Bohmian Mechanics

First published Fri Oct 26, 2001; substantive revision Mon Mar 27, 2017

Bohmian mechanics, which is also called the de Broglie-Bohm theory, the pilot-wave model, and the causal interpretation of quantum mechanics, is a version of quantum theory discovered by Louis de Broglie in 1927 and rediscovered by David Bohm in 1952. It is the simplest example of what is often called a hidden variables interpretation of quantum mechanics. In Bohmian mechanics a system of particles is described in part by its wave function, evolving, as usual, according to Schrödinger’s equation. However, the wave function provides only a partial description of the system. This description is completed by the specification of the actual positions of the particles. The latter evolve according to the “guiding equation”, which expresses the velocities of the particles in terms of the wave function. Thus, in Bohmian mechanics the configuration of a system of particles evolves via a deterministic motion choreographed by the wave function. In particular, when a particle is sent into a two-slit apparatus, the slit through which it passes and its location upon arrival on the photographic plate are completely determined by its initial position and wave function.

Bohmian mechanics inherits and makes explicit the nonlocality implicit in the notion, common to just about all formulations and interpretations of quantum theory, of a wave function on the configuration space of a many-particle system. It accounts for all of the phenomena governed by nonrelativistic quantum mechanics, from spectral lines and scattering theory to superconductivity, the quantum Hall effect and quantum computing. In particular, the usual measurement postulates of quantum theory, including collapse of the wave function and probabilities given by the absolute square of probability amplitudes, emerge from an analysis of the two equations of motion: Schrödinger’s equation and the guiding equation. No invocation of a special, and somewhat obscure, status for observation is required.

1. The Completeness of the Quantum Mechanical Description

Conceptual difficulties have plagued quantum mechanics since its inception, despite its extraordinary predictive successes. The basic problem, plainly put, is this: It is not at all clear what quantum mechanics is about. What, in fact, does quantum mechanics describe?

It might seem, since it is widely agreed that any quantum mechanical system is completely described by its wave function, that quantum mechanics is fundamentally about the behavior of wave functions. Quite naturally, no physicist wanted this to be true more than did Erwin Schrödinger, the father of the wave function. Nonetheless, Schrödinger ultimately found this impossible to believe. His difficulty had little to do with the novelty of the wave function:

That it is an abstract, unintuitive mathematical construct is a scruple that almost always surfaces against new aids to thought and that carries no great message. (Schrödinger [1935] 1980: 327)

Rather, it was that the “blurring” that the spread out character of the wave function suggests “affects macroscopically tangible and visible things, for which the term ‘blurring’ seems simply wrong”.

For example, in the same paper Schrödinger noted that it may happen in radioactive decay that

the emerging particle is described … as a spherical wave … that impinges continuously on a surrounding luminescent screen over its full expanse. The screen however does not show a more or less constant uniform surface glow, but rather lights up at one instant at one spot …. (Schrödinger [1935] 1980: 327–328)

And he observed that one can easily arrange, for example by including a cat in the system, “quite ridiculous cases” with

the \(\psi\)-function of the entire system having in it the living and the dead cat (pardon the expression) mixed or smeared out in equal parts. (Schrödinger [1935] 1980: 328)

It is thus because of the “measurement problem”, of macroscopic superpositions, that Schrödinger found it difficult to regard the wave function as “representing reality”. But then what does? With evident disapproval, Schrödinger observes that

the reigning doctrine rescues itself or us by having recourse to epistemology. We are told that no distinction is to be made between the state of a natural object and what I know about it, or perhaps better, what I can know about it if I go to some trouble. Actually—so they say—there is intrinsically only awareness, observation, measurement. (Schrödinger [1935] 1980: 328)

Many physicists pay lip service to the Copenhagen interpretation—that quantum mechanics is fundamentally about observation or results of measurement. But it is becoming increasingly difficult to find any who, when pressed, will defend this interpretation. It seems clear that quantum mechanics is fundamentally about atoms and electrons, quarks and strings, not those particular macroscopic regularities associated with what we call measurements of the properties of these things. But if these entities are not somehow identified with the wave function itself—and if talk of them is not merely shorthand for elaborate statements about measurements—then where are they to be found in the quantum description?

There is, perhaps, a very simple reason why it is so difficult to discern in the quantum description the objects we believe quantum mechanics ought to describe. Perhaps the quantum mechanical description is not the whole story, a possibility most prominently associated with Albert Einstein. (For a general discussion of Einstein’s scientific philosophy, and in particular of his approach to the conflicting positions of realism and positivism, see the entry on Einstein’s philosophy of science.)

In 1935 Einstein, Boris Podolsky and Nathan Rosen defended this possibility in their famous EPR paper. They concluded with this observation:

While we have thus shown that the wave function does not provide a complete description of the physical reality, we left open the question of whether or not such a description exists. We believe, however, that such a theory is possible. (Einstein et al. 1935: 780)

The argument that the EPR paper advances to support this conclusion invokes quantum correlations and an assumption of locality. (See the entries on the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument in quantum theory and on quantum entanglement and information.)

Later, on the basis of more or less the same considerations as those of Schrödinger quoted above, Einstein again concluded that the wave function does not provide a complete description of individual systems, an idea he called “this most nearly obvious interpretation” (Einstein 1949: 672). In relation to a theory incorporating a more complete description, Einstein remarked that

the statistical quantum theory would … take an approximately analogous position to the statistical mechanics within the framework of classical mechanics. (Einstein 1949: 672)

We note here, and show below, that Bohmian mechanics exactly fits this description.

2. The Impossibility of Hidden Variables … or the Inevitability of Nonlocality?

John von Neumann, one of the greatest mathematicians of the twentieth century, claimed that he had proven that Einstein’s dream of a deterministic completion or reinterpretation of quantum theory was mathematically impossible. He concluded that

It is therefore not, as is often assumed, a question of a re-interpretation of quantum mechanics—the present system of quantum mechanics would have to be objectively false, in order that another description of the elementary processes than the statistical one be possible. (von Neumann [1932] 1955: 325)

Physicists and philosophers of science almost universally accepted von Neumann’s claim. For example, Max Born, who formulated the statistical interpretation of the wave function, assured us that

No concealed parameters can be introduced with the help of which the indeterministic description could be transformed into a deterministic one. Hence if a future theory should be deterministic, it cannot be a modification of the present one but must be essentially different. (Born 1949: 109)

Bohmian mechanics is a counterexample to the claims of von Neumann. Thus von Neumann’s argument must be wrong. In fact, according to John Bell, von Neumann’s assumptions (about the relationships among the values of quantum observables that must be satisfied in a hidden-variables theory) are so unreasonable that the “the proof of von Neumann is not merely false but foolish!” (Mermin 1993: 805, fn 8, quoting an interview in Omni, May, 1988: 88). Nonetheless, some physicists continue to rely on von Neumann’s proof.

Recently, however, physicists more commonly cite the Kochen-Specker Theorem and, more frequently, Bell’s inequality in support of the contention that a deterministic completion of quantum theory is impossible. We still find, a quarter of a century after the rediscovery of Bohmian mechanics in 1952, statements such as these:

The proof he [von Neumann] published …, though it was made much more convincing later on by Kochen and Specker (1967), still uses assumptions which, in my opinion, can quite reasonably be questioned. … In my opinion, the most convincing argument against the theory of hidden variables was presented by J.S. Bell (1964). (Wigner [1976] 1983: 291)

Now there are many more statements of a similar character that we could cite. This quotation is significant because Wigner was one of the leading physicists of his generation. Unlike most of his contemporaries, moreover, he was also profoundly concerned about the conceptual foundations of quantum mechanics and wrote on the subject with great clarity and insight.

There was, however, one physicist who wrote on this subject with even greater clarity and insight than Wigner himself: the very J. S. Bell whom Wigner praises for demonstrating the impossibility of a deterministic completion of quantum theory such as Bohmian mechanics. Here’s how Bell himself reacted to Bohm’s discovery:

But in 1952 I saw the impossible done. It was in papers by David Bohm. Bohm showed explicitly how parameters could indeed be introduced, into nonrelativistic wave mechanics, with the help of which the indeterministic description could be transformed into a deterministic one. More importantly, in my opinion, the subjectivity of the orthodox version, the necessary reference to the “observer”, could be eliminated. …

But why then had Born not told me of this “pilot wave”? If only to point out what was wrong with it? Why did von Neumann not consider it? More extraordinarily, why did people go on producing “impossibility” proofs, after 1952, and as recently as 1978? … Why is the pilot wave picture ignored in text books? Should it not be taught, not as the only way, but as an antidote to the prevailing complacency? To show us that vagueness, subjectivity, and indeterminism, are not forced on us by experimental facts, but by deliberate theoretical choice? (Bell 1982, reprinted in 1987c: 160)

Wigner to the contrary notwithstanding, Bell did not establish the impossibility of a deterministic reformulation of quantum theory, nor did he ever claim to have done so. On the contrary, until his untimely death in 1990, Bell was the prime proponent, and for much of this period almost the sole proponent, of the very theory, Bohmian mechanics, that he supposedly demolished.

Bohmian mechanics is of course as much a counterexample to the Kochen-Specker argument for the impossibility of hidden variables as it is to the one of von Neumann. It is obviously a counterexample to any such argument. However reasonable the assumptions of such an argument, some of them must fail for Bohmian mechanics.

