Feminist Political Philosophy

First published Sun Mar 1, 2009; substantive revision Fri Oct 12, 2018

Feminist political philosophy is an area of philosophy that is in part focused on understanding and critiquing the way political philosophy is usually construed—often without any attention to feminist concerns—and on articulating how political theory might be reconstructed in a way that advances feminist concerns. Feminist political philosophy is a branch of both feminist philosophy and political philosophy. As a branch of feminist philosophy, it serves as a form of critique or a hermeneutics of suspicion (Ricœur 1970). That is, it serves as a way of opening up or looking at the political world as it is usually understood and uncovering ways in which women and their current and historical concerns are poorly depicted, represented, and addressed. As a branch of political philosophy, feminist political philosophy serves as a field for developing new ideals, practices, and justifications for how political institutions and practices should be organized and reconstructed.

While feminist philosophy has been instrumental in critiquing and reconstructing many branches of philosophy, from aesthetics to philosophy of science, feminist political philosophy may be the paradigmatic branch of feminist philosophy because it best exemplifies the point of feminist theory, which is, to borrow a phrase from Marx, not only to understand the world but to change it (Marx and Engels 1998). And, though other fields have effects that may change the world, feminist political philosophy focuses most directly on understanding ways in which collective life can be improved. This project involves understanding the ways in which power emerges and is used or misused in public life (see the entry on feminist perspectives on power). As with other kinds of feminist theory, common themes have emerged for discussion and critique, but there has been little in the way of consensus among feminist theorists on what is the best way to understand them. This introductory article lays out the various schools of thought and areas of concern that have occupied this vibrant field of philosophy for the past forty years. It understands feminist philosophy broadly to include work conducted by feminist theorists doing this philosophical work from other disciplines, especially political science but also anthropology, comparative literature, law, and other programs in the humanities and social sciences.

1. Historical Context and Developments

Current feminist political philosophy is indebted to the work of earlier generations of feminist scholarship and activism, including the first wave of feminism in the English-speaking world, which took place from the 1840s to the 1920s and focused on improving the political, educational, and economic system primarily for middle-class women. Its greatest achievements were to develop a language of equal rights for women and to garner women the right to vote. It is also indebted to the second wave of feminism, which, beginning in the 1960s, drew on the language of the civil rights movements (e.g., the language of liberation) and on a new feminist consciousness that emerged through women’s solidarity movements and new forms of reflection that uncovered sexist attitudes and impediments throughout the whole of society. By 1970, feminism had expanded from activism to scholarship with the publication of Shulamith Firestone’s The Dialectic of Sex (Firestone 1971); Kate Millett’s Sexual Politics (Millett 1970); and Robin Morgan’s Sisterhood is Powerful (Morgan 1970).

One of the first theoretical advances of second wave feminism was to separate out biological conceptions of women’s identity from socially-constructed ones in order to disprove the notion that biology was destiny and hence that women’s main role was as mothers and caregivers. Drawing on the social sciences and psychoanalytic theory, anthropologist Gayle Rubin developed an account of a “sex/gender system” (Rubin 1975; Dietz 2003, 401; and the entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender). The sex/gender distinction pointed to “a set of arrangements by which the biological raw material of human sex and procreation is shaped by human, social intervention” (Rubin 1975, 165). While biological sex was fixed, in Rubin’s view, gender was a social construction that served to divide the sexes and privilege men. Because gender was mutable, the sex/gender distinction gave feminists a powerful tool to look for ways to address women’s oppression.

With this socially-constructed notion of gender, early second-wave theorists sought out an understanding of woman as a universal subject and agent of feminist politics. A major set of fault lines in feminist thought since the 1990s is over the questions of the subject of “woman.” According to Mary Dietz’s 2003 article laying out the field, there are two large groups here. One champions the category of woman (in the singular and universal), arguing that the specificity of women’s identity, their sexual difference from men, should be appreciated and revalued. (The other, discussed below, takes up women’s diversity.) This “difference feminism” includes two distinct groups: (i) those who look at how gendered sexual difference is socially constituted and (ii) those who look at how sexual difference is constructed symbolically and psychoanalytically. The first, social difference feminism, includes theories that revalue mothering and caring and has been developed largely in the Anglo-American context. (See for example Tronto 1993 and Held 1995.) The second, symbolic difference feminism, is that of what are often referred to as the French Feminists, including Irigaray, Cixous, and Kristeva. They belong in this group to the extent that they value and distinguish women’s specific sexual difference from men’s. Irigaray’s focus on sexual difference is emblematic of this. Social-difference and symbolic-difference feminisms have very little to do with each other but, Dietz argues, they share the notion that a feminist politics requires a category woman that has a determinate meaning (Dietz 2003, 403; Nicholson 1994, 100).

Just as Marxist theory sought out a universal subject in the person of the worker, feminists theorists sought it out in a shared and common condition that afflicted women across cultures. But this notion of a universal womanhood was interrupted by other thinkers, such as bell hooks, saying that it excluded non-white and non-middle-class women’s experience and concerns. Hooks’ 1981 book titled Ain’t I a Woman? exposed mainstream feminism as a movement of a small group of middle- and upper-class white women whose experience was very particular, hardly universal. The work of hooks and later Cherrie Moraga, Gloria Anzaldúa, Maria Lugones, Elizabeth Spelman, and others foregrounded the need to account for women’s multiple and complex identities and experiences. By the 1990s the debates about whether there was a coherent concept of woman that could underlie feminist politics was further challenged by non-Western women challenging the Western women’s movement as caught up in Eurocentric ideals that led to the colonization and domination of “Third World” people. What is now known as postcolonial theory further heightened the debate between feminists who wanted to identify a universal feminist subject of woman (e.g. Okin, Nussbaum, and Ackerly) and those who call for recognizing multiplicity, diversity, and intersectionality (e.g., Spivak, Narayan, Mahmood, and Jaggar).

