Adolf Reinach

First published Sun Sep 21, 2008; substantive revision Fri Apr 5, 2024

Adolf Reinach was a leading representative of so-called “realist” phenomenology. So pivotal was his role in shaping the early phases of the phenomenological movement that many young scholars saw in Reinach their real teacher in phenomenology. Although his life was tragically cut short at the age of 34 in 1917, Reinach’s production is remarkably wide and diverse in its thematic breadth, touching on issues of relevance to general ontology, philosophy of mind and action, philosophy of law, philosophy of language, philosophy of physics, philosophy of religion, and other disciplines. Lucidly clear, profoundly insightful, and precisely argued, Reinach’s contributions represent some of the best results that can be achieved through the phenomenological approach to philosophizing.

1. Life and Works

Adolf Reinach was born into a prominent Jewish family in Mainz, Germany in 1883. In 1901 he enrolled at the Ludwig Maximilian University in Munich to study law, psychology, and philosophy. Four years later he submitted his dissertation, which was entitled On the Concept of Causality in the Criminal Code, and written under the direction of Theodor Lipps. During this time, Reinach joined the Academic Society for Psychology—a group of young philosophers who gravitated around Lipps. This group included Johannes Daubert, Alexander Pfänder, Theodor Conrad, Moritz Geiger, among many others. In 1909 Reinach moved to Göttingen, where he completed his Habilitation on Essence and Systematics of Judgment under Edmund Husserl’s sponsorship. During his years in Göttingen, Reinach inspired and influenced the so-called Munich and Göttingen Circles of Phenomenology.

Between 1909 and 1913 Reinach published an important series of long articles. These include: On the Theory of Negative Judgment (1911), which is a condensed summary of his lost Habilitation developing his theory of judgment and of states of affairs; Kant’s Conception of Hume’s Problem (1911), where an account of metaphysical necessity is presented; and Premeditation; its Ethical and Legal Significance (1912/13), which provides a description of epistemic and practical agency. In 1913 he published his masterpiece The Apriori Foundations of the Civil Law (Die apriorischen Grundlagen des bürgerlichen Rechtes), which appeared in the first volume of the Yearbook for Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, which Reinach had founded and edited together with Moritz Geiger, Edmund Husserl, Max Scheler, and Alexander Pfänder. In this monograph, Reinach offers an account of many fundamental concepts concerning our shared social world, including normativity, proxy agency, property, positive law, and speech acts such as promises, orders, requests, and enactments.

After the declaration of war in 1914, Reinach enlisted in the German army, and only some letters and philosophical sketches from the war years have survived. Shortly after he was baptized into the Evangelical Church, he died in battle in Flanders in 1917. His death profoundly influenced the future history of the phenomenological movement. Herbert Spiegelberg writes:

Independently of each other, the Göttingen students of phenomenology like Wilhelm Schapp, Dietrich von Hildebrand, Alexander Koyré and Edith Stein, in their accounts of this period, refer to Reinach, not to Husserl, as their real teacher in phenomenology. Hedwig Conrad-Martius even goes so far as to call him the phenomenologist par excellence… It was his death in action in 1917 rather than Husserl’s going to Freiburg which cut short not only his own promise but that of the Göttingen phenomenological circle. (1982: 191–192)

Karl Schuhmann and Barry Smith’s critical edition of Reinach’s work includes all his publications as well as his unpublished manuscripts. In this latter material, one can find the text of the lecture he gave in 1914 in Marburg entitled Concerning Phenomenology, which can be considered a manifesto of realist phenomenology.

Many of Reinach’s ideas have been rediscovered by contemporary philosophers, often without awareness of his philosophical work and significance. Notable examples of this include his theory of social acts, which predates similar theories developed by Austin and Searle; the thesis that metaphysical necessity is grounded in essences; the distinction between social and moral normativity; the idea that acquiring knowledge is a sui generis act of the mind; the description of the psychological sense of commitment; and his recognition that there are genuinely social entities, which are neither physical nor psychological (examples being the claim and obligation that arise through an act of promising).

