Darwin: From Origin of Species to Descent of Man

First published Mon Jun 17, 2019

This entry intends to give a broad historical review of the origin and development of Darwin’s theory of evolution by natural selection through the initial Darwinian phase of the “Darwinian Revolution” up to the publication of the Descent of Man in 1871. The development of evolutionary ideas before Darwin’s work has been treated in the separate entry evolutionary thought before Darwin. Several additional aspects of Darwin’s theory of evolution and his biographical development are dealt with in other entries in this encyclopedia (see the entries on Darwinism; species; natural selection; creationism). The remainder of this entry will focus on the following points in relation to Darwin’s theory not developed in the other entries. It will also maintain a historical and textual approach. Other entries in this encyclopedia cited at the end of the article and the bibliography should be consulted for discussions beyond this point. The issues will be examined under the following headings:

1. The Origins of Darwin’s Theory

1.1 Historiographical Issues

Charles Darwin’s version of transformism has been the subject of massive historical and philosophical scholarship almost unparalleled in any other area of the history of science. This includes the continued flow of monographic studies and collections of articles on aspects of Darwin’s theory (Richards and Ruse 2016; Ruse 2013a, 2009a,b, 2008; Ruse & Richards 2008; Hodge & Radick 2003 [2009]; Hösle & Illies [eds] 2005; Gayon 1998; Bowler 1996; Depew & Weber 1995; Kohn 1985a). The continuous production of popular and professional biographical studies on Darwin provide ever new insights (Ruse et al. 2013a; Johnson 2012; Desmond & Moore 1991, 2009; Browne 1995, 2002; Bowlby 1990; Bowler 1990). In addition, major editing projects on Darwin’s manuscripts and Correspondence, now completed through 1878, continue to reveal details and new insights into the issues surrounding Darwin’s own thought (Keynes [ed.] 2000; Burkhardt et al. [eds] 1985–; Darwin 1836–1844 [1987]). The Cambridge Darwin Online website (see Other Internet Resources) serves as an international clearinghouse for this worldwide Darwinian scholarship.

A long tradition of scholarship has interpreted Darwin’s theory to have originated from a framework defined by endemic British natural history, a British tradition of natural theology defined particularly by William Paley (1743–1805), the methodological precepts of John Herschel (1792–1871), and the geological theories of Charles Lyell (1797–1875). His conversion to the uniformitarian geology of Charles Lyell and to Lyell’s thesis of gradual change over time during the voyage of the HMS Beagle (December 1831–October 1836) has been seen as fundamental in his formation (Norman 2013; Herbert 2005; Hodge 1983a). Complementing this predominantly anglophone historiography has been the social-constructivist analyses emphasizing the origins of Darwin’s theories in British Political Economy (Young, 1985: chps. 2, 4, 5). Recently, it has been argued that a primary generating source of Darwin’s inquiries was his involvement with the British anti-slavery movement, a concern reaching back to his revulsion against slavery developed during the Beagle years (Desmond & Moore 2009).

A strain of revisionist historiography, on the other hand, has de-emphasized some of the novelty of Darwin’s views; questions have been raised regarding the validity of the standard biographical picture of the early Darwin; new emphasis has been placed on Darwin’s relations to the German Romantic movement, to British and Scottish medical developments, and to his early formation in Scottish science and philosophy (R.J. Richards 1999, 2002; Desmond 1989; Manier 1978). Such revisions to a long-standing historiography in the understanding of the genesis of Darwinian theory are indebted to the wealth of manuscripts and correspondence that have become available since the 1960s and which are now electronically accessible at the Darwin Online “Papers and Manuscripts” section (see Other Internet Resources).

These materials have drawn attention to previously ignored aspects of Darwin’s biography. In particular, the importance of his Edinburgh period from 1825–27, largely discounted in importance by Darwin himself in his late Autobiography, has been seen as critical for his subsequent development (Desmond & Moore 1991; Hodge 1985). As a young medical student at the University of Edinburgh (1825–27), Darwin developed a close relationship with the comparative anatomist Robert Edmond Grant (1793–1874) through the student Plinian Society, and in many respects Grant served as Darwin’s first mentor in science in the pre-Beagle years (Desmond & Moore 1991, chp. 1). Through Grant he was exposed to the transformist theories of Jean Baptiste Lamarck and the Cuvier-Geoffroy debate centered on the Paris Muséum nationale d’histoire naturelle (see entry on evolutionary thought before Darwin, Section 4). This Scottish period also developed in Darwin an abiding interest in invertebrate zoology that would later emerge in full in his important work on the barnacles (Stott 2004; Love 2002; Sloan 1985).

Similarly, there has been a new appreciation of the importance of Darwin’s work in physiological botany and entomology during his studies in Cambridge from 1827–31 under the guidance of his mentor John Stevens Henslow (1795–1861), who exposed him to the physiological botany of Swiss botanist Alphonse De Candolle (1806–93). Through Henslow he was also led to the writings of John Herschel, Alexander von Humboldt (1769–1859), and Charles Lyell. Deeper understanding is now possible concerning Darwin’s work in geology at Cambridge with Adam Sedgwick (1795–1873). All of this has considerably deepened the understanding of his scientific and intellectual preparation for the theoretical work that transpired during the voyage of the H.M.S. Beagle (Sloan 2003b [2009]). Some scholars now interpret Darwin’s initial reflections on transformism to have developed from lines of thought stimulated by Humboldt’s version of German philosophy of nature as much as from the traditional sources usually assumed in Lyell, Herschel and British natural theology (R.J. Richards 2005, 2002: chp. 14). This scholarly work, while not rejecting the importance of traditional British sources, has revealed the multiplicity of origins of Darwin’s reflections that display the interaction of British traditions with Continental developments in life science and philosophy, including those of German origin (R.J. Richards 2002; Sloan 2003a, 2007).

The continued scholarly interest in the origins of Darwin’s theory reflects not only the concerns of historians of science, but also those who see a continued relevance of Darwin’s own writings as sources of creative reflection for contemporary work in evolutionary biology (Gayon 2003). This phenomenon, however, presents difficulties for the historical understanding of Darwinism. Particularly within anglophone philosophy of biology, the emphasis on the lines of the development of Darwin’s evolutionary theory that have led to the consensus position achieved in the so-named “Synthetic” theory of evolution of the 1930s (Smocovitis 1996; Mayr & Provine [ed.] 1980; Provine 1971), has tended to obscure the complex history of Darwin’s own theoretical reflections and the history of Darwinian theory since 1859 (Depew & Weber 1995; Bowler 1983).

These internal complexities in the heritage of Darwin’s works have shaped Darwinism into more than one tradition, with pre-existing social and intellectual contexts playing a critical role in the interpretation of Darwin’s achievement. French biology, for example, still pays greater respect to Lamarck than is true in anglophone literature (Laurent [ed.] 1997). Several commentators currently seek to de-emphasize the contrasts between the presumably failed theories of Lamarck and those of Darwin that figure largely in British and American literature, or else see some greater compatibility between a “molecularized” understanding of evolution and Lamarckianism (Gissis & Jablonka [eds] 2011). The long heritage of Kantianism and German Idealism has influenced lines of the German interpretations of Darwin up to the present (Hösle & Illies [eds] 2005). The general importance of prior social and intellectual context in the reception of Darwin’s work is a topic of active research that will be summarized in greater detail below.

1.2 Darwin’s Early Reflections

In its historical origins, Darwin’s theory was different in kind from its main predecessors in important ways (Ruse 2013b; see also the entry on evolutionary thought before Darwin). Viewed against a longer historical scenario, Darwin’s theory does not deal with cosmology or the origins of the world and life through naturalistic means, and therefore was more restricted in its theoretical scope than its main predecessors influenced by the reflections of Buffon, Herder, and German Naturphilosophen. It also differed from the historical developmentalism of his German contemporary, the paleontologist Heinrich G. Bronn (Gliboff 2008, 2007). This restriction also distinguished Darwin’s work more immediately from the grand evolutionary cosmology put forth anonymously in 1844 by the Scottish publisher Robert Chambers (1802–71) in his immensely popular Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation, a work which in many respects prepared Victorian society in England, and pre-Civil War America for general evolutionary theories (Secord 2000; MacPherson 2015). It also distinguished it from the theories of his contemporary Herbert Spencer (1820–1903) summarized below.

