First published Mon Nov 15, 2004; substantive revision Sat Mar 27, 2021

For the purposes of this entry an idiolect is a language the linguistic (i. e. syntactic, phonological, referential, etc.) properties of which can be exhaustively specified in terms of the intrinsic properties of some single individual, the person whose idiolect it is. The force of “intrinsic” is to exclude essential reference to features of the person’s wider environment, and in particular to their linguistic community.

Some hold that idiolects in this sense do not exist or that the notion is useless or incoherent, but are nonetheless happy to use the word “idiolect” to describe a person’s partial grasp of, or their pattern of deviance from, a language that is irreducibly social in nature. The substantial debate, here, is not over how to define a word. It turns, rather, on whether an idiolectal perspective on language is to be preferred to a non-idiolectal one. Someone taking an idiolectal perspective on language treats idiolects (in something like the first sense) as having ontological or investigative priority over social languages, conceiving of the latter as nothing but more-or-less overlapping idiolects. Someone taking a non-idiolectal perspective will see social languages as ontologically distinct from and prior to the individual idiolects of those who speak them. At issue, then, is what we should take languages to be.

The terms of the debate are not quite as simple as this implies. There is scope, for example, for a spectrum of views. Perhaps we should be idiolectal when thinking about language acquisition but not when thinking about the reference of proper names. Perhaps too we should recognize two kinds of linguistic content, only one of which—narrow content—is best thought of in idiolectal terms. Moreover, even someone taking a strongly idiolectal stance will want to qualify the definition of “idiolect” given above—by tying its properties to a person at a specified time, in a specified social setting, or on a specified occasion, for example, or by treating the idiolect as belonging not to a concrete individual speaker, replete with a suite of performance errors, but to a person who is in some respects an idealization and an abstraction.

Several important debates feature talk of languages that are more idiolectal than social. Some are considered in detail in other entries (see the entries on the language of thought hypothesis, private language, and externalism about mental content). This entry will concentrate instead on one extremely influential non-idiolectal view (Lewis’s account of languages as conventions, Section 2, which also discusses Davidson’s anti-conventionalism) and one extremely influential idiolectal view (Chomsky’s notion of an I-language, Section 3). The entry begins in Section 1 with some general remarks about the ontology of languages.

1. Language Ontology

1.1 Idiolects versus Social Languages

Key to the distinction between an idiolect and a social language is the fact that the same natural language, L, can be picked out in either of two ways: L as the language with specified linguistic (semantic, syntactic, phonological, etc.) properties, or L as the language possessed (spoken, etc.) by a specific individual or population. French, for example, is the language containing an adjective, rouge, that refers to the color red and in its spoken form begins with a voiced uvular fricative, etc. But French is also the first language of most residents of France, the lingua franca of Côte d’Ivoire, the medium in which Simone de Beauvoir wrote, spoke, and thought, etc.

There is no limit to the number of languages we could conjure up in the abstract using the first mode of individuation. But only a small number of these abstract objects will be realized in the sense of being describable in the second mode—as possessed, known, spoken, understood, or in some other respect used by some individual or population. If we pick out a language as the language of some individual, and believe we can specify its properties by reference to the intrinsic properties of that individual, then we are picking out an idiolect. If on the contrary we either specify it by reference to a community, or specify it by reference to an individual but can only determine its properties by looking to their wider social environment (identifying salient linguistic authorities, for example), then we are picking out a social language.

Language theorists have varying conceptions of what it is for a language to be realized. For David Lewis, a language in the abstract (which for him amounts to a pairing of sentences and meanings) is realized in a population when it describes a convention governing their behaviour, in the specific sense summarized in Section 2. Lewis, then, takes a non-idiolectal perspective. For Noam Chomsky, in contrast, a language is realized in an individual if it is “represented” in that individual’s “language faculty”, a component of their brain. The goal of linguists working in the Chomskian tradition is to make what is represented explicit in the form of a theory, a grammar, for that individual. This, then, is an idiolectal perspective. There is a twist, however. The brain properties that most interest Chomsky are species-wide rather than unique to any individual, so the “individual” is essentially the product of an idealization, useful for helping us to understand linguistic competence, a human biological trait. Still, we can persist in calling this an idiolectal perspective in that it eschews any essential role for languages of discrete linguistic communities.

1.2 The Case against English and Other Folk Languages

The folk, and plenty of self-proclaimed experts, tend to operate with an ontology of social languages that most linguists reject. This folk ontology includes English, Hungarian, Tagalog, Old Norse, etc., and commitment to this ontology has real-world effects, which politicians are sensitive to and which sociolinguists can study. But the objects themselves, as opposed to the folk’s beliefs in and about them, are generally regarded, by linguists anyway, as fictional or ideological. Although linguists will inevitably talk of “Hungarian” and the like, they tend to take themselves as using a convenient shorthand for “the idiolect of some typical inhabitant of Hungary”.

Grounds for rejecting folk ontologies of language vary. Some argue that specifying a folk language’s properties is, unavoidably, a prescriptive (and so unscientific) exercise. An example sometimes used to illustrate this charge is the meaning of English word “livid”. Most dictionaries give its meanings as “bluish” or “pale”, in deference to its complex etymology. Most English speakers lean towards thinking it means red, after the idiomatic expression “livid with rage” and the belief that rage makes a person red. Similarly, and to the consternation of many who claim to know what English really is, English speakers regularly split infinitives, and see the use of “hopefully” in (1) as no less acceptable than its use in (2), despite being a “Germanism”.

Hopefully, all the passengers will escape by helicopter.
The passengers looked hopefully at the helicopter.