Wigner was quite right to suggest that the assumptions of Kochen and Specker are more convincing than those of von Neumann. They appear, in fact, to be quite reasonable indeed. However, they are not. The impression that they are arises from a pervasive error, an uncritical realism about operators, that we discuss below in the sections on quantum observables, spin, and contextuality.

John Bell replaced the “arbitrary axioms” (Bell 1966, reprinted 1987c: 11) of Kochen-Specker and others by an assumption of locality, of no action-at-a-distance. It would be hard to argue against the reasonableness of such an assumption, even if one were so bold as to doubt its inevitability. Bell showed that any hidden-variables formulation of quantum mechanics must be nonlocal, as, indeed, Bohmian mechanics is. But he showed much much more. (For more detail on Bell’s locality assumption, see Goldstein et al. 2011 and Norsen 2011.)

In a celebrated paper he published in 1964, Bell showed that quantum theory itself is irreducibly nonlocal. (More precisely, Bell’s analysis applies to any single-world version of quantum theory, i.e., any version for which measurements have outcomes that, while they may be random, are nonetheless unambiguous and definite, in contrast to the situation with Everett’s many-worlds version of quantum theory.) This fact about quantum mechanics, based as it is on a short and mathematically simple analysis, could have been recognized soon after the discovery of quantum theory in the 1920’s. That this did not happen is no doubt due in part to the obscurity of orthodox quantum theory and to the ambiguity of its commitments. (It almost did happen: Schrödinger 1935, in his famous cat paper, came remarkably close to discovering a Bell-type argument for quantum nonlocality. For details see Hemmick and Shakur 2012, chapter 4.) It was, in fact, his examination of Bohmian mechanics that led Bell to his nonlocality analysis. In the course of investigating Bohmian mechanics, he observed that:

in this theory an explicit causal mechanism exists whereby the disposition of one piece of apparatus affects the results obtained with a distant piece. …

Bohm of course was well aware of these features of his scheme, and has given them much attention. However, it must be stressed that, to the present writer’s knowledge, there is no proof that any hidden variable account of quantum mechanics must have this extraordinary character. It would therefore be interesting, perhaps, to pursue some further “impossibility proofs”, replacing the arbitrary axioms objected to above by some condition of locality, or of separability of distant systems. (Bell 1966: 452; reprinted 1987c: 11)

In a footnote, Bell added that “Since the completion of this paper such a proof has been found” (1966: 452, fn. 19). He published it in his 1964 paper, “On the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen Paradox”. In this paper he derives Bell’s inequality, the basis of his conclusion of quantum nonlocality. (See the entry on Bell’s Theorem. For a discussion of how nonlocality emerges in Bohmian mechanics, see Section 13.)

It is worth stressing that Bell’s analysis indeed shows that any (single-world) account of quantum phenomena must be nonlocal, not just any hidden variables account. Bell showed that the predictions of standard quantum theory itself imply nonlocality. Thus if these predictions govern nature, then nature is nonlocal. [That nature is so governed, even in the crucial EPR-correlation experiments, has by now been established by a great many experiments. The first rather conclusive such experiment was that of Aspect (Aspect, Dalibard, & Zanghì 1982). More conclusive still is the experiment of Weihs et al. 1998. Very recently there have been several “loop-hole free” tests of Bell’s inequality (Giustina et al. 2015; Hensen et al. 2015; and Shalm et al. 2015).]

Bell, too, stressed this point (by determinism Bell here means hidden variables):

It is important to note that to the limited degree to which determinism plays a role in the EPR argument, it is not assumed but inferred. What is held sacred is the principle of “local causality”—or “no action at a distance”…

It is remarkably difficult to get this point across, that determinism is not a presupposition of the analysis. (Bell 1981a, reprinted 1987c: 143)

Despite my insistence that the determinism was inferred rather than assumed, you might still suspect somehow that it is a preoccupation with determinism that creates the problem. Note well then that the following argument makes no mention whatever of determinism. … Finally you might suspect that the very notion of particle, and particle orbit … has somehow led us astray. … So the following argument will not mention particles, nor indeed fields, nor any other particular picture of what goes on at the microscopic level. Nor will it involve any use of the words “quantum mechanical system”, which can have an unfortunate effect on the discussion. The difficulty is not created by any such picture or any such terminology. It is created by the predictions about the correlations in the visible outputs of certain conceivable experimental set-ups. (Bell 1981a, reprinted 1987c: 150)

The “problem” and “difficulty” to which Bell refers above is the conflict between the predictions of quantum theory and what can be inferred, call it \(C\), from an assumption of locality in Bohm’s version of the EPR argument, a conflict established by Bell’s inequality. \(C\) happens to concern the existence of a certain kind of hidden variables, what might be called local hidden variables, but this fact is of little substantive importance. What is important is not so much the identity of \(C\) as the fact that \(C\) is incompatible with the predictions of quantum theory. The identity of \(C\) is, however, of great historical significance: it is responsible for the misconception that Bell proved that hidden variables are impossible, a belief that physicists until recently almost universally shared, as well as for the view, even now almost universally held, that what Bell’s result does is to rule out local hidden variables, a view that is misleading.

Here again is Bell, expressing the logic of his two-part demonstration of quantum nonlocality, the first part of which is Bohm’s version of the EPR argument, concerning EPRB correlations:

Let me summarize once again the logic that leads to the impasse. The EPRB correlations are such that the result of the experiment on one side immediately foretells that on the other, whenever the analyzers happen to be parallel. If we do not accept the intervention on one side as a causal influence on the other, we seem obliged to admit that the results on both sides are determined in advance anyway, independently of the intervention on the other side, by signals from the source and by the local magnet setting. But this has implications for non-parallel settings which conflict with those of quantum mechanics. So we cannot dismiss intervention on one side as a causal influence on the other. (Bell 1981a, reprinted 1987c: 149)

As with just about everything else in the foundations of quantum mechanics, there remains considerable controversy about what exactly Bell’s analysis demonstrates. (For further insight into the various controversies see Maudlin 2014 and Goldstein et al. 2011.) Nonetheless, the opinion of Bell himself about what he showed is perfectly clear. See Norsen 2011 for a nice overview of Bell’s views on the matter.

3. History

The pilot-wave approach to quantum theory was initiated by Einstein, even before the discovery of quantum mechanics itself. Einstein hoped that interference phenomena involving particle-like photons could be explained if the motion of the photons was somehow guided by the electromagnetic field—which would thus play the role of what he called a Führungsfeld or guiding field (see Wigner [1976] 1983: 262 and Bacciagaluppi and Valentini 2009: Ch. 9). While the notion of the electromagnetic field as guiding field turned out to be rather problematical, Max Born explored the possibility that the wave function could play this role, of guiding field or pilot wave, for a system of electrons in his early paper founding quantum scattering theory (Born 1926). Heisenberg was profoundly unsympathetic.

Not long after Schrödinger’s discovery of wave mechanics in 1926, i.e., of Schrödinger’s equation, Louis de Broglie in effect discovered Bohmian mechanics: In 1927, de Broglie found an equation of particle motion equivalent to the guiding equation for a scalar wave function (de Broglie 1928: 119), and he explained at the 1927 Solvay Congress how this motion could account for quantum interference phenomena. However, despite what is suggested by Bacciagaluppi and Valentini (2009), de Broglie responded very poorly to an objection of Wolfgang Pauli (Pauli 1928) concerning inelastic scattering, no doubt making a rather bad impression on the illustrious audience at the congress.

Born and de Broglie very quickly abandoned the pilot-wave approach and became enthusiastic supporters of the rapidly developing consensus in favor of the Copenhagen interpretation. David Bohm (1952) rediscovered de Broglie’s pilot-wave theory in 1952. He was the first person to genuinely understand its significance and implications. John Bell became its principal proponent during the sixties, seventies and eighties.

For a very good discussion of the history of quantum mechanics, the debates about its foundations, and about the reception of Bohmian mechanics in particular, see Bricmont 2016. See also Beller 1999.

4. The Defining Equations of Bohmian Mechanics

In Bohmian mechanics the wave function, obeying Schrödinger’s equation, does not provide a complete description or representation of a quantum system. Rather, it governs the motion of the fundamental variables, the positions of the particles: In the Bohmian mechanical version of nonrelativistic quantum theory, quantum mechanics is fundamentally about the behavior of particles; the particles are described by their positions, and Bohmian mechanics prescribes how these change with time. In this sense, for Bohmian mechanics the particles are primary, or primitive, while the wave function is secondary, or derivative.