Darwin’s theory first took written form in reflections in a series of notebooks begun during the latter part of the Beagle voyage and continued after the return of the Beagle in October of 1836. His reflections on the possibility of species change are first entered in March of 1837 (“Red Notebook”) and are developed in the other notebooks (B–E) through July of 1839 (Darwin 1836–1844 [1987]; Hodge 2013a, 2003). Beginning with the reflections of the third or “D” Notebook, composed between July and October of 1838, Darwin first worked out the rudiments of what was to become his theory of natural selection. In the parallel “M” and “N” Notebooks, dating between July of 1838 and July of 1839, and in a loose collection called “Old and Useless Notes”, dating from approximately 1838–40, he also developed many of his main ideas on human evolution that would only be made public in the Descent of Man of 1871 (see below).

To summarize a complex issue, these Notebook reflections show Darwin proceeding through a series of stages in which he first formulated a general theory of the transformation of species from common ancestry. He then attempted to work out a causal theory of life that would explain the tendency of life to complexify and diversify (Hodge 2013a, 2003, 1985; Sloan 1986). This causal inquiry into the underlying nature of life , and the explanation of life’s innate tendency to develop and complexify, was then replaced by a shift in focus away from inner tendencies of life. It was replaced by a concern with external forces controlling population, which was, following Thomas Malthus’s (1766–1834), assumed to expand geometrically. This shift allowed him to develop the implications of population increase for the transformation of species.

By universalizing the Malthusian “principle of population”, Darwin introduced an “inertial” principle into his theory, although such language is never used in his text. Newton’s first law, for example, established his physical system upon the tendency of a body in motion to persist either at rest or in uniform motion in a straight line, requiring a causal explanation for any deviations from this initial state. But Newton did not seek a deeper metaphysical explanation for this tendency. Similarly, the principle of population supplied Darwin with the assumption of an initial dynamic state of affairs that was not itself explained within the theory—there is no attempt to account causally for this tendency of living beings universally to reproduce geometrically. The principle of population might therefore be regarded as functioning axiomatically, defining a set of initial conditions from which any deviance from this ideal state demands explanation. This theoretical shift enabled Darwin to bracket his earlier efforts to develop a causal theory of life, and focus instead on the means by which the dynamic force of population was controlled. This allowed him to emphasize how this control on population worked in company with the phenomenon of slight individual variation and changing conditions of life to produce a gradual change of form and function. Darwin would later claim that he was able empirically to support the claim that living populations do tend to increase in this way, but he does not offer a causal theory of life to explain this tendency (Origin 1859: chp. 3, 63–68).

2. Darwinian Evolution

2.1. The Concept of Natural Selection

The primary distinguishing feature of Darwin’s theory that separates it from previous explanations of species change centers on the causal explanation he offered for how this process occurred. Prior theories, such as that of Jean-Baptiste Lamarck, relied on the inherent dynamic properties of matter, or in some of the German reflections, on special dynamic forces, such as those building upon the “Formative Drive” (Bildungstrieb) theory of Johann Blumenbach (1752–1840) (Zammito 2018: chps. 7–9). The change of species was not, in these pre-Darwinian efforts, explained through an adaptive process. Darwin’s emphasis after Notebook D on the factors controlling population increase, rather than on a dynamic theory of life grounded in vital forces, however, accounts for many of the differences between Darwin’s theory and those of his predecessors and contemporaries.

These differences can be summarized in the concept of natural selection as a central ingredient of Darwinian theory. However, the exact meaning of this concept, and the varying ways he stated the principle in the Origin over its six editions (1859–1872), has given rise to multiple interpretations of the meaning of this principle in the history of Darwinism.

One way to see the complexity of Darwin’s own thinking on these issues is to follow the textual development of this concept between the close of the Notebook period (1839) and the publication of the Origin of Species in 1859. This period of approximately twenty years involved Darwin in a series of reflections that form successive strata in the final version of his theory of the evolution of species. Understanding the historical sequence of these developments also has significance for subsequent controversies over this concept and the different readings of the Origin as it went through successive editions, and as it was received in other cultural contexts (see below, Section 3). It also has some bearing on assessing Darwin’s relevance for more general philosophical questions, such as those surrounding the teleology of nature.

The earliest set of themes in the manuscript elaboration of natural selection theory can be characterized as those developed through a strong analogy between human art and the workings of nature (Theunissen 2013). As this was expressed in the first coherent draft of the theory, a 39-page manuscript written in 1842, this discussion transferred the concept of selection of forms by human agency in the creation of the varieties of domestic animals and plants, to the active selection in the natural world by an almost conscious agency, a “being more sagacious than man (not an omniscient creator)” (Darwin 1842 [1909: 6] [1996: 91]). This agency selects out those features most beneficial to organisms in relation to conditions of life, analogous in its action to the selection by man on domestic forms in the production of different breeds. Interwoven with these references to an almost Platonic demiurge are appeals to the selecting power of an active “Nature”:

Nature’s variation far less, but such selection far more rigid and scrutinizing[.…] Nature lets [an] animal live, till on actual proof it is found less able to do the required work to serve the desired end, man judges solely by his eye, and knows not whether nerves, muscles, arteries, are developed in proportion to the change of external form. (1842 [1909: 9] [1996: 93])

These themes were continued in the 230 page draft of his theory of 1844. Again he referred to the selective action of a wise imaginary being whose selection was made with greater foresight and wisdom than human selection. This agency worked as a secondary cause in a larger plan of a superintending creator, allowing that

the process of selection could go on adapting, nicely and wonderfully, organisms, if in ever so small a degree plastic, to diverse ends. I believe such secondary means do exist. (Darwin 1844a [1909: 87] [1996: 103])

Darwin returned to these issues in 1856, following a twelve-year period in which he published his Geological Observations on the Volcanic Islands (1844b), the second edition of his Journal of Researches (1845), Geological Observations on South America (1846), the four volumes on fossil and living barnacles (1851, 54, 55), and Geological Observations on Coral Reefs (1851). In addition, he had published several smaller papers on invertebrate zoology, on geology, and had reported on his experiments on the resistance of seeds to salt water, a topic that would be of importance in his explanation of the population of remote islands.

These intervening inquiries, conducted between 1844 and 1856, positioned Darwin to deal with the question of species permanence against an extensive empirical background. The initial major synthesis of these investigations takes place in his long manuscript, or “Big Species Book”, commenced in 1856, known in current scholarship as the “Natural Selection” manuscript. This formed the immediate background text behind the published Origin. Although incomplete, “Natural Selection” provides insights into many critical issues in Darwin’s thinking. It was also prepared with an eye to the scholarly community. This distinguishes its form of argument from that of the subsequent “abstract” which became the published Origin of Species. “Natural Selection” contained tables of data, references to scholarly literature, and other apparatus expected of a non-popular work, none of which survived in the published Origin.

The “Natural Selection” manuscript also contained some new theoretical developments of relevance to the concept of natural selection that are not found in earlier manuscripts. Scholars have noted the introduction in this manuscript of the “principle of divergence”, the thesis that organisms under the action of natural selection will tend to radiate and diversify within their “conditions of life”—the contemporary name for the complex of environmental and species-interaction relationships (Kohn 1985b, 2008). Although the concept of group divergence under the action of natural selection might be seen as an implication of Darwin’s theory from his earliest formulations of the 1830s, nonetheless Darwin’s explicit definition of this as a “principle”, and its discussion in a long later insertion in the “Natural Selection” manuscript, suggests its importance for Darwin’s mature theory. The principle of divergence was now seen by Darwin to form an important link between natural variation and the conditions of existence under the action of the driving force of population increase.

Still evident in the “Natural Selection” manuscript is Darwin’s implicit appeal to some kind of teleological ordering of the process. The action of the “wise being” of the earlier manuscripts, however, has now been given over entirely to the action of a selective “Nature”, now referred to in the traditional feminine gender. This Nature,

…cares not for mere external appearance; she may be said to scrutinise with a severe eye, every nerve, vessel & muscle; every habit, instinct, shade of constitution,—the whole machinery of the organisation. There will be here no caprice, no favouring: the good will be preserved & the bad rigidly destroyed.… Can we wonder then, that nature’s productions bear the stamp of a far higher perfection than man’s product by artificial selection. With nature the most gradual, steady, unerring, deep-sighted selection,—perfect adaption [sic] to the conditions of existence.… (Natural Selection 1856 [1974: 224–225])

The language of this passage, directly underlying statements about the action of “natural selection” in the first edition of the published Origin, indicates the complexity in the exegesis of Darwin’s meaning of “natural selection” when viewed in light of its historical genesis (Ospovat 1981). The parallels between art and nature, the intentionality implied in the term “selection”, the notion of “perfect” adaptation, and the substantive conception of “nature” as an agency working toward certain ends, all render Darwin’s views on teleological purpose more complex than they are typically interpreted from the standpoint of contemporary Neo-selectionist theory (Lennox 1993, 2013). As will be discussed below, the changes Darwin subsequently made in his formulations of this concept over the history of the Origin lead to different conceptions of what he meant by this principle and underlie most contemporary meanings of natural selection.

