The Phenomenology of the Munich and Göttingen Circles

First published Mon Aug 3, 2015; substantive revision Thu Nov 5, 2020

In the first decades of the twentieth century, the members of the so-called “Munich and Göttingen circles” of phenomenology made important contributions to philosophy of mind, philosophy of language, philosophy of action, epistemology, social philosophy, axiology, and ontology. Some of the most prominent members of these circles are Alfred Brunswig, Theodor Conrad, Hedwig Conrad-Martius, Johannes Daubert, August Gallinger, Moritz Geiger, Roman Ingarden, Alexander Pfänder, Adolf Reinach, Wilhelm Schapp, Max Scheler, Kurt Stavenhagen, Edith Stein, and Gerda Walther. The ideas of these authors were influenced by such thinkers as Henri Bergson, Bernard Bolzano, Franz Brentano, Theodor Lipps, Hermann Lotze, Anton Marty, Alexius Meinong, and—perhaps to a more significant degree—by the work of Edmund Husserl.

Some of the most original insights provided by what has also been characterized as “early phenomenology” concern the notion of intentionality, which is the property of some mental states whereby they are directed towards objects and states of affairs. Several members of the Munich and Göttingen circles claimed that there are radically different kinds of intentionality (and, by extension, of intentional acts), which cannot be reduced to a unitary genus. Moreover, these authors fostered our understanding of various forms of intersubjective intentionality by developing insightful theories about social or speech acts, empathy, and collective intentionality.

Early phenomenologists understood the investigation of mental experiences as part of a general theory of objects or ontology, and their contributions share some common traits on this matter. In particular, it was assumed that objects and facts exist independently of anyone’s beliefs, mental states or conceptual schemes, and that they instantiate essential properties. The two main categories of phenomenological ontology, to which several members of both circles devoted extensive research, are that of objects and states of affairs.

1. The Munich and Göttingen Circles of Phenomenology: A Brief History

At the turn of the twentieth century, the relation between philosophy and psychology was a topic of intense debate in various academic circles. Among other issues, this debate concerned whether psychology should be understood as a philosophical discipline or, the other way around, whether philosophy should be grounded in psychology. Of particular importance to this debate is whether ethical, metaphysical and logical concepts are psychological or not. Since these concepts are usually held to be constitutive of the corresponding laws of ethics, metaphysics, and logic, claiming that these concepts are psychological would imply that the nature of such laws is psychological and, thus, that their investigation is a task that should be assigned to psychology. To give an example, according to logical psychologism (Mohanty 1982: §2; Kusch 2007 [2011]), the law of the excluded middle is about the psychological impossibility of a subject judging that p and that non-p at the same time. On this interpretation, this law is psychological in nature and its investigation should be pursued by psychology. Psychologism was not uncontested, as we will see: although the anti-psychologist camp encompassed different views as to how logical, ethical, and metaphysical concepts have to be positively defined, these views all agreed on the negative insight that logic, ethics, and metaphysics do not depend on psychology.

It is against this background that Theodor Lipps founded the Academic Society for Psychology in Munich, most likely in 1895. Lipps, who was both a philosopher and a trained psychologist, helped to shape the Department of Philosophy in Munich, where he became professor in 1894. Although Lipps revised his initial views over the years, by the end of the nineteenth century he endorsed a psychologistic approach by promoting a form of psychology that he at times qualified as “descriptive” (1903: 5). Lipps understood descriptive psychology as a discipline that, by means of inner perception, describes, compares, and systematizes mental contents (basically, any part of our conscious mental life, see 1903: 5). Lipps maintained that inner perception is able to grasp these contents with evidence.

The meetings of the Society dealt with a broad range of issues at the intersection of philosophy and psychology. Some of the topics discussed in the initial years are: “the sensations and the contents of consciousness as objects of psychology” (1895), “the theory of feelings and striving” (1895–1896), “the definition of psychology” (1896), etc. (Schuhmann 2000: 19f). In addition to Lipps, other senior figures of the circle were Alexander Pfänder, Max Ettlinger, and Johannes Daubert. In the decades after its foundation, a rapidly growing community of young students partook in the activities of the Society. These students included (in alphabetical order): Maximilian Beck, Alfred Brunswig, Theodor Conrad (nephew of Theodor Lipps), Aloys Fischer, August Gallinger, Moritz Geiger, Dietrich von Hildebrand, Paul Linke, Karl Loewenstein-Freudenberg, Karl Löwith, Adolf Reinach, Hermann Ritzel, Herman Schmalenbach, Otto Selz, Alfred Schwenninger, Gerda Walther, and Czesław Znamierowski (Avé-Lallemant 1975a; Smid 1982). It is worth noting that Max Scheler, who had been teaching in Munich since 1906, also participated in these meetings. Scheler’s philosophy followed its own peculiar trajectory within the history of phenomenology and deeply influenced the members of the Munich and, later on, Göttingen circle.

Tradition credits Daubert with the merit of submitting Edmund Husserl’s work to the attention of the group in Munich. Daubert began to discuss Husserl’s Logical Investigations (1900–01, henceforth: LI) at the meetings of the Society from 1902 (Schuhmann 2002; Smid 1985: 269). This two-volume work follows Husserl’s first book of 1891, Philosophy of Arithmetic. Psychological and Logical Investigations (Hua XII), and is the result of Husserl’s attempt to reconcile the various positions that inspired his thinking in that period and, in particular, the logical realism advocated by authors like Bernard Bolzano, Hermann Lotze, and Gottlob Frege, and the philosophical psychology of Franz Brentano and Carl Stumpf. Briefly after the publication of the LI, Husserl was appointed Extraordinary Professor at the University of Göttingen, where Daubert paid him a visit in 1903. This was the first personal contact between Husserl and a member of the Munich circle and has been described as “easily the most important single event in the history of the Munich Phenomenological Circle” (Spiegelberg 1982: 169). As a consequence of this meeting, Husserl was invited to give a lecture at the Society in May 1904, after which the LI became one of the main philosophical references for the members of the Munich circle.

As the following section illustrates, the LI were not received without substantial criticism, but one element that was explicitly appreciated in Husserl’s line of argument was its anti-psychologism, which early phenomenological reading of this work put particular emphasis on. Husserl devoted extensive efforts especially in the first volume of the LI (the Prolegomena to Pure Logic) to show that the laws of logic and ontology are not psychological. Mental acts are intentional, i.e., they are directed towards objects and facts that transcend the mind: these objects and facts are not mere contents of consciousness and, thus, have a structure of their own, which is regulated by laws of their own. Early phenomenologists thought this idea provided the systematic basis for what could be qualified as an “objectivist” approach to philosophical problems (according to which ontology, logic, ethics and aesthetics are about entities with an ontological status of their own, see Conrad 1954 [1992: 81]; in a similar vein, Geiger speaks of a “turning to the object” in the LI, see Geiger 1933: 13). At the same time, the Prolegomena also questions what it means for mental experiences to be intentionally directed towards objects and asks for a clarification of the relationship between logic and psychology. The second volume of the book (Investigations in Phenomenology and Theory of Knowledge) attempts to provide a solution to these and cognate questions by presenting an articulated theory of intentionality, which attracted a more critical reception in early phenomenology (partly because this theory was perceived as, to some extent, reneging on the anti-psychologist principles of the Prolegomena, see Conrad-Martius 1959: 177).

