Social and Political Thought in Chinese Philosophy

First published Thu Jul 21, 2016; substantive revision Thu Jan 13, 2022

Issues in social and political thought have been central to Chinese philosophy from its earliest moments down to the present day. Neither “social” nor “political” have ready correlates in Chinese prior to the nineteenth century, but Chinese thinkers consistently have been concerned with understanding how both individuals and institutions have broad effects in what we can call both social and political modes. In some cases, the philosophers narrowly focus on governance and the state, but in many other cases, no firm distinction is made between the realms of political, social, and even family or individual. The scope of social and political thought, and its relation to other concerns like individual ethics, are discussed in Section 1.

The bulk of this entry is arranged chronologically, beginning with the most important texts of the classical (or pre-Imperial) era; then briefly attending to developments in the early Imperial era; next looking more carefully at some of the key developments in the 800-year Neo-Confucian era; and ending with Chinese social and political thinking over the last 150 years. The organization within each section differs because of differences in our sources. While theories concerning the composition and dating of classical texts remain intensely controversial, it is at least clear that our default should not be to treat these texts as the products of single authors at a single time, much less as representing the theories of well-established schools of thought. Instead, it makes sense to take individual texts, and sometimes individual chapters, as our basic units of analysis. The nature and authorship of sources are clearer as we move into later eras, and so a topical organization makes sense for subsequent sections of the entry.

Several questions are central to the teachings and debates that make up Chinese social and political thought, among which the issue of how to sustain “order (zhi)”—often understood more particularly as “harmony (he)”—is the most basic. To what degree should we rely on institutions (and of what kinds?), and to what degree is human leadership crucial? What sorts of roles, relationships, or hierarchies should structure our societies, and how are they justified? Can they be challenged or changed? Insofar as society is divided into rulers and ruled, what are the responsibilities that each owes to the other, and why? We will see that social and political topics routinely connect up with other aspects of Chinese philosophy—for example, answers to some of the questions just raised lead to further ethical, epistemic, or metaphysical questions—but for the most part it is still possible to make sense of social and political thought in its own terms.

1. The Scope of the “Political”

On one common reading, a ruler’s authority is based in individual moral charisma (or virtue; de). The famous “Mandate of Heaven (tianming)” theory has its roots in the way that the Zhou people legitimized their conquest of the Shang. Passages in the Book of History tell us that Heaven (tian: the deity of the Zhou people) had transferred its “mandate” from the Shang to the Zhou leaders, as a result of the depravity and misrule of the Shang kings. The Zhou leadership claimed to know this by employing oracle bone divination: they adopted the Shang practice of divining, but put it to the new use of justifying political authority, and thus the shift of Heaven’s favor (partly by eliding the difference between the Shang chief deity and their own). One aspect of this transformation was transforming Heaven into a moral figure, a god who made judgments based on the perceived virtue of the leader (Allan 1984). As we will see below, by the time of the Warring States era and the foundational texts of Confucian philosophy, there have been further transformations: Heaven is no longer a figure at all, but closer to an abstract sense of the normative order of the universe, and its intentions are no longer accessible via divination. Still, most modern scholars hold that for the majority of classical thinkers, an ethical ideal continues to serve as the ultimate justification of political authority.

It must be acknowledged, though, that there is attention in Confucian texts to procedural matters and to the norm of “order”, at least partly separate from rulers’ virtue. Some interpreters have argued that this means the Confucians recognized a distinct species of “political” norms, and that such political concerns were more important to the Confucians than the achievement of individual, rarefied ethical states. For example, in his discussion of under what circumstances Mencius judges a rebellion to be justified, Justin Tiwald emphasizes that Mencius “puts a great deal of weight on the essentially procedural requirement that the ruler be properly designated for the task” (Tiwald 2008: 274). Even more explicitly, Loubna El Amine argues at length in her Classical Confucian Political Thought for the importance of a distinct sphere of politics. She says that while “the realm of politics is not completely distinct from the realm of ethics,… political order, not moral edification, is the end”; and furthermore that “political order is an end in itself, not a means toward virtue” (El Amine 2015: 15).

All interpreters agree that there is at least a narrow kind of political legitimacy in play, of the type that tells one who the legitimate heir to the throne should be. According to the Mencius, in the earliest days, political power was passed on via sagely, particularistic assessment of who was most qualified to rule, coupled with the endorsement of Heaven, as viewed through the actions of the people. This is how the throne was passed from Yao to Shun, and from Shun to Yu. This practice quickly fell apart, though, and in its (supposed) place arose the mechanisms of hereditary monarchy (MC 5A:5 and 5A:6). This is an ingenious explanation for the shift that also helps to explain why Confucius was never tapped to rule in the way that Shun had been. Mou Zongsan has influentially argued that the shift from sagely judgment on who is best fit to rule, to hereditary monarchy, is a shift from a holistic form of ethical authority to what is merely an effective technology for the administration of power instead of genuine political authority (Mou 1991: 132). In other words, Mou agrees with El Amine on the existence of a relatively distinct realm of politics, though—writing as a modern Confucian philosopher—Mou regrets the degree to which this shallow form of politics is disconnected from justification deeper than “order”, and argues for a re-imagining of Confucian politics (on which see Section 5).

While Mou’s argument that Confucian political thought is too narrow is certainly controversial, all agree that at least some classical thinkers focus on effective technology for the administration of power and the maintenance of order, to the exclusion of ethical concerns. Indeed, one of the better arguments that Confucians really did refuse to separate the ethical and the political is simply that so many of the Confucians’ critics interpreted them in this way. Whatever we decide about early Confucians, it is quite evident that a millennium later, most Neo-Confucians took ethics and politics to be mutually entailing, as we will see in Section 4.

2. The Classical Era

A small amount of historical context will be useful before we begin. The Zhou people conquer the Shang in approximately 1046 BCE, and for the next several hundred years, the central plains of what is now China were either ruled directly by the Zhou king, or else by elite families loyal to the Zhou, in a kind of feudal system. By the Spring and Autumn era (771 BCE–476 BCE), the power of the feudal lords had eclipsed that of the Zhou king, but a rough peace still prevailed with different feudal lords acting as “hegemon (ba)”. This system then breaks down and the pre-Imperial period enters its final stage, the Warring States era (often dated 475 BCE–221 BCE), which received its name from the incessant warfare conducted between the realms that established themselves as independent powers after the effective demise of the Zhou dynasty. Not only was warfare common in this period; it was also increasingly vast in scope, as the chariot armies of the elite made way for much larger conscript-based armies. This change was in turn related to the increasing abilities of states to raise, organize, and feed such large armies. Both larger populations and more complex governmental structures lay behind these developments. All these inter-related developments, finally, both drove and were shaped by the era’s social and political philosophies. The texts that we examine here all date from the Warring States era, a period of pluralistic debate that establishes key terms and questions addressed by Chinese thinkers for many centuries thereafter. Three general, provocative treatments of this era are El Amine 2015, Bai 2012, and Pines 2012, and Hsiao 1979 is a classic account of the subject.

2.1 Guanzi: Carrot and Stick

The earliest chapters of the Guanzi, which were composed in the state of Qi and date from the mid-4th century BCE, are among the first theoretical writings on governance. In a famous passage from “Shepherding the People”, we find that “Success in government lies in following the hearts of the people”. Success is not defined as making the people happy—we learn elsewhere that success for the ruler is having a strong state that endures through the ages—but following the people’s wishes turns out to be a necessary condition for success. Thus:

When the granaries are full, the people will know propriety and moderation; when their clothing and food are adequate, they will know the distinction between honor and shame.


