Philosophy in Han Dynasty China

First published Mon Jan 3, 2022

Philosophy in early China underwent a major transformation after the beginning of empire in the late third century BCE. These were the years of the Han Dynasty, in its two parts, the Western Han (206 BCE–9 CE) and Eastern Han (25–220 CE). Some of the main trends, ideas, and thinkers of the more than 400 years of the Han period are discussed in this article. Some of the particularly prominent features of Han philosophy in comparison with that of earlier periods are: increased focus on metaphysics , the prominence of syncretism, new views on language, the rise of naturalism, and debates about methodology. In addition, many of the ideas we associate with Pre-Qin philosophy were developed most fully in the Han. Retrospective interpretation in later years, including during the Han itself, led to our association of some of these ideas with earlier texts and traditions. Many of the “early”, pre-Han Chinese texts were actually compiled or created during the Han (see Hunter 2018; Klein 2010). Even the “school” categories that we often use to classify texts and thinkers from periods prior to the Han, such as “Confucianism” (rujia 儒家), “Daoism” (daojia 道家), Legalism (fajia 法家), and so on, were actually Han period creations. It is no exaggeration to say that the Chinese philosophical tradition was founded as such during the Han.

1. Background

Much of the most prominent philosophy in the Han period in China was closely associated with the state. Philosophical discussions and texts were commissioned by state or imperial representatives and organizations, to help resolve problems or guide political action. By the Han, there had long been a tradition of philosophy associated with advisors to the state. Many of the most well-known philosophers in earlier periods had been political advisors, with some notable exceptions such as the “Dao-tradition” figures represented in texts such as the late Warring States Period (475–221 BCE) text Zhuangzi. While prior to the Han, we find a variety of philosophical “schools” associated with different states and individuals (as there was no imperial structure), many (but not all) of the surviving philosophical texts from the Han are associated in some way with the Han state. Some well-known examples of philosophy closely linked to Han imperial concerns and issues are the treatises of the early Han advisors Lu Jia (240–170 BCE) and Jia Yi (200–169 BCE), the Huainanzi, commissioned by Liu An (179–122 BCE), the vassal ruler of the Huainan state and uncle of Emperor Wu of Han (156–87 BCE), the Yantielun (“Salt and Iron Discourses”), the account by Huan Kuan of a series of discussions organized by Emperor Zhao of Han concerning state production of goods, and the Baihutong, recounting a similar group of imperially sanctioned discussions. It is not quite right, however, to say that in the Han, philosophy becomes the purview of the state. Religion, divination, medicine, and other areas of thought all contained a great deal of philosophical content. And as we will see, philosophical discussions in the later part of the Han were increasingly independent of the state.

In the Han we also find the origins of the commentarial tradition on philosophical texts. There was already an established commentarial tradition by the time of the Han on the historical and ritual texts known as the Five Classics. The commentarial tradition on the ancient historical text Chunqiu, in particular, became central in the early Han. A new commentarial tradition developed in the Han, however, connected to philosophical texts such as the Analects, Daodejing, Zhuangzi, and others. The commentarial tradition surrounding these texts became a major source of philosophical development throughout the rest of the history of philosophy in China (see Makeham 2003).

An additional important feature of Han philosophy is what we might call the “naturalistic shift”. Scientific developments in the Han, particularly in astronomy and medicine, linked philosophical concerns to those of areas that were newly developing at the time and more empirical in nature (see entries on Chinese philosophy and Chinese medicine and on science and Chinese philosophy).

2. Western Han (202 BCE–9 CE)

2.1 Political Thought: Lu Jia and Jia Yi

Political philosophy was central to the Han Dynasty from its very beginning. In the Han Shu (Book of the Han), we read that the first Han emperor, Gaozu (formerly Liu Bang, 256–195 BCE), commissioned a number of scholars to construct texts on subjects valuable for the operation of empire. Lu Jia (d. 170 BCE), one of Gaozu’s ministers, wrote the Xinyu (“New Discussions”), the earliest extant treatise on political philosophy and practical government of the Han period. The organization of the text follows a pattern that would become common in political texts throughout the period and into later Chinese history. It begins with theoretical foundations discussing the connection of political concerns to broader metaphysical concerns, then expands on this to show how the practical application of political ideas follows.

The first chapter of the Xinyu discusses the foundation of the political project (and the human project more generally) in nature, or “heaven” (tian 天), borrowing a well-known and contentious concept from earlier Chinese philosophical discourse. The dao 道 (way) of proper action and governance here is associated with understanding the patterns (li 理) of heaven and earth. Lu Jia offers a “realist” conception of political and ethical principles (which early Chinese thinkers see as continuous for the most part). These principles are based in the mind-independent world, rather than dependent on human construction. Of course, the distinction between mind and world is not heavily stressed in early China. Although early Chinese philosophers did draw a distinction between mind and body (Slingerland 2019; McLeod 2021), we do not find the strong distinction between mind-dependence and independence that ground conceptions of antirealism and realism in contemporary Western philosophical discourse. The construction of dao (as political and ethical principles) is dependent on the nature of the world, including facts about patterns (li) as they exist within and determine human activity. Both “mind” and “world”, that is, are responsible for the dao. This is expressed in the Xinyu as a matter of the ancient sages’ expression of what they discern in the cosmos/heaven (tian). Lu Jia gives us a succinct explanation of this:

In order to determine the Way (dao) of human beings, the first sage looked up to observe Heaven’s pattern, looked down to examine the configuration of the ground, and then delineated the hexagrams Qian and Kun. The people began to become aware, understood the affection between father and son, right conduct between ruler and minister, separation between men and women, and proper order of senior and junior. Thereupon the numerous offices were established and the Kingly Way was born. (Xinyu 1.6, Goldin and Sabattini [trans] 2020: 23)

After this initial establishment of the Way based on understanding the patterns inherent in the world and human nature, more conventional norms still proved necessary. All of the particular manifestations of culture were then created by various sages, including the well-known Confucian concepts li 禮 (ritual) and yi 義 (appropriateness). The first stage of construction of the Way required the coordination of the sage and the patterns of the world—the sage had to make known and usable these patterns. After this, a more “antirealist” conception was offered—more conventional moral and political norms still had to be created from this more basic and abstract conception of the Way. The sages thus established ritual (li 禮) and appropriateness (yi 義). Through the sages’ construction of institutions and social systems, as well as their moral and political instruction, they helped people to follow the Way.

Lu Jia did not treat ethics and politics as distinct from one another or from human culture (wen 文) more generally. The human dao includes elements we might distinguish as political, ethical, aesthetic, etc. Thus, music and dress are discussed in terms of “proper” and “improper”, alongside considerations of respect for elders and superiors, and other principles that we would consider political and ethical. Neglect of one of them would inevitably lead to decay in the others.

Following the example or direction of the sage is continually necessary because of the human tendency to diverge from the dao, according to Lu Jia (Xinyu 1). Seemingly influenced by the Xunzi and legalist texts such as Hanfeizi and Shangjunshu, Lu Jia held that having the right structure between ruler and ministers was key to maintaining order of the state and moral action. Most importantly, the ministers who serve under a ruler must be morally upright. The ideal ruler, following earlier Daoist and Confucian ideas, should be “non-active” (wu wei 無為), employing the right people with the proper motivations and abilities, to ensure the commitment of the rest of society to moral activity. The ministers work in this way as exemplars and influences on those below in society.

Jia Yi (200–168 BCE) was a Han official who served as tutor to a number of vassal kings associated with the Han—first to the ruler of the distant southern region of Changsha, and later to the ruler of the region of Liang (more on this system of government below in discussion of the Huainanzi). His political thought is presented in the text Xinshu (“New Writings”). Despite debates as to whether the Xinshu was written by Jia or later authors in his name, we can take it as representative of an important strain of Han political thought (Sanft 2005: 6).

The most famous section of the Xinshu is Jia Yi’s criticism of the Qin, the first imperial dynasty of China which unified the “Warring States” in 221 BCE. Jia’s criticism stresses the Qin state’s failure to treat the people (min 民) with sufficient consideration. The Qin’s harsh treatment of people led to the loss of the obedience required to maintain order in a state. Jia Yi stressed that successful rule was only possible with the consent and obedience of the people—a position referred to as “taking the people as root” (min ben 民本). Jia wrote about the Qin rulers:

[They] made penalties many and punishments severe. The officers’ handling of cases was harsh to an extreme. Rewards and punishments were not appropriate and taxation lacked proper measure. (translated in Sanft 2016: 54)

To ensure successful rule, a ruler must govern with “humanenness” (ren 仁), a concern for the wellbeing of the people that was a major topic of discussion in Pre-Han Confucian texts. Unlike these earlier Confucians, however, Jia Yi’s interest in humaneness was mainly with its practical benefits for ensuring the stability of the ruler’s position. Earlier Confucians were more concerned with the issue of moral development and the role of humaneness in the development of the person. Jia Yi’s concern with humaneness was about political expediency. Lacking humaneness, as he claims the Qin rulers did, will inevitably lead to the collapse of one’s rule. Securing the cooperation and support of the people is necessary to maintain a state, and thus the good ruler must attend to this. (Sanft 2005: 35–6) While concern for the people is necessary, Jia does not take the assent of the people to being governed as the ground or justification for the ruler’s authority. This authority, according to Jia, is independent of the people. The “people as root” position developed in the Xinshu is fully based in pragmatic considerations of rulership. In this way, Jia Yi links the ideas developed in early Confucian texts with the pragmatic “amoralism” of Legalists like Han Feizi who argued for the appropriateness of political strategies on the basis of their success in maintaining the power of the ruler, rather than on the basis of moral considerations. Jia’s political thought thus represents a new trend in the Han period, one that forms the basis for the ideology of what Dingxin Zhao calls “the Confucian-Legalist state” (Zhao 2015). The origins of the political philosophy that would guide Chinese dynasties through much of the rest of Chinese history are found in the Han.

