Richard Price

First published Thu Oct 3, 2019

Richard Price (1723–1791) was a prominent dissenting minister and a leading figure in philosophical and political thought in the second half of the eighteenth century. As well as publishing on a wide range of subjects, including ethics, politics, theology, and probability theory, he also greatly advanced work on actuarial tables, which enabled insurers to predict more accurately the life-expectancy of people in their differing circumstances. His passionate commitment to the cause of liberty led him to take a prominent public role in various campaigns, including a remission of the penalties on non-conformists, and in support of both the American and the French revolutions. His defense of the latter prompted a famous reply by Burke, as well as defenses by his friends Paine and Wollstonecraft.

1. Life, Works, and General Overview

Price was born in Llangeinor, Wales, the son of a dissenting minister. He was initially educated privately, but after the death of his parents was encouraged by an uncle to attend the dissenting academy in Moorfields, London. In 1744 Price became family chaplain to George Streatfield at Stoke Newington. His duties were not onerous, leaving him ample time for study. It was here that he began what became his most important work: A Review of the Principal Questions in Morals (1758; 3rd. ed. 1787). In its main doctrines Price was strongly influenced by Ralph Cudworth, whose Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality was published posthumously in 1731. In 1757 Streatfield died and, his financial circumstances having improved, Price married Sarah Blundell in June of that year and became, shortly after, the minister in Newington Green, where he remained for most of his life.

Price became a leading figure in liberal intellectual groups, especially the “Bowood Circle”, which was named after the house of its leader, Lord Shelburne, and included Joseph Priestley and Benjamin Vaughan. He also belonged to the group that Benjamin Franklin dubbed the “Club of Honest Whigs”: a dining group revolving round John Canton, which included some other members of the Bowood Circle. Other prominent visitors or acquaintances included the eminent politicians, Lord Stanhope, William Pitt the Elder, and the prison reformer John Howard, as well as David Hume, and Adam Smith.

Price was a keen supporter of both the American and French revolutions. In early 1776 he published Observations on the Nature of Civil Liberty, followed by Additional Observations in the next year. In 1784 he added Observations on the Importance of the American Revolution. Price’s support of the colonies earned him the friendship of many of the leading figures in the rebellion, including Franklin, Jefferson, Adams, and Paine. His support led to his being invited by the Continental Congress to assist in the financial administration of the States, and to his being awarded an honorary LL.D. by Yale University (1781, the other honoree that year being George Washington), to add to the honorary doctorates he had already received from Aberdeen and Glasgow Universities. When Lord Shelburne became Prime Minister in 1782 he offered Price the post of his private secretary, which Price refused.

His published sermon, A Discourse on the Love of our Country (1789), defending the French revolution, ignited a pamphlet war, including Burke’s famous and furious response in Reflections on the Revolution in France (1790), as well as equally passionate defenses by his friends Thomas Paine in Rights of Man (1791), and Mary Wollstonecraft in A Vindication of the Rights of Men (1790).

A central aspect of Price’s dissension from the doctrines of the Church of England was his rejection of Trinitarianism. For the Trinitarian, the Godhead is three persons in one substance, so that Christ is fully God as well as fully man. For the Socinian, by contrast, Jesus is merely human: a supreme teacher and exemplar of how to live, but nothing more. Price takes a position between these extremes. Christ is creator and judge, who descended from heaven and became man. He is not God, but the Messiah, and is on no account to be worshipped. When it comes to Christ’s redemptive power, Price again steers a middle course between the Socinian view that Christ saves by precept and example, so that his death was not necessary to salvation, and the Calvinist claim that redemption is wholly the work of God, who saves whom he will save, and damns whom he will damn (see Romans 9:18). For Price, salvation requires the cooperation of both parties. The sinner must of his own free will repent and strive for righteousness, but God is not required to accept repentant sinners, for repentance does not wipe out the consequences of sin. God wipes out all guilt as a reward to Christ for his perfect obedience.

In line with Cudworth, Clarke, and many others, Price rejected theological voluntarism: the view that the precepts of morality depend on God’s will. The fundamental principles of morality are necessary, and thus eternal and immutable. The standard objection to this view is that it limits the sovereignty of God by making him subject to moral demands that are not dependent on him. Price’s response to this difficulty lies in his claim that, since God is eternal truth and reason, and since reason must recognize moral obligations, moral constraints are part of God’s nature, and not distinct from it. Nothing external to God constrains him.

In addition to his writings on ethics, theology, and politics, Price corresponded at length with Joseph Priestley on the topic of free will; their correspondence was published in 1778. He was also a pioneer in probability theory, and edited Thomas Bayes’ major work An Essay Towards Solving a Problem in the Doctrine of Chances (1763). As a consequence of his important introduction to Bayes’ essay he was elected a Fellow of the Royal Society in 1765. His statistical work led to an interest in demography and actuarial calculations. His foundational book, Observations on Reversionary Payments (1771) was in use for about a century, as was his life table compiled by data he drew from a study of Northampton. His Essay on the Population of England (2nd ed. 1780) influenced Thomas Malthus. His concern about the failure of successive governments to tackle the mounting national debt led to his publication, in the same year, of his Appeal to the Public on the Subject of the National Debt (1771), which may have influenced William Pitt the Younger to re-establish the sinking fund for the extinction of the national debt.

It is Price’s views on ethics that remain most relevant to contemporary philosophy, so that will be the central focus of this entry, which will also cover his political theory, theology, and his position on free will.

2. Price’s Moral Philosophy

2.1 Overview

Price can be classified as an Ethical Intuitionist in two respects. First, he rejects empiricism about our acquisition of knowledge, and espouses an intuitionist epistemology in ethics. Empiricists are mistaken in thinking that all knowledge has its basis in experience. There are a number of substantial necessary truths, essential to rational thought, which cannot be established by empirical methods, but which are self-evident. Reflection on them is sufficient to establish their truth. These include, as well as some mathematical and metaphysical truths, a number of fundamental moral principles.

Empiricism is also mistaken in its account of concept acquisition. There are certain simple concepts that cannot be acquired by abstraction from sensory data or from reflecting on the mind’s own operations. Among these are the basic concepts of ethics denoted by words such as: “right”, “wrong”, “good”, “bad”, “obligation”. While nothing in experience itself answers to these concepts, they can be grasped and applied correctly by the understanding to pick out genuine properties of agents and actions. Since we possess these moral concepts, which cannot arise in the ways that empiricists allow, the empiricism to which Locke and Hume subscribe must be false.

Are these sufficient grounds for rejecting empiricism as a methodology? If moral concepts were alone in presenting a difficultly for empiricism, then there might be grounds for maintaining that epistemology, and either denying that there are moral concepts, or at least denying that we have moral knowledge. Price’s main argument against empiricism about concept acquisition consists in finding what Mackie later called companions in guilt; i.e., other concepts which are indispensable, and which we happily use, that cannot be explained on empiricist epistemology of this sort. Price’s rather familiar examples include: solidity, substance, power, cause, duration, inertia, infinity, number, identity, equality, and all modal concepts. If empiricists are successfully to defend their methodology they must either show that the concepts in question can be explained on their epistemology, or bite the bullet and deny that we do have any clear understanding of concepts like these or, at least, that our ideas about such matters are confused or misleading. For Price, by contrast, it is the understanding (a branch of reason), and not sense experience, that is the source of such concepts.

Price is also an Intuitionist in a second and quite different sense in that he embraces pluralism about basic duties. Those of a utilitarian persuasion held that all our duties were founded in one fundamental duty: to be benevolent, in the sense of promoting the well-being of all parties impartially. Price denies this. He contends, first, that we have a duty to give preference to the welfare of some rather than others; second, that there are duties that are quite distinct from benevolence. On the first count, we have positional duties to God, to ourselves, and to those with whom we have a special relationship. On the second, there are some duties, such as gratitude, veracity, and justice, which are quite distinct from benevolence. Indeed, Price claims, our duties to God do not even include benevolence; it does not make sense to suppose we can benefit God, or increase his happiness, by our obedience and worship.

Price recognizes that our various duties may conflict in a particular case: the only way to prevent harm may be to lie; acting justly may be imprudent, and so on. He maintains that in some cases one duty is clearly weightier than another and no perplexity arises. But there are many cases where it is not clear what is the right thing to do, and conscientious people may differ as to which duty should give way in such cases. There is always a determinate answer to the question of which action is right, but as finite creatures we may lack penetration and wisdom to discern it. Doubt about what we should do in a particular case should not, however, infect our confidence in the existence of objective moral truth, for the fundamental principles that we bring to bear on particular cases are self-evident.

These claims have been made familiar in more recent times by W. D. Ross, and consequently much debated, so the focus in what follows will be on what is peculiar to Price’s views.