If the ruler can ensure the people their existence and provide them with security, they will be willing to endure danger and disaster for him. (GZ ch. 1, pp. 54 and 52)

This is not to say that the people should be given free reign. If they are well fed and put to work at tasks well-suited to them, they are likely to accord with propriety and moderation, but the author adds that rulers must “Make clear the road to certain death”, by which he means “having severe punishments” for those who go astray (GZ ch. 1, p. 55). In another chapter of the text, possibly by the same author, we find:

Those who shepherd the people desire them to be controllable. Since they desire them to be controllable, they must pay serious attention to standards (fa). (GZ ch. 3, p. 98)

These “standards” are then enumerated to include honoring ranks and ceremonial dress, giving salaries and rewards to the deserving, granting offices, and applying punishments. The Guanzi thus presents us with versions of the two techniques of governance that will run throughout the texts of the Warring States: nurturing the people and setting them standards.

2.2 Mozi: Theological or Utilitarian Justification?

Roughly contemporary with the Guanzi is the Mozi, one chapter of which begins:

In ancient times, when people were first born and before there were any punishments or government, in their languages each had a different notion of rightness (yi). One man had one notion, two men had two…. Thus those with good doctrines would keep them secret and refuse to teach them. (MZ ch. 11, p. 91, translation significantly modified by author)

This of course led to chaos and suffering, the cause of which was the absence of “a leader to govern”. A ruler was therefore selected, declared the “Son of Heaven”, and provided with a staff of ministers to aid him. The ruler then established the single idea of rightness that all would heed. The text describes a comprehensive hierarchy according to which each individual would heed his or her superior’s judgment as to what was “good (shan)”, ultimately leading up to the ruler who would base his judgment on Heaven.

“Heaven (tian)” is a difficult term. It once clearly referred to a religious entity, but eventually comes to be understood in more naturalistic terms. Which it means in this chapter is a matter of scholarly disagreement. For the most part, Warring States philosophers of governance do not appeal to supernatural standards to justify their claims. Even in the Mozi, if one takes evidence from other chapters into account, the interpretive dispute over “tian” may be moot. These other chapters record that just as carpenters can use a compass to determine what is circular, so an understanding of the “will of Heaven” leads one to reliably judge what is right. The striking thing about a compass is that no special knowledge is needed to use it: it is a public, objective standard for circles. If the “will of Heaven” is to be analogous, then there must be a public, objective standard for right. Mysterious knowledge of the will of a deity does not sound like a good candidate for such a public, objective standard. The text offers an alternative, though: it regularly speaks of maximally “benefitting (li)” the people as a standard. A neat way of resolving all these loose ends, then, is to conclude that the “will of Heaven” is a metaphorical reference to the standard of “benefit”. Proper Mohist governance thus would ultimately be a matter of utilitarian judgment.

2.3 Analects (Lunyu) and Mencius

Ostensibly a collection of sayings by Confucius and his students, much if not all of the Analects was composed after Confucius’s death, and its various chapters express the teachings of individuals who identified themselves with Confucius’s legacy. The earliest chapters in the text (mid-5th to mid-4th century BCE; chs. 3–9) may well be the earliest written philosophical reflection in China, but show little direct concern with governance. In one of the most dramatic shifts in the text, governance takes center stage in a set of chapters (12, 13, 2) which may date from the last quarter of the 4th century BCE (Brooks & Brooks 1998). The theory of this segment of the Analects has much in common with the Guanzi. Asked about government, “Confucius” is made to say: “Enough food; enough weapons; the people having confidence in the ruler” (LY 12:7, p. 91). Of these, “confidence (xin)” is most important. “Confidence” here means that one identifies with one’s ruler, doing so because he manifestly seeks what is good for one (see also LY 13:29–30).

The dynamic of people identifying with and modeling themselves on the ruler permeates the text’s understanding of governance. Asked whether a ruler should kill those who fail to follow the way (dao), Confucius responds:

You are there to govern; what use have you for killing? If you desire the good, the people will be good. The virtue of the gentleman is the wind; the virtue of the little people is the grass. The wind on the grass will surely bend it. (LY 12:19, p. 94; see also LY 2:1)

Unlike the emphasis put on “punishments” as one kind of “standard (fa)” in the Guanzi, the Analects here minimizes the importance of killing. This point is reinforced in perhaps the most famous saying in the text about governance:

Lead them with government and regulate them by punishments, and the people will evade them with no sense of shame. Lead them with virtue and regulate them by ritual, and they will acquire a sense of shame—and moreover, they will be orderly. (LY 2:3, p. 110)

There are only a few passages in the text that stress the continued need for punishments in a good society, and they all come quite late in the text: 13:3 is an obvious interpolation, and like the similar 20:2, probably dates to the mid-third century BCE.

In a variety of ways the Mencius picks up where Analects 12, 13, and 2 left off. One innovation of the Mencius is to give a name to its preferred mode of governance: “humane government (renzheng)”. This means that one should rule by loving the people like a parent loves his children: providing for them, educating them, giving them a role model. The text stresses that while this policy is beneficial to all involved, one must pursue it out of humane concern rather than out of cold calculation. Because of the ruler’s ability to transform others through his example, if he acts on the basis of “benefit (li)” alone, his subjects will do so as well, and each from his or her own, narrow perspective. The result will be chaos and suffering, rather than order, harmony, and mutual benefit, all of which would arise from genuinely humane governance (MC 1A:1).

The Mencius emphasizes humane governance as well as the distinction between rightness (yi) and mere concern with benefit, rejecting utilitarian calculation without regard to rightness. It also opposes coercive authority, recognizing that even modeling and role-emulation work indirectly:

You can never win the allegiance of people by trying to dominate them with goodness; but if you use goodness to nurture them, then you will win the allegiance of the whole world. (MC 4B:16; see also 7A:14)

From other places in the text we can tell that Mencius (or his followers) knew and disapproved of the Mohists; this passage criticizes the Mohist practice of directly enforcing a standard of goodness through hierarchy. The Mencius contains numerous hierarchical ideas (see esp. MC 3A:4), but it has considerable faith in the people’s ability to do good if they are provided for, and not otherwise (see MC 1A7, 3A3).

Both the Mozi and the Guanzi stress the need for objective standards (fa), as will many subsequent texts. In this context Analects 12, 13, and 2 and Mencius stand out as not taking fa seriously. Even when we come upon the tool metaphor in Mencius (MC 4A:1), it is applied to the idea of “humane government” rather than to specific, institutionalizable standards. This is not to say that the Analects and Mencius were devoid of any notion of “standard”. Their standard, though, is resolutely particular, rather than objective and general: the model set by the ethical ruler. The later Analects (e.g., 13:3, a late interpolation) and the Xunzi (see below) recognize a role for coercion, but authority in the earlier “Confucian” texts is non-coercive. People follow willingly, initially because the good ruler provides for them, and increasingly because they come to love him as a father: they are transformed from individuals into members of a single, state-wide family.

2.4 Dao De Jing: Nature and Non-Action (Wuwei)

The “Guodian” version of the Dao De Jing, discovered in a tomb in 1993, begins:

Cut off knowledge, abandon argumentation, and the people will benefit a hundredfold. Cut off cleverness, abandon “benefit”, and there will be no more thieves or bandits. Cut off activity and abandon purposefulness, and the people will again be filial…. Exhibit the unadorned and embrace the simple. Have little thought of self and few desires. (Henricks 2000: 28; cp. ch. 19 of received version [DDJ])

In several respects the attitude here expressed mirrors that of the Mencius: explicit discussion of “benefit” is rejected, though the indirect goal of benefitting the people is endorsed; argumentation—whether referring to litigation or logical disputation—is rejected; a simple life with “few desires” (cp. MC 7B:35) is favored. On at least the first two counts, Mohism seems the specific target (as it is in the Mencius as well).

Despite these resonances, though, there are also important differences between the Dao De Jing and Mencius. Most important are the differences in their respective positive accounts of what rulers should do. In the Mencius, rulers are enjoined to follow the way of the ancient kings and establish a humane government. The Dao De Jing is much more reticent about articulating any specific human standard; indeed, in the received version of the text, the line which reads “Cut off activity and abandon purposefulness” in the Guodian version has been updated to “Cut off ‘humaneness’ and abandon ‘rightness’”, thus extending to followers of Confucius the treatment initially reserved only for Mohists.