The problem with these and similar judgements (Crystal 2007 recounts their history in the case of English) is not that they are obnoxiously conservative, a tool for social exclusion. Often they don’t play this role. Some dictionaries now include red as a possible meaning of “livid”, for example, but this, too, is a normative stance and it is normativity, not conservativism in particular, that is incompatible with a scientific stance. Even liberal views on linguistic acceptability (e.g., that it is okay to end sentences with a preposition) are prescriptions. In so far as such normativity is unavoidable in the determination of the properties of English and other languages in the folk ontology, these languages have no place in science (save as a fictional object for sociological investigation—because belief in the fiction has social effects—or as a useful shorthand).

A distinct but related case against the folk ontology is that the delineation of a population as speakers of a single language is invariably driven by geo-political considerations. Serbo-Croatian and the Czechoslovak languages endured only as long as nationalist politics required them to, and ceased to be almost overnight, without any major change in how people spoke. Some dialects of the Netherlands are closer in their characteristics to dialects in neighboring Germany than they are to dialects spoken on the Netherlands coast, despite being grouped with the latter but not the former as variants of the same language, Dutch. The concern here is not well captured in the observation that languages in the folk sense are fuzzy. The special sciences are replete with fuzziness. Rather, the individuation conditions seem arbitrary from a linguistic perspective. The same arguments against languages in the folk sense apply at the level of dialects in the folk sense. Cockneys, and hence speakers of the cockney dialect, are traditionally required to have been born within earshot of the bells of Bow Church in east London, but noise pollution and demographic change have rendered that definition absurd. No matter how fine-grained a version of the folk ontology one seeks out, similar problems will recur.

Ruling out folk-ontological languages does not necessarily push us into an idiolectal direction. Nothing said so far speaks against the possibility of technical notions of a social language that side-step the normativity or arbitrariness built into their folksy cousins (assuming such side-stepping is indeed needed). Lewis’s account of language as a convention is, arguably, in this category.

2. The Debate over the Conventionality of Language

2.1 Language Use as a Convention: the Basic View

Lewis’s (1975) take on human languages results from his attempt to solve an apparent paradox. On the one hand, languages are functions from sentences to meanings, and a theory of meaning for any language will describe such functions. On the other hand, a natural language is a social practice followed by a given population. It seems that languages (simpliciter) and natural languages belong to deeply different categories, raising the puzzle of how the two might be related. One difference is that there are indefinitely many languages, but the great majority are not even potentially natural languages. They could not be learned, acquired, or deployed by humans because they have an infinite lexicon, for example, or infinitely many rules of composition, or allow for an unlimited embedding of subordinate sentences. Another difference is that languages are abstract objects while a natural language appears to be a concrete thing that, by definition, is learned, acquired, and developed by members of a specific human population.

Lewis claims that we can incorporate both perspectives within a single view. Natural languages, he says, are a proper subset of the set of languages. More specifically, a natural language is a function L from sentences to meanings that a particular population uses, where this use of L is governed by a convention of “truthfulness and trust in L”. To understand this proposal, we need to understand (a) Lewis’s conception of the motive a population might have to use L, (b) what he means by “convention”, and (c) how he thinks a language—a function from sentences to meanings—could figure within a convention thus understood.

(a) At the most general level, members of any population often want the others to think and act in a particular way. This requires them to recognize each other’s intentions, share thoughts, and to act accordingly. Members of the population must therefore find a way to display their intentions, etc., and, in equal measure, to recognize the intentions, etc., of others. Using the same language (i.e., the same function from sentences to meanings) to convey their mental states offers an excellent way of meeting this need. It gives members of the population a way to “control others’ beliefs and actions to some extent by means of sounds and marks” (Lewis 1975: 166). Lewis explains how they do this—and in particular how they settle on the same language—by invoking his general notion of a convention.

(b) A convention is a practice that solves a coordination problem within a community. The solution will bring mutual benefits but it will also be arbitrary. For example, the practice in North America of driving on the right is a convention in this sense: it is a mutually beneficial practice, but at least one other solution to the problem of avoiding head-on collisions is available: driving on the left. Natural languages (i.e., the use of languages by populations along the lines described in (a)) seem to be conventions in this simple sense. The existence of shared meanings within a community is clearly of mutual benefit, as evidenced, for example, by the use of English among English-speaking populations. It allows members of a population to learn one another’s thoughts about the world, for example. But there are many other solutions to the problem of finding out one another’s thoughts about the world, such as using Spanish or Japanese, so the choice is arbitrary.

Moving beyond this simple account of conventionality, Lewis tells us that a convention in his sense is a regularity R in action (driving on the left, for example) or in belief within a population P for which the following six conditions nearly always hold:

  1. Everyone conforms to R.
  2. Everyone believes the others conform to R.
  3. The belief in (2) gives each believer a (practical or epistemic) reason to conform to R.
  4. General conformity is generally preferred to slightly-less-than-general conformity.
  5. R is not the only regularity that could satisfy (3) and (4).
  6. (1)–(5) are known matters of mutual knowledge: they are known to everyone, and it is known that they are known to everyone, and so on.

(2) and (3) jointly predict that R perpetuates itself within the community (as in (1)), despite being (according to (5)) arbitrarily chosen. A convention is stable within a community because it is rational for each member of the community to abide by it. (The convention entry goes into more detail.)

(c) How could the use of a language in Lewis’s sense (a function pairing sentences with meanings) be a convention in his sense, i.e., a regularity satisfying conditions (1) to (6)? Lewis’s answer is that the regularity, the R, is the practice of being truthful and trusting in a language, L. When this practice is a convention in a community, L is the community’s language. To be truthful in L is to utter a sentence only if one believes that what it means in L holds. To be trusting in L is to believe whatever is meant in L by the sentences one hears uttered. Together, these conventions give rise to a basic two-way cooperation, with speakers being truthful and hearers being trusting. Without this two-way coordination the coordination problem would be difficult (if not impossible) to solve. If speakers are not truthful, what they say is not trustworthy evidence of what they think. If hearers are not trusting, what speakers say is not useful to get hearers to believe and act in the intended manner.