The hurried preparation and publication of the Origin between the summer of 1858 and November of 1859 was prompted by the receipt on June 18 of 1858 of a letter from Alfred Russel Wallace that outlined his remarkably similar views on the possibility of continuous species change under the action of a selection upon natural variation. This event had important implications for the subsequent form of Darwin’s published argument. Rapidly condensing the detailed arguments of the “Natural Selection” manuscript into shorter chapters, Darwin also universalized several claims that he had only developed with reference to specific groups of organisms, or which he had applied only to more limited situations in the manuscript. This resulted in a presentation of his theory at the level of broad generalization. The absence of tables of data, detailed footnotes, and references to the secondary literature in the published version also resulted in predictable criticisms which will be discussed below in Section 3.

2.2. The Central Argument of the Origin

The structure of the argument of the Origin has been the topic of considerable literature and can only be summarized here (Darwinism, this encyclopedia; Hodge 2013b; Hoquet 2013; Waters 2003; Depew 2008; Ruse 2008; Lennox 2005). Darwin himself described his book as “one long argument”. The exact nature of this argument is, however, not immediately transparent, and alternative interpretations have been made of his reasoning and rhetorical strategies in formulating his evolutionary theory.

The scholarly reconstruction of Darwin’s methodology employed in the Origin has taken two primary forms. One approach has been to reconstruct it from the standpoint of currently accepted models of scientific explanation, sometimes presenting it as a formal deductive model (Sober 1984). Another, more historical, approach interprets his methodology in the context of accepted canons of scientific explanation found in Victorian discussions of the period (Ruse 2013b; Waters 2003; Hull 2003; Lewens 2008; Ruse 2008; Lennox 2005; Hodge 1983b). The degree to which Darwin did in fact draw from the available methodological discussions of his contemporaries—John Herschel, William Whewell, John Stuart Mill—is not fully clear from available documentary sources. The claim most readily documented, and defended particularly by M. J. S. Hodge (1977, 1983a), has emphasized the importance of John Herschel’s A Preliminary Discourse on the Study of Natural Philosophy (1830), which Darwin read as a young student at Cambridge prior to his departure on the HMS Beagle in December of 1831. In Herschel’s writings he would have encountered the claim that science seeks to determine “true causes”—verae causae. This concept Newton had specified in the Principia as the third of his “Rules of Reasoning in Philosophy” (see the entry on Newton’s philosophy, Section 4). This was to be the goal of scientific explanation. Such causes, in Herschel’s formulation, were those necessary to produce the given effects; they were truly active in producing the effects; and they adequately explained these effects (Herschel 1830; Lennox 2005; Waters 2003). These criteria distinguished a satisfactory scientific account from the simple “saving of phenomena” by plausible explanations in the tradition of scientific conventionalism. The impact of Herschel’s arguments on Darwin’s intellectual development was evidently profound, although there is no direct textual reference to Herschel’s concept of a vera causa itself in the Notebooks and other early writings.

The other plausible methodological source for Darwin’s mature reasoning was the work of his older contemporary and former Cambridge mentor, the Rev. William Whewell (1794–1866), whose three-volume History of the Inductive Sciences (1837) Darwin read with care after his return from his round-the-world voyage. Again, the impact of Whewell’s explicit theory of scientific method, as set forth in his Philosophy of Inductive Science (first ed. 1840) in the pre-Origin period is difficult to document, with no direct evidence of the reading of Whewell’s Philosophy in the Darwin reading Notebooks or Correspondence from his formative years before the publication of the Origin.

Nevertheless, a plausible argument has been made that the actual structure of Darwin’s text is more closely similar to a “Whewellian” rather than to a “Herschelian” model of argument (Ruse 1975, 2013c). In Whewell’s 1840 account, the emphasis of scientific inquiry is, as Herschel had also argued, to be placed on the discovery of “true causes”. But evidence for the determination of a vera causa was to be demonstrated by the ability of disparate phenomena to be drawn together under a single unifying “Conception of the Mind”, exemplified for Whewell by Newton’s universal law of gravitation. This “Consilience of Inductions”, as Whewell termed this process of theoretical unification under a few simple concepts, was achieved only by true scientific theories employing true causes (Whewell 1840: xxxix). In a restatement of this principle in a revised edition of his Philosophy of Inductive Science published only a year before the Origin, Whewell argued that

the cases in which inductions from classes of facts altogether different have thus jumped together, belong only to the best established theories which the history of science contains. (Whewell 1858: 88)

It has therefore been argued that Darwin’s theory fundamentally produces this kind of consilience argument, and that his methodology is more properly aligned with that of Whewell.

In rhetorical structure, the Origin more evidently develops what can be termed a “constructive” argument, with a complex style of presentation indebted to what has been called “situated argumentation”, similar to the views developed by contemporary Oxford logician and rhetorical theorist Richard Whately (1787–1863) (Depew 2008). It proceeds by drawing the reader into Darwin’s world by personal narration as it presents a series of limited issues for acceptance in the first three chapters, none of which required of the reader a considerable leap of theoretical assent, and most of which, such as natural variation and Malthusian population increase, had already been recognized in some form in the literature of the period.

These ingredients are then assembled together in chapter four into a remarkable synthesis that rapidly extends the claims by generalization to cover the full range of life, both in time and in space. With Darwin’s carefully-designed rhetorical strategy of presentation, only by chapter four would the reader know the full character and broad implications of the claims being developed in the early chapters. By the end of that chapter, the reader would be presented with a remarkably comprehensive theory of the relations of living forms, and the mode of their origin, both in the present and in the past history of the planet.

Opening with a pair of chapters that draw upon the art-nature analogy developed in the manuscripts, Darwin framed the argument with an account of the probable origin of domestic animals, and by inference, of domesticated plants (Theunissen 2013). These forms are presumed to have arisen through the action of human selection on the slight variations existing between individuals within the same species. A possible interpretation of this process as implying directional, and even intentional, selection, was at the same time downplayed in the published work through the importance given by Darwin to the role of “unconscious” selection, a concept not encountered in the Natural Selection manuscript. This denotes the selection practiced even by aboriginal peoples who simply seek to maintain the integrity of a breed by preserving the best forms. The domestic breeding analogy is, however, more than a decorative rhetorical strategy. It repeatedly functions for Darwin as the principal empirical example to which he could appeal at several places in the text as a means of visualizing the working of natural selection in nature, and this appeal remains intact through the six editions of the Origin.

From this model of human selection working on small natural variations to produce the domestic forms, Darwin then developed in the second chapter the implications of “natural” variation, delaying discussion of the concept of natural selection until chapter four. The focus of the second chapter introduces another important issue. Here he extends the discussion of variation developed in chapter one into an attack on the traditional “Linnaean” understanding of classification as a sorting out of species by means of essential defining properties. It is in this chapter that Darwin most explicitly develops his own position on the nature of organic species in relation to his theory of descent. It is also here that he sets forth the ingredients for his attack on species “essentialism”.

Darwin’s analysis of the “species question” is a complex issue that has many implications for how his work was read by his contemporaries and successors. This still forms a topic of extensive discussion in the literature (see species and Darwinism, this encyclopedia; Mallet 2013; Hodge 2013b; R.A. Richards 2010; Wilkins 2009; Stamos 2007; Sloan 2008, 2013). His sometimes contradictory statements on this issue—alternating between overt denials of the reality of species in some places, and clear affirmation of the reality of species in others—have been seen by some scholars as an intentional rhetorical strategy (Stamos 2007; Beatty 1985).

Prior tradition had been heavily affected by Buffon’s novel conception of biological species in which he made a sharp distinction between “natural” species defined by such properties as fertile interbreeding, and “artificial” species and varieties defined by morphological traits and measurements upon these (see the entry on evolutionary thought before Darwin, Section 3.3). This distinction was utilized selectively by Darwin. Particularly as conceptualized by German natural historians of the early nineteenth-century, “Buffonian” species were defined by the unity of common descent, and distinguished by their historical and ontological character from the taxonomic species of Linnaean natural history. This distinction between “natural” and “logical” species had maintained a distinction between problems of practical classification of preserved specimens, and those relating to the unity of natural species, which most maintained as fixed on the basis of reproductive unity and the sterility criterion (Sloan 2008).