2.2 Moral Epistemology and Metaphysics

As a moral realist, Price rejects all forms of voluntarism, all forms of the self-interest theory, as well as all forms of the sentimentalist theories of Hutcheson and Hume. A central plank in his arguments against the first two of these positions is what would later become known as the Open Question Argument. Indeed it is Price, and not Moore, that should be credited with its discovery. Price’s challenge, like Moore’s, poses a dilemma for his opponent. Either the opponent is offering an account of what constitutes rightness and wrongness, or she is offering an account of what makes actions right and wrong. Either answer leads to difficulties. Embracing the first horn leaves the proponent open to the Open Question Argument.

As to the schemes which found morality on self-love, on positive laws and compacts, or the Divine Will; they must either mean, that moral good and evil are only other words for advantageous and disadvantageous, willed and forbidden. Or they relate to a very different question; that is, not to the question, what is the nature and true account of virtue; but what is the subject-matter of it.

As far as the former may be the intention of the schemes I have mentioned, they afford little room for controversy. Right and wrong when applied to actions which are commanded or forbidden by the will of God, or that produce good or harm, do not signify merely, that such actions are commanded or forbidden, or that they are useful or hurtful, but a sentiment concerning them and our consequent approbation or disapprobation of the performance of them. Were not this true, it would be palpably absurd in any case to ask, whether it is right to obey a command, or wrong to disobey it; and the propositions, obeying a command is right, or producing happiness is right, would be most trifling. (R 16)

(As Raphael points out, it is clear from the rest of the book that by “sentiment”, Price here means opinion, not feeling.)

If, however, the self-interest theorist, or the utilitarian, takes the second horn, and is propounding a substantial moral theory about what makes actions right or wrong, then she will have to show that her theory survives critical reflection. Is it really true that we have no reason to do anything unless it is in our self-interest, or unless it produces happiness? Price is confident that the answer to these questions is in the negative, but they can be answered only by careful thought about our actual moral judgments.

Whether Price's argument is successful depends on the soundness of the Open Question Argument about which there is continuing disagreement. Price has, however, other arguments against sentimentalism in particular, which is his main target in this book. The disagreement concerns the metaphysical status of moral attributes: are they genuinely properties of actions and agents, or are they best understood as projections of our feelings or sentiments onto actions and agents?

2.2.1 The battle with sentimentalism

Throughout the eighteenth century there was considerable disagreement, which continues today, between sentimentalists and rationalists, about the basis or origin of morals. On the sentimentalist side were those, such as Hutcheson and Hume, who thought that our moral faculty was grounded, not in our ability to reason, but in our capacity to experience emotions, and pleasure or displeasure—in short, in our sentiments. “Morality is more properly felt than judged of” (Hume 1739–40: 470; Book III, Part I, Section 2). We are so constituted that we take pleasure in contemplating some characters and actions, while we are displeased by others. Reason does indeed play a role in moral agency, but a subordinate one. Once our feelings have selected our ends, then we need to use reason to find suitable means to those ends. Despite some differences, most humans share many of their basic emotional responses; we tend to care about the same things. It is in virtue of this widespread agreement that there can be a shared standard of morality. But such agreement is contingent; we can imagine agents very different from ourselves in their emotional make-up. If other agents share our moral outlook it will not be in virtue of our common rationality, but as a result of their having a similar range of affective responses to us.

A main strength of sentimentalism is the apparent ease with which it can explain how our moral attitudes typically motivate us. Since moral attitudes are expressions of the affective rather than the cognitive sides of our nature, there is nothing puzzling about how our desires and aversions, likes and dislikes, approvings and disapprovings, can play a motivational role. Rationalism, by contrast, is frequently charged with being unable to explain the connection between morality and motivation. On the rationalist account, it seems, it must be possible to know what is right or wrong and not care in the least.

In opposition to sentimentalism were ranged those, such as Cudworth, Clarke, Balguy, and Price, who adhered to the more traditional view that moral distinctions are perceived by reason, and that reason has authority to direct our lives. Reason tells us what goals we should aim at, as well as how best to achieve them. It has motivational power.

2.2.2 The battle with sentimentalism: defense

Price offers both defensive and offensive strategies against sentimentalism. On the defensive side, he tries to meet the following objections to his view.

  1. How can reason, rather than our feelings of approval and disapproval, be the origin of our moral concepts?
  2. How can we discern moral properties and make true moral claims about them?
  3. What is the connection between feeling and cognition?
  4. How can reason move us to act?

I briefly discussed the first two questions in §2.1. It turns out that the last two are connected.

Sentimentalists claim that we adopt a moral stance in virtue of our having feelings of approval or disapproval towards an object, action, or practice. Price maintains that this gets things the wrong way round: we have feelings of approval towards an action or a person, because we apprehend that the action is right, or the person morally praiseworthy.

I cannot perceive an action to be right without approving it; or approve it, without being conscious of some satisfaction and complacency. … To behold virtue is to admire it. (R 59)

When we are conscious that an action is fit to be done, or that it ought to be done, it is not conceivable that we can remain uninfluenced, or want a motive to action. … An affection or inclination to rectitude cannot be separated from the view of it. (R 186–7)

Further, to recognize an action as right, or wrong, is to recognize that one has an obligation to do it, or refrain from doing it.

[V]irtue, as such, has a real obligatory power. (R 105)

From the account given of obligation, it follows that rectitude is a law as well as a rule to us; that it not only directs, but binds all, as far as it is perceived … Reason is the guide, the natural and authoritative guide of a rational being. (R 108)

How absurd it is to enquire, what obliges us to practise virtue? … [I]t is the very same as to ask, why are we obliged to do what we are obliged to do. (R 110)

In the passages above, Price is making three claims that are, on his view, inseparable. The first is an espousal of motivational internalism about obligation. To recognize an action as morally required (or forbidden) is to be motivated to do it (or abstain from doing it). The second is a claim about the connection between cognition and feeling: the recognition of the moral character of an action necessarily arouses appropriate feelings in us. We cannot, for example, breach the moral law without suffering remorse and pain. Thirdly, he takes it that, if we are morally obliged to act then we are obliged to act, period. Why? Because the principles of morality are principles of reason; thus we have decisive reason to do what morality dictates. For some philosophers, the question of what I ought to do has a moral and a deliberative reading. Once I have determined what morality requires of me, the deliberative question of what, all things considered, I should do is still open. Price denies this gap. For him the question of why I ought to do what I morally ought to do makes no sense, for it is simply asking why I ought to do what I ought.

In more modern parlance, Price is claiming that, in our practical deliberations, the notions of obligation and duty, right and wrong, are normative ones. Normative features are internally tied to (motivation to) action, since to think one ought or should do something is to think there are decisive reasons to do it, and to think there is decisive reason to do something is, ceteris paribus, to do it. This analysis supplies Price with an answer to the challenge that Rational Intuitionists are unable to explain how awareness of moral facts is sufficient to motivate us. Although moral weakness may cause us to fail to do what we recognize we have decisive reason to do, no rational creature can be wholly unmoved by the awareness that she has such reason, and if she fails to act she is less than fully practically rational in this respect.

These claims are, of course, controversial, and there is no space to discuss them here. But we might note that Price’s position is as old as Western Philosophy itself. It is, at its heart, a Platonist view of value. Rational beings cannot fail to love and be moved by what is good; if they love less than they should it is because they are not fully rational agents.

2.2.3 The battle with sentimentalism: offense

Hutcheson, and following him, Hume, hold that there is an implanted moral sense, the deliverances of which guide us in matters of morals. For Hutcheson, there are more than the five senses. As well as touch, taste, smell, sight, and hearing, there is, for example, the sense of beauty. Certain objects afford aesthetic delight, while others disgust us. The operation of all senses depends on the actual constitution of human nature, and that is a contingent matter. It is perfectly conceivable that, like the dung beetle, we should find the smell of faeces attractive. Similarly, on this view, the structure of our moral sense depends on contingent facts about our affective responses. It is this aspect of the view that Price finds most intolerable: had our emotional reactions been different then we would have had a different moral sense, which would have been no better or worse than the one we have—simply different.

Are our moral judgments the product of sense or of understanding? Price’s main argument for the latter view is an appeal to moral phenomenology. It is, he asserts, “scarcely conceivable” that on careful introspection someone should ascribe to the view that

when he thinks gratitude or beneficence to be right, he perceives nothing true of them, and understands nothing, but only receives an impression from a sense. (R 44)

In short, Price offers the by now very familiar challenge to the sentimentalist or expressivist to explain how it is, if her view is correct, that we speak and think as if moral judgments are true or false independently of what anyone feels on these matters.

The moral sense theorist offers our awareness of color, sound, and smell as a model or analogy by which to understand the sentimentalist account of moral properties.

Vice and virtue, therefore, may be compared to sounds, colours, heat and cold, which, according to modern philosophy, are not qualities in objects, but perceptions in the mind. (Hume 1739–40: 469; III.i.1)

That is, they are akin to secondary rather than primary qualities. Price, in his criticism of the moral sense theorist fastens on to this analogy. However, the cogency of Price’s objections is somewhat clouded by the fact that both parties subscribe to a controversial and rather implausible account of secondary qualities. To appreciate this point, we need to say more about the then widely accepted distinction between primary and secondary qualities that had its origin in Locke.