In 1905, Daubert and Reinach began to attend Husserl’s lectures in Göttingen. This initiated a trend that culminated in what has been described as the “Munich invasion” of Göttingen (Schapp 1959: 20f): in 1906, several students of Lipps left Munich to study under Husserl. The first were Moritz Geiger, Alfred Schwenninger, and Fritz Weinmann, but others followed: most notably, Conrad in 1907 and von Hildebrand in 1909. Göttingen became thus home to a large community of young phenomenologists, which included: Winthrop Bell, Rudolf Clemens, Hedwig Conrad-Martius, Fritz Frankfurter, Siegfried Hamburger, Erich Heinrich, Jean Héring, Heinrich Hoffman, Roman Ingarden, Alexandre Koyré, Hans Lipps, Dietrich Mahnke, Helmuth Plessner, Wilhelm Schapp, Kurt Stavenhagen, Edith Stein, and Alfred von Sybel (Avé-Lallemant 1988; Sepp 1988a).

This group of scholars gave itself an institutional form when Conrad and von Sybel founded the Philosophical Society of Göttingen in 1907. The pivotal center of this new circle of phenomenology was Adolf Reinach, who taught at the local university after receiving his habilitation to teach at university level (the venia legendi) in 1909. Reinach’s philosophical and didactic skills were so admired that several members referred to him, and not Husserl, as their teacher in phenomenology (Conrad-Martius 1921; Ingarden 1968 [1998: 408f]; Stein 1965: 195; von Hildebrand 1975: 78).

The period that extended from 1906 to the end of the First World War was particularly fruitful in the history of early phenomenology. Important dissertations were submitted and defended (e.g., Conrad in 1909, Conrad-Martius in 1912 [1913], von Hildebrand in 1912 [1917], Stein in 1917). In 1911 Pfänder edited the important Lipps-Festschrift with the title Munich Philosophical Essays (1911b), which contains influential articles by Brunswig, Conrad, Geiger, Reinach, and Pfänder himself. Just two years later, in 1913, the first volume of the Yearbook for Philosophy and Phenomenological Research (Jahrbuch für Phänomenologie und phänomenologische Forschung) appeared: Geiger, Pfänder, Reinach, and Scheler were co-editors, together with Husserl. By presenting classics such as the first part of Pfänder’s On the Psychology of Sentiments, Geiger’s Contributions to the Phenomenology of Aesthetic Enjoyment, the first part of Scheler’s Formalism in Ethics and Non-Formal Ethics of Values, and Reinach’s The Apriori Foundations of the Civil Law, this volume probably marks the peak in the philosophical production of the two circles.

The first volume of the Yearbook also featured Husserl’s Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, where Husserl places transcendental philosophy at the heart of his research agenda in terms that are far clearer than those he has used up to that point. Husserl’s transcendental phenomenology has many facets and one aspect is particularly significant for early phenomenologists: this is the idea of a necessary correlation between reality and consciousness (Zahavi 2008: 361). To put this in Husserl’s own words:

[a]n object existing in itself is never one with which consciousness or the Ego pertaining to consciousness has nothing to do. (Hua III/1, Eng. trans. 106)

Husserl’s so-called transcendental idealism remains a matter of debate today: questions concerning the relation between Husserl’s Ideas and his previous works (especially the LI) or the exact location of his transcendental phenomenology between the two poles of idealism and realism have not yet found a definite answer in the relevant literature.

In the Munich and Göttingen circles, Husserl’s Ideas was intensively discussed. Parts of its research program were pursued further; to make just one example, Héring (1921) and Ingarden (1925) further developed Husserl’s eidetics (ontology of essences). Generally, however, the Ideas provoked what could be seen as a mirror image reaction, for it provided young phenomenologists with an opportunity to renew their commitment to a robust form of metaphysical realism, which was perceived as incompatible with Husserl’s transcendental idealism. Reality, it was claimed, exists independently of subjectivity (whether this is intended empirically or transcendentally). The clash between these two different approaches to phenomenology has been labeled “the realism-idealism controversy” (Ingarden 1929; Avé-Lallemant 1975b) and turned out to be a decisive episode in the history of the phenomenological movement. To mention but one of its most important consequences, Husserl referred to Pfänder’s dismissal of transcendental idealism (shared, as he writes, by “the phenomenologists of the Munich and Göttingen tradition”) as the main reason for preferring Martin Heidegger as his successor for the professorship in Freiburg in 1928 (Husserl 1994: 180f).

The tragedy of the Great War not only led to an abrupt stop in the scientific output of the two circles, but also contributed to the dissolution of the Munich and, in particular, the Göttingen group. Many among early phenomenologists died at the front: Reinach fell in 1917, and his fate was shared by, among others, Clemens, Frankfurter, and Ritzel. In 1916, when Husserl moved to Freiburg to take over Heinrich Rickert’s position as chair of philosophy, the “tradition of phenomenology” fostered by the two circles remained active mainly in Munich and Bergzabern (a small city in Rhineland-Palatinate, where the Conrads had an estate and regularly hosted discussions in which mainly Héring, Koyré, Lipps, Stein, and von Sybel took part, see Feldes 2015). It was in Munich, however, that the future of this approach to phenomenology seemed most secure: there, Pfänder became full professor in 1929, and Gallinger and von Hildebrand taught as Privatdozenten. The rise of Nazism in Germany, however, put an end to this group, too. Due to his opposition to the regime, von Hildebrand had to flee to the United States. Gallinger, who was of Jewish origin, left Germany for Sweden. Geiger (full professor in Göttingen from 1923) was forced to retire in 1933. And Stein died in Auschwitz in 1942.

Although it could be argued that the Munich and Göttingen eras of phenomenology ended in those years, some of its members (e.g., Conrad-Martius, von Hildebrand, Ingarden, and Stavenhagen) continued to publish and remained active after the Second World War. Their ideas have also directly influenced other authors, including Friedrich Bassenge, Nicolai Hartmann, Aurel Kolnai, José Ortega y Gasset, Herbert Spiegelberg, and Karol Wojtyła.

2. Philosophy of Mind

This section is organized as follows. It begins by summarizing some of the main contributions early phenomenologists delivered on the general theory of intentionality (§2.1). In a subsequent step, it zooms in on intersubjective forms of intentionality by discussing social, empathic, and collective acts (§2.2). Phenomenological insights into the philosophy of mind shape a multi-faceted and articulated view about mentality and its position in the natural and social world, which anticipates many contemporary positions on these and related issues.

2.1 Theory of Intentionality

The contributions of the Munich and Göttingen circles to the theory of intentionality generally converge on the idea that there are many primitive kinds of of-ness or about-ness, which are radically different from each other. This idea can be claimed to conflict with Husserl’s theory of intentionality as presented in his Logical Investigations: on a plausible interpretation of Husserl’s theory, “objectifying” acts (acts like thinking, perceiving, and imagining) come in several kinds, but they are all intentional in exactly the same sense, since they all instantiate the very same essence (accordingly, kinds of objectifying acts are “species” of the genus of “intention”, or “intentional act”, Hua XIX 380f, 432f, 625f). In what follows, the assumption of radically different kinds of intentionality is discussed in connection with two important distinctions drawn by early phenomenologists. The first, broached in §2.1.1, holds between acts of “meaning” something and acts of presenting something (e.g., acts of perception or imagination). The second, which is the topic of §2.1.2, contrasts the cognitive acts discussed in §2.1.1 with the doxastic, affective, or conative attitudes (position-takings or stances) that a subject can adopt towards objects and facts.

