B*'s. So
*B*'s falsity content cannot exceeds *A*'s without
*B*'s truth content also exceeding *A*'s. The
relationship depicted in diagram 4 simply cannot obtain.

It is tempting at this point (and Popper was so tempted) to retreat
to something like the comparison of truth contents alone. That is to
say, *A* is as close to the truth as *B* if *A*
entails all of *B*'s truth content, and *A* is closer
to the truth than *B* just in case *A* is at least as
close as *B*, and *B* is not at least as close as
*A*. Call this the *Simple Truth Content account*.

This Simple Truth Content account preserves Popper's ordering of true
propositions. However, it also deems a false proposition the closer to
the truth the stronger it is. (Call this principle: *the value of
content for falsehoods*.) According to this principle, since the
false proposition that *there are seven planets, and all of them
are made of green cheese* is logically stronger than the false
proposition that *there are seven planets* the former is closer
to the truth than the latter. So, once we know a theory is false we
can be confident that tacking on any old arbitrary proposition, no
matter how misleading it is, will lead us inexorably closer to the
truth. Amongst false theories, *brute logical strength* becomes
the sole criterion of a theory's likeness to truth. This is
the *brute strength* objection.

Popper also dabbled in some *measures* of verisimilitude, based
on measures of content, which in turn he derived from measures of
logical probability (somewhat ironically, given his dim view of
logical probability). Unfortunately his measures suffered from defects
very similar to his purely qualitative proposals.

After the failure of Popper's attempts to capture the notion of
truthlikeness, a number of variations on the content approach have
been explored. Some stay within Popper's essentially syntactic
paradigm, comparing classes of true and false sentences (e.g. Newton
Smith 1981). Others make the switch to a more semantic paradigm,
searching for a plausible theory of *distance* between the
semantic content of sentences, construing these semantic contents as
classes of possibilities. A variant of this approach takes the class
of models of a language as a surrogate for possible states of affairs
(Miller 1978a). The other utilizes a semantics of incomplete possible
states like those favored by structuralist accounts of scientific
theories (Kuipers 1987b). The idea which these share in common is that
the distance between two propositions is measured by the *symmetric
difference* of the two sets of possibilities. Roughly speaking,
the larger the symmetric difference, the greater the distance between
the two propositions. Symmetric differences might be compared
qualitatively – by means of set-theoretic inclusion - or
quantitatively, using some kind of probability measure. Both can be
shown to have the general features of a measure of distance.

If the truth is taken to be given by a complete possible world (or
perhaps represented by a unique model) then we end up with results
rather close to the truncated version of Popper's account, comparing
by truth contents alone (Oddie 1978). In particular, amongst both
truths and falsehoods, one proposition is closer to the truth than
another the stronger it is. However, if we take the structuralist
approach then we will take the relevant possibilities to be
“small” states of affairs — small *chunks* of
the world, rather than an entire world — and then the
possibility of more fine-grained distinctions between theories opens
up. A rather promising exploration of this idea can be found in Volpe
1995.

The fundamental problem with the original content approach lies not in the way it has been articulated, but rather in the basic underlying assumption: that truthlikeness is a function of just two variables — content and truth value. This assumption has a number of rather problematic consequences.

Two things follow if truthlikeness is a function just of the logical
content of a proposition and of its truth value. Firstly, any given
proposition *A* can have only two degrees of verisimilitude:
one in case it is false and the other in case it is true. This is
obviously wrong. A theory can be false in very many different ways.
The proposition that *there are eight planets* is false whether
there are nine planets or a thousand planets, but its degree of
truthlikeness is much higher in the first case than in the latter. As
we will see below, the degree of truthlikeness of a true theory may
also vary according to where the truth lies. Secondly, if we combine
the value of content for truths and the value of content for
falsehoods, then if we fix truth value, verisimilitude will vary only
according to amount of content. So, for example, two equally strong
false theories will have to have the same degree of verisimilitude.
That's pretty far-fetched. That *there are ten planets* and
that *there are ten billion planets* are (roughly) equally
strong, and both are false in fact, but the latter seems much further
from the truth than the former.

Finally, how might strength determine verisimilitude amongst false
theories? There seem to be just two plausible candidates: that
verisimilitude increases with increasing strength (the principle of
the value of content for falsehoods) or that it decreases with
increasing strength (the principle of the disvalue of content for
falsehoods). Both proposals are at odds with attractive judgements and
principles. One does not necessarily make a step toward the truth by
reducing the content of a false proposition. The proposition
that *the moon is made of green cheese* is logically stronger
than the proposition that *either the moon is made of green cheese
or it is made of dutch gouda*, but the latter hardly seems a step
towards the truth. Nor does one necessarily make a step toward the
truth by increasing the content of a false theory. The false
proposition that *all heavenly bodies are made of green cheese*
is logically stronger than the false proposition *all heavenly
bodies orbiting the earth are made of green cheese* but it doesn't
seem to be an improvement.

## 1.3 The Consequence Approach

Popper crafted his initial proposal in terms of the true and false consequences of a theory. Any sentence at all that follows from a theory is counted as a consequence that, if true, contributes to its overall truthlikeness, and if false, detracts from that. But it has struck many that this both involves an enormous amount of double counting, and that it is the indiscriminate counting of arbitrary consequences that lies behind the Tichý-Miller trivialization result.

Consider a very simple framework with three primitive
sentences: *h* (for the state *hot*), *r* (for
*rainy*) and *w* (for *windy*). This framework
generates a very small space of eight possibilities. The eight maximal
conjunctions of the three primitive sentences express those
possibilities.

Suppose that in fact it is hot, rainy and windy (expressed by the
maximal conjunction *h*&*r*&*w*). Then
the claim that it is cold, dry and still (expressed by the sentence
~*h*&~*r*&~*w*) is further from the truth
than the claim that it is cold, rainy and windy (expressed by the
sentence ~*h*&*r*&*w*). And the claim
that it is cold, dry and windy (expressed by the sentence
~*h*&~*r*&*w*) is somewhere between the
two. These kinds of judgements, which seem both innocent and
intuitively correct, Popper's theory cannot accommodate. And if they
are to be accommodated we cannot treat all true and false consequences
alike. For the three false claims mentioned here have exactly the same
number of true and false consequences.

Clearly, if we are going to measure closeness to truth by counting
true and false consequences, some true consequences have to count more
than others if we are to discriminate amongst them. For
example, *h* and *r* are both true, and ~*h* and
~*r* are false. The former should surely count in favor of a
claim, and the latter against. But ~*h*→~*r* is
true and *h*→~*r* is false. After we have counted
the truth *h* in favor of a claim's truthlikeness and the
falsehood ~*r* against it, should we also count the true
consequence ~*h*→~*r* in favor, and the
falsehood *h*→~*r* against? Surely this is both
unnecessary and misleading. And it is precisely counting sentences
like these that renders Popper's account, in terms of all true and
false consequences, susceptible to the Tichý-Miller
argument.

According to the consequence approach, Popper was right in thinking
that truthlikeness depends on the relative sizes of classes of true
and false consequences, but erred in thinking that all consequences of
a theory count the same. Some consequences are *relevant*,
some aren't. Let *R* be some criterion of relevance of
consequences; let *A _{R}* be the set
of

*relevant*consequences of

*A*. Whatever the criterion

*R*is it has to satisfy the constraint that

*A*be recoverable from (and hence equivalent to )

*A*. Popper's account is the limiting one — all consequences are relevant. (Popper's relevance criterion is the empty one,

_{R}*P*, according to which

*A*is just

_{P}*A*itself.) The

*relevant truth content of A*(abbreviated

*A*) can be defined as

_{R}^{T}*A*∩

_{R}*T*(or

*A∩T*), and similarly the

_{R}*relevant falsity content of A*can be defined as

*A*∩

_{R}*F*. Since

*A*= (

_{R}*A*∩

_{R}*T*)∪(

*A*∩

_{R}*F*) it follows that the union of true and false relevant consequences of

*A*is equivalent to

*A*. And where

*A*is true

*A*∩

_{R}*F*is empty, so that A is equivalent to

*A*∩

_{R}*T*alone.

With this restriction to relevant consequences we can basically apply Popper's definitions: one theory is more truthlike than another if its relevant truth content is larger and its relevant falsity content no larger; or its relevant falsity content is smaller, and its relevant truth content is no smaller.

Although this basic idea was first explored by Mortensen in his 1983,
explicitly using a notion of *relevant entailment*, by the end
of his paper Mortensen had abandoned the basic idea as unworkable, at
least within the framework of standard relevant logics. Others,
however, have used the relevant consequence approach to avoid the
trivialization results that plague the content approach, and capture
quite a few of the basic intuitive judgments of truthlikeness.
Subsequent proposals within the broad program have been offered by
Burger and Heidema 1994, Schurz and Weingartner 1987 and 2010, and
Gemes 2007. (Gerla also uses the notion of the relevance of a
“test” or factor, but his account is best located more
squarely within the likeness approach.)

One possible relevance criterion that
the *h*-*r*-*w* framework might suggest
is *atomicity*. (See Cevolani, Festa and Kuipers 2013) for an
approach along these lines.) But even if we could avoid the problem of
saying what it is for a sentence to be atomic, since many distinct
propositions imply the same atomic sentences, this criterion would not
satisfy requirement that *A* be equivalent
to *A _{R}*. For example, (

*h*∨

*r*) and (~

*h*∨~

*r*), like tautologies, imply no atomic sentences at all.

Burger and Heidema 1994 compare theories by positive and negative
sentences. A positive sentence is one that can be constructed out of
&, ∨and any true basic sentence (where a basic sentence is
either an atomic sentence or its negation). A negative sentence is
one that can be constructed out of &, ∨ and any false basic
sentence. Call a sentence *pure* if it is either positive or
negative. If we take the relevance criterion to be *purity*,
and combine that with the relevant consequence schema above, we have
Burger and Heidema's proposal, which yields a reasonable set intuitive
judgments like those above. Unfortunately purity (like atomicity)
does not quite satisfy the constraint that *A* be equivalent to
the class of its relevant consequences. For example, if *h*
and *r* are both true then (~*h*∨*r*) and
(*h*∨~*r*) both have the same pure consequences
(namely, none).

Schurz and Weingartner 2010 use the following notion of
relevance *S*: being equivalent to a disjunction of atomic
propositions or their negations. With this criterion they can
accommodate a range of intuitive judgments in the simple weather
framework that Popper's account cannot.

For example, where >_{S} is the relation
of *greater S-truthlikeness* we capture the following
relations among false claims, which, on Popper's account, are mostly
incommensurable:

(h&~r) >_{S}(~r) >_{S}(~h&~r).

and

(h∨r) >_{S}(~r) >_{S}(~h∨~r) >_{S}(~h&~r).

The relevant consequence approach faces three major hurdles.

The first is an extension problem: the approach does produce some intuitively acceptable results in a finite propositional framework, but it needs to be extended to more realistic frameworks — for example, first-order and higher-order frameworks. Gemes's recent proposal in his 2007 is promising in this regard. More research is required to demonstrate its adequacy.

The second is that, like Popper's original proposal, it judges no false proposition to be closer to the truth than any truth, including logical truths. Schurz and Weingartner have answered this objection by extending their qualitative account to a quantitative account, by assigning weights to relevant consequences and summing. The problem with this is that it assumes finite consequence classes.

The third involves the language-dependence of any adequate relevance criterion. This problem will be outlined and discussed below in connection with the likeness approach (§1.4.4).

## 1.4 The Likeness Approach

In the wake of the collapse of Popper's articulation of the content
approach two philosophers, working quite independently, suggested a
radically different approach: one which takes the *likeness* in
truthlikeness seriously (Tichý 1974, Hilpinen 1976). This shift
from content to likeness was also marked by an immediate shift from
Popper's essentially syntactic approach (something it shares with the
consequence program) to a semantic approach, one which trafficks in
the contents of sentences.

Traditionally the semantic contents of sentences have been taken to be
non-linguistic, or rather non-syntactic, items —
*propositions*. What propositions are is, of course, highly
contested, but most agree that a proposition carves the class of
possibilities into two sub-classes — those in which the
proposition is true and those in which it is false. Call the class of
worlds in which the proposition is true its *range*. Some have
proposed that propositions be *identified* with their ranges
(for example, David Lewis, in his 1986). This identification is
implausible since, for example, the informative content of
*7+5=12* seems distinct from the informative content of
*12=12*, which in turn seems distinct from the informative
content of Gödel's first incompleteness theorem – and yet all
three have the same range. They are all true in all possible worlds.
Clearly if semantic content is supposed to be sensitive to
informative content, classes of possible worlds will not be
discriminating enough. We need something more fine-grained for a full
theory of semantic content.

Despite this, the range of a proposition is certainly an important
aspect of informative content, and it is not immediately obvious why
truthlikeness should be sensitive to differences in the way a
proposition picks out its range. (Perhaps there are cases of logical
falsehoods some of which seem further from the truth than others. For
example *7+5=113* might be considered further from the truth
than *7+5=13* though both have the same range — namely,
the empty set of worlds. See Sorenson 2007.) But as a first
approximation to the concept, we will assume that it is not
hyperintensional and that logically equivalent propositions have the
same degree of truthlikess. The proposition that *the number of
planets is eight* for example, should have the same degree of
truthlikeness as the proposition that *the square of the number of
the planets is sixty four*.

There is also not a little controversy over the nature of possible
worlds. One view — perhaps Leibniz's and more recently David
Lewis's — is that worlds are maximal collections of possible
*things*. Another — perhaps the early Wittgenstein's
— is that possible worlds are complete possible *ways for
things to be*. On this latter state-conception, a world is a
complete distribution of properties, relations and magnitudes over
the appropriate kinds of entities. Since invoking “all” properties,
relations and so on will certainly land us in paradox, these
distributions, or possibilities, are going to have to be relativized
to some circumscribed array of properties and relations. Call the
complete collection of possibilities, given some array of features,
the *logical space*, and call the array of properties and
relations which underlie that logical space, the *framework* of
the space.

Familiar logical relations and operations correspond to well-understood set-theoretic relations and operations on ranges. The range of the conjunction of two proposition is the intersection of the ranges of the two conjuncts. Entailment corresponds to the subset relation on ranges. The actual world is a single point in logical space — a complete specification of every matter of fact (with respect to the framework of features) — and a proposition is true if its range contains the actual world, false otherwise. The whole Truth is a true proposition that is also complete: it entails all true propositions. The range of the Truth is none other than the singleton of the actual world. That singleton is the target, the bullseye, the thing at which the most comprehensive inquiry is aiming.

Without additional structure on the logical space we have just three factors for a theorist of truthlikeness to work with — the size of a proposition (content factor), whether it contains the actual world (truth factor), and which propositions it implies (consequence factor). The likeness approach requires some additional structure to the logical space. For example, worlds might be more or less like other worlds. There might be a betweenness relation amongst worlds, or even a fully-fledged distance metric. If that's the case we can start to see how one proposition might be closer to the Truth — the proposition whose range singles out the actual world — than another. The core of the likeness approach is that the truthlikeness of a proposition supervenes on the likeness between worlds, or the distance between worlds.

The likeness theorist has two initial tasks: firstly, making it plausible that there is an appropriate likeness or distance function on worlds; and secondly, extending likeness between individual worlds to likeness of propositions (i.e. sets of worlds) to the actual world.