Our sense-organs enable the mind to receive ideas of objects and events in our immediate environment. Some of these ideas, those of the primary properties or qualities, such as shape, size, and solidity, are both caused by and standardly resemble those qualities as they actually are in the objects themselves. Thus the computer screen I am looking at now looks oblong and is oblong. Under ideal conditions, the way the primary qualities of an object appear accurately represent its real nature, both as portrayed by common sense and as understood by scientific investigation. By contrast, the ideas of secondary qualities do not resemble the properties in the object that cause us to have those ideas. There is nothing in the objects themselves that resembles our ideas of color, sound, and so on. The story, as revealed by scientific investigation, of what is going on in the physical world when someone sees a red ball, or smells the aroma of their morning coffee, would not mention colors or smells at all. Rather, the objects in question are so constituted that, in suitable conditions, they emit waves or particles that stimulate the sense-organs in certain ways causing us to have the characteristic secondary quality experience. The full scientific account of how this happens is complicated, more complicated than people in Locke’s time realized, but however the story goes, there will be nothing in the world at all like colors-as-we-see-them, or sounds-as-we-hear-them. Since the ideas of secondary qualities that arise in our minds when our sense-organs are stimulated depend on the nature and constitution of our sensory apparatus, as well as on the nature of external reality, it follows that creatures whose sense-organs differ from ours would have a different kind of secondary quality experience. Nor is this merely a thought experiment; it seems that insects, for example, make color distinctions that do not match ours in significant respects.

So far, the theory has talked about the ideas of secondary qualities, and their relation to the physical goings on that lead to these ideas arising in the mind. But what are colors, sounds, and smells? Two accounts can be found in Locke. First, there is the dispositional theory: secondary qualities are powers or dispositional properties in the object to produce certain ideas in us. Thus to say that something is, for example, red is to say that it has a capacity or power, based in the physical microstructure of its surface, to cause the characteristic idea of red in normal human observers in standard conditions. Second, there is the subjective theory: colors, sounds, etc. are not in objects; rather, they are identified with the ideas in the perceiving subject caused by those objects. Both accounts exist in tension in Locke, though it is now generally agreed that the former view represents his “official” position. The dispositional account has the advantage of preserving the truth of many of the things that we want to say about secondary qualities: for an object standardly retains a power even when it is not being exercised. Salt is soluble whether or not it is immersed in water; red objects remain red under lighting conditions that make them look a different color, or even in the absence of light. But the subjective account gained considerable currency through the writings of Berkeley and Hume, who took it to be the one Locke was offering.

The subjectivist allows that we do normally take colors, sounds, and smells to be properties of things existing outside of us; similarly, we take right and wrong, vice and virtue, to be properties of actions and agents. In both cases, the sentimentalist claims, we are mistaken, and in virtue of a similar mechanism in each case. We project the contents of the mind on to reality; or, as Hume rather charmingly puts it (1739–40, 167; 1.3.14), the mind has a tendency to “spread itself on external objects”. In both cases, reflection shows that, contrary to the way they are presented in experience, these features in fact have no existence outside the mind. If we can be mistaken in the case of secondary qualities, we can equally be mistaken in the case of moral qualities, so the moral phenomenology to which Price appeals is no more decisive in the one case than the other. Since Price accepts the subjective account of secondary qualities, he would seem to be vulnerable to this riposte.

In response, Price denies that the two cases are parallel. The reason we must reject the phenomenology in the case of secondary qualities is that the ascription of them to objects is seen, on philosophical examination, to be incoherent. This is not so in the case of moral properties. Since it makes sense to suppose that they are properties of actions and agents, we have no reason, in their case, to reject the phenomenology as mistaken.

A coloured body, if we speak accurately, is the same absurdity with a square sound. We need no experience to prove that heat, cold, colours, tastes, etc. are not real qualities of bodies; because the idea of matter and of these qualities are incompatible. But is there indeed any such incompatibility between actions and right? Or any such absurdity in affirming the one of the other? Are the ideas of them as different as the idea of a sensation and its cause? (R 46)

What is it about secondary qualities that makes the supposition that they are properties of matter absurd? Price’s argument has two premisses. First, only conscious beings can have sensations:

Sensations, as such, are modes of consciousness, or feelings of a sentient being, which must be of a nature totally different from the particular causes which produce them. (R 46)

Second, colors, sounds, tastes, smells, are sensations. Price uses the example of pleasure and pain to illustrate the point. The entry of the knife into the body causes the person to feel pain, but it is absurd to think that the pain might be a property of the knife; pains can only be a property of conscious perceivers. But the colors we see and the sounds we hear are equally sensations. Therefore, it is incoherent to suppose that they might be properties of matter.

This argument appears to beg the question. Price’s objection comes to this: we know a priori that realism is an error in the case of secondary qualities, but it remains an open question whether it is an error in the case of moral properties. But the sentimentalist can maintain that, strictly speaking, the one identification is as much a metaphysical error as the other, though we make them often enough in ordinary life. It only seems to Price to be an open question in the moral case because he rejects the metaphysics of the sentimentalist. But that is precisely what is in dispute. If moral properties are affective responses, it is incoherent to ascribe them to objects.

There is much that is confused in this dispute between Price and the sentimentalists. Conscious states are properties of the perceiver, and not of the perceived object, but the claim that colors, sounds, and smells are essentially conscious states is not well supported. Nor should the ideas of these properties be classified as sensations, on the model of pleasure and pain. It is noteworthy that, whereas no-one supposes that the sensations of pleasure and pain can be predicated of whatever causes the pain, this is not true of colors, tastes, and sounds. But if it is as absurd to suppose that a body is colored as it is to suppose that what causes us pain is itself in pain, why is the first identification so often made and the second not? There must be some difference between the two cases that explains this tendency, but any such difference casts doubt on the claim that they should be regarded as being equally sensations.

Suppose the sentimentalist were to switch to the more plausible dispositional account of both secondary qualities and moral properties. Colors, tastes etc. really are properties of objects—it is just that they are dispositional and not categorical, as we might at first be tempted to suppose. Similarly, actions really are right and wrong, but these are dispositional, rather than categorical, properties. Certain features of actions and agents are apt to arouse feelings of approval or disapproval in us.

If we adopt the dispositional account, it might seem that Price has now lost any dialectical advantage. In both the perceptual and the moral cases the theory lines up with the phenomenology. Broad (1971: 208) plausibly claims, however, that Price would also have rejected the dispositional theory of moral properties. One of Price’s principal objections to the sentimentalist account is that it makes the truth of moral claims contingent on our natures—and our natures might have been very different. On this view, what we approve or disapprove of depends on

a positive constitution of our minds, or … an implanted and arbitrary principle by which a relish is given us for certain moral objects and forms and aversion to others. (R 14)

This objection applies as much to the dispositional as to the subjective account. Especially worrying for a theist like Price, there is no reason to suppose on the sentimentalist view that God shares our moral sentiments. Indeed, Hume had already drawn this conclusion in a letter to Hutcheson (Hume [L], 38–40 = Volume I, Letter 16, 16 March 1740).

Indeed Price goes further and claims that, were sentimentalism true, God would have an attitude of complete moral indifference to everything that happens. For he knows that all actions and states are in themselves neither right nor wrong, neither good nor bad; nor, lacking our emotional nature, can he be supposed to make moral discriminations based on feeling.

The subjective and the dispositional sentimentalist models are equally vulnerable to Price’s implanted sense complaint; on either account the standard of correctness for our moral judgments is set by our contingent human nature. Price, by contrast, insists that moral principles are necessarily and not merely contingently true. What makes them true is solely the intrinsic nature of the actions or character that they characterize. To use a more modern parlance, Price is a moral realist, who holds that there are stance-independent moral facts.

2.3 Necessary moral principles

If there are necessary moral principles, it might seem that they must be exceptionless. If lying is, in virtue of its nature, wrong, then all lying is wrong. And the same will hold for any other principles. But such moral rigorism seems deeply implausible. While some (most notably Kant) have bitten the bullet, most of us believe that there are circumstances in which it is permissible, or even required, to lie. Price agrees. Principles can conflict and none automatically trumps the others. Which principle should govern our actions will depend on the circumstances. In some cases of conflict, it is clear what morality demands. But in many cases it is not: “doubt arises; and we may thus be rendered entirely incapable of determining what we ought to chuse” (R 167). The lack of clarity here is epistemic, not metaphysical: “Truth and right in all circumstances, require one determinate way of acting” (R 167). But since what that way is can be unclear, there can be disagreements between right-minded people about what to do. None of this, however, impugns our knowledge of the fundamental principles.

The principles themselves, it should be remembered, are self-evident; and to conclude the contrary … because of the obscurity attending several cases wherein a competition arises between the several principles of morality, is very unreasonable. It is not unlike concluding, that, … because it may not in some instances be easy to determine what will be the effect of different forces, variously compounded and acting contrary to each other; therefore we can have no assurance what any of them acting separately will produce, or so much as know that there is any such thing as force. (R 168)

Price has, in effect, anticipated Ross’s celebrated distinction between prima facie duties and duties proper, even down to using the same analogy about conflicting forces to illustrate the distinction.