2.1.1 Meaning Acts and Presentations

Early phenomenology associates (or even simply identifies) the notion of thinking with that of Meinen (literally: “to mean”, hereafter “meaning something” or “meaning act”, Mulligan 2011). Meinen is a specific kind of intentional act, which is claimed to differ fundamentally from presentation (presentations are intuitive experiences like perception or imagination). The focus on meaning acts is found throughout the entire history of the two circles (Mulligan 2011, 2012): despite differences in the details, early phenomenologists share a basic understanding of this concept.

Alexander Pfänder is perhaps the first phenomenologist who, in his Phenomenology of the Will (1900), extensively discusses the notion of meaning something (Schuhmann 2004a). He originally describes this act as a presentation (Vorstellung), which is non-intuitive. According to this initial view, to mean something is to present (vorstellen) a (representing) content that symbolically (i.e., by means of a similarity or depictive relation, 1900: 25ff, see also Fischer 1905) refers to another (represented) content. For instance, you mean the Eiffel Tower, when you form a mental image (a representing content) of the Eiffel Tower (the represented content). Pfänder’s position would rapidly evolve in the following years, though. In a talk given at Munich’s Society for Psychology in 1898, he recognizes that presentations are always intuitive (anschaulich), whereas meaning acts do not have intuitive content. In this context, Pfänder gives the example of someone attending a lecture (1898: 61): if you understand the speaker, then you mean the same objects the speaker means or talks about. This act of meaning something should be distinguished from the act of presenting the words uttered by the speaker: the words are intuitively given to you, but their referents are not (or, at least, they are not required to be intuitively given in order for you to mean them). Therefore, the way in which you are directed to (or: you mean) the referents is different from the way in which you are directed to (or: you present) the words. Presenting something—but not meaning something—always requires the intuitive presence of their objects (either in perception or imagination). Pfänder develops this position in later works by increasingly emphasizing the differences between presenting and meaning something (see 1911a: 135). Contrary to his initial position of 1900, he then comes to consider the latter experience as an act of its own kind and no longer as a kind of presentation (1913, 19): the concept of a non-intuitive presentation is eventually held to be a contradiction in terms (1921: 140; 1933: 21f), and meaning acts, being defined by complete lack of intuitive content, are described as referring to an object only in a linguistic way (1973: 153). This last feature licenses the label of “thinking” as applied to meaning acts (or, at least, as one kind of thinking among others like questioning, conjecturing, assuming, inferring, etc., see 1921: 145f; 1933: 21).

Pfänder’s early positions provide the basis for a series of arguments that Reinach develops in his 1911 paper On the Theory of Negative Judgment to illustrate that meaning something is an act of its own kind that is fundamentally different from presentation. Reinach, too, seems to understand the notion of meaning something as interchangeable with that of thinking (1908a [1989: 339f]; 1913a [1989: 419], but see Mulligan 2011: 266 for a different interpretation). The broader sense of “thinking”, which is equivalent to that of “meaning something”, is contrasted with a narrower one, which restrictedly points to those acts that are directed towards ideal or abstract objects only (1911a [1989: 104]). Reinach also operates with a broader notion of presentation, which encompasses all acts that secure intuitive access to their objects: this notion includes sensual and categorial perceptions, imaginations, “presentifications” (i.e., the act of making “present” an object in consciousness), etc. (1911a [1989: 101]).

According to Reinach, a number of properties characterize acts of meaning in contradistinction to presentations (1911a [1989: 102ff]). In particular, meaning something is an intrinsically linguistic act, whilst presentations are not linguistic (1911a [1989: 104]). This is conducive to the idea that, whereas presentations are defined in terms of experiences that enable an intuitive access to the object, meaning acts are “blind” (1911a [1989: 119]): if one means an object, no intuitive aspect of the object becomes present in virtue of the fact that this object has been meant. Reinach notes that this has consequences for how these acts relate to time. The objects of presentations, being intuitively present, stand “in front of” the mind in corresponding acts of perception, imagination, presentification, etc. It is therefore possible for these acts to extend in time for as long as the object stands in front of the mind. By contrast, meaning acts are “temporally punctual” in the sense that to mean something is an act that does not last in time: this is why it would make no sense to ask the subject how long it took her to mean a certain object (Chrudzimski 2015: 289). Reinach complements these ideas by developing an additional argument that turns out to be crucial for the phenomenological understanding of meaning acts.

Reinach ponders whether the distinction between meaning acts and presentations could be traced back to the one introduced by Husserl in his Logical Investigations between acts that lack intuitive content and acts that are intuitively fulfilled. Roughly, Husserl’s idea is that objectifying acts either are intuitions because they bear intuitive content—in the case of perceptions, this content is saliently made of sensations (these being mental experiences that are not intentional). Or they are thinking acts (“meaning-intentions” or “significations”) because they lack such content. Husserl claims that objectifying acts can be more or less intuitively fulfilled, which entails the idea that the intuitive content typically comes in degrees: if the act has a maximum of intuitive content, then one faces a so-called “pure intuition”, in which

no part, no side, no property of its object fails to be intuitively presented […], none is merely indirectly co-meant [mitgemeint]. (Hua XIX 611, Eng. trans. mod., 236)

By contrast, if the intentional act is empty, then it is a thinking act. In addition, if an intuition and a thinking act are directed to the same object in the same sense, they can “fuse”, to the effect that the intuition can be said to intuitively fulfill the empty act. Note one important implication of this view: since the presence of intuitive content is not essential for the act to be an objectifying act, every such act either is a signification or is always co-constituted by a signification. (It should not go unmentioned that Husserl modifies his view about this issue by arguing in later works that intuitions are not co-constituted by thinking acts, see Hua XVI §17; Hua XX/I, 85–98; Melle 2002.)

Reinach grants that a presentation can be more or less intuitively fulfilled, but he also emphasizes that the act’s component, which is fulfilled by the intuitive content, is not a meaning act (1911a [1989: 105]). In addition, Reinach again grants that the subject can simultaneously present an object and mean this very same object. However, he also maintains that in this case the two acts do not relate to each other in any essential way:

this identity of reference point of the two acts cannot sanction the identification of the acts themselves, i.e., by allowing the dissolution of the punctual act of meaning within [sic] the stretched-out act of presentation. (1911a [1989: 103] [1982: 324])

In other words, Reinach contends that, although the objectual correlates of both acts can coincide, meaning acts cannot enter a relation of fulfillment with presentations (or with intuitions in Husserl’s sense), i.e., they cannot fuse (1911a [1989: 106], on this, also see Salice 2012).

Put differently, meaning acts, insofar as they are essentially “blind”, simply cannot have intuitive content. Although such contents, sometimes, can “accompany” meaning acts, they operate as mere accessories for they

do not “exhibit” or “present” anything—for of course in the sphere of meaning there is absolutely nothing to hand which is presented. (1911a [1989: 106] [1982: 328]; see also Gallinger 1914: 36 who operates with this idea in his investigation of memory)

Thus, intuitive contents are not and cannot be present in meaning acts and, if these acts did have such contents, they would not qualify as meaning acts, but as presentations (this argument is developed by Reinach in explicit contrast to Husserl in 1908a [1989: 339]). Conversely, while meaning acts are always “empty” (or, more precisely, they do not show anything like the dichotomy of emptiness/fullness), it is “very questionable whether there exist absolutely intuition-free presentations” (1911a [1989: 106] [1982: 329]).