Diagram 5: Verisimilitude by similarity circles

Suppose, for example, that worlds are arranged in similarity spheres nested around the actual world, familiar from the Stalnaker-Lewis approach to counterfactuals. Consider Diagram 5.

The bullseye is the actual world and the small sphere which includes
it is *T*, the Truth. The nested spheres represent likeness to
the actual world. A world is less like the actual world the larger
the first sphere of which it is a member. Propositions *A* and
*B* are false, *C* and *D* are true. A carves
out a class of worlds which are rather close to the actual world
— all within spheres two to four — whereas *B*
carves out a class rather far from the actual world — all
within spheres five to seven. Intuitively *A* is closer to the
bullseye than is *B*.

The largest sphere which does not overlap at all with a proposition
is plausibly a measure of how close the proposition is to being true.
Call that the *truth factor*. A proposition *X* is
closer to being true than *Y* if the truth factor of
*X* is included in the truth factor of *Y*. The truth
factor of *A*, for example, is the smallest non-empty sphere,
*T* itself, whereas the truth factor of *B* is the
fourth sphere, of which *T* is a proper subset.

If a proposition includes the bullseye then of course it is true
simpliciter, it has the maximal truth factor (the empty set). So all
true propositions are equally close to being true. But truthlikeness
is not just a matter of being close to being true. The tautology,
*D*, *C* and the Truth itself are equally true, but in
that order they increase in their closeness to the whole truth.

Taking a leaf out of Popper's book, Hilpinen argued that closeness to the whole truth is in part a matter of degree of informativeness of a proposition. In the case of the true propositions, this correlates roughly with the smallest sphere which totally includes the proposition. The further out the outermost sphere, the less informative the proposition is, because the larger the area of the logical space which it covers. So, in a way which echoes Popper's account, we could take truthlikeness to be a combination of a truth factor (given by the likeness of that world in the range of a proposition that is closest to the actual world) and a content factor (given by the likeness of that world in the range of a proposition that is furthest from the actual world):

Ais closer to the truth thanBif and only ifAdoes as well asBon both truth factor and content factor, and better on at least one of those.

Applying Hilpinen's definition we capture two more particular
judgements, in addition to those already mentioned, that seem
intuitively acceptable: that *C* is closer to the truth than
*A*, and that *D* is closer than *B*. (Note,
however, that we have here a partial ordering: *A* and
*D*, for example, are not ranked.) We can derive from this
various apparently desirable features of the relation *closer to
the truth*: for example, that the relation is transitive,
asymmetric and irreflexive; that the Truth is closer to the Truth than
any other theory; that the tautology is at least as far from the Truth
as any other truth; that one cannot make a true theory worse by
strengthening it by a truth (a weak version of the value of content
for truths); that a falsehood is not necessarily improved by adding
another falsehood, or even by adding another truth (a repudiation of
the value of content for falsehoods).

But there are also some worrying features here. While it avoids the relative worthlessness of falsehoods, Hilpinen's account, just like Popper's, entails the absolute worthlessness of all falsehoods: no falsehood is closer to the truth than any truth. So, for example, Newton's theory is deemed to be no more truthlike, no closer to the whole truth, than the tautology.

Characterizing Hilpinen's account as a combination of a truth factor
and an information factor seems to mask its quite radical departure
from Popper's account. The incorporation of similarity spheres
signals a fundamental break with the pure content approach, and opens
up a range of possible new accounts: what such accounts have in
common is that the truthlikeness of a proposition is a
*non-trivial function of the likeness to the actual world of
worlds in the range of the proposition*.

There are three main problems for any concrete proposal within the likeness approach. The first concerns an account of likeness between states of affairs – in what does this consist and how can it be analyzed or defined? The second concerns the dependence of the truthlikeness of a proposition on the likeness of worlds in its range to the actual world: what is the correct function? (This can be called “the extension problem”.) And finally, there is the famous problem of “translation variance” or “framework dependence” of judgements of likeness and of truthlikeness. This last problem will be taken up in §1.4.4.

### 1.4.1 Likeness of worlds in a simple propositional framework

One objection to Hilpinen's proposal (like Lewis's proposal for counterfactuals) is that it assumes the similarity relation on worlds as a primitive, there for the taking. At the end of his 1974 paper Tichý not only suggested the use of similarity rankings on worlds, but also provided a ranking in propositional frameworks and indicated how to generalize this to more complex frameworks.

Examples and counterexamples in Tichý 1974 are exceedingly
simple, utilizing the little propositional framework introduced above,
with three primitives — *h* (for the
state *hot*), *r* (for
*rainy*) and *w* (for *windy*).

Corresponding to the eight-members of the logical space generated by distributions of truth values through the three basic conditions, there are eight maximal conjunctions (or constituents):

w _{1}h&r&ww _{5}~ h&r&ww _{2}h&r&~ww _{6}~ h&r&~ww _{3}h&~r&ww _{7}~ h&~r&ww _{4}h&~r&~ww _{8}~ h&~r&~w

Worlds differ in the distributions of these traits, and a natural,
albeit simple, suggestion is to measure the likeness between two
worlds by the number of agreements on traits. This is tantamount to
taking distance to be measured by the size of the symmetric difference
of generating states — the so-called city-block measure. As is
well known, this will generate a genuine metric, in particular
satisfying the triangular inequality. If w_{1} is the actual
world this immediately induces a system of nested spheres, but one in
which the spheres come with numbers attached:

Diagram 6: Similarity circles for the weather space

Those worlds orbiting on the sphere *n* are of distance
*n* from the actual world.

In fact the structure of the space is better represented not by similarity circles, but rather but rather by a three-dimensional cube:

Diagram 7: The three-dimensional weather space

This way of representing the space makes a clearer connection between distances between worlds and the role of the atomic propositions in generating those distances through the city-block metric. It also eliminates inaccuracies in the relations between the worlds that are not at the center that the similarity circle diagram suggests.

### 1.4.2 The likeness of a proposition to the truth

Now that we numerical distances between worlds, numerical measures of
propositional likeness to, and distance from, the truth can be defined
as some function of the distances, from the actual world, of worlds in
the range of a proposition. But which function is the right one? This
is the * extension problem *.

Suppose, once more, that *h*&*r*&*w*
is the whole truth about the matter of the weather. Following
Hilpinen's lead, we might consider overall distance of a propositions
from the truth to be some function of the distances from actuality of
two extreme worlds. Let *truth*(*A*) be the truth value
of *A* in the actual world. Let *min*(*A*) be the
distance from actuality of that world in *A* closest to the
actual world, and *max*(*A*) be the distance from actuality
of that world in *A* furthest from the actual world.

Atruth(A)min(A)max(A)h&r&wtrue 0 0 h&rtrue 0 1 h&r&~wfalse 1 1 htrue 0 2 h&~rfalse 1 2 ~ hfalse 1 3 ~ h&~r&wfalse 2 2 ~ h&~rfalse 2 3 ~ h&~r&~wfalse 3 3 Table 1: Theminandmaxfunctions.

The simplest proposal (made first in Niiniluoto 1977) would be to
take the average of these two quantities might (call this
measure *min-max-average*). This would remedy a rather glaring
shortcoming which Hilpinen's qualitative proposal shares with Popper's
original proposal, namely that no falsehood is closer to the truth
than any truth (even the worthless tautology). This numerical
equivalent of Hilpinen's proposal renders all propositions comparable
for truthlikeness, and some falsehoods it deems more truthlike than
some truths.

But now that we have distances between all worlds, why take only the extreme worlds in a proposition into account? Why shouldn't every world in a proposition potentially count towards its overall distance from the actual world?

A simple measure which does count all worlds is average distance
from the actual world. *Average* delivers all of the particular
judgements we used above to motivate Hilpinen's proposal in the first
place, and in conjunction with the simple metric on worlds it delivers
the following ordering of propositions in our simple framework:

Atruth(A)average(A)h&r&wtrue 0 h&rtrue 0.5 h&r&~wfalse 1.0 htrue 1.3 h&~rfalse 1.5 ~ hfalse 1.7 ~ h&~r&wfalse 2.0 ~ h&~rfalse 2.5 ~ h&~r&~wfalse 3.0 Table 2: theaveragefunction.

This ordering look quite promising. Propositions are closer to
the truth the more they get the basic weather traits right, further
away the more mistakes they make. A false proposition may be made
either worse or better by strengthening (~*w* is the same
distance from the Truth as ~*h*;
*h*&*r*&~*w* is better than ~*w*
while ~*h*&~*r*&~*w* is worse). A false
proposition (like *h*&*r*&~*w*) can be
closer to the truth than some true propositions (like *h*).

These judgments may be sufficient to show that average is superior
to *min-max-average*), at least on this group of propositions,
but they are clearly not sufficient to show that averaging is the
right procedure. What we need are some straightforward and compelling
general desiderata which jointly yield a single correct function. In
the absence of such a proof, we can only resort to case by case
comparisons.

Atruth(A)average(A)h∨ ~r∨wtrue 1.4 h∨ ~rtrue 1.5 h∨ ~htrue 1.5 Table 3:averageviolates the value of content for truths.

Furthermore *average* has by no means found universal favor
on the score of particular judgments either. Notably, there are pairs
of true propositions such that the average measure deems the stronger
of the two to be the further from the truth. According to the average
measure, the tautology, for example, is not the true proposition
furthest from the truth. Averaging thus violates the Popperian
principle of the value of content for truths (Popper 1976).

Atruth(A)sum(A)h&r&wtrue 0 h&rtrue 1 h&r&~wfalse 1 htrue 4 h&~rfalse 3 ~ hfalse 8 ~ h&~r&wfalse 2 ~ h&~rfalse 5 h&~r&~wfalse 3 Table 4: thesumfunction.

Consider the *sum* function — the sum of the distances
of worlds in the range of a proposition from the actual world.

The *sum* function is an interesting measure in its own right,
though no one has proposed it as a stand-alone account of closeness to
truth. Although *sum*, like *average* is sensitive to the
distances of all worlds in a proposition from the actual world, it is
not plausible as a measure of distance from the truth.
What *sum* does measure is a special kind logical weakness. In
general the weaker a proposition is, the larger its *sum*
value. But adding words far from the actual world makes the *sum*
value larger than adding worlds closer in. This guarantees, for
example, that of two truths the *sum* of the logically weaker is
always greater than the *sum* of the stronger. Thus *sum*
might play a role in capturing the value of content for truths. But
it also delivers the implausible value of content for falsehoods. If
you think that there is anything to the likeness program it is hardly
plausible that the falsehood
~*h*&~*r*&~*w* is closer to the truth
than its consequence ~*h*. Niiniluoto argues that *sum*
is a good likeness-based candidate for measuring Hilpinen's
“information factor”. It is obviously much more sensitive
than is *max* to the proposition's informativeness about the
location of the truth.

Atruth(A)min-sum-average(A)h&r&wtrue 0 h&rtrue 0.5 h&r&~wfalse 1 htrue 2 h&~rfalse 2 ~ hfalse 4.5 ~ h&~r&wfalse 2 ~ h&~rfalse 3.5 ~ h&~r&~wfalse 3 Table 5: Themin-sum-averagefunction.

Niiniluoto thus proposes, as a measure of distance from the truth, the
average of this information factor and Hilpinen's truth factor:
*min-sum-average*. Averaging the more sensitive information
factor (*sum*) and the closeness-to-being-true factor
(*min*) yields some interesting results. For example, this
measure deems *h*&*r*&*w* more truthlike
than *h*&*r*, and the latter more truthlike than
*h*. And in general *min-sum-average* delivers the value
of content for truths. For any two truths the *min* factor is the
same (0), and the *sum* factor increases as content decreases.
Furthermore, unlike the symmetric difference measures,
*min-sum-average* doesn't deliver the objectionable value of
contents for falsehoods. For example,
~*h*&~*r*&~*w* is deemed further from the
truth than ~*h*. But *min-sum-average* is not quite home
free. For example from an intuitive point of view. For example,
~*h*&~*r*&~*w* is deemed closer to the
truth than ~*h*&~*r*. This is because what
~*h*&~*r*&~*w* loses in closeness to the
actual world (*min*) it makes up for by an increase in strength
(*sum*).

In deciding how to proceed here we confront a methodological problem. The methodology favored by Tichý is very much bottom-up. For the purposes of deciding between rival accounts it takes the intuitive data very seriously. Popper (along with Popperians like Miller) favor a more top-down approach. They are deeply suspicious of folk intuitions, and sometimes appear to be in the business of constructing a new concept rather than explicating an existing one. They place enormous weight on certain plausible general principles, largely those that fit in with other principles of their overall theory of science: for example, the principle that strength is a virtue and that the stronger of two true theories (and maybe even of two false theories) is the closer to the truth. A third approach, one which lies between these two extremes, is that of reflective equilibrium. This recognizes the claims of both intuitive judgements on low-level cases, and plausible high-level principles, and enjoins us to bring principle and judgement into equilibrium, possibly by tinkering with both. Neither intuitive low-level judgements nor plausible high-level principles are given advance priority. The protagonist in the truthlikeness debate who has argued most consistently for this approach is Niiniluoto.

How might reflective equilibrium be employed to help resolve the
current dispute? Consider a different space of possibilities,
generated by a single magnitude like the number of the planets
(N). Suppose that N is in fact 8 and that the further *n* is from
8, the further the proposition that N=*n* from the
Truth. Consider three sets of propositions. In the left-hand column we
have a sequence of false propositions which, intuitively, decrease in
truthlikeness while increasing in strength. In the middle column we
have a sequence of corresponding true propositions, in each case the
strongest true consequence of its false counterpart on the left
(Popper's “truth content”). Again members of this sequence
steadily increase in strength. Finally on the right we have another
column of falsehoods. These are also steadily increasing in strength,
and like the left-hand falsehoods, seem (intuitively) to be decreasing
in truthlikeness as well.

Falsehood (1)Strongest True ConsequenceFalsehood (2)10 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=8 or 10 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=9 or 10 ≤ N ≤ 20 11 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=8 or 11 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=9 or 11 ≤ N ≤ 20 …… …… …… 19 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=8 or 19 ≤ N ≤ 20 N=9 or 19 ≤ N ≤ 20 N = 20 N=8 or N = 20 N=9 or N = 20 Table 6

Judgements about the closeness of the true propositions in the center
column to the truth may be less intuitively clear than are judgments
about their left-hand counterparts. However, it would seem highly
incongruous to judge the truths in table 4 to be steadily increasing
in truthlikeness, while the falsehoods both to the left and the right,
both marginally different in their overall likeness relations to
truth, steadily decrease in truthlikeness. This suggests that that all
three are sequences of steadily increasing strength combined with
steadily *decreasing* truthlikeness. And if that's right, it
might be enough to overturn Popper's principle that amongst true
theories strength and truthlikeness must covary (even while granting
that this is not so for falsehoods).

If this argument is sound, it removes an objection to averaging distances, but it does not settle the issue in its favor, for there may still be other more plausible counterexamples to averaging that we have not considered.

Schurz and Weingartner argue that this extension problem is the main defect of the likeness approach:

“the problem of extending truthlikeness from possible worlds to propositions is intuitively underdetermined. Even if we are granted an ordering or a measure of distance on worlds, there are many very different ways of extending that to propositional distance, and apparently no objective way to decide between them.” (Schurz and Weingartner 2010, 423)

One way of answering this objection head on is to identify principles that, given a distance function on worlds, constrain the distances between worlds and sets of worlds, principles perhaps powerful enough to identify a unique extension. (An argument of this kind is considered in §1.5.)