Putting this together with the six conditions that define what it is to be a convention, a language L is the natural language of a given community when the following six conditions hold, at least to a significant degree:

  1. Everyone is truthful and trusting in L.
  2. Everyone believes the others are truthful and trusting in L.
  3. The belief in (2) gives each a reason to be truthful and trusting in L.
  4. General conformity to truthfulness and trustfulness in L is generally preferred to slightly-less-than-general conformity.
  5. L is not the only language that could satisfy (3) and (4).
  6. (1)–(5) are known matters of mutual knowledge: they are known to everyone, and it is known that they are known to everyone, and so on.

2.2 Further Important Aspects of the Lewisian account

Section 2.1 gives the basic vision of natural languages as the embodiment in a population of a convention defined in terms of a language in the abstract sense. There are three further features of Lewis’s view that merit emphasis: his explanation of why natural languages must be compositional, his disclaimer that his account is but an idealization, and the fact that his is a theory of expression meaning rather than of speaker meaning.

For the coordination problem within P to be solved by using L, all members of P must be in a position to determine the meaning of all the sentences of L. In other words, it must be that members of P have a way to identify the function that, for any given sentence, will deliver the corresponding meaning. Given the limitations of speakers, both physical and cognitive, there must be a finite and simple way to do this. The compositionality of L can help explain how this is possible (see entry on compositionality). Roughly put, for L to be compositional is for the meaning of all complex expressions e1en of L to be fully determined by the meaning of their parts and by the way such parts are composed. Thus, the functions that map sentences into their meanings will take into account the meaning of their parts and the way they are combined.

But language use exhibits several problematic features that must be accommodated: indexicality, context sensitivity, ambiguity, etc. To properly account for these features, the relevant meaning functions must take several variables as arguments. It will not be a simple one-to-one mapping from sentence to meaning, but a more complex mapping of a sentence together with a speaker, a time, a world, and what have you, onto a corresponding meaning. Lewis is aware of this, and includes it as part of what L should be like if it is to be used by P. So long as members of P know this about L, and use it while abiding by the conventions of truthfulness and trust, there should be no serious trouble. (To say that speakers know this is not to say that they can, upon request, explicitly describe how it is that L works, but to say that they have implicit knowledge of L, such that they can successfully use L to communicate with and understand other members of P.) Lewis calls the situation of a language’s being realized in this way a “perfect case of normal language use”. That is, it is at best an idealization in need of refinement. Chomsky and Davidson (below) can be thought of as in different ways suggesting that the conceptualization offered here of language and its realization is fundamentally mistaken and not merely a rough draft.

Lewis’s is an account of expression meaning and as such it is sometimes seen as a useful complement to an intention-based account of speaker’s meaning, such as Paul Grice’s. Speaker’s meaning in the Gricean tradition is identified with the effect that, in performing a given utterance, the speaker intends, by means of the audience’s recognition of this very intention, to produce in that audience. The exact form meaning-bestowing intentions take is a matter of debate and not especially relevant here (see entry on Paul Grice). But a theory of individual speaker’s meaning requires, in addition to an accurate statement of the meaning-bestowing intentions, a complementary theory of expression meaning. Only with the latter can we account, first, for the expectation on the part of the speaker that she or he will be interpreted as intended (and some expectation of success is a precondition for the formation of any intention); and second, for the rate of success in audience uptake. Grice originally related expression meaning to speaker’s meaning by suggesting that:

[expression] x means (timeless[ly]) that “so-and-so” might as a first shot be equated with some statement or disjunction of statements about what “people” (vague) intend…to effect by x. (Grice 1957: 385).

Lewis’s convention-based account of expression meaning is generally thought to be a vast improvement on this crude early effort. But equally, Grice’s account of speaker’s meaning gives us something missing from Lewis’s. For there to be a convention of being truthful and trusting in L, there has to be something it is to speak with a particular meaning on an occasion, and Grice’s theory gives us this.

2.3 Against Treating Languages as Conventions

In “A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs”, Donald Davidson argues that languages, if they are “anything like what many philosophers and linguists have supposed”, do not exist (1986: 446). He does not list the philosophers and linguists he has in mind, but somewhere near the centre of the cloud of positions he is criticizing is Lewis’s conventionalist theory.[1] More broadly, he rejects the notion of socially established links between expressions and meanings, shared participation in which enables a community to communicate. Davidson’s article is jargon-rich and so his argument is tricky to unpack. In this statement of it, we begin by explaining his formulation of the view he rejects, then outline his case against the view so formulated.[2]

The view is expressed as the claim that first meaning is shared, systematic, and prepared. To see what he means by “first meaning”, consider Grice’s famous example of a testimonial for an academic job candidate:

Dear Sir, Mr X’s command of English is excellent, and his attendance at tutorials has been regular. Yours, etc. (Grice 1975: 33)

The author’s insinuation—that Mr X is a weak candidate—is arrived at only via a prior interpretation of the expressions as they are used in the utterance. This prior interpretation is the first meaning. The contrast implicit in “first” is with the insinuations or implicatures one subsequently goes on to read into the utterance. Davidson uses “first” meaning in an effort to avoid the terms “literal” or “conventional” meaning because the thought that there is a level of meaning that is somehow determined independently of the communicative act, by linguistic convention, is exactly what he plans to challenge. “First meaning” is to be understood more neutrally as the initial meaning the utterer intends you to ascribe to the uttered expressions in the context of a particular utterance.