2.4 Virtue

2.4.1 Virtuous motivation

What is it to be virtuous? A virtuous act is one that is motivated by the sense of duty—a recognition of what morality requires and forbids. What of actions that are motivated by other concerns? While Price denies any moral worth to actions not motivated by a sense of duty, he seems to allow that, where motives are mixed, moral credit should be given to the degree to which considerations of duty motivate.

But instinctive benevolence is no principle of virtue, nor are any actions flowing merely from it virtuous. … All actions … appear to have as much less moral value, as they are derived more from natural instinct, and less attended with reflexion on their reasonableness and fitness. (R 191)

How is it that humans so often ignore the call of duty? The answer lies in the other motivational forces in our nature, such as self-love, desires, and the emotions, which can conflict with dutifulness. But we are not helpless in the face of these impulses; we can resist at least some of them at will, and we can learn to control them better by developing our character. How our character develops is to some extent under our control because personality traits can be strengthened or weakened by practice. Since we are imperfectly rational, we should strive to modify our desires and feelings so that it is easier for us to do our duty.

But in what does our duty consist? Price distinguishes between what he terms abstract and practical virtue, or what was later (by Prichard and Ross) called objective and subjective duty. An agent’s objective duty is what she is morally required to do, given the actual facts of the case; her subjective duty lies in what she should do, given her reasonable beliefs about the facts of the case. It is for succeeding or failing to do one’s subjective duty that one should be praised or blamed, for an imperfect agent cannot be required to avoid all errors of fact.

2.4.2 Supererogation

What is it to be perfectly virtuous? Is it sufficient simply to perform all our duties, or is there something even better, as many have supposed: meritorious acts of heroism or saintliness that exceed what is morally required and are singled out for special praise? Price maintains that there are no such supererogatory acts—acts that go beyond the call of duty. Why? Price holds that any action must be either right (i.e., required), or wrong, or indifferent. Supererogatory actions do not fit this pattern. They are not required but their performance is not morally indifferent. Rejecting the supererogatory leads Price to a counter-intuitive conclusion.

To aim at acting beyond obligation, being the same with acting contrary to obligation; and doing more than is fit to be done, the same with doing wrong. (R 124)

If we find this doctrine harsh, there are two possible responses. The first is to add a further category to Price’s tripartite distinction. Price suggests that some may wish to deny that “right” and “obligatory” are co-extensive.

All right actions are not so in precisely the same sense; and it might … be granted, that some things are right in such a sense as yet not to be our indispensable duty. (R 120)

Price’s only comment on this approach is that it would undermine a symmetry between “right” and “wrong” as he is using them. It allows cases where an action is right but not required, but there are still no cases in which an action is wrong but not forbidden. Price does not reject this approach but thinks it unnecessarily complicated.

He prefers to retain his original tripartite structure, but to soften any apparent harshness by further explanation. Many of our obligations, such as that of being benevolent, are framed only in general and vague terms. How and when we fulfill them is, to some extent, up to us. Since it is unclear exactly how much is required of us by way of kind deeds, a truly virtuous person will err on the side of generosity. The praise we bestow on them is not, as the proponent of supererogation supposes, because they exceeded the demands of duty, but because they showed such scrupulous care to ensure that they did not fall short of what was required of them. This solution has the advantage of explaining why the heroic or saintly frequently claim that they were, after all, only doing their duty, rather than claiming that they were exceeding it.

2.4.3 Promising

Most of Price’s claims are defensible, and many have been adopted by other prominent thinkers in the Intuitionist tradition. But there is one issue on which he has generally, but not universally, been held to have gone astray: namely, the source of our obligation to keep our promises. Instead of taking it to be a distinct species of duty, Price holds that “fidelity to promises is properly a branch or instance of veracity” (R 155). We must distinguish, Price claims, between statements about the present and statements about the future. Expressing an intention or a resolution to act does not, Price allows, give rise to obligation.

For when I say I intend to do such and such, I affirm only a present fact.—But to promise, is to declare that such a thing shall be done. … In this case, it is not enough to acquit me from the charge of falsehood, that I intend to do what I promise, but it must be actually done, agreeably to the assurances given. (R 155)

Price allows that I can confidently and reasonably make predictions about events outside my control that subsequently turn out to be false, without being guilty of lying. But in the case of actions that lie within our power

the falsehood must be known and wilful, and entirely imputable to our own neglect and guilt. (R 156)

This view has been attacked on a number of counts. First, acts of lying are datable; when someone lies they do so at a particular time, in a particular place, and to a particular audience. While the content of a false assertion may concern the future, the lie occurs at the time of utterance. If someone fails to do what they said she would, she does not lie at that later time, for at that later time she asserts nothing. Nor does she lie when she says she will do it because, ex hypothesi, she sincerely believed at that time that she would. If the deed does not follow her words she may be guilty of many things: weakness of will, or laziness, cowardice, pusillanimity, depending on the circumstances. If she has led someone to rely on her earlier assertion, she may be accused of breach of faith, or going back on her word. But what she is not guilty of is lying. She would only be guilty of that if she was not expressing a sincere belief when she made the original assertion.

Second, Price’s view fails to account for the fact that promises are made to particular individuals. Suppose Shakira promises Tom, in the presence of Miguel, that she will pick him up at the airport when he returns from his journey. Miguel later discovers that he is flying in to the airport at the same time as Tom and awaits Shakira’s arrival hoping for a ride. Each has taken Shakira at her word and relied on her for transport home. On Price’s account, if Shakira does not show up (without an adequate excuse) then she has lied to both of them, and hence both have the same cause for complaint. However, Tom has a complaint against Shakira that Miguel does not have, for Shakira’s promise was to Tom and not to Miguel. It is Tom that she has let down, and not Miguel. Arguably, Miguel has no complaint against Shakira. He reasonably believed that she would show up, but she had offered him no assurances. Further, only Tom can let Shakira off her promise, while Miguel has no such power.

There are, indeed, lying promises, but these are ones where the promisor has, at the time he makes it, no intention of carrying it out. If my promise is sincere but I fail (without adequate excuse) to fulfill it I may be a scoundrel, but not a lying scoundrel.

These are weighty criticisms, but they may be uncharitable to Price. Though veracity is, of course, the virtue that concerns truth, Price has a wider conception of what it involves than merely avoiding lying.

Under this head, I would comprehend impartiality and honesty of mind in our enquiries after truth, as well as a sacred regard to it in all we say; fair and ingenuous dealing; such an openness and simplicity of temper as exclude guile and prevarication, and all the contemptible arts of craft, equivocation and hypocrisy; fidelity to our engagements; sincerity and uprightness in our transactions with ourselves as well as others; and the careful avoiding of all secret attempts to deceive ourselves, and to evade or disguise the truth in examining our own characters. (R 154–5)

This is a good description of the virtue of honesty (or straightforwardness, or trustworthiness). And one might reasonably describe someone who fails to keep their word as dishonest. Moreover, guile and deception need not involve lying. Iago does not lie when he leaves Desdemona’s handkerchief for Othello to find. And there is being “economical with the truth”, and casuistry of all kinds. Understood thus, there is nothing untoward in Price grouping these desirable qualities together. But “veracity”, with its narrow implication of truth-telling, does not happily cover this wide range of characteristics and Price often forgets his official definition and equates honesty with truthfulness.

Part of what Price is doing is to resolve a puzzle raised by Hume in the Treatise.

[S]ince the act of the mind, which enters into a promise, and produces its obligation, is neither the resolving, desiring, nor willing any particular performance, it must necessarily be the willing of that obligation, which arises from the promise. Nor is this only a conclusion of philosophy; but is entirely conformable to our common ways of thinking and of expressing ourselves, when we say that we are bound by our own consent, and that the obligation arises from our mere will and pleasure. The only question, then, is, whether there be not a manifest absurdity in supposing this act of the mind, and such an absurdity as no man cou'd fall into, whose ideas are not confounded with prejudice and the fallacious use of language. (1739–40: 516–7; III.ii.5)

Hume’s puzzle is: how can I, by a mere act of will, create a new obligation? In making a promise, I would thereby declare that I am creating an obligation to do something, that was previously morally indifferent. I would somehow make it the case that I am now under an obligation I was not under before. Yet nothing about the act I promise to do has changed. How can mere words transform the moral landscape?

Price agrees with Hume that obligations cannot be created simply by an act of will, but denies that this is the correct conception of promising. He first tackles this problem when defending his anti-voluntarist account of obligation. On his view, which he takes from Cudworth, each action has a nature in virtue of which it is required, forbidden, or indifferent.