### 1.4.3 Likeness in more complex frameworks

Simple propositional examples are convenient for the purposes of illustration, but what the likeness approach needs is some evidence that it can transcend such simple examples. (Popper's content approach, whatever else its shortcomings, can be applied in principle to theories expressible in any language, no matter how sophisticated.) Can the likeness program be generalized to arbitrarily complex frameworks? For example, does the idea extend even to first-order frameworks the possible worlds of which may well be infinitely complex?

There is no straightforward, natural or obvious way to construct
distance or likeness measures on worlds considered as non-denumerably
infinite collections of basic or “atomic” states. But a
fruitful way of implementing the likeness approach in frameworks that
are more interesting and realistic than the toy propositional weather
framework, involves cutting the space of possibilities down into
manageable chunks. This is not just an *ad hoc* response to the
difficulties imposed by infinite states, but is based on a principled
view of the nature of inquiry — of what constitutes
an *inquiry*, a *question*, a *query*, a *cognitive
problem*, or a *subject matter*. Although these terms might
seem to signify quite different notions they all have something deep
in common.

Consider the notion of a *query* or a *question*. Each
well-formed question *Q* receives an answer in each complete
possible state of the world. Two worlds are *equivalent* with
respect to the question *Q* if they receive the *same*
answer in both worlds. Given that *Q* induces an equivalence
relation on worlds, the question partitions the logical space into a
set of mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive cells:
{*C*_{1}, *C*_{2},
... , *C*_{i}, ...}. Each
cell *C*_{i} is a complete possible answer to the
question *Q*. And each *incomplete* answer to *Q* is
tantamount to the union, or disjunction, of some collection of the
complete answers. For example, the question *what is the number of
the planets?* partitions the set of worlds into those in which N=0,
those in which N=1, ..., and so on. The question *what is the state
of the weather?* (relative to our three toy factors) partitions the
set of worlds into those in which is hot, rainy and windy, those in
which it is hot, rainy and still, ... and so on. (See Oddie 1986a.)
In other words, the so-called “worlds” in the simple
weather framework are in fact surrogates for large classes of worlds,
and in each such class the answer to the coarse-grained weather
question is the same. The elements of this partition are all complete
answers to the weather question, and distances between the elements of
the partition can be handled rather easily as we have seen.
Essentially the same idea can be applied to much more complex
questions.

Niiniluoto characterizes the notion of a *cognitive problem*
in the same way, as a partition of a space of possibilities. And this
same explication has been remarkably fruitful in clarifying the
notions of *aboutness* and of a *subject matter* (Oddie
1986a, Lewis 1988).

Each inquiry is based on some question that admits of a range of
possible complete answers, which effect a partition
{*C*_{1}, *C*_{2},
... , *C*_{n}, ...} of the space of worlds.
Incomplete answers to the question are equivalent to disjunctions of
those complete answers which entail the incomplete answer. Now, often
there is a rather obvious measure of distance between the elements of
such partitions, which can be extended to a measure of distance of an
arbitrary answer (whether complete or partial) from the true
answer.

One rather promising source of natural partitions (Tichý
1976, Niiniluoto 1977) are Hintikka's *distributive normal
forms* (Hintikka 1963). These are smooth generalizations of the
familiar maximal conjunctions of propositional frameworks used
above. What corresponds to the maximal conjunctions are known
as *constituents*, which, like maximal conjunctions in the
propositional case, are jointly exhaustive and mutually
exclusive. Constituents lay out, in a very perspicuous manner, all the
different ways individuals can be related to each other—
relative, of course, to some collection of basic attributes. (These
correspond to the collection of atomic propositions in the
propositional case.) The basic attributes can be combined by the
usual boolean operations into complex attributes which are also like
the maximal conjunctions, in that they form a partition of the class
of individuals. These complex predicates are
called *Q*-predicates in the simple monadic case,
and *attributive constituents* in the more general case.
Constituents specify, for each member in this set of mutually
exclusive and jointly exhaustive complex attributes, whether or not
that complex attribute is exemplified.

In the simplest case a framework of three basic monadic attributes
(*F*,*G* and *H*) gives rise to eight complex
attributes: — Carnap's *Q*-predicates:

Q_{1}F(x)&G(x)&H(x),

Q_{2}F(x)&G(x)&~H(x)…

Q_{8}~F(x)&~G(x)&~H(x)

The simplest constituents run through these *Q* – predicates
(or *attributive constituents*) specifying for each one whether
or not it is instantiated.

C_{1}∃xQ_{1}(x) & ∃xQ_{2}(x) & ... & ∃xQ_{7}(x) & ∃xQ_{8}(x)

C_{2}∃xQ_{1}(x) & ∃xQ_{2}(x) & ... & ∃xQ_{7}(x) & ~∃xQ_{8}(x)…

C_{255}~∃xQ_{1}(x) & ~∃xQ_{2}(x) & ... & ~∃xQ_{7}(x) & ∃xQ_{8}(x)

C_{256}~∃xQ_{1}(x) & ~∃xQ_{2}(x) & ... & ~ ∃xQ_{7}(x) & ~∃xQ_{8}(x)

In effect the partition induced by the set constituents corresponds
to the question: *Which Q-predicates are instantiated*? A
complete answer to that question will specify one of the constituents,
an incomplete answer will specify a disjunction of such.

Note that the last constituent in this listing,
*C*_{256}, is logically inconsistent. Given that the set
of *Q*-predicates is jointly exhaustive, each individual has to
satisfy one of them, so at least one of them has to be
instantiated. Once such inconsistent constituents are omitted, every
sentence in a monadic language (without identity or constants) is
equivalent to a disjunction of a unique set of these constituents. (In
the simple monadic case here there is only one inconsistent
constituent, but in the general case there are many inconsistent
constituents. Identifying inconsistent constituents is equivalent to
the decision problem for first-order logic.)

For example, the sentence
∀x(*F*(*x*)&*G*(*x*)&*H*(*x*))
is logically equivalent to:

C_{64}∃xQ_{1}(x) & ~ ∃xQ_{2}(x) & ... & ~∃xQ_{7}(x) & ~ ∃xQ_{8}(x).

The sentence
∀x(~*F*(*x*)&*G*(*x*)&*H*(*x*))
is logically equivalent to:

C_{128}~∃ xQ_{1}(x) & ∃xQ_{2}(x) & ~∃xQ_{1}(x) & ... & ~∃xQ_{7}(x) & ~∃xQ_{8}(x).

The sentence
∀x(~*F*(*x*)&~*G*(*x*)&~*H*(*x*))
is logically equivalent to:

C_{255}~∃xQ_{1}(x) & ~∃xQ_{2}(x) & ... &~ ∃xQ_{7}(x) & ∃xQ_{8}(x).

More typically, a sentence is equivalent to disjunction of constituents. For example the sentence ∀x(*G*(*x*)&*H*(*x*)) is logically equivalent to:

C_{64}∨C_{128}.

And the sentence
∀x(*F*(*x*)∨*G*(*x*)∨*H*(*x*))
is logically equivalent to:

C_{1}∨C_{2}∨ ... ∨C_{253}∨C_{254}.

Before considering whether distributive normal forms (disjunctions of constituents) can be generalized to more complex and interesting frameworks (involving relations and greater quantificational complexity) it is worth thinking about how to define distances between these constituents, since they are the simplest of all.

If we had a good measure of distance between constituents then presumably the distance of some disjunction of constituents from one particular constituent could be obtained using the right extension function (§1.4.2) whatever that happens to be. And then the distance of an arbitrary expressible proposition from the truth could be defined as the distance of its normal form from the true constituent.

As far as distances between constituents go, there is an obvious
generalization of the city-block (or symmetric difference) measure on
the corresponding maximal conjunctions (or propositional
constituents): namely, the size of the *symmetric difference* of
the sets of *Q*-predicates associated with each constituent. So,
for example, since *C*_{1} and *C*_{2}
differ on the instantiation of just one *Q*-predicate
(namely*Q*_{8}) the distance between them would be 1. At
the other extreme, since *C*_{2}
and *C*_{255} disagree on the instantiation of
every *Q*-predicate, the distance between them is 8
(maximal).

Niiniluoto first proposed this as the appropriate distance measure
for these constituents in his 1977, and since he found a very similar
proposal in Clifford, he called it the *Clifford measure*. Since
it is based on symmetric differences it yields a function that
satisfies the triangular inequality (the distance between *X*
and *Z* is no greater than the sum of the distances
between *X* and *Y* and *Y* and *Z*).

Note that on the Clifford measure the distance
between *C*_{64} (which says that *Q*_{1} is
the only instantiated *Q*-predicate) and *C*_{128}
(which says that *Q*_{2} is the only
instantiated *Q*-predicate) is the same as the distance
between *C*_{64} and *C*_{255} (which says
that *Q*_{8} is the only
instantiated *Q*-predicate).

C_{255}~∃xQ_{1}(x) & ~∃xQ_{2}(x) & ... & ~∃xQ_{7}(x) & ∃xQ_{8}(x)

*C*_{64} says that everything has *F*, *G*
and *H*; *C*_{128}, that everything has
~*F*, *G* and *H*; *C*_{255}, that
everything has ~*F*, ~*G* and ~*H*. If the likeness
intuitions in the weather framework have anything to them,
then *C*_{128} is closer to *C*_{64}
than *C*_{255} is. Tichý (1976 and 1978) captured
this intuition by first measuring the distances
between *Q*-predicates using the city-block measure. Then the
basic idea is to extend this distances between sets
of *Q*-predicates by identifying the “minimal routes”
from one set of such *Q*-predicates to another. The distance
between two sets of *Q*-predicates is the distance along some
minimal route.

Suppose that two normal forms feature the same number of constituents.
That is, the two sets of *Q*-predicates associated with two
constituents are the same size. Let a *linkage* be any 1-1
mapping from one set to the other. Let the *breadth* of the
linkage be the average distance between linked items. Then according
to Tichý the distance between two constituents (or their
associated sets of *Q*-predicates) is the breadth of the
narrowest linkage between them. If one constituent *C* contains
more *Q*-predicates than the other then a linkage is defined as a
surjection from the larger set to the smaller set, and the rest of the
definition is the same.

This idea certainly captures the intuition concerning the relative
distances between *C*_{128}, *C*_{64}
and *C*_{255}. But it suffers the following defect: it
does not satisfy the triangular inequality. This is because in a
linkage between sets with different numbers of members,
some *Q*-predicates will be unfairly represented, thereby
possibly distorting the intuitive distance between the sets. This can
be remedied, however, by altering the account of a linkage to make
them *fair*. The details need not detain us here (for those see
Oddie 1986a) but in a fair linkage each *Q*-predicate in a
constituent receives the same weight in the linkage as it possesses in
the constituent itself.

The simple Clifford measure ignores the distances between
the *Q*-predicates, but it can be modified and refined in various
ways to take account of such distances (see Niiniluoto 1987).

Hintikka showed that the distributive normal form theorem can be
generalized to first-order sentences of any degree of relational or
quantificational complexity. Any sentence of a first-order sentence
comes with a certain quantificational *depth* —the number
of its overlapping quantifiers. So, for example, analysis in the
first-order idiom would reveal that (1) is a depth-1 sentence; (2) is
a depth-2 sentence; and (3) is a depth-3 sentence.

(1) Everyone loves himself.

(2) Everyone who loves another is loved by the other.

(3) Everyone who loves another loves the other's lovers.

We could call a proposition *depth-d* if the shallowest depth
at which it can be expressed is *d*. Hintikka showed how to
define both attributive constituents and constituents of
depth-*d* recursively, so that every depth-*d*
proposition can be expressed by a disjunction of a unique set of
(consistent) depth-*d* constituents.

Constituents can be
represented as finite tree-structures, the nodes of which are all like
*Q*-predicates – that is, strings of atomic formulas either
negated or unnegated. Consequently, if we can measure distance between
such *trees* we will be well down the path of measuring the
truthlikeness of depth-*d* propositions – it will be some
function of the distance of constituents in its normal form from the
true depth-d constituent. And we can measure the distance between such
trees using the same idea of a minimal path from one to the other.
This too can be spelt out in terms of fair linkages between trees,
thus guaranteeing the triangular inequality.

This program for defining distance between expressible propositions has proved quite flexible and fruitful, delivering a wide range of intuitively appealing results, at least in simple first-order cases. And the approach can be further refined – for example, by means of Carnap's concept of a family of properties.

There are yet more extension problems for the likeness program. First-order theories can be infinitely deep — that is to say, there is no finite depth at which such a theory theory can be expressed. The very feature of first-order constituents that makes them manageable — their finite structure — ensures that they cannot express propositions that are not finitely axiomatizable in a first-order language. Clearly it would be desirable for an account of truthlikeness to be able, in principle, to rank propositions that go beyond the expressive power of first-order sentences. First-order sentences lack the expressive power of first-order theories in general, and first-order languages lack the expressive resources of higher-order languages. A theory of truthlikeness that applies only to first-order sentences, while not a negligible achievement, would still have limited application.

There are plausible ways of extending the normal-form approach to these more complex cases. The relative truthlikeness of infinitely deep first-order propositions can be captured by taking limits as depth increases to infinity (Oddie 1978, Niiniluoto 1987). And Hintikka's normal form theorem, along with suitable measures of distance between higher-order constituents, can be extended to embrace higher-order languages (These higher-order “permutative constituents” are defined in Oddie 1986a and a normal form theorem proved.) Since there are propositions that are only expressible by a non-finitely axiomatizable theory in first-order logic that can be expressed by a single sentence of higher-order logic this greatly expands the reach of the normal-form approach.

Although scientific progress sometimes seems to consist in the accumulation facts about the existence of certain kinds of individuals (witness the recent excitement evoked by the discovery of the Higgs boson, for example) mostly the scientific enterprise is concerned with causation and laws of nature. L. J. Cohen has accused the truthlikeness program of completely ignoring this aspect of the aim of scientific inquiry.

… the truth or likeness to truth that much of science pursues is of a rather special kind – we might call it ‘physically necessary truth’ (Cohen 1980, 500)

The discovery of instances of new kinds (as well as the inability to find them when a theory predicts that they will appear under certain circumstances) is generally welcomed because of the light such discoveries throw on the structure of the laws of nature. The trouble with first-order languages is that they lack adequate resources to represent genuine laws. Extensional first-order logic embodies the Humean thesis that there are no necessary connections between distinct existences. At best first-order theories can capture pervasive, but essentially accidental, regularities.

There are various ways of modeling laws. According to the theory of laws favored by Tooley 1977 and Armstrong 1983, laws of nature involve higher-order relations between first-order universals. These, of course, can be represented easily in a higher-order language (Oddie 1982). But one might also capture lawlikeness in a first-order modal language supplemented with sentential operators for natural necessity and natural possibility (Niiniluoto 1983). And an even simpler representation in terms of nomic conjunctions in a propositional framework, which utilizes the simple city-block measure on partial constituents, has recently been developed in Cevolani, Festa and Kuipers 2012.