2. Reinach’s Realist Phenomenology

Reinach sees himself as developing a distinctive approach to philosophy with the goal of being faithful to what is given in different kinds of experience (linguistic, religious, moral, perceptual, emotional, aesthetic, and so forth). Reinach argues that some of these experiences have the power to make their subject acquainted with objects and their “a priori” or “essential structures (Wesenszusammenhänge)”. Thus, Reinach writes:

We can surely take it as generally granted that there are no self-evident and necessary relations of essence in the causal relations of external events. However it is, to speak with Hume, that we come to know that fire produces smoke, this is surely not intelligibly grounded in the essence of fire, as it lies in the essence of the number 3 to be larger than the number 2. (1913a [1989: 155], English translation 2012: 15, emphasis added)

As this passage illustrates, Reinach draws a fundamental distinction between contingent and a priori, i.e., general and metaphysically necessary states of affairs. Three ideas, here, shed light on Reinach’s understanding of phenomenology.

First, a priori states of affairs are grounded in the very nature, or essence, of their underlying or “founding” objects (Reinach 1911b; for contemporary discussions of this idea, see Fine 1994a, 1994b, 1995 and Mulligan 2004). For example, 3 is larger than 2 in virtue of its essence; orange lies between red and yellow in virtue of its essence; promises generate obligations in virtue of their essence; and remorse presupposes the memory of a past wrongdoing in virtue of its essence. Since each and every object, being the object that it is, carries an essence or a nature, each and every object is embedded in some a priori or essential structure. Importantly, such structures are mind-independent states of affairs: they are not ascribed, imposed, or projected onto the world; rather, they are grounded in the nature of the entities themselves. This is not, however, to say that the mind, for Reinach, does not have the capacity to create entities, as we will see in his account of social and institutional entities.

A core aim of phenomenology is thus to accurately describe the a priori states of affairs that we find in the world. Each and every object carries an essence, but not all essences are of equal interest to the phenomenologist, whose attention goes to those essences which have a higher degree of intelligibility or of philosophical significance (von Hildebrand 1976: 128–136). The task of investigating such philosophically significant essences opens up an almost inexhaustible domain of eidetic research for the phenomenologist:

the realm of the a priori is incalculably large … [and this] opens up for investigation an area so large and rich that still today we cannot see its boundaries. (1914 [1989: 546], English translation 2012: 215f)

In defending the existence of a priori states of affairs, phenomenological realists thus believe that they have established a new kind of research agenda for philosophy, illustrated in Reinach’s investigations into the essences of mental states (emotions, intentions, perceptions, judgments…), the nature of social and institutional entities (obligations, claims, rights, property…), the nature of movement, and many more. All these investigations should be understood as contributions to corresponding eidetic disciplines (eidetic psychology, eidetic social ontology, eidetic physics, and so on).

Second, to invoke essences in metaphysical explanations “does not mean anything dark or mystical” (1913a [1989: 144], English translation 2012: 5). Essences are objects of a particular kind: they are, as the next section clarifies, ideal objects. Hence, essences, just like objects of other sorts, can—at least in principle—be apprehended, grasped or cognized by a subject (Reinach 1911c [1989: 104], English translation 1982: 325). Importantly, Reinach denies that the intuition of essences requires any special epistemological technique (as the later Husserl argued). We can intuit essences in experiencing just a single instance: for example, in making a promise (in realizing a specific instance of the essence of promise), the promisor can understand that all instances of promises, by necessity, are directed to an addressee. To put this differently, the subject understands that, as a matter of necessity, there can be no promise that is not directed to some promisee. In fact, Reinach goes so far as to claim that we don’t even need to experience an actual instance of the essence: in some cases, an act of imagination can make the essence known to the imagining subject. He writes:

I can now, in this moment, convince myself with complete certainty of the fact that orange lies qualitatively between red and yellow, if only I succeed in bringing to clear intuition for myself the corresponding natures. I need not have reference to some sense perception, which would have to lead me to a place in the world where a case of orange, red, and yellow could be found. Because of this, not only—as is often pointed out—does one need to perceive merely a single case in order to apprehend the a priori laws involved in it; in truth, one also does not need to perceive, to “experience”, the single case. One need perceive nothing at all. Pure imagination suffices. (Reinach 1914 [1989: 543], English translation 2012: 157; see also 1912/13 [1989: 285])

It is important that Reinach not be misunderstood on this point. He is not suggesting that the job of the phenomenologist starts and ends with intuitions of essences. Quite the contrary: the intuition should be proved to be veridical, the revealed essence adequately understood, its relations with other essences described, the conditions of its instantiation clarified.