The effects of this diversity movement would be felt more in the 1990s and beyond. In the meantime, in the 1970s and 1980s feminist theory began to develop in the various areas of the social sciences and humanities, and in philosophy it began to arise in what were already the different traditions and areas of research. As a branch of political philosophy, feminist political philosophy has often mirrored the various divisions at work in political philosophy more broadly. Prior to the fall of the Berlin Wall and the end of the Cold War, political philosophy was usually divided into categories such as liberal, conservative, socialist, and Marxist. Except for conservatism, for each category there were often feminists working and critiquing alongside it. Hence, as Alison Jaggar’s classic text, Feminist Politics and Human Nature, spelled out, each ideological approach drew feminist scholars who would both take their cue from and borrow the language of a particular ideology (Jaggar 1983). Jaggar’s text grouped feminist political philosophy into four camps: liberal feminism, socialist feminism, Marxist feminism, and radical feminism. The first three groups followed the lines of Cold War global political divisions: American liberalism, European socialism, and a revolutionary communism (though few in the west would embrace Soviet-style communism). Radical feminism was the most indigenous of the feminist philosophies, developing its own political vocabulary with its roots in the deep criticisms of patriarchy that feminist consciousness had produced in its first and second waves. Otherwise, feminist political philosophy largely followed the lines of traditional political philosophy. But this has never been an uncritical following. As a field bent on changing the world, even liberal feminist theorists tended to criticize liberalism as much or more than they embraced it, and to embrace socialism and other more radical points of view more than to reject them. Still, on the whole, these theorists generally operated within the language and framework of their chosen approach to political philosophy.

Political philosophy began to change enormously in the late 1980s, just before the end of the Cold War, with a new invocation of an old Hegelian category: civil society, an arena of political life intermediate between the state and the household. This was the arena of associations, churches, labor unions, book clubs, choral societies and manifold other nongovernmental yet still public organizations. In the 1980s political theorists began to turn their focus from the state to this intermediate realm, which suddenly took center stage in Eastern Europe in organizations that challenged the power of the state and ultimately led to the downfall of communist regimes.

After the end of the Cold War, political philosophy along with political life radically realigned. New attention focused on civil society and the public sphere, especially with the timely translation of Jürgen Habermas’s early work, the Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere (Habermas 1989). Volumes soon appeared on civil society and the public sphere, focusing on the ways in which people organized themselves and developed public power rather than on the ways that the state garnered and exerted its power. In fact, there arose a sense that the public sphere ultimately might exert more power than the state, at least in the fundamental way in which public will is formed and serves to legitimate—or not—state power. In the latter respect, John Rawls’s work was influential by developing a theory of justice that tied the legitimacy of institutions to the normative judgments that a reflective and deliberative people might make (Rawls 1971). By the early 1990s, Marxists seemed to have disappeared or at least become very circumspect (though the downfall of communist regimes needn’t have had any effect on Marxist analysis proper, which never subscribed to Leninist or Maoist thought). Socialists also retreated or transformed themselves into “radical democrats” (Mouffe 1992, 1993, 2000).

Now the old schema of liberal, radical, socialist, and Marxist feminisms were much less relevant. There were fewer debates about what kind of state organization and economic structure would be better for women and more debates about the value of the private sphere of the household and the nongovernmental space of associations. Along with political philosophy more broadly, more feminist political philosophers began to turn to the meaning and interpretation of civil society, the public sphere, and democracy itself.

Feminist theorists have also done substantial work in rescuing from obscurity feminist political philosophers who were excluded from the canon and rethinking the canon itself. See the entry on Feminist History of Philosophy.

2. Contemporary Approaches and Debates

Now in the second decade of the twenty-first century, feminist theorists are doing an extraordinary variety of work on matters political and democratic, including global ethics, human rights, disabilities studies, bioethics, climate change, and international development. Some of the tensions that came to the fore in previous decades are played out in any of these areas.

For example, in global ethics there is a debate over whether there are universal values of justice and freedom that should be intentionally cultivated for women in the developing world or whether cultural diversity should be prized. Feminist theorists have sought to answer this question in a number of different and compelling ways. (For some examples see Ackerly 2000, Ackerly & Okin 1999, Benhabib 2002 and 2008, Butler 2000, Gould 2004, and Zerilli 2009.)

Likewise new philosophical work on disabilities, as the entry on feminist perspectives on disability explains, is informed by a great deal of feminist theory, from standpoint philosophy to feminist phenomenology, as well as political philosophical questions of identity, difference, and diversity. (See also Carlson & Kittay, 2010.)

Ultimately, the number of approaches that can be taken on any of these issues is as high as the number of philosophers there are working on them. Nonetheless there are some general family resemblances to be found in certain groupings, not altogether unlike Jaggar’s 1983 classification. The remainder of this entry will identify how the previous schema has changed and what new constellations have emerged.