No will … can render any thing good and obligatory, which was not so antecedently, and from eternity. (R 50)

If an act is morally indifferent, then no mere act of will can change its moral status. Price considers the objection that the command of God, or a sovereign, may do just that. Price replies:

It is true, the doing of any indifferent thing may become obligatory, in consequence of a command from a being possessed of rightful authority over us: But … in this case, the command produces a change in the circumstances of the agent, and that what, in consequence of it, becomes obligatory, is not the same with what before was indifferent. (R 51)

As Price puts it, the “matter of the action” remains the same, but it now falls under a moral law that it did not before. In virtue of changed circumstances, what was previously indifferent can become an instance of gratitude, or obedience to a lawful command or, indeed, an instance of promise-keeping. In this last case we should not suppose

that our own will or breath alters the nature of things by making what is indifferent not so. … All that the promise does, is, … to cause that to be an instance of right conduct [in earlier editions, Price writes ‘of a general and eternal duty] which was not so before. (R 51)

Price’s answer to Hume is that, though we cannot create an obligation by our mere will and pleasure, we can place ourselves under an obligation by what we do or say, including when what we say expresses our will. On this central point, Price is correct. As we have seen, Price holds that the species of obligation under which I place myself in promising is veracity. It may be that the moral category of honesty or trustworthiness would better capture what Price wants to say, but that is of comparatively secondary importance.

3. Theology

Price’s writings on theology and philosophy of religion are extensive and complex. After a brief discussion of his views about God’s nature and the arguments for his existence, this section will focus on those aspects of his views that bear on morality, and his discussion of the credibility of miracles.

3.1 A priori Arguments for God’s existence

Price appended to the Review a “Dissertation on the Being and Attributes of the Deity”, in which he largely follows Samuel Clarke’s a priori arguments to show that there must be a first cause that is perfect in every respect. He begins with a version of the well-known argument from contingency, which proceeds from things that exist contingently to something that exists non-contingently, i.e., necessarily. Price accepts the argument but holds that previous writers have not properly explained the nature of the necessity of God’s existence. The necessity in question is not what he terms “relative” or “consequential” necessity, as when we say there must be a cause of every effect. Rather,

the impossibility of not existing implied in the necessity of God’s existence is … an impossibility appearing immediately, and carrying its own evidence with it; an impossibility in the nature of the thing itself. (R 287)

Price then goes on, in short order, to deduce several conclusions. First, that the “necessity of God’s existence implies that it is necessary … to the very conception of all other existence” (R 288). What can be conceived without a divine ground can be conceived as existing alone. Such beings

might be conceived to exist without him, which is the same as conceiving him not to exist, and consequently, with the possibility of his non-existence. (R 288)

What exists necessarily can have no limits or imperfections. For what is limited could have had different limits, and so the limited has only contingent existence. Finally, and for our purposes most importantly, a necessary being does not possess its properties, as other things do, by participation in those properties as something distinct from it. Suppose, for example, God were to be omnipresent by existing in every part of space, then we could conceive of infinite space without him. But if space were distinct from him we would need an explanation of why he existed in all of it, rather than in some part, or in none. The same, Price says, is true of God’s relation to all his attributes, which he must possess

in a manner peculiar to himself. He is intelligent, not by the apprehension of truth, but by being truth. (R 290)

And so on, for all his other attributes.

There can be numberless beings who are powerful, wise and benevolent; but there can be but one being of whose nature, power, wisdom and benevolence in necessary union and forming one idea, are the essential attributes. (R 295)

Price did not publish this piece for some time, and remained concerned that the “particular imperfection of language” rendered him “incapable of stating [his view] with sufficient correctness and clearness” (R 286). It is indeed rather puzzling. His view is clearly influenced by the neo-Platonism which, presumably, he gets from Cudworth. Necessary truths depend on the Forms, on their self-identity. The Forms constitute a purely intelligible realm, and other things are intelligible only in so far as they participate in the Forms. Since the Forms are purely intelligible beings their mode of being, the manner in which they exist is by being thought. That which thinks the Forms, namely God, is that in which they are. They cannot exist independently, because their very being is to be a part of his nature. And it is his own nature governs his will.

Be that as it may, Price’s account of God’s nature enables him to deal with a standard objection to those who reject the Divine Command Theory of morality. If we conceive of morality as a set of truths that are outside God’s control, are we not demeaning God’s sovereignty, by supposing that there is something both external to him and co-eternal with him? Price’s answer is that God’s rectitude consists, not in obeying some principles that he did not create, cannot change, and must accept, but in following his own nature.

3.2 Natural Theology

Like Cleanthes in Hume’s Dialogues, Price holds that belief in a Designer is immediate and irresistible. “This visible universe … is self-evidently, an exhibition of the power and wisdom of a powerful and wise cause” (R 285) But what of his moral qualities? Although in his introduction to the “Dissertation”, Price claims that a posteriori arguments also show the Designer to be good, in Chapter X of the Review, Price strikes a cautious note. There may be much more of good than bad in the works of that Designer, but we might wonder whether that is sufficient grounds for drawing conclusions about the Designer’s moral character. For a malicious being could produce happiness, and perhaps the Designer grants us happiness now only to frustrate our expectations in order to increase our misery later by contrast to our present state. Price himself thinks that, despite such possibilities, we are justified in inferring God’s goodness from his creation but accepts that such inferences are open to cavil. However, as a moral realist, Price does not need to rely on arguments from the distribution of good and bad things in the world. For if benevolence is, in itself better than malice, justice than injustice, and so on, and if an intelligent mind must both recognize and be guided by these thoughts, then we can know a priori that God is morally perfect.

Nevertheless, it is a striking fact that virtue is not always proportionately rewarded, nor vice punished. Price is more realistic on this point than Butler who said “Self-love then, though confined to the interest of the present world, does in general perfectly coincide with virtue” (1729: Sermon 3, para. 8 [2017: 36]). Not only do the virtuous often suffer and the vicious flourish, but the virtuous are open to peculiar psychological sufferings of which the vicious know nothing. They may suffer from an over scrupulous conscience, from guilt, and consciousness of their own unworthiness.

It can scarcely be denied with respect to wickedness, that it would very frequently be much better for a man, (I mean for his own present ease) to be thoroughly wicked than partially so. (R 259)

So much is this the case that Price contends

this world appears fitted more to be a school for the education of virtue, than a station of honour to it. (R 257)

What may we infer from these rather dismal facts with respect to a future life? If we are moral sentimentalists, nothing. But if we accept moral realism then we know that a wise Designer will also be a morally good one. From this we may conclude that there is some future scene of life in which these imbalances between virtue and reward will be rectified. We cannot, however, infer that this future life will be endless, for the injustices of this life could be rectified in a finite time.

That we are to be delivered to from death to a new life that shall never end of complete happiness, this is unspeakably more than any arguments from distributive justice can teach us to expect. (R 263)

It is revelation alone that can assure us of God’s graciousness in this respect.

3.3 Miracles

Price’s illuminating discussion of Hume’s notorious attack on the credibility of miracles is informed both by his interest in probability theory, and by his good sense. Hume’s argument, in a nutshell, is that there can never be sufficient reason to believe in a violation of a law of nature because we know, a priori, that any evidence from testimony for the occurrence of a miracle will be outweighed by our evidence from long experience that such things do not happen. Our confidence in the reliability of testimony and our confidence in some generalization being a law of nature have the same source: experience. But whereas we have often found testimony to be false, the experiences on which our belief in a law of nature is founded are exceptionless. If there were exceptions, we would conclude that we were not dealing with a law of nature. So we always have more evidence that a miracle did not occur than that it did. Hume presents us with a characteristic fork. If what is reported would violate a law of nature, then we should not give credence to the report. If what is reported is merely uncommon, then we might have sufficient evidence to believe it, but the event would not be miraculous.

Price disputes four claims, on which he thinks Hume’s argument rests. The most important are the first three.

  1. “That the credit we give to testimony, is derived solely from experience”
  2. “That a miracle is a fact contrary to experience”
  3. “That the previous improbability of a fact is a proof against it, diminishing, in proportion to the degree of it, the proof from testimony for it” (D 389).

Price’s rebuttals are as follows.