Remarkable in Darwin’s argument, however, is the way in which he draws selectively from these preexistent traditions to undermine the species “realism” assumed within these. One tradition—what can be considered in his immediate context the Linnaean tradition—regarded species in the sense of universals of logic or class concepts, whose “reality” rested in many cases on divine creation. The alternative “Buffonian” tradition viewed species in the sense of material lineages of descent whose fixity was determined by some kind of immanent principle, such as an “internal mold” or specifying vital force (see evolutionary thought before Darwin 3.3). The result in Darwin’s hands is a complex interweaving of concepts of varieties, races, sub-species, tribes, and natural families that can be shown to represent different traditions of discussion in the literature of the period. This creative conflation also led to many confusions about how Darwin actually did conceive of species and species change in time (Sloan 2008).

Darwin addresses the species question by raising the problems caused by natural variation in the practical discrimination of taxa at the species and varietal levels. Although the difficulty of taxonomic distinctions at this level was a well-recognized problem in the literature of the time, he subtly transforms this practical problem into a metaphysical ambiguity—the fuzziness of formal taxonomic distinctions is seen to imply a similar ambiguity of “natural” species boundaries.

For example, natural variation is employed by Darwin in chapter two of the Origin to break down the distinction between species and varieties as these concepts were commonly employed in the practical taxonomic literature. The arbitrariness apparent in making distinctions, particularly in plants and invertebrates, meant that such species were only what “naturalists having sound judgment and wide experience” defined them to be (Origin 1859: 47). These arguments form the basis for claims by his contemporaries that Darwin was a species “nominalist”, who defined species only as conventional and convenient divisions of a continuum of individuals.

But this feature of Darwin’s discussion of species only in part captures the complexity of his argument. Drawing also on the tradition of species realism developed within the Buffonian tradition, Darwin also affirmed that species and varieties are defined by common descent and material relations of interbreeding. Darwin then employed the ambiguity of the distinction between species and varieties created by taxonomic variation in practical taxonomy to undermine the ontological fixity of “natural” species. Varieties are not simply the formal taxonomic subdivisions of a natural species as conceived in the Linnaean tradition. They are, as he terms them, “incipient” species (Origin 1859: 52). This subtly transformed the issue of local variation and adaptation to circumstances into a primary ingredient for historical evolutionary change. The conclusions to be drawn from this argument were, however, only to be revealed in chapter four of the text.

Before assembling the ingredients of these first two chapters, Darwin then introduced in chapter three the concept of a “struggle for existence”. This concept is introduced in a “large and metaphorical sense” that included different levels of organic interactions, from direct struggle for food and space to the struggle for life of a plant in a desert. Although described as an application of Thomas Malthus’s parameter of geometrical increase of population in relation to the arithmetical increase of food supply, Darwin’s use of this concept in fact reinterprets Malthus’s principle, which was formulated only with reference to human population in relation to food supply. It now becomes a general principle governing all of organic life. Thus the organisms comprising food itself would also be included. Through this universalization, the controls on population becomes only in the extreme case grounded directly on the traditional Malthusian limitations of food and space. Normal controls are instead exerted through a complex network of relationships of species acting one on another in predator-prey, parasite-host, and food-web relations. This profound revision of Malthus’s arguments rendered Darwin’s theory deeply “ecological” as this term would later be employed. The abundance of red clover in England Darwin sees as dependent on the numbers of pollinating humble bees which are controlled by mice, and these are controlled by the number of cats, making cats the determinants of clover abundance. The abundance of Scotch Firs is limited by the number of cattle, to cite two examples employed by Darwin (Origin 1859: 72–74). This recognition of complex species-species interactions as the primary means of population control also prevents one from reading the Origin as a simple extension of British political economy and the competition embedded in Victorian industrialization to the natural world.

With the ingredients of the first three chapters in place, Darwin was positioned to assemble these together in his culminating fourth chapter on natural selection. In this long discussion, Darwin develops the main exposition of his central theoretical concept. For his contemporaries and for the subsequent tradition, however, Darwin’s concept of “natural” selection was not unambiguously clear for reasons we have outlined above, and these unclarities were to be the source of several persistent lines of disagreement and controversy. It is not clear, for example, whether Darwin conceives of natural selection as an efficient or as a final cause; whether it is an emergent result of other causes; or if it is a simple description of the working together of several independent causal factors without its own causal status. Judging from the text of the Origin itself, it is difficult to verify the claim that natural selection was itself considered by Darwin to be a vera causa in Herschel’s sense. The importance of the vera causa principle for Darwin’s argument has been claimed by several scholars (Hodge 2013b; Waters 2003 [2009: 124–27]). But from textual evidence, Darwin reserved this designation in the Origin for “community of descent”, for the causes of “ordinary generation”, or even for the mistaken beliefs of “special creationists” (Origin 1859: 159, 352, 482; Depew 2008: 243).

In the initial definition of natural selection presented in the first edition of Darwin’s text, it is characterized as “preservation of favourable variations and the rejection of injurious variations” (Origin 1859: 81). When Darwin elaborated on this concept in chapter four of the first edition, he continued to describe natural selection in language suggesting that it involved intentional selection, continuing the strong art-nature parallel found in the manuscripts. For example:

As man can produce and certainly has produced a great result by his methodical and unconscious means of selection, what may not nature effect? Man can act only on external and visible characters: nature cares nothing for appearances, except in so far as they may be useful to any being. She can act on every internal organ, on every shade of constitutional difference, on the whole machinery of life. Man selects only for his own good; Nature only for that of the being which she tends. Every selected character is fully exercised by her; and the being is placed under well-suited conditions of life. (Origin 1859: 83)

The manuscript history behind such passages prevents the simple discounting of these statements as mere rhetorical imagery. As we have seen, the parallel between intentional human selectivity and that of “nature” formed the original model upon which the concept of natural selection was originally constructed.

Criticisms that quickly developed over the overt intentionality embedded in such passages, however, led Darwin to revise the argument in editions beginning with the third edition of 1861. From this point onward he explicitly downplayed the intentional and teleological language of the first two editions, denying that his appeals to the selective role of “nature” were anything more than a literary figure, and he moved decisively in the direction of defining natural selection as the description of the action of natural laws working upon organisms rather than as an efficient or final cause of life. He also regrets in his Correspondence his mistake in not utilizing the designation “natural preservation” rather than “natural selection” to characterize his principle (letter to Lyell 28 September 1860, Burkhardt et al. 1993 8: 397; also see Darwin Correspondence Project in Other Internet Resources). The adoption in the fifth edition of 1869 of contemporary Herbert Spencer’s designator, “survival of the fittest” (Spencer 1864: 444–445; Origin 1869: 72), as a synonym for “natural selection”, further emphasized this shift of meaning away from the concept that can be extracted from the early texts and drafts. Thus the formulations of the principle in the final statements of the late 1860s and early 70s underlie the tradition of later “mechanistic” and non-teleological understandings of natural selection, a reading developed by his disciples who, in the words of David Depew, “had little use for either his natural theodicy or his image of a benignly scrutinizing selection” (Depew 2008: 253).

The conceptual synthesis of chapter four also introduced discussions of such matters as the conditions under which natural selection most optimally worked, the role of isolation, the causes of the extinction of species, and the principle of divergence. Many of these points were made through the imaginative use of “thought experiments” in which Darwin constructed possible scenarios through which natural selection could bring about substantial change. Although these were not regarded by his critics as empirical evidence for his claims, it has been argued that these assisted Darwin in satisfying certain criteria of adequacy as set forth by John Herschel’s methodological canons (Lennox 2005). One prominent way Darwin captured the complexity of this process is reflected in the single diagram to appear in all the editions of the Origin (Velasco 2013). In this illustration was summarized the image of gradual change from common ancestral points, the depiction of the frequent extinction of most lineages, the general tendency of populations to diverge and fragment under the pressure of population increase, and a way of envisioning relations of taxonomic affinity to time. It also depicted the persistence of some forms that are unchanged over long geological periods in which stable conditions prevail.

Graph labeled on the horizontal-axis with the letters A to L and on the vertical-axis with Roman numerals I to XIV. From A branch up several dashed lines; all but two stop before reaching vertical-level I; from those two branch up several more dashed lines, some stop before the next vertical-level those that don’t sprout up more lines, repeat though in some cases no line from a particular branch reaches the next vertical-level. Further description in the text following.

Figure: Tree of life diagram from Origin of Species (Origin 1859: between pages 116 and 117).