2.2 Correlative Metaphysics: Chunqiu Fanlu

The Chunqiu Fanlu is one of the earliest and most prominent Han examples of so-called “correlative cosmology”. The text has been traditionally associated with the well-known Han court scholar Dong Zhongshu (b. ~195 BCE), an advocate of the tradition based on the Gongyang commentary on the classic history Chunqiu, a text believed to be essential for understanding philosophy. Three major commentaries on the text, Gongyang, Zuo, and Guliang, offered different interpretations and explanations of the Chunqiu, itself a very sparse and direct text. Different scholastic traditions developed around these commentaries, as groups accepted one or the other of the commentaries as authoritative. In early China, particularly in the Han period, intellectual “schools” are better understood in terms of commitments to the centrality of certain texts rather than commitment to certain concepts or theories.

In the Chunqiu Fanlu we also find the development of two important categories—the “five phases” (wu xing 五行) and yin-yang 陰陽—as well as discussion of their connection to the concept of qi 氣. The ethical and political content of the Chunqiu Fanlu does not differ considerably from the standard “Confucian” views of the time as found in texts such as those of Lu Jia and Jia Yi, so I here focus on the metaphysics of the Chunqiu Fanlu, where we find its most original contribution.

In what we can call a “naturalistic shift” in Han thought, which began in the earlier texts of the late Warring States period such as the Xunzi, we see a move toward the development of correlative cosmology and new uses of concepts such as qi (vital energy) to explain human behavior and guide ethical and political activity.

Developing an older distinction, the Chunqiu Fanlu uses the contrast of yin and yang, the qualities associated with each, and their transformations, to make sense of properties of the world and humans. One of the key features of this naturalistic shift of the Han is the view that “heaven/nature and humanity are as one” (tian ren yi ye 天人一也, CQFL 49.1). The principles and patterns that explain the operation of the natural world, such as yin-yang and the five phases, also explain human characteristics, society, and conduct. There is some debate as to whether yin and yang are something like properties of their own that belong to objects and events, or whether they are qualities or types of qi. In some parts of the text, yin and yang are discussed as if they are particular and concrete elements of the world, and in other parts of the text yin and yang are discussed as features of qi. The Chunqiu Fanlu, unlike earlier Daoist texts, takes a partisan stance here, arguing that we should value yang over yin. Yang is associated with positive features such as virtue, humanity, and life, while yin is understood as absence, and associated with the opposing features of vice, violence, and death. This contrasts with earlier “Daoist” texts, which generally take yin and yang to be mutually valuable principles of change, which should be followed as situations call for. The Chunqiu Fanlu argues instead that we should “honor yang and denigrate yin” (CQFL 43.1), and that “yang is lofty, yin is lowly.” (CQFL 43, Queen & Major 2016: 393)

Everything from the change of seasons to the movement of planets and alternation of emotions can be understood in terms of yin and yang. The pair gives us a way to make sense of the constructive and deconstructive aspects involved in any change. We can understand any change or any state as involving contrastive elements that alternate with one another during change. These two complementary and oppositional principles of yin and yang (not forces or substances but something more like causally efficacious qualities or categories) explain the movement and change of things in the world. In most early Chinese texts, yin and yang are given a balanced priority. They are equally responsible for the emergence of things, each governs half of the year, the day, and growth. The Chunqiu Fanlu makes the unusual move of elevating the position of yang, making it responsible for a greater amount, of more potency, and thus ultimately higher value.

In addition to yin and yang, the Chunqiu Fanlu also uses the concept of the “five phases” (wu xing) to understand change. The five phases are at the center of what is known as correlative cosmology—the explanation of things in the world by reference to their correlative associations with other things. A thing is associated with a particular phase or element, with principles of change built into the phases or elements, as each has a transformational principle determined by the phase into which it changes. Xing 行 is in this context generally translated as “phase” because of this focus on change. A phase describes not only the nature of a thing in its current state, but more importantly the future states of this thing, that into which it transforms. In this sense, the phases had value as predictive features of things. The five phases situate things with respect to their relationships with other things—in terms of their becoming other things, their location, roles, and coordinating activities. Chapter 42 of the Chunqiu Fanlu explains this use of the phases. After explaining the ordering of the five phases: wood, fire, earth, metal, and water, the chapter then discusses their relationships, in terms of transformation, location, reciprocal activity, and reliance.

Metal gives birth to fire; fire gives birth to earth; earth gives birth to metal; metal gives birth to water; water gives birth to wood. This is their father-son relationship. Wood dwells on the left; metal dwells on the right; fire dwells in the front; water dwells in the rear; earth dwells in the center. This is their father-son sequence. The phases receive from and distribute to one another. […] To constantly rely on the father to direct the son is the Way of Heaven. Therefore once wood is born, fire nurtures it; once metal dies, water buries it. Fire delights in wood and nourishes it with yang, water overcomes metal and nourishes it with yin. Earth’s managing of the affairs of fire fully expresses its loyalty. Thus the five phases exemplify the conduct of the filial son and loyal minister. (Queen & Major [trans] 2016: 367–8).

We see here that Chunqiu Fanlu combines the five phases explanation of change and interaction with yin and yang principles. Yin and yang operate within the five phases, and are properties of the phases explaining their relationships to one another. It is in the Chunqiu Fanlu that we find the fusion of these two previously distinct correlative systems in an overarching correlative synthesis (even though the synthesis is not perfect—the systems are still very much treated separately in particular areas of the text, likely due to the composite nature of the text).

The five phase makes possible both explanation and prediction. When we understand the interaction of the five phases, it becomes possible to understand how things will change, which gives us the ability to make use of them. The phases govern activity as well, including human activity. Through understanding the phases we come to understand which kinds of activity will be most effective at performing certain kinds of tasks, attaining certain kinds of ends. This is all relevant for those in government, particularly the ruler (such people are the text’s primary audience), as understanding of the phases will allow the ruler to properly evaluate and appraise others, knowing who to elevate to particular positions, based on their abilities as determined by the phases.

2.3 Knowledge and Method: The Syncretism of the Huainanzi

One of the major developments of the Han was the formation of what is commonly known as “Han Syncretism”, associated by some with “schools” such as Huang-Lao and texts such as the Huainanzi. The development and nature of Huang-Lao are topics still debated by scholars (see Graham 1991; Major 1993: 10; Chen & Sung 2015). While the syncretic or synthetic tendency, its ascent, and its pinnacle was reached during the Han, such thinking actually had its origins much earlier in Chinese history. In Warring States texts such the Guanzi and Lushi Chunqiu, we find the first developments of syncretism. It is in the Han that this trend really takes off, and the Huainanzi represents its high-water mark.

Earlier forms of syncretism involved the intentional combination of aspects of different schools and textual traditions, such as Confucianism, Daoism, and Legalism. While we see this to some extent in texts like the Chunqiu Fanlu, these forms of syncretism were often not explicit. The Huainanzi, on the other hand, openly discusses its synthesis of ideas from across previously opposing schools and traditions. In the Huainanzi, we find a specific methodology for and justification of synthesis built from a framework using ideas primarily from the Zhuangzi and Daodejing, but involving Confucian, Legalist, and even Mohist ideas as well. Numerous scholars have debated the ultimate purpose of the Huainanzi’s syncretism (see Goldin 1999; Vankeerberghen 2001). Clearly there is a political aim of the overall project. Liu An (179–122 BCE), the vassal ruler of the territory of Huainan, brought together the scholars who constructed the text. Liu was concerned with the ideology of empire. His primary aim was the development of a system synthesizing the numerous and diverse peoples, cultures, systems, languages, and ways of life throughout the still relatively new Han empire. The ways of governance and social ideologies of the past, Liu recognized, may have been acceptable in the smaller-scale societies in which they developed. But these societies were already unified by language, culture, and social norms. Imposing the norms and ideology of a single people on others simply would not work in a territory as large and diverse as that controlled by the Han. What was needed was a political, ethical, and metaphysical system that unified the variety of peoples in a single social project while at the same time allowing for the independence and individuality of their local approaches. What resulted from this reflection by the committee of scholars at Liu An’s court was one of the most comprehensive and powerful syntheses in the history of human thought. Liu An’s scholars almost seamlessly combined all of the known philosophical, political, scientific, and religious systems of their day into one overarching explanation of the cosmos.