  1. Our confidence in the reliability of testimony rests, and should rest, not only on the frequency with which testimony has been confirmed balanced against the frequency with which it has been disconfirmed, but also on our knowledge of the character(s) of those bearing witness, and of people in general.
    One action, or one conversation with a man, may convince us of his integrity and induce us to believe his testimony, though we have never, in a single instance, experienced his veracity. (D 399)
  2. “A miracle is more properly an event different from experience than contrary to it” (D 402). Testimony to an unusual event, while it provides evidence for the occurrence of that event, does not contradict our experience of what happened before, or even conflict with it. We would continue to be as justified as we were previously in believing that this kind of event had not happened before. Prior uniform observation is not experiential evidence against the occurrence of the unusual. “[I]t can be no part of any one’s experience, that the course of nature will continue always the same” (D 402). Were this not so, we could never have reason to believe that something we previously took to be a law of nature was not in fact one.
  3. Price argues that it is very common for “the slightest testimony to overcome an almost infinite improbability” (D 406). The prior probability of many common facts is extremely low, yet the evidence of testimony is sufficient to confirm them. Take an example where the prior probability can be calculated: the odds against any particular distribution of cards in a game of Bridge are enormous. Yet the testimony of the players as to what was in each hand is quite sufficient to establish that as a fact. What is more, Price argues, variations in the prior improbability of the event are irrelevant when it comes to the weight of testimony. “The only causes of falsehood in testimony are the intention to deceive, and the danger of being deceived” (D 415). But the degree of prior improbability does not increase or diminish either of these.
    Improbabilities … as such, do not affect the capacity of testimony to report truth. They … should not be considered as a counter-evidence invalidating, in proportion to their degree, its reports.—But tho’ this is true, it by no means follows, that they may not in many circumstances affect the credit of testimony, or cause us to question its veracity. (D 417)

As Hume pointed out, mankind are lovers of the marvelous, and raconteurs delight in feeding that credulity. If someone reports a truly astonishing event, especially if it redounds to the narrator’s credit, or supports some ideology she is keen to promote, that may lead us “to question the faithfulness of a report, and give just ground to suspect a design to misrepresent or exaggerate” (D 420). Price points out, however, that this only applies when the reporter is aware of the marvelous nature of their tale. Mere coincidence does not diminish the evidential weight of testimony.

[W]ere a person to tell us that … at the time of drawing a lottery, he happened to hear his age, the day of the month, and the date of the year drawn together, we should scarcely believe him, tho’ we know that he was not more unlikely to hear these numbers drawn, than any other particular numbers. But if the same person was only to tell us the numbers themselves, and the coincidence which strikes us was entirely our own discovery, we should have just the same reason for believing his account, as if there had been no such coincidence. (D 422–3)

The upshot is that, in Price’s view, the debate should neither focus on the abstract possibility of evidence for miracles, nor on their prior improbability, but, rather, on the particular question of whether the Apostles were either deceived or were themselves deceivers. Price, needless to say, is confident of victory on this ground, though others may demur.

4. Liberty

Price distinguishes four different sorts of liberty all of which, he claims, have a common theme.

  • Physical liberty is “that principle of spontaneity, or self-determination, which constitutes us agents, or which gives us a command over our actions, rendering them properly ours, and not effects of the operation of any foreign cause” (P 21–2).
  • Moral liberty “is the power of following, in all circumstances, our sense of right and wrong, or of acting in conformity to our reflecting and moral principles, without being controuled by any contrary principles” (P 22)
  • Religious liberty “is the power of exercising, without molestation, that mode of religion which we think best” (P 22)
  • Civil liberty “is the power of a civil society … to govern itself by its own discretion, or by laws of its own making” (P 22).

The first two concern the issue of free will and moral responsibility; the second two concern issues of political governance. Nevertheless, Price contends, they are all forms of liberty because “there is one general idea that runs through them all; … the idea of self-direction or self-government” (P 22)

4.1 Free will, rationality, and moral agency

Price distinguishes, in a way that anticipates Kant, two ways in which my action may be free: the first, physical liberty, is freedom to choose; the second is moral autonomy. Freedom of choice is required for agency and hence for moral responsibility. But that freedom allows us to act wrongly as well as rightly, to be irrational as well as rational, to go astray as well as to go aright. When we go astray, Price contends, by doing something we know we shouldn’t, we feel ourselves unfree, in that we have lost control. We lack self-mastery or moral autonomy: we have succumbed to temptation, instead of obeying the moral law. As with Kant, moral autonomy is the triumph of both rationality and morality over countervailing desires, since we always have most reason to fulfill our moral obligations. Price contends also, in good Platonic fashion, that when we follow virtue we do what we (really) want. It is fairly common to distinguish those parts of one’s personality with which one identifies, and that are taken to be its central core, and those impulses that are seen as external, alien, or even threatening. The metaphor of addiction or enslavement is virtually irresistible in explaining this distinction: we are under attack by passions which can take control of us if we are not careful, so that we no longer do what we want to do, but what these alien forces or siren voices tempt us to do. If we give in too often we will have lost the battle and our autonomy; we will no longer be in charge of our own lives, but succumb to what we reject, and even hate. Some philosophers hold that the agent has considerable choice in determining which parts of her personality are central and which peripheral. Price claims, however, that the central core of our identity is metaphysically fixed.

[What] is most properly a man’s self … is … not his passions, but his reason or his judgment, prescribing what is right, and prohibiting what is wrong. The conscience of a man is the man; the reflecting principle is our supreme principle. It is what gives our distinction as intelligent creatures; and whenever we act contrary to it, we violate our natures, and are at variance with ourselves. (Price 1816: 208, quoted in D. O. Thomas 1977: 170)

In short, physical liberty is a necessary condition of the capacity to direct one’s actions at all; moral liberty is exercising that agency to direct one’s actions as normative reality requires.

4.2 Determinism and agent-causation

There is much to suggest that Price is a libertarian who denies psychological determinism and embraces agent-causation instead. It is we, and not our psychological states, that determine our actions. The self stands above the fray, as it were, and decides which reasons or motives we will act on. The following passages are typical.

Determination requires an efficient cause. If that cause is the being himself, I plead for no more. If not, then it is no longer his determination; that is, he is no longer the determiner, but the motive, or whatever else any one will say to be the cause of the determination. To ask, what effects our determination, is the very same with asking who did an action, after being informed that such a one did it. (R 181–2)

[It is] very plain, that motives can have no concern in effecting [the agent’s] determination … What would be more absurd than to say, that our inclinations act upon us, or compel us; that our desires and fears put us into motion, or produce our volitions; that is, are agents? (R 183n)

D. O. Thomas (1977: 160–2) points out, however, that there are passages in Price in which he appears to embrace psychological determinism, of which this is one of the most striking.

Were we thoroughly acquainted with the heart of a man, the turn of his temper, and the make of his mind, we should never want experience to inform us, what he will do, or how far he is to be trusted (R 28).

Solving these difficulties is beyond the scope of this entry, but we might note that while causal determinism (whether physical or psychological) entails that, in principle, all events are completely predictable, including human actions, the entailment does not run the other way. What is predictable need not be causally determined. Consider God, the morally perfect agent. He will always act according to the dictates of reason, and thus has moral freedom to the highest degree. This need not preclude his having freedom of choice, however. Price’s view is that he has the power, the physical liberty, to do or abstain, but his character is such that he will not do the wrong thing. (R 206)

What of finite agents? In the passage from which the quotation comes, Price is contrasting our belief that phenomena are regularly connected with each other with a real understanding of why this is so.

The whole meaning of accounting for a fact, implies something in the nature of objects that includes a connexion between them, or a fitness in certain ways to influence one another. …While we only see one thing constantly attending or following another, without perceiving the real dependence and connexion … we are necessarily dissatisfied. (R 27)

Given this context, Price may be claiming simply that, were we to understand the light in which an agent saw all the considerations relevant to acting, we would know how he would choose. That may be compatible with the agent’s character being self-formed by his choices.

Here are two difficulties for Price’s claim that understanding the light in which someone saw their action would enable us to predict what they would do. First, it is questionable whether weak-willed actions are fully intelligible. Although the agent has reasons for what he does, they do not explain his making the worse rather than the better choice. Second, if we are genuinely able to form and change our characters through our choices, then there must be occasions on which we act out of character. If there is real freedom of choice even God might not know with complete certainty what we will do (though this view, known as Open Theism, might be unpalatable to Price).

4.3 Political Liberty

Price’s writings on religious and civil liberty are voluminous. Many are largely of historical interest, as they deal with issues of the day, rather than broad principles. The main claims of his social and political philosophy are briefly summarised in what follows.

4.3.1 Religious Liberty

Price’s reasons for advocating complete freedom of religion are numerous, but familiar. All religious tests for public office encourage persecution of the nonconformists as well as hypocrisy, by giving incentives for outward subscription to something not believed. They interfere with conscience, which is a private matter between an individual and his deity. Above all, they hinder the great Enlightenment project of the onward march of reason and the destruction of all forms of superstition. Toleration is insufficient, for that implies that society recognizes one creed but tolerates others. Full freedom should be extended to all religions, not just different Christian denominations.

4.3.2 Civil Liberty

Price’s political philosophy is, broadly speaking, in line with Locke’s, but he follows it through to more radical conclusions. The legitimacy of a government (though not of other hierarchical distinctions) stems from the consent of the governed. Whereas in Locke the people have a right to rebel only if there is a breach of the social contract, for Price they retain the right to alter their form of government as they wish. Direct democracy is the most desirable form of government, but in larger states democracy has perforce to be representative. However, those elected are to be more delegates than representatives, subject to instructions from their constituents (P 25).

It is not clear how far Price thinks the franchise should be extended. The logic of his position would seem to suggest universal suffrage, but Price is no real advocate for it. He shares a common concern about the qualifications of the uneducated and dependent to be voters. Writing of the election of British Members of Parliament before the Great Reform Act of 1832, Price complains not only of the small size of the electorate, but also that voters are often drawn from the “meanest persons”, the “lowest of the people”. One worry was that, insofar as they were dependent on landowners or employers, their vote would not be genuinely independent. Price appears never to have suggested extending the suffrage to women, perhaps because he thought them too ill educated and too dependent on their husbands or other male relatives. Price, unlike his friend Wollstonecraft, appears never to have questioned the status quo in this respect.