The third idea is that essences may or may not be instantiated. It is controversial in the literature whether or not this idea commits Reinach to Platonism (DuBois 1995; Baltzer-Jaray 2009). But it can be argued that, if it does (see Salice 2009; B. Smith 1987), then Reinach would not be embracing a naïve form of Platonism. For instance, Reinach explicitly rejects a notion of essences that would generate any form of third man argument. In his article, The Supreme Rules of Rational Inference According to Kant of 1911, he observes that essences (what he calls there “general concepts”) do not have the same properties as the objects that instantiate them. He notes that it would be an ontological mistake to assume that essences are the same sorts of things as the entities that have them. For instance, the judgment that “the triangle has three sides” does not convey the idea that the essence of the triangle itself instantiates triangularity—for that would be nonsensical. Rather, the judgment should be understood as expressing the thought that “everything that is a triangle has three sides”. It is this general and necessary state of affairs that is the specific object of our a priori knowledge.

3. General Ontology: Objects and States of Affairs

By endorsing the view that the two most general categories in formal ontology are those of object and state of affairs, Reinach refines a number of ideas that were already circulating at his time (Husserl 1900/01; Meinong 1904, 1910).

Objects (Gegenstände) are either real or ideal. Real objects are either physical or mental. So, for instance, a volcano is a physical entity: it is an individual that is extended in both time and space. By contrast, the perception of a volcano is a mental entity, which is also an individual, but extended only in time. Hence, what gives unity to the category of real objects is that all real entities are both temporal and individual.

Ideal objects are atemporal: they are unaffected by the passage of time. An important distinction Reinach draws within this category is between sortal and non-sortal essences (1911 [1989: 57], English translation 1994: 87f, see also 1913b [1989: 420]). Qualities, i.e., non-sortal essences or characterizing properties, like redness or sweetness, do not allow us to count things (or they do so only in association with the count noun “thing”). By contrast, sortal essences help us in counting (one whale, a second whale, a third whale…). Objects are instances of types or essences, while “moments” (individualized properties or “tropes”) are instances of qualities (see Reinach 1912 [1989: 361]).

The combination of an object with its moments is called by Reinach an “underlying situation [zugrundelieger Tatbestand]” or a “unitary complex [Einheitskomplex]” (compare the use of the term “complex” by Russell and Wittgenstein, see Potter 2008, esp. 102–108). So, for instance, the singular term “the rose” refers to an object, where “the red rose” points to a complex that is constituted by the rose together with its moment of redness. Importantly, any complex “founds” states of affairs: in this example, the red rose founds the being-red of the rose. States of affairs (Sachverhalte—another term used by Wittgenstein) are categorically different from objects and complexes, as the following considerations show (many of these ideas are presented in Reinach 1911c [1989: 112–120], English translation 1982: 332–346).

First, states of affairs either obtain or not, whereas objects (and, by extension, complexes) either exist or not. Reinach does not elaborate on this point, but it stands to reason that a state of affairs obtains if and only if its underlying complex exists. The point is made by his close friend Theodor Conrad: “Clearly one can … say correctly [that states of affairs subsist] only if the (external) situation [Tatbestand] really is objective …” (Conrad 1953–1954). For instance, the being-red of the rose obtains if and only if the red rose exists.

Second, states of affairs are either positive or negative, whereas objects do not exhibit any analogous dichotomy. States of affairs are negative or positive in virtue of their unique structure, which is constituted by a predicative component: “the being-F of x”. A negative state of affairs is one whose predicative component is affected by negation: “the not-being-F of x”. Since states of affairs are the only entities constituted by a predicative component, and since the negation only affects predicative components, only states of affairs can be negative. Two consequences follow from this idea:

  • Since objects do not carry a predicative component, and since negation only affects predicative components, there are no negative objects. Essences, qualities, or complexes are objects and hence there are no negative essences, qualities or complexes.
  • States of affairs require an object that saturates or “completes [ergänzt]” their predicative component. The number of saturating objects varies depending on the nature of the predicative component. In addition to monadic states of affairs and polyadic states of affairs (i.e., relations), Reinach defends the controversial claim that there are also genuinely impersonal states of affairs (1908). So, for instance, the proposition “it rains” refers to a state of affairs that, according to Reinach, is impersonal. (We will come back to this idea in Section 5.)