Ostensibly the purpose of this, according to Liu An, was to instruct his nephew, Emperor Wu of Han, in the proper ways to maintain the empire, unifying the people while allowing for their differences, which would prove much more effective than attempting to eliminate these differences or impose norms. There was likely another more personal purpose behind the text as well. In the mid to late second century BCE, the central Han government began moving away from an older model of imperial control in which vassal rulers were given independent control of distant states. These vassal kingdoms were generally handed out to family or those otherwise demonstratively loyal to the Han, such as Liu An, who was the uncle of the Emperor Wu. In the early days of the Han empire, such a political structure was necessary because of the inexperience of the Han court (or any political entity for that matter) in administering a vast and diverse empire. By the time of the Huainanzi’s construction, however, the Han had developed the experience, organizational structure, and centralized power to more directly administer the various regions. The central Han government began to take direct control of these regions, moving away from the older system of vassal rulership. Liu An, as one of these vassal rulers in the dying years of the practice, wanted to secure the practice in order to keep his position and lands. Thus the pluralistic argument of the Huainanzi was to a large extent also an argument to Emperor Wu for why he should leave the vassal kingdoms intact, rather than bringing them under the direct control of the Han.

A number of new themes in early Chinese thought are discussed in the Huainanzi. The methodology of philosophy is a central concern of the text, as discussed in the first two chapters and the final chapter in particular. Using a framework that seems to borrow most from Daoism (Roth 2015: 342), the text aims to create a synthesis of not only other existing intellectual schools, but a variety of other multiplicities. The first two chapters of the text, as well as the final “overview” chapter offer the main structure for the synthesis of the text, which is explored in specifics in the other chapters (Murray 2004). The two main images used are the distinction between root (ben 本) and branches (mo 末), and the appeal to a unifying “pattern” (li 理). The Huainanzi argues that the unification of all things is explained by the origination of all things in “the one” (yi 一), which it associated with dao. Things emerge from dao in particular patterns, following yin and yang change. We gain understanding and mastery over ourselves and nature by following the myriad things (wan wu 萬物) as they develop and change, and their patterns. To do this, we must follow the way of tian 天 (heaven) rather than that of the human. Following earlier views of texts such as the Zhuangzi, the distinction drawn between tian and the human (ren 人) in the Huainanzi is one of wide vs. narrow focus. It seems to parallel a kind of distinction between the natural and the human that takes what is associated with the human to be modifying nature, with nature as the untouched and separate. The nature/human distinction in the Huainanzi is not total—humanity is ultimately seen as originating in the same source as the rest of nature, somehow operating on the stuff of nature—which later chapters (such as ch. 3) understand in terms of the human “completion” (cheng 成) of nature. In chapter one, however, a valuation seems to be made, contrasting the human as the narrow and flawed with the natural as the broad and pure. A key passage in Chapter One reads:

what we call nature is pure and untainted, unadorned and plain, and has never begun to be tainted with impurities. What we call human is askew because of wisdom and precedent. It is what looks back to past generations and interacts with the vulgar. (Huainanzi 1.10, Major, Queen, et al. [trans] 2010: 37)

The human is associated here with desire, intention, artifice, and agency, and contrasted with the non-agentive and “spontaneous” activity of tian. We have the ability to act as tian acts by following along with tian. This idea is developed in the Zhuangzi and a number of earlier texts, in which tian and dao are sometimes used interchangeably. The Huainanzi, like Daoist texts, locates the problem of human failure, in terms of individual thriving, skill and achievement, knowledge, or political organization, in the existence of specifically human agency. Like texts such as the Daodejing and Zhuangzi, the Huainanzi presents action in concert with nature (tian) and undermining of the specifically human activity guided by intention as the keys to ensuring success in all of the above measures. In order to act in this way, however, we must have an understanding of the patterns of nature, so as to align ourselves with them.

The Huainanzi has a difficult balancing act to maintain here, however. While it accepts the Daoist view outlined above concerning the efficacy of following nature and the corrosive nature of specifically human activity, artifice, and tools such as ritual, moral norms, and righteousness (Huainanzi 2.3), it also endorses the Confucian view of the value and necessity of ritual and other such human inventions. This is partially explained by the account of human development given in Chapter 2. The ancients, according to the text, were able to act in accordance with nature, and thus did not require the artifice of ritual, humanity, and righteousness. In later ages, there was a decline such that ritual and the tools of humanity became necessary. The key to using these artifacts well is to use them consistently with the dao.

The main argument for synthesis of the Huainanzi is that the knowledge to be gained about the world that ultimately allows one to attain success can be best attained through understanding what is correct in all schools and perspectives. The assumption here is that each of the competing schools had something right, and was properly responding to some aspect of the world or human life. The mistake the various schools made was in their commitment to partiality, and the idea that the aspects of the world they had uncovered were the only ones to uncover. When we move beyond this partiality, we recognize that each of the myriad schools, teachings, customs, etc. have some value, if we understand the perspectives from which they are useful and the aspects of the world they illuminate. A key passage in Chapter Two reads:

The Hundred Schools have different theories, and each has its own origins. For example, the relationship of Mozi, Yang Zhu, Shen Buhai, and Lord Shang to the Way of Governing is like that of an individual umbrella rib to the whole canopy and like that of an individual spoke to the whole chariot wheel. If you have any one of them, you can complete the number; if you are missing any one of them, it will not affect the utility of the whole. Each one thought that he alone had a monopoly on true governing; he did not understand the genuine disposition of Heaven and Earth. (Huainanzi 2.10, Major, Queen, et al. [trans] 2010: 93–94 [modified])

The solution the Huainanzi offers to the partiality of the myriad schools is to take the entirety of them, understand how they are individually useful, and use them in the right ways. The Huainanzi takes this same approach to all areas of human knowledge, people, customs, rituals, and things in the world. The sage aims to understand all of these myriad ways and to thus make use of them, through organizing them in the proper ways. This opens up a problem, however. How can one possibly understand all schools, traditions, peoples, customs, etc? There is far too much diversity and material in the world for any given person to know. The Huainanzi’s bold claim is that one can and should strive to attain a summative awareness of all human knowledge. How is this possible?

The Huainanzi offers a number of ways out of this difficulty, but the most developed one is the use of the distinction between root (ben 本) and branch (mo 末) as applied to areas of knowledge. Each of the various schools, areas of human knowledge, and things in the world can be considered a “branch”, where the branches are connected to one another via their grounding in the same “root”. This root can be understood as the pattern (li) of nature that links the branches. The image of the umbrella and rib above shows us one example of this, and there are many others in the text. A passage in Ch. 2 reads:

When the myriad things differentiate and branch off, when the hundred affairs proliferate and diverge, all have their foundation in a single root, despite their ten million branchings. (Huainanzi 2.11, Major, Queen, et al. [trans] 2010: 94)

The key to understanding (and thus also knowing how to employ) all forms of human knowledge is to understand the nature and pattern of the root in which these myriad ways are grounded. The same patterns are manifest not only in different areas of human knowledge, subjects, people, customs, languages, etc., but also in the rest of the world. One of the key features of Han syncretic thought and “correlative cosmology” is the linking of the general structure of humanity and the cosmos (tian), such that the very same patterns govern both. This insight is behind much of what I have called the “naturalistic shift” of the Han, and the origins of much of early Chinese science in the Han period. Some examples of this are the development of the medical tradition, found in early texts such as the Huangdi Neijing, and the systematization of astronomy, geography, calendrics, and mathematics. The earliest texts in these areas date to the Han period, and we find general discussions of these areas in texts such as Huainanzi that attempt to organize all human knowledge. Thus we have chapters on astronomy (Tianwen, ch. 3), calendrics and seasons (Shize, ch. 5), and other areas of natural science.

The application of this understanding of the root, according to the Liu An’s scholars, is in managerial acumen. The ruler who understands the root will also understand the value and role of the variety of different regions, people, customs, languages, disciplines, schools, and other things that make up the vast collection of things in the empire. Only a ruler with such vast understanding could hope to be successful in maintaining order in an empire as broad and diverse as the Han. Thus, the art of learning the root underlying all human knowledge is part of the art of rulership, which is the central concern of the Huainanzi. As many noticed, however (and was surely intended), this general framework is applicable beyond the case of the ruler. The individual reader can benefit from the Huainanzi’s model of learning and understanding, for their own purposes.

One interesting feature of the Huainanzi is its position on the role of humanity in completing (cheng 成) the cosmos, through such activity as measurement (ch.3), naming (ch. 1), and construction of customs (ch. 11). The Huainanzi focuses on the role of the human in both understanding the patterns inherent in nature, and also in shaping and completing things on the basis of these patterns. In comparison in particular with accounts of agency and free will emerging in philosophical contexts of the post-Abrahamic West, the Huainanzi, and Han philosophy in general, has a far easier time squaring human activity and that of the extra-human world.

The Huainanzi represents the most sophisticated expression of the tendency toward synthesis popular in the early Han period, as well as the high-water mark of the trend, before it began to recede in the years after the Han political consolidation of vassal states. Despite this, a strong current of the kind of syncretism found in the Huainanzi would continue to thrive in Chinese thought, ultimately facilitating the construction of the unique kinds of Buddhist thought that emerged in China in later centuries, which heavily borrowed from both Daoist and Confucian ideas.