Reinach’s line of argument suggests that presentations and meaning acts are directed to objects and states of affairs in two radically different ways: if these acts were directed towards their correlate in the same way, they would share the same essence and, thus, they could fuse. To put this differently, the “of-ness” of presentations does not coincide with the intentionality of intentions or meaning acts. This distinction is terminologically fixed by Conrad, who in his 1911 essay, Perception and Presentation (An Essential Comparison), further explores Reinach’s view and reserves the expression “Intentionalität” to the directedness of meaning acts (1911: 64 fn) while qualifying presentations as the consciousness of an object or of a thing.

As we have seen, the intentionality of meaning something, in contrast to the of-ness of presentations, requires linguistic signs (see also Conrad 1910, Schmücker 1956, Fabbianelli 2015). This idea is further investigated by Herman Ritzel in his dissertation of 1914 (published 1916) where the distinction between meaning acts and presentations is articulated in an original way. Ritzel endorses Reinach’s idea that presentations require the intuitive presence of the object, whereas meaning something does not (1916: 35), but he develops this view by claiming that meaning acts and presentations differ in kind because they correlate to objects of different kinds. Whereas presenting directly points at objects, meaning linguistically points at concepts, and it is by means of concepts that meaning acts can be said to refer to objects (1916: 48f).

Ritzel’s proposal aligns with the idea, quite generally embraced by early phenomenologists, that presentations are non-conceptual, whereas Meinen is essentially conceptual. However, it also stands out for the following reason: Ritzel claims that, when it comes to meaning acts pointing at “empirical concepts” (an expression he adopts from Kant to express concepts based on sensorial experience, see Critique of Pure Reason A50/B74; 1916: 22), semantic reference works in the same way in which, on John Stuart Mill’s view, proper names denote individuals: just as proper names directly refer to individuals, so do “[empirical concepts] denote [nennen] their object directly [in direkter Weise]” (1916: 17). More precisely, what both cases have in common is that meanings of proper names or of terms of empirical concepts change if the objects they denote change. That is, the content of an empirical concept is identical with the kind that the concept refers to. In contrast to the traditional view about concepts, in these cases, it is not the intension (the content) of a concept that determines its extension, but rather the extension that determines the intension. On this point, Ritzel seems to anticipate the theory of direct reference and rigid designators (see Sowa 2007: 97).

The contributions of Pfänder, Reinach, and Ritzel (among others) support a statement made by Conrad in his last publication according to which phenomenologists in Göttingen rejected Husserl’s claim that intentionality is the essential characteristic of perception and presentation (1968: 3). Indeed, despite differences in the details, the idea that intentionality is not a general, but a specific property that characterizes only a given kind of experience (acts of meaning something) seems to have been a widely endorsed view among early phenomenologists: authors like Daubert (see Schuhmann & Smith 1985: 784—on Daubert’s view in relation to the nature of intentionality, see also Bower 2019), Geiger (1911a: 125, 139), Stavenhagen (1925: 164f; 1933: 38), or Brunswig (1910: 64f) mention this idea in their publications often without feeling the need to offer further justification. However, not all early phenomenologists concurred on this view: some of them refused certain implications of it, others refused the view altogether.

Karelitzki, for instance, sides with Reinach and Conrad when it comes to distinguishing meaning from presentation, but he rebuts their central point that meaning is always blind, i.e., that it can never get sight of the object (1914: 33f). Karelitzki argues that, although meaning is generally blind, it does not have to be so: he presents an example in which someone asks the question “what do you mean with…?” and the addressee of the question gives a characterization of what was meant, hence bringing the meaning act step by step closer to what Karelitzki calls the “essence” of the meant object (1914: 36).

Other voices within the groups maintained, in line with Husserl, that thinking and intuition can fuse together. This idea is advocated by Schapp (1910), Hofmann (1913) and Leyendecker (1913), who apply it to the phenomenology of perception, and by Heinrich, who presupposes it in his work on concepts (1910). For instance, Schapp holds that, in perception, intuitive contents and ideas (or concepts) can only be separated conceptually, but not factually: without ideas, we cannot perceive things (1910: 133f). Although Hofmann was critical towards the existence of sensations (the first chapter of his 1913 essay is a critique of this notion), he nonetheless puts Husserl’s concept of apprehension at the core of perception (as does Ingarden, see his 1997: 15ff): in apprehension, a subject “interprets” an intuitive content by means of a conceptual content (but see Mulligan 1995 for a different interpretation). According to Hofmann, perception is apprehension, even though the apprehended contents are not mere sensations, but structured “sight or visual things” (Sehdinge, see Hofmann 1913: 82; on the notion of Sehding, see Casati 1994). Furthermore, Leyendecker investigated the phenomenon of cognitive penetrability and various ways in which perception is permeable to thinking by discussing a large number of perceptual situations including various kinds of illusions, selective perception, the experience of “overlooking” something, etc.

2.1.2 Attitudes: Doxastic, Affective, Conative.

One important idea secured by early-phenomenological discussions about presentations and acts of meaning something is that, in acts of the first kind, the subject is acquainted with or simply has the object in a purely receptive or passive sense (rezeptives Haben, see von Hildebrand 1916: 134; Pfänder 1911a: 167f; Reinach 1911a [1989: 102]; Karelitzki 1914: 35, among others). This is why the broad family of presentations are sometimes called “cognitions” (Kenntnisnahmen, literally: the experience of “taking note of something”, von Hildebrand 1916: 139ff). The receptive way in which the subject relates to the object in presentations is contrasted with an active one: once the subject has the object in cognition, she can adopt an attitude (a position or a stance, Stellungnahme) towards that object (Reinach 1911a [1989: 109f]; von Hildebrand 1916, Stavenhagen 1925). Phenomenologists generally agree on the idea that, based on one’s cognitions, a subject can form attitudes of a doxastic, affective, or conative nature. Another way of formulating this idea is that cognitions “found” attitudes, where “founding” expresses existential (one-sided) dependence: attitudes would not exist without cognitions, but not vice versa. One way to understand the receptive/active distinction is that attitudes can be made subject to a specific sense of the “why?” question (Uemura & Salice 2019): if you believe that p, feel a certain emotion about p, or want that p, you put yourself under the rational demand of providing reasons for your attitudes. The remainder of this subsection summarizes early phenomenology’s main ideas about these three kinds of attitudes.

Doxastic attitudes. Suppose you perceive a child falling on the street. In this perception, you have cognized a given state of affairs, but you have not yet adopted any doxastic position towards that state of affairs. You do that when you form the positive belief that a child is falling on the street. The distinction between perception and beliefs can be easily overlooked and is illustrated most clearly by scenarios involving optical illusions. For instance, in the Müller-Lyer illusion, your perception that the two segments are of different length is clearly different from your belief that they are of equal length.

Beliefs are a member of the family of doxastic attitudes, together with assumptions, conjectures, convictions, etc. Beliefs are states: they endure in time and, in their dispositional form, they can endure for a very long period of time (your belief, say, that Rome is the capital of Italy lasts for years). Also, they are polar attitudes: a belief is either positive or negative. For instance, the positive belief that the segments are of the same length in the Müller-Lyer illusion has, as its counterpart, the negative belief (or disbelief) that they are of the same length. And that disbelief should be distinguished from the positive belief that they are not equal in length. Finally, beliefs come in degree: your belief that p is the case can be more or less firm. These properties show why beliefs, even when true and justified, ought to be distinguished from “apprehension” (or the act of “coming to know something”, Erkennen, Mulligan 2014: 381). For instance, suppose that you perceive a moving object from afar and that, at some point, you realize that it is a cyclist: in this case, you have come to know a certain fact. Coming to know that p does not endure, it is temporally punctual. Also, coming to know that p does not have a polar opposite. And finally, this act does not come in degree: you either know that p or do not. It also merits attention that, while cognitions can found belief and apprehension, and while apprehension can found beliefs, beliefs can found neither apprehension nor cognitions: this makes apprehension more fundamental than beliefs in our psychological architecture (Reinach 1911a [1989: 118]; von Hildebrand 1950: 5–11; Scheler 1915: 222f). Partly also because of these considerations, some commentators have identified the epistemology developed by early phenomenologists as a precursor of the “knowledge first view” (Mulligan 2014).