2.1 Feminist Engagements with Liberalism and Neoliberalism

Of Jaggar’s categories, liberal feminism remains a strong current in feminist political thought. Following liberalism’s focus on freedom and equality, liberal feminism’s primary concern is to protect and enhance women’s personal and political autonomy, the first being the freedom to live one’s life as one wants and the second being the freedom to help decide the direction of the political community. This approach was invigorated with the publication of John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice (Rawls 1971) and subsequently his Political Liberalism (Rawls 1993). Susan Moller Okin (Okin 1989, 1979; Okin et al. 1999) and Eva Kittay (Kittay 1999) have used Rawls’s work productively to extend his theory to attend to women’s concerns.

From a more critical perspective, several feminist theorists have argued that some of the central categories of liberalism occlude women’s lived concerns; for example, the central liberal private/public distinction sequesters the private sphere, and any harm that may occur there to women, away from political scrutiny (Pateman 1983). Perhaps more than any other approach, liberal feminist theory parallels developments in liberal feminist activism. While feminist activists have waged legal and political battles to criminalize, as just one example, violence against women (which previously, in marital relations, hadn’t been considered a crime), feminist political philosophers who have engaged the liberal lexicon have shown how the distinction between private and public realms has served to uphold male domination of women by rendering power relations within the household as “natural” and immune from political regulation. Such political philosophy uncovers how seemingly innocuous and “commonsensical” categories have covert power agendas. For example, old conceptions of the sanctity of the private space of the household and the role of women primarily as child-bearers and caregivers served to protect male domination of women in the household from public scrutiny. Feminist critiques of the public/private split supported legal advances that finally led in the 1980s to the criminalization in the United States of spousal rape (Hagan and Sussman 1988).

Other feminist critics note that liberalism continues to treat unproblematically many of the concepts that theorists in the 1990s and since have problematized, such as “woman” as a stable and identifiable category and the unity of the self underlying self-rule or autonomy. Critics (such as Zerilli 2009) have argued that the universal values that liberals such as Okin invoked were really expanded particulars, with liberal theorists mistaking their ethnocentrically derived values as universal ones. At the same time, however, some feminist critics are showing how many of the values of liberalism could be performatively reconstituted. (See section 2.7)

Nonetheless there is very important work going on in this field. For example, Carole Pateman and Charles Mills have been working within the liberal tradition to show the limits and faults of social contract theory for women and people of color. Their jointly authored book, Contract & Domination, levels a devastating critique against systems of sexual and racial domination. This work engages and critiques some of the most dominant strains of political philosophy.

Beyond liberal feminism, contemporary feminist philosophers have led the way in theorizing and critiquing what is known as neoliberalism, especially the ways that neoliberal social and economic forces impact the lives of women. On Wendy Brown’s account (2015), neoliberalism refers to a set of relations between state, society, and subjects that mimics and reinforces radical free-market ideals in the economy. These forces, Brown argues, undermine liberal democratic citizenship, public institutions, and popular sovereignty. Nancy Fraser (2013), Jodi Dean (2009), and Judith Butler (2015) join Brown in asking whether democracy—or “the demos”—can be sustained under neoliberal conditions of rapidly increasing economic precariousness and diminishing social and political resources for resistance.

2.2 Radical Feminism

While feminist liberalism continues to flourish, the historical developments and emerging debates described in the previous sections have eclipsed or deeply transformed Jaggar’s other three categories of radical, Marxist, and socialist feminism (Jaggar 1983). Also, the “grand narratives” that underlay these views, especially the latter two, have fallen out of favor (Snyder 2008).

Those who work in radical feminism continue to take issue with many of the central tenets of liberal feminism, especially its focus on the individual and the supposedly free choices that individuals can make. Where the liberal sees the potential for freedom, the radical feminist sees structures of domination that are bigger than any individual. Patriarchy itself, according to this view, dominates women by positioning them as objects of men’s desire (Welch 2015). Radical feminists remain committed to getting at the root of male domination by understanding the source of power differentials, which some radical feminists, including Catharine MacKinnon, trace back to male sexuality and the notion that heterosexual intercourse enacts male domination over women. “Women and men are divided by gender, made into the sexes as we know them, by the requirements of its dominant form, heterosexuality, which institutionalizes male sexual dominance and female sexual submission. If this is true, sexuality is the linchpin of gender inequality” (MacKinnon 1989,113). Radical feminists of the 1980s tended to see power as running one-way, from those with power over those who are being oppressed. As Amy Allen puts it, “Unlike liberal feminists, who view power as a positive social resource that ought to be fairly distributed, and feminist phenomenologists, who understand domination in terms of a tension between transcendence and immanence, radical feminists tend to understand power in terms of dyadic relations of dominance/subordination, often understood on analogy with the relationship between master and slave.” (See the section on radical feminist approaches in the entry on feminist perspectives on power.) Unlike the more reformist politics of liberal feminism, radical feminists of the 1980s largely sought to reject the prevailing order altogether, sometimes advocating separatism (Daly 1985, 1990).

A new generation of radical feminist theorists are renewing the tradition, showing how it has respected concerns such as intersectionality (Whisnant 2016) and shares some of the commitments of the postmodern feminists discussed below, e.g., skepticism about any fixed gender identity or gender binaries and a more fluid and performative approach to sexuality and politics (Snyder 2008), as well as the ways that power and privilege continue to hold women back (Chambers in Garry et al 2017, 656).