On the view Davidson rejects, successful communication happens because this first meaning is shared (i.e., utterer and audience assign the same first meaning), prepared (i.e., it was available to both utterer and audience prior to the utterance) and systematic (i.e., capturable in a compositional theory). All three properties are implicit in the conventionalist supposition that expressions have their meaning specified within the social language from which they are drawn. We might conceptualize this social language as English, or instead as a convention in Lewis’s technical sense. If the latter, the claim Davidson has in his sights is that communication within a given linguistic community is made possible by a (shared, prepared, systematic) convention to be truthful and trusting in some L. Davidson denies that there is any such L.

His argument against first meaning’s being systematic, shared, and prepared emerges from reflection on various linguistic phenomena, all of which have in common that “the speaker expects to be, and is, interpreted as the speaker intended, although the interpreter did not have a correct theory in advance” (1986: 440). Grice’s example does not fit this description. It does not, therefore, threaten the thought that the first meaning (about regular attendance) is the simple product of an antecedently shared compositional theory. Malapropisms, on the other hand do fit the description. Here is the original Mrs Malaprop addressing Captain Absolute in the exchange that gives Davidson’s paper its title:

[I]f I reprehend anything in this world, it is the use of my oracular tongue, and a nice derangement of epitaphs! (Richard Sheridan, The Rivals, Act III, Scene 3)

Captain Absolute manages to figure out the first meaning of Mrs Malaprop’s utterance, which is that if she understands (comprehends) anything it is the use of her own vernacular tongue and a nice arrangement of epithets. Davidson offers an intuitive description of what is going on in this case, a description that applies equally to regular communicative exchange. He then argues that this description of communicative exchange is incompatible with the claim that first meaning is systematic, shared, and prepared—and so conventional.

The intuitive description is couched in terms of prior theories and passing theories of first meaning, defined for an arbitrary utterer S and intended audience H as follows:

H’s prior theory: How H is prepared in advance of S’s utterance to interpret the expressions in it

S’s prior theory: What S believes H’s prior theory to be

S’s passing theory: The theory S intends H to use to interpret the expressions in S’s utterance

H’s passing theory: How H in fact interprets the expressions in S’s utterance

Successful communication at the level of first meaning happens whenever S’s and H’s passing theories coincide, notwithstanding any disagreement in prior theories. Letting S be Mrs. Malaprop and H be Captain Absolute, their prior and passing theories assign meanings to “epitaph” as in the table below:

Meaning of “epitaph” in prior theory epithet epitaph
Meaning of “epitaph” in passing theory epithet epithet

Neither meaning-according-to-prior-theories nor meaning-according-to-passing-theories have all three of the properties required to make them conventional. Specifically:

Prior theories are systematic and prepared, but not shared.

Passing theories are systematic and shared, but not prepared

Davidson anticipates the simple response that two interlocutors “share the same language” if their prior theories overlap closely enough that they can exploit ad hoc strategies for interpretation, such as that used by Captain Absolute and the theatre audience, i.e., searching for a similar sounding word that makes sense of the utterance in context. But these “principles of … inventive accommodation are not themselves reducible to theory, involving as they do nothing less than all our skills at theory construction”. In other words:

Such a capacity, though shared and prepared, is not systematic.

To put the claim as a charge against Lewis in particular: there is no L, no pairing of sentences and meanings, such that communication as it actually occurs is made possible by virtue of a (shared, prepared, systematic) convention to be truthful and trusting in L.

Malapropisms may seem like a marginal phenomenon to be treated as a special case. But Davidson thinks the point generalizes, and that achieving passing-theory agreement involves far more work than participating in a convention. For a start there are plenty of relevantly similar phenomena (metaphor, polysemy, incomplete sentences, unfamiliar names, and performance errors such as slips of the tongue or temporary confusion over whether to use “underestimated” or “overestimated” after “cannot be”). Indeed, even where there is prior-theory agreement, general intelligence and not simply application of a known convention must be exercised by both speaker and audience to appreciate this fact.

2.4 Conventionalist Responses

Davidson’s position, conceived as an objection to Lewis, comes with three separate claims. First, as demonstrated in the case of malapropisms, antecedent knowledge of L prior to a given use may not be enough to reach successful communication, because “prior meanings” may not coincide between speaker and hearer and, thus, antecedent knowledge is not mutual. Second, once the relevant use takes place, mutual knowledge of L is reached, which is enough to achieve communication, but such knowledge is not grasped antecedently. Third, the move from insufficient antecedent knowledge of L to successful communication may happen in virtue of non-linguistic knowledge (i.e., practical reasoning, explanatory reasoning, general knowledge, etc.), but this knowledge is not systematic.

Lewis, it seems, has a way to reply to Davidson’s objection. We will only sketch such a reply here. Recall the central tenets of Lewis’s account. First, languages (all of them, including natural ones) are abstract objects, a function from sentences to meanings. These functions may be as complex as required; they may take as arguments more than just sentences (i.e., occasions of use, times, worlds, speakers, etc.). As with any abstract object, these functions are what they are independently of any convention that may hold among human populations. Second, humans face a coordination problem. To solve it, they use some language or other, some abstract set of functions or other. Third, for the use of an abstract object L to successfully solve the coordination problem among members of a population P, at least two conventions must hold among members of P: the conventions of truthfulness and of trust in L. Finally, it is assumed that members of P know all relevant functions, or have a way to know them, for any possible sentence of L. In short, members of P antecedently know (in some sense) all the relevant sentence-to-meaning functions of L.

Now, Davidson presents us with a case where antecedent knowledge of L is not enough to guarantee communication and, hence, to solve the coordination problem that Lewis has in mind. Yet, there clearly is a way in which speakers manage to solve the coordination problem even in cases of malapropisms. Davidson suggests that this is done in virtue of using non-linguistic knowledge (e.g., using practical reasoning, explanatory reasoning, etc.). To see if such uses of L really constitute a counterexample to Lewis’s position we must ask ourselves if, in solving this coordination problem, speaker and hearer do observe the conventions of truthfulness and trust in L, or if they simply reject them in order to successfully communicate.