Affective Attitudes. Suppose further that you not only perceive the child falling on the street, but you also become acquainted with the negative (dis-)value of the child falling on the street. In this case, you could emote according to that disvalue by feeling disquiet about or concern for the child. This example illustrates two further insights about our mental life secured by early phenomenology. First, it illustrates the possibility of becoming acquainted with value-properties: these are higher-order properties like being dangerous, beautiful, elegant, morally blameworthy, pleasurable, commendable, etc., which supervene on properties of other kinds, but do not reduce to them. The specific kind of act that gives access to value-properties is called by phenomenologists “feeling” (Fühlen) (see Brunswig 1910: 182; Geiger 1928: 36f; Reinach, 1912/13 [1989: 295–301]; von Hildebrand 1916: 203ff, Pfänder 1933: 24; Scheler 1913/16: 271f; on this notion, see also Mulligan 2010: 235f). Even if affectively colored, feeling is not an affective attitude, but belongs to the family of presentations or cognitions and thus shares the main features exemplified by acts of this kind. In particular, this act secures a receptive, non-conceptual, and intuitive access to value-properties. Interestingly, feeling’s sensitivity can be cultivated through time: this enables subjects to better discriminate values and, thereby, to achieve epistemic excellence in the appreciation of the goods that exemplify values (see Schapp 1930: 11f).

Second, the example also indicates that, when confronted with facts or objects and their values, one can also adopt an affective position towards those correlates: when one feels emotions towards them, one affectively responds to them (see von Hildebrand 1916: 134f; Brunswig 1911: 47; Reinach 1912/13 [1989: 295ff]; Scheler 1913/16: 267ff; on the early phenomenological conception of emotions and its development, see Vendrell Ferran 2008; Müller 2019; Szanto & Landweer 2020). The distinction between the cognitive act of feeling values and emotions is illustrated by the possibility of a subject’s grasping the value-property of something by, nonetheless, remaining affectively inert towards it (von Hildebrand 1916: 200f): e.g., it is possible to observe a moral wrongdoing without eliciting indignation or to perceive a commendable action without admiring it. In this case, the act of feeling has not triggered an emotive response towards it. The value-property, which in contemporary debates on emotions is also called the emotion’s “formal object” (Kenny 2003), is the condition of fit of the emotion: an emotion is fit or warranted if it tracks a value-property.

Affective phenomena are variegated and multifarious. One of the most sophisticated accounts is developed by Scheler, who distinguishes four kinds of affective phenomena or feelings (Gefühle, the German term equally applies to bodily feelings and emotions):

  1. sensible feelings like pleasure or displeasure deriving, e.g., from eating food;
  2. vital feelings (Vitalgefühle), which affect body (Leibgefühle) or life (Lebensgefühle): they include feeling sick, feeling old, feeling tired, vigour, etc.;
  3. mental or psychic feelings (seelische Gefühle) like happiness, sadness, sorrow, or grief; and
  4. spiritual feelings like bliss or despair, etc. (Scheler 1913/16: 341ff; Mulligan 2008a; Schloßberger 2020).

This taxonomy is enriched by other phenomenologists in various ways. To mention but a few lines of investigation: Pfänder (1913, 1916) discusses various kinds of sentiments (Uemura & Yaegashi 2020); Geiger (1911b) tackles moods and their intentional correlates (Schloßberger 2019); Else Voigtländer (1910) offers an articulated description of self-conscious feelings and emotions in her dissertation (Vendrell Ferran 2020). Interestingly, Scheler claims that his four-part distinction of affective phenomena correlates with four different kinds of values (that are hierarchically ordered, Scheler 1913/16: 125ff):

  1. the values of the agreeable and the disagreeable (which occupy the lowest level in the hierarchy);
  2. vital values like weakness, well-being, nobility or vulgarity;
  3. aesthetic, moral, and epistemic values; and, finally,
  4. the values of the holy and the unholy, which are in the highest position of the hierarchy.

Conative Attitudes. Conative experiences are the third kind of attitudes that attracted substantial attention in early phenomenology (see Pfänder 1900, 1911a, 1913, 1916; von Hildebrand 1916; Scheler 1913/16, esp. 141ff; Reinach 1912/13, and Reiner 1927). Conative attitudes share the core properties of doxastic and affective attitudes: once a subject is confronted with certain facts in cognitions or presentations, it is possible for her to respond to those facts by adopting a conative position. To go back to the previous example, the acquaintance with the disvalue of the child falling on the street can also motivate you to adopt a particular conative stance, e.g., by forming the will to help the child.

The will always represents the goal under a positive value-property: the conative attitude is fit if the goal (the state of affairs to be brought about by the action) indeed exemplifies the represented value-property and if alternative goals exemplify properties that are of lower rank (that is why elements like premeditation, preferences and, more generally, the experiences by which we grasp the goal’s value-property have moral relevance, see Reinach 1912/13; von Hildebrand 1916). Phenomenologists put the category of the will (rather than that of desire) at the heart of intentional agency. In contrast to a widespread tendency of tracing the will back to wishes or desires (see Frankfurt 1971), phenomenologists argue that willing is a sui generis experience (Scheler 1913/16: 143f, Löwenstein 1933). One of the main differences between willing and desiring is that the former, but not the latter, entails the disposition of forming a decision or intention (Entschluss or Vorsatz): just as the belief that p (but, say, not the assumption that p) entails the disposition of asserting p, so wanting that p (but not desiring that p) grounds the disposition of intending that p (von Hildebrand 1916: 36, Salice forthcoming A).

Intentions (like assertions) are not attitudes, but mental actions (whereby intentions as actions [das Fassen eines Vorsatzes] should be distinguished from the states of having an intention [das Haben eines Vorsatzes], Reinach 1913b [1989: 158f], Salice 2018). Intentions aim at realizing projects that are instrumental to reach the goal (which is spelled out by the willing). For instance, if you intend or decide to help the child on the street, you will form a plan or project on how to do that (calling an ambulance, providing first aid, etc.). Intentions are acts of self-determination (or “causally self-referential attitudes” to use Searle’s terminology, 1983: 86ff): the intention is satisfied if it is the subject of the intention that brings about the project (Pfänder 1911a: 174; Heller 1932: 254f). Intentions also self-commit the subject: when the subject forms an intention, they thereby put themselves under a commitment to satisfy it (von Hildebrand 1916: 159; see also Reiner 1927: 71). Intentions have the power of triggering actions (some phenomenologists claim that this triggering identifies a further act lying in between the intention and the bodily movements, see von Hildebrand 1916: 161f, but the existence of this act is contested, see Reiner 1927: 76ff). Finally, intentions control actions via “acts of realization” (Realisierungsakte) that accompany and affect bodily movements (Scheler 1913/16: 142; von Hildebrand 1916: 152).