2.3 Socialist and Marxist Feminisms

Through much of the twentieth century, many political theorists in Europe, the United States, and Latin America drew on socialist and Marxist texts to develop theories of social change attentive to issues of class relations and exploitation in modern capitalist economies. After learning of the horrors of Stalinism, most Western Marxists and socialists were extremely critical of the communist systems in the Soviet Union and later in China. Western, mostly anti-communist, Marxist thought flourished in Italy (with Antonio Gramsci’s work), England (with Stuart Hall and Raymond Williams’ work), France (with the Socialisme ou Barbarie group), and the United States (but less so there after McCarthyism, yet renewed somewhat in the 1960s with the New Left). Jaggar’s 1983 book summed up well the way feminists were using socialist and Marxist ideas to understand the way women were exploited and their laboring and reproductive work devalued and unpaid though necessary for capitalism to function. In the entry on feminist perspectives on class and work, the authors point to much of the work that was going on in this field up through the mid-1990s.

But since then, the authors note, various postmodern, postcolonial, poststructuralist, and deconstructive theories have criticized the bases for socialist and Marxist thought, including the “grand narrative” of economic determinism and the reduction of everything to economic and material relations. At the same time, Marxist analyses are important parts of other contemporary feminist philosophers’ work. (See Dean 2009, Fraser 2009, Spivak 1988.) So while the categories of socialist and Marxist feminisms are less relevant today, many feminist philosophers still take seriously the need to attend to the material conditions of life and engage in the hermeneutics of suspicion that Marxist analysis calls for. This is espcially evident in new feminist work in critical theory (See for example Fraser 2009, Allen 2007, McAfee 2008, and Young 2000.)

2.4 Care, Vulnerability, and Affect Theories

Where liberal feminists prefer to focus on equality, not just between people but between the sexes more generally, radical feminists tend to see sexual difference as something instituted by power. So in a curious way, neither approach, however at odds with each other, takes sexual difference seriously. Rather, they see it as an effect of power, not something real in its own right. In contrast, the variety of theories addressed in this and the next section take seriously the category of woman and want to develop an ethics and politics upon it. The views considered in this section, largely developed from in the Anglo-American context, take their cue from the material and lived conditions of women, both as mothers and as subjects, and the politics that these experiences give rise to.

A prime example is care ethics, which, originally developed as an alternative to mainstream ethical theory, has been harnessed to counter liberal political theory (Gilligan 1982; Held 1995). (See the discussion in the entry on feminist ethics.) Drawing on feminist research in moral psychology (Gilligan 1982; Held 1995), this field explores the ways in which the virtues that society and mothering cultivate in women can provide an alternative to the traditional emphases in moral and political philosophy on universality, reason, and justice. Some care ethicists have sought to take the virtues that had long been relegated to the private realm, such as paying particular attention to those who are vulnerable or taking into consideration circumstances and not just abstract principles, and use them as well in the public realm. This approach has led to intense debates between liberals who advocated universal ideals of justice and care ethicists who advocated attention to the particular, to relationships, to care. By the 1990s, however, many care ethicists had revised their views. Rather than seeing care and justice as mutually exclusive alternatives, they began to recognize that attention to care should be accompanied by attention to fairness (justice) in order to attend to the plight of those with whom we have no immediate relation (Koggel 1998).

The care ethics approach raises the question of whether and, if so, how women-as-care-givers have distinct virtues. Feminists as a whole have long distanced themselves from the idea that women have any particular essence, choosing instead to see femininity and its accompanying virtues as social constructs, dispositions that result from culture and conditioning, certainly not biological givens. So for care ethicists to champion the virtues that have inculcated femininity seems also to champion a patriarchal system that relegates one gender to the role of caretaker. The care ethicists’ answer to this problem has largely been to flip the hierarchy, to claim that the work of the household is more meaningful and sustaining than the work of the polis. But critics, such as Drucilla Cornell, Mary Dietz, and Chantal Mouffe, argue that such a revaluation keeps intact the dichotomy between the private and the public and the old association of women’s work with childcare. (Butler and Scott 1992; Phillips and NetLibrary Inc 1998, pp. 386–389)

Disregard for the role of emotion in political life has long been a policy in the history of philosophy, in particular because emotionality—like care—is frequently associated with women and racialized others. However, women philosophers have insisted on the importance of this intersection (for example Hall 2005, Krause 2008, and Nussbaum 2015). Building on the contributions of feminist care ethicists and difference feminists who worked to show the significance of positive affects typically associated with femininity—such as love, interest, and care—in ethical encounters (see Held 1995, Tronto 1993), other thinkers worried that this appraisal merely reified a false (gendered) dichotomy between reason and emotion, mind and body. Instead, early work by Alison Jaggar (1990), Elizabeth Spelman (1989 and 1991), Genevieve Lloyd (1993), Elizabeth Grosz (1994), and others argued that reason is both embodied and emotion-laden, and that emotion is an important resource for epistemology in particular. Building on this work, feminist political theorists have argued that understanding the role of emotion and affect is crucial for understanding a number of important political phenomena: motivation for action (Krause 2008), collective action and community formation (Beltrán 2009 and 2010, Butler 2004 and 2015), solidarity and patriotism (Nussbaum 2005 and 2015), as well as vulnerability (Fineman 2013), racism and xenophobia (Ahmed 2015, Anker 2014, Ioanide 2015). Meanwhile, others examine the political significance of specific emotions, for instance: shame (Ahmed 2015), precarity and grief (Butler 2004), anger (Spelman 1989, Lorde 1984), fear (Anker 2015), and love (Nussbaum 2015).