Warning: It is the positions of the particles in Bohmian mechanics that are its “hidden variables”, an unfortunate bit of terminology. As Bell writes, referring to Bohmian mechanics and similar theories,

Absurdly, such theories are known as “hidden variable” theories. Absurdly, for there it is not in the wavefunction that one finds an image of the visible world, and the results of experiments, but in the complementary “hidden”(!) variables. Of course the extra variables are not confined to the visible “macroscopic” scale. For no sharp definition of such a scale could be made. The “microscopic” aspect of the complementary variables is indeed hidden from us. But to admit things not visible to the gross creatures that we are is, in my opinion, to show a decent humility, and not just a lamentable addiction to metaphysics. In any case, the most hidden of all variables, in the pilot wave picture, is the wavefunction, which manifests itself to us only by its influence on the complementary variables. (1987a, reprinted 1987c: 201–202)

Bohmian mechanics is the minimal completion of Schrödinger’s equation, for a nonrelativistic system of particles, to a theory describing a genuine motion of particles. For Bohmian mechanics the state of a system of \(N\) particles is described by its wave function \(\psi = \psi(\boldsymbol{q}_1 ,\ldots ,\boldsymbol{q}_N) = \psi(q)\), a complex (or spinor-valued) function on the space of possible configurations \(q\) of the system, together with its actual configuration \(Q\) defined by the actual positions \(\mathbf{Q}_1 ,\ldots ,\mathbf{Q}_N\) of its particles. (The word “spinor” refers to a suitable array of complex numbers in place of a single one. Spinor-valued wave functions are used in quantum mechanics to describe electrons and other quantum particles that “have spin”.) The theory is then defined by two evolution equations: Schrödinger’s equation \[ i\hslash\frac{\partial \psi}{\partial t} = H\psi \] for \(\psi(t)\), where \(H\) is the nonrelativistic (Schrödinger) Hamiltonian, containing the masses of the particles and a potential energy term, and (writing \(\Im[z]\) for the imaginary part \(b\) of a complex number \(z = a +\di b)\) a first-order evolution equation,

The Guiding Equation \[ \frac{d\mathbf{Q}_k}{dt} = \frac{\hslash}{m_k} \Im {{\psi^*\partial_k\psi} \over{\psi^*\psi}} (\mathbf{Q}_1 ,\ldots ,\mathbf{Q}_N) \]

for \(Q(t)\), the simplest first-order evolution equation for the positions of the particles that is compatible with the Galilean (and time-reversal) covariance of the Schrödinger evolution (Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì 1992a: 852–854). Here \(\hslash\) is Planck’s constant divided by \(2\pi\), m\(_k\) is the mass of the \(k\)-th particle, and \(\partial_k = (\partial /\partial x_k,\partial /\partial y_k,\partial /\partial z_k)\) is the gradient with respect to the generic coordinates \(\boldsymbol{q}_k = (x_k,y_k,z_k)\) of the \(k\)-th particle. If \(\psi\) is spinor-valued, the two products involving \(\psi\) in the equation should be understood as scalar products (involving sums of products of spinor components). When external magnetic fields are present, the gradient should be understood as the covariant derivative, involving the vector potential. (Since the denominator on the right hand side of the guiding equation vanishes at the nodes of \(\psi\), global existence and uniqueness for the Bohmian dynamics is a nontrivial matter. It is proven in Berndl, Dürr, et al. 1995 and in Teufel and Tumulka 2005.)

For an \(N\)-particle system these two equations (together with the detailed specification of the Hamiltonian, including all interactions contributing to the potential energy) completely define Bohmian mechanics. This deterministic theory of particles in motion accounts for all the phenomena of nonrelativistic quantum mechanics, from interference effects to spectral lines (Bohm 1952: 175–178) to spin (Bell 1964: 10). It does so in an entirely ordinary manner, as we explain in the following sections.

For a scalar wave function, describing particles without spin, the form of the guiding equation above is a little more complicated than necessary, since the complex conjugate of the wave function, which appears in the numerator and the denominator, cancels out. If one looks for an evolution equation for the configuration compatible with the space-time symmetries of Schrödinger’s equation, one almost immediately arrives at the guiding equation in this simpler form as the simplest possibility.

However, the form above has two advantages: First, it makes sense for particles with spin—and, in fact, Bohmian mechanics without further ado accounts for all the apparently paradoxical quantum phenomena associated with spin. Secondly, and this is crucial to the fact that Bohmian mechanics is empirically equivalent to orthodox quantum theory, the right hand side of the guiding equation is \(J/\varrho\), the ratio of the quantum probability current to the quantum probability density. This shows that it should require no imagination whatsoever to guess the guiding equation from Schrödinger’s equation, provided one is looking for one, since the classical formula for current is density times velocity. Moreover, it follows from the quantum continuity equation \(\partial \varrho /\partial t + \textrm{div} J = 0\), an immediate consequence of Schrödinger’s equation, that if at some time (say the initial time) the configuration \(Q\) of our system is random, with distribution given by \(\lvert \psi \rvert^2 = \psi *\psi\), this will always be true (provided the system does not interact with its environment).

This demonstrates that it is wrong to claim that the predictions of quantum theory are incompatible with the existence of hidden variables, with an underlying deterministic model in which quantum randomness arises from averaging over ignorance. Bohmian mechanics provides us with just such a model: For any quantum experiment we merely take as the relevant Bohmian system the combined system, including the system upon which the experiment is performed as well as all the measuring instruments and other devices used to perform the experiment (together with all other systems with which these have significant interaction over the course of the experiment). We then obtain the “hidden variables” model by regarding the initial configuration of this big system as random in the usual quantum mechanical way, with distribution given by \(\lvert \psi \rvert^2\). The guiding equation for the big system then transforms the initial configuration into the final configuration at the conclusion of the experiment. It then follows that this final configuration of the big system, including in particular the orientation of instrument pointers, will also be distributed in the quantum mechanical way. Thus our deterministic Bohmian model yields the usual quantum predictions for the results of the experiment.

As the preceding paragraph suggests, and as we discuss in more detail later, Bohmian mechanics does not need any “measurement postulates” or axioms governing the behavior of other “observables”. Any such axioms would be at best redundant and could be inconsistent.

Besides the guiding equation, there are other velocity formulas with nice properties, including Galilean symmetry, and yielding theories that are empirically equivalent to orthodox quantum theory—and to Bohmian mechanics (Deotto & Ghirardi 1998). The Bohmian choice is arguably the simplest. Moreover, Wiseman (2007) has shown that it is the Bohmian velocity formula, given by the guiding equation, that, according to orthodox quantum theory, would be found in a “weak measurement” of the velocity of a particle. (Marian, Zanghì, and Oriols 2016 have recently proposed an explicit procedure for performing such a measurement.) And, somewhat paradoxically, it can be shown (Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì 2009) that according to Bohmian mechanics such a measurement is indeed a genuine measurement of the particle’s velocity—despite the existence of empirically equivalent velocity formulas! Similarly, weak measurements could be used to measure trajectories. In fact, quite recently Kocsis et al. (2011) have used weak measurements to reconstruct the trajectories for single photons “as they undergo two-slit interference”, finding “those predicted in the Bohm-de Broglie interpretation of quantum mechanics”. And Mahler et al. 2016 have experimentally found, using weak measurements, “Bohmian trajectories” for entangled photons, illustrating quantum nonlocality and the phenomenon of “surreal Bohmian trajectories”.

For a single particle the guiding equation defines the motion of a particle guided by a wave in physical 3-dimensional space. One might expect that similar motions might arise classically. Couder & Fort (2006) have shown, by investigating interference-like phenomena in the motion of bouncing oil droplets in a fluid, that this is indeed so. Bush (2015) has further explored this sort of possibility for the emergence of a Bohmian version of quantum mechanics from something like classical fluid dynamics. A serious obstacle to the success of such a program is the quantum entanglement and nonlocality characteristic of many-particle quantum systems.

The “many interacting worlds” approach of Hall, Deckert, & Wiseman (2014), independently advanced by Sebens (2015), retains particle trajectories but attempts to do away with a wave-function at the level of fundamental ontology. What takes its place is a large number of trajectories of points in configuration space, each corresponding to the motions of a finite number of particles in physical space regarded as describing a a world in its own right. These interact in such a way as to mimic trajectories guided by a wave function: a coarse-grained density of worlds takes the place of \(\lvert \psi \rvert^2\). The velocities of the world-particles are required to at least approximately be related to their configurations via some smooth function on configuration space. This condition would be a rather surprising one for the sorts of large systems studied in statistical mechanics. Even more unmotivated from a classical perspective, the velocity function must be the gradient of a multivalued function that obeys a Bohr-Sommerfeld-like quantum condition.

We stress that Bohmian mechanics should be regarded as a theory in its own right. Its viability does not depend on its being derivable from some other theory, classical or otherwise.

5. The Quantum Potential

Bohmian mechanics as presented here is a first-order theory, in which it is the velocity, the rate of change of position, that is fundamental. It is this quantity, given by the guiding equation, that the theory specifies directly and simply. The second-order (Newtonian) concepts of acceleration and force, work and energy do not play any fundamental role. Bohm, however, did not regard his theory in this way. He regarded it, fundamentally, as a second-order theory, describing particles moving under the influence of forces, among which, however, is a force stemming from a “quantum potential”.

In his 1952 hidden-variables paper, Bohm arrived at his theory by writing the wave function in the polar form \(\psi = R\)exp\((iS/\hslash)\), where \(S\) and \(R\) are real, with \(R\) nonnegative, and rewriting Schrödinger’s equation in terms of these new variables to obtain a pair of coupled evolution equations: the continuity equation for \(\varrho = R^2\) and a modified Hamilton-Jacobi equation for \(S\). This differs from the usual classical Hamilton-Jacobi equation only by the appearance of an extra term, the quantum potential \[ U = {-}\sum_k (\hslash^2 /2m_k) (\partial_{k}^2 R / R ), \] alongside the classical potential energy term.