2.4 Human Nature: Yang Xiong

Yang Xiong (53 BCE–18 CE) was one of the last major philosophical figures before the end of the Western Han Dynasty, whose life spanned into the short-lived “interregnum” period of Wang Mang’s Xin Dynasty (9–23 CE). Yang’s late work represents a crucial pivot point toward the new kind of philosophical thought that would come to dominate in the Eastern Han period. Though the naturalism of the early Han remained, later Han thought moved back toward the kind of metaphysically sparse realism of the pre-Han period, away from the elaborate correlative systems of the earlier Han. Yang Xiong’s Fayan (“Model Sayings”) returns to the style and ideas of early texts such as the Analects.

While Yang’s early scholarly reputation was based on his fu poems (a genre of polemic poetry generally aimed at influencing political policy during this time), his best known work today is his philosophical work, produced later in his life. The earlier of these texts, the Taixuanjing (“Classic of Supreme Mystery”) is a very much continuous with the correlative metaphysical trends of earlier Han philosophy. The text is an divinatory and philosophical manual in the style of the early divination classic Yijing, and develops a similar correlative metaphysics to ones found in earlier texts such as Chunqiu Fanlu and Huainanzi. Fayan, perhaps his most famous work, was one of his later works, written during period of Wang Mang’s Xin Dynasty. While this work is innovative in its return to an older style of presentation as well as its presentation of new theories of xing 性 (human nature/inborn characteristics), moral cultivation, and political organization, it’s legacy led to the sidelining of Yang Xiong in the later Chinese tradition. Song Dynasty Neo-Confucians such as Zhu Xi (1130–1200 CE) criticized Yang on the basis of what they saw as the presumptuousness of his use of the style of the Analects for the construction of Fayan. Because of this, Yang’s work was not included as one of the essential Confucian texts by these later scholars, and this led to the neglect of Yang’s work from this time, given the influence of the Neo-Confucians (Nylan 2014: 2).

The correlative model of the Taixuanjing, as it follows in general the kind of “Five Phases” thought found in earlier works, is presented in the style of the Yijing, as short descriptions of divinatory tetragrams. It is a notoriously difficult text, written in the same terse, poetic, and suggestive way as the Yijing itself, and its main focus is divinatory, although Yang develops some philosophical positions in the text as well.

Arguably the most well-known of Yang’s philosophical positions is his view of xing 性 (human nature/inborn characteristics), a view later criticized by Neo-Confucians in the Song Dynasty because of its inconsistency with Mengzi’s view, which had by that time become the “orthodox” Confucian position. Contrary to the earlier Confucian philosophers Mengzi and Xunzi, Yang held that human inborn characteristics contain both good and evil, and that moral development is a matter of cultivating the good aspects of it, while allowing the evil elements to wither. The fact that a particular characteristic is inborn or part of our nature, according to Yang, does not necessitate that we act according to it. Humans have the ability (through ritual and other tools) to shape our dispositions. Agreeing with earlier Confucians, Yang argues that what is contained in our nature must be developed in order to become either virtue or vice. The contents of our nature can be called good or evil, but an individual only becomes virtuous or vicious in connection with these characteristics once they are developed. The key passage in Fayan reads:

Human xing is a mixture of good and evil. If one cultivates the good aspects one becomes good, while if one cultivates the evil aspects one becomes evil. As for qi—is it not the horse that carries one to either good or evil? (Fayan 3.2, author’s translation)

3. Eastern Han (25–220CE)

3.1 The Development of Late Han Naturalism: Huan Tan

Although Huan Tan (43 BCE–28 CE) was a contemporary of Yang Xiong (with whom he interacted), he can be considered the first of the philosophers of the Eastern Han. Like Yang Xiong, Huan was associated with the Xin court of Wang Mang, and was for this reason criticized by a number of later figures, but unlike Yang, Huan’s life and work stretched a few years into the Eastern Han, and Huan’s reputation was salvaged to some extent by his continued service as an official in the second Han Dynasty.

Huan Tan receives a special section here, unlike other of his contemporaries such as Liu Xin, because of his influence on the philosophy of the rest of the Eastern Han, both in argumentative style and in content. In Huan’s major philosophical work, Xinlun (“New Discourses”), which only exists today in fragmentary form, he offered a naturalistic and physicalistic view of mind/spirit (jingshen 精神), arguing that the spirit is dependent on and linked to the body, and that it thus dies with the death of the body. In this way, Huan criticizes what he takes to be superstitious views accepting the existence of ghosts or disembodied spirits. He also objected to the popular practices of the time of seeking of immortality through alchemy, physical techniques, or intellectual cultivation. We cannot, Huan argued, forestall the natural decline and ultimate death of the human organism. This critical spirit taking aim at earlier non-physicalistic views comes to mark a number of thinkers in the Eastern Han, most prominently Wang Chong. Huan describes the connection between the conscious spirit (jingshen) and the body (xing) thus, in discussing what he takes to be the wrongheadedness of the life-extension techniques of esoteric Daoists:

The conscious spirit inhabits the body as a flame does a candle. If the candle is properly tended and turned so that it follows the flame need not be extinguished until the candle is all used up. Of course, if the candle has no flame, it cannot become active in the void, nor can its ashes be lighted later. (fragment from Hongming Ji 5.18, Pokora [trans.] 1975: 76–77).

While the literature of criticism had long been a part of Chinese intellectual culture, in Huan’s work we begin to see more direct and incisive criticism, rather than the carefully expressed, indirect, and suggestive criticism we see earlier in the Western Han, when fu poetry was a dominant form of presentation of critique and literary subtlety and indirectness were prized. Such indirect criticism through fu poetry was still practiced in the Eastern Han, by masters of the art such as Cai Yong, but the more direct critical literature of scholars like Huan Tan came to play a larger role in this period. Huan’s critical stance undermined many earlier traditional practices, such as divination, and he does not, unlike many previous thinkers, rely on historical precedent and appeals to the figures of the past. This aligns him to some extent with the realist pragmatism of the Legalists, although it is incorrect to see Huan in terms of this older school designation that had no cache in the Han. His thought is representative of the critical, rationalist, and more insistently naturalist mode of thinking that became more prominent in the Eastern Han. Huan and others criticized what they saw as the excesses of the metaphysics of correlative cosmology of the Western Han, and its tendency to proliferate entities in its ontology, many of which Huan thought were imaginary. Huan’s critical style is clearly echoed in later thinkers of the Eastern Han such as Wang Fu and Wang Chong. Particularly in his approach to the classical texts, we find influence on later thinkers such as Wang Chong. Huan advocated a piecemeal approach rather than acceptance or rejection of a text as a whole. We should accept what is true and reject what is false in the writings of the past.

Although there are unfounded and outrageous passages in…those other books, we must use what is best in them. How dare we talk of rejecting them completely? (Xinlun, Pokora [trans.] 1975: xvi, 2)

Huan’s political and ethical program followed this critical and piecemeal approach. While he did not, as early Legalists such as Han Feizi, completely reject the way of the sages of the past as a guide for current political practice, he did follow the Legalists in holding that the features of current situations should ultimately determine practice, and that at least some of the models of the past should be rejected.

3.2 New Methods in Epistemology and Metaphysics: Wang Chong

While the critical and naturalistic thought of Huan Tan is only today known through fragments, we have far more material from Wang Chong (27–100 CE), a somewhat similar thinker of the Eastern Han whose work was likely influenced by Huan. While Wang Chong was a somewhat marginal figure in his time (a situation about which he complains in his work), his thought became influential indirectly in later years, particularly in the leadup to the Xuanxue movement in the Wei-Jin period. Wang’s writing was not only voluminous, but contained a wealth of historical references, quotes, and citations of earlier thinkers. Wang apparently studied a wide range of texts, and wrote about many of them. Thus, his work survived mainly due to being collected and used as a kind of encyclopedia by figures in the late Han and Wei-Jin periods. A number of these figures became prominent in the “Qingtan” (pure talk) discussion movement that preceded Xuanxue, and Wang’s ideas influenced the movement via this direction (see McLeod 2020).

Wang’s most original contributions were his views on methodology and criticism, truth and knowledge, and human nature and agency. A number of scholars have written in recent years on Wang’s views on these topics (including Klein & Klein 2016; McLeod 2018; and Song 2020).