The best communities, as far as the Dao De Jing is concerned, are those that form and flourish naturally, with little guidance from above. Later chapters will add that the community is best if small and isolated (DDJ ch. 80), as well as providing theoretical justifications for the success of such communities, as for instance:

The way is revered and virtue is honored not because this is decreed by any authority but because it is natural for them to be treated so. (DDJ ch. 51)

Rulers succeed by allowing nature to take its course: by “not acting (wuwei)”. Ironically, some of the Dao De Jing’s teachings are appropriated as straight-forward political advice by certain later thinkers. The Han Feizi (on which see more below), for example, echoes the Dao De Jing in calling for rulers to avoid articulating explicit standards or desires, but it does so in order to make sure that ministers cannot pander to the ruler, rather than out of a deeper objection to standards as such.

2.5 Zhuangzi: Rejecting Governance

Unlike the Dao De Jing, with which it is often lumped as fellow “Daoist” texts, it is difficult to read the Zhuangzi as concerned with governance or aimed at rulers. This is not to say that the text advocates anarchism; like all texts from the Warring States, it seems to take for granted that states will have rulers. To a greater extent than any other text, though, it is uninterested in the problems rulers faced and even seems disinclined to grant rulers any special authority. It is certainly at odds with those thinkers who believe that people must come to identify with their states. One gloss for the attitude of the text towards governance issues, in fact, might be: avoid commitment, accept what comes.

At the heart of the text is a radical linguistic and epistemological argument against accepting any one perspective as ultimately, eternally correct. “Clarity (ming)” comes when one realizes the perspectival nature of all affirmations and denials. Having attained this kind of clarity, it makes no sense to put oneself on the line for any one set of evaluations, like “our state must triumph” or even “it is better for humans to flourish than plants”. In the context of the harsh realities of the Warring States, these doctrines may well have appealed to many.

2.6 Book of Lord Shang: Benefit Through Order

The Book of Lord Shang (Shangjun shu) builds on two themes that we have already encountered. First, it argues that “the greatest benefit to the people is order (zhi)” (SJS ch. 7). This is to implicitly accept that “benefit (li)” is the standard by which theories of governance are judged, but it also places particular stress on the collective character of “benefit”. In a war-torn world, we are told, only when the state is strong can its inhabitants flourish. Those who act for their own interests rather than for the “benefit of the state”, therefore, are to be punished (SJS ch. 14). The text is no friend of those who like to debate and push their own agendas; it prefers a people devoted to agriculture who are “simple (pu) and easy to direct” (SJS ch. 3). We can see here, in short, that one result of the fuzziness surrounding the idea of “benefitting the people” is that if clearer criteria can plausibly be seen as necessary conditions for benefitting the people, they take center stage. A prime example is “order”. Disorder, it is natural to assume, is incompatible with the people’s well-being, so rulers could concentrate on order and allow benefit to follow in its wake. Especially when combined with the idea that the people tend to be selfish and not understand what is really good for them, though, a focus on order can rapidly lead to tyranny.

Another idea we have seen already is that governance demands objective standards. This is a central theme of the Book of Lord Shang. It repeatedly stresses the importance of public, impartial standards (fa) for application of punishment and reward. “Fa” is often translated “law”, but its uses here and elsewhere are clearly broader than mere penal law. One kind of standard, to be sure, is the penal statute (xian), but standards take many other forms. The fact that rewards and punishments are regularly attached to standards makes it clear that these are normative expectations, and not just ideals. In another way the “fa” are more than ideals: they are institutionalized. This aspect no doubt explains part of the appeal of translating “fa” as “law”, since we often think of laws as norms that are subject to some kind of enforcement, unlike ethical ideals.

Finally, the text also insists that there be no debate over what the standards are nor about when they have been fulfilled: the ruler alone fixes the standard based on his assessment of the needs of the age. He should neither imitate antiquity nor follow current standards. What is crucial is that his standards set out the distinct roles (fen) expected of people, as well as the rewards and penalties that will enforce these roles. The text adds that the intelligent ruler will not fail to carry out his own role, on pain of “harming the standards”.

2.7 Shen Buhai: Bureaucratic “Non-Action”

Shen became Chancellor of the state of Han in 354 BCE and died 337 BCE. Early bibliographies list a text bearing his name, but all that remains of it are quotations in other works; the original has been lost. It is thus difficult to date this material.

Shen’s central insight seems to have been that government should be based not on feudal principles, but on a bureaucratic system. Creel observes that Shen favored “a system of administration by means of professional functionaries, whose functions are more or less definitely prescribed” (SBH p. 55). Rulers should not find good men and give them responsibility, but instead find the right man for each role in the system. The role of the ruler in such a theory is simple: define the needed functions and select men to perform them, then “do nothing (wuwei)”. Doing nothing does not mean to literally abstain from action, but the ruler does nothing more than keep the system running smoothly. Shen compares the ruler to a scale:

… which merely establishes equilibrium, itself doing nothing; yet the mere fact that it remains in balance causes lightness and heaviness to discover themselves. (SBH p. 352)

Unlike the Dao De Jing, which seems to trust nature more than man, Shen Buhai trusts man-made institutions more than individuals’ decision-making powers.

2.8 Xunzi: Transforming the People

Chapter 19 of the Xunzi contains one of the Warring States era’s most famous origin stories.

From what did ritual (li) arise? I say: Humans are born having desires. When they have desires but do not get the objects of their desire, then they cannot but seek some means of satisfaction. If there is no measure or limit to their seeking, then they cannot help but struggle with each other. If they struggle with each other then there will be chaos, and if there is chaos then they will be impoverished. The former kings hated such chaos, so they established rituals and rightness in order to establish distinctions among the people, to nurture their desires, and to satisfy their seeking. (XZ ch. 19, p. 201, slightly modified by author)

Ritual (li—a different character from that for “benefit”) was important in many chapters of the Analects, but takes on an even more central role here. While people (unlike animals) have the ability to notice and pay heed to distinctions (fen), they will not do so naturally. Their desires have to be shaped through on-going ritual education in order for society to be harmonious and for people to flourish. The text explicitly links ritual with the idea of “standard (fa)”: “To reject ritual is to be without standards”, and “a man without standards is lost and guideless” (XZ ch. 2, p. 14, modified). Unlike the explicit regulations for when punishments and rewards are deserved of the Book of Lord Shang, that is, the Xunzi takes standards to come through having been taught ritual by an expert teacher—by one’s immediate teacher, by one’s ruler, and by the sage kings, who originally established the proper set of rituals. Both texts seek to exploit features of peoples’ psychologies to establish order, both in the name of benefiting the people. The central difference, which hearkens back to Analects 2:3, is that the Book of Lord Shang relies directly on people’s desire for benefit and hatred of harm, while the Xunzi relies on people’s ability to care about “distinctions” in order to transform them. Once transformed, ritual propriety and shame, rather than direct concern with benefit, will guide them.

Although Xunzi puts considerable emphasis on the role of standards, he also famously argues that “There are people who create order; there are no standards creating order of themselves” (XZ ch. 12, p.117, slightly modified). A major theme in Xunzi’s writings is that explicit standards are necessarily vague, so that the proper implementation of them is underdetermined. He also holds that proper implementation of standards requires a great deal of skill and technique. Furthermore, he notes that standards sometimes appear to conflict with one another, and it requires wisdom and experience to know how to balance such competing considerations. Finally, there is no fixed way of systematizing the rules. Changes in circumstance require that the priority of rules will sometimes need to be revised, and this too requires good judgment. For all these reasons, Xunzi credits good people with order, not the standards themselves.

2.9 Han Feizi: Pragmatic Justification of Practical Policies

Like several earlier texts, the Han Feizi puts considerable stress on objective criteria for governance. Rulers are to compare “names (ming)”—that is, explicit statements of a position’s duties—with results and bestow awards or inflict punishments based on how the two correspond. We also read that: “A truly enlightened ruler uses standards (fa) to select men for him; he does not choose them himself” (HFZ ch. 6, p. 24). While the ruler does not choose ministers according to his own judgment or whim, he still must establish standards in the first place; he cannot simply rely on tradition or precedent:

The sage does not try to practice the ways of antiquity or to abide by a fixed standard, but examines the affairs of the age and takes what precautions are necessary. (HFZ ch. 49, pp. 96–7)

This contrasts with strands in several earlier texts which advocated conforming with past tradition. In some of these texts, the recorded or imagined practices of earlier ages are thought to have epistemological significance: evidence of the insights of the sages. Others, more skeptical about naturalistic justifications, imply that observing tradition is our only means of agreeing on a single set of standards, and without such agreement, disorder looms.