Reinach argues that the principle of non-contradiction is grounded in these two properties of states of affairs (obtaining vs non-obtaining; being negative vs being positive): either a positive state of affairs obtains, or its negative contradictory does. Insofar as the principle of non-contradiction applies to states of affairs, it is an ontological principle and must be distinguished from the principle of bivalence, which is a logical (not an ontological) principle asserting that any declarative proposition is either true or false. The two principles are, however, closely related: a proposition is true if and only if the corresponding state of affairs obtains. To put this differently, states of affairs are truth-makers, whereas propositions are truth-bearers.

Reinach maintains further that, just like the principle of non-contradiction, many other principles, which are traditionally held to be logical in nature, are in fact ontological because they hold of states of affairs (1911c [1989: 138 fn 1], English translation 1982: 376). For instance, the theory of deduction (Schlußlehre), traditionally conceived as a branch of logic, in fact belongs to ontology since it concerns states of affairs. Reinach shows this by pointing out that the relation of ground and consequent, which is fundamental to the understanding of deduction, holds among states of affairs and must be distinguished from causality. For instance, the being-mortal of all humans is the ground—not the cause—of Socrates’ being mortal. Events, by contrast, stand in relations of causality, but they never enter relations of ground and consequent. A first billiard ball hitting a second ball is the cause—not the ground—for the movement of the second ball.

Two other properties of states of affairs are of importance.

First, states of affairs can instantiate modal properties. These include alethic properties such as possibility and necessity. We have already seen that a state of affairs is necessary when it is grounded in an essence. Furthermore, states of affairs can also instantiate deontic properties: for instance, something can be permissible or obligatory. (We will come back to the deontic properties of states of affairs in the next section.)

Second, Reinach also suggests that states of affairs are either atemporal (for example, the fact that 3 is bigger than 2) or temporal (for example, the fact that the tree is blossoming). The temporality of states of affairs has a specific nature: states of affairs are in time, even though, in contrast to events, they do not unfold in time. He writes:

events, for example thunder, unfold themselves [konstituieren sich] in time, things do not, but a thing is in time. Accordingly, states of affairs do not unfold themselves in time, but they are in time because they are equipped with temporal determinations. (1910 [1989: 352])

How do we come to know states of affairs? Reinach claims that these entities can be given to us in perceptual acts of a specific kind. When we report a perception by using a that-clause (“I perceive that this animal is barking”) or a qualifier followed by a property (“I perceive this animal as a dog”), then we are reporting an instance of cognizing or of coming to know something (Erkennen, Reinach 1911c [1989: 118], English translation 1982: 342). Given that states of affairs are either positive or negative, it follows that, if certain psychological preconditions are fulfilled, one can also perceive or come to know negative states of affairs. If, e.g., I open the fridge with the expectation of finding a can of beer unbeknownst of the fact that somebody already drank it, then I can perceive that there is no can of beer in the fridge. Importantly, this experience is not a belief (or conviction, Überzeugung) because belief is polar (I either believe or disbelieve something). But cognizing is not polar: either I cognize something or I do not cognize at all. Also, beliefs endure, whereas acts of cognizing are episodic. This difference, however, should not let us overlook the important relations between the two experiences. In particular, acts of cognizing can motivate beliefs, Reinach argues: the perception that there is no beer in the fridge can motivate you to believe that there is no beer in the fridge. And the act of rehearsing that belief in conscious and linguistic thought by uttering the words “there is no beer in the fridge!” is an act of assertion (Behauptung). Because of the basic and fundamental role that sui generis acts of cognizing play in making us acquainted with states of affairs, some authors have claimed that Reinach anticipates the so-called knowledge-first approach in epistemology (see Mulligan 2014; on the knowledge-first approach, see Williamson 2000).

Reinach’s description of states of affairs and objects belongs to general ontology. Yet, his contributions to ontology are not limited to this area of research. In particular, he must be credited for uncovering the specific ontology of social and institutional entities (in a philosophical exercise that nowadays goes under the label of “social ontology”). Consider a promissory obligation (Verbindlichkeit), for example the obligation to meet you at the pub at 5 p.m., which is generated by my promising that I will meet you at the pub at 5 p.m.

This obligation is discharged, which means that it ceases to exist, at the moment I honor it by meeting you at the pub. But if it can be discharged, this means that the obligation was there in the first place. Hence, the obligation is an entity, which invites the question concerning its ontological nature: do obligations fall under the category of object or under that of state of affairs? If they were objects, then they would be either real or ideal.