Bohm then used the modified Hamilton-Jacobi equation to define particle trajectories just as one does for the classical Hamilton-Jacobi equation, that is, by identifying \(\partial_k S\) with \(m_k\boldsymbol{v}_k\), i.e., by setting \[ d\mathbf{Q}_k /dt = \partial_k S / m_k. \] This is equivalent to the guiding equation for particles without spin. [In this form the (pre-Schrödinger equation) de Broglie relation \(\boldsymbol{p} = \hslash \boldsymbol{k}\), as well as by the eikonal equation of classical optics, already suggest the guiding equation.] The resulting motion is precisely what would be obtained classically if the particles were acted upon by the force generated by the quantum potential, in addition to the usual forces.

The quantum potential formulation of the de Broglie-Bohm theory is still fairly widely used. For example, the monographs by Bohm and Hiley and by Holland present the theory in this way. And regardless of whether or not we regard the quantum potential as fundamental, it can in fact be quite useful. In order to see most clearly that Newtonian mechanics should be expected to emerge from Bohmian mechanics in the classical limit, it is convenient to transform the theory into Bohm’s Hamilton-Jacobi form. Then the (size of the) quantum potential provides a measure of the deviation of Bohmian mechanics from its classical approximation. Moreover, the quantum potential is also useful for developing approximation schemes for solutions to Schrödinger’s equation (Nerukh & Frederick 2000).

However, Bohm’s rewriting of Schrödinger’s equation in terms of variables that seem interpretable in classical terms is not without a cost. The most obvious is an increase in complexity: Schrödinger’s equation is rather simple, and it is linear, whereas the modified Hamilton-Jacobi equation is somewhat complicated, and highly nonlinear. Moreover the latter, since it involves \(R\), requires the continuity equation for its closure. The quantum potential itself is neither simple nor natural. Even to Bohm it seemed “rather strange and arbitrary” (Bohm 1980: 80). And it is not very satisfying to think of the quantum revolution as amounting to the insight that nature is classical after all, except that there is in nature what appears to be a rather ad hoc additional force term, the one arising from the quantum potential. The artificiality that the quantum potential suggests is the price one pays for casting a highly nonclassical theory into a classical mold.

Moreover, the connection between classical mechanics and Bohmian mechanics that the quantum potential suggests is rather misleading. Bohmian mechanics is not simply classical mechanics with an additional force term. In Bohmian mechanics the velocities are not independent of positions, as they are classically, but are constrained by the guiding equation. (In classical Hamilton-Jacobi theory we also have this equation for the velocity, but there the Hamilton-Jacobi function \(S\) can be entirely eliminated and the description in terms of \(S\) simplified and reduced to a finite-dimensional description, with basic variables the positions and the (unconstrained) momenta of all the particles, given by Hamilton’s or Newton’s equations.)

Arguably, the most serious flaw in the quantum potential formulation of Bohmian mechanics is that it gives a completely false impression of the lengths to which we must go in order to convert orthodox quantum theory into something more rational. The quantum potential suggests, as has often been stated, that transforming Schrödinger’s equation into a theory that can account in “realistic” terms for quantum phenomena, many of which are dramatically nonlocal, requires adding to the theory a complicated quantum potential of a grossly nonlocal character. It should be clear that this view is inappropriate. After all, the quantum potential need not even be mentioned in the formulation of Bohmian mechanics, and it in any case merely reflects the wave function, which Bohmian mechanics shares with orthodox quantum theory.

6. The Two-Slit Experiment

According to Richard Feynman, the two-slit experiment for electrons is

a phenomenon which is impossible, absolutely impossible, to explain in any classical way, and which has in it the heart of quantum mechanics. In reality it contains the only mystery. (Feynman, Leighton, & Sands 1963: 37–2)

This experiment

has been designed to contain all of the mystery of quantum mechanics, to put you up against the paradoxes and mysteries and peculiarities of nature one hundred per cent. (Feynman 1967: 130)

As to the question,

How does it really work? What machinery is actually producing this thing? Nobody knows any machinery. Nobody can give you a deeper explanation of this phenomenon than I have given; that is, a description of it. (Feynman 1967: 145)

But Bohmian mechanics is just such a deeper explanation. It resolves in a rather straightforward manner the dilemma of the appearance of both particle and wave properties in one and the same phenomenon: Bohmian mechanics is a theory of motion describing a particle (or particles) guided by a wave. Here we have a family of Bohmian trajectories for the two-slit experiment.

[line drawing, a vertical bar on the left with two openings, multiple lines angle out to the right from each]

Figure 1: An ensemble of trajectories for the two-slit experiment, uniform in the slits.
(adapted by Gernot Bauer from Philippidis, Dewdney, & Hiley 1979: 23, fig. 3)

While each trajectory passes through only one slit, the wave passes through both; the interference profile that therefore develops in the wave generates a similar pattern in the trajectories guided by the wave.

Compare Feynman’s presentation with Bell’s:

Is it not clear from the smallness of the scintillation on the screen that we have to do with a particle? And is it not clear, from the diffraction and interference patterns, that the motion of the particle is directed by a wave? De Broglie showed in detail how the motion of a particle, passing through just one of two holes in screen, could be influenced by waves propagating through both holes. And so influenced that the particle does not go where the waves cancel out, but is attracted to where they cooperate. This idea seems to me so natural and simple, to resolve the wave-particle dilemma in such a clear and ordinary way, that it is a great mystery to me that it was so generally ignored. (Bell [1989] 1987c: 191)

Perhaps the most puzzling aspect of the two-slit experiment is the following: If, by any means whatsoever, it is possible to determine the slit through which the particle passes, the interference pattern will be destroyed. This dramatic effect of observation is, in fact, a simple consequence of Bohmian mechanics. To see this, one must consider the meaning of determining the slit through which the particle passes. This must involve interaction with another system that the Bohmian mechanical analysis must include.

The destruction of interference is related, naturally enough, to the Bohmian mechanical analysis of quantum measurement (Bohm 1952). It occurs via the mechanism that in Bohmian mechanics leads to the “collapse of the wave function”.

For an accessible presentation of the behavior of Bohmian trajectories in scattering and tunneling phenomena, see Norsen 2013.

7. The Measurement Problem

The measurement problem is the most commonly cited of the conceptual difficulties that plague quantum mechanics. (It amounts, more or less, to the paradox of Schrödinger’s cat.) Indeed, for many physicists the measurement problem is not merely one conceptual difficulty of quantum mechanics; it is the conceptual difficulty.

The problem is as follows. Suppose that the wave function of any individual system provides a complete description of that system. When we analyze the process of measurement in quantum mechanical terms, we find that the after-measurement wave function for system and apparatus that arises from Schrödinger’s equation for the composite system typically involves a superposition over terms corresponding to what we would like to regard as the various possible results of the measurement—e.g., different pointer orientations. In this description of the after-measurement situation it is difficult to discern the actual result of the measurement—e.g., some specific pointer orientation. But the whole point of quantum theory, and the reason we should believe in it, is that it is supposed to provide a compelling, or at least an efficient, account of our observations, that is, of the outcomes of measurements. In short, the measurement problem is this: Quantum theory implies that measurements typically fail to have outcomes of the sort the theory was created to explain.

In contrast, if we, like Einstein, regard the description provided by the wave function as incomplete, the measurement problem vanishes: There is no measurement problem with a theory or interpretation in which, as in Bohmian mechanics, the description of the after-measurement situation includes, in addition to the wave function, at least the values of the variables that register the result. In Bohmian mechanics pointers always point.

Often, the measurement problem is expressed a little differently. Textbook quantum theory provides two rules for the evolution of the wave function of a quantum system: A deterministic dynamics given by Schrödinger’s equation when the system is not being “measured” or observed, and a random collapse of the wave function to an eigenstate of the “measured observable” when it is. However, the objection continues, textbook quantum theory does not explain how to reconcile these two apparently incompatible rules.

That this formulation of the measurement problem and the preceding one are more or less equivalent should be reasonably clear: If a wave function provides a complete description of the after-measurement situation, the outcome of the measurement must correspond to a wave function that describes the actual result, that is, a “collapsed” wave function. Hence the collapse rule. But it is difficult to take seriously the idea that different laws than those governing all other interactions should govern those interactions between system and apparatus that we happen to call measurements. Hence the apparent incompatibility of the two rules.

The second formulation of the measurement problem, though basically equivalent to the first, raises an important question: Can Bohmian mechanics itself reconcile these two dynamical rules? How does Bohmian mechanics justify the use of the “collapsed” wave function instead of the original one? This question was answered in Bohm’s first papers on Bohmian mechanics (Bohm 1952: Part I, Section 7 and Part II, Section 2). What would nowadays be called effects of decoherence, which interaction with the environment (air molecules, cosmic rays, internal microscopic degrees of freedom, etc.) produces, make difficult the development of significant overlap between the component of the after-measurement wave function corresponding to the actual result of the measurement and the other components of the after-measurement wave function. (This overlap refers to the configuration space of the very large system that includes all systems with which the original system and apparatus come into interaction.) But without such overlap that component all by itself generates to a high degree of accuracy the future evolution of the configuration of the system and apparatus. The replacement is thus justified as a practical matter (see also Dürr, Goldstein & Zanghì 1992a: Section 5).