More common than a desire to conform to old practices, though, is the notion that times change and the good ruler must be prepared to change with them. New standards are needed for a new age. This is even endorsed by some of the texts which ground ultimate justification on the natural order: the underlying patterns of nature may not change, but their specific applications can, as human society grows and changes. Other justifications of change are more pragmatic, though, and the Han Feizi is perhaps the most explicit. Here we read that rulers are enjoined to measure the gains that come from enacting new standards against the losses that ensue; “… if one finds gain will exceed losses, one goes ahead with them” (HFZ ch. 47).

The Han Feizi also gives us a clearer idea than any earlier text of why rule via standard was to be preferred to rule by the wise and virtuous. Chapter 40 puts readers through the following dialectic. We begin with the idea, attributed to Shen Dao, that virtue and wisdom are unnecessary for good governance; everything depends on “political purchase (shi)” and “status (wei)”. To this a critic responds that “talent (cai)” is also necessary: give power to the unworthy and the result will be chaos. The conclusion follows: when rulers are so good or bad that nothing could change them, we will call that shi-by-nature and set that aside. But such men are rare. The author is interested in the average ruler, for whom shi is crucial. So in the end we are back to Shen Dao’s position as the only tenable one for the vast majority of rulers—and for all the rulers for whom the author’s advice is going to make any difference.

Another theme of the text is the conflict between individuals and public, state interests. We are shown that even for the virtuous, family loyalties regularly trump state loyalties, and thus:

Since the interests of superior and inferior are as disparate as all this, it is hopeless for the ruler to praise the actions of the private individual and at the same time try to insure blessing on the state’s altars of the soil and grain. (HFZ ch. 49, p. 107)

The author analyzes this as a conflict between “private (si)” and “public (gong)” perspectives, and argues that the two are mutually irreconcilable.

The ruler, in particular, must heed the distinction between gong and si. For instance,

… For his part the ruler must never make selfish (si) use of his wise ministers or able men, so the people are never tempted to go beyond their communities to form friendships. (HFZ, ch. 6, p. 25)

The clear suggestion is that ruler can be blamed if people conspire against him. In another chapter, we read that

To fail to heed your loyal ministers when you are at fault, insisting on having your own way, which will in time destroy your good reputation and make you a laughing stock of others. (HFZ ch. 10, p. 49)

While there are certainly some sections of the text that paint the relationship between rulers and ministers as conflictive—since the latter tend to look only to their personal concerns, at the expense of the state’s more general well-being—this chapter, at least, urges a more constructive relationship between them.

3. The Early Imperial Era

In 221 BCE the king of the state of Qin vanquishes his final rival and declares himself the First Emperor, inaugurating both the Qin dynasty and China’s imperial era. The First Emperor’s success was founded in part on his adherence to social and political ideas akin to those in the Book of Lord Shang, and he endeavors to extend socio-political standardization and control in unprecedented ways in the new empire. The Qin dynasty does not long outlive its founder, but it is followed by the four-century-long Han dynasty in which many of key characteristics of imperial Chinese state and society are first established. A lengthy period of disunity follows the collapse of the Han in 220 CE; over this period and through the succeeding Sui and Tang dynasties, intellectuals focus less on social and political philosophy than on issues of spiritual cultivation and abstract metaphysics: in particular, this is the era when Chinese Buddhism comes of age. While there certainly is socio-political thinking to be found (see, for example, Chiu-Duke 2000) it makes sense to focus in this section on the Han dynasty.

In the area of social and political philosophy, Han dynasty thinkers make three main contributions. First of all, they seek to better understand and systematize their inheritance from the classical era. In part they do this by editing and establishing standard editions of earlier texts; many of these now-classic texts take their current form at the hands of Han dynasty scholars. Another important aspect of this work is establishing categories through which to understand the classical era authors and debates. Distinctions among “schools (jia)” such as Confucian, Mohist, Standards (fajia, often translated as “Legalist”), and Daoist (daodejia) come from the efforts of Han scholars to divide up earlier thinkers’ approach to governance in particular (Csikszentmihalyi 2006: xvii; Smith 2003). The second important contribution during the Han dynasty lies at the intersection of thought and practice: rulers and the advisers implement a variety of institutions aimed at realizing socio-political goals that rest on a synthesis of classical thinking. That is, notwithstanding the efforts to distinguish various classical schools of thought, much Han thought and practice was highly synthetic, seeking to harmonize the insights of all schools. This meant building a state that rests on laws and other “standards” as well as on rituals and on the ethical characters of the rulers. Han emperors establish central educational institutions and initiate the practice of bringing talented scholars into the government via examination (albeit at a much smaller scale than in the later Neo-Confucian era).

The third contribution of Han thinkers is their individual philosophizing about the ways that state and society should be organized and fit into the larger cosmos; we will briefly consider three examples. Jia Yi (200–168 BCE) was a statesman and thinker whose eclectic philosophizing was emblematic of his era. He is best known, though, for his “Confucian”-sounding ethical and political writings. For example, he carefully articulates the ways that a crown prince should be educated, living alongside scrupulously correct people so as to acquire a correct “second nature”, just as one acquires one’s mother tongue. As the prince matures, he must be open to the realities of the world and to his own fallibility: Jia prescribes that “Wooden boards are erected, on which people might censure his actions. He is subject to the drum of remonstrance” (HCT pp. 12–13). Jia elaborates on the implied vision of socio-political order in another essay, arguing that while the common people must be punished when they violate standards such as laws, high officials are accountable to ritual and ethics rather than public law. These latter methods enable the cultivation of a sense of shame, an internal moral compass, which in turn will enable officials to learn from public remonstration—which is explicitly legitimate—and to adjudicate wisely in law courts (HCT, pp. 36–7).

Another feature of Han socio-political thought is an emphasis on “non-action (wuwei)”. The term is best-known from the Dao De Jing, although the term and, more broadly, the general ideal of non-purposive, spontaneous action is widespread in Warring States thought (Slingerland 2003). In the Han we see it adapted to many different approaches to governance. The Utopian vision that lies at the heart of the Dao De Jing (on at least one common reading) is still present, but more common is a synthesis of ritual or legal standards with the idea of non-action. For example, one official recommends what he takes to have been the approach of the early sage kings, which was that “In making laws and edicts, they made sure [those laws and edicts] accorded with human dispositions and only then put them into effect” (HCT, p. 60). In this way, people follow the laws naturally, needing no overt intervention on the part of the state. Texts that brought together an emphasis on overt standards and ideas like non-action are widespread; in fact, the earliest extant commentaries on the Dao De Jing are included as chapters—likely added to the text in the Han—of the Han Feizi, which as we saw above is the epitome of standards-based governance.

Finally, many thinkers in the Han stress the ways in which human activity fits into and is even shaped by cosmological processes and patterns. Here is an example of such a naturalistic justification of the political order:

The five phases each move according to its place in the sequence…. This is the reason that wood rules life, metal rules death, fire rules heat, and water rules cold. Human beings have no choice but to go by their sequence, and officials have no choice but to go by their abilities. (HCT, p. 178)

In such a context astronomical and other portents take on significant political roles, though the Han also had famous skeptics like Wang Chong (27 CE–100 CE) who denied their importance. All in all, we can say that the Han bequeathed to China a normative vision emphasizing socio-political harmony, even including harmony with the cosmos, that has room for various objective standards alongside important roles played by virtuous rulers and ministers.