If obligations were real objects, then they must be either physical or mental. But obligations are not physical objects for they are not extended in space (one cannot stumble upon an obligation; obligations cannot be seen, heard, set on fire).

The question then is whether obligations are mental objects. Reinach first considers whether they are beliefs. They are not, he claims, because having a belief about an obligation does not obligate the believer: the belief can, for example, be about someone else’s obligation. Also, my belief about my obligation can be mistaken—I have the belief, but there is no obligation. Reinach then considers whether an obligation boils down to a subjective sense of commitment. Interestingly, and anticipating much literature on the matter (see Michael 2022; Tomasello 2020), he insists that feelings like the sense of commitment (and the sense of entitlement) do indeed exist and play a crucial role in our psychology (within phenomenology, Stavenhagen 1931 amplifies on this topic). But such feelings do not coincide with obligations—for feelings are warranted or not: just as my fear of the barking dog in front of me is warranted only if the dog is dangerous, so my feeling of commitment towards you is warranted only if I have an obligation towards you, and this obligation is then in addition to my feeling. In general, Reinach contends that any hypothesis which aims at reducing obligations to subjective experiences is doomed to misfire. To illustrate the point, imagine accepting a car loan and agreeing to pay back the loan over a 36-month period. The very fact that an obligation (or a claim) may last for years without change shows that it survives (and, in fact, that it is independent of) changes in the bearer’s psychology: the bearer can forget the obligation, can lose consciousness, can even die, but none of these impacts the existence of the obligation. But if obligations are neither mental nor physical, then they are not real objects either.

This result leads to the question of whether obligations are ideal objects. But again, the answer here is in the negative, given that ideal objects are atemporal, whereas obligations exist in time (all these arguments are to be found in 1913a [1989: 147–150], English translation 2012: 8–11).

Are promissory obligations states of affairs? Interestingly, Reinach points to several similarities between the two. For instance, he tells us that obligations stand in relations of ground and consequent—the existence of a promise (which is a state of affairs) is a ground (not a cause) of an obligation (Reinach 1913a [1989: 155], English translation 2012: 15). Also, promissory obligations appear to be relations (and, thus, polyadic states of affairs): they hold between a promisor, a promisee, and the content of the promise; they also are associated in every case with promissory claims as their converse relations. Further, as we have seen, Reinach consistently argues that obligations, like some states of affairs, are in time (although they do not unfold in time). Nowhere, however, does he explicitly state that promissory obligations and claims are states of affairs.

4. Social Acts and Normativity

In the Logical Investigations, Husserl develops a thesis advanced by Franz Brentano, according to which intentionality, i.e., the property of being directed towards an object, is a crucial power of the mind. Based on this notion of intentionality, Husserl argues that, since language essentially serves to express intentional experiences, all uses of language essentially are referential. So, for example, the sentence “this is a whale” uttered by a subject while they perceive a whale expresses their subjective perception of the whale and, hence, refers to the intentional object of the perception (which is the perceived whale). To accommodate non-declarative sentences like promises, questions or commands in this conceptual framework, Husserl maintains that these sentences express beliefs about the subject’s inner experience. For instance, my question “what time is it?” expresses my belief that I have the desire to know the time and, hence, refers to that desire (the desire being the intentional object of my belief). Similarly, my promise to you “I’ll be at the pub at 5 p.m”. expresses my belief that I have the intention of being at the pub at 5 p.m. and, hence, refers to that intention.

It was in critical reaction to such theses that Reinach developed his theory of social acts (B. Smith 1990), a theory which bears striking similarities to the theory of speech acts later developed by Austin and Searle in the 1960s. Compare promising and reporting one’s intention to do something. According to Reinach, these two experiences belong to the category of what he calls “spontaneous” acts: these are acts which involve a subject’s bringing something about within his own psychic sphere, as contrasted with passive experiences of, say, feeling a pain or hearing an explosion (1913a [1989: 158], English translation 2012: 18). Yet, there is a crucial difference between these two spontaneous acts, namely that they have different conditions of success. In particular, the promise is successful if it generates a promissory obligation for the promisor and a claim for the promisee. We will come back to this point below, but for now it is important to highlight that the report of an intention does not stand under similar criteria of assessment. Forming an intention and reporting it are not acts that aim at the generation of obligations and claims.