More recently, many feminist critics have turned their attention to how neoliberalism demands resiliency in the face of increasing precarity. Some borrow from Michel Foucault’s late work on biopolitics, examining how neoliberal demands for autonomy, self-sufficiency, delf-discipline, and self-investment impact individuals on the level of subjectivity, making both life and the possibility of political action to transform the conditions of life increasingly untenable. Individuals, they argue, are met with increasing vulnerability to economic forces and fewer resources to overcome vulnerability due to social isolation and limited access to social services (Butler 2015, Povinelli 2011). Some feminists study how subjectivity, affect, and morality accommodate these neoliberal trends. For instance, this shows up in how the demand to “overcome vulnerability” via the contemporary emphasis on individual “resilience” attempts to transform vulnerable persons, especially women, into productive neoliberal subjects (James 2015), how productive emotions like “happiness” are encouraged and unruly ones like “willfulness” are discouraged (Berland 2011, Ahmed 2014), or how the targeted discourse around “self-care” can contribute to individualist consumer culture that diminishes women’s capacities for collective action (Ahmed 2017). Instead, many feminist critiques challenge neoliberal individualism by reasserting that agency need not be synonymous with autonomy, and propose nonsovereign or relational accounts of the agentic subject instead.

2.5 Poststructuralist Feminisms

Another group of feminist political theorists who take sexual difference seriously are those who work in the continental traditions, especially poststructuralism, and attend to the ways in which language and meaning-systems structure experience. Notable among them are the so-called French Feminists, namely Cixous, Kristeva, and Irigaray. Of them all, Irigaray may have the most developed political philosophy, including several books on the rights that should be afforded to girls and women. Irigaray’s early work (1985a and 1985b) made the case that in the history of philosophy women have been denied their own essence or identity. Rather, they have been positioned as men’s mirror negation. So that to be a man is to not be a woman, and hence that woman equals only not-man. Her strategy in response to this is to speak back from the margins to which women have been relegated and to claim some kind of “essence” for women, and along with that a set of rights that are specifically for girls and women (Irigaray 1994 and 1996). Criticisms of her views have been heated, including among feminists themselves, especially those who are wary of any kind of essentialist and biological conflation of women’s identity. To the extent that Irigaray is an essentialist, her view would indeed be relegated to the approach outlined here as symbolic difference feminism, as Dietz 2003 does. But there are compelling arguments that Irigaray is wielding essentialism strategically or metaphorically, that she isn’t claiming that women really do have some kind of irreducible essence that the history of metaphysics has denied them (Fuss 1989). This other reading would put Irigaray more in the performative group described below. The same kind of argument could be made for the work of Julia Kristeva, that her metaphors of the female chora, for example, are describing the western imaginary, not any kind of womanly reality. So whether French feminist thought should be grouped as difference feminism or performative feminism is still very much open to debate.

To the extent that the above two types of feminist theory are pinpointing some kind of specific difference between the sexes, they raise concerns about essentialism or identifying distinct values that women have as women. Such concerns are part of a larger set of criticisms that have run through feminist theorizing since the 1970s, with non-white, non-middle-class, and non-western women questioning the very category of “woman” and the notion that this title could be a boundary-spanning category that could unite women of various walks of life. (See the entries on identity politics and feminist perspectives on sex and gender.) Criticisms of a unitary identity of “woman” have been motivated by worries that much feminist theory has originated from the standpoint of a particular class of women who mistake their own particular standpoint for a universal one. In her 1981 book, Ain’t I a Woman?: Black women and feminism, bell hooks notes that the feminist movement pretends to speak for all women but was made up of primarily white, middle class women who, because of their narrow perspective, did not represent the needs of poor women and women of color and ended up reinforcing class stereotypes (hooks 1981). What is so damning about this kind of critique is that it mirrors the one that feminists have leveled against mainstream political theorists who have taken the particular category of men to be a universal category of mankind, a schema that does not in fact include women under the category of mankind but marks them as other (Lloyd 1993).

2.6 Decolonial and Intersectional Feminisms

Hence, one of the most vexing issues facing feminist theory in general and feminist political philosophy in particular is the matter of identity (see the entry on identity politics). Identity politics, itself a politically vexed term, refers to political practices of mobilizing for change on the basis of a political identity (women, Black, Chicana, etc.). The philosophical debate is whether such identities are based on some real difference or history of oppression, and also whether people should embrace identities that have historically been used to oppress them. Identity politics in feminist practice is fraught along at least two axes: whether there is any real essence or identity of woman in general and even if so whether the category of woman could be used to represent all women. People at the intersection of multiple marginalized identities (e.g, Black women) have raised questions about which identity is foremost or whether either identity is apt. Such questions play out with the question of political representation—what aspects of identity are politically salient and truly representative, whether race, class, or gender (Phillips 1995; Young 1997, 2000). The ontological question of women’s identity gets played out on the political stage when it comes to matters of political representation, group rights, and affirmative action. The 2008 U.S. Democratic Party primary battle between Senators Barack Obama and Hillary Clinton turned this philosophical question into a very real and heated one from Black women throughout the United States. Was a Black woman who supported Clinton a traitor to her race, or a Black woman who supported Obama a traitor to her sex? Or did it make any sense to talk about identity in a way that would lead to charges of treason? Of the approaches discussed above, radical and maternal feminism seem particularly wedded to feminist identity politics.