4. The Neo-Confucian Era

The Neo-Confucian era begins in the early Song dynasty, which itself is founded in 960 CE. A combination of social and political changes create fertile ground for new socio-political theorizing. The key marker of social status in the Tang dynasty (618–907) had been one’s pedigree, and the society was organized around something close to a state-sponsored aristocracy. Seeking its own legitimacy, the leaders of the new Song dynasty settled on a partnership with a transformed elite class, now based more in education and claims of merit than in ancestry. Instead of official families, the elite become a “community of the educated”; Song society is far more literate and published than its Tang predecessor, and scholars generally refer to the new elite as the “literati” (Bol 2008: 31–9). In this fertile soil, the idea that literati should reflect on the Way and seek to influence their society took root and grew.

In the mid-twentieth century, a range of scholars argued for two, closely linked theses concerning the relation of Neo-Confucians to imperial power. The first was the Autocracy Thesis, according to which imperial power began to grow in the Song dynasty, eventually reaching despotic levels in later dynasties. The second was the Inward-Turn Thesis, which held that Neo-Confucians largely abdicated from engagement in political affairs, especially after the loss of northern China (Liu 1988). In recent decades, though, new scholarship has shown quite convincingly that ministerial and literati power remain significant throughout the Song, and that Neo-Confucians remain politically engaged (Bol 2008: 119; Levey 1991: 545f). The nature of the political engagement does change, however. Rather than seeing Neo-Confucians as simply advocating an inward turn, it is more accurate to see them as often favoring a localist, decentralized approach to governance. Among other things, they come to see non-state spaces as extremely important to successful change at wider levels of the state. This is not to say that Neo-Confucians abandon efforts to educate, direct, and serve the emperor, and strong emperors early in the Ming and Qing dynasties manage to bring the focus back to themselves for periods of time. Overall, though, the emphasis of Neo-Confucian theories of governance is nicely captured in the modern slogan “think globally, act locally”.

According to Neo-Confucians, institutions of governance operate on two levels simultaneously, one socio-political and the other personal. At the socio-political level, they are concerned with the practicalities of keeping order in a large state filled with imperfect people. At the personal level they are concerned with an individual’s moral character. Someone might think that operations on these two levels work at cross-purposes, because crafting good institutions and policies requires that we take human imperfections into account, and yet a full commitment to improving one’s character requires that we rise above these imperfections. Neo-Confucians disagree. For them, the continuity of the socio-political with the personal received its canonical expression in a passage from the classical Greater Learning:

Wanting to light up the bright virtue of all in the world, the ancients first put their states in order. Those who wanted to put their states in order first regulated their families. Those who wanted to regulate their families first cultivated their selves. Those who wanted to cultivate their selves first rectified their heartminds. Those who wanted to rectify their heartminds first made their intentions sincere. Those who wanted to make their intentions sincere first reached understanding. Reaching understanding lies in investigating things. (Greater Learning 4)

We could understand the continuity described in this passage as a temporally connected set of steps: first investigate things, then reach understanding, then make one’s intentions sincere, and so on, eventually putting one’s state in order. But in fact the Neo-Confucians tend to see the steps as mutually constitutive: investigating things just is reaching understanding, families are regulated through the very act of personal cultivation, and having orderly families is part of what it means for a state to be in order. The implicit relationship between personal cultivation and socio-political order is captured in the frequently used slogan “inner sage-outer king”: ethics and governance are two sides of the same coin. In other words, socio-political order entails the ethical transformation of people in the state, as well as their leaders; in the language of the text, this is to “light up the bright virtue of all in the world”.

With virtually no exceptions, Neo-Confucians accepted hereditary monarchy as their form of government. This does not mean that all monarchs automatically enjoyed full legitimacy, however. Already in the latter half of the Tang dynasty, Confucian and Buddhist scholars had begun to claim that the proper moral or spiritual teaching was passed on in a genealogical fashion (Wilson 1995). Han Yu (768–824) famously asserted that this transmission of the Confucian “Way” had been lost for many centuries; Northern Song progenitors of Neo-Confucianism argued that it was only in their generation that the Way had been recovered. In other words, legitimate succession from one monarch to another did not assure that individual rulers—or even their dynasty as a whole—were following the Way. Zhu Xi (1130–1200) gives this idea its most influential formulation when he says that the “succession of the Way (daotong)” comes to those who are able to grasp the deep truths embedded in the classics by the early sages. According to this view, the earliest sages both grasped the Way and ruled, but over time rulers lost this tie to the moral Way. A few great teachers like Confucius and Mencius understood the Way and tried to steer their societies in the right direction, even though they were not rulers, but eventually the succession of the Way was lost until it was recovered, says Zhu Xi, by the Cheng brothers (Cheng Hao [1032–1085] and Cheng Yi [1033–1107]).

The idea that the succession of the Way can come apart from the more superficial succession of monarchy has a number of important implications, especially when combined with the view of governance operating at two levels (maintaining social order and achieving moral transformation). Borrowing a term from classical antiquity, Neo-Confucians argue that a ruler who is successful at keeping order but who falls short of achieving broader transformation is a mere “hegemon” rather than a true “king”. It is better to be a hegemon than a cruel tyrant, to be sure, but even the successful hegemon still needs to aspire to something greater. The gatekeepers to these greater achievements, meanwhile, are those scholars who have attained the succession of the Way. According to this manner of thinking, therefore, monarchs must accept that leaders of the literati should be their teachers or even co-rulers, or that the monarch’s central authority should be reined in so that morally cultivated literati can hold sway over local affairs. Over the Neo-Confucian period literati had varying degrees of success in asserting authority derived from the succession of the Way.

4.1 Factions and Political Independence

William de Bary, one of the most influential Western scholars of Neo-Confucianism, has said an important “trouble with Confucianism” is that it imposed tremendous moral demands on the Confucian superior person (junzi) without providing the political power to fulfill them. The superior person shoulders the responsibility of cultivating humane monarchs and fashioning social and political institutions that work for the public weal, but Confucians are also committed to a system that gives superior people very little leverage with which to accomplish these herculean tasks. They deprive themselves of this leverage in various ways, some of them obvious (Confucianism embraces powerful and largely unchecked monarchical government) and some of them subtle. One of the ways of undermining Confucians’ own power is by refusing to pander to specific constituencies or factions, standing on the side of the right and the public good rather than with allies or friends of convenience. Their weakness, de Bary argues, is

in their indisposition or inability to establish any power base of their own.… [E]xcept on rare, momentary occasions, they faced the state, and whoever controlled it in the imperial court, as individual scholars unsupported by an organized party or active constituency. (de Bary 1991: 49)

Indeed, there is no question that the role of the Confucian minister is complex and often vexed. This section highlights one of its key dimensions.

Let us start with some context. From late-classical times down into the early Song, the term “faction” (pengdang) was invariably derogatory, referring to associations of “petty people” who aimed to use their roles in government to further their own, selfish ends. There is a certain degree of support for this understanding of “faction” in even earlier texts, but it is significant for our purposes that some passages in early texts like Confucius’s Analects also suggest that superior people (junzi) can form associations, so long as they do not act in partisan ways (Levine 2008: 25–6 and 34–5; LY 12:24). A key question that emerges in the midst of the political and intellectual wrangling of the Northern Song is whether horizontal affiliations among equals are in any way appropriate, or whether the only axis of loyalty is the vertical one, from individuals upward to the ruler (and beyond, to the Way or to cosmic Pattern tianli]).

We can identify three different positions on this question. The most common is the long-held view that factions and factionalism are the exclusive domains of the self-centered; superior people, in contrast, are individually loyal. The radical alternative to this was the claim, made most forcefully by Ouyang Xiu (1007–1072), that genuine factions—which he understands as long-lasting associations organized collectively to pursue the common good—are only formed by superior people. The affiliations of petty people are only temporary, for personal gain (Levine 2008: 47–56; Ouyang’s essay is translated in de Bary and Bloom 1999). Crucially, Ouyang adds that genuinely superior people will unite around a shared Way (tongdao), so disputatiousness at the ruler’s court is inevitably seen as sign of self-centeredness. Finally, a third position agrees with the first in using “faction” as a term for selfish associations that ignore the common good, but agrees with the second view that superior people can and should collaborate with one another for their mutual edification: “When superior people cultivate themselves and regulate their heartminds, their Way is one of collaboration with others” (Levine 2008: 58). So, according to this third position, while superior people should not engage in factional wrangling at court, they should work together to cultivate themselves and pursue the common good.