Many proponents of orthodox quantum theory believe that decoherence somehow resolves the measurement problem itself. It is not easy to understand this belief. In the first formulation of the measurement problem, nothing prevents us from including in the apparatus all sources of decoherence. But then decoherence can no longer be in any way relevant to the argument. Be that as it may, Bohm (1952) gave one of the best descriptions of the mechanisms of decoherence, though he did not use the word itself. He recognized its importance several decades before it became fashionable. (See also the encyclopedia entry on The Role of Decoherence in Quantum Mechanics.)

8. The Collapse of the Wave Function

In the previous section we indicated that collapse of the wave function can be regarded in Bohmian mechanics as a pragmatic affair. However, there is a sense in which the collapse of the wave function in Bohmian mechanics is more than a matter of convenience. If we focus on the appropriate notion of the wave function, not of the composite of system and apparatus—which strictly speaking remains a superposition if the composite is treated as closed during the measurement process—but of the system itself, we find that for Bohmian mechanics this does indeed collapse, precisely as the quantum formalism says. The key element here is the notion of the conditional wave function of a subsystem of a larger system, which we describe briefly in this section and that Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì 1992a: Section 5, discuss in some detail, together with the related notion of the effective wave function.

For the evolution of the wave function, Bohmian mechanics is formulated in terms of Schrödinger’s equation alone. Nonetheless the textbook collapse rule is a consequence of the Bohmian dynamics. To appreciate this one should first note that, since observation implies interaction, a system under observation cannot be a closed system but rather must be a subsystem of a larger closed system, which we may take to be the entire universe, or any smaller more or less closed system that contains the system to be observed, the subsystem. The configuration \(Q\) of this larger system naturally splits into \(X\), the configuration of the subsystem, and \(Y\), the configuration of the environment of the subsystem.

Suppose the larger system has wave function \(\Psi = \Psi(q) = \Psi(x, y)\). According to Bohmian mechanics, the larger system is then completely described by \(\Psi\), evolving according to Schrödinger’s equation, together with \(X\) and \(Y\). The question then arises—and it is a critical question—as to what should be meant by the wave function of the subsystem.

There is a rather obvious answer for this, a natural function of \(x\) that suitably incorporates the objective structure at hand, namely the conditional wave function \[\psi(x) = \Psi(x, Y)\] obtained by plugging the actual configuration of the environment into the wave function of the larger system. (This definition is appropriate only for scalar wave functions; for particles with spin the situation would be a little more complicated.) It then follows immediately that the configuration of the subsystem obeys the guiding equation with the conditional wave function on its right-hand side.

Moreover, taking into account the way that the conditional wave function depends upon time \(t\) \[\psi_t (x) = \Psi_t (x, Y_t)\] via the time dependence of \(Y\) as well as that of \(\Psi\), it is not difficult to see (Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì 1992a) the following two things about the evolution of the conditional wave: First, that it obeys Schrödinger’s equation for the subsystem when that system is suitably decoupled from its environment. Part of what is meant by this decoupling is that \(\Psi\) has a special form, what might be called an effective product form (similar to but more general than the superposition produced in an “ideal quantum measurement”), in which case the conditional wave function of the subsystem is also called its effective wave function. Second, using the quantum equilibrium hypothesis, that it randomly collapses according to the usual quantum mechanical rules under precisely those conditions on the interaction between the subsystem and its environment that define an ideal quantum measurement.

It is perhaps worth noting that orthodox quantum theory lacks the resources that make it possible to define the conditional wave function, namely, the actual configuration \(Y\) of the environment. Indeed, from an orthodox point of view what should be meant by the wave function of a subsystem is entirely obscure.

9. Quantum Randomness

According to the quantum formalism, for a system with wave function \(\psi\) the probability density for finding its configuration to be \(q\) is \(\lvert\psi(q)\rvert^2\). To the extent that the results of measurement are registered configurationally, at least potentially, it follows that the predictions of Bohmian mechanics for the results of measurement must agree with those of orthodox quantum theory (assuming the same Schrödinger equation for both) provided that it is somehow true for Bohmian mechanics that configurations are random, with distribution given by the quantum equilibrium distribution \(\lvert\psi(q)\rvert^2\). Now the status and justification of this quantum equilibrium hypothesis is a rather delicate matter, one that has been explored in considerable detail (Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì 1992a). Here are a few relevant points.

It is nowadays a rather familiar fact that dynamical systems quite generally give rise to behavior of a statistical character, with the statistics given by the (or a) stationary probability distribution for the dynamics. So it is with Bohmian mechanics, except that for the Bohmian system stationarity is not quite the right concept. Rather it is the notion of equivariance that is relevant. A probability distribution on configuration space \(\varrho^{\psi}\), depending upon the wave function \(\psi\), is equivariant if \[(\varrho^{\psi})_t = \varrho^{\psi_t}\] where the dependence on \(t\) on the right arises from Schrödinger’s equation and on the left from the evolution on probability distributions arising from the flow that the guiding equation induces. Thus equivariance expresses the mutual compatibility, relative to \(\varrho^{\psi}\), of the Schrödinger evolution of the wave function and the Bohmian motion of the configuration. It is an immediate consequence of the guiding equation and the quantum continuity equation that \(\varrho^{\psi} = \lvert\psi(q)\rvert^2\) is equivariant. (It can be shown in fact that this is more or less the only equivariant possibility that is suitably local (Goldstein & Struyve 2007).)

In trying to understand the status in Bohmian mechanics of the quantum equilibrium distribution, it is perhaps helpful to think of

quantum equilibrium, \(\varrho = \lvert\psi \rvert^2\)

as roughly analogous to (classical)

thermodynamic equilibrium, \(\varrho = \textrm{exp} (-H/kT) /Z\),

the probability distribution of the phase-space point of a system in equilibrium at temperature \(T\). (\(Z\) is a normalization constant called the partition function and \(k\) is Boltzmann’s constant.) This analogy has several facets: In both cases the probability distributions are naturally associated with their respective dynamical systems. In particular, these distributions are stationary or, what amounts to the same thing within the framework of Bohmian mechanics, equivariant. In both cases it seems natural to try to justify these equilibrium distributions by means of mixing-type, convergence-to-equilibrium arguments (Bohm 1953; Valentini & Westman 2005). It has been argued, however, that in both cases the ultimate justification for these probability distributions must be in terms of statistical patterns that ensembles of actual subsystems within a typical individual universe exhibit (Bell 1981b, reprinted 1987c: 129; Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì 1992a). In both cases the status of, and justification for, equilibrium distributions is still controversial. It is also perhaps worth noting that the typicality-grounded account of quantum randomness in Bohmian mechanics is extremely similar to Everett’s account (Everett 1957) of quantum randomness for “many worlds”, despite the huge metaphysical differences that exist between these two versions of quantum theory. It can be shown (Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì 1992a) that probabilities for positions given by the quantum equilibrium distribution emerge naturally from an analysis of “equilibrium” for the deterministic dynamical system that Bohmian mechanics defines, much as the Maxwellian velocity distribution emerges from an analysis of classical thermodynamic equilibrium. (For more on the thermodynamic side of the analogy see Goldstein 2001.) Thus with Bohmian mechanics the statistical description in quantum theory indeed takes, as Einstein anticipated, “an approximately analogous position to the statistical mechanics within the framework of classical mechanics”.

10. Quantum Observables

Orthodox quantum theory supplies us with probabilities not merely for positions but for a huge class of quantum observables. It might thus appear that it is a much richer theory than Bohmian mechanics, which seems exclusively concerned with positions. Appearances are, however, misleading. In this regard, as with so much else in the foundations of quantum mechanics, Bell made the crucial observation:

[I]n physics the only observations we must consider are position observations, if only the positions of instrument pointers. It is a great merit of the de Broglie-Bohm picture to force us to consider this fact. If you make axioms, rather than definitions and theorems, about the “measurement” of anything else, then you commit redundancy and risk inconsistency. (Bell 1982, reprinted 1987c: 166)

Consider classical mechanics first. The observables are functions on phase space, functions of the positions and momenta of the particles. The axioms governing the behavior of the basic observables—Newton’s equations for the positions or Hamilton’s for positions and momenta—define the theory. What would be the point of making additional axioms, for other observables? After all, the behavior of the basic observables entirely determines the behavior of any observable. For example, for classical mechanics, the principle of the conservation of energy is a theorem, not an axiom.

The situation might seem to differ in quantum mechanics, as usually construed. Here there is no small set of basic observables having the property that all other observables are functions of them. Moreover, no observables at all are taken seriously as describing objective properties, as actually having values whether or not they are or have been measured. Rather, all talk of observables in quantum mechanics is supposed to be understood as talk about the measurement of the observables.

But if this is so, the situation with regard to other observables in quantum mechanics is not really that different from that in classical mechanics. Whatever quantum mechanics means by the measurement of (the values of) observables—that, we are urged to believe, don’t actually have values—must at least refer to some experiment involving interaction between the “measured” system and a “measuring” apparatus leading to a recognizable result, as given potentially by, say, a pointer orientation. But then if some axioms suffice for the behavior of pointer orientations (at least when they are observed), rules about the measurement of other observables must be theorems, following from those axioms, not additional axioms.