A quick glance at Davidson’s example suggests that, even in cases of malapropisms, speaker and hearer do observe the said conventions. Both speaker S and hearer H presuppose that they are using the same language, even though they do not realize that this is not exactly true (i.e., in virtue of having different prior theories they do not share the same prior-L); yet, despite her malapropism, S is still being truthful. H assumes S to be truthful, and so finds a way to reinterpret S by engaging in practical, explanatory, or another form of general reasoning. Thus, we must take H as observing the convention of trust, for otherwise H’s diagnosis of S’s malapropism (together with H’s reinterpretation of S’s original utterances) would be absurd. Furthermore, it seems that something like an assumption of compositionality is also in place, for otherwise it would be strange for H to (so to speak) interpolate the expression “a nice derangement of epitaphs”, which seems to compose its meaning in just the same way as “a nice arrangement of epithets”.

From here a Lewisian reply could follow either one of two strategies. One would be to allow that the account does not extend to malapropisms but treat malapropisms as a special case, an example of a non-purely linguistic phenomenon that, as such, necessarily involves general intelligence. The success of this strategy depends on how generalizable these cases are.

A second strategy would be to revise the theory in order to include general intelligence as a central element. This should not have to be problematic since Lewis’s theory is meant as an idealization. As Lewis notes, general intelligence is already needed to deal with vagueness, indexicality, and other phenomena. Nor would Lewis be alone in claiming this. Some have claimed that “pragmatic determinants of what is said” are at work in every single utterance. (For more on this same theme, see the entries on pragmatics and defaults in semantics and pragmatics.)

This second strategy might itself be developed in two distinct ways, in an effort to show its compatibility with the broad sweep of Lewis’s theory. First, it could be admitted that there is no prior L with respect to which the conventions of truthfulness and trust both hold. The conventions hold, however, with respect to their passing theories. Participants arrive at these passing theories from their (potentially divergent) prior theories plus some general intelligence. Compositionality, moreover, also plays an essential role in the extraction of passing theories from prior theories, with the conventions of truthfulness and trust being observed in the resulting passing L. However, the principle of compositionality would have to be weakened so as to not consider the strictly linguistic process it describes as fully determining meaning, thus leaving room for extra elements to take part. Alternatively, there could be truthfulness and trust in prior L if Lewis’s fine-grained individuation of languages is rejected. On this second version of the theory, one and the same L may sometimes have different sentence-to-meaning mappings; alternatively, it could be claimed that the conventions hold with respect to different common Ls or a set of sufficiently similar such languages.

With appropriate extrapolation, then, Lewis’s main tenets may be perfectly compatible with Davidson’s own description of these supposedly troublesome cases. Even in cases of malapropism, speaker and hearer are trying to solve a coordination problem by using a common language L (i.e., a common passing L, a common open or dynamic L, or a common set of sufficiently similar Ls) in a way that observes the conventions of truthfulness and trust. Of course, Lewis must include some form of general explanatory reasoning, thereby contradicting his apparent assumption that successful uses of L are fully systematic (or compositional). Yet it is worth considering how damaging this would be for Lewis’s account. It seems clear that something like Lewis’s theory (including some appropriately weakened version of his compositionality assumption, such as that developed in García-Ramírez 2019), will be needed.

3. E-Languages versus I-Languages

3.1 Chomsky’s notion of an I-language

The “I-” in “I-language” is short, not for “idiolectal”, but for a cluster words that connote an idiolectal approach and coincidentally begin with the same letter, especially “internal” and “individualistic”.[3] “E-language” is used critically by Chomsky to refer to those things, whatever they are, that are the target of study for those who take languages and their properties to be external to the mind. This includes many philosophers of language. Chomsky’s case for introducing and using the notion of an I-language is, in the end, indistinguishable from his case for a cognitivist approach to the study of language as a natural phenomenon. And his case against E-languages is that there is no scientifically coherent project to which they belong as posits.

3.1.1 The Case For I-languages

Once one sees beyond the technicalities, Lewis’s notion of natural languages approximates to the ordinary notion of languages as things we use to communicate with others in a linguistic community. Chomsky’s notion of a language as an object internal to the human mind or brain can seem odd from this perspective. We can dispel this sense of oddity by appreciating the scientific project from which this usage of “a language” emerges. The fact that a usage fails to mesh with ordinary thinking hardly constitutes an objection to the usage if the project housing it is a good one. Ordinary thinking would struggle to accept mass as one of energy’s possible forms, but this gives physicists no cause to pause.

Chomsky’s project is to work towards a scientifically credible understanding of a natural object, the human brain. More feasibly, his ambition is to make progress on understanding those aspects of the brain that are central to our nature as linguistic beings. A reasonable starting hypothesis for such an inquiry is that a functionally discrete part of the brain, the “language faculty”, is responsible for core elements of our capacity to use language. If this hypothesis is right, other parts of the brain, and plenty that lies outside the brain in our external social and physical environment, may well combine with this language faculty to produce linguistic behaviour; but the inquiry itself is limited to understanding the language faculty itself. This voluntary limitation has a rationale. Our overt behaviour is extraordinarily complex, an intractable interaction effect, so we need to be appropriately modest in our explanatory ambitions. A scientific understanding of the internal workings of the language faculty would in itself be a massive achievement. Linguistic behaviour—the sounds language-users produce, their description of certain constructions as ungrammatical, etc.—can supply defeasible evidence for or against hypotheses we make about the language faculty proper, but we should not treat the description of overt behaviour as the goal of study. (In an earlier incarnation of much the same point, Chomsky distinguished between core competence and the use of that competence manifest in overt performance, arguing that competence is far more promising an object of linguistic inquiry than the latter. He moved away from this terminology after it gave rise to persistent misinterpretations. Competence, for example, has unintended normative connotations—we speak of people as having “poor competence in Spanish”.)