The other large group of contemporary feminist philosophers that Dietz (2003) describes disagrees entirely with the idea that there is or needs to be a single and universal category of “woman.” Dietz refers to this group as diversity feminism, which began with what we described earlier: women of color and others pointing out that the presuppositions of mainstream feminism were based on their very particular race and class. In the 1980s and 1990s philosophy along with the rest of Western culture started grappling with demands for multicultural perspectives. Shortly thereafter postcolonial theory raised the need to become aware of multiple global perspectives. As Sharon Krause describes it, “this development involved the ‘world diversification’ of feminism to a more global, comparative, and differentiated body of work” (Krause 2011, 106). This diversification, Krause notes, is also due to new literature on intersectionality, that is, the ways in which the intersections of our multiple identities (race, gender, orientation, ethnicity, etc.) all need to be attended to in talking about political change (Krause 2011, 107). Intersectionality also links up with discussions of “hybridity” in postcolonial literature, of religion and globalization, and of the experiences of LGBTQ people. “The result is an explosion of knowledge about the lived experience of differently placed and multiply-positioned women” (Krause 2011, 107).

Decolonial feminists overlap in many areas with other women of color feminists, but they bring several unique concerns specific to the colonial and post-colonial experience. In contemporary decolonial theory, these concerns are largely framed within the discourse of “coloniality,” first theorized in terms of “coloniality of power” by Anibal Quijano (Quijano 2003). Here, “coloniality” refers to how relations between colonizer and colonized are racialized, for instance how labor, subjectivity, and authority are racialized around the colonial system of capitalist exploitation. (For more on “coloniality,” see Lugones 2010, Mignolo 2000, Maldonado Torres 2008, Wynter 2003.) For feminist thinkers like María Lugones (2007, 2010), gender is another axis around which the global capitalist system of power classifies and dehumanizes people. For Lugones and others, including Oyeronke Oyewumi (1997), gender is a colonial imposition in tension with non-modern cosmologies, economies, and modes of kinship. Lugones calls this the “coloniality of gender,” noting that de-colonizing gender is part of a wider project of decolonial resistance opposed to the categorial, dichotomous, and hierarchical logics of capitalist modernity that are rooted in the colonization of the Americas.

In feminist decolonial literature, resistance is often discussed in terms of the coloniality of gender (Lugones 2003, 2007, 2010; Oyewumi 1997, 2004); language (Spivak 2010); identity and subjectivity – for instance, accounts of hybridity, multiplicity, and mestizaje (Anzaldúa 1987, Ortega 2016, Moraga and Anzaldúa 2015); and “world-traveling” (Lugones 1995, Ortega 2016). Many of these same thinkers argue that feminism itself must be decolonized, critiquing feminist universalisms that claim to account for the complex intersections of sexuality, race, gender, and class (see Mohanty 2003, Lugones 2010).

Instersectionality, which is in part a theory of power, grew out of groundbreaking works by Black feminist theorists such as Kimberlé Crenshaw’s “Demarginalizing the Intersection of Race and Sex: A Black Feminist Critique of Antidiscrimination Doctrine, Feminist Theory and Antiracist Practice” (Crenshaw 1989), Patricia Hill Collins’s book Black Feminist Thought: Knowledge, Consciousness and the Politics of Empowerment (Collins 1990), Angela Davis’s Women, Race, and Class (Davis 1981), and Patricia Williams’s The Alchemy of Race and Rights (Williams 1992). The impact of this work was felt strongly where it originated in feminist legal theory (see feminist philosophy of law), and has continued to be an important concept for theories of power and oppression in and out of feminist political philosophy. (See also the section on intersectionality in the entry on discrimination.)

2.7 Performative Feminisms

If the diversity feminists, from multiculuturalists to postcolonial and intersectional thinkers, are right, then there is no reliable category of woman on which to base feminist politics. By the end of the 1990s some saw this as a radical danger of relativism, and the field seemed to be at an impasse. But then another approach began to emerge. As Mary Dietz writes in her 2003 essay on current controversies in feminist theory,

In recent years, political theorists have been engaged in debates about what it might mean to conceptualize a feminist political praxis that is aligned with democracy but does not begin from the binary of gender. Along these lines, Mouffe (1992, pp. 376, 378; 1993), for example, proposes a feminist conception of democratic citizenship that would render sexual difference “effectively nonpertinent.” Perhaps the salient feature of such conceptions is the turn toward plurality, which posits democratic society as a field of interaction where multiple axes of difference, identity, and subordination politicize and intersect (e.g., Phelan 1994, Young 1990, 1997b, 2000; Benhabib 1992; Honig 1992; Ferguson 1993; Phillips 1993, 1995; Mouffe 1993; Yeatman 1994, 1998; Bickford 1996; Dean 1996; Fraser 1997; Nash 1998; Heyes 2000; McAfee 2000). (Dietz 2003, 419)

Following up on what has happened in feminist political theory since Dietz’s article, Sharon Krause writes that this work is “contesting the old assumption that agency equals autonomy” and makes room “within agency for forms of subjectivity and action that are nonsovereign but nevertheless potent” (Krause 2011, citing Allen 2007, Beltrán 2010, Butler 2004, Hirschman 2002, and Zerilli 2005.) “For some theorists,” Krause writes, “this shift involves thinking of agency and freedom in more collective ways, which emphasize solidarity, relationality, and constitutive intersubjectivity” (Krause 2011, 108, citing Butler 2004, Cornell 2007, Mohanty 2003, and Nedelsky 2005).