It should be clear from the discussion towards the end of Section 4 and at the beginning of Section 9 that, assuming the quantum equilibrium hypothesis, any analysis of the measurement of a quantum observable for orthodox quantum theory—whatever it is taken to mean and however the corresponding experiment is performed—provides ipso facto at least as adequate an account for Bohmian mechanics. The only part of orthodox quantum theory relevant to the analysis is the Schrödinger evolution, and it shares this with Bohmian mechanics. The main difference between them is that orthodox quantum theory encounters the measurement problem before it reaches a satisfactory conclusion while Bohmian mechanics does not. This difference stems of course from what Bohmian mechanics adds to orthodox quantum theory: actual configurations.

The rest of this section will discuss the significance of quantum observables for Bohmian mechanics. (It follows from what has been said in the three preceding paragraphs that what we conclude here about quantum observables for Bohmian mechanics holds for orthodox quantum theory as well.)

Bohmian mechanics yields a natural association between experiments and so-called generalized observables, given by positive-operator-valued measures (Davies 1976), or POVMs, \(O(dz)\), on the value spaces for the results of the experiments (Berndl, Daumer, et al. 1995). This association is such that the probability distribution of the result \(Z\) of an experiment, when performed upon a system with wave function \(\psi\), is given by \(\langle \psi | O(dz)\psi \rangle\) (where \(\langle | \rangle\) is the usual inner product between quantum state vectors).

Moreover, this conclusion is follows immediately from the very meaning of an experiment from a Bohmian perspective: a coupling of system to apparatus leading to a result \(Z\) that is a function of the final configuration of the total system, e.g., the orientation of a pointer. Analyzed in Bohmian mechanical terms, the experiment defines a map from the initial wave function of the system to the distribution of the result. It follows directly from the structure of Bohmian mechanics, and from the fact that the quantum equilibrium distribution is quadratic in the wave function, that this map is bilinear (or, more precisely, sesquilinear, in that its dependence on one factor of the wave function is antilinear, involving complex conjugation, rather than linear). Such a map is equivalent to a POVM.

The simplest example of a POVM is a standard quantum observable, corresponding to a self-adjoint operator \(A\) on the Hilbert space of quantum states (i.e., wave functions). For Bohmian mechanics, more or less every “measurement-like” experiment is associated with this special kind of POVM. The familiar quantum measurement axiom that the distribution of the result of the “measurement of the observable \(A\)” is given by the spectral measure for \(A\) relative to the wave function (in the very simplest cases just the absolute squares of the so-called probability amplitudes) is thus obtained.

For various reasons, after the discovery of quantum mechanics it quickly became almost universal to speak of an experiment associated with an operator \(A\) in the manner just sketched as a measurement of the observable \(A\)—as if the operator somehow corresponded to a property of the system that the experiment in some sense measures. It has been argued that this assumption, which has been called naive realism about operators, has been a source of considerable confusion about the meaning and implications of quantum theory (Daumer et al. 1997a).

11. Spin

The case of spin illustrates nicely both the way Bohmian mechanics treats non-configurational quantum observables, and some of the difficulties that the naive realism about operators mentioned above causes.

Spin is the canonical quantum observable that has no classical counterpart, reputedly impossible to grasp in a nonquantum way. The difficulty is not quite that spin is quantized in the sense that its allowable values form a discrete set (for a spin-1/2 particle, \(\pm \hslash/2\)). Energy too may be quantized in this sense. Nor is it precisely that the components of spin in the different directions fail to commute—and so cannot be simultaneously discussed, measured, imagined, or whatever it is that we are advised not to do with noncommuting observables. Rather the problem is that there is no ordinary (nonquantum) quantity which, like the spin observable, is a 3-vector and which also is such that its components in all possible directions belong to the same discrete set. The problem, in other words, is that the usual vector relationships among the various components of the spin vector are incompatible with the quantization conditions on the values of these components.

For a particle of spin-1 the problem is even more severe. The components of spin in different directions aren’t simultaneously measurable. Thus, the impossible vector relationships for the spin components of a quantum particle are not observable. Bell (1966), and, independently, Simon Kochen and Ernst Specker (1967) showed that for a spin-1 particle the squares of the spin components in the various directions satisfy, according to quantum theory, a collection of relationships, each individually observable, that taken together are impossible: the relationships are incompatible with the idea that measurements of these observables merely reveal their preexisting values rather than creating them, as quantum theory urges us to believe. Many physicists and philosophers of physics continue to regard the Kochen-Specker Theorem as precluding the possibility of hidden variables.

We thus might naturally wonder how Bohmian mechanics copes with spin. But we have already answered this question. Bohmian mechanics makes sense for particles with spin, i.e., for particles whose wave functions are spinor-valued. When such particles are suitably directed toward Stern-Gerlach magnets, they emerge moving in more or less a discrete set of directions—2 possible directions for a spin-1/2 particle, having 2 spin components, 3 for spin-1 with 3 spin components, and so on. This occurs because the Stern-Gerlach magnets are so designed and oriented that a wave packet (a localized wave function with reasonably well defined velocity) directed towards the magnet will, by virtue of the Schrödinger evolution, separate into distinct packets—corresponding to the spin components of the wave function and moving in the discrete set of directions. The particle itself, depending upon its initial position, ends up in one of the packets moving in one of the directions.

The probability distribution for the result of such a Stern-Gerlach experiment can be conveniently expressed in terms of the quantum mechanical spin operators—for a spin-1/2 particle given by certain 2 by 2 matrices called the Pauli spin matrices—in the manner alluded to above. From a Bohmian perspective there is no hint of paradox in any of this—unless we assume that the spin operators correspond to genuine properties of the particles.

For further discussion and more detailed examples of the Bohmian perspective on spin see Norsen 2014.

12. Contextuality

The Kochen-Specker Theorem, the earlier theorem of Gleason (Gleason 1957 and Bell 1966), and other no-hidden-variables results, including Bell’s inequality (Bell 1964), show that any hidden-variables formulation of quantum mechanics must be contextual. It must violate the noncontextuality assumption “that measurement of an observable must yield the same value independently of what other measurements may be made simultaneously” (1964, reprinted 1987c: 9). To many physicists and philosophers of science contextuality seems too great a price to pay for the rather modest benefits—largely psychological, so they would say—that hidden variables provide.

Even many Bohmians suggest that contextuality departs significantly from classical principles. For example, Bohm and Hiley write that

The context dependence of results of measurements is a further indication of how our interpretation does not imply a simple return to the basic principles of classical physics. (1993: 100)

However, to understand contextuality in Bohmian mechanics almost nothing needs to be explained. Consider an operator \(A\) that commutes with operators \(B\) and \(C\) (which however don’t commute with each other). What is often called the “result for \(A\)” in an experiment for “measuring \(A\) together with \(B\)” usually disagrees with the “result for \(A\)” in an experiment for “measuring \(A\) together with \(C\)”. This is because these experiments differ and different experiments usually have different results. The misleading reference to measurement, which suggests that a pre-existing value of \(A\) is being revealed, makes contextuality seem more than it is.

Seen properly, contextuality amounts to little more than the rather unremarkable observation that results of experiments should depend upon how they are performed, even when the experiments are associated with the same operator in the manner alluded to above. David Albert (1992: 153) has given a particularly simple and striking example of this dependence for Stern-Gerlach experiments “measuring” the \(z\)-component of spin. Reversing the polarity in a magnet for “measuring” the \(z\)-component of spin while keeping the same geometry yields another magnet for “measuring” the \(z\)-component of spin. The use of one or the other of these two magnets will often lead to opposite conclusions about the “value of the \(z\)-component of spin” prior to the “measurement” (for the same initial value of the position of the particle).

As Bell insists:

A final moral concerns terminology. Why did such serious people take so seriously axioms which now seem so arbitrary? I suspect that they were misled by the pernicious misuse of the word “measurement” in contemporary theory. This word very strongly suggests the ascertaining of some preexisting property of some thing, any instrument involved playing a purely passive role. Quantum experiments are just not like that, as we learned especially from Bohr. The results have to be regarded as the joint product of “system” and “apparatus”, the complete experimental set-up. But the misuse of the word “measurement” makes it easy to forget this and then to expect that the “results of measurements” should obey some simple logic in which the apparatus is not mentioned. The resulting difficulties soon show that any such logic is not ordinary logic. It is my impression that the whole vast subject of “Quantum Logic” has arisen in this way from the misuse of a word. I am convinced that the word “measurement” has now been so abused that the field would be significantly advanced by banning its use altogether, in favour for example of the word “experiment”. (Bell 1982, reprinted 1987c: 166)

13. Nonlocality

Bohmian mechanics is manifestly nonlocal. The velocity, as expressed in the guiding equation, of any particle of a many-particle system will typically depend upon the positions of the other, possibly distant, particles whenever the wave function of the system is entangled, i.e., not a product of single-particle wave functions. This is true, for example, for the EPR-Bohm wave function, describing a pair of spin-1/2 particles in the singlet state, that Bell and many others analyzed. Thus Bohmian mechanics makes explicit the most dramatic feature of quantum theory: quantum nonlocality, as discussed in Section 2.