Wang developed a critical method he referred to as wen nan 問難 (“questioning and challenging”), built of two parts (Lunheng 28). According to Wang, to discern the truth in the texts of the sages of the past, we begin with an investigation of their words, subjecting them to questioning so as to clarify them. The statements or teachings (yan 言) found in texts that are unclear or interpretively ambiguous, Wang claims, should be subjected to clarifying questioning. This questioning aims to remove any lack of clarity and derive a position that can be evaluated on its merits. Once we have clear and evaluable statements, we can then apply the method of “challenging”, which more directly evaluates statements by presenting them with counterexamples, looking for cases in which they do not hold, testing their plausibility, considering their practicability, etc. Wang offers a general statement of the need for this method in his chapter “Questioning Confucius”, in which he criticizes his contemporaries for their unwillingness to challenge the words of sages of the past:

When the worthies and sages wrote their works, they used their thoughts to make a detailed investigation of things. We cannot say that they completely attained the truth (about everything) even then. Given this, how could it possibly be that their everyday and idle statements are completely true? These statements cannot all be true, but the people of today don’t know how to challenge them. Or if some of these statements are true and the ideas imparted are unclear and hard to make out, the people of today do not know how to question them. (Lunheng 28.1, author’s translation)

According to Wang, this inability is in part explained by the unwillingness of scholars to innovate and to break with the sages. In the chapter Duizuo (Replies on Creation), Wang confronts the commonly held view, expressed in the Analects of Confucius, that it is best to transmit the teachings of the ancient sages rather than to create or innovate. “Creation” (zuo 作) as such was looked at in a negative way in the Han, despite a wealth of innovation in this period. Using his proposed method, Wang aimed to distinguish true (shi 實) statements from false (xu 虛) statements. Wang understood false statements as ones that tend to have a grip on us for a variety of reasons. Wang was not concerned with falsehoods that we have no inclination to believe, but rather with ones that have an intrinsic attractiveness. He argued that “flowery” (hua 花) words have this feature, attracting us due to their style, rather than their veridicality. A whole host of human biases contributes to making certain kinds of falsehoods attractive to us. In addition to having a preference for flowery words, we are also inclined toward those statements and teachings that present us in a good light, feeding our sense of superiority, our vanity, or advancing our personal interests. It is this category of statement for which Wang reserves the category of “false” (xu), using a term that also has the sense of “empty”. Xu statements are attractive statements that lack the important features that make statements true. What makes a statement true (shi) is that it has the features we generally seek in evaluating statements, rather than only in particular cases with certain options attractive to us. These features will be different depending on the kind of statement we are evaluating. A true moral statement will have different truth-making features than a statement of medicine or geology.

Another important issue dealt with in Wang’s work is that of human nature or inborn characteristics (xing 性), which is intertwined with a number of concepts, including agency and allotment (ming 命). Wang develops an account of human agency that is remarkably innovative for his time, drawing a contrast between agency and “spontaneity” or self-action (ziran 自然). Wang is concerned with the ways in which the kind of moral cultivation discussed in earlier texts such as those of the Confucians can make a difference in human behaviors and in the outcomes resulting from these behaviors. Can we, through the kinds of practices the Confucians enjoin, rectify and change our behavior so as to produce different effects than those that otherwise would have resulted? To accept that human activity can make such a difference in the world seems to conflict with another idea of antiquity, that all of us are bound by our allotment (ming), which is governed by the world. Wang attempts to square these two conflicting ideas in numerous chapters of the Lunheng.

According to Wang, human inborn characteristics (xing) are determined by the allotment (ming) provided to humans by nature. This process is one absent of agency of any kind, and happens “spontaneously” (ziran). Wang uses the image of generation in nature to describe such spontaneous or non-agentive activity. The act of human procreation, for example, displays both agentive and non-agentive features. While individuals decide to engage in the procreative act, the generation of the embryo that becomes a child happens spontaneously (ziran), without effort and intention. Wang seems to go even further than this toward determinism, however. He writes that even human behavior is ultimately determined by non-agentive features of the world, even bypassing the inborn characteristics generally taken to explain our behavior, and itself determined by non-agentive features of the world. Wang writes, in the Zhiqi (Periods of Government) chapter of Lunheng:

When grain is sufficient and there is enough to eat, adherence to ritual and righteousness are born in the heart. When ritual flourishes and righteousness is abundant, the foundations of peace are established. Therefore in the spring of a year of famine, one does not even feed one’s relatives, whereas in the autumn of a year of abundance, one calls together one’s neighbors from the four directions to feast. Not to feed relatives is evil conduct, while to call together neighbors from the four directions is good, righteous conduct. The formation of good or bad conduct is not a matter of the substantive character of the person (zhi xing 質性), but is rather a matter of the collection of grains. (Lunheng 53.6, author’s translation)

While attributing human behavior to such non-agentive external circumstances, Wang also makes room for inborn characteristics (xing). These characteristics, which differ by individual on the basis of that individual’s allotment (ming) from nature, determine the moral quality of a person’s actions. Wang writes:

…in the natural characteristics of persons there is good and bad, just like concerning the talents of persons there is high and low…..Natural characteristics and the receipt of one’s allotment (ming) are one in the same. Allotment determines whether one is wealthy or impoverished, natural characteristics whether one is virtuous or vicious. (Lunheng 13.19, author’s translation)

In linking inborn characteristics concerning the moral quality of behavior to naturally allotted features such as certain kinds of talent, Wang attempts to explain the origins of character in terms of ultimately spontaneous, non-agentive aspects of the world. Despite a seemingly deterministic view of human activity, however, Wang attempts to make room for agency and the efficacy of human activity in altering patterns. Wang argues that moral education can play a role in transforming human behavior, through transforming one’s character, and this involves concerted effort (agentive effort) on the part of the individual (Lunheng 5). Wang recognizes that on the face this view seems to conflict with his statements of determinism elsewhere. To attempt to solve this problem, he relies on a distinction between three types of allotment (ming). In some earlier texts, ming is understood in a more clearly deterministic way, which is why we commonly see the term translated as “destiny” or “fate”. Wang abandons this strict determinism here. Human agency can play a role in certain types of allotment and not others. Wang writes:

Tradition says that there are three types of allotment: natural allotment, consequent allotment, and incidental allotment. Natural allotment is said to be when good outcome issues from the original constitution of itself. Based on natural characteristics in themselves the bones are healthy, therefore one does not have to move away from and transform one’s conduct to seek good fortune, but a good outcome is achieved from one’s own characteristics. This is why it is called natural allotment. Those with consequent allotment exert effort to control their conduct and through this achieve good fortune and outcome. If they were to allow free rein to their emotions and desires they would come upon misfortune. This is why it is called consequent allotment. As far as those with incidental allotment, their conduct is good but they obtain evil, and they are without any hope for help. Meeting with incident externally, they obtain misfortune. This is why it is called incidental allotment. (Lunheng 6.4, author’s translation)

The role of agency is emphasized in the second of these three types of allotment, consequent allotment (sui ming 隨命. We begin with a natural allotment (zheng ming 正命) such that particular features of our lives are determined. This allotment can be altered either by human effort (which gives us consequent allotment) or meeting with accidents in the world—incidental allotment (zao ming 遭命). While human agency can alter our allotment and thus the outcomes of our lives and behaviors, the scope and effect of this activity is still limited by our natural allotment. Indeed, Wang argues that this external limitation is key to understanding the value and effect of moral instruction and cultivation. This is the case for both individual moral self-cultivation and for the moral instruction of the people by the state and the ruler. Wang writes, in his discussion on government in the chapter Zhiqi (Periods of Government):

A good doctor is able to use needles and medicines and is successful in his arts when he meets with a person who has not yet died who has an illness that does not lead to death. If the person’s illness is terminal, the doctor can do nothing, even if he is a master. The allotment connected to a serious illness is such that it cannot be cured, just as disorder among the people cannot be undone. Medicine cures illness just as instruction guides and pacifies the people. They are both a matter of allotment (ming) and the times, and cannot be attained by ordering or using force. (Lunheng 53.3, author’s translation).

3.3 Ban Zhao and the Scholarship of Women

Ban Zhao (c. 45–116 CE) is an interesting figure in early Chinese history for a number of reasons. The younger sister of the Han court historian Ban Gu and the grandniece of the famous concubine known as Ban Jieyu (jieyu being a rank title) noted for her scholarship, Ban Zhao had an unusually scholarly upbringing for a woman of the era. She became an important scholar of the period, composing numerous works on ethics, politics, history, and astronomy. Her most well-known works are the Nüjie (Instructions for Women), a guide to norms concerning virtue and conduct for women, and her completion of the official court history of the Western Han, the Han Shu, after her brother Ban Gu died in prison in 92 CE before its completion.

The Nüjie is a compendium of norms for women, social and moral, in line with traditional Confucian views. One of these views was that virtue was relative to role and position in society. Not only would a virtuous ruler and a virtuous servant look different because of their different ways of manifesting particular kinds of virtue, but the virtues exemplified by the virtuous ruler and servant were different. There was a heavy focus in early Confucianism on roles connected to relationships, with the central relationships in human life being seen as those between parent and child, ruler and servant, and husband and wife—part of the so-called “Five Relationships” (wu lun 五倫). Ban’s Nüjie focused specifically on the virtues proper to the woman as wife, that is, mainly in relationship to her husband, and to a lesser extent toward her children. As with discussions of role norms for other individuals in Confucian texts, the focus in the Nüjie is very much on the responsibilities of the wife toward the husband. The earlier Western Han author Liu Xiang’s Lienü Zhuan (“Biographies of Exemplary Women”) contained many examples of virtuous women, including Ban Zhao’s ancestor Ban Jieyu. It seems that despite the focus on presenting women as ideally subordinate in key ways to men, particularly with respect to a husband, there was no strict regulation against women engaging in scholarship. Indeed, Ban’s description of her own situation and her motivation for writing the Nüjie gives us a window onto the lives and expectations of women in the Eastern Han period:

…at the age of fourteen I was in charge of the work of dustpan and broom in the Cao family. Now, more than forty some years have passed; during these years, trembling with fear, I was constantly afraid that I may be dismissed or humiliated. Such an incident, if it happened, would have brought disgrace upon my parents and burdened members of my husband’s family, as well as my natal family. […] It grieves me to see you, my daughters, who have just reached the age of marriage, to not have been gradually taught more nor have you learned proper rituals of being a married woman. […] For this reason, I have composed the seven chapters of the Nüjie. (Preface to Nüjie, Pang-White [trans.] 2018: 41)

While it is interesting and unique in the history of this period to see women associated with scholarship as these two famous women of the Ban family, the virtues of women according to these texts were very different than those of men in most roles, with perhaps the exception of the role of subordinate to ruler. It is also important to note that, while the responsibilities of women, according to texts like the Nujie, tends to be other-directed in nature, most of the responsibilities of men share these features as well. One has the responsibility to subordinate oneself to people such as parents, superiors in society, and the ruler, whether man or woman. The end goal of this is both social harmony and a good name, in terms of contribution to overall harmony (Nüjie 7, Pang-White [trans.] 2018: 64).