This constellation of thinkers could be working in what we could call performative political philosophy, performative in several senses: in theorizing how agency is constituted, how political judgments can be made in the absence of known rules (Honig 2009, 309), how new universals can be created and new communities constituted. Performative feminist politics doesn’t worry about whether it is possible to come up with a single definition of “woman” or any other political identity; it sees identity as something that is performatively created. “How we assume these identitites,” Drucilla Cornell writes, “is never something ‘out there’ that effectively determines who we can be as men and women—gay, lesbian, straight, queer, transsexual, transgender, or otherwise” (Cornell 2003, 144). It is something that is shaped as we live and externalize identities. From a performative feminist perspective, feminism is a project of anticipating and creating better political futures in the absence of foundations. As Linda Zerilli writes, “politics is about making claims and judgments—and having the courage to do so—in the absence of the objective criteria or rules that could provide certain knowledge and the guarantee that speaking in women’s name will be accepted or taken up by others” (Zerilli 2005, 179). Drawing largely on Arendt and Butler, Zerilli calls for a “freedom-centered feminism” that “would strive to bring about transformation in normative conceptions of gender without returning to the classical notion of freedom as sovereignty” that feminists have long criticized but found difficult to resist (ibid.).

In its feminist incarnations, this view also takes its cue from Judith Butler’s performative account of gender as well as Hannah Arendt’s observation that human rights are created politically, as well as other thinkers’ ideas, to describe an anticipatory ideal of politics. Linda Zerilli describes this kind of feminist politics as “the contingently based public practice of soliciting the agreement of others to what each of us claims to be universal” (Zerilli 2005, p. 173). From a performatve perspective, normative political claims appeal to other people, not to supposed truths or foundations.

This view recuperates many of the ideals of the Enlightenment—such as freedom, autonomy, and justice—but in a way that drops the Enlightenment’s metaphysical assumptions about reason, progress, and human nature. Instead of seeing these ideals as grounded in some metaphysical facts, this new view sees them as ideals that people hold and try to instantiate through practice and imagination. Where many ancient and modern ideals of politics were based on suppositions about the nature of reality or of human beings, contemporary political philosophies generally operate without supposing that there are any universal or eternal truths. Some might see this situation as ripe for nihilism, arbitrariness, or the exercise of brute power. The performative alternative is to imagine and try to create a better world by anticipating, claiming, and appealing to others that it should be so. Even if there is no metaphysical truth that human beings have dignity and infinite worth, people can act as if it were true in order to create a world in which it is seen to be so.

Peformative feminist political philosophy shares liberal feminism’s appreciation for Enlightenment ideals but in a way that is skeptical about foundations. Just as Zerilli performatively reconstitutes the concept of freedom, Drucilla Cornell recuperates ideas of autonomy, dignity, and personhood, in a new performative capacity, as ideals that people aspire to rather than as moral facts waiting to be discovered, applied, or realized.

Despite the shared post-foundational theorizing among performative feminists, when it comes to thinking about democratic politics, there are sharp divergences, namely on the question of “what it means to actualize public spaces and enact democratic politics” (Dietz 2003, 419). On this questions, theorists tend to diverge into two groups: associational and agonistic. Associational theorists (e.g., Benhabib 1992, 1996; Benhabib and Cornell 1987; Fraser 1989; Young 1990, 1997, 2000) gravitate more toward deliberative democratic theory, while agonistic theorists (e.g., Mouffe 1992, 1993, 1999, 2000; Honig 1995; Ziarek 2001) worry that democratic theories that focus on consensus can silence debate and thus they focus more on plurality, dissensus, and the ceaseless contestation within politics.

The differences spring from, or perhaps lead to, different readings of the philosopher who has most inspired performative political theory: Hannah Arendt, namely Arendt’s ideas of speech and action in the public sphere, of the meaning of plurality, of the ways in which human beings can distinguish themselves. As Bonnie Honig, a champion of the agonistic model writes,

Political theorists and feminists, in particular, have long criticized Arendt for the agonistic dimensions of her politics, charging that agonism is a masculinist, heroic, violent, competitive, (merely) aesthetic, or necessarily individualistic practice. For these theorists, the notion of an agonistic feminism would be, at best, a contradiction in terms and, at worst, a muddled and, perhaps, dangerous idea. Their perspective is effectively endorsed by Seyla Benhabib who, in a recent series of powerful essays, tries to rescue Arendt for feminism by excising agonism from her thought. (Honig 1995, 156)