Another problem for the normal-form approach involves the fact that most interesting theories in science are not expressible in frameworks generated by basic properties and relations alone, but rather require continuous magnitudes — world-dependent functions from various entities to numbers. All the normal-form based accounts (even those developed for the higher-order) are for systems that involve basic properties and relations, but exclude basic functions. Of course, magnitudes can be finitely approximated by Carnap's families of properties, and relations between those can be represented in higher-order frameworks, but if those families are infinite then we lose the finitude characteristic of regular constituents. Once we lose those finite representations of states, the problem of defining distances becomes intractable again.

There is a well-known way of reducing *n*-argument functions
to *n*+1-place relations. One could represent a magnitude
of *n*-tuples of objects as a relation between *n* objects
and numbers. One would have to include the set of real or complex
numbers in the domain of individuals, or else have multiple domains at
the lowest level. However, not only is that a somewhat *ad hoc*
solution to the problem, but no interesting applications based on such
a reduction have been explored. So each space has to be treated
differently and the resulting theory lacks a certain unity. It would
clearly be preferable to be able to give a unified treatment with
different applications. It would also be preferable to be able to
treat basic magnitudes on a par with basic properties and relations in
the generation of logical space. Niiniluoto (in his 1987) showed how
to extend the likeness approach to functional spaces (see also
Kieseppa 1996) but so far there is no good extension of the
distributive normal-form approach that both combines functions with
properties and relations, and reduces the infinite complexity that
these generate to finite or manageable proportions. Until such an
account is forthcoming, the normal form approach does not provide a
comprehensive theory of closeness to truth.

The problem of complexity might force a reconsideration of the methodology here. Instead of trying to define specific distance measures in a bottom-up piecemeal way, a more modest, more tractable, top-down approach might be to posit the existence of a (possibly partial) relation of likeness on worlds, satisfying various plausible structural features and desirable principles. Assuming these principles are consistent, this would in turn determine a class of numerical distance functions (all those that represent or realize them). Plausible principles could then be explored to narrow the class of admissible likeness functions. This idea is developed a little further in §1.5. But before we go there the most important objection to the likeness approach needs to be addressed.

### 1.4.4 The framework dependence of likeness

The single most powerful and influential argument against the whole likeness approach is the charge that it is “language dependent” or “framework dependent” (Miller 1974a, 1975 a, 1976, and most recently defended, vigorously as usual, in his 2006). Early formulations of the likeness approach (Tichý 1974, 1976, Niiniluoto 1976) proceeded in terms of syntactic surrogates for their semantic correlates — sentences for propositions, predicates for properties, constituents for partitions of the logical space, and the like. The question naturally arises, then, whether we obtain the same measures if all the syntactic items are translated into an essentially equivalent language — one capable of expressing the same propositions and properties with a different set of primitive predicates. Newton's theory can be formulated with a variety of different primitive concepts, but these formulations are typically taken to be equivalent. If the degree of truthlikeness of Newton's theory were to vary from one such formulation to another, then while such a concept might still might have useful applications, it would hardly help to vindicate realism.

Take our simple weather-framework above. This trafficks in three
primitives — *hot*, *rainy*, and *windy*.
Suppose, however, that we define the following two new weather
conditions:

minnesotan=_{df}hotif and only ifrainy

arizonan=_{df}hotif and only ifwindy

Now it appears as though we can describe the same sets of weather
states in an *h*-*m*-*a*-ese based on these
conditions.

h-r-w-eseh-m-a-eseTh&r&wh&m&aA~ h&r&w~ h&~m&~aB~ h&~r&w~ h&m&~aC~ h&~r&~w~ h&m&aTable 7

If *T* is the truth about the weather then theory *A*,
in *h*-*r*-*w*-ese, seems to make just one error
concerning the original weather states, while *B* makes two
and *C* makes three. However, if we express these two theories
in *h*-*m*-*a*-ese however, then this is
reversed: *A* appears to make three errors and *B*
still makes two and *C* makes only one error. But that means
the account makes truthlikeness, unlike truth, radically
language-relative.

There are two live responses to this criticism. But before detailing
them, note a dead one: the similarity theorist cannot object that
*h*-*m*-*a* is somehow logically inferior to
*h*-*r*-*w*, on the grounds that the primitives
of the latter are essentially “biconditional” whereas the primitives
of the former are not. This is because there is a perfect symmetry
between the two sets of primitives. Starting within
*h*-*m*-*a*-ese we can arrive at the original
primitives by exactly analogous definitions:

rainy=_{df}hotif and only ifminnesotan

windy=_{df}hotif and only ifarizonan

Thus if we are going to object to
*h*-*m*-*a*-ese it will have to be on other than
purely logical grounds.

Firstly, then, the similarity theorist could maintain that certain predicates (presumably “hot”, “rainy” and “windy”) are primitive in some absolute, realist, sense. Such predicates “carve reality at the joints” whereas others (like “minnesotan” and “arizonan”) are gerrymandered affairs. With the demise of predicate nominalism as a viable account of properties and relations this approach is not as unattractive as it might have seemed in the middle of the last century. Realism about universals is certainly on the rise. While this version of realism presupposes a sparse theory of properties — that is to say, it is not the case that to every definable predicate there corresponds a genuine universal — such theories have been championed both by those doing traditional a priori metaphysics of properties (e.g. Bealer 1982) as well as those who favor a more empiricist, scientifically informed approach (e.g. Armstrong 1978, Tooley 1977). According to Armstrong, for example, which predicates pick out genuine universals is a matter for developed science. The primitive predicates of our best fundamental physical theory will give us our best guess at what the genuine universals in nature are. They might be predicates like electron or mass, or more likely something even more abstruse and remote from the phenomena — like the primitives of String Theory.

One apparently cogent objection to this realist solution is that it would render the task of empirically estimating degree of truthlikeness completely hopeless. If we know a priori which primitives should be used in the computation of distances between theories it will be difficult to estimate truthlikeness, but not impossible. For example, we might compute the distance of a theory from the various possibilities for the truth, and then make a weighted average, weighting each possible true theory by its probability on the evidence. That would be the credence-mean estimate of truthlikeness. However, if we don't even know which features should count towards the computation of similarities and distances then it appears that we cannot get off first base.

To see this consider our simple weather frameworks. Suppose that all
I learn is that it is rainy. Do I thereby have some grounds for
thinking *A* is closer to the truth than *B*? I would
if I also knew that *h*-*r*-*w*-ese is the
language for calculating distances. For then, whatever the truth is,
*A* makes one fewer mistake than *B* makes. *A*
gets it right on the rain factor, while *B* doesn't, and they
must score the same on the other two factors whatever the truth of
the matter. But if we switch to *h*-*m*-*a*-ese
then *A*'s epistemic superiority is no longer guaranteed. If,
for example, *T* is the truth then *B* will be closer
to the truth than *A*. That's because in the
*h*-*m*-*a* framework raininess as such doesn't
count in favor or against the truthlikeness of a proposition.

This objection would fail if there were empirical indicators
not just of which atomic states obtain, but also of which are the
genuine ones, the ones that really reality at the joints.
Obviously the framework would have to contain more than just
*h*, *m* and *a*. It would have to contain
resources for describing the states that indicate whether these were
genuine universals. Maybe whether they enter into genuine causal
relations will be crucial, for example. Once we can distribute
probabilities over the candidates for the real universals, then we
can use those probabilities to weight the various possible distances
which a hypothesis might be from any given theory.

The second live response is both more modest and more radical. It is
more modest in that it is not hostage to the objective priority of a
particular conceptual scheme, whether that priority is accessed a
*priori* or *a posteriori*. It is more radical in that it denies a
premise of the invariance argument that at first blush is apparently
obvious. It denies the equivalence of the two conceptual schemes. It
denies that *h*&*r*&*w*, for example,
expresses the very same proposition as
*h*&*m*&*a* expresses. If we deny
translatability then we can grant the invariance principle, and grant
the judgements of distance in both cases, but remain untroubled.
There is no contradiction (Tichý 1978).

At first blush this response seems somewhat desperate. Haven't the respective
conditions been *defined* in such a way that they are simple
equivalents by fiat? That would, of course, be the case if *m*
and *a* had been introduced as defined terms into
*h*-*r*-*w*. But if that were the intention then
the similarity theorist could retort that the calculation of
distances should proceed in terms of the primitives, not the
introduced terms. However that is not the only way the argument can
be read. We are asked to contemplate two partially overlapping
sequences of conditions, and two spaces of possibilities generated by
those two sequences. We can thus think of each possibility as a point
in a simple three dimensional space. These points are ordered triples
of 0s and 1s, the *n*th entry being 0 if the *n*th
condition is satisfied and 1 if it isn't. Thinking of possibilities
in this way, we already have rudimentary geometrical features
generated simply by the selection of generating conditions. Points
are adjacent if they differ on only one dimension. A path is a
sequence of adjacent points. A point *q* is between two points
*p* and *r* if *q* lies on a shortest path from
*p* to *r*. A region of possibility space is convex if
it is closed under the betweenness relation — anything between
two points in the region is also in the region (Oddie 1987, Goldstick and O'Neill 1988).

Evidently we have two spaces of possibilities, S1 and S2, and the
question now arises whether a sentence interpreted over one of these
spaces expresses the very same thing as any sentence interpreted over
the other. Does *h*&*r*&*w* express the
same thing as *h*&*m*&*a*?
*h*&*r*&*w* expresses (the singleton of)
u_{1} (which is the entity <1,1,1> in S1 or
<1,1,1>_{S1}) and
*h*&*m*&*a* expresses v_{1} (the entity
<1,1,1>_{S2}).
~*h*&*r*&*w* expresses u2
(<0,1,1>_{S1}), a point adjacent to that expressed by
*h*&*r*&*w*. However
~*h*&~*m*&~*a* expresses v_{8}
(<0,0,0>_{S2}), which is not adjacent to v_{1}
(<1,1,1>_{S2}). So now we can construct a simple proof
that the two sentences do not express the same thing.

u_{1}is adjacent tou_{2}.

v_{1}is not adjacent tov_{8}.

Therefore, eitheru_{1}is not identical tov_{1}, oru_{2}is not identicalv_{8}.

Therefore, eitherh&r&wandh&m&ado not express the same proposition, or ~h&r&wand ~h&~m&~ado not express the same proposition.

Thus at least one of the two required intertranslatability claims
fails, and *h*-*r*-*w*-ese is not
intertranslatable with *h*-*m*-*a*-ese. The
important point here is that a space of possibilities already comes
with a structure and the points in such a space cannot be
individuated without reference to rest of the space and its
structure. The identity of a possibility is bound up with its
geometrical relations to other possibilities. Different relations,
different possibilities.

This kind of rebuttal to the Miller argument would have radical
implications for the comparability of actual theories that appear to
be constructed from quite different sets of primitives. Classical
mechanics can be formulated using mass and position as basic, or it
can be formulated using mass and momentum The classical concepts of
velocity and of mass are different from their relativistic
counterparts, and even if they were “intertranslatable” in
the way that the concepts of *h*-*r*-*w*-ese are
intertranslatable with *h*-*m*-*a*-ese.

This idea meshes well with recent work on conceptual spaces in
Gärdenfors [2000]. Gärdenfors is concerned both with the
semantics and the nature of genuine properties, and his bold and
simple hypothesis is that properties carve out convex regions of an
*n*-dimensional quality space. He supports this hypothesis with
an impressive array of logical, linguistic and empirical data.
(Looking back at our little spaces above it is not hard to see that
the convex regions are those that correspond to the generating (or
atomic) conditions and conjunctions of those. See Burger and Heidema
1994.) While Gärdenfors is dealing with properties it is not hard
to see that similar considerations apply to propositions, since
propositions can be regarded as 0-ary properties.

Ultimately, however, this response may seem less than entirely
satisfactory by itself. If the choice of a conceptual space is merely
a matter of taste then we may be forced to embrace a radical kind of
incommensurability. Those who talk
*h*-*r*-*w*-ese and conjecture
~*h*&*r*&*w* on the basis of the
available evidence will be close to the truth. Those who talk
*h*-*m*-*a*-ese while exposed to the
“same” circumstances would presumably conjecture
~*h*&~*m*&~*a* on the basis of the
“same” evidence (or the corresponding evidence that they
gather). If in fact *h*&*r*&*w* is the
truth (in *h*-*r*-*w*-ese) then the
*h*-*r*-*w* weather researchers will be close to
the truth. But the *h*-*m*-*a* researchers will
be very far from the truth.

This may not be an explicit contradiction, but it should be worrying all the same. Realists started out with the ambition of defending a concept of truthlikeness which would enable them to embrace both fallibilism and optimism. But what the likeness theorists seem to have ended up with here is something that suggests a rather unpalatable incommensurability of competing conceptual frameworks. To avoid this the realist will need to affirm that some conceptual frameworks really are better than others. Some really do “carve reality at the joints” and others don't. But is that something the realist should be reluctant to affirm?

## 1.5 The Compatibility of the Approaches

The three different approaches are motivated by somewhat different desiderata. An interesting question thus arises as to whether the three approaches are compatible. If they are compatible, then the different desiderata that motivate them might be accommodated in one happy hybrid.

Consider, for example, Hilpinen's proposal, which is typically
located within the likeness approach. Interestingly, Hilpinen himself
thought of his proposal as a refined and improved articulation of
Popper's content approach. Popper's *truth factor* Hilpinen
identified with that world, in the range of a proposition, closest to
the actual world. Popper's
*content* or *information factor* he identified with
that world, in the range of a proposition, furthest from the actual
world. An improvement in truthlikeness involves an improvement in
either the truth factor or the information factor. His proposal
clearly departs from Popper's in as much as it incorporates likeness
into both of the determining factors but Hilpinen was also attempting
to capture, in some way or other, Popper's penchant for content as
well as truth. And his account achieves a good deal of that. In
particular his proposal delivers a weak version of the value of
content for truths: namely, that of two truths the logically stronger
cannot be further from the truth than the logically weaker. It fails,
however, to deliver the stonger principle of the value of content for
truths: that the logically stronger of two truths is closer to the
truth.

To answer the compatibility question we need precise characterizations
of the approaches. Zwart (2001) characterized the approaches in terms
of that proposition they judge to be furthest from the truth. Suppose
that *z* is the world furthest from the actual world, and
let *Z* be a proposition that is true only in *z*. On all
likeness approaches *Z* is the proposition that is furthest from
the truth. Call this principle *Worst*. *Worst* is at least
a necessary condition for a theory to lie within the likeness
approach, though it seems insufficient. Content theorists judge
theories more or less good in terms of two factors: truth value and
content. So the worst theory will have to be false. And presumably
it will also be weak. Consider ~*T*, the negation of the
truth. It is both false, and it is the logically weakest falsehood.
So, according to Zwart 2001, content theorists ought to judge
~*T* to be the worst theory on offer. Call this
principle *Weakest*. *Weakest* assumes something like the
separability of content and truth factors in the evaluation of
truthlikeness. While that captures Miller's and Kuiper's symmetric
difference account it would banish from the content-based fold those
accounts that judge false theories to be worse the logically stronger
they are.

Zwart and Franssen 2007 adopted somewhat stronger characterizations
of the approaches. Their characterization of the content approach is
essentially that it encompass the Simple Truth Content
account: *viz* that *A* is as close to the truth
as *B* if *A* entails all of *B*'s truth content,
and *A* is closer to the truth than *B* just in
case *A* is at least as close as *B*, and *B* is
not at least as close as *A*. This guarantees that any
articulation of the content approach will embody the value of content
for truths, but it goes somewhat further as we saw above, guaranteeing
the value of content for falsehoods as well. (It is thus much
stronger than *Weakest*.)