2.2 Social, Empathic, and Collective Experiences

Early phenomenologists did not shed light only on infra-personal intentionality (intentional experiences that, roughly, do not require the existence of other persons). They also devoted extensive investigations to cases of intersubjective intentionality (intentional experiences that require the existence of other persons). These investigations can be summarized under three main umbrella topics: social or speech acts, acts of empathy, collective acts.

Social Acts. An act is social if it stands under the requirement of being understood by its addressee in order to be successfully or happily performed. On this definition, acts like promises, orders, bets, apologies, and more in general: all so-called “speech” acts, are social acts. (It is worth noting that the concept of “social act” as “social operation of the mind” can be found in Thomas Reid already, see Schuhmann & Smith 1990. Reid was not unknown within the two circles of phenomenology, see Peters 1909, but there is no solid evidence that early phenomenologists adopted this idea from Reid, see Mulligan 1987a: 33f n 5.) One main difference between the phenomenological and the ordinary language approach to speech acts is that the tradition inaugurated by John Austin understands speech acts as conventional or ritual actions (Austin 1962: 14), whereas phenomenology describes them as mental acts or experiences (Smith 1990).

The first steps towards a theory of social acts are made by Pfänder and Daubert. In his logic of imperatives (1909), Pfänder theorizes that the logical form of imperatives is different from that of predicative sentences. This provides evidence for the idea that the act of ordering something is not identical to the judgment of having a certain conative experience. Daubert developed extensive considerations about questions around 1911/12 (Schuhmann & Smith 1987; despite his influential role within early phenomenology, Daubert never published a single line in his life and the only sources available to scholars are unpublished manuscripts). In these considerations, he describes various phenomena that are usually collated under the label of “question”, and argues that, among various erotetic phenomena, one in particular should be set apart. While many erotetic phenomena are purely inner phenomena, when one raises a “direct question”, then one addresses the question to somebody else.

It is plausible to assume that Reinach—who in 1913 presented the most advanced and articulated theory of such acts within phenomenology—developed his position in close dialogue with both Pfänder and Daubert (Reinach 1913b; see also Schuhmann 2004b; Smith 1990). In fact, Reinach expands on the ideas that social acts are not descriptions of inner experiences and that these acts have addressees. More specifically, Reinach defines social acts as all those acts that are in-need-of-being-heard (vernehmungsbedürftig, see Mulligan 1987a). A social act performed between two or more human beings is heard (in this specific sense), according to Reinach, when three conditions are satisfied: first, the linguistic utterance is acoustically or visually perceived by the act’s addressee; second, the addressee understands the content of the utterance; third, the addressee understands the type of the act, that is, she understands whether a given utterance is a promise, an order, etc. Furthermore, social acts have illocutionary effects: a promise, e.g., generates a claim on the promisee’s end and an obligation on the promisor’s end. Finally, social acts undergo various modifications: they can be honest or treacherous, they can be addressed to many and/or performed by many, they (or their contents) can be conditional, they can be performed in the name of somebody else.

Reinach’s ideas have proven to be seminal for further investigations. For instance, von Hildebrand extends the idea of experiences that are in need of being heard to emotions: accordingly, some forms of love are claimed to exemplify that property as love can be reciprocated only if the loved one is aware of being loved (von Hildebrand 1930: 28f). Schapp applies Reinach’s idea of promises as generators of claims and commitments to develop a theory of economic contracts (1930). Also, Stein advances Reinach’s theory by discussing the possibility for states to be subject of social acts and, especially, of enactments (1925, see Taieb forthcoming).

Empathy. We have seen that part of what it means for a social act to be happy is that the addressee grasps the act that is addressed to her. This presupposes the ability of understanding others and their mental states, which invites the question of how, in general, that is possible. An initial answer to this question is provided by Lipps, who adopts the notion of empathy (Einfühlung) from debates in aesthetics and claims that empathy is the specific experience, which enables social understanding. Empathy, according to Lipps, relies on two innate drives: a drive to imitate others and a drive to express mental states. On Lipps’ view, I understand that the other is sad, when the following happens: First, I should be aware that, whenever I am sad, an inner drive leads me to express sadness. Second, when I see the other’s face, this triggers the drive of imitating his expression in me. Because in my mental life, that facial expression has constantly been linked with sadness, having that expression induces sadness in me. By feeling sad with the other, I project sadness onto him (Lipps 1907a).

This understanding of empathy rapidly attracted criticisms in the Munich and Göttingen circles. One of the most striking criticisms was that Lipps’ account is not able to explain the explanandum: why the fact that the other’s expression induces a certain mental state in me (which I then project onto the other) is supposed to explain my understanding of the other’s mental state? And can’t I understand the other without living through his mental state? (see Zahavi 2014: 131f). As an alternative solution, phenomenologists argue that mental states are not unobservable entities that lie “behind” our bodily expressions and gestures. Rather, mental states can be genuinely perceived: they are perceived in these very movements and gestures (see Scheler 1923).

Perhaps one of the first explicit formulation of this idea is provided by Schwenninger in 1908. In his critical discussion of Hume’s notion of sympathy (which is also directed against Lipps), Schwenninger writes:

the consciousness of the mental state [Seelenzustand] is immediately included in the perception of the gesture [Gebärde]. I grasp something [and] this is what is expressed in the expression; this means: in the grasp, an intimate connection, unity, intertwinement [Ineinander] between expression and expressed obtains. […] (1908: 44)

Importantly, Schwenninger argues further:

speaking of perception here [that is, of perception as applied to mental states] is just as correct as speaking of perception in the case of three-dimensional objects. […] The sympathizer [der Sympathisierende] perceives that the other expresses certain mental experiences and, therefore, also perceives these experiences, but he does not live through them himself, which just means that he does not have an adequate inner perception [of these experiences]. (1908: 46f)

The ideas that mental states can be perceived in the gestures of others and that the perceiver does not live through the other’s experience are the building blocks of early phenomenology’s theory of social cognition. In particular, Stein (1917) puts them at the basis of her articulated view of empathy, according to which the perception of the other’s mental state is only the first step in the cognitive process that leads to a fuller understanding of the other. After one is struck, as it were, by the other’s mental state in perception, one has the possibility to put oneself in the other’s shoes and, thereby, to explicate the experience (e.g., by appreciating the intentional object of the state). In a third step, the empathizer can gain a piece of propositional knowledge by forming the thought that subject x lives through a given experience (see also Dullstein 2013).

Collective Acts. Paradigmatic cases of empathy or of social acts exemplify an I-Thou intentional relation where an I is directed towards the other as a you. This relation should be distinguished from the collective relation in which you and I share an experience as ours. Interestingly, the phenomenological investigation into experiential sharing is part and parcel of a larger investigation into various forms of groups. The two topics are related because phenomenologists argue that different kinds of groups correlate with different kinds of social attitudes.

The starting point of this investigation is the distinction between societies, communities, and masses (Scheler 1913/16; Stavenhagen 1934; Stein 1922; von Hildebrand 1930; Walther 1923). The distinction between societies and communities has been drawn originally by Ferdinand Tönnies (in his seminal book of 1887) and the introduction of the mass as a different kind of group in the taxonomy should be mainly credited to Scheler, who adopts it from French sociology (see Stavenhagen 1936: 20; Thonhauser forthcoming).