What, then, should be done about factions in practice, and about ministerial disagreement more generally? Again, there are three main positions. Those who believe that superior people should be individually loyal tend to argue that the ruler should try to wipe out all factions. One strong argument for this view maintains that even if there is a faction of superior people, they will be outnumbered by factions of the selfish; factionalism itself is destructive, so should be rooted out (Levine 2008: 46–7). Ouyang Xiu’s radical view holds that the true faction of superior people can be identified as such, and their one voice—which, after all, is unified around pursuit of the common good—should be heeded. False factions of petty people should be suppressed. The third view, finally, acknowledges that factionalism seems inevitable and calls for a strong and wise ruler who is able to encourage vertical loyalty and to judge among the competing ministerial arguments. By relying on the ruler in this way, this third view is able consistently to maintain that superior people need not themselves form ministerial factions, even though they should collaborate to encourage mutual ethical development.

In his own day, Ouyang Xiu’s radical view fails to win out, but over time the idea that there is one genuine faction becomes widespread within Neo-Confucianism. Zhu Xi encourages his contemporaries to support the formation of such a “faction of superior people”, to join it themselves, and even to see that the emperor himself becomes part of this faction. For Zhu, it is this faction of superior people—those who have grasped the “succession of the Way”—who have the ultimate legitimacy in society, thus even the emperor needs to be properly educated so that he can strive to join this group. Zhu is also explicit that it is crucial to maintain the ethical purity of those in the faction; “if there are those who are wicked and evil, then you ought to expel them completely” (WJ vol. 21, p. 1244). Similar views can be found among the leaders of Neo-Confucianism’s most famous faction, the Donglin. This late-Ming dynasty movement is multi-faceted, including a broad ethical revitalization movement, a national Confucian “moral fellowship”, and a ministerial faction in Beijing; the whole movement takes its name from its institutional base in the privately funded Donglin Academy in southern China (Dardess 2002). The Donglin faction goes to extreme lengths to promote its cause, driven by its members’ conviction that theirs is a battle of the good and public-spirited against the evil and self-centered. Donglin partisans contribute to a toxic political atmosphere in which each side demonizes its opponents. The crucial moment in the struggle comes when a Donglin figure issues a public document explicitly accusing a leading palace figure of gross immorality. In a modern scholar’s words, this document is written in the “language of moral terrorism”: language that is uncompromising, “heated to the highest possible degree of emotional incandescence” (Dardess 2002: 71). Not long after this comes a violent backlash in which key Donglin figures are arrested, tortured, and killed, the academy razed, and the movement crushed.

Reflecting on Neo-Confucian ideas of faction, three observations are in order. First, returning to de Bary’s conception of the “trouble with Confucianism” with which we began this section, Neo-Confucian principles make it difficult for proper Confucian ministers to establish a power-base of their own, in part because they are not supposed to have special commitments or loyalties to groups. Second, even if the primary axis of loyalty is vertical (to the emperor, public good, and more abstract notions like the Way), horizontal solidarity fits very well with key aspects of Neo-Confucian views of self-cultivation, such as the part that one’s community plays in developing an ethical “commitment”. In this light, and given the excesses to which the “one true faction” view can lead, it is tempting to conclude that the third view of factions described above is most attractive. Finally, recent scholars have disagreed about the significance of Neo-Confucian views of faction. One opines that

had Confucian gentry been able to transmit their local influence to the provincial and national levels through legitimized factional organizations such as the Donglin academy, it is interesting to speculate what sorts of political forces would have been released into Confucian political culture;

he goes on to suggest a parallel to “the trend against absolutist monarchy and toward parliamentary rule in the West” (Elman 1989: 389). In contrast, another scholar argues that

the Donglin affair was no harbinger of some possible future parliamentarian democracy. Donglin Confucian thought was monarchical and authoritarian to its core. (Dardess 2002: 7)

4.2 Institutional vs. Character-centered Theories of Governance

Most basically, China’s governmental structure in the Neo-Confucian era has four parts: (1) the emperor, imperial family, and inner-court attendants like eunuchs; (2) the outer-court ministers, bureaucracy, and the literati families who staff them; (3) the common people; and (4) the institutions that help to shape the ways in which (1)–(3) interact. One of the great debates of the Neo-Confucian era is about the relative importance or priority of institutions. This debate takes on many guises, but at bottom is the sense that there is a tension between two ways of understanding the structure that undergirds a well-ordered society. One sees institutions and their component parts (traditions, rules, and regulations, etc.) as more fundamental. The other sees the people who direct and belong to the institutions, and particularly the character of such people (understood as a combination of talents and ethical dispositions), as more fundamental. Where a philosopher stands on this issue can help to explain how they align on other critical issues in matters of governance. Those who tend to see institutions as more fundamental are more inclined to see legal and regulatory reform as the primary way of addressing large-scale problems. Those who see the character of people as more fundamental often think the solution to such problems lies in moral cultivation and transformation (in particular, of the emperor himself). To a certain extent, the former think that institutions should be designed to take human flaws and shortcomings into account, so that the state does not require large numbers of people to be virtuous in order to create social order, while the latter tend to worry that institutions designed for flawed people will, at least at certain levels, inhibit the kind of self-improvement that makes government truly transformative. For ease of reference, let us use the term “character-centered” and “institutionalist” to refer to these two positions.

On one somewhat simplistic historical account, most Neo-Confucians advocate a character-centered theory of politics, holding that ethical cultivation of people and not institutional reform is the most plausible means of restoring social order. This is supposedly what precipitated the “Inward Turn” described above, encouraging individuals to abandon interest in state governance and focus instead on their own moral self-improvement. This version of history is not entirely misleading. Neo-Confucians of the Southern Song frequently blame the fall of the Northern Song on its failed experiments in institutional reform, especially those of the institutionalist thinker and statesman Wang Anshi (1021–1086). And the most famous Neo-Confucian philosophers tended to make pronouncements more consistent with the character-centered theory, including the Cheng brothers, Zhu Xi, and Wang Yangming.

But the truth is quite a bit more complicated, and more philosophically interesting. From the Song dynasty all the way through the Qing, the Neo-Confucians counted among their ranks many thinkers interested in “statecraft (jingshi)”. By the late Ming dynasty and thereafter, “statecraft” came to describe almost any method or techniques that could be used for the practical operations of the state, construed so expansively as to include mathematics and history. But in the narrower sense common among earlier Neo-Confucians, it refers to a philosophical position that aims to address social problems through institutional reform rather than through dramatic transformations of character. Scholars sometimes describe these thinkers as belonging to a “Statecraft School” which includes Song philosophers like Chen Liang (1143–1194) and Ye Shi (1150–1223), and the Ming Neo-Confucian Wang Tingxiang (1474–1544) (Niu 1998; Tillman 1982; Ong 2006). It also includes reform-minded Neo-Confucians who lived through the downfall of the Ming and the rise of the Qing dynasty, such as Gu Yanwu (1613–1682) and Huang Zongxi (1610–1695). Even for more character-centered Confucians, what it meant to say that people’s character is more fundamental than institutions was open to debate.