Their characterization of the likeness approach is that it deliver
all the judgments delivered by Hilpinen's proposal. (This is clearly
much stronger than *Worst*.)

With these characterizations in hand Zwart and Franssen go on to show that Arrow's famous theorem in social choice theory can be applied to obtain a surprising general result about truthlikeness orderings: that there is a precise sense in which there can be no compromise between the content and likeness approaches, that any apparent compromise effectively capitulates to one paradigm or the other. (Given their characterization of the two approaches, Hilpinen's apparent compromise is deemed to err on the side of the likeness approach.)

This theorem represents an interesting new development in the truthlikeness debate. As already noted, much of the debate has been conducted on the battlefield of intuition, with protagonists from different camps firing off cases which appear to refute their opponent's definition while confirming their own. The Zwart-Franssen-Arrow theorem is not only an interesting result in itself, but it represents an innovative and welcome development in the debate, since most of the theorizing has lacked this kind of theoretical generality.

One problem with this incompatibility result lies in Zwart and Franssen's characterization of the two approaches. If delivering all the judgments that are delivered by the Simple Truth Content is a necessary condition for a proposal to be welcomed in the content camp, then while the symmetric difference proposals of Miller and Kuipers are ruled in, Popper's original proposal is ruled out. Further, if delivering all the judgments delivered by Hilpinen's proposal is stipulated to be a necessary for any likeness account then Tichý's averaging account is ruled out of the likeness camp. So both characterizations appear to be too narrow. They rule out what are perhaps the central paradigms of two different approaches.

A rather more liberal characterization of the content approach would count in any proposal that guarantees the value of content for truths. That, at least, was Popper's litmus test for acceptability and what primarily motivated his original proposal. A more inclusive characterization of the likeness approach would count in any proposal that makes truthlikeness supervene on a measure or ordering of likeness on worlds.

On these more inclusive characterizations, Popper's theory qualifies as a content account; Tichý's theory qualifies as a likeness account. And that is as it should be. Further, Hilpinen's theory falls within the likeness approach, but fails to qualify as a genuine content account. It does not deliver the full value of content for truths. So on these characterizations Hilpinen's account is not a genuine hybrid.

As we have seen, one shortcoming which Hilpinen's proposal shares with
Popper's original proposal is the absolute worthlessness of all
falsehoods: that no falsehood is closer to the truth than any truth
(even the worthless tautology). This defect of Hilpinen's qualitative
proposal can be remedied by assuming quantitative distances between
worlds, and letting *A*'s distance from the truth be a weighted
average of the distance of the closest world in *A* from the
actual world, and the distance of the furthest world in
*A* from the actual world. This quantitative version (call it
*min-max-average*) of Hilpinen's account renders all
propositions comparable for truthlikeness, and some falsehoods it
deems more truthlike than some truths.

Although *min-max-average* falls within the likeness
approach broadly characterized, it too fails to deliver the value of
content for truths. So it does not qualify as a content ordering
either. Moreover, it is not entirely satisfactory from a likeness
perspective either, despite satisfying the rather weak likeness
constraint that truthlikeness supervene on likeness. To illustrate
this, let *A* be a true proposition with a number of worlds
tightly clustered around the actual world
*a*. Let *B* be a false proposition with a number of
worlds tightly clustered around a world *z* maximally distant
from actuality. *A* is highly truthlike, and *B* highly
untruthlike and *min-max-average* agrees. But now let
*B*+ be *B* plus *a*, and let *A*+ be
*A* plus *z*. Considerations of both continuity and
likeness suggest that *A*+ should be much more truthlike than
*B*+, but they are deemed equally truthlike by
*min-max-average*.

Part of the problem with *min-max-average* proposal is that the
furthest world in a proposition is, as noted above, a very crude
estimator of overall content. It is precisely for this reason that
Niiniluoto suggests a different content measure: the
(normalized) *sum* of the distances of worlds in
*A* from the actual world. As we have seen, *sum* is
not itself a good measure of distance of a proposition from the
truth. However formally, *sum* is a probability measure, and
hence a measure of a kind of logical weakness. But *sum* is
also a content-likeness hybrid, rendering a proposition more
contentful the closer its worlds are to actuality. Being genuinely
sensitive to size, *sum* is clearly a better measure of
logical weakness than the world furthest from actuality. Hence
Niiniluoto proposes a weighted average of the closest world (the
truth factor) and *sum* (the information factor).

Niiniluoto's measure,
*min-sum-average*, ranks a *tautology*, *B*+ and
*A*+ in that order of closeness to the
truth. *min-sum-average* also delivers the value of content for
truths: if *A* is true and is logically stronger
than *B* then both have the same truth factor (0), but since
the range of *B* contains more worlds, its
*sum* will be greater, making it further from the truth. So
*min-sum-average* falls within the content approach on this
characterization. On the other hand, *min-sum-average* also seems
to fall within the likeness camp, since it deems truthlikeness to be
a non-trivial function of the likenesses of worlds, in the range of a
proposition, to the actual world.

According to *min-sum-average*: all propositions are
commensurable for truthlikeness; the full principle of the value of
content for truths holds provided the content factor gets non-zero
weight; the Truth has greater truthlikeness than any other
proposition provided all non-actual worlds are some distance from the
actual world; some false propositions are closer to the truth than
others; the principle of the value of content for falsehoods is
appropriately repudiated, provided the truth factor gets some weight;
if *A* is false, the truth content of *A* is more
truthlike than *A* itself, again provided the truth factor
gets some weight. *min-sum-average* thus seems like a
consistent and appealing compromise between content and
likeness approaches.

This compatibility result may be too quick and dirty for the following
reason. We laid down a somewhat stringent condition on content-based
measures (namely, the value of content for truths) but we have only
required a very lax, supervenience condition for likeness-based
measures (namely, that the likeness of a proposition to the truth
be *some function or other* of the likeness of the worlds in the
proposition to the actual world). This latter condition allows any old
function of likeness to count. For example, summing the distances of
worlds from the actual world is a function of likeness, but it hardly
satisfies basic intuitive constraints on the likeness of a proposition
to the truth. There might well be more demanding but still plausible
constraints on the likeness approach, and those constraints might
block the compatibility of likeness and content. It also has to be
admitted that there is something a little unsatisfactory with the
rather piecemeal method that was used to arrive at an extension from
distance between worlds to distance from the truth. A better way of
proceeding would be to discover some highly plausible general
principles that any likeness theorist would find compelling, which
would ideally uniquely identify the correct extension.

The following three constraints on any extension of distances between worlds to distances of propositions from the truth have been proposed (Oddie 2013).

First, suppose that all the worlds in the range of *A* are
exactly the same distance from the actual world. What is the overall
distance of *A* from the actual world? One very plausible
answer is that *A* is exactly the same distance as the worlds
it contains:

: If the worlds in the range ofThe uniform distance principleAare of a uniform distancedfrom the actual world then the distance ofAfrom the actual world is alsod.

Note that *average* and *min-max-average* both
obey *uniform distance* while *min-sum-average* does
not. *min-sum-average* is based on the intuition that adding new
disjuncts decreases truthlikeness, unless the new disjunct improves
the minimum distance. For example, on *min-sum-average* if it is
hot and rainy, the false proposition
(*h*&~*r*)∨(~*h*&*r*) is further from
the truth than either of its two false disjuncts, even though both
disjuncts are the same distance from the truth.

Let *A ^{v/u}* be any proposition that differs
from

*A*only in that it contains

*v*rather than

*u*, and suppose that

*v*is closer to the actual world than

*u*. Clearly

*A*cannot be

^{v/u}*further*from the actual world than

*A*is.

This gives us:

: IfThe pareto principlevis at least as close to the actual world asuis, thenAis at least as close to the truth as^{v/u}Ais.

If *v* is closer to the actual world than *u* is then there
should be a difference between the distance of *A* from the
truth and the distance of *A ^{v/u}* from the truth.
What should that difference depend on? Given
that

*A*differs from

^{v/u}*A*only over the distance from the actual world of worlds

*u*and

*v*, the difference in closeness to truth of

*A*and

*B*can certainly depend on the distance of

*u*from the actual world and the distance of

*v*from the actual world. The following argument shows that the difference may also depend on the size of

*A*.

The smaller *A* is the more the replacement changes what we
might call *A*'s distance profile. In the limit if *A* is a
singleton (viz. {*u*}), *A ^{v/u}* is also a
singleton (viz., {

*v*}). From the uniform distance principle, we know that the difference between the distances of

*A*and of

*A*in this case is the difference between the distance of

^{v/u}*v*and the distance of

*u*from the actual world. And that is the largest difference that replacing

*u*with

*v*could make. The larger

*A*is the less of an impact the replacement will have. So size of

*A*may make a difference to the impact of replacement. However, we don't have to stipulate any particular function here, or even that it be a decreasing function of the size of

*A*(as indeed it should be). Rather, we merely allow that the difference between the two distances is

*some function or other*of these three factors.

: The difference in closeness to the truth ofThe difference principleAandAis some function or other of at most three factors: the distance of^{v/u}ufrom the actual world; the distance ofvfrom the actual world; and the size ofA.

These three extension principles individually should be very
attractive to a likeness theorist. And it is easy to check that
averaging satisfies the extension principles. Interestingly it can
also be shown that averaging is the only extension principle to do so.
Any other extension will violate one of the three constraints. By
relaxing the implicit assumption that all worlds are of equal weight,
a generalized argument shows that *weighted average distance* is
the only function to satisfy the extension principles.

Call a distance/likeness function *δ* *flat*
provided *δvw*=1 if and only if *v*≠*w*. A
flat distance function embodies an extreme version of likeness
nihilism — namely, that as a matter of brute necessity no world
is more like the actual world than is any other. It still counts as a
possible view of likeness, albeit an extreme view, one which is
perhaps supported by a generalized language dependence argument (see
section §1.4.4). Given a flat distance function on worlds,
together with weighted averaging, the distance of proposition *A*
from the truth is (1−(*P*(*A*)/*P*(*T*))
if *A* is true, and 1 if *A* is false. Since this is
generated by a distance function this measure of distance from the
truth falls within the likeness approach broadly construed, and since
we used weighted averaging, it also satisfies the distance extension
principles. Further, since the ordering delivers the value of content
for truths it falls within the content approach, broadly
characterized.

So, it turns out that the content and likeness approaches are compatible. Indeed Popper's original ordering satisfies the strictures of both content and likeness approaches. It is obviously a content ordering, and, since averaging the flat distance function induces an extension of Popper's ordering, it falls within the likeness approach as well. Notice that averaging a flat distance function delivers both kinds of worthlessness for falsehoods. It yields the result that no falsehood is closer to the truth than any other, and no falsehood is closer to the truth than the least truthlike truth. Furthermore, this is not just a peculiar feature of the flat distance function, for at least one half of this result is completely general:

Any ordering of closeness to truth which is derived from averaging a likeness function, and which delivers the value of content for truths, deems all falsehoods to be absolutely worthless.

Although the three approaches are, strictly speaking, compatible,
there is still a deep tension between them. If you accept the three
plausible likeness principles (*uniform distance*, *pareto*,
and *difference*) then you either have to reject the principle of
the value of content for truths or you have to accept the absolute
worthlessness of falsehoods. The latter is not a serious option.
Both *uniform distance* and *pareto* seem rather compelling.
If this is right the choice is between rejecting the *difference*
principle and rejecting the value of content for truths.

## 2. The Epistemological Problem

The quest to nail down a viable concept of truthlikeness is
motivated, at least in part, by fallibilism (§1.1). It is
certainly true that with a viable notion of distance from the truth
progress in an inquiry through a succession of false theories is
rendered possible. It is also true that if there is no such viable
notion then truth can be retained as the goal of inquiry only at the
cost of making partial progress towards it virtually impossible. But
does the mere *possibility* of making progress towards the truth
improve our epistemic lot? Some have argued that it doesn't (see for
example Laudan, 1977, Cohen 1980, Newton-Smith 1981). One common
argument can be recast in the form of a simple dilemma. Either we can
ascertain the truth or we can't. If we can ascertain the truth then we
have no need for a concept of truthlikeness – it is an entirely
useless addition to our intellectual repertoire. But if we cannot
ascertain the truth then then we cannot ascertain the degree of
truthlikeness of our theories either. So again, the concept is useless
for all practical
purposes. (See Scientific
Progress §2.4)

Consider the second horn of this dilemma. Is it true that if we
can't know what the (whole) truth of some matter is, we also cannot
ascertain whether or not we are making progress towards it? Suppose
you are interested in the truth about the weather tomorrow. Suppose
you learn (from a highly reliable source) that it will be hot. Even
though you don't know the *whole* truth about the weather
tomorrow, you do know that you have added a truth to your existing
corpus of weather beliefs. One does not need to be able to ascertain
the whole truth to ascertain some less encompassing truths. And it
seems to follow that you can also know that, with a little discovery
like this one, you have made at least some progress towards the whole
weather truth.

This rebuttal is too swift. It presupposes that the addition of a
new truth *A* to an existing corpus *K* guarantees that your
revised belief *K***A* constitutes progress towards the
truth. But whether or not *K***A* is closer to the truth
than *K* depends not only on a theory of truthlikeness but also
on a theory of belief
revision. (See Logic of Belief
Revision.)

Let's consider a simple case. Suppose *A* is some newly
discovered truth, and that *A* is compatible with *K*.
Assume that belief revision in such cases is simply a matter of
so-called *expansion* — i.e. conjoining *A*
to *K*. Consider the case in which *K* also happens to be
true. Then any account of truthlikeness that endorses the value of
content for truths (e.g. Niiniluoto's *min-sum-average*)
guarantees that *K***A* is closer to the truth
than *K*. That's a welcome result but it has rather limited
application. Typically one doesn't know that *K* is true so even
if one knows that *A* is true one cannot use this fact to
celebrate progress.

The situation is even more dire when it comes to falsehoods.
If *K* is in fact false then, without the disastrous principle of
the value of content for falsehoods, there is certainly no guarantee
that *K***A* will constitute a step towards the truth. (And
even if one endorsed the disastrous principle one would hardly be
better off. For then the addition of any proposition, whether true or
false, would constitute an improvement on a false theory.) Consider
again the number of the planets, N. Suppose that the truth is N=8, and
that your existing corpus *K* is (N=7 ∨ N=100). Suppose you
somehow acquire the truth *A*: N>7. Then *K***A* is
N=100, which (on *average*, *min-max-average*
and *min-sum-average*) is further from the truth
than *K*. So revising a false theory by adding truths by no means
guarantees progress towards the truth.

For theories that reject the value of content for truths
(e.g. the *average* proposal) the situation is worse still. Even
if *K* happens to be true, there is no guarantee that
expanding *K* with truths will constitute progress. Of course,
there will be certain general conditions under which the value of
content for truths holds. For example on the *average* proposal,
the expansion of a true *K* by an atomic truth (or, more
generally, by a convex truth) will guarantee progress towards the
truth.

So under very special conditions one can know that the acquisition a truth will enhance the overall truthlikeness of one's theories, but these conditions are exceptionally narrow and provide at best a very weak defense against the dilemma. (See Niiniluoto 2011. For rather more optimistic views of the relation between truthlikeness and belief revision see Kuipers 2000, Lavalette, Renardel & Zwart 2011, and Cevolani, Festa and Kuipers 2013.)