While this captures the sense in which Chomsky is taking an internalist (and individualist) approach to the study of language, it does not yet reveal where the notion of a language, internalized or otherwise, sits within the approach, or why any appeal to languages (with “language” used as a count noun rather than a mass noun) is needed at all. Chomsky’s discussion of language acquisition can provide us with a good illustration of this further step. It will also bring out a revealing contrast with Lewis’s approach (see 2.1).[4]

Lewis, we saw, thinks a language is an arbitrary pairing of sentences and meanings. This arbitrariness is overcome through the co-ordination embodied in a conventional practice, an E-language in Chomsky’s terminology. Chomsky does not deny the existence of some linguistic arbitrariness, manifest in linguistic diversity but he holds that this diversity is limited by human psychology (1995a: 15f). On a “learning” model of language development, which Chomsky rejects, infants are little scientists observing and inferring the linguistic conventions prevailing among adult users (e.g., to be truthful and trusting in some L). But these learners could not possibly rule out all but one of the languages that are logically compatible with the data. Even if the child was exceptionally smart, the evidence available in the typical linguistic environment is insufficiently rich—there is a “poverty of stimulus”. If the information in a child’s environment is too poor to account for developments in her competence, anterior knowledge must be providing her with mental stirrups (see Laurence and Margolis 2001 and the entry on innateness and language).

This is the context in which introducing talk of I-languages can be useful, according to Chomsky (1986: 22–3; 2000: 4–5). Language acquisition can be thought of as a development through states of the brain from S0 through intermediate states into a relatively stable mature state, SM. S0 is the initial state common to all humans, idealizing away from individual linguistic impairments and the like. Subsequent states arise through exposure to a particular linguistic environment. Nothing said so far requires that these states be thought of as representational states we could call “knowing a language”. But if we describe being-in-state SL as knowing a language L, knowledge that a linguist might in principle make explicit in a theory of L, language acquisition can be described—usefully—as a matter of children evolving through various stages of knowledge en route to acquiring adult competence. This description is useful because the empiricist/nativist debate can now be couched as a debate over what linguistic information must already be known by someone in S0 if information supplied by the linguistic environment is to culminate in knowledge of the mature language M. Empiricists claim that nothing much is needed, that S0 is a “blank slate” to be filled in using environmental data. Nativists claim that plenty of information must already be provided, in the form of innate knowledge of a language dubbed Universal Grammar (UG) by Chomsky. We each come predisposed to acquire only certain languages, the humanly possible ones that can grow out of UG.

An I-language, then, is something that is represented in the language faculty of an (idealized) individual at a particular stage of development. But it is not anything beyond the language faculty. Statements about I-languages being represented in the brain are “statements about the structures of the brain formulated at a certain level of abstraction from mechanisms” (1986: 33). In other words, to talk of the language faculty as representing some piece of information is simply one way among others of giving an abstract description of the language faculty, a human “organ” (Chomsky 1975: 10; Anderson & Lightfoot 2000). Another way might be to describe it in chemical terms, but the representationalist description is—for reasons just sketched—rather more helpful than a chemical one within the context of explaining language acquisition. A grammar for an individual, a linguistic theory in other words, is an abstract statement of this I-language, but what it purports to describe is their language faculty, not something external to it.

As theoretical posits, I-languages earn their keep through their role in this kind of enquiry. By treating states on the path to normal mature linguistic competence in humans as representational states, states of knowledge (where what is represented or known is an I-language), important empirical generalizations can be formulated and assessed. One would not even have to sit at the nativist end of the spectrum in the debate on language acquisition to accept this way of framing the question. Moreover, this conception of the brain as a representational, information processing system, or as an integrated bundle of such systems, has application beyond the specific instance of language, developmental or otherwise. Chomsky’s case against behaviorism in the study of language (1959), and his alternative vision of how it might be studied, was pivotal in the cognitive revolution across psychology and affiliated disciplines (see e.g., Glass, Holyoak, & Santa 1979; Marr 1982; Pylyshyn 1984; Fodor 1987).

3.1.2 The Case Against E-languages

Chomsky does not deny that language (in the mass-noun sense) is at least in part “a social product” (1986: 18). He cites Putnam’s famous “division of linguistic labor” hypothesis (Putnam 1975), for example, arguing that, suitably described, the phenomenon of semantic deference is compatible with his internalized perspective. The E-languages (“E-” for “externalized”) of which he is skeptical are languages in the count-noun sense. These objects have properties that are independent of the mind/brain, or of the language faculty in particular. He offers a number of examples (1986: 19): Bloomfield’s view that a language is a totality of utterances that can be made in a speech community; Saussure’s notion of a langue (an arbitrary association of sounds with concepts); and Lewis’s pairing of sentences and meanings, the actual language of a population when the regularities described earlier hold. Chomsky also includes any system of actions or behaviours, where this system is individualist but is the product of a myriad of performance systems interacting with the language faculty and each other. A grammar, on the E-language approach, purports to describe these mind-external (or at least language-faculty external) entities.

Because there is considerable variety here in the underlying conceptions of languages, Chomsky’s criticisms can seem sweeping, but the underlying thought is that, because E-languages are less “real” than I-languages, “the concept [of an E-language] appears to play no role in the theory of language” (1986: 26). The argument for this negative conclusion is not so different from the positive argument for an I-language perspective outlined in 3.1.1. Linguistic behaviour is the product of both the language faculty on the one hand and external influences—performance systems in the mind/brain of the individual and social factors—on the other. At issue is not whether anything at all can ever be said, usefully, about these “downstream” effects, but whether the notion of an E-language has any pivotal explanatory role to play in saying it (save as a useful shorthand). Nothing much is added to the account of language learning in 3.1.1, for example, by describing it as development towards the learning of an externalistically specified social language, as opposed to some specific mature state, SM, of an individual.