To understand the nuances of the resulting debates, it helps to begin by recalling the classical Confucian philosopher Xunzi, famous as a defender of the character-centered view; as noted above, he holds that “There are people who create order; there are no standards creating order of themselves”. Discoursing on Xunzi’s claim gives Neo-Confucians opportunities to develop new ways of explaining how the character of people can be prior to institutions. One crucial elaboration is made by Hu Hong (1106–1161). On Hu’s view, people enter into the explanatory order of governance at two levels: first, they are the ones who implement the rules and regulations. At this level Hu’s analysis closely follows Xunzi’s, stressing the necessary vagueness of law and the need to have skillful magistrates who understand individual laws in a systematic way. But secondly, the people are also the ones who fix the rules whenever the rules are not suited to the circumstances. That is, humans govern not just as executives but as originators too:

Xunzi said, “There are people who create order; there are no standards that create order”. I humbly submit that we illustrate this by drawing an analogy between wanting to restore order after a period of chaos, and trying to cross a river or lake [by boat]. The rules are like the boat and the people [i.e. the ruler and his officials] are like the steersman. If the boat is damaged and the rudder is broken, then even if [the steersman] has seemingly divine technique everyone nevertheless understands that the boat cannot get across. So whenever there is a period of great disorder it is necessary to reform the rules. There has never been a case where one could successfully restore order without reforming the rules. (HHJ pp. 23–24)

In short, for Hu, people bear credit for successful governance not just by guiding the institution correctly, but also by creating and modifying the very rules on which governance is founded. Credit goes not just to the steersmen but to the shipwrights as well.

Although human discretion may allow people of talent and good character to update rules or apply them differently in different contexts, they also allow people who lack talent and good character to misuse them. In these cases, it helps to set limits to abuses of authority and leadership by requiring that leaders adhere to rules. The philosopher who argues for this view most forcefully is Huang Zongxi, who lived in the late Ming and early Qing. In a remarkable essay titled “On Standards (Yuanfa)”, Huang maintains that we should distinguish between legitimate and illegitimate standards, where the illegitimate ones are distinguished by the fact that they are created or modified primarily to serve the interests of rulers. Huang says that what gives rules legitimacy is the purpose for which they are fashioned, not just tradition or the duty to respect the ancestors who fashioned them. When rules are designed with the interests of the people in mind they tend to be loose and open-ended, for their purpose is not just to control human behavior but also to cultivate virtues. People are more likely to develop virtuous character traits if their orderly conduct is done willingly rather than under threat, and they are more likely to act willingly if they are brought up under a regime of rules that protects their interests. Ironically, it is the rules of self-serving authorities that require greater and greater stringency. Because they rely heavily on coercion and work against the welfare of ordinary people, the policy makers have to create one layer of rules that govern human conduct, then a second layer of rules establishing institutions to enforce the first, then a third layer of rules to enforce those in the second, and so on. The result is a regime with considerably less flexibility and room for human discretion than the proponents of the Xunzian principle envision (YF p. 317).

4.3 Final Thoughts

According to most Neo-Confucians, revering the emperor meant both ritual respect for the role of the emperor and obedience to the legitimate authority of the emperor, but not unthinking loyalty to the ruler no matter what he might do or say. Ultimate loyalty is owed to no individual but to the Way, which Neo-Confucians also discuss in terms of “cosmic Pattern (tianli)”—that is, the ultimate harmony of all things. Neo-Confucians lived in a public culture in which it was expected, at least in principle, that ministers show their loyalty by courageously pointing out flaws and remonstrating with their rulers. And many Neo-Confucians, including Zhu Xi, quietly or reluctantly acknowledged that there are cases when one should not obey one’s emperor, presumably after all attempts to dissuade the misguided ruler had been exhausted (Schirokauer 1978: 141–43). We already saw some of this in the Donglin incident, discussed above; there are numerous other cases in which ministers, either individually or as a group, seek to upbraid or reform an errant ruler. Often these disputes revolved around ritual matters, since the stability of human relationships as expressed through ritual was central to the overall harmony of the society and cosmos. Throughout much of the Neo-Confucian era political actors also find it necessary to justify their proposals through reference to classical texts, which one contemporary scholar has therefore argued serve a partly “constitutional” role (Song 2015). Notwithstanding the various ways in which literati can partly constrain the choices of rulers, though, there is little question that the power of rulers remains paramount. And while the deep-seated belief that harmony relies on the well-being of the people is no doubt responsible for the peasantry living better lives than they might have otherwise, in the end Neo-Confucian socio-political thought grants them only one political outlet: revolt (Angle 2009: ch. 10).

5. The Modern Era

The last years of the Qing dynasty, which collapsed in 1911, were marked by a flourishing of political thought under the twin stimuli of domestic challenges and encounters with foreign political philosophies. The Russian Revolution of 1917 added further fuel to the fire, at a time when the nascent Republic of China was struggling with both internal and external threats. The nature and sources of political authority once again were topics of debate. Many now took it for granted that the goal was some sort of “democracy” in which the people were (at least in principle) sovereign. But who counted as “the people”, how they were to be led or represented, and how collective versus individual goals were to be balanced all were up for grabs. At a broader level, there was a debate between those who felt the answer lay in one or another “ism”—that is, an all-encompassing ideology like Marxism—and those who favored working more pragmatically, via institution building, on one “problem” at a time. A few decades later, after the founding of the People’s Republic, similar issues were addressed in the contrast between “Red” (ideologically and morally pure) and “expert” (possessing technical expertise). In various ways, these twentieth-century debates resonated with classical and Neo-Confucian contention between insitutional and character-centered theories of governance. Were morally advanced individuals the key to an ideal society? Or should objective standards of success, coupled with objective institutions, be society’s political foundation? In cases of conflict, which had priority?

There was certainly no single answer offered to these questions by any of the groups making up twentieth-century China’s political landscape, ranging from “New Confucians” to nationalists to liberals to Marxists. However, the “isms” approach won out through much of the century, and Thomas Metzger has shown that Chinese political thinkers of all camps tended toward what he calls “epistemological optimism”, which is a confidence that the one, universally applicable moral and political truth is knowable, and so great authority should be vested in those gifted individuals able to perceive this truth (Metzger 2005). Another way to put this would be to say that there is a strong Utopian strand in much twentieth-century Chinese political thought, which has both pushed toward radical solutions and led to dissatisfaction with continued dissonance or piecemeal progress. Even Chinese liberals have, in many cases, envisioned harmonious societies in which individual self-realization goes hand-in-hand with the realization the larger collectivity, which they often called the “larger self (dawo)” (Zarrow 2021).

Some philosophers in the twentieth century have been more aware than others of the problems with Utopianism. Mou Zongsan (1909–1995), a leader of the new Confucian movement, was not only aware of it, but also offered a particularly creative way out of the recurrent tension between personal virtue (or morality) and public standards (or politics). Mou’s insight is that the relation between morality and politics is “dialectical”. Rather than seeing a leader’s political virtue as a direct extension of his or her personal, moral virtue, Mou argues that there needs to be an indirect relation between them. Politics and political virtue must develop out of morality, but nonetheless have an independent, objective existence. This means that human rights, for example, must have a basis in morality, but come to be measured by standards that are separate from moral standards. The converse is also true: full moral virtue requires that which partly “restricts itself (ziwo kanxian)”, namely objective structure (Mou 1991: 59). Objective structures (like laws) are fundamentally different from the subjectively-felt, internalized morality after which we should all individually strive. The concrete implication of this is that no matter what one’s level of moral accomplishment,

insofar as one’s virtue is manifested in politics, one cannot override the relevant limits (that is, the highest principles of the political world), and in fact must devote one’s august character to the realization of these limits. (Mou 1991: 128)

In short, sages cannot break the law or violate the constitution. Politics thus has its independence from morality.

Philosophers have differed in their evaluations of Mou’s argument, but it can stand as an instance of the continuing creativity to be found in contemporary Chinese political thinking (Angle 2012). China’s dynamic society offers a crucible within which new ideas and new political forms may be forged and tested in coming years. To be sure, genuinely novel and intellectually challenging ideas do not form the majority of contemporary Chinese political discourse, but they are nonetheless present across the entire political spectrum. It remains to be seen whether robust political values and institutions will emerge as alternatives to models with which Western political theorists are familiar, just as we cannot yet foresee what role the Marxist, Confucian, liberal, and other traditions will play in future Chinese political thinking. Concerns with harmony and virtue are unlikely to disappear, but (as Mou’s example shows) this by no means limits the future interest of whatever political institutions and theories emerge in China.