A different tack is to deny that a concept is useless if there is
no effective empirical decision procedure for ascertaining whether it
applies. For even if we cannot know for sure what the value of a
certain unobservable magnitude is, we might well have better or
worse *estimates* of the value of the magnitude on the
evidence. And that may be all we need for the concept to be of
practical value. Consider, for example, the propensity of a certain
coin-tossing set-up to produce heads — a magnitude which, for
the sake of the example, we assume to be not directly observable. Any
non-extreme value of this magnitude is compatible with any number of
heads in a sequence of *n* tosses. So we can never know with
certainty what the actual propensity is, no matter how many tosses we
observe. But we can certainly make rational estimates of the
propensity on the basis of the accumulating evidence. Suppose one's
initial state of ignorance of the propensity is represented by an even
distribution of credences over the space of possibilities for the
propensity (i.e. the unit interval). Using Bayes theorem, and the
Principal Principle, after a fairly small number of tosses we can
become quite confident that the propensity lies in a small interval
around the observed relative frequency. Our *best estimate* of
the value of the magnitude is its *expected value* on the
evidence.

Similarly, suppose we don't and perhaps cannot know which
constituent (at a certain depth *d*) is in fact true (or more
generally which answer to our query is the right answer). But suppose
that we do have a good measure of distance between
constituents *C _{i}* and we have selected the right
extension function. So we have a measure of the truthlikeness of a
proposition

*A*given that constituent

*C*is true. (Let this be

_{i}*TL*(

*A*|

*C*).) Provided we also have a measure of epistemic probability

_{i}*P*(where

*P*(

*C*|

_{i}*e*) is the degree of rational credence in

*C*given evidence

_{i}*e*) we also have a measure of the

*expected*degree of truthlikeness of

*A*on the evidence (

*(*

**E**TL*A*|

*e*) which we can identify with the best epistemic estimate of truthlikeness. (Niiniluoto, who first explored this concept in his 1977, calls the epistemic estimate of degree of truthlikeness on the evidence, or expected degree of truthlikeness,

*verisimilitude*. Since

*verisimilitude*is typically taken to be a synonym for

*truthlikeness*I will not follow him in this, and will stick instead with

*expected truthlikeness*for the epistemic notion. See also Maher (1993).)

(ETLA|e) = ∑_{i}P(C|_{i}e) ×TL(A|C)._{i}

Clearly the expected degree of truthlikeness of a
proposition *is* epistemically accessible, and it can serve as
our best empirical estimate of the objective degree of
truthlikeness. Progress occurs in an inquiry when actual truthlikeness
increases. And apparent progress occurs when expected degree of
truthlikeness increases.

Like truthlikness, expected degree of truthlikeness behaves quite differently from probability. The expected degree of truthlikeness of a proposition can be low even though its probability is high. A tautology, for example, has low degree of truthlikeness (closeness to the whole truth) whatever the truth is, and hence a low degree of expected truthlikeness, while its probability is maximal. More interestingly a proposition can be known to be false, and so have zero probability, and yet have a a higher degree of truthlikeness than some known truths. For example, that the number of planets is 7 is known to be false but since we know that the number of planets is 8, its degree of expected truthlikeness is identical to its actual truthlikeness, which is as good as a false answer to the question about the number of the planets gets. (See Niiniluoto 2011 for other examples.)

Of course, the possibility of estimating truthlikeness relies on
the availability of a reasonable theory of probability. But the basic
idea can be implemented whether one is a subjectivist about
probability, or one subscribes to some more objective version of a
theory of logical probability. It turns out, not surprisingly, that
there is a well-known framework for logical probability which fits the
normal-form approach to truthlikeness like a glove — namely,
that based on Hintikka's distributive normal forms (Hintikka
1965). Hintikka's approach to inductive logic can be seen as a rather
natural development of Carnap's *continuum of inductive methods*
(Carnap 1952). Recall that Carnap advocated distributing prior
probabilities equally over *structure *descriptions, rather than
over state descriptions, in order to make it possible to learn from
experience. But in an infinite universe there are still infinitely
many structure descriptions, and while Carnap's approach makes it
possible for a finite amount of data to change the probability of a
singular prediction, it renders probabilistic learning from experience
impossible for all genuine universal generalizations. Since universal
claims start with zero probability, updating by conditionalization on
new evidence can never change that.

Constituents partition the logical space according to the kinds of
individuals that exist. Constituents can be plausibly assigned equal
probabilities, perhaps motivated by a principle of indifference of
some kind. In the simplest case — first-order monadic
constituents of depth-1 — each constituent says of some set
of *Q*-predicates that they are instantiated and that they are
the only instantiated *Q*-predicates. The *width* of a
constituent is the number of *Q*-predicates it says are
instantiated. Suppose that *n* pieces of evidence have been
accumulated to date, and that the total accumulated
evidence *e _{n}* entails that all and only
the

*Q*-predicates in

*C*are instantiated. That is,

^{e}*C*, is the

^{e}*narrowest*constituent compatible with the total evidence. Then given Hintikka's initial equal distribution,

*C*emerges as the constituent with the highest probability on the evidence. Further, suppose that we reach a point in the gathering of evidence after which no new kinds of individuals are observed. (Since there are only a finite number of kinds in the monadic framework envisaged, there must be such a point.) Then

^{e}*P*(

*C*|

^{e}*e*) → 1 as

_{n}*n*→ ∞. And then it follows that for any proposition

*A*expressible in the framework:

(ETLA|e) →_{n}TL(A|C) as^{e}n→ ∞.

Further, provided that the evidence is eventually exhaustive (that is, instances of all the different kinds of individuals that are in fact instantiated eventually turn up at some stage in the evidence) expected truthlikeness will come arbitrarily close to actual degree of truthlikeness.

While this idea has been developed in detail for monadic first-order frameworks only, the model does demonstrate something interesting: namely the consilience of two important but apparently antagonistic traditions of twentieth century philosophy of science. On the one hand there is the Carnapian tradition, which stressed the probabilification of scientific hypotheses through the application of inductive methods. On the other, there is the Popperian tradition which completely rejected so-called inductive methods, along with the application of probability theory to epistemology, embracing instead the possibility of progress towards the whole truth through highly improbable conjectures and their refutation. If the model is on the right lines, then there is a rational kernel at the core of both these traditions. Inquiry can, and hopefully does, progress towards the truth through a sequence of false conjectures and their nearly inevitable refutation, but we can also have fallible evidence of such progress. Expected degree of truthlikeness will typically approach actual degree of truthlikeness in the long run.

With this proposal Niiniluoto also made a connection with the
application of decision theory to epistemology. Decision theory is an
account of what it is rational to do in the light of one's beliefs and
desires. One's goal, it is assumed, is to maximize utility. But given
that one does not have perfect information about the state of the
world, one cannot know for sure how to accomplish that. Given
uncertainty, the rule to maximize utility or value cannot be applied
in normal circumstances. So under conditions of uncertainty, what it
is rational to do, according to the theory, is to
maximize *subjective expected utility*. Starting with Hempel's
classic 1960 essay, epistemologists conjectured that
decision-theoretic tools might be applied to the problem of
theory *acceptance* — which hypothesis it is rational to
accept on the basis of the total available evidence to hand. But, as
Hempel argued, the values or utilities involved in a decision to
accept an hypothesis cannot be simply regular practical values. These
are typically thought to be generated by one's desires for various
states of affairs to obtain in the world. But the fact that one would
very much like a certain favored hypothesis to be true does not
increase the cognitive value of accepting that hypothesis.

This much is clear: the utilities should reflect the value or disvalue which the different outcomes have from the point of view of pure scientific research rather than the practical advantages or disadvantages that might result from the application of an accepted hypothesis, according as the latter is true or false. Let me refer to the kind of utilities thus vaguely characterized as purely scientific, or epistemic, utilities. (Hempel (1960), p 465)

If we had a decent theory of *epistemic utility* (also known
as *cognitive utility* and *cognitive value*) perhaps what
hypotheses one ought to accept, or what experiments one ought to
perform, or how one ought to revise one's corpus of belief in the
light of new information, could be determined by the rule: maximize
expected epistemic utility (or maximize expected cognitive
value). Thus decision-theoretic epistemology was born.

Hempel went on to ask what epistemic utilities are implied in the standard conception of scientific inquiry — “..construing the proverbial 'pursuit of truth' in science as aimed at the establishment of a maximal system of true statements...” Hempel (1960), p 465)

Already we have here the germ of the idea central to the truthlikeness program: that the goal of an inquiry is to end up accepting (or “establishing”) the theory which yields the whole truth of some matter. It is interesting that, around the same time that Popper was trying to articulate a content-based account of truthlikeness, Hempel was attempting to characterize partial fulfillment of the goal (that is, of maximally contentful truth) in terms of some combination of truth and content. These decision-theoretic considerations lead naturally to a brief consideration of the axiological problem of truthlikeness.

## 3. The Axiological Problem

Our interest in the concept of truthlikeness is presumably rooted in the value of lighting on highly truthlike theories. And that in turn seems rooted in the value of truth (Oddie 2008). This suggests that truth and truthlikeness are cognitive values and, one would hope, closely related values. If so, how are they related?

Let's start with the putative value of truth. Truth is not, of
course, a good-making property of the objects of belief states. The
proposition *h*&*r*&*w* is not a
better *proposition* when it happens to be hot, rainy and windy
than when it happens to be cold, dry and still. Rather, the cognitive
state of *believing* *h*&*r*&*w* is often
deemed to be a good state to be in if the proposition is true, not
good if it is false. So the state of *believing truly* is better
than the state of *believing falsely*.

At least some, perhaps most, of the value of believing truly can be accounted for instrumentally. Desires mesh with beliefs to produce actions that will best achieve what is desired. True beliefs will generally do a better job of this than false beliefs. If you are thirsty and you believe the glass in front of you contains safe drinking water rather than lethal poison then you will be motivated to drink. And if you do drink, you will be better off if the belief you acted on was true (you quench your thirst) rather than false (you end up dead).

We can do more with decision theory utilizing purely practical or
non-cognitive values. For example, there is a well-known,
decision-theoretic, *value-of-learning theorem*, the Ramsey-Good
theorem, which partially vindicates the value of gathering new
information, and it does so in terms of “practical”
values, without assuming any purely cognitive values. (Good 1967.)
Suppose you have a choice to make, and you can either choose now, or
choose after doing some experiment. Suppose further that you are
rational (you always choose by expected value) and that the experiment
is cost-free. It follows that performing the experiment and then
choosing always has at least as much expected value as choosing
without further ado. Further, doing the experiment has higher expected
value if one possible outcome of the experiment would alter the
relative values of some your options. So, you should do the experiment
just in case the outcome of the experiment could make a difference to
what you choose to do. Of course, the expected gain of doing the
experiment has to be worth the expected cost. Spending $10 to find
out information that makes only a $5 difference to the expected value
of your final choice would be irrational. But that seems right. Not
all information is worth pursuing when you have limited time and
resources.

These kinds of considerations do not, of course, deliver either the invariable instrumental superiority of true belief or of the value of learning.

Suppose you are diagnosed with an illness with a very low survival rate. However, those who are deluded into believing that they have a good chance of survival have a slightly better (though still not good) chance of survival. Then firmly embracing a falsehood (if you can pull it off) has greater overall expected utility than believing its true negation. So practical values, non-epistemic values, don't uniformly favor believing truly.

David Miller notes the following powerful objection to the Ramsey-Good value-of-learning theorem:

The argument as it stands simply doesn't impinge on the question of why evidence is collected in those innumerable cases in theoretical science in which no decisions will be, or anyway are envisaged to be, affected. (Miller 1994, 141).

There are some things that we think are worth knowing about, the
knowledge of which would not change the expected value of any action
that one might be contemplating performing. We have just spent
billions of dollars conducting an elaborate experiment to try to
determine whether the Higgs boson exists, and the results are
promising enough that Higgs *et al* were awarded the Nobel Prize
for their prediction. The results of the experiment have shifted the
credences in favor of the standard model. The discovery may, of
course, also yield practical benefits, but it is the *cognitive*
change it induces that makes us think it was worthwhile. It was
valuable simply for what it did to our credal state — not just
our credence in the existence of the Higgs, but our overall credal
state. We may of course be wrong about the Higgs — the results
might be misleading — but from our new epistemic viewpoint it
certainly appears to us that we have made cognitive gains. We have a
little bit more evidence for the truth, or at least the truthlikeness,
of the standard model.

What we need, it seems, is some account of pure cognitive value, one that embodies the idea that getting at the truth is itself valuable whatever its practical benefits. As noted this possibility was first explicitly raised by Hempel, and developed in various difference ways in the 1960s and 1970s by Levi (1967), Hilpinen (1968), amongst others. (For recent developments see Epistemic Utility Arguments for Probabilism (§6).)

We could take the cognitive value of believing a single
proposition *A* to be positive when *A* is true and negative
when *A* is false. But acknowledging that belief comes in
degrees, the idea might be that the stronger one's belief in a truth
(or of one's disbelief in a falsehood), the greater the cognitive
value. Let *V* be the characteristic function of answers )both
complete and partial, to the question
{*C*_{1}, *C*_{2},
... , *C*_{n}, ...}. That is to say,
where *A* is equivalent to some disjunction of complete
answers:

V_{i}(A) = 1 ifAis entailed by the complete answerC_{i}(i.eAis true according toC_{i});

V_{i}(A) = 0 if the negation ofAis entailed by the complete answerC_{i}(i.e.Ais false according toC_{i}.

Then the simple view is that the cognitive value of
believing *A* to degree *P*(*A*)
(where *C*_{i} is the complete true answer) is
greater the closer *P*(*A*) is to the actual value
of *V _{i}*(

*A*)— that is, the smaller |

*V*(

_{i}*A*)−

*P*(

*A*)| is. Variants of this idea have been endorsed, for example by Horwich (1982, 127–9), and Goldman (1999) (who calls this “veristic value”).

|*V _{i}*(

*A*)−

*P*(

*A*)| is a measure of how far

*P*(

*A*) is from

*V*(

_{i}*A*), and −|

*V*(

_{i}*A*)−

*P*(

*A*)| of how close it is. So here is the simplest linear realization of this desideratum:

Cv¹_{i}(A,P) = − |V(_{i}A)−P(A)|.

But there are of course many other measures satisfying the basic idea. For example we have the following quadratic measure:

Cv²_{i}(A,P) = −((V(_{i}A)−P(A))².

Both *Cv*¹ and *Cv*² reach a maximum
when *P*(*A*) is maximal and *A* is true,
or *P*(*A*) is minimal and *A* is false; and a minimum
when *P*(*A*) is maximal and *A* is false,
or *P*(*A*) is minimal and *A* is true.