Associational theorists tend to look for ways, amidst all the differences and questions about the lack of foundations, it is possible to come to agreement on matters of common concern. This is seen in feminist democratic theory, perhaps best known through the works of Seyla Benhabib (Benhabib 1992, 1996), greatly inspired by her non-agonistic reading of Arendt and of the work of the German critical theorist, Jürgen Habermas. Benhabib’s work engages democratic theorists quite broadly, not just feminist theorists. This passage of hers helps to clarify what she takes to be the best aim of a political philosophy: a state of affairs to which all affected would assent. As she writes,

Only those norms (i.e., general rules of action and institutional arrangements) can be said to be valid (i.e., morally binding), which would be agreed to by all those affected by their consequences, if such agreement were reached as a consequence of a process of deliberation that had the following features: 1) participation in such deliberation is governed by norms of equality and symmetry; all have the same chances to initiate speech acts, to question, to interrogate, and to open debate; 2) all have the right to question the assigned topics of conversation; and 3) all have the right to initiate reflexive arguments about the very rules of the discourse procedure and the way in which they are applied or carried out. (Benhabib 1996, 70)

Following Habermas, Benhabib contends that certain conditions need to be in place in order for members of a political community to arrive at democratic outcomes, namely the proceedings need to be deliberative. Some take deliberation to be a matter of reasoned argumentation; others see it as less about reason or argumentation but more about an open process of working through choices. (McAfee 2004.)

Not all theorists who tend toward the associational model embrace deliberative theory so readily. Iris Young’s pioneering book, Justice and the Politics of Difference and several of her subsequent works have been very influential and have led to a good deal of hesitance in feminist theoretical communities about the claims of deliberative theory. Where Benhabib is confident that conditions can be such that all who are affected can have a voice in deliberations, Young points out that those who have been historically silenced have a difficult time having their views heard or heeded. Young is skeptical of the claims of mainstream democratic theory that democratic deliberative processes could lead to outcomes that would be acceptable to all (Young 1990, 1997). Young, along with Nancy Fraser (Fraser 1989) and others, worried that in the process of trying to reach consensus, the untrained voices of women and others who have been marginalized would be left out of the final tally. Young’s criticisms were very persuasive, leading a generation of feminist political philosophers to be wary of deliberative democratic theory. Instead of deliberative democracy, in the mid 1990s Young proposed a theory of communicative democracy, hoping to make way for a deliberative conception that was open to means of expression beyond the rational expression of mainstream deliberative democratic theory. Young worried that deliberation as defined by Habermas is too reason-based and leaves out forms of communication that women and people of color tend to use, including, as she puts it, “greeting, rhetoric, and storytelling”. Young argued that these alternative modes of communication could provide the basis of a more democratic, communicative theory. In her last major book, Inclusion and Democracy (Young 2000), Young had clearly moved to embrace deliberative theory itself, seeing the ways in which it could be constructed to give voice to those who had been otherwise marginalized. More recent feminist democratic theory has engaged deliberative theory more positively. (See McAfee and Snyder 2007.)

Where liberal feminists inspired by John Rawls and democratic feminists inspired by Jürgen Habermas and/or John Dewey hold out the hope that democratic deliberations might lead to democratic agreements, agonistic feminists are wary of consensus as inherently undemocratic. Agonistic feminist political philosophy comes out of poststructural continental feminist and philosophical traditions. It takes from Marxism the hope for a more radically egalitarian society. It takes from contemporary continental philosophy notions of subjectivity and solidarity as malleable and constructed. Along with postmodern thought, it repudiates any notion of pre-existing moral or political truths or foundations (Ziarek 2001). Its central claim is that feminist struggle, like other struggles for social justice, is engaged in politics as ceaseless contestation. Agonistic views see the nature of politics as inherently conflictual, with battles over power and hegemony being the central tasks of democratic struggle. Advocates of agonistic politics worry that the kind of consensus sought by democratic theorists (discussed above) will lead to some kind of oppression or injustice by silencing new struggles. As Chantal Mouffe puts it, “We have to accept that every consensus exists as a temporary result of a provisional hegemony, as a stabilization of power, and that it always entails some form of exclusion” (Mouffe 2000, 104).

Where associational theorists seek out ways that people can overcome systematically distorted communication and deliberation, Dietz notes that agonists eschew this project because they understand politics as “essentially a practice of creation, reproduction, transformation and articulation.... Simply put, associational feminists scrutinize the conditions of exclusion in order to theorize the emancipation of the subject in the public sphere of communicative interaction; agonistic feminists deconstruct emancipatory procedures to disclose how the subject is both produced through political exclusions and positioned against them” (Dietz 2003, 422).

New work in democratic theory and new readings of Arendt’s philosophy offer hope of moving beyond the associational/agonistic divide in performative feminist politics (Barker et al. 2012). Benhabib’s proceduralism is being surpassed with more affect-laden accounts of deliberation (Krause 2008; Howard 2017). Instead of the rational back-and-forth of reasoned argumentation, theorists are beginning to see deliberative talk as forms of constituting the subject, judging without pre-conceived truths, and performatively creating new political projects.

In sum, feminist political philosophy is a still evolving field of thought that has much to offer mainstream political philosophy. In the past two decades it has come to exert a stronger influence over mainstream political theorizing, raising objections that mainstream philosophers have had to address, though not always very convincingly. And in its newest developments it promises to go even further.


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Noëlle McAfee <noelle.c.mcafee@emory.edu>
Katie B. Howard <khowar19@calstatela.edu>

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