Civil liberty, for Price, concerns the autonomy of a community or state to make its own laws, free from outside interference. Important as this is, especially in the context of the American Revolution, it raises the question of what constitutes a distinct community or society. Does any dissident group constitute a community with the right to secede? This is an issue that has occasioned much violence and bloodshed, including the secession of the Southern States in 1860 and, in our own day, Scottish, Basque, and Irish independence. The omission of a discussion of this seriously weakens his political philosophy.

Oddly, Price does not include the liberty of the citizen as well as the liberty of a country in his original definition of civil liberty. A country that governs itself can still be internally deeply repressive. Price became aware of this deficiency, and expanded his account in Additional Observations (P 76-100).

A citizen is free when the power of commanding his own conduct and the quiet possession of his life, person, property and good name are secured to him by being his own legislator … a government is free when constituted in such a manner as to give this security. And the freedom of a community or nation is the same among nations that the freedom of a citizen is among his fellow-citizens. (P 82)

The best ways to secure a free government are the following:

  1. all parts of the state should be represented in the governing legislature
  2. the representatives must be freely chosen by the electorate
  3. the representatives must be independent of any outside source of power
  4. they should be subject to frequent re-election
  5. they should be accountable to their constituents in all their acts

These proposals may now appear fairly modest, but few societies match up to them. For example, the power of corporate owners and lobbyists in funding elections in the United States breaches clause 3. The existence of dependent territories, such as Puerto Rico, breaches clause 1. The existence of the House of Lords in the United Kingdom breaches clauses 2 and 4. Revolutionary for the time, Price’s suggestions remain radical even today.

5. Influence

Although Price was influential in his lifetime in many areas, that influence soon waned, and few of his works were reprinted after his death. His immediate impact on discussion of the events surrounding the American and French revolutions was large, but naturally faded as those upheavals slipped into history. He died before the excesses of the French revolution, which had been predicted by Burke. As a result of the success of his predictions, Burke acquired an immense reputation, while Price’s was eclipsed. There is no doubt that Price, along with others in the “Age of Reason”, exaggerated the degree to which people would pay attention to rational principles and reasonable solutions. There seems little to suggest that his writings had a long-term impact on political philosophy. Nevertheless, liberal-democratic societies have embraced many of Price’s causes; in that sense, in the longer term, Price could be seen as being on the side of history after all.

His influence on the Unitarian movement also faded. His version of Arianism, in which Christ was seen as having most of the supernatural attributes of the second person of the Trinity without actually being God, gave way to the Socinian view, championed by Priestley, which stressed the straightforward humanity of Jesus. His reputation in actuarial work and demography suffered from his mistaken claim that the British population was in decline. Even his beloved project of reducing or eliminating the national debt by means of a sinking fund fell out of favor.

His main legacy is, of course, in moral philosophy, but even here it is unclear how much direct influence he had. Some of the themes in A Review, especially issues to do with moral motivation and responsibility, find distinct echoes in Kant, but that comes from sympathy of outlook, rather than influence. And Price’s epistemology and metaphysics are wholly different from Kant’s, despite Hastings Rashdall’s exaggerated claim that the Review “contains the gist of the Kantian doctrine without Kant’s confusion” (1907: 81 fn 1). The main features of Price’s epistemology, and his pluralism about moral principles, emerge again with the British Intuitionists who flourished in the first half of the twentieth century. While we know that C. D. Broad and Hastings Rashdall both rated Price very highly, there is no direct evidence that Prichard, or even Ross (whose views most closely resemble Price’s) had read him, though it seems likely they did.

Interest in Price was to some degree revived by books by Roland Thomas (1924), Carl Cone (1952), Lennart Åqvist (1960), D. O. Thomas (1977), and W. D. Hudson (1970). Since then there has been a steady trickle of articles on aspects of Price’s work, but no real groundswell of interest, despite another revival in the fortunes of Intuitionism towards the end of the twentieth century. In 1977 the Price-Priestley Newsletter was founded; it morphed later into Enlightenment and Dissent, which ceased publication in 2016. However, resources for the study of Price have been greatly enhanced by the untiring work of D. O. Thomas who not only edited Price’s political writings but, together with Bernard Peach, produced a complete edition of Price’s correspondence.


Primary Literature

Works by Richard Price

There is currently no up to date complete edition of Price’s works. The relevant historical editions of his works discussed in this article are:

  • 1759, Britain’s Happiness, and the Proper Improvement of it, London: A. Millar and R. Griffiths.
  • [D] 1768 [1777], Four Dissertations, London: A. Millar and T. Cadell. The fourth edition is 1777. [D available online]
  • 1778, Two Tracts on Civil Liberty, the War with America, and the Debts and Finances of the Kingdom, London.
  • 1778, A Free Discussion of the Doctrines of Materialism, and Philosophical Necessity, (with Joseph Priestley), London: J. Johnson and T. Cadell.
  • 1781, A Fast Sermon, London: T. Cadell.
  • 1787a, A Review of the Principal Questions in Morals, London: T. Cadell.
  • 1787b, Sermons on the Christian Doctrines as received by the different Denominations of Christians, London. [Price 1787b available online]
  • 1816, Sermons on Various Subjects, in William Morgan (ed.), The Works of Dr. Richard Price. With Memoirs of His Life, London: R. Rees, available online.

Modern Editions are:

  • [R] 1948, A Review of the Principal Questions in Morals, D. D. Raphael (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • [P] 1991, Political Writings, D. O. Thomas (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139170239
  • The Correspondence of Richard Price, D. O. Thomas and Bernard Peach (eds), Durham NC: Duke University Press / Cardiff: University of Wales Press.
    • 1983, Vol. 1: July 1748 – March 1778
    • 1991, Vol. 2: March 1778 – February 1786
    • 1994, Vol. 3: February 1786 – February 1791

Page numbers for quotations from Price are taken from three editions. Page references prefaced by R are to Raphael’s 1974 edition of A Review. Those prefaced by P are to the 1991 collection of Price’s political writings. And those prefaced by D are to the 1777 edition of Four Dissertations.

Influences on Price

  • Balguy, John, 1734, A Collection of Tracts, Moral and Theological, London: J. Pemberton.
  • Butler, Joseph, 1729 [2017], Fifteen Sermons (2nd ed.) London: John and Paul Knapton in Joseph Butler: Fifteen Sermons and Other Writings on Ethics, David McNaughton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2017.
  • –––, 1736, The Analogy of Religion, Natural and Revealed, London: John and Paul Knapton.
  • Clarke, Samuel, 1728, A Discourse Concerning the Being and Attributes of God, the Unchangeable Obligations of Natural Religion, and the Truth and Certainty of the Christian Revelation, London: James & John Knapton.
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1731, A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality, London: James and John Knapton.
  • Hume, David, 1739–40 [1978], A Treatise of Human Nature, in David Hume: A Treatise of Human Nature, Peter H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1978.
  • –––, 1777 [1975], An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, in David Hume: Enquiries Concerning Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals, Peter H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • –––, [L] The Letters of David Hume (2 vols.), J.Y.T. Greig (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1932.
  • Hutcheson, Francis, 1725, An Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue; in Two Treatises, London: W. and J. Smith.
  • –––, 1728, An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections. With Illustrations on the Moral Sense, Dublin: J. Smith and W. Bruce.
  • Locke, John, 1690 [1975], An Essay Concerning Human Understanding in The Works of John Locke: An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Peter H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Paley, William, 1785, Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy, London: R. Faulder
  • Reid, Thomas, 1764 [1997], An Inquiry into the Human Mind, on the Principles of Common Sense, in The Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid, Derek Brookes (ed.), Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1997.
  • –––, 1785 [2002], Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, in The Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid, Derek Brookes and Knud Haakonssen (eds.), Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2002.
  • Shaftesbury, Lord, 1714 [1999], Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times in Shaftesbury: Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, Lawrence E. Klein (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Smith, Adam, 1759, The Theory of Moral Sentiments in Adam Smith: The Theory of Moral Sentiments, Amartya Sen (ed.), Harmondsworth: Penguin Classics, 2010.
  • Wollaston, William, 1724 [1978],The Religion of Nature Delineated (New York & London: Garland Publishing, 1978).