One apparent corollary of this is significant for those many philosophers of language who have agonized over how to construct a theory of meaning for English. A common thought is that such a theory ought to take the form of a statement of the referential properties of the expressions of English—a link between words and objects in the world—from which the truth conditions of all English sentences can be derived (e.g., Davidson 1970, Montague 1970; see the entries for theories of meaning and reference). Echoing P.F. Strawson (1950), Chomsky suggests that referring is something people do. They use words in doing so, it is true, but referring is not something that words somehow do by themselves, through some fantastical medium, English (2000: 40–1). If referential properties of expressions amount to anything, rather than being relational properties between expressions and external objects (or “word-world” relations) they should be thought of as embodying instructions to the individual’s conceptual system, one of the performance systems with which the language faculty interfaces (an idea explored in Jackendoff 2002). If Chomsky is right, a great deal of the philosophy of language is either radically off beam or needs considerable re-interpretation (see Hornstein 1989, Ludlow 2003, Pietroski 2003, Stainton 2006).

3.2 First Response to the I-language Perspective: No Representations Without Representeds

Criticisms of Chomsky’s internalism, and so by implication his notion of an I-language, stretch back over half a century, as do his responses. Three collections (George 1989; McGilvray 1999; Antony and Hornstein 2003) between them contain a full array of philosophical commentary. In this and the next section we focus on concerns that have particular currency.

Many critics have focused on an unacknowledged commitment to externalism that they think is implicit in Chomsky’s terminology. The charge can be made using any of the different phrasings he has used to express his internalism, including competence, knowledge, and representation. For the first: competence implies competence in something. For that something to be defined in terms of the language faculty itself, there would be no such thing as incompetence, making a nonsense of talk of competence. Error would be impossible (see Barber 2001). For the second: knowledge implies something known—an external language or some subset of its properties. Chomsky has described these criticisms as arising from a misinterpretation of his view, and said that he was using competence and knowledge in a technical sense rather than in full accordance with ordinary usage. He has occasionally suggested “cognize” as an alternative term of art to prevent confusion, where to cognize an I-language is for it to be represented in one’s language faculty.[5] Recent iterations of the criticism have thus tended to focus on representation. It seems that there can be no representing without something’s being represented—something external to the thing doing the representating, and so external to the language faculty or even the individual. Chomsky’s response has been to say that he is not using representation in a relation sense, representation of (1995a: 53 and in Antony and Hornstein 2003: 276–7).

The notion of representation is central to a good deal of cognitive science and is a topic that has preoccupied many philosophers of mind and language who share Chomsky’s naturalistic bent. Many of the latter have been surprised and puzzled by his rejection of both the relational notion of representation (where the relation is between vehicles of representation in the mind/brain, and the things they represent) and attempts to define this relation in naturalistic language (see causal theories of mental content, intentionality, and mental representation). Georges Rey, for example, sees the intentionality, the “aboutness”, implicit in the notion of representation as essential to the computational-representational theory of mind—precisely the theory that he and others think Chomsky’s work has helped to inspire and shape (Rey 2003a,b & 2005). Rey concludes that Chomsky is mistaken about the status his own theory, and offers instead what he thinks is a more charitable interpretation: that the representations are of something, but typically inaccurate and harmlessly so.

In the earlier presentation (3.1.1) we tried to capture Chomsky’s arelational notion of representation, where to describe something as representating an I-language is simply a way of describing it abstractly. John Collins has gone to greater lengths to make good this suggestion that there could be representations without representata (2014). Adopting “dyadic representational talk” helps us to “frame generalizations about monadic representational states”, he says. Representata are no more than the byproducts of a grammarians’ attempt to type non-relational states the mind/brain can be in or pass through. Invoking them does not generate any ontological commitment to languages external to the mind/brain being described.

Frances Egan has taken a view that appears to capture the spirit of Chomsky’s attitude to representation while also making room (and seeing the need) for a relational notion of representational content in cognitive explanation (generally, and in linguistics in particular). According to Egan (2003, 2014), representational content—the dyadic notion, that is—figures in cognitive explanation, but not in the way orthodoxy would have it. The internal computational mechanism alone, uninterpreted, does the explaining. That this mechanism has the representational content it does figures only within the explanans. It is used to specify the explanandum. This explanandum, and hence any allocation to it of content, will often be quite vaguely characterized, and may even fail to correspond to anything real.

Because the mechanism, as computationally characterized, would not track these [external] properties in every environment, the semantic interpretation of the device is not an essential characterization, and cannot serve to individuate it. However, the semantic interpretation enables us to specify the cognitive function of the mechanism, to characterize it as computing [visual] depth from disparity, for example, or as computing the syntactic structure of a sentence. (Egan 2014: 98)

This is arguably in the same spirit as Chomsky’s description of the language faculty as “providing instructions” to performance systems (1995b: 15). Representations in the language faculty corresponding to elements of a grammar such as [voiced coronal sibilant], for example, do not stand for movements of the mouth (such as the one produced at the beginning of an utterance of the English word zebra), but they might nonetheless be part of the causal story of why a human moves her or his mouth in a particular way in particular circumstances.

Many of those engaged in this debate focus on cases such as the edges in Kaniza’s triange illusion (figure 1) or PRO (a sytanctic constituent to which nothing corresponds in the sound-stream). The nub of the issue, here, seems to be what to make of the fact that there is no edge, or no syntactic constituent, beyond the edge or syntactic constituent represented in our mind-brain. The same might even hold of the notion of a common language. What we make of this for the nature of cognitive explanation, and of the notion of representation that so typically figures within it, is yet to be settled, and goes to the very heart of the philosophy of cognitive science.