According to Ban, humility is one of the main virtues women should aim to cultivate. Humility here is understood as “putting others before oneself” (xian ren hou ji 先人後己). This seems to be an extension of the view expressed in the Analects of Confucius (12.1), that “restraining the self and returning to ritual” is the key to developing virtue. Despite Ban’s following of traditional norms throughout the Nüjie, there are certain passages where we see criticism of common practices of her society, including the neglect of education of women and girls. She writes:

…only to educate men and not to educate women—are they not being partial in their treatment of the two sides? According to the Liji, at the age of eight, children should begin receiving instruction on the classics. At the age of fifteen, they should receive an adult education. Why is women’s education alone not following this as a principle? (Nüjie 2, Pang-White [trans.] 2018: 48)

3.4 Politics of Reclusion: Wang Fu

The work of Wang Fu (82–167 CE) represents one of the strains of Confucian thought that began to gain new ground in the Eastern Han as the dynasty went into decline leading toward the series of catastrophes that would end with the collapse of the Han in the late second and early third centuries CE. The tradition of social criticism had long been part of Confucian scholarship, but Wang Fu’s work Qianfulun (Discourses of a Hermit) revived the theme of Confucian reclusion, a controversial idea, though one suggested in texts such as the Analects itself. Perhaps the most famous example of such reclusion (in Wang’s time and our own) was that of the Warring States Period scholar Qu Yuan (c. 340–278 BCE), the subject and purported author of the poems of the Han period compilation Chuci (Songs of Chu). Qu Yuan, faced with the decline of society past the point of reformation, went into exile in the distant wilds, composing his laments including the famous poem Li Sao (compiled in the Chuci), and eventually committing suicide by drowning himself in the river as a final act of righteous protest (see Berkowitz 1992; Schneider 1980).

Wang Fu’s Qianfulun is in part a revival of the approach of Confucian disengagement, offering a solution to the tension between social concern and personal virtue. Early Confucians, hundreds of years before Wang Fu’s time, stressed the importance of strong commitment to the development and moral rectification of society as a whole. The morally developed person, according to these thinkers, has a commitment to the community that is not contingent on the goodness of the community. This must be the case for all of the communities that one is part of and that make up vital facts about who one is—the state, the village, the family. One cannot abandon or turn one’s back on a corrupt or vicious family, but instead must put their effort into trying to rectify this community. To do less than this would be a failure of one’s humanity. We find many passages in the early texts committing to such a view (for example Analects 4.18). At the same time, we find an alternative response developed in these same texts, including the Analects (8.13; 15.6) and Xunzi (32.7). The committed and morally developed person has a responsibility to take an active role in the community when the times (shi 時) are such that either the moral way prevails or it is possible that one can bring it about. But when the times are such that the moral way is abandoned and it is impossible to bring it about, the morally developed person should stay away from taking an active role, lest they become morally soiled.

In the late Han, the theme of disengagement and reclusion due to morally corrupted government, which had been popular in the Warring States but had declined through the years of the earlier Western and Eastern Han, was revived, with thinkers like Wang Fu at the forefront of this movement. Wang Fu’s advocacy of retreat from society is, like those of the Confucian recluses of the past, ultimately aimed at restoring virtue to society. Wang recognized that when a community passes a certain threshold of viciousness and disorder, it is not possible for the individual to transform it. The only possible outcome in such a case, if the individual engages with the society, is for the individual to be transformed, to become vicious and disordered like the community. Despite the loftiest intentions and the most developed character, one cannot withstand the transformative power of the community. Thus, remaining within a corrupt community with the intention of changing it would lead only to the corruption of the individual rather than the moral salvation of the community.

Wang Fu’s response is to advocate continuation of the work of attempting to morally rectify the community, from the outside, through such activity as scholarship and writing. Even if this is for the benefit of future generations rather than one’s own, one’s responsibility to the community and commitment to it should not diminish even when one is forced to withdraw from society due to its viciousness. While the theme of Confucian reclusion is perhaps the most important aspect of Wang Fu’s work, we find a number of other standard Confucian ideas developed in the Qianfulun, including views on rulership, virtues, learning, ritual, and even some further development of the correlative metaphysics of the earlier Han.

3.5 Philosophy of Language: Xu Gan on Name and Actuality

Xu Gan (170–217 CE) might be considered the last major philosophical figure of the Han period. He was one of a group of scholars active in during the Jian An reign period (196–220 CE) in the late Han, during which the Han emperor was a mere puppet and figurehead, and the region was torn in warfare between competing warlords such as the famous Cao Cao (whose son would establish the Wei state in 220 CE), Liu Bei (who established a new state also named Han, today referred to as Shu Han, in the same year), and Sun Quan (who founded the state of Wu). Known as the “Three Kingdoms”, these states would vie for supremacy for almost a century, until the reunification by the Jin Dynasty in 280 CE. This was one of the most famous periods of Chinese history, immortalized by the fourteenth century CE writer Luo Guanzhong’s classic novel Sanguo Yanyi (“Romance of the Three Kingdoms”). Xu Gan was one of the scholars known as the “Seven Masters of Jian An”. Five of the seven died in the plague of 217 CE, including Xu Gan, only 47 years old at the time.

While he was concerned with many of the standard Confucian issues, such as the efficacy of ritual, the need for moral self-cultivation, and creating proper moral motivation (among others), his most unique contribution was in the area of language, particularly in the consideration of the connection between language, reality, and moral behavior. Xu followed the kind of critical evaluative methodology developed by philosophers such as Huan Tan and Wang Chong. A number of the essays of his major work, Zhonglun (Discourses Hitting the Mark), focus on criticisms of common views and practices Xu saw as ultimately harmful to the individual and society, such as “disputing” without aiming at truth. In a passage reminiscent of Wang Chong, in his chapter Hebian (“An Examination of Disputation”), Xu writes:

What the vulgar person calls “disputation” is not disputation at all. That he should call it disputation, though it is not, is probably because he has heard the name “disputation” but does not know its actuality. Accordingly, we regard this as preposterous. The person who is commonly referred to as “disputer” is, in fact, a glib person. The glib person readily embellishes the tone of his voice and multiplies his retorts, just like the onset of a gale, or the downpour of a rainstorm. Disregarding the inherent rights and wrongs of a situation, and not understanding the principles of truth and distortion, he fixes it so that he is never at a loss for words and works at securing certain victory. […] Disputation is about persuading people in their hearts; it is not about verbal submission. Hence disputation is to articulate distinctions, and also to separate and distinguish different categories of affairs skillfully, so as to arrange them clearly. Disputation does not mean being quick-witted in one’s words and speech to talk over people’s heads. (Zhonglun 8.1, Makeham [trans] 2002: xxiv–xxv)

Xu’s theory of the connection between names (ming) and actualities (shi) drew on but further developed earlier views of the efficacy of language in moral development. Names, or terms, should be applied to things in particular ways that suggest proper uses. We can improperly apply names when we apply them not with the aim of communal harmony or individual moral instruction, but with the aim of advancing our own reputations or selfish interest. When we use names in these unsatisfactory ways, this reduces their efficacy in creating the kinds of motivational effect that is the fundamental use of names. The key in using names correctly is to ensure that names are tied to the actualities with which these names are associated. Xu describes the connection between name and actuality:

A name is that which is used to name an actuality. When an actuality has been established, its name follows after it; it is not the case that a name is established and then its actuality follows after it. Thus if a long shape is established, then it will be named “long”, and if a short shape is established, it will be named “short”. It is not the case that the names “long” and “short” are first established and then the long and short shapes follow after them. That which Confucius valued were those “names” which truly name actualities. In so valuing names, he thereby valued actualities. Names are tied to actualities just as plants are tied to the seasons. In the spring, plants blossom into flower; in summer, they are covered in leaves; in autumn, their foliage withers and falls; and in winter, they bear fruit. This is not acting for a specific purpose and yet the plant completes itself. If a plant is forced, its natural tendencies will be harmed. It is the same with names. Hence, false name makers are all those who would harm names. People are aware only of the good that is done by names and are ignorant of the bad that is done by false name makers. (Zhonglun 11.5, Makeham [trans.] 2002: 149–150)

Actualities (shi 實), for Xu Gan, are independent of human activity and “established” (li 立) by the world itself. John Makeham defines Xu Gan’s conception of actuality as

a state of development peculiar to an entity or state of affairs by virtue of which that entity or state of affairs is what it is. (Makeham 1994: 27)

A name or term is attached naturally to this—while our language is in some sense conventional, actualities are described by particular names independently of the way we accord these names to objects. Xu’s example in the above passage of “long” demonstrates this. When we describe a particular object as “long”, we use an already existent term, with an independent meaning, to describe a particular actuality. The connection between this name and the actuality of an object is determined independently of our determination. We can choose to correctly use the term “long” to describe the object or incorrectly use the term “short”, but the latter term does not match the actuality of the long object (setting aside here the issue of the issue of the conventional or comparison-relative nature of concepts such as long and short). A name, according to Xu, follows or it attached naturally to a particular actuality, and to improperly use a name (to call the long thing “short”, for example) is to damage the nature (xing 性) of that name. Its nature is damaged due to improper associations based on incorrect use. When we use the term “short” to describe things that are long, this throws people into confusion concerning the term “short” as well as the term “long”. We can no longer clearly describe the actualities of things, because of the obfuscation of associations. Using the term “short” will after time become unable to express the actuality, as its application to things without the actuality corresponding to the name will become part of the accepted or expected usage of the name, and the name will lose its proper meaning. “Short” will come to mean “long” to some, “short” to others, and “an open question as to long or short” to many as well.