An extensive collection of extracts from the above authors can be found in:

  • Raphael, D. Daiches, 1969, British Moralists 1650–1800, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Secondary Literature

  • Aiken, Henry David, 1954, “The Ultimacy of Rightness in Richard Price’s Ethics: A Reply to Mr. Peach”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 14(3): 386–392. doi:10.2307/2104110
  • Åqvist, Lennart, 1960, The Moral Philosophy of Richard Price, Copenhagen: Gleerup, Lund, and Munksgaard.
  • Barnes, Winston H. F., 1942, “Richard Price: A Neglected Eighteenth Century Moralist”, Philosophy, 17(66): 159–173. doi:10.1017/S0031819100003326
  • Broad, C. D., 1945, Some Reflections on Moral-Sense Theories in Ethics”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 45(1): 131–166. Reprinted in Broad’s Critical Essays in Moral Philosophy, David Cheney (ed.), London: George Allen & Unwin, 1971, pp. 188–222. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/45.1.131
  • Canovan, Margaret, 1978, “Two Concepts of Liberty: Eighteenth Century Style”, The Price-Priestley Newsletter, 2: 27–43. [Canovan 1978 available online]
  • Cone, Carl B., 1952, Torchbearer of Freedom: The Influence of Richard Price on 18th Century Thought, Lexington, KY: University Press of Kentucky.
  • Crisp, Roger, 2018, “Richard Price on Virtue”, in Virtue, Happiness, Knowledge: Themes from the Work of Gail Fine and Terence Irwin, David O. Brink, Susan Sauvé Meyer, and Christopher Shields (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 252–268.
  • Cua, A. S., 1966, Reason and Virtue: A Study in the Ethics of Richard Price, Athens, OH: Ohio University Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen, 1998, “Price, Richard (1723–91)”, in Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780415249126-DB057-1
  • Dickinson, H. T., 2005, “Richard Price on Reason and Revolution”, in Religious Identities in Britain, 1660–1832, William Gibson and Robert G. Ingram (eds.), London: Routledge, 231–254.
  • Duthille, Rémy, 2012, “Richard Price on Patriotism and Universal Benevolence”, Enlightenment and Dissent, 28: 24–41. [Duthille 2012 available online]
  • Earman, John, 2000, Hume’s Abject Failure: The Argument against Miracles, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0195127382.001.0001
  • –––, 2002, “Bayes, Hume, Price and Miracles”, in Bayes's Theorem, Richard Swinburne (ed.), (Proceedings of the British Academy, 113), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 91–109.
  • Frame, Paul, 2015, Liberty’s Apostle: Richard Price, His Life and Times, Cardiff: University of Wales Press.
  • Holland, J. D., 1968, “An Eighteenth-Century Pioneer Richard Price, D.D., F. R. S. (1723–1791)”, Notes and Records of the Royal Society of London, 23(1): 43–64. doi:10.1098/rsnr.1968.0009
  • Hudson, W.D., 1970, Reason and Right: A Critical Examination of Richard Price’s Moral Philosophy, London: Macmillan.
  • Hunt-Bull, Nicholas, 2004–7, “Richard Price and Francis Hutcheson—Does a Moral Sense Theory Make Ethics Arbitrary”, Enlightenment and Dissent, 23: 24–44. [Hunt-Ball 2004 available online]
  • Laboucheix, Henri, 1970 [1982], Richard Price: théoricien de la révolution américaine, le philosophe et le sociologue, le pamphlétaire et l'orateur, (Etudes anglaises 37), Paris: Didier. Translated as Richard Price as moral philosopher and political theorist, Sylvia and David Raphael (trans.), Oxford: Voltaire Foundation at the Taylor Institution, 1982.
  • Morgan, William, 1815, Memoirs of the Life of the Rev. Richard Price, London: R. Hunter. [Morgan 1815 available online]
  • Olson, Jonas, 2014, “Rationalism vs. Sentimentalism: Reviewing Price’s Review”, Philosophical Papers, 43(3): 429–445. doi:10.1080/05568641.2014.976443
  • Owen, David, 1987, “Hume Versus Price on Miracles and Prior Probabilities: Testimony and the Bayesian Calculation”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 37(147): 187–202. doi:10.2307/2220337
  • Passmore, J. A., 1951, Ralph Cudworth: An Interpretation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (Chapter 8: Cudworth and the British Moralists).
  • Peach, Bernard, 1954, “The Indefinability and Simplicity of Rightness in Richard Price’s Review of Morals”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 14(3): 370–385. doi:10.2307/2104109
  • –––, 1955, “History of Philosophy as Justifiable Interpretation a Reply to Henry Aiken”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 16(1): 113–120. doi:10.2307/2103453
  • –––, 1978, “On What Point Did Richard Price Convince Hume of a Mistake? With a Note by Henri Laboucheix”, The Price-Priestley Newsletter, 2: 76–81. [Peach 1978 available online]
  • –––, (ed.), 1979, Richard Price and the Ethical Foundations of the American Revolution, Durham, NC: University of North Carolina.
  • –––, 1980, “Hume’s Mistake”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 41(2): 331–334. doi:10.2307/2709465
  • Peterson, Susan Rae, 1984, “The Compatibility of Richard Price’s Politics and Ethics”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 45(4): 537–547. doi:10.2307/2709372
  • Poitras, Geoffrey, 2013, “Richard Price, Miracles and the Origins of Bayesian Decision Theory”, The European Journal of the History of Economic Thought, 20(1): 29–57. doi:10.1080/09672567.2011.565356
  • Price, H. S., 1986, “A Few Observations on David Hume and Richard Price on Miracles”, Enlightenment and Dissent, 5: 21–37. [H.S. Price 1986 available online]
  • Prior Arthur N., 1949a, Logic and the Basis of Ethics, Oxford: Clarendon Press. [Prior 1949a available online]
  • –––, 1949b, “Propriety and Truth: (1) Preliminary History”, in Prior 1949a: ch. 6.
  • –––, 1949c, “The Naturalistic Fallacy: The History of Its Refutation”, in Prior 1949a: ch. 9.
  • Raphael, D. Daiches, 1947, The Moral Sense (Chapter 8: Richard Price), London: Oxford University Press.
  • Rashdall, Hastings, 1907, “Intuitionism”, in Theory of Good and Evil: A Treatise on Moral Philosophy, second edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press, vol. 1, ch. 4. [Rashdall 1907 available online]
  • Raynor, David, 1981, “Hume’s Mistake—Another Guess”, Hume Studies, 7(2): 164–166. doi:10.1353/hms.2011.0565
  • Schneewind, Jerome B., 1998, “Price's Intuitionism”, in The Invention of Autonomy: A History of Modern Moral Philosophy (Section ii of Ch. 18, “Against a Fatherless World”), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511818288
  • Sidgwick, Henry, 1902, “Modern, Chiefly English, Ethics: Later Intuitionism, Price”, in Outlines of the History of Ethics for English Readers, fifth edition, London: Macmillan, (ch. 4, sec. 11) pp. 224–6. [Sidgwick 1902 available online]
  • Stephen, Leslie, 1876, “The Intellectual School”, “Price's Review”, “The Intellect and the Emotions”, “Result of his Teaching”, §§12–14 of Chapter 9 (“Moral Philosophy”), Section II “The Intellectual School” of History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century, first edition, London: Smith, Elder, & Co., Vol. II, pp. 12–14. [Stephen 1876 available online]
  • Stephens, John, 2000, “Conscience and the Epistemology of Morals: Richard Price’s Debt to Joseph Butler”, Enlightenment and Dissent, 19: 133–146. [Stephens 2000 available online]
  • Thomas, David Oswald, 1976, Richard Price 1723–1791, Cardiff: University of Wales Press.
  • Thomas, David Oswald, 1977, The Honest Mind: The Thought and Work of Richard Price, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Thomas, David Oswald, John Stephens, and P. A. L. Jones, 1993, A Bibliography of the Works of Richard Price, Aldershot: Scolar Press.
  • Thomas, David Oswald, 2005, “Price, Richard (1723–1791)”, in Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford: Oxford University Press, version of 26 May 2005. doi:10.1093/ref:odnb/22761
  • Thomas, Roland, 1924, Richard Price, Philosopher and Apostle of Liberty, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Zebrowski, Martha K., 2000, “‘We may venture to say that the number of Platonic Readers is considerable’: Richard Price, Joseph Priestley, and the Platonic Strain in Eighteenth Century Thought”, Enlightenment and Dissent, 19: 193–213. [Zebrowski 2000 available online]


The earliest of the biographies of Price is by his nephew, William Morgan (1815) who worked with Price for the last twenty years of his life on actuarial matters. Although it contains some inaccuracies, it is by far the most detailed contemporary source. A modern edition, edited and with an introduction by D. O. Thomas, constitutes the complete contents of the journal Enlightenment and Dissent 22 (2003). R. Thomas (1924) interweaves biography with discussion of his ideas and influence. It devotes considerable space to Price's influence on actuarial practice and on the politics of his day. Cone (1952) has a similar structure, but is more detailed than Thomas 1924. Written from an American perspective it casts light on Price's influence in the framing of the Constitution of the USA. Thomas 1976 is a very brief but engaging study. Frame's (2015) magisterial volume is the first to take a purely chronological approach to its subject seeking to place Price and his work firmly in their historical context. It makes full use of Price's correspondence and his shorthand journal to give the fullest picture to date.

Other Internet Resources


I am very grateful to Eve Garrard and John Roberts for their considerable help and encouragement.

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David McNaughton <>

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