Remarkable about Darwin’s diagram of the tree of life is the relativity of its coordinates. It is first presented as applying only to the divergences taking place at the varietal level, with varieties represented by the small lower-case letters within species A–L of a “wide ranging genus”, with the horizontal time coordinates measured in terms of a limited number of generations. However, the attentive reader could quickly see that Darwin’s destructive analysis of the distinction between “natural” and “artificial” species and the relativity of the species-variety distinction, worked out in chapter two, allowed this diagram to represent eventually all organic relationships, from those at the non-controversial level of diverging varieties within fixed species, to those of the relations of species within different genera. Letters A–L could also represent taxa at the level of Genera, Families or Orders. The diagram can thus be applied to relationships between all levels of the Linnaean hierarchy with the vertical coordinates representing potentially vast expanses of time, and the horizontal coordinates the degree of taxonomic divergence over time. In a very few pages of argument, the diagram was generalized to represent the most extensive group relations, encompassing the whole of geological time. Extension of the dotted lines at the bottom could even suggest, as Darwin argues in the last paragraph of the book, that all life was a result of “several powers, having been originally breathed into a few forms or into one” (Origin 1859: 490). This could suggest a naturalistic origin of original forms either by material emergence, or through the action of a vitalistic power of life. It could also be read as implying the action of a supernatural cause.

In response to criticisms of his unclarity on this latter point, Darwin quickly added to the final paragraph in the second edition of 1860 the phrase “by the Creator” (1860: 484), which remained in all subsequent editions. Coupled with the quotations on the frontispiece that remained in all editions of the work, this could imply for some readers Darwin’s intent to locate work within the tradition of British natural theology and the long tradition running back to the Scholastics that conceptualized creation by secondary law. Conceptual space was thereby created for a reading of the Origin by some contemporaries, notably by the Harvard botanist Asa Gray (1810–88), as compatible with traditional natural theology (Gray 1860; Lennox 2013).

The sweep of the theoretical generalization that closed the natural selection chapter, one restated even more generally in the final paragraph of the book, required Darwin to deal with several obvious objections to the theory that would occupy him through the numerous revisions of the text between 1859 and 1872. As suggested by David Depew, the rhetorical structure of the original text developed in an almost “objections and response” structure that resulted in a constant stream of revisions to various editions of the original text as Darwin engaged his opponents (Depew 2008; Peckham 1959 [2006]). Anticipating at first publication several obvious lines of objection, Darwin devoted much of the text of the original Origin to offering a solution in advance to predictable difficulties. As Darwin outlined these main lines of objection, they included first the apparent absence of numerous slight gradations between species, both in the present and in the fossil record, of the kind that would seem to be predictable from the gradualist workings of the theory (chps. 6, 9). Second, the existence of organs and structures of extreme complexity, such as the vertebrate eye, structures that had since the writings of Galen in Hellenistic antiquity served as a mainstay of the argument for external teleological design, needed some plausible explanation (chp. 6). Third, the evolution of the elaborate instincts of animals and the puzzling problem of the evolution of social insects that developed sterile neuter castes, proved to be a particularly difficult issue for Darwin in the manuscript phase of his work and needed some account (chp. 7). As a fourth major issue needing attention, the traditional distinction between natural species defined by interfertility, and artificial species defined by morphological differences, first dealt with in Chapter Two, required an additional chapter of analysis in which he sought to undermine the absolute character of the interbreeding criterion as a sign of fixed natural species (chp. 8).

As a fifth topic, in chapter ten, Darwin developed his position on the fossil record. At issue was whether the known fossil record displays a gradual progression of forms from simple to complex, as might be argued by Lamarckian transformists, or whether it supported the claim for the persistence of major groups throughout the record as might be held by someone endorsing the tradition of Cuvier (see the entry on evolutionary thought before Darwin, Section 4.1). The thesis of geological progressionism had in fact been denied by none other than Darwin’s great mentor in geology, Charles Lyell in his Principles of Geology (1830–33; Desmond 1984; Bowler 1976). Darwin defended the progressionist view in this chapter.

To each of the lines of objection to his theory, Darwin offered his contemporaries plausible, if not for many critics compelling, replies (Hull 1973). Additional arguments were worked out through the insertion of numerous textual insertions over the five revisions of the Origin between 1860 and 1872, including the addition of a new chapter to the sixth edition dealing with “miscellaneous” objections. For reasons related both to the condensed and summary form of public presentation, and also as a reflection of the bold conceptual sweep of the theory, the primary argument of the Origin could not gain its force from the data presented by the book itself. Instead, it presented an argument from unifying simplicity, gaining its force from the ability of Darwin’s theory to draw together a wide variety of issues in taxonomy, comparative anatomy, paleontology, biogeography, and embryology under the simple principles worked out in the first four chapters (chps. 11–13). In important respects, this “consilience” argument might be seen as best reflecting the impact of William Whewell’s methodology (see above), although Whewell is not cited in any of the editions.

The explanatory methodology of Darwin’s theory also provided him with a means of defeating certain major objections, such as those drawn from the existence of organs of great complication and function. To deal with the question of the vertebrate eye in chapter six, for example, Darwin offered a few speculations on how such a structure could have developed by the gradual selection upon the rudimentary eyes of invertebrates. But the primary solution offered was the ability of his theory to draw together in its total argument numerous lines of inquiry that would not otherwise receive a coherent explanation. In such a case one would

admit that a structure even as perfect as the eye of an eagle might be formed by natural selection, although in this case he does not know any of the transitional grades. (Origin 1859: 188)

Here again, one might see Whewell’s notion of a “consilience of inductions” at work.

As Darwin envisioned it, with the acceptance of his theory, “a grand untrodden field of inquiry will be opened” (Origin 1859: 486) in biology and natural history. The long-standing issues of species origins, if not the ultimate origins of life, as well as the causes of their extinction, had been brought within the domain of naturalistic explanation. It is in this context that he makes the sole reference in the text to the claim that “light will be thrown on the origin of man and his history” (Origin 1859: 488).

3. The Reception of the Origin

3.1 The Popular Reception of Darwin’s Theory

The broad sweep of Darwin’s claims, the brevity of the empirical evidence actually supplied in the text, and the implications of his theory for several more general philosophical and theological issues, immediately opened up a controversy over Darwinian evolution that has waxed and waned over more than 150 years. As is well-known, Darwin developed his argument rhetorically with the claims of its explanatory superiority over the doctrine of “special creation”, which he posed as the main alternative to his account. This stylized opposition to “creationism”, rather than to the arguments raised by the traditions of Cuvier, Buffon, and Lyell that demonstratively formed the basis of the scientific opposition to transformism before Darwin (see the entry on evolutionary thought before Darwin), was a point of considerable criticism by contemporaries such as Richard Owen, who held no such theory of special creationism (Bowler 2013a). But the rhetorical strategy of opposing his theory to theistic creationism served to define much of the popular debate over Darwin’s theory in the succeeding period, and continues to define it in the present.

On the level of popular culture, Darwin’s theory fell into a complex social situation that took on different features in different national traditions. In the anglophone world, the great popularity of the anonymous Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation of 1844, which had reached 11 editions and sold 23,350 copies by December of 1860 (Secord “Introduction” to Chambers 1844 reprint [1994: xxvii]), with several more editions to appear by the end of the century, certainly prepared the groundwork for the general notion of the evolutionary origins of species by natural law. The Vestiges’s grand schema of a teleological development of life from the earliest beginnings of the solar system in a gaseous nebula to the emergence of humanity under the action of a great “law of development”, had also been popularized for Victorian readers by Alfred Lord Tennyson’s epic poem In Memoriam (1850). This provided a context in which some could read Darwin as supplying additional support for the belief in an optimistic historical development of life under teleological guidance with the promise of ultimate historical redemption. Such readings also rendered the Origin seemingly compatible with the progressive evolutionism of Herbert Spencer (1820–1903; see the entry on Herbert Spencer). Spencer’s writings have been shown to be an important vehicle by which Darwin’s views, modified to fit the progressivist views expounded by Spencer, were first introduced in non-Western contexts (Jin 2019a,b; Yang 2013; Lightman [ed.] 2015; Pusey 1983; Elshakry 2013) Most of this popular reception ignored or revised Darwin’s concept of evolution by natural selection to fit these progressivist alternatives (Bowler 1983). The popular image often depicted of a great public outcry against Darwin’s work has been shown by careful historical analysis to be generally mythical, or at least in need of careful discrimination by social group, national tradition, and religious affiliation (Bowler 2013a; Ellegård 1958).