[three solid black circles arranged in an equilateral  triangle each with 60 degree sector cut out so that if edges of the sectors were lines and extended an equilateral triangle would be formed.  Three pairs of lines also exist where if the lines were extended another equilateral triangle would exist.]

Figure 1. Kanizsa’s Triange (from Wikimedia Commons, by User:Fibonacci)

3.3 Second Response to the I-language Perspective: Psycholinguistics

More recently, a whole field of scientific research, psycholinguistics, has been precisely dedicated to studying external, anti-individualistic, mind-independent properties of language, massively advancing our understanding of language development in the process (see Hoff and Shatz 2007). The guiding assumption within this field is that external factors, such as the child’s social and physical environment, can play a substantial role in determining both the child’s linguistic competence and the vocabulary and syntax of the acquired language. On this view, such external factors supply most, if not all, of the relevant stimuli for language acquisition, contrary to Chomsky’s central poverty of stimulus argument for I-languages.

Several different inquires have benefited from psycholinguistic studies of overt linguistic behavior. These include questions about the relative autonomy of distinct areas of linguistic knowledge, such as the question: are syntax, semantics and pragmatics independent from each other, or do they rather support each other? (see Gleitman, Cassidy, et al. 2005; Gleitman 1990; Naigles and Swensen 2007; and Diesendruck 2007); and about the role of the child in the process of language acquisition: is the child a passive subject, or an active participant within her linguistic community (see Shatz 1987, 1994; Shafer and Garrido-Nag 2007; and Poulin-Dubois and Graham 2007)?

We saw (in section 3.1.1 and 3.1.2) that Chomsky’s case for I-languages and against E-languages is heavily entwined with the poverty of stimulus assumption. This is used to defend the claim that human languages are little more than modifications of UG, and that the process of language acquisition and development is the process of such modifications. But studies have shown that social input, which children may pick up from and rely on, is rich both in content and structure (see Baldwin and Meyer 2007). In child-directed speech, adults use words in a way that makes it easier for children to identify the relevant information (see Brent and Siskind 2001; Akhtar, Dunham, and Dunham 1991), suggesting that social input is highly relevant to the development of semantic knowledge. Even if we limit the UG hypothesis to a claim about syntax there are empirical challenges. According to this more limited reading, the acquisition of syntactic process is “seen to rely most heavily on the operation of innate structural principles” (Baldwin and Meyer 2007: 95). Social input, on this view, plays a mere triggering role. Further studies have shown this hypothesis to be controversial. Alternative, socio-pragmatic, accounts have shown that children can learn syntax from adult language use (see Tomasello 2003, 2004). Children’s domain general abilities of statistical analysis, and pattern and intention recognition, are believed to assist the child in identifying and acquiring syntactic structure from the social linguistic input they receive (see Saffran, Aslin, and Newport 1996; Gentner, Holyoak, and Kokinov 2001). In general, the empirical evidence obtained by psycholinguistic studies strongly suggests that language acquisition and development is much more than just a process of UG modifications by means of mind/brain maturation.

However these debates evolve, two things seem clear. First, the external, anti-individualistic, mind-independent properties of language, including overt linguistic behavior, are apt for proper scientific investigation. Exactly how much of a threat this is to Chomsky’s view is a matter for debate, since as we saw (in 3.1.2) he insists he is not denying that language is at least partly a social product; but the claims made on the back of these results certainly seem to run contrary to the thrust of his internalism. And, second, against Chomsky’s skepticism, there are good reasons to develop such research into external influences, as it may prove to be central for a proper understanding of the semantics, and even the grammar and syntax, of human language and its acquisition.

4. Further Reading

For thoughts on how best to characterize an idiolectal conception of language, and views on how such a conception sits with respect to Chomskian internalism and to conventionalist views, see George 1990 and Higginbotham 2006.

The theory of conventions used in Lewis 1975 is developed at length in his earlier book (1969). The resulting theory of language is elaborated by Bennett 1976 and criticized in Burge 1975 and Laurence 1996. Wiggins 1997 and Millikan 2005, like Lewis, see languages as essentially social in nature (Chomsky replies to a version of the latter in Antony and Hornstein 2003).

A special issue of the journal Inquiry (see Begby & Ramberg 2016) contains a handful of useful discussions of Davidson’s influential 1986 article. These include Stainton 2016, which rejects what the author describes as Davidson’s case against public languages, adding to parallel criticisms of Chomskian arguments to the same end in Stainton 2011. For work on the pragmatics/semantics boundary, much of it raising similar issues, see Stanley 2000, Carston 2002, Borg 2004, Recanati 2004, Cappelen and Lepore 2005, and Szabó 2005. In earlier work on Davidson’s paper, his anti-conventionalism is discussed by Hacking 1986, Dummett 1986, Pietroski 1994, and Reimer 2004. Hacking addresses the extent to which Davidson’s conclusion undermines his earlier philosophy of language. Dummett attempts to show that the notion of a prior theory presupposes the notion of a linguistic community, and hence of a shared language.

McGilvray 1999 and Smith and Allott 2016 both offer clear introductions to Chomsky’s philosophy of language and linguistics, including his E-/I-language distinction. A shorter account of his views on this topic in particular can be found in Bezuidenhout 2006. Critical discussion can be found in five collections: George 1989, Otero 1994 (Volume II), Antony and Hornstein 2003, Barber 2003, and McGilvray 2005. Chomsky’s own non-technical writing is usually accessible. Good starting places would be the second chapter of Chomsky 1986, the essays in Chomsky 2000 (some of which also appeared within his 1995a), or the early sections of Chapter 1 of his 1995b (co-written with Howard Lasnik).

Hoff and Shatz 2007 offers an excellent overview of the field of language development, including foundational issues, as well as syntactic, semantic and pragmatic topics in infancy, early childhood and atypical development.


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