For Xu, as for Confucians more generally, creating confusion concerning names is most harmful because it impedes the process of moral cultivation and maintenance of social harmony. One important source of incorrect use of names is disputation by those seeking to gain a name for themselves rather than seeking the truth. When one’s goal is simply to look better than others in disputation, respecting the connection between names and actualities is not important. Those whose focus is on disputation for this reason are dangerous. Proper disputation, according to Xu, aims to attain truth so as to achieve individual and social moral development. Xu writes:

The glib person readily embellishes the tone of his voice and multiplies his retorts, just like the onset of a gale, or the downpour of a rainstorm. Disregarding the inherent rights and wrongs of a situation, and not understanding the principles of truth and distortion, he fixes it so that he is never at a loss for words and works at securing certain victory. […] The words used in disputation should be terse and to the point, unconvoluted and informative. The tempo of their delivery needs to be modulated so that they do not transgress the ritual teachings and their import should serve as a worthy complement to those teachings. (Zhonglun 8,1. Makeham [trans] 2002: 99–100)

Instead of looking to further one’s reputation by means of duplicitous application of names and thus reducing the efficacy and meaning of names, one should strive to cultivate virtue (de 德), which is the actuality of the exemplary person (junzi 君子). With the elevation of one’s actuality, both reputation and authority will increase naturally (as moral influence is gained with name and fame).

As with previous Confucian thinkers, Xu recognizes that those who are authentically virtuous are not always successful. Indeed, he thinks that the situation in the Eastern Han is such that those with the highest positions are far from virtuous. He explains this in the standard Confucian way by explaining that the times (shi) make a difference, and that even the most virtuous scholar will not meet with fortune if encountering the wrong time. What constitutes the time (shi) is a matter of communal habits, beliefs, quality of rulership, and natural state. If one is born into a time of decay in a state, with weak and unvirtuous leadership, disasters like drought, and communal apathy, then one will likely not advance to a high state of reputation, even with the highest virtue. This is a situation that Confucians from the earliest times worried about, and we see it discussed in all of the thinkers mentioned here from the Eastern Han as well. Echoing Wang Fu, however, Xu Gan holds that if the times are such that the virtuous person cannot thrive in society, one should abandon society and focus on developing his own qualities (Makeham 1994: xii).

Xu Gan uses the structure of ben-mo 本末 (roots and branches) developed in earlier Han texts such as the Huainanzi to explain the relationship between virtue (de 德) and human arts (yi 藝). He reverses what we see in thought of Jia Yi, who takes virtue to be an adornment and guide for governing. Xu argues that the arts (including ritual and even presumably governing) cannot be perfected without virtue. At the same time, he asserts that virtue also cannot be completed (cheng 成) without the arts. The two are interdependent (Zhonglun 7.1).

One aspect of Xu Gan’s thought which have led some to declare him (and some similar Han thinkers) as a “Legalist” (fajia 法家) philosopher is his endorsement of the view that timely and consistent reward and punishment are essential tools for governing, shared by Warring States legalist thinkers such as Han Feizi, Shang Yang, and Shen Buhai (Makeham 1994: 264, Zhonglun 19). While, as I mention above, school categories are of limited use in categorizing Eastern Han thinkers, Xu certainly has much more in common with early Confucians than with Warring States Legalists, even though it becomes more popular in the Eastern Han to adopt the Legalist position concerning reward and punishment.

4. The Transition to Three Kingdoms and Wei-Jin

Toward the end of the Eastern Han Dynasty and into the fractious “Three Kingdoms” period, a commentarial and collective scholarly literature surrounding Confucius (rather than later exponents of the tradition such as Mengzi or Xunzi) became popular. A number of volumes emerged that collected (and added) stories about Confucius and extant sayings purported to be of Confucius, from a number of earlier sources. Two of these volumes, the Kongzi Jiayu (Discussions of the Confucius School) and Kong Congzi (Collected Sayings of Confucius) were compiled just after the end of the Han Dynasty, during the revolts of the Three Kingdoms period, by the Cao Wei court scholar Wang Su (195–256 CE). This compilation was part of a general concern with and debate surrounding commentaries on the classics. It became common in the modern period to dismiss Wang Su’s collections as “forgeries”, but this makes little sense, given that Wang’s compilations drew together passages from a host of other well-known sources. The commentarial tradition on such texts as the Analects and Laozi took hold in the Han, with one of the most famous commentarial collections, the Lunyu Jijie (“Collected Explanations of the Analects”) produced by a team of Cao Wei scholars associated with He Yan, who played a major role in the development of the Xuanxue (Neo-Daoist) movement in the Wei-Jin period.

A number of other important texts dealing with philosophically important topics were written or compiled in the Han as well. The etymological dictionary Shuowen Jiezi of Xu Shen (58–147 CE) had a major influence on later understandings of important philosophical terms, despite its sometimes fanciful and questionable etymologies, and is still consulted today. The Baihutong Delun, an account of an important council held in 58 CE, was compiled by Ban Gu, brother of Ban Zhao and the primary author of the Han Shu (Book of the Han). In addition, it is in the Eastern Han that we see the first references to Buddhism, a religious and philosophical tradition that would come to play an enormous role throughout the rest of Chinese history. Though knowledge of Buddhist teachings seems to have been relatively limited at the time, we find references to the Buddha as a seemingly Daoist-like figure. In the minister Xiang Kai’s (d. 184 CE) memorial to Emperor Huan in 166 CE, recorded in the Hou Han Shu, we find one of the earliest references to Buddhism. Discussing an image of the Buddha found in the palace, Xiang gives a brief account of Buddhist views and links them with the Huang-Lao teachings, focusing on emptiness, eliminating desires, and “non-forced action” (wu wei 無為).

Moving into the Three Kingdoms and the Wei and Jin periods, we see the rise of Buddhist thought (and philosophy) in China and the development of “religious Daoism”, as personal and individual concerns start to take central stage, over the communal and political concerns that had been central to earlier periods of Chinese history. The reasons for this shift are not altogether clear, but one plausible story is that the breakdown of Han government and the roots of the shift to the internal with its roots in Eastern Han withdrawal and culminating in Xuanxue thought of figures like Guo Xiang (252–312 CE) and Wang Bi (226–249 CE) are partly responsible for this shift (Holcombe 1994: 87–90). Many of the concerns and themes of Eastern Han endure throughout the history of Chinese thought. Particularly, the conflict between individual retirement from worldly concerns (in either Confucian or Buddhist mode) and the duty to engage in the social project, as well as eremeticism as a form of protest, remain major features of Chinese intellectual life down to the current day.


Primary Texts Cited

All citations of Chinese texts follow the Chinese Text Project (CTP) ( numbering. Note that translations of Chinese material are included in the Works Cited list where available. Translations are cited by name, CTP numbering, translator and year. While the texts here are broken into Pre-Han, Han, and Post-Han categories, for some of these texts dating is difficult and controversial. The categorization here is based on traditionally accepted dating.

Pre-Han Texts

Han Texts

  • Xinyu (New Discussions), Lu Jia.
  • Xinshu (New Writings), Jia Yi.
  • Chunqiu Fanlu (Luxuriant Dew of the “Spring and Autumn”), traditionally attributed to Dong Zhongshu.
  • Huainanzi, commissioned by Liu An.
  • Fayan (Model Sayings), Yang Xiong.
  • Taixuanjing (Classic of Supreme Mystery), Yang Xiong.
  • Xinlun (New Discourses), Huan Tan
  • Lunheng (Balanced Discourses), Wang Chong.
  • Nüjie (Instructions for Women), Ban Zhao
  • Qianfulun (Discourses of a Hermit), Wang Fu.
  • Zhonglun (Discourses Hitting the Mark), Xu Gan.
  • Kongzi Jiayu (Discussions of the Confucius School), Wang Su.
  • Kong Congzi (Collected Sayings of Confucius), Wang Su.
  • Lunyu Jijie (Collected Explanations of the Analects), He Yan (ed.)
  • Shuowen Jiezi (Explanation of Written Characters), Xu Shen (ed.).
  • Baihutong Delun (Virtuous Discussions at the White Tiger Hall), compiled by Ban Gu.
  • Yantielun (Salt and Iron Discourses), Huan Kuan.
  • Han Shu (Book of the Han), Ban Gu.
  • Huangdi Neijing (Internal Classic of the Yellow Emperor).
  • Lienü Zhuan (Biographies of Exemplary Women), compiled by Liu Xiang.