Analysis of the various European receptions of Darwin’s work currently forms a scholarly industry in its own right (Bowler 2013a; Gayon 2013; Glick 1974 [1988], 2013; Glick & Shaffer 2014; Engels & Glick 2008; Gliboff 2008; Numbers 1998; Pancaldi, 1983 [1991]; Todes 1989; Kelly 1981; Hull 1973). Studies of non-Western receptions is a newer area in Darwin studies. These display similar patterns, but also important differences, from the reception in European contexts (Jin 2019a,b; Yang 2013; Shen 2016; Elshakry 2013; Glick 1988 “Preface”; Pusey 1983). These studies continue to display a common pattern in which the general reception of Darwin’s theories was conditioned, if not determined, by the pre-existing intellectual, scientific, social, and political contexts into which Darwin’s theories were inserted.

Three examples—France, Germany, and China—can be elaborated upon. In France, Darwin’s theory was received against the background of the prior debates over transformism of the 1830s that pitted the theories of Lamarck and Etienne Geoffroy St. Hilaire against Cuvier (Gayon 2013; entry on evolutionary thought before Darwin, 4.1). At least within official Parisian science, these debates had been resolved in favor of Cuvier’s anti-transformism. Darwin was, as a consequence, viewed as endorsing rejected science by leading figures of French science. As the leading physiologist and methodologist of French Science, Claude Bernard (1813–78) put this in 1865, Darwin’s theory was to be regarded with those of “a Goethe, an Oken, a Carus, a Geoffroy Saint Hilaire”, locating it within speculative philosophy of nature rather than granting it the status of “positive” science (Bernard 1865: 158–159 [1957: 91–92]). The intellectual framework provided by the “positive philosophy” of Auguste Comte (1798–1857) also worked both for and against Darwin. On one hand, Comte’s emphasis on the historical progress of science over superstition and metaphysics allowed Darwin to be summoned in support of a theory of the progress of science. The Origin was so interpreted in the preface to the first French translation of the Origin made by Clémence Royer (Harvey 2008). On the other hand, the Comtean three stages view of history, with its claim about the historical transcendence of speculative and metaphysical periods of science by a final period of experimental science governed by determinate laws, placed Darwinism in a metaphysical phase of speculative nature philosophy, as captured in the above quotation from Claude Bernard.

In the Germanies, Darwin’s work entered a complex social, intellectual and political situation in the wake of the failed efforts to establish liberal democracy in 1848. It also entered an intellectual culture strongly influenced by the pre-existent philosophical traditions of Kant, of Schelling’s Naturphilosophie, German Romanticism, and the Idealism of Fichte and Hegel (R.J. Richards 2002, 2008, 2013; Gliboff 2008, 2007; Mullen 1964). These factors formed a complex political and philosophical environment into which Darwin’s developmental view of nature and theory of the transformation of species was quickly assimilated, if also altered. Many readings of Darwin consequently interpreted his arguments against a background of Schelling’s philosophy of nature. Darwin’s role in debates over scientific materialism were also brought to the fore by the enthusiastic advocacy of Darwinism in Germany by University of Jena professor of zoology Ernst Heinrich Haeckel (1834–1919). More than any other individual, Haeckel made Darwinismus a major player in the polarized political and religious disputes of Bismarckian Germany (R.J. Richards 2008). Through his polemical writings, such as the Natural History of Creation (1868), Anthropogeny (1874), and Riddle of the Universe (1895–99), Haeckel advocated a materialist monism in the name of Darwin, and used this as a stick with which to beat traditional religion. Much of the historical conflict between religious communities and evolutionary biology can be traced back to Haeckel’s polemical writings, which went through numerous editions and translations, including several English and American editions that appeared into the early decades of the twentieth century.

To turn to a very different context, that of China, Darwin’s works entered Chinese discussions by a curious route. The initial discussions of Darwinian theory were generated by the translation of Thomas Henry Huxley’s 1893 Romanes Lecture “Evolution and Ethics” by the naval science scholar Yan Fu (1854–1921) who had encountered Darwinism while being educated at the Royal Naval College in Greenwich from 1877 to 1899. This translation was accompanied by Huxley’s “Prolegomena”, and was accompanied with an extensive commentary by Yan Fu drawing heavily upon the writings of Herbert Spencer. This translation, published under the name of Tianyan Lun in 1898, has been shown to have been the main vehicle by which the Chinese learned of Darwin’s work (Jin 2019a,b; Yang 2013; Pusey 1983). Beginning in 1902 with a partial translation by Ma Junwu (1881–1940), a Chinese scientist, trained in chemistry and metallurgy in Japan and Germany, the early chapters of the Origin itself were made available to a Chinese audience. This initial translation of the first five chapters between 1902 and 1906 by Ma Junwu modified the text to agree with the progressive evolutionism of Spencer and with Yan Fu’s popular Tianyan Lun. Only in September of 1920 did the Chinese have Ma Junwu’s full translation of Darwin’s sixth edition. This gave a more faithful rendering of Darwin’s text, including an accurate translation of Darwin’s final views on natural selection (Jin 2019a,b). As a political reformer and close associate of democratic reformer Sun Yat-Sen (1866–1925), Junwu’s concern with Darwin also was involved in revolutionary Chinese politics (Jin 2019a).

3.2 The Professional Reception of Darwin’s Theory

One cannot always distinguish between “popular” and “professional” receptions of Darwin. The simplest solution is to confine the latter designation to those who embraced Darwin’s version of a general theory of descent with modification by people with professional research and teaching positions in universities and scientific societies, those who were intimately familiar with the empirical evidence and the technical scientific issues under debate in the 1860s in geology, comparative anatomy, embryology, biogeography, and classification theory. This group can usually be distinguished from lay interpreters who may not have made distinctions between the views of Lamarck, Chambers, Schelling, Spencer, and Darwin on the historical development of life. But this only gives a crude instrument of analysis.

The case of Ernst Haeckel displays this imprecision. He was a leading professor of zoology at an important German university (Jena), and he formed a generation of scientific workers in embryology and natural history who had major impact on the history of the life sciences. From his position, Haeckel was able to develop Darwinism both as a popular movement with social and political extensions, and also as a scientific research program that pursued the study of morphology and comparative embryology in the light of Darwin’s general theory (R.J. Richards 1992: chp. 6, 2008, 2013; Nyhart 1995).

If we concentrate on the reception by workers holding professional positions in museums, laboratories, and research and teaching positions in universities and membership in elite scientific societies, Darwin’s reception was varied (Bowler 1996; Hull 1973). Many prominent members of Darwin’s immediate intellectual circle—Adam Sedgwick, William Whewell, Charles Lyell, Richard Owen, and Thomas Huxley—had previously been highly critical of Chambers’s Vestiges in the 1840s for its speculative character and its scientific incompetence (Secord 2000). Darwin himself feared a similar reception, and he recognized the substantial challenge facing him in convincing this group and the larger community of scientific specialists with which he interacted and corresponded widely. With this group he was only partially successful.

Historical studies have revealed that only rarely did members of the scientific elites accept and develop Darwin’s theories exactly as they were presented in his texts. Statistical studies on the reception by the scientific community in England in the first decade after the publication of the Origin have shown a complicated picture in which there was neither wide-spread conversion of the scientific community to Darwin’s views, nor a clear generational stratification between younger converts and older resisters, counter to Darwin’s own predictions in the final chapter of the Origin (Hull et al. 1978). These studies also reveal a distinct willingness within the scientific community to separate acceptance of Darwin’s more general claim of species descent with modification from common ancestors from the endorsement of his explanation of this descent through the action of natural selection (Bowler 1983, 2013a). To utilize the categories of a Lakatosian “research program” analysis of scientific theories in their historical extension, one can distinguish between a “hard core” of defining central assumptions, a “protective belt” of auxiliary hypotheses that protect this central core from refutations, and a “positive heuristic” of applied research applications that are subject to continued revision and even refutation (Lakatos 1970). With these distinctions in mind, it is difficult to claim that anything more than the belief in descent from common ancestry was maintained by a broadly international scientific community at the “hard core” level in the period between 1870–1930. This meant that the historical impact of Darwin’s theories on the professional scientific community must consider the important deviations from his own formulations (Bowler 1983, 2003).

Of central importance in analyzing this complex professional reception was the role assigned to normal individual variation and its causes. In the initial public presentation of his theory, Darwin had relied on the novel claim that small individual variations—the kind of differences considered by an earlier tradition as merely “accidental”—formed the raw material upon which, by unlimited addition through the action of natural selection, major changes could be produced sufficient to explain the origin and subsequent differences in all the various forms of life over time. Darwin, however, left the specific causes of this variation unspecified beyond some effect of the environment on the sexual organs. Variation was presented in the Origin with the statement that “the laws governing inheritance are quite unknown” (Darwin 1859: 13). In keeping with his commitment to the gradualism of Lyellian geology, Darwin also rejected the role of major “sports” or other sources of discontinuous change in this process.