These are measures of *local* value — the value of
investing a certain degree of belief in a single answer *A* to
the question *Q*. But we can agglomerate these local values into
the value of a total credal state *P*. This involves a
substantive assumption: that the value of a credal state is some
additive function of the values of the individual beliefs states it
underwrites. A credal state, relative to inquiry *Q*, is
characterized by its distribution of credences over the elements of
the partition *Q*. An *opinionated* credal state is one that
assigns credence 1 to just one of the complete answers. The best
credal state to be in, relative to the inquiry *Q*, is the
opinionated state that assigns credence 1 to the complete correct
answer. This will also assign credence 1 to every true answer, and 0
to every false answer, whether partial or complete. In other words,
if the correct answer to *Q* is *C _{i}* then the
best credal state to be in is the one identical
to

*V*: for each partial or complete answer

_{i}*A*to

*Q*,

*P*(

*A*) =

*V*(

_{i}*A*). This credal state is the state of believing the truth, the whole truth and nothing but the truth about

*Q*. Other total credal states (whether opinionated or not) should turn out to be less good than this perfectly accurate credal state. But there will, of course, have to be more constraints on the accuracy and value of total cognitive states.

Assuming additivity, the value of the credal state *P* can be
taken to be the (weighted) sum of the cognitive values of local belief
states.

CV(_{i}P) = ∑_{A}λ_{A}Cv_{i}(A,P) (whereAranges over all the answers, both complete and incomplete, to questionQ), and the λ–terms assign a fixed (non-contingent) weight to the contribution of each answerAto overall accuracy.

Plugging in either of the above local cognitive value measures, total cognitive value is maximal for an assignment of maximal probability to the true complete answer, and falls off as confidence in the correct answer falls away.

Since there are many different measures that reflect the basic idea
of the value of true belief how are we to decide between them? We
have here a familiar problem of underdetermination. Joyce (1998) lays
down a number of desiderata, most of them very plausible, for a
measure of what he calls the *accuracy* of a cognitive state.
These desiderata are satisfied by the *Cv*² but not
by *Cv*¹. In fact all the members of a family of closely
related measures, of which *Cv*² is a member, satisfy
Joyce's desiderata:

CV(_{i}P) = ∑_{A}−λ_{A}[ (V_{i}(A) −P(A))²].

Giving equal weight to all propositions
(λ _{A} = some non-zero constant *c* for
all *A*), this is equivalent to the *Brier* measure
(see Epistemic Utility Arguments for
Probabilism (§6)). Given the
character:lambda]–weightings can vary, there is considerable
flexibility in the family of admissible measures. Whether there are
other quite different measures satisfying Joyce's desiderata is not
known.

Joyce's primary aim is to vindicate *probabilism* — the
thesis that rational credences must conform to the probability
calculus. Assuming probabilism, our main interest here is whether any
of these so-called *scoring rules* (rules which score the overall
accuracy of a credal state) might constitute an acceptable measure of
the cognitive value of a credal state.

Absent specific refinements to the λ–weightings, the
quadratic measures seem unsatisfactory as a solution to the problem of
both accuracy and cognitive value. Suppose you are inquiring into the
number of the planets and you end up fully believing that the number
of the planets is 9. Given that the correct answer is 8, your credal
state is not perfect. But it is pretty good, and it is surely a much
better credal state to be in than the opinionated state that sets
probability 1 on the number of planets being 9 billion. It seems
rather natural to hold that the cognitive value of an opinionated
credal state is sensitive to the degree of *truthlikeness* of the
complete answer that it fixes on, not just to its *truth
value*. But this is by no means endorsed by the family of quadratic
measures.

Joyce's desiderata build in the thesis that accuracy is
insensitive to the distances of various different complete answers
from the complete true answer. The crucial principle
is *Extensionality*.

Our next constraint stipulates that the “facts” which a person's partial beliefs must “fit” are exhausted by the truth-values of the propositions believed, and that the only aspect of her opinions that matter is their strengths. (Joyce 1998, 591)

We have already seen that this seems wrong for opinionated states
that confine all probability to false propositions. Being convinced
that the number of planets in the solar system is 9 is better than
being convinced that it is 9 billion. But the same idea holds for
truths. Suppose you believe truly that the number of the planets is
either 7, 8, 9 or 9 billion. This can be true in four different ways.
If the number of the planets is 8 then, intuitively, your belief is a
little bit closer to the truth than if it is 9 billion. (This
judgment is endorsed by both the *average* and
the *min-sum-average* proposals.) So even in the case of a true
answer to some query, the value of believing that truth can depend not
just on its truth and the strength of the belief, but on where the
truth lies. If this is right *Extensionality* is misguided.

Joyce considers a variant of this objection: namely, that given Extensionality Kepler's beliefs about planetary motion would be judged to be no more accurate than Copernicus's. His response is that there will always be propositions which distinguish between the accuracy of these falsehoods:

I am happy to admit that Kepler held more accurate beliefs than Copernicus did, but I think the sense in which they were more accurate is best captured by an extensional notion. While Extensionality rates Kepler and Copernicus as equally inaccurate when their false beliefs about the earth's orbit are considered apart from their effects on other beliefs, the advantage of Kepler's belief has to do with the other opinions it supports. An agent who strongly believes that the earth's orbit is elliptical will also strongly believe many more truths than a person who believes that it is circular (e.g., that the average distance from the earth to the sun is different in different seasons). This means that the overall effect of Kepler's inaccurate belief was to improve the extensional accuracy of his system of beliefs as a whole. Indeed, this is why his theory won the day. I suspect that most intuitions about falsehoods being “close to the truth” can be explained in this way, and that they therefore pose no real threat to Extensionality. (Joyce 1998, 592)

Unfortunately this contention — that considerations of
accuracy over the whole set of answers which the two theories give
will sort them into the right ranking — doesn't seem correct, at
least as it stands. For example, consider any question *Q* to
which Kepler's theory *K* and Copernicus's theory *C* are
complete but false answers, and let the correct complete answer
be *T*. Let *P ^{K}* and

*P*be the opinionated credal states corresponding to those theories. Let

^{C}*A*be just like

^{C/K}*A*except that

*K*is replaced by

*C*. For any answer

*A*to

*Q*that

*P*gets right and

^{K}*P*gets wrong there will be a corresponding answer

^{C}*A*that

^{C/K}*P*gets right and

^{C}*P*gets wrong. Let

^{K}*A*include both

*K*and

*T*as disjuncts, while excluding

*C*. Then

*A*is true,

*P*(

*A*)=1, and

*P*scores full marks on it (namely, λ

^{K}_{A}on the weighted quadratic measure).

*P*(

^{C}*A*)=0, so

*P*scores bottom marks (−λ

^{C}_{A}).

*A*is also true,

^{C/K}*P*(

^{C}*A*)=1, and

^{C/K}*P*scores top marks (λ

^{C}_{AC/K}), while

*P*(

^{K}*A*)=0, and

^{C/K}*P*scores bottom marks (−λ

^{K}_{AC/K}). Since

*A*and

*A*have the same strength, there seems little justification for assigning them distinct λ–values. As far as

^{C/K}*A*and

*A*go, (provided λ

^{C/K}_{A}= λ

_{AC/K}),

*K*and

*C*are level-pegging. But we can pair off correct and incorrect answers across the board like this showing that, absent some gerrymandered λ-values,

*K*and

*C*will end up being on a par.

Wallace and Greaves (2005) assert that the weighted quadratic
measures “can take account of the value of
verisimilitude.” They suggest this can be done “by a
judicious choice of the coefficients” (i.e. the
λ–values). They go on to say: “... we simply assign
high λ_{A} when *A* is a set of 'close'
states.” (Wallace and Greaves 2005, 628). 'Close' here
presumably means 'close to the actual world'. But whether an
answer *A* contains complete answers that are close to the actual
world — that is, whether *A* is *truthlike* — is
clearly a world-dependent matter. The coefficients
λ_{A} are not world-dependent. One could, of
course, append world-dependent coefficients to the local quadratic
measure, but then there is no guarantee that the resulting scoring
rule will satisfy an important desideratum— namely *
propriety* or *cogency*. (See below.)

This defect of the quadratic class of measures corresponds to a problem familiar from the investigation of attempts to capture truthlikeness simply in terms of classes of true and false consequences, or in terms of truth value and content alone. Any two complete false answers yield precisely the same number of true consequences and the same number of false consequences. The local quadratic measure accords the same value to each true answer and the same disvalue to each false answer. So if, for example, all answers are given the same λ–weighting in the global quadratic measure, any two opinionated false answers will be accorded the same degree of accuracy by the corresponding global measure.

It may be that there are ways of tinkering with the
λ–terms to avoid the objection, but on the face of it the
notions of local cognitive value embodied in both the linear and
quadratic rules seem to be deficient because they omit considerations
of truthlikeness even while valuing truth. It seems that any adequate
measure of the cognitive value of investing a certain degree of belief
in *A* should take into account not just whether *A* is true
or false, but here the truth lies in relation to the worlds
in *A*.

One rather simple articulation of this thought for local cognitive value is this:

Cv^{3}_{i}(A,P) =TL(A|C) ×_{i}P(A).

Suppose we calibrate degrees of truthlikeness so that the complete
true answer has truthlikeness degree 1, the least truthlike
proposition has truthlikeness degree −1, and tautologous answers
have truthlikeness degree 0. (This is easy to do in the propositional
framework with the city-block measure and extending
by *average*.) Then this measure of cognitive value entails that
believing a tautology to the correct degree (namely 1) has 0 cognitive
value, as does investing any degree of credence in any proposition
with the same degree of truthlikeness as a tautology. So believing
trivial truths would add nothing to cognitive value. Only if the
truthlikeness of a proposition exceeds that of a tautology would
believing it add anything to cognitive value. And any degree of belief
in a proposition less truthlike than the tautology would detract from
cognitive value. If there are *truths* that are less truthlike
than tautologies (as there are on the *average* proposal) then
believing such truths will also detract from overall cognitive
value.

Whatever our account of cognitive value, each credal state *P*
assigns an expected cognitive value to every credal state *Q*
(including *P* itself of course).

(ECV_{P}Q) = ∑_{i}P(C)_{i}CV(_{i}Q).

Suppose we accept the injunction that one ought to maximize
expected value as calculated from the perspective of one's current
credal state. Let us say that a credal state *P*
is *self-defeating* if to maximize expected value from the
perspective of *P* itself one would have to adopt some distinct
credal state *Q*, * without the benefit of any new
information*:

Pisself-defeating= for someQdistinct fromP,(ECV_{P}Q) >(ECV_{P}P).

The requirement of *cogency* requires that no credal state
be self-defeating. No credal state demands that you shift to another
credal state without new information. One feature of the quadratic
family of proper scoring rules is that they guarantee cogency, and
cogency is an extremely attractive feature of cognitive value. From
cogency alone one can construct arguments for the various elements of
probabilism. For example, cogency effectively guarantees that the
credence function must obey the standard axioms governing additivity
(Leitgeb and Pettigrew 2010); cogency guarantees a version of the
value-of-learning theorem in purely cognitive terms (Oddie, 1997);
cogency provides an argument that conditionalization is the only
method of updating compatible with the maximization of expected
cognitive value (Oddie 1997, Greaves and Wallace 2005, and Leitgeb and
Pettigrew 2010). Any account of cognitive value that doesn't deliver
cogency would seem to be somewhat problematic.

One problem with the truthlikeness-sensitive local
measure *Cv*^{4} is that it yields, by additivity, a
global measure of cognitive value that violates cogency. For example,
if we use the city-block measure for propositional worlds, and extend
that to propositions by any of the three plausible extension functions
(*average*, *min-max-average*, *min-sum-average*) some
credal states turn out to be self-defeating. Perhaps there are
plausible accounts of total cognitive value that capture the idea
that, other things being equal, beliefs are better the greater their
truthlikeness, as well as the idea that a credal state is better the
closer the credence is to the truth value. If there is no such account
of cognitive value then the cognitive value of truthlikeness and the
cognitive value of believing truly pull in different directions.

Maher (1993) argues both that truthlikeness is an important and
viable notion, and that it is intimately connected with cognitive
value. But instead of trying to define verisimilitude first and then
deriving cognitive value from that, perhaps together with various
other ingredients, Maher suggests we should proceed in the opposite
direction. We should start with plausible constraints on cognitive
value (or as he prefers to call it, cognitive utility) and derive a
notion of verisimilitude from that. According to Maher, the cognitive
utility of a proposition *A*, given that *C _{i}* is
the truth, is identical to the cognitive utility of

*accepting*the proposition in those circumstances. The verisimilitude of a proposition can then be identified with the cognitive utility of accepting it. (Maher 1993, 228). Maher does not define

*acceptance*explicitly. But, roughly speaking, according to Maher a person accepts

*P*if she asserts

*P*sincerely (or would be prepared to assert

*P*sincerely). But her investing a high probability in

*P*is neither necessary nor sufficient for her to accept

*P*.

Maher lays down what appear to be fairly modest constraints on what
would count as an acceptable cognitive utility function for acceptance
(*CU*) all of which are independent of the agent's credences.
For example, his first constraint is *Respect for truth* (Maher
1990, 210):

IfCentails_{i}AandCentails ~_{j}A, thenCU(_{i}A) ≥CU(_{j}A).

Note that this is not a strict inequality. All this guarantees is
that it is not cognitively worse to accept *A* when it is true
than when it is false. It need not be cognitively better to
accept *A* when true than when false. However, even this
apparently weak condition is not uncontroversial. If a false
proposition can be closer to the truth than its own (true) negation,
then the corresponding principle will not hold of verisimilitude. And
almost all the accounts we have considered so far allow this. The
proposition that the number of planets is 9 is false, but it comes as
close to the truth as any false proposition can come. Compare this
with the nearly tautologous proposition that the number is either less
than 9 or greater than 9. That true proposition allows a vast range of
possibilities almost all of which lie vast distances from the
truth.

Mayer also stipulates that the cognitive utility of
accepting *A* is insensitive to where the truth lies within the
range of *A*. We could call this *Truth-location
indifference* (Maher 1990, 211):

IfCand_{i}Cboth entail_{j}A, thenCU(_{i}A) =CU(_{j}A).

Truth location indifference is also controversial. Suppose you acccept that the number of the planets is either 7, 8, 9 or 9 billion. This can be true in four different ways. If the number of the planets is 8 then, intuitively, your belief is overall closer to the truth than if the number is 9 billion.

Maher's third main constraint is *Respect for information*
(Maher 1990, 213):

IfCentails both_{i}AandB, thenCU(_{i}A&B) ≥CU(_{i}A), for allAandB.

This corresponds to the weak value of content for truths. As we have seen, this too is a controversial principle in the truthlikeness debate. Some theorists accept it, but there are some worthy arguments against it.

Maher's constraints allow a good deal of latitude in what can be cognitively valued, and according to Maher that is precisely as it should be. It is the same with practical utility functions. There are a wide range of legitimate cognitive utility functions, all of which respect the core values of scientific inquiry. Even if the core values of scientific inquiry are not captured by these three constraints, Maher's approach — of deriving verisimilitude from cognitive value rather than vice versa — may well be a fruitful one, and worthy of further exploration.

## 4. Conclusion

We are all fallibilists now, but we are not all skeptics, or antirealists or nihilists. Most of us think inquiries can and do progress even when they fall short of their goal of locating the truth of the matter. We think that an inquiry can progress by moving from one falsehood to another falsehood, or from one imperfect credal state to another. To reconcile epistemic optimism with realism in the teeth of the dismal induction we need a viable concept of truthlikeness, a viable account of the empirical indicators of truthlikeness, and a viable account of the role of truthlikeness in cognitive value. And all three accounts must fit together appropriately.