It should be emphasized that the nonlocality of Bohmian mechanics derives solely from the nonlocality, discussed in Section 2, built into the structure of standard quantum theory. This nonlocality originates from a wave function on configuration space, an abstraction which, roughly speaking, combines—or binds—distant particles into a single irreducible reality. As Bell has stressed,

That the guiding wave, in the general case, propagates not in ordinary three-space but in a multidimensional-configuration space is the origin of the notorious “nonlocality” of quantum mechanics. It is a merit of the de Broglie-Bohm version to bring this out so explicitly that it cannot be ignored. (Bell 1980, reprinted 1987c: 115)

Thus the nonlocal velocity relation in the guiding equation is but one aspect of the nonlocality of Bohmian mechanics. There is also the nonlocality, or nonseparability, implicit in the wave function itself, which is present even without the structure—actual configurations—that Bohmian mechanics adds to orthodox quantum theory. As Bell has shown, using the connection between the wave function and the predictions of quantum theory about experimental results, this nonlocality cannot easily be eliminated (see Section 2).

The nonlocality of Bohmian mechanics can be appreciated perhaps most efficiently, in all its aspects, by focusing on the conditional wave function. Suppose, for example, that in an EPR-Bohm experiment particle 1 passes through its Stern-Gerlach magnet before particle 2 arrives at its magnet. Then the orientation of the Stern-Gerlach magnet for particle 1 will significantly affect the conditional wave function of particle 2: If the Stern-Gerlach magnet for particle 1 is oriented so as to “measure the \(z\)-component of spin”, then after particle 1 has passed through its magnet the conditional wave function of particle 2 will be an eigenvector (or eigenstate) of the \(z\)-component of spin (in fact, belonging to the eigenvalue that is the negative of the one “measured” for particle 1), and the same thing is true for any other component of spin. You can dictate the kind of spin eigenstate produced for particle 2 by appropriately choosing the orientation of an arbitrarily distant magnet. As to the future behavior of particle 2, in particular how its magnet affects it, this of course depends very much on the character of its conditional wave function and hence the choice of orientation of the distant magnet strongly influences it.

This nonlocal effect upon the conditional wave function of particle 2 follows from combining the standard analysis of the evolution of the wave function in the EPR-Bohm experiment with the definition of the conditional wave function. (For simplicity, we ignore permutation symmetry.) Before reaching any magnets the EPR-Bohm wave function is a sum of two terms, corresponding to nonvanishing values for two of the four possible joint spin components for the two particles. Each term is a product of an eigenstate for a component of spin in a given direction for particle 1 with the opposite eigenstate (i.e., belonging to the eigenvalue that is the negative of the eigenvalue for particle 1) for the component of spin in the same direction for particle 2. Moreover, by virtue of its symmetry under rotations, the EPR-Bohm wave function has the property that any component of spin, i.e., any direction, can be used in this decomposition. (This property is very interesting.)

Decomposing the EPR-Bohm wave function using the component of spin in the direction associated with the magnet for particle 1, the evolution of the wave function as particle 1 passes its magnet is easily grasped: The evolution of the sum is determined (using the linearity of Schrödinger’s equation) by that of its individual terms, and the evolution of each term by that of each of its factors. The evolution of the particle-1 factor leads to a displacement along the magnetic axis in the direction determined by the (sign of the) spin component (i.e., the eigenvalue), as described in the fourth paragraph of Section 11. Once this displacement has occurred (and is large enough) the conditional wave function for particle 2 will correspond to the term in the sum selected by the actual position of particle 1. In particular, it will be an eigenstate of the component of spin “measured by” the magnet for particle 1. (For a more explicit and detailed discussion see Norsen 2014.)

The nonlocality of Bohmian mechanics has a remarkable feature: it is screened by quantum equilibrium. It is a consequence of the quantum equilibrium hypothesis that the nonlocal effects in Bohmian mechanics don’t yield observable consequences that can be controlled—we can’t use them to send instantaneous messages. This follows from the fact that, given the quantum equilibrium hypothesis, the observable consequences of Bohmian mechanics are the same as those of orthodox quantum theory, for which instantaneous communication based on quantum nonlocality is impossible (see Eberhard 1978). Valentini (1991) emphasizes the importance of quantum equilibrium for obscuring the nonlocality of Bohmian mechanics. (Valentini [2010a] has also suggested the possibility of searching for and exploiting quantum non-equilibrium. However, in contrast with thermodynamic non-equilibrium, we have at present no idea what quantum non-equilibrium, should it exist, would look like, despite claims and arguments to the contrary.)

14. Lorentz Invariance

Like nonrelativistic quantum theory, of which it is a version, Bohmian mechanics and special relativity, a central principle of physics, are not compatible: Bohmian mechanics is not Lorentz invariant. Nor can it easily be modified to accommodate Lorentz invariance. Configurations, defined by the simultaneous positions of all particles, play too crucial a role in its formulation, with the guiding equation defining an evolution on configuration space. (Lorentz invariant extensions of Bohmian mechanics for a single particle, described by the Dirac equation (Bohm & Hiley 1993; Dürr et al. 1999) or the Klein-Gordon equation (Berndl et al. 1996; Nikolic 2005), can easily be achieved, though for a Klein-Gordon particle there are some interesting subtleties, corresponding to what might seem to be a particle traveling backwards in time.)

This difficulty with Lorentz invariance and the nonlocality in Bohmian mechanics are closely related. Since quantum theory itself, by virtue merely of the character of its predictions concerning EPR-Bohm correlations, is irreducibly nonlocal (see Section 2), one might expect considerable difficulty with the Lorentz invariance of orthodox quantum theory as well with Bohmian mechanics. For example, the collapse rule of textbook quantum theory blatantly violates Lorentz invariance. As a matter of fact, the intrinsic nonlocality of quantum theory presents formidable difficulties for the development of any (many-particle) Lorentz invariant formulation that avoids the vagueness of orthodox quantum theory (see Maudlin 1994).

Bell made a somewhat surprising evaluation of the importance of the problem of Lorentz invariance. In an interview with the philosopher Renée Weber, not long before he died, he referred to the paradoxes of quantum mechanics and observed that

Those paradoxes are simply disposed of by the 1952 theory of Bohm, leaving as the question, the question of Lorentz invariance. So one of my missions in life is to get people to see that if they want to talk about the problems of quantum mechanics—the real problems of quantum mechanics—they must be talking about Lorentz invariance. (Interview with John Bell, in Weber 1989, Other Internet Resources)

The most common view on this issue is that a detailed description of microscopic quantum processes, such as would be provided by a putative extension of Bohmian mechanics to the relativistic domain, must violate Lorentz invariance. In this view Lorentz invariance in such a theory would be an emergent symmetry obeyed by our observations—for Bohmian mechanics a statistical consequence of quantum equilibrium that governs the results of quantum experiments. This is the opinion of Bohm and Hiley (1993), of Holland (1993), and of Valentini (1997).

However—unlike nonlocality—violating Lorentz invariance is not inevitable. It should be possible, it seems, to construct a fully Lorentz invariant theory that provides a detailed description of microscopic quantum processes. One way to do this is by using an additional Lorentz invariant dynamical structure, for example a suitable time-like 4-vector field, that permits the definition of a foliation of space-time into space-like hypersurfaces providing a Lorentz invariant notion of “evolving configuration” and along which nonlocal effects are transmitted. See Dürr et al. 1999 for a toy model. Another possibility is that a fully Lorentz invariant account of quantum nonlocality can be achieved without the invocation of additional structure, exploiting only what is already at hand, for example, the wave function of the universe or light-cone structure. For more on the latter possibility, see Goldstein and Tumulka’s model (2003), in which they reconcile relativity and nonlocality through the interplay of opposite arrows of time. For a discussion of the former possibility, see Dürr et al. 2014. In the sort of theory discussed there, the wave function of the universe provides a covariant prescription for the desired foliation. Such a theory would be clearly Lorentz invariant. But it is not so clear that it should be regarded as relativistic.

Be that as it may, Lorentz invariant nonlocality remains somewhat enigmatic. The issues are extremely subtle. For example, Bell rightly would find

disturbing … the impossibility of “messages” faster than light, which follows from ordinary relativistic quantum mechanics in so far as it is unambiguous and adequate for procedures \(we\) [emphasis added] can actually perform. The exact elucidation of concepts like “message” and “we”, would be a formidable challenge. (1981a, reprinted 1987c: 155)

While quantum equilibrium and the absolute uncertainty that it entails (Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì 1992a) may be of some help here, the situation remains puzzling.

15. Objections and Responses

Bohmian mechanics has never been widely accepted in the mainstream of the physics community. Since it is not part of the standard physics curriculum, many physicists—probably the majority—are simply unfamiliar with the theory and how it works. Sometimes the theory is rejected without explicit discussion of reasons for rejection. One also finds objections that are based on simple misunderstandings; among these are claims that some no-go theorem, such as von Neumann’s theorem, the Kochen-Specker theorem, or Bell’s theorem, shows that the theory cannot work. Such objections will not be dealt with here, as the reply to them will be obvious to those who understand the theory. In what follows only objections that are not based on elementary misunderstandings will be discussed.