As critics focused their attacks on the claim that such micro-differences between individuals could be accumulated over time without natural limits, Darwin began a series of modifications and revisions of the theory through a back and forth dialogue with his critics that can be followed by revisions to the text of the Origin. In the fourth edition of 1866, for example, Darwin inserted the claim that the continuous gradualism illustrated by his branching diagram was misleading, and that transformative change does not necessarily go on continuously. “It is far more probable that each form remains for long periods unaltered, and then again undergoes modification” (Origin 1866: 132 [Peckham 1959 [2006: 213]). This change-stasis-change model presumably allowed variation to stabilize for a period of time around a mean value from which additional change could then resume. Such a model would, however, presumably require even more time for its working than the multi-millions of years assumed in the original presentation of the theory.

The difficulties in Darwin’s arguments that had emerged by 1866 were highlighted in a lengthy and telling critique in 1867 by the Scottish engineer Henry Fleeming Jenkin (1833–85) (typically Fleeming Jenkin). Using an argument previously raised in the 1830s by Charles Lyell against Lamarck, Fleeming Jenkin cited empirical evidence from domestic breeding that suggested a distinct limitation on the degree of variation, and denied that selection upon this could be taken to the extent assumed by Darwin (Fleeming Jenkin 1867; Hoquet 2013). Using a loosely mathematical argument, Fleeming Jenkin argued that the effects of intercrossing would continuously swamp deviations from the mean values of characters and result in a tendency of the variation in a population to return to mean values over time. For Fleeming Jenkin, Darwin’s reliance on continuous additive deviation was presumed to be undermined by this argument, and only more dramatic and discontinuous change—something Darwin explicitly rejected—could account for the origin of new species.

Fleeming Jenkin also argued that the time needed by Darwin’s theory was simply inadequate, supporting this claim by an appeal to the physical calculations of the probable age of the earth presented in publications by Fleeming Jenkin’s mentor, the Glasgow physicist William Thompson (Lord Kelvin, 1824–1907; Burchfield, 1975). On the basis of Thompson’s quantitative physical arguments, Fleeming Jenkin judged the time since the origin of the solar system to be insufficient for the Darwinian gradualist theory of species transformation to take place. Jenkin’s multi-pronged argument gave Darwin considerable difficulties and set the stage for more detailed empirical inquiries into variation and its causes. The time difficulties were only resolved in the twentieth-century with the discovery of radioactivity.

As a solution to the variation question, Darwin developed his “provisional hypothesis” of pangenesis, which he presented the year after the appearance of the Fleeming Jenkin review in his two-volume Variation of Plants and Animals Under Domestication (1868, second edition 1875; Olby 2013). Although this theory had been formulated independently of the Jenkin review (Olby 1963), in effect it functioned as his reply to it. This offered a causal theory of variation and inheritance through a return to a theory resembling Buffon’s theory of the organic molecules of the previous century (see entry on evolutionary thought before Darwin section 3.2). Invisible material “gemmules” were presumed to exist within the cells, and according to theory, these were subject to possible external alteration by environment and circumstance. The gemmules were then shed continually into the blood stream (the “transport” hypothesis) and assembled by “mutual affinity for each other, leading to their aggregation into buds or into the sexual elements” (Variation 1875: vol. 2: 370). In this form they were then transmitted—the details were not explained—by sexual generation to the next generation to form the new organism out of “units of which each individual is composed” (ibid.). In Darwin’s view, this hypothesis united together numerous issues into a coherent and causal theory of inheritance and explained the basis of variation. It also explained how use-disuse inheritance, a theory which Darwin never abandoned, could work.

The pangenesis theory, although not specifically referred to, seems to be behind an important distinction he inserted into the fifth edition of the Origin of 1869 where he made a direct reply to the criticisms of Jenkin. In this textual revision, Darwin distinguished “certain variations, which no one would rank as mere individual differences”, from ordinary variations (Origin 1869: 105) [Peckham 1959 [2006: 178–179]]). This revision shifted Darwin’s emphasis away from his early reliance on normal slight individual variation, and gave new status to what he termed by the sixth edition of 1872 “strongly marked” variations. The latter were now the form of variation to be given primary evolutionary significance, and presumably this was more likely to be transmitted to the offspring, although details are left unclear. In this form it presumably could be maintained in a population against the tendency to swamping by intercrossing. Darwin’s struggles over this issue defined a set of problems that British life scientists in particular were to deal with into the 1930s. The debates over variation placed Darwinism in a defensive posture that forced its supporters into major revisions in the Darwinian research program (Gayon 1998; Vorzimmer 1970). The long period between 1870 and 1930, sometimes characterized as the “Eclipse” of Darwinism, or at least of his natural selection theory, was the outcome of these debates (Bowler 1983, 2013a).

4. Human Evolution and the Descent of Man

4.1 The Genesis of Darwin’s Descent

Darwin had retained his own conclusions on human evolution quietly in the background while the defense of his general theory was conducted by advocates as diverse as Thomas Henry Huxley (1825–95) in England, Asa Gray (1810–88) in the United States, and Ernst Haeckel (1834–1919) in Germany. Darwin’s own position on the “human question” remained unclear, and his rhetorical situating of the Origin within a tradition of divine creation by secondary law, captured in the frontispiece quotations from William Whewell and Francis Bacon, retained in all editions, in some degree allowed many before 1871 to see Darwin as more open to religious views than those of some of his popularizers.

It was in February of 1867 that Darwin decided to remove material from his massive manuscript of the Variation of Plants and Animals Under Domestication and create a “very small volume, ‘an essay on the origin of mankind’” (Darwin to Hooker, 8 February 1867 and CD to Turner, 11 February 1867, Burkhardt et al. 2006 15: 74, 80). At this time he also sent to several correspondents a questionnaire asking for information on human emotional expression. This expanded into a major enterprise in which he became deeply engaged with the issue of the implications of his theory for ethics, writing to Asa Gray that “the difficulties of the Moral sense has [sic] caused me much labor” (CD to Gray, 15 March 1870, Burkhardt et al. 2010 18: 68). This was expanded into a two volume work by the time it was sent to the printer in June of 1870. By this date he had also pulled out a separate section from the Variation manuscript that was to become the Expression of the Emotions in Man and the Animals,published in 1872.

4.2. Reception of the Descent

The dual publication of the Descent of Man, and Selection in Relation to Sex (1871) and the Expression of the Emotions (1872) created a watershed in the public reception of Darwin’s views (Radick 2013). Although Darwin had first worked out many of his views on human evolution in the early “M” and “N” Notebooks of 1838–40, public knowledge of Darwin’s own conclusions on human evolution rested on the one vague sentence on the issue in the Origin itself. The Descent, however, made public his more radical conclusions, and seemed to many of his readers, even those previously sympathetic to the Origin, to throw Darwin’s weight behind materialist and anti-religious forces spearheaded by such individuals as German physiologist Friederich Ludwig Büchner (1824–1899), Dutch physiologist Jacob Moleschott (1822–93), English socialist and Darwin popularizer Edward Aveling (1849–98), and German zoologist Ernst Haeckel. Although the question of human evolution had already been dealt with in part by Thomas Huxley in the Man’s Place in Nature of 1863, by Charles Lyell in the same year in his Geological Evidences of the Antiquity of Man, by Alfred Russel Wallace in articles in 1864 and 1870 (Wallace 1864, 1870 and online), and by Haeckel in his Natürliche Schöpfungsgeschichte of 1868, these authors had either not dealt with the full range of questions presented by the inclusion of human beings in the evolutionary process (Huxley), or they had emphasized the moral and mental discontinuity between humans and animals (Lyell, Wallace). Only Haeckel had drawn out a more general reductive conception of humanity from evolutionary theory and he had not ventured into the specific issues of ethics, social organization, the origins of human races, and the relation of human mental properties to those of animals, all of which are dealt with in the Descent. Darwin’s two-volume treatise presented, as one commentator has put it, “a closer resemblance to Darwin’s early naturalistic vision than anything else he ever published” (Durant 1985: 294).