Post-Han Texts

  • Hongming Ji (Collection for the Expansion and Clarification [of Buddhism]), Sengyou
  • Hou Han Shu (Book of the Later Han), Fan Ye.
  • Sanguo Yanyi (Romance of the Three Kingdoms), Luo Guanzhong.

Further Readings on Han Philosophy

  • Czikszentmihalyi, Mark (ed./trans.), 2006, Readings in Han Chinese Thought, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
  • Fung Yu-Lan [Feng Youlan], 1931–1934 [1983], 中國哲學史 Zhongguo zhexue shi, Shanghai: Commercial Press. Translated as A History of Chinese Philosophy, two volumes, Derk Bodde (trans.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1952–1953, paperback reprinting 1983.
  • Ing, Michael D. K., 2016, “Philosophy in Western Han Dynasty China (206 BCE–9 CE): Philosophy in Western Han Dynasty China”, Philosophy Compass, 11(6): 289–304. doi:10.1111/phc3.12326
  • McLeod, Alexus, 2015, “Philosophy in Eastern Han Dynasty China (25–220 CE): Eastern Han Philosophy”, Philosophy Compass, 10(6): 355–368. doi:10.1111/phc3.12209
  • Xu Fuguan, 1972–1978, 兩漢思想史 Liang han sixiang shi (History of the Philosophy of the Two Han Dynasties), 3 volumes, Taibei Shi: Taiwan xue sheng shu ju,
  • Zhou Guidian, 2006, 秦漢哲學· Qin han zhexue (Qin and Han Philosophy), Wuhan: Wuhan chubanshe.

Works Cited

  • Berkowitz, Alan J., 1992, “The Moral Hero: A Pattern of Reclusion in Traditional China”, Monumenta Serica, 40: 1–32. doi:10.1080/02549948.1992.11731227
  • Chen, L. K. and Hiu Chuk Winnie Sung, 2015, “The Doctrines and Transformation of the Huang-Lao Tradition”, in Liu 2015: 241–264. doi:10.1007/978-90-481-2927-0_10
  • Didier, John C., 2009, In and Outside the Square: The Sky and the Power of Belief in Ancient China and the World, c. 4500 BC – AD 200, 3 volumes, Sino-Platonic Papers 192. [Didier 2009 available online]
  • Durrant, Stephen and Wai-yee Li (trans), 2017, Zuo Tradition/ Zuozhuan: Commentary on the “Spring and Autumn Annals”, Seattle, WA: University of Washington Press.
  • Forke, Alfred (trans.), 1907, Lun Heng: Philosophical Essays of Wang Ch’ung, Leipzig: Otto Harrassowitz.
  • Goldin, Paul Rakita, 1999, “Insidious Syncretism in the Political Philosophy of Huai‐nan‐tzu”, Asian Philosophy, 9(3): 165–191. doi:10.1080/09552369908575498
  • Goldin, Paul and Elisa Levi Sabattini (trans), 2020, Lu Jia’s “New Discourses”: A Political Manifesto from the Early Han Dynasty, Leiden: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004419889
  • Graham, Angus, 1991, “Reflections and Replies”, in Chinese Texts and Philosophical Contexts: Essays Dedicated to Angus C. Graham, Henry Rosemont, Jr (ed.), La Salle, IL: Open Court, 267–322.
  • Holcombe, Charles, 1994, In the Shadow of the Han: Literati Thought and Society at the Beginning of the Southern Dynasties, Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.
  • Hunter, Michael, 2018, “The Lunyu as a Western Han Text”, in Confucius and the Analects Revisited, Michael Hunter and Martin Kern (eds), Leiden: Brill, 67–91 (ch. 3).
  • Klein, Esther, 2010, “Were There ‘Inner Chapters’ in the Warring States?” T’oung Pao, 96(4): 299–369. doi:10.1163/156853210X546509
  • Klein, Esther Sunkyung and Colin Klein, 2016, “Wang Chong’s Epistemology of Testimony”, Asia Major, 29(2): 115–146.
  • Lewis, Mark Edward, 2010, The Early Chinese Empires: Qin and Han, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Liu, Xiaogan (ed.), 2015, Dao Companion to Daoist Philosophy, (Dao Companions to Chinese Philosophy 6), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands. doi:10.1007/978-90-481-2927-0
  • Loewe, Michael, 2011, Dong Zhongshu, a ‘Confucian’ Heritage and the Chunqiu Fanlu, Leiden: Brill.
  • Loewe, Michael and Denis Twitchett (eds), 1986, The Cambridge History of China, Volume 1: The Ch’in and Han Empires, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521243278
  • Major, John S., 1993, Heaven and Earth in Early Han Thought: Chapters Three, Four, and Five of the Huainanzi, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Major, John S., Sarah A. Queen, Andrew Seth Meyer, and Harold D. Roth (trans), 2010, The Huainanzi: A Guide to the Theory and Practice of Government in Early Han China, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Makeham, John, 1994, Name and Actuality in Early Chinese Thought, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • ––– (trans.), 2002, Balanced Discourses: A Bilingual Edition, by Xu Gan, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • –––, 2003, Transmitters and Creators: Chinese Commentators and Commentaries on the Analects, (Harvard East Asian monographs 228), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Asia Center.
  • McLeod, Alexus, 2018, The Philosophical Thought of Wang Chong, London: Palgrave Macmillan. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-95291-8
  • –––, 2020, “Wang Chong’s View of Ziran and Its Influence on Wang Bi and Guo Xiang”, in Dao Companion to Xuanxue 玄學 (Neo-Daoism), David Chai (ed.), (Dao Companions to Chinese Philosophy 14), New York: Springer International Publishing, 149–163. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-49228-1_8
  • –––, 2021, The Dao of Madness: Mental Illness and Self-Cultivation in Early Chinese Philosophy and Medicine, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Murray, Judson, 2004, “A Study of ‘Yao Lue’ 要略, ‘A Sumary of the Essentials’: The Huainanzi 淮南子 from the Point of View of the Postface”, Early China, 29: 45–109. doi:10.1017/S0362502800007094
  • Nylan, Michael, 2013, Exemplary Figures/Fayan, Seattle, WA: University of Washington Press.
  • –––, 2014, Canon of Supreme Mystery: A Translation With Commentary of the T’ai Hsuan Ching, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Pang-White, Ann A. (trans.), 2018, The Confucian “Four Books for Women”: A New Translation of the Nü Sishu and the Commentary of Wang Xiang, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pokora, Timoteus (trans.), 1975, Hsin-lun (New Treatise), and Other Writings by Huan Tan (43 BC–28 AD), Ann Arbor, MI: Center for Chinese Studies, University of Michigan.
  • Queen, Sarah A. and John S. Major (trans), 2016, Luxuriant Gems of the Spring and Autumn, New York: Columbia University Press, 2016.
  • Roth, Harold D., 2015, “Huainanzi: The Pinnacle of Classical Daoist Syncretism”, in Liu 2015: 341–365. doi:10.1007/978-90-481-2927-0_15
  • Sanft, Charles, 2005, Rule: A Study of Jia Yi’s “Xin shu”, PhD Dissertation, University of Münster.
  • –––, 2016, “Jia Yi on the Management of the Populace”, Asia Major, 29(2): 47–71.
  • Schneider, Laurence, 1980, A Madman of Ch’u: The Chinese Myth of Loyalty and Dissent, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • Slingerland, Edward, 2019, Mind and Body in Early China: Beyond Orientalism and the Myth of Holism, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780190842307.001.0001
  • Song, Yunwoo, 2020, “Wang Chong’s Fatalism”, Early China, 43: 285–310. doi:10.1017/eac.2020.7
  • Unschuld, Paul U. and Hermann Tessenow (trans), 2011, Huang Di Nei Jing Su Wen: An Annotated Translation of Huang Di’s Inner Classic—Basic Questions, 2 volumes, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • Vankeerberghen, Griet, 2001, The Huainanzi and Liu An’s Claim to Moral Authority, Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 2001.
  • Zhao, Dingxin, 2015, The Confucian-Legalist State: A New Theory of Chinese History, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199351732.001.0001

Other Internet Resources

  • Han Dynasty 漢 (206 BCE – 200 CE), Ulrich Theobald (Tübingen). Part of the site; an overview of the Han period with links to discussions of Han philosophy and other areas of thought, as well as specific texts and thinkers.
  • Traditions of Exemplary Women: Liu Xiang’s Lienü Zhuan, Anne Behnke Kinney (Virginia); collection of texts related to the Lienü Zhuan.
  • Chinese Text Project, Donald Sturgeon (Durham); collection of important pre-modern Chinese texts online; includes a host of Han texts and other texts in Classical Chinese, with hyperlinked dictionary and citation information, and English translation for certain texts.
  • Philosophy and Religion, Internet Guide for Chinese Studies, Hanno Lecher (Heidelberg); contains links to a number of important sites on Chinese philosophy and religion broadly, despite having last been updated in 2008.

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