A common objection is that Bohmian mechanics is too complicated or inelegant. To evaluate this objection one must compare the axioms of Bohmian mechanics with those of standard quantum mechanics. To Schrödinger’s equation, Bohmian mechanics adds the guiding equation; standard quantum mechanics instead requires postulates about experimental outcomes that can only be formulated in terms of a distinction between a quantum system and the experimental apparatus. And, as noted by Hilary Putnam,

In Putnam ([1965]), I rejected Bohm’s interpretation for several reasons which no longer seem good to me. Even today, if you look at the Wikipedia encyclopaedia on the Web, you will find it said that Bohm’s theory is mathematically inelegant. Happily, I did not give that reason in Putnam ([1965]), but in any case it is not true. The formula for the velocity field is extremely simple: you have the probability current in the theory anyway, and you take the velocity vector to be proportional to the current. There is nothing particularly inelegant about that; if anything, it is remarkably elegant! (2005: 262)

One frequent objection is that Bohmian mechanics, since it makes precisely the same predictions as standard quantum mechanics (insofar as the predictions of standard quantum mechanics are unambiguous), is not a distinct theory but merely a reformulation of standard quantum theory. In this vein, Heisenberg wrote,

Bohm’s interpretation cannot be refuted by experiment, and this is true of all the counter-proposals in the first group. From the fundamentally “positivistic” (it would perhaps be better to say “purely physical”) standpoint, we are thus concerned not with counter-proposals to the Copenhagen interpretation, but with its exact repetition in a different language. (Heisenberg 1955: 18)

More recently, Sir Anthony Leggett has echoed this charge. Referring to the measurement problem, he says that Bohmian mechanics provides “little more than verbal window dressing of the basic paradox” (Leggett 2005: 871). And in connection with the double-slit experiment, he writes,

No experimental consequences are drawn from [the assumption of definite particle trajectories] other than the standard predictions of the QM formalism, so whether one regards it as a substantive resolution of the apparent paradox or as little more than a reformulation of it is no doubt a matter of personal taste (the present author inclines towards the latter point of view). (Leggett 2002: R419)

Now Bohmian mechanics and standard quantum mechanics provide clearly different descriptions of what is happening on the microscopic quantum level. So it is only with a purely instrumental attitude towards scientific theories that Bohmian mechanics and standard quantum mechanics can possibly be regarded as different formulations of exactly the same theory. But even if they were, why would this be an objection to Bohmian mechanics? Even if they were, we should still ask which of the two formulations is superior. Those impressed by the “not-a-distinct-theory” objection presumably give considerable weight to the fact that standard quantum mechanics came first. Supporters of Bohmian mechanics give more weight to its greater simplicity and clarity.

The position of Leggett, however, is very difficult to understand. There should be no measurement problem for a physicist with a purely instrumentalist understanding of quantum mechanics. But for more than thirty years Leggett has forcefully argued that quantum mechanics indeed suffers from the measurement problem. For Leggett the problem is so serious that it has led him to suggest that quantum mechanics might fail on the macroscopic level. Thus Leggett is no instrumentalist, and it is hard to understand why he so cavalierly dismisses a theory like Bohmian mechanics that obviously doesn’t suffer from the measurement problem, with which he has been so long concerned.

Sir Roger Penrose also seems to have doubts as to whether Bohmian mechanics indeed resolves the measurement problem. He writes that

it seems to me that some measure of scale is indeed needed, for defining when classical-like behaviour begins to take over from small-scale quantum activity. In common with the other quantum ontologies in which no measurable deviations from standard quantum mechanics is expected, the point of view (e) [Bohmian mechanics] does not possess such a scale measure, so I do not see that it can adequately address the paradox of Schrödinger’s cat. (2005: 811)

But contrary to what he writes, his real concern seems to be with the emergence of classical behavior, and not with the measurement problem per se. With regard to this, we note that the Bohmian evolution of particles, which is always governed by the wave function and is always fundamentally quantum, turns out to be approximately classical when the relevant de Broglie wave length, determined in part by the wave function, is much smaller than the scale on which the potential energy term in Schrödinger’s equation varies (see Allori et al., 2002). Under normal circumstances this condition will be satisfied for the center of mass motion of a macroscopic object.

It is perhaps worth mentioning that despite the empirical equivalence between Bohmian mechanics and orthodox quantum theory, there are a variety of experiments and experimental issues that don’t fit comfortably within the standard quantum formalism but are easily handled by Bohmian mechanics. Among these are dwell and tunneling times (Leavens 1996), escape times and escape positions (Daumer et al. 1997b), scattering theory (Dürr et al., 2000), and quantum chaos (Cushing 1994; Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì 1992b). Especially problematical from an orthodox perspective is quantum cosmology, for which the relevant quantum system is the entire universe, and hence there is no observer outside the system to cause collapse of the wave function upon measurement. In this setting Bohmian models have clarified the issue of the inevitability of the presence of singularities in theories of quantum gravity (Falciano, Pinto-Neto, & Struyve 2015). Moreover, the additional resources present in Bohmian mechanics, in particular the notion of the conditional wave function defined in Section 8, have been useful for the development of approximation schemes for dealing with practical quantum applications (Oriols & Mompart 2012).

Another claim that has become popular in recent years is that Bohmian mechanics is an Everettian, or “many worlds”, interpretation in disguise (see entry on the many worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics for an overview of such interpretations). The idea is that Bohmians, like Everettians, must take the wave-function as physically real. Moreover, since Bohmian mechanics involves no wave-function collapse (for the wave function of the universe), all of the branches of the wave function, and not just the one that happens to be occupied by the actual particle configuration, persist. These branches are those that Everettians regard as representing parallel worlds. As David Deutsch expresses the charge,

the “unoccupied grooves” must be physically real. Moreover they obey the same laws of physics as the “occupied groove” that is supposed to be “the” universe. But that is just another way of saying that they are universes too. … In short, pilot-wave theories are parallel-universes theories in a state of chronic denial. (Deutsch 1996: 225)

See Brown and Wallace (2005) for an extended version of this argument. Not surprisingly, Bohmians do not agree that the branches of the wave function should be construed as representing worlds. For one Bohmian response, see Maudlin (2010). Other Bohmian responses have been given by Lewis (2007) and Valentini (2010b).

The claim of Deutsch, Brown, and Wallace is of a novel character that we should perhaps pause to examine. On the one hand, for anyone who, like Wallace, accepts the viability of a functionalist many-worlds understanding of quantum mechanics—and in particular accepts that it follows as a matter of functional and structural analysis that when the wave function develops suitable complex patterns these ipso facto describe what we should regard as worlds—the claim should be compelling. On the other hand, for those who reject the functional analysis and regard many worlds as ontologically inadequate (see Maudlin 2010), or who, like Vaidman (see the SEP entry on the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics), accepts many worlds on non-functionalist grounds, the claim should seem empty. In other words, one has basically to have already accepted a strong version of many worlds and already rejected Bohm in order to feel the force of the claim.

Another interesting aspect of the claim is this: It seems that one could consider, at least as a logical possibility, a world consisting of particles moving according to some well-defined equations of motion, and in particular according to the equations of Bohmian mechanics. It seems entirely implausible that there should be a logical problem with doing so. We should be extremely sceptical of any argument, like the claim of Deutsch, Brown, and Wallace, that suggests that there is. Thus what, in defense of many worlds, Deutsch, Brown, and Wallace present as an objection to Bohmian mechanics should perhaps be regarded instead as an objection to many worlds itself.

There is one striking feature of Bohmian mechanics that is often presented as an objection: in Bohmian mechanics the wave function acts upon the positions of the particles but, evolving as it does autonomously via Schrödinger’s equation, it is not acted upon by the particles. This is regarded by some Bohmians, not as an objectionable feature of the theory, but as an important clue about the meaning of the quantum-mechanical wave function. Dürr, Goldstein, & Zanghì (1997) and Goldstein & Teufel (2001) discuss this point and suggest that from a deeper perspective than afforded by standard Bohmian mechanics or quantum theory, the wave function should be regarded as nomological, as an object for conveniently expressing the law of motion somewhat analogous to the Hamiltonian in classical mechanics, and that a time-dependent Schrödinger-type equation, from this deeper (cosmological) perspective, is merely phenomenological.

Bohmian mechanics does not account for phenomena such as particle creation and annihilation characteristic of quantum field theory. This is not an objection to Bohmian mechanics but merely a recognition that quantum field theory explains a great deal more than does nonrelativistic quantum mechanics, whether in orthodox or Bohmian form. It does, however, underline the need to find an adequate, if not compelling, Bohmian version of quantum field theory, and of gauge theories in particular. Some rather tentative steps in this direction can be found in Bohm & Hiley 1993, Holland 1993, Bell 1987b), and in some of the articles in Cushing, Fine, & Goldstein 1996. A crucial issue is whether a quantum field theory is fundamentally about fields or particles—or something else entirely. While the most common choice is fields (see Struyve 2010 for an assessment of a variety of possibilities), Bell’s is particles. His proposal is in fact the basis of a canonical extension of Bohmian mechanics to general quantum field theories, and these “Bell-type quantum field theories” (Dürr et al. 2004 and 2005) describe a stochastic evolution of particles that involves particle creation and annihilation. (For a general discussion of this issue, and of the point and value of Bohmian mechanics, see the exchange of letters between Goldstein and Weinberg by following the link provided in the Other Internet Resources section below.)

For an accessible introduction to Bohmian mechanics see Bricmont 2016.


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I am grateful to Joanne Gowa, Paul Oppenheimer, and the subject editors, Guido Bacciagaluppi and Wayne Myrvold, for very careful readings and many valuable suggestions.

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