There are a number of approaches to the logical problem of truthlikeness but, unfortunately, there is as yet little consensus on what constitutes the best or most promising approach, and prospects for combining the best features of each approach do not at this stage seem bright. There is, however, much work to be done on both the epistemological and the axiological aspects of truthlikeness, and it may well be that new constraints will emerge from those investigations that will help facilitate a fully adequate solution to the logical problem as well.

## Bibliography

- Aronson, J., Harre, R., and Way, E.C., 1995,
*Realism Rescued: How Scientific Progress is Possible*, Chicago: Open Court. - Aronson, J., 1997, “Truth, Verisimilitude, and Natural Kinds”,
*Philosophical Papers*, 26: 71–104. - Armstrong, D. M., 1983,
*What is a Law of Nature?*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Barnes, E., 1990, “The Language Dependence of Accuracy”,
*Synthese*, 84: 54–95. - –––, 1991, “Beyond Verisimilitude: A
Linguistically Invariant Basis for Scientific Progress”,
*Synthese*, 88: 309–339. - –––, 1995, “Truthlikeness, Translation, and
Approximate Causal Explanation”,
*Philosophy of Science*, 62/2: 15–226. - Bealer, G., 1982,
*Quality and Concept*, Oxford: Clarendon. - Brink, C., & Heidema, J., 1987, “A verisimilar ordering of
theories phrased in a propositional language”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 38: 533–549. - Britton, T., 2004, “The problem of verisimilitude and counting
partially identical properties”,
*Synthese*, 141: 77–95. - Britz, K., and Brink, C., 1995, “Computing verisimilitude”,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 36(2): 30–43. - Burger, I. C., and Heidema, J., 1994, “Comparing theories by their
positive and negative contents”,
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 45: 605–630. - Burger, I. C., and Heidema, J., 2005, “For better, for worse:
comparative orderings on states and theories” in R. Festa, A. Aliseda,
and J. Peijnenburg (eds.),
*Confirmation, Empirical Progress, and Truth Approximation*, Amsterdam, New York: Rodopi, 459–488. - Carnap, Rudolf, 1952,
*The Continuum of Inductive Methods*. Chicago: University of Chicago Press. - Cevolani, G., Festa, R, & Kuipers, T. A. F. 2013,
“Verisimilitude and belief change for nomic conjunctive
theories”,
*Synthese*, 190(16): 3307–3324. - Cohen, L.J., 1980, “What has science to do with truth?”,
*Synthese*, 45: 489–510. - –––, 1987, “Verisimilitude and legisimilitude”, in Kuipers 1987a, 129–45.
- Gärdenfors, P., 2000,
*Conceptual Spaces*, Cambridge: MIT Press. - Gemes, K., 2007, “Verisimilitude and Content”,
*Synthese*, 154(2): 293–306. - Gerla, G., 1992, “Distances, diameters and verisimilitude of
theories”,
*Archive for mathematical Logic*, 31(6): 407–14. - Gerla, G., 2007, “Point free geometry and verisimilitude of
theories”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 36: 707–733. - Gärdenfors, P., 2000,
*Conceptual Spaces*, Cambridge: MIT Press. - Goldstick, D. and B. O'Neill, 1988. “Truer”
in
*Philosophy of Science*, 55: 583–597. - Goldman, A., 1999,
*Knowledge in a Social World*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Good, I.J., 1967, “On the Principle of Total
Evidence”, in
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 17(4): 319–321. - Harris, J., 1974, “Popper's definition of
‘Verisimilitude’”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 25: 160–166. - Hempel, Carl G., 1960, “Inductive inconsistencies”, in
*Synthese*, 12(4): 439–69. - Hilpinen, Risto, 1968,
*Rules of acceptance and inductive logic*. Amsterdam: North Holland. - –––, 1976, “Approximate truth and
truthlikeness”, in Przelecki,
*et al*. (eds.),*Formal Methods in the Methodology of the Empirical Sciences*, Dordrecht: Reidel, 19–42 - Hintikka, J., 1963, “Distributive normal forms in first-order
logic” in
*Formal Systems and Recursive Functions*(Proceedings of the Eighth Logic Colloquium), J.N. Crossley and M.A.E. Dummett (eds.), Amsterdam: North-Holland, 47-90. - –––, 1966, “A two-dimensional continuum of
inductive methods”, in J. Hintikka and P. Suppes,
*Aspects of Inductive Logic*. Dordrecht: Reidel. 113–32. - Horwich, P., 1982,
*Probability and Evidence*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Kieseppa, I.A., 1996,
*Truthlikeness for Multidimensional, Quantitative Cognitive Problems*, Dordrecht: Kluwer. - –––, 1996, “Truthlikeness for Hypotheses
Expressed in Terms of n Quantitative Variables”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 25: 109–134. - –––, 1996, “On the Aim of the Theory of
Verisimilitude”,
*Synthese*, 107: 421–438 - Kuipers, T. A. F. (ed.), 1987a,
*What is closer-to-the-truth? A parade of approaches to truthlikeness*(Poznan Studies in the Philosophy of the Sciences and the Humanities, Volume 10), Amsterdam: Rodopi. - –––, 1987b, “A structuralist approach to truthlikeness”, in Kuipers 1987a, 79–99.
- –––, 1987c, “Truthlikeness of stratified theories”, in Kuipers 1987a, 177–186.
- –––, 1992, “Naive and refined truth
approximation”,
*Synthese*, 93: 299–341. - –––, 2000,
*From Instrumentalism to Constructive Realism*, Dordrecht: Reidel. - –––, 2011, “Basic and Refined Nomic Truth
Approximation by Evidence-Guided Belief Revision in AGM-Terms”,
*Erkenntnis*, 75(2): 223–236. - Lavalette, Gerard R. Renardel de & Zwart, Sjoerd D., 2011,
Belief Revision and Verisimilitude Based on Preference and Truth
Orderings.
*Erkenntnis*, 75(2): 237–254. - Leitgeb, H. and R. Pettigrew, 2010, “An Objective Justification of Bayesianism I: Measuring Inaccuracy”, Philosophy of Science, 77: 201–235.
- Levi, Isaac, 1967,
*Gambling with Truth*. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Lewis, David, 1988, “Statements Partly About Observation”, in
*Philosophical Papers*, 17: 1–3 - Maher, Patrick, 1993,
*Betting on Theories*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Miller, D., 1972, “The Truth-likeness of Truthlikeness”,
*Analysis*, 33(2): 50–55. - –––, 1974a, “Popper's Qualitative Theory of
Verisimilitude”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 25: 166–177. - –––, 1974b, “On the Comparison of False Theories
by Their Bases”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 25(2): 178–188 - –––, 1975a, “The Accuracy of Predictions”,
*Synthese*30(1–2): 159–191. - –––, 1975b, “The Accuracy of Predictions: A
Reply”,
*Synthese*, 30(1–2): 207–21. - –––, 1976, “Verisimilitude Redeflated”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 27(4): 363–381. - –––, 1977, “Bunge's Theory of Partial Truth Is No
Such Thing”,
*Philosophical Studies*, 31(2): 147–150. - –––, 1978a, “The Distance Between Constituents”,
*Synthese*, 38(2): 197–212. - –––, 1978b, “On Distance from the Truth as a True
Distance”, in Hintikka
*et al*. (eds.),*Essays on Mathematical and Philosophical Logic*, Dordrecht: Reidel, 415–435. - –––, 1982, “Truth, Truthlikeness, Approximate
Truth”,
*Fundamenta Scientiae*, 3(1): 93–101 - –––, 1984a, “Impartial Truth”, in Skala
*et al*. (eds.),*Aspects of Vagueness*, Dordrecht: Reidel, 75–90. - –––, 1984b, “A Geometry of Logic”, in Skala
*et al*. (eds.),*Aspects of Vagueness*, Dordrecht: Reidel, 91–104. - –––, 1990, “Some Logical Mensuration”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 41: 281–90. - –––, 1994,
*Critical Rationalism: A Restatement and Defence*, Chicago: Open Court. - –––, 2006,
*Out Of Error: Further Essays on Critical Rationalism*, Aldershot: Ashgate. - Mormann, T., 2005, “Geometry of Logic and Truth
Approximation”, in Festa, R., et al. (eds.),
*Poznan Studies in the Philosophy of the Sciences and the Humanities: Confirmation, Empirical Progress and Truth Approximation*, 83: 431–54. - –––, 2006, “Truthlikeness for Theories on
Countable Languages”, Jarvie, I. et al. (eds.)
*Karl Popper: A Centenary Assessment. Volume III: Science*, Aldershot: Ashgate, 3–15. - Newton-Smith, W.H., 1981,
*The Rationality of Science*, Boston: Routledge & Kegan Paul. - Niiniluoto, I., 1977, “On the Truthlikeness of
Generalizations”, in Butts
*et al*. (eds.),*Basic Problems in Methodology and Linguistics*, Dordrecht: Reidel, 121–147. - –––, 1978a, “Truthlikeness: Comments on Recent
Discussion”,
*Synthese*, 38: 281–329. - –––, 1978b, “Verisimilitude, Theory-Change, and
Scientific Progress”, in I. Niiniluoto
*et al*. (eds.),*The Logic and Epistemology of Scientific Change*,*Acta Philosophica Fennica*, 30(2–4), Amsterdam: North-Holland, 243–264. - –––, 1979a, “Truthlikeness in First-Order
Languages”, in I. Niiniluoto
*et al*. (eds.),*Essays on Mathematical and Philosophical Logic*, Dordrecht: Reidel, 437–458. - –––, 1979b, “Degrees of Truthlikeness: From
Singular Sentences to Generalizations”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 30: 371–376. - –––, 1982a, “Scientific Progress”,
*Synthese*, 45(3): 427–462. - –––, 1982b, “What Shall We Do With
Verisimilitude?”,
*Philosophy of Science*, 49: 181–197. - –––, 1983, “Verisimilitude vs. Legisimilitude”,
*Studia Logica*, 42(2–3): 315–329. - –––, 1986, “Truthlikeness and Bayesian
Estimation”,
*Synthese*, 67: 321–346. - –––, 1987a, “How to Define Verisimilitude”, in Kuipers 1987a, 11–23.
- –––, 1987b, “Verisimilitude with Indefinite Truth”, in Kuipers 1987a, 187–195.
- –––, 1987c,
*Truthlikeness*, Dordrecht: Reidel. - –––. “Reference Invariance and Truthlikeness”, in
*Philosophy of Science*64 (1997), 546–554. - –––, 1998, “Survey Article: Verisimilitude: The
Third Period”, in
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 49: 1–29. - –––, 1999,
*Critical Scientific Realism*, Oxford: Clarendon. - –––, 2003, “Content and likeness
definitions of verisimilitude”, in Hintikka et al. (eds.)
*Philosophy and Logic: In Search of the Polish Tradition*, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 27–36. - –––, 2005, “Abduction and truthlikeness”,
in.
*Poznan Studies in the Philosophy of the Sciences and the Humanities*, 83(1): 255–275. - –––, 2011, “Revising beliefs towards the truth”,
in
*Erkenntnis*, 75: 165–181. - Oddie, G., 1978, “Verisimilitude and distance in logical space”,
*Acta Philosophica Fennica*, 30(2–4): 227–243. - –––, 1982, “Cohen on verisimilitude and natural
necessity”,
*Synthese*, 51: 355–79. - –––, 1986a,
*Likeness to Truth*, (Western Ontario Series in Philosophy of Science), Dordrecht: Reidel. - –––, 1986b, “The poverty of the Popperian program
for truthlikeness”,
*Philosophy of Science*, 53(2): 163–78. - –––, 1987, “Truthlikeness and the convexity of
propositions” in
*What is Closer-to-the-Truth?*, T. Kuipers (ed.), Amsterdam: Rodopi, 197–217. - –––, 1990, “Verisimilitude by power relations”,
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 41: 129–35. - –––, 1997, “Conditionalization, cogency and
cognitive value”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 48: 533–41. - –––, 2008, “Truthlikeness and Value”, in
*Festschrift for Ilkka Niiniluoto*, College Publications: London, 225–40. - –––, 2013, “The content, consequence and
likeness approaches to verisimilitude: compatibility,
trivialization,and underdetermination”,
*Synthese*, 190: 1647–1687; first published online 2011. doi:10.1007/s11229-011-9930-8 - Oddie, G. and P. Milne, 1991, “Act and value: expectations
and the representability of moral theories”,
*Theoria*, 48: 165–82. - Pearce, D., 1983, “Truthlikeness and translation: a comment on
Oddie”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 34: 380–5. - Popper, K. R., 1963,
*Conjectures and Refutations*, London: Routledge. - –––, 1976, “A note on
verisimilitude”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 27(2): 147–159. - Psillos, S., 1999,
*Scientific Realism: How Science Tracks Truth*, London: Routledge. - Rosenkrantz, R., 1975, “Truthlikeness: comments on David
Miller”,
*Synthese*, 30(1–2): 193–7. - Ryan, M. and P.Y. Schobens, 1995, “Belief revision and
verisimilitude”,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 36: 15–29. - Schurz, G., and Weingartner, P., 1987, “Verisimilitude defined by relevant consequence-elements”, in Kuipers 1987a, 47-77.
- –––, 2010, “Zwart and Franssen's
impossibility theorem holds for possible-world-accounts but not for
consequence-accounts of verisimilitude”,
*Synthese*172(3): 415–36. - Smith, N., 2005, “Vagueness as closeness”,
*Australasian Journal of Philosophy*, 83: 157–83 - Sorenson, R. 2007, “Logically Equivalent: But Closer to the
Truth”,
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 58: 287–97. - Tarski, A., 1969, “The concept of truth in formalized
languages” in J. Woodger (ed.),
*Logic, Semantics, and Metamathematics*, Oxford: Clarendon. - Teller, P., 2001, “The Twilight of the Perfect Model
Model”,
*Erkenntnis*, 55: 393–415. - Tichý, P., 1974, “On Popper's definitions of
verisimilitude”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 25: 155–160. - –––, 1976, “Verisimilitude
Redefined”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 27: 25–42. - –––, 1978, “Verisimilitude Revisited”
*Synthese*, 38: 175–196. - Tooley, M., 1977, “The Nature of Laws”,
*Canadian Journal of Philosophy*, 7: 667–698. - Urbach, P., 1983, “Intimations of similarity: the shaky basis of
verisimilitude”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 34: 166–75. - Vetter, H., 1977, “A new concept of
verisimilitude”,
*Theory and Decision*, 8: 369–75. - Volpe, G., 1995, “A semantic approach to comparative
verisimilitude”,
*The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 46: 563–82. - Weston, T., 1992, “Approximate truth and scientific realism”,
*Philosophy of Science*, 59: 53–74. - Zamora Bonilla, J. P., 1992, “Truthlikeness Without Truth: A
Methodological Approach”,
*Synthese*, 93: 343–72. - –––, 1996, “Verisimilitude, Structuralism and
Scientific Progress”,
*Erkenntnis*, 44: 25–47. - –––, 2000, “Truthlikeness, Rationality and
Scientific Method”,
*Synthese*, 122: 321–335. - –––, 2002, “Verisimilitude and the Dynamics of
Scientific Research Programmes”,
*Journal for the General Philosophy of Science*, 33: 349–368 - Zwart, S. D., 2001,
*Refined Verisimilitude*, Dordrecht: Kluwer. - Zwart, S. D., and M. Franssen, 2007, “An impossibility theorem for
verisimilitude”,
*Synthese*, 158(1): 75–92.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]