What animates crowds is mental contagion, which is the psychological mechanism whereby the mental states of one individual pass (often unconsciously) to another individual. In crowds, individuals form mental states on the basis of others’ mental states, but the induced states are entertained without a reason. So, for instance, the warranted joy of a subject x may infect individual y who elicits an emotional episode of the same kind, but without having a reason for it. This is what makes crowds different from societies: in societies, too, individuals form mental states on the basis of others’ mental states, but here the individuals take the other’s mental state to be a reason for them to entertain their own states. For instance, agent x might form the intention to act with agent y (and vice versa) because x and y come to know that each of them pursues the same goal.

Crowds and societies should be distinguished from communities. Whereas crowds are characterized by mental contagion and societies by interlocked experiences (often based on instrumental considerations), members of communities share experiences. For instance, when two parents stand beside the dead body of their child, they mourn together and, thereby, share their experience of mourning (Scheler 1923: 23f). One of the elements that sets experiential sharing apart from the previous two forms of sociality is the sense of us that infuses the life of the community members and that grounds solidary behavior among them. Communal or collective experiences are lived through as ours by the group members and that is why these members are prone to mutual help and support.

The pre-conditions of collective experiences are debated in early phenomenology. According to Walther, what makes an experience ours is a complex structure of social cognition: the individuals, under condition of common knowledge, empathize with each other and mutually unify, where “unification” is described as a particular affective state (see León & Zahavi 2016; Zahavi & Salice 2016). Other authors, e.g., Stein, emphasize a rationality requirement: among other conditions, for an experience to qualify as collective, it has to be entertained for a group’s reason. Accordingly, a single individual could live through a collective experience as long as that experience is sustained by a group reason (Stein 1922: 123; Szanto 2015). Other authors, e.g., Stavenhagen, put a self-understanding as a group member at the core of collective experiences: for an experience to qualify as such, the subject must understand herself as belonging to a group. Interestingly, Stavenhagen identifies several factors that could lead to that self-understanding (Salice forthcoming B): sharing preferences with others, having mutual respect, or being part of an “emotional tradition” are elements that can elicit that particular self-understanding.

3. The Theory of Objects in the Munich and Göttingen Circles

The previous section introduced phenomenological descriptions of various kinds of experiences. These descriptions are presented by phenomenologists as “eidetic”, which means that they are supposed to identify the essential properties of the experiences at issue. Phenomenology, however, is not merely concerned with providing eidetic descriptions of mental experiences. That is why the “phenomenology of acts” (Aktphänomenologie) should be distinguished from (although it is not unrelated to) the “phenomenology of objects” (Gegenstandsphänomenologie, Geiger 1907: 355). Among other tasks, the latter discipline (also called “theory of objects” or “ontology”) is concerned with the identification of the essential properties exemplified by objects of all kinds (and not only by objects of the mental kind).

3.1 General Features

There are at least three interrelated features that broadly characterize the wide range of early phenomenological investigations on ontology: metaphysical realism, ontological pluralism, and essentialism.

Metaphysical realism. Early phenomenologists consider the world to be made, in large part, of a variety of objects that are intentionality-independent. Accordingly, these objects exist independently of a subject that might know them (regardless of how the notion of the subject is conceived of). It is important to remark that this position does not exclude the existence of objects, which are intentionality-dependent: artefacts and social objects like institutional facts (promissory commitments, institutions, etc.) exist precisely because there are individuals or communities that intentionally create them. Interestingly, it is assumed that, regardless of its relation to intentionality, the existence of an object always implies the possibility for this object to be known by a cognizer, which is why (at least in principle) all objects and their properties are intelligible.

Ontological Pluralism. Objects belong to different fundamental categories. Because there are fundamentally different kinds of objects, their investigations are also assigned to different disciplines. This is why psychologism has to be discarded: logical psychologism, e.g., collapses different categories (the psychological and the logical) into one, leading to the conclusion that there is one single discipline—psychology—in charge of their investigation. The flip side of ontological pluralism is anti-reductionism and a descriptive approach to ontological questions: all objects must be described as they are—without failing to the temptation of reducing one kind of objects to another (Geiger 1933). Against this backdrop, eidetic descriptions are occasionally contrasted to definitions that characterize a concept in terms of other concepts: the idea is that definitions of this sort should be avoided because they “betray” the very essence of the definiendum (cf. Reinach 1914 [1989: 535], on the relations between explanation and description, see also Brunswig 1904 and Mulligan 2012: §1). This view has been criticized, even within phenomenology, for being conducive to a form of phenomenology characterized as “picture book phenomenology” (Bilderbuchphänomenologie, Scheler 1913/16: 11; Héring 1939: 370 n 1).

Essentialism. Phenomenological ontology is committed to a form of essentialism according to which objects are constituted by an essence. It should be noted that the word “essence” (Wesen) is ambiguous (Reinach 1912): on the one hand, it can refer to the so-being of an individual object, i.e., to that which makes an individual the individual it is. For instance, how finely a given quill pen writes is a property that qualifies this individual pen as the pen it is—for no other pen can write in the same fine way (Héring 1921: 496f; Héring reserves the term, “essence” (Wesen), for this concept; see also De Santis 2015, Fabbianelli 2016). On the other, it can also indicate the what-being of a given object or the kind to which it belongs: e.g., being a pen is one such kind (Héring uses the word “essentiality” (Wesenheit) to refer to essence in this second sense, see 1921: 505ff and Seifert 1996). Essences (in this second sense) ground necessity (Héring 1921; Ingarden 1925; Reinach 1911b). For instance, the essence of promise, color, movement, or tone grounds the necessary facts that promises generate claims and obligations, that colors have extension, that movements have velocity, that tones have pitch and intensity, etc. (see also Mulligan 2004; Fine 1994a,b, 1995). Essences are taken to exist independently of whether they have exemplifications or not. As such, they are described as ideal (abstract) and atemporal objects. Not all essences are atemporal, though: for instance, Geiger discusses the idea of “dynamic essences” (Geiger 1924, e.g., the essence of the tragic), which evolve through time and are characteristically instantiated in artworks.

3.2 Objects and States of Affairs

Almost all phenomenological investigations into ontology presuppose that “objectualities” (Gegenständlichkeiten) come in two kinds: objects and states of affairs.

Objects are the objectual correlates of nominal acts: if you perceive (think of, remember, imagine, etc.) Napoleon, then Napoleon is the object of your perception. From a linguistic point of view, objects are the referents of singular terms, be they concrete or abstract. In line with Husserl’s LI, early phenomenology takes the category of object to be divided into the two sub-categories of real and ideal objects, which are distinguished by their relation to time (cf. Hua XIX 129f). Ideal objects are atemporal; these are usually taken to be either general or individual objects. Properties and essences are general because they can be predicated of several objects. By contrast, ideal objects, which cannot be predicated of anything else, are individual. So, e.g., Reinach takes natural numbers to be ideal and individual for they are not predicated of other entities (1911c [1989: 58]; 1914 [1989: 539f]). Real objects are temporal, and this category is traditionally divided into material and mental objects. Over the years, this standard classification underwent substantial revision: in particular, the increasing attention devoted to social ontology led phenomenology to enrich its table of categories (Salice 2013). For instance, the case of entities like promissory claims and obligations called into question the strong connection hitherto endorsed or presupposed between ideality and temporality: on the one hand, these entities are neither material nor mental; on the other, they are temporal (they are brought about by a successful promise and extinguish when the promise is honored). Also, we have already seen that investigations into aesthetics led some phenomenologists to accept the existence of essences that are ideal, but nonetheless temporal or historical (for a similar conception, see also Husserl’s notion of “bound idealities”, 1938: 321).