Darwin’s extension of his theory to a range of questions traditionally discussed within philosophy, theology, and social and political theory, hardened the opposition of many religiously-based communities to evolutionary theory, although here again, distinctions must be made between different communities (Ellegård 1958: chp. 14). Such opposition was not simply based upon the denial of the literal scriptural account of the origins of humankind, an issue that played out differently within the main religious communions (Haught 2013; Finnegan 2013; Swetlitz 2013; Artigas, Glick, & Martinez 2006; Moore 1979). The more fundamental opposition was due to the denial of distinctions, other than those of degree, between fundamental human properties and those of animals. Furthermore, the apparent denial of some kind of divine guidance in the processes behind human evolution and the non-teleological character of Darwin’s final formulations of the natural selection theory in the fifth and sixth editions of the Origin, hardened this opposition. His adoption from Herbert Spencer of designator “survival of the fittest” as a synonym for “natural selection” in the fifth edition added to this growing opposition. As a consequence, the favorable readings that many influential religious thinkers—John Henry Newman (1801–1890) is a good example—had given to the original Origin, disappeared. The rhetoric of the Descent, with its conclusion that “man is descended from a hairy quadruped, furnished with a tail and pointed ears” (1871: vol. 2: 389), presented to the public a different Darwin than many had associated with the author of the Journal of Researches and the early editions of the Origin.

Most striking in comparing the Origin to the Descent was the strong emphasis on the workings of the secondary process of sexual selection in the animal kingdom (E. Richards 2017; R.A. Richards 2013). Sexual selection—the selection of females by males or vice versa for breeding purposes—had given a general statement of this principle in chapter four of the Origin, but this played a minor role in the original argument, and its importance was denied by contemporaries like A. R. Wallace. Darwin now developed this secondary form of selection in extensive detail as a factor in evolution that could even work against ordinary natural selection. Sexual selection could now be marshaled to explain both sexual dimorphism and also those character and properties of organisms—elaborate feeding organs, bright colors on fish and birds, and seemingly maladaptive structures such as the great horn on the Rhinoceros beetle—, that might appear to be anomalous outcomes of ordinary natural selection working to the optimal survival of organisms in nature. In a dramatic extension of this principle to human beings, the combination of natural and sexual selection is used to explain the origins of the human beings from simian ancestors. It also explains the sexual dimorphism displayed by human beings, and is the main factor accounting for the origin of human races.

4.3 The Ethical Theory of the Descent of Man

The many dimensions of “social” Darwinism that were affected by the Descent demand separate articles, as does the separate impact of the Expression of the Emotions, a treatise that in many respects is different in tone and content from the Descent. It is also the case that many of the social implications of evolutionary theory were due more to the influence of Herbert Spencer than to Darwin’s own writings, and for this reason what has been termed “social Darwinism” may have developed independently of Darwin (Bowler 2013b). In this closing subsection the author will focus exclusively on one important aspect of this broader social impact of the Descent, the Darwinian treatment of ethics. This will be examined within its specific Victorian context, rather than in light of more recent discussions of altruism within contemporary sociobiology that may owe some filiation with these Darwinian discussion (see entries on morality and evolutionary biology and biological altruism).

As can be seen from the letter to Asa Gray of March 1870 (Burkhardt et al. 2010 18: 68) , Darwin was particularly exercised by the issue of ethics in preparing the Descent. His published treatment focused the long chapter three of the Descent on the issue of the “moral sense”. In approaching ethics “exclusively from the side of natural history” (Descent 1871: vol 1: 71), he offered some innovations that do not easily map on to standard ethical positions formulated around the familiar categories of Utilitarianism and the Kantian heritage of Deontology. The closest connections might be drawn with certain aspects of contemporary virtue ethics and some aspects of Natural Law theory, although there are many specific differences that prevent assimilation to these traditions as well (Sloan 1999). His closest historical affinities are with the Scottish moral sense tradition of Adam Smith, David Hume, and particularly as this was developed in the writings of Darwin’s distant relative, Sir James Macintosh (1765–1832) (R.J. Richards 1987, 1999, 2003, .

Traditional moral sense theory linked ethical behavior to an innate property or instinct that was considered universal in human beings, even though it required education and cultivation to reach its highest expression (see moral sentimentalism in this encyclopedia). This inherent property, or “moral sense”, presumably explained such phenomena as ethical conscience, and it also accounted for altruistic actions that could not be reduced to a hedonic seeking of pleasure and avoiding pain. It also did not involve the rational calculation of advantage by the individual prior to action.

Darwin’s reinterpretation of the moral sense tradition within his evolutionary framework, however, implied important transformations. The moral sense, for Darwin, was derived by biological descent from animal instinct, and particularly from the social instincts developed by natural selection. From this perspective, Darwin could then argue for a genuine “homology” of ethical foundations holding between humans and animals, with the precursors of human ethical behavior found in the behavior of other animals, particularly those with social organization. Natural and sexual selection then shaped these ethical instincts in ways that favored group survival rather than immediate individual benefit (Descent 1871: vol. 1: 98). Human ethical behavior is therefore grounded in a natural property, and ethical action can occur without moral calculus or rational deliberation. Because he considered ethical action to be grounded on a biologically innate property, Darwin criticized John Stuart Mill’s Utilitarian theory because it relied on acquired habits rather than something present in humans from the beginning (1871: vol. 1: 71n5). The innate moral sense is his explanation for self-sacrifice and other altruistic acts that cannot be attributed to individual self-survival (1871: vol. 1: 86). Humans can be

impelled by the same instinctive motive, which made the heroic little American monkey…attack the great and dreaded baboon, to save his keeper. (Descent 1871: vol. 1: 87)

When moral conflict occurs, this is generally attributed to a conflict of instincts, with the stronger of two conflicting instincts favored by natural selection insofar as it favors group benefit (Descent 1871: vol. 1: 84). In human beings the “more enduring Social Instincts” thus come to override the less persistent “individual” instincts (1871: vol. 1: 87).

The adequacy of evolutionary ethical naturalism as a foundation for ethical realism has been a point of contention for Darwin’s contemporaries and successors since the publication of the Descent. For some moral philosophers, Darwin had simply reduced ethics to a property subject to the relativizing tendencies of natural selection (Farber 1994: chp. 5). It was, in the view of Darwin’s philosophical critics, to reduce ethics to biology and in doing so, to offer no way to distinguish ethical goods from survival advantages. Not even for some strong supporters of Darwinism, such as Thomas Huxley and Alfred Russel Wallace, was Darwin’s account adequate (Farber 1994: chp. 4). Much of subsequent moral philosophy was to be grounded upon the canonical acceptance of the “is-ought” distinction, which developed from this critique of “evolutionary” ethical theory. Receiving its most influential expression in G. E. Moore ’s (1873–1958) Principia Ethica (1903)—itself an attack on Spencer’s version of evolutionary ethics—, the debate over the adequacy of evolutionary ethics has continued (Hauser 2006; Katz (ed.) 2000; Maienschein & Ruse (eds.) 1999).

5. Summary and Conclusion

The historiography adopted in this article rejects a simple linear story of the development of Darwinian theory as a history of increasingly true theories leading to a present consensus. Instead it favors a more complicated “competing research programs” analysis (Lakatos 1970), programs which through historical competition have resulted in more adequate accounts of the relation of living beings to historical time and naturalistic processes, but which show repeated historical competition with one another .

More general philosophical issues associated with evolutionary theory—those surrounding natural teleology, ethics, the relation of evolutionary naturalism to the claims of religious traditions, the implications for the relation of human beings to the rest of the organic world—continue as issues of scholarly inquiry. If contemporary neo-selectionist evolutionary theory displays continuity with select features of the theories of Darwin, alternative interpretations, such as the current movement known as evolutionary developmental theory or “evo-devo”, mark a return to presumably discarded traditions of the nineteenth and twentieth century that considered it essential to link evolution with embryonic development and with the effects of external conditions on inheritance (Gilbert 2015; Newman 2015; Laubichler & Maienschein 2013, [eds] 2007; Gissis & Jablonka [eds] 2011; Pigliucci & Müller [eds] 2010; Amundson 2005; Gilbert, Opitz, & Raff 1996). Such developments suggest that there are still substantial theoretical issues at stake that may alter the future understanding of evolutionary theory in important ways (Sloan, McKenny, & Eggleson [eds] 2015).


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Other Internet Resources


The author wishes to acknowledge the valuable comments on this article by David Depew, M.J.S. Hodge, Robert Richards, and Xiaoxing Jin. Additional comments were made by Michael Ruse, Edward Zalta, M. Katherine Tillman, and the anonymous reviewers for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. I am particularly indebted to my student, Mr. Xiaoxing Jin, for information contained in his substantial doctoral work and subsequent research on the reception of Darwinism into China. Responsibility for all interpretations is my own.

Copyright © 2019 by
Phillip Sloan <sloan.1@nd.edu>

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