Primary Texts

[DDJ] Dao De Jing; see the entry on Laozi.
[GL] Greater Learning: for a translation, see Wing-tsit Chan, A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
[GZ] Guanzi; for a translation see W. Allyn Rickett (ed. and trans.), Guanzi: Political, Economic, and Philosophical Essays from Early China, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985.
[HCT] Readings in Han Chinese Thought, Mark Csikszentmihalyi (ed. and trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett Press, 2006. (Cited texts include Jia Yi, “Protecting and Tutoring” and “The Platform Steps”; Chao Cuo, “Responses to an Imperial Edict”; and Dong Zhongshu, “The Meaning of the Five Phases.”)
[HFZ] Han Feizi; for a translation, see Han Fei Tzu: Basic Writings, Burton Watrson (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, 1964; and see the entry on Legalism in Chinese Philosophy.
[HHJ] Hu Hong Ji; Hu Hong 胡宏, 《胡宏集》 [Collected Works of Hu Hong], Beijing: Zhonghua Shuju, 1987.
[LY] Lunyu (Analects); for a translation, see The Original Analects, E. Bruce and A. Taeko Brooks (eds. and trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, 1998; see the entry on Confucius.
[MC] Mencius (or Mengzi); see the entry on Mencius.
[MZ] Mozi: for a translation, see The Mozi: A Complete Translation, Ian Johnston (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, 2010; see the entry on Mohism.
[SBH] Shen Buhai; Cited from the collection of fragments: Herrlee G. Creel, Shen Pu-hai: A Chinese Political Philosopher of the Fourth Century B.C., Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1974.
[SJS] Book of Lord Shang: for a translation, see Yuri Pines (ed. and trans.), The Book of Lord Shang: Apologetics of State Power in Early China, New York: Columbia University Press, 2017; see the entry on Legalism in Chinese Philosophy.
[WJ] Zhu Xi’s Wenji (Collected Writings); Zhu Xi 朱熹, 《朱 子全書》 [Complete Works of Master Zhu], Shanghai and Hefei: Shanghai Guji chubanshe and Anhui Jiaoyu chubanshe, 2002; see the entry on Zhu Xi.
[XZ] Xunzi; for a translation, see Xunzi: The Complete Text, Eric L. Hutton (trans.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2014; see the entry on Xunzi.
[YF] Huang Zongxi’s “Yuan Fa” (“On Standards”); for a translation, see Huang Zongxi, “On Law”, in Justin Tiwald and Bryan W. Van Norden (ed.), Readings in Later Chinese Philosophy: Han Dynasty to the 20th Century, Cambridge: Hackett, 2014, 315–18.
[ZZ] Zhuangzi; for a translation, see Zhuangzi: The Essential Writings, Brook Ziporyn (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett Press, 2009; see the entry on Zhuangzi.

Secondary Texts

  • Allan, Sarah, 1984, “Drought, Human Sacrifice and the Mandate of Heaven in a Lost Text from the Shang shu”, Bulletin of the School of Oriental and African Studies, 47(3): 523–39.
  • Angle, Stephen C., 2009, Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2012, Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy: Toward Progressive Confucianism, Cambridge, UK: Polity Press.
  • ––– and Justin Tiwald, 2017, Neo-Confucianism: A Philosophical Introduction, Oxford: Polity Press.
  • Bai, Tongdong, 2012, China: The Political Philosophy of the Middle Kingdom, London: Zed Books.
  • Bol, Peter K., 2008, Neo-Confucianism in History, Cambridge: Harvard University Asia Center.
  • Brooks, E. Bruce and A. Taeko Brooks (trans. and ed.), 1998, The Original Analects: Sayings of Confucius and His Successors, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Chiu-Duke, Josephine, 2000, To Rebuild the Empire: Lu Chih’s Confucian Pragmatist Approach to the Mid-T’ang Predicament, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Creel, Herrlee G., 1974, Shen Pu-hai: A Chinese Political Philosopher of the Fourth Century B.C., Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mark, 2006, Readings in Han Chinese Thought, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Dardess, John W., 2002, Blood and History in China: The Donglin Faction and Its Repression, 1620–1627, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • de Bary, William Theodore, 1991, The Trouble with Confucianism, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • de Bary, William Theodore and Irene Bloom (eds.), 1999, Sources of Chinese Tradition, vol. 1, (2nd edition), New York: Columbia University Press
  • El Amine, Loubna, 2015, Classical Confucian Political Thought: A New Interpretation, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Elman, Benjamin A., 1989, “Imperial Politics and Confucian Societies in Late Imperial China: The Hanlin and Donglin Academies”, Modern China, 15(4): 379–418.
  • Fraser, Chris, 2016, The Philosophy of the Mòzĭ: The First Consequentialists, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Harris, Eirik L., 2016, “Xunzi’s Political Philosophy”, in Eric Hutton (ed.), Dao Companion to the Philosophy of Xunzi, Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 95–138.
  • Henricks, Robert G., 2000, Lao Tzu’s “Tao Te Ching”: A Translation of the Startling New Documents Found at Guodian, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Hsiao, Kung-chuan, 1979, A History of Chinese Political Thought. Volume 1: From the Beginnings to the Sixth Century A.D., Frederick W. Mote (trans.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Kim, Sungmoon, 2020, Theorizing Confucian Virtue Politics: The Political Philosophy of Mencius and Xunzi, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Levey, Matthew, 1991, “Chu Hsi as a ‘Neo-Confucian’: Chu Hsi’s Critique of Heterodoxy, Heresy, and the ‘Confucian’ Tradition”, PhD dissertation, University of Chicago.
  • Levine, Ari Daniel, 2008, Divided by a Common Language: Factional Conflict in Late Northern Song China, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • Liu, James T.C., 1988, China Turning Inward: Intellectual-political changes in the early twelfth century, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Metzger, Thomas A., 2005, A Cloud Across the Pacific: Essays on the Clash Between Chinese and Western Political Theories Today, Hong Kong: Chinese University of Hong Kong Press.
  • Mou Zongsan 牟宗三, 1991, 《政道與治道》 [Authority and Governance], Taipei: Xuesheng Shuju.
  • Niu, Pu, 1998, “Confucian Statecraft in Song China: Ye Shi and the Yongjia School”, PhD. dissertation, Arizona State University.
  • Ong, Chang Woei, 2006, “The Principles are Many: Wang Tingxiang and Intellectual Transition in Mid-Ming China”, Harvard Journal of Asiatic Studies, 66(2): 461–93.
  • Pines, Yuri, 2012, The Everlasting Empire: The Political Culture of Ancient China and Its Imperial Legacy, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Schirokauer, Conrad, 1978, “Chu Hsi’s Political Thought”, Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 5: 127–48.
  • Slingerland, Edward, 2003, Effortless Action: Wu-Wei as Conceptual Metaphor and Spiritual Ideal in Early China, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Smith, Kidder, 2003, “Sima Tan and the Invention of Daoism, Legalism, et cetera”, Journal of Asian Studies, 62(1): 129–56.
  • Song, Jaeyoon, 2015, Traces of Grand Peace: Classics and State Activism in Imperial China, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Tillman, Hoyt Cleveland, 1982, Utilitarian Confucianism, Cambridge, MA: Council on East Asian Studies.
  • Tiwald, Justin, 2008, “A Right of Rebellion in the Mengzi?”, Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy, 7(3): 269–82.
  • Wilson, Thomas A, 1995, Genealogy of the way: the construction and uses of the Confucian tradition in late imperial China, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Zarrow, Peter, 2021, Abolishing Boundaries: Global Utopias in the Formation of Modern Chinese Political Thoughts, 1880–1940, New York: State University of New York Press.

Other Internet Resources


The section of this entry on Neo-Confucian socio-political thought is drawn in significant part from on-going collaborative work on Neo-Confucianism that I am undertaking with Justin Tiwald, and I gratefully acknowledge both his influence on my understanding of these matters, and his willingness to allow me to use some of our joint findings here.

Copyright © 2022 by
Stephen C. Angle <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free