States of affairs are the objectual correlates of propositional attitudes like assumptions and judgments. Judging always is judging that something is or is not the case. That which is or is not the case is the state of affairs the mental attitude is directed towards. States of affairs are the referents of declarative sentences as well as of perfect nominals (perfect nominals are linguistic constructions that contain a gerund and can syntactically act as names, e.g., “the rose’s being red”, cf. Vendler 1967). The German expression for state of affairs is Sachverhalt, which apparently was introduced in the Brentano School around 1888 by Carl Stumpf (Rojszczak & Smith 2003: 165; Meinong’s equivalent reads “objective [Objektiv]”, Salice 2009). The term has its roots in jurisprudence (Smith 1978a) where it is used to express the “juridical ‘status’ in the sense of ‘status rerum’ (state or constitution of things)” (Smith 1988: 25). This is conducive to how early phenomenologists use the term Sachverhalt: objects or things have an ontological structure, and this is a structure of states of affairs. (When this structure involves a value-property, then phenomenologists sometimes talk of a “state of value” [Wertverhalt]).

Early phenomenological debate about these entities extends over many years and is animated by various positions. These different positions can be sorted into two more or less well-defined competing views. According to the first, all states of affairs have an ontological status of their own, which is intentionality-independent. The second view claims that only a restricted class of states of affairs are intentionality-independent entities. On this second view, non-obtaining states of affairs (e.g., Elvis’ being the president of the US) or negative states of affairs (e.g., the not being red of the White House) or existential states of affairs (the existence of Barack Obama) or impersonal states of affairs (the state of affairs that it is raining) and/or other kinds of state of affairs have been argued to be intentionality-dependent.

In this debate, Reinach’s theory represents one extreme position (Reinach 1911a): according to him, all meaningful declarative sentences are directed towards states of affairs. True sentences (i.e., those sentences which express true propositions) refer to obtaining states of affairs, false ones to non-obtaining. States of affairs make propositions true or false: they are truth-makers and the corresponding propositions truth-bearers. Reinach does not elaborate on the truth-making relation, but an interesting account of this relation in terms of the principle of sufficient reason is developed by Pfänder in his Logic of 1921 (see also Mulligan 2008b).

In addition, Reinach suggests that states of affairs are either positive or negative, and he argues that either a positive state of affairs or its negative contradictory obtains (e.g., either the being-red of the rose obtains or its not-being red). The principle of the excluded middle is hence claimed to hold for states of affairs and, analogously, other principles traditionally believed to be of a logical nature (and in particular the laws of inference, see 1911a [1989: 115]) are interpreted by Reinach as being primarily ontological principles, i.e., principles which hold for states of affairs. That is, states of affairs are the objects of logic (1911a [1989: 138 n 1]), and logic is primarily about states of affairs and only secondarily about truth-bearers (on this point, see also Gallinger 1912, Honecker 1921, Gardies 1985).

An ontologically more parsimonious counterpart to this first position was developed by Daubert. In his theory of judgment, Daubert draws a distinction between two notions. First, he calls “states of affairs” complex entities which exist independently of intentionality, e.g., the being-red of the rose (cf. Schuhmann & Smith 1987; Schuhmann 2004c). In addition to states of affairs, he also identifies so-called “states of affairs as cognized” (Kenntnisverhalte), which are described as intentionality-dependent entities. (Although using different terminology, Pfänder, too, seems to have had a similar distinction in mind in 1921 when he speaks of “the objects in their objectual state” (das Selbstverhalten der Gegenstände) and of “states of affairs” as entities which are “projected or outlined” (entworfen) by judgment and which are “completely dependent” on judgment, Pfänder 1921: 40f, 253.)

Daubert’s idea is that, within a judgment, an aspect of the state of affairs is selected by the mind and conceptually framed. So, for instance, the expressions

  • “the chairman opens the meeting”,
  • “the chairman is opening the meeting”,
  • “the meeting is being opened by the chairman”,
  • “the opening of the meeting is being conducted by the chairman” and
  • “the chairman has opened the meeting”, (cf. Schuhmann & Smith 1987: 368)

point at different “states of affairs as cognized” (Kenntnisverhalte) to which the same state of affairs pertains. The same can be said for expressions such as “a > b” and “b < a”. In the LI, Husserl employs this very same example to argue that the two sentences express different propositional meanings pointing at the same state of affairs (Hua XIX A 48). Daubert reports having discussed this example with Husserl (Schuhmann 2004c: 206 n 25), which might have inspired Husserl to replace his previous theory of the LI with his later distinction, which is analogous to Daubert’s own, between states of affairs and situations (Sachlagen, see Hua XXVI 97f, Husserl 1938: 285ff).

To be sure, Reinach, too, distinguishes between coarse-grained “factual material” (Tatbestand) and fine-grained states of affairs (Smith 1987: 218ff). Yet, contrary to Reinach, Daubert contends that states of affairs as cognized do not exist without corresponding judgments. Moreover, Daubert claims that, analogously to states of affairs as cognized, states of affairs as questioned (Frageverhalte) or as ordered (Befehlsverhalte) also exist only in relation to acts of question or of order (Schuhmann 2004b: 91).

Daubert’s position raises the question as to what properties qualify states of affairs proper and what properties qualify states of affairs as cognized. For instance, Daubert holds that there are no negative states of affairs, but only negative Kenntnisverhalte (cf. Schuhmann 1987—based on a somewhat similar approach, Ingarden, too, denies the existence of intentionality-independent negative states of affairs, see 1964 II/1; Chrudzimski 2010). Analogously, Pfänder (1921: 72f) argues that, when it comes to giving an account of impersonal judgments, these have impersonal states of affairs as their correlates, but the incompleteness that characterizes such states of affairs has no place at the level of reality, i.e., at the level of “the objects in their objectual state” (a position which, again, is in agreement with Daubert, Schuhmann 1998: 184).

4. Conclusion

Early phenomenologists make up a philosophical tradition that has been almost wholly overlooked by historians of twentieth century philosophy. Partly building upon the ideas of Husserl and other philosophers, while nevertheless also developing their own ideas independently, they made contributions to as many fields as the philosophy of mind, the philosophy of psychology, the philosophy of speech acts, epistemology, social philosophy, axiology, and ontology.

Some of their most important contributions are accounts of the distinction between presentations (perceptions and imaginations) and the acts of meaning something with an expression; of affective phenomena, including episodic emotions and long-lasting sentiments; of knowledge as a direct grasp of objects and states of affairs rather than any sort of belief or conviction; of the distinction between attitudes or stances, such as belief and emotions, on the one hand, and knowledge, on the other; of the distinction between motivation and reasons, on the one hand, and mental causality, on the other; of the structure of speech acts such as promises, orders and questions; of collective intentionality and its relation to social facts; and of values, our acquaintance with them, and our reactions to them. In ontology, they developed theories of states of affairs and an account of modality according to which the most fundamental type of necessity flows from the essences or natures of objects. The fact that their ideas have been consistently overlooked is made even more curious by the fact that they write in clear German and that many of their ideas were rediscovered, beyond phenomenology, during the twentieth century.

Uncovering the full extent of these still rather neglected resources is an ongoing process that promises to impact different strands of philosophical debate and to substantially enrich the received picture of the phenomenological movement.


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I would like to thank Søren Overgaard, Genki Uemura, Íngrid Vendrell Ferran, and Joel Walmsley for their helpful comments on previous draft of this entry.

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Alessandro Salice <>

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