Once this first point is established, one can unearth another crucial difference between the two acts. For an act of promise to be successful, that is, for it to generate a claim and an obligation, this act must be registered by its addressee. For unless the promisee has heard the act that has been directed to them, the promise will not have the mentioned consequences. This peculiar property, which Reinach calls “the need of being heard (Vernehmungsbedürftigkeit)”, is one that the promise shares with a vast number of acts like apologizing, commanding, accusing, answering, asking, requesting, informing. Those acts and only those acts, which are in need of being heard, are classified by Reinach as “social acts”. All social acts hence require a linguistic utterance or some other overt performance of a non-natural and rule-governed sort that is addressed to an addressee. This thereby serves the fulfillment of their need of being heard, which is a necessary condition for them to achieve their effects.

None of this applies to intentions (nor to their mere reports, as it does not apply also to acts such as cursing, blessing, forgiving, and so forth). This is not, however, to say that promises and intentions are unrelated. Quite the contrary: a promise always presupposes the intention to perform the action that has been promised. If such an intention is not present, one issues merely a sham promise, which is not a promise at all (as a false friend is not a friend). Reinach speaks in this context of the “pseudo-performance (Scheinvollzug)” of a promise (1913a [1989: 162], English translation 2012: 22). Similar considerations apply to all social acts: to be authentically performed, each social act presupposes a non-social, internal state on the part of the speaker. Thus an act of questioning presupposes uncertainty about the content of the question (otherwise it is a rhetorical question, i.e., a question to which the questioner already knows the answer); an act of informing presupposes belief in the content of the information on the part of the informer; and so on.

Reinach discusses a plethora of social acts in The A Priori Foundations of the Civil Law, including commanding, requesting, warning, questioning and answering, informing, enacting, revoking, transferring, granting, and the waiving of claims. But he devotes most of his attention to the act of promising. His account of promise is rich and insightful, but a few ideas merit extra consideration.

The first idea is that, for Reinach, promises generate promissory obligations in virtue of their nature. Promises bring about obligations because of what they are: obligation-generators. Promising is a sui generis phenomenon that was discovered and not invented. This can also be seen in the contrast between promising and those elements of a code of law which truly are constructed, for example specific rules concerning primogeniture or the discharging of liens. In holding this view, Reinach rejects any attempt of tracing the nature of promises back to other allegedly more well-understood accounts of obligation-generation, including via: useful social practices (Hume 1739), social institutions (Searle 1969), expectation triggers (Scanlon 1990), solicitations of trust (Friederich & Southwood 2011), and joint decisions (Gilbert 2018). Hewrites:

Strictly speaking, we are not proposing any theory of promising. For we are only putting forward the simple thesis that promising as such produces claim and obligation. One can try, and we have in fact tried, to bring out the intelligibility of this thesis by analysis and clarification. To try to explain it would be just like trying to explain the proposition, 1 × 1 = 1. It is a fear of what is directly given, a strange reluctance or incapacity to look the ultimate data in the face and to recognize them as such, that has driven unphenomenological philosophies, in this as in so many other more fundamental problems, to untenable and ultimately to extravagant constructions. (1913a [1989: 188], English translation 2012: 46)

In insisting on the intrinsic capacity of promises to elicit normative consequences, Reinach by the same token also insists that promises generate obligations and claims even when they have an immoral content: immoral promises are promises and thus they commit the promisor and entitle the promisee. This important idea requires two comments for further elaboration.

First, Reinach recognizes that the promissory obligation only is a sufficient, pro-tanto reason for keeping the promise and that the pro-toto reason results from the aggregation of various other reasons to which the promisor is exposed. To begin with, the promisor is subject not only to the promissory obligation generated by the promise, but also to the moral duty to keep the promise. Crucially, if the content of the promise is immoral, then the promisor also stands under the moral duty of omitting the promised action.

Second, in determining the factors that resolve this issue, Reinach draws a distinction between what might be called “social” normativity and “axiological” normativity (of which “moral normativity” is subspecies alongside aesthetic and epistemic normativity). Promises and other acts of the mind generate social normativity (social obligations, claims, norms…). Axiological normativity, in contrast, is grounded in values (1913a [1989: 152f], English translation 2012: 13f). He writes on this point: “it is morally right that a morally valuable thing exists, and the contradictory state of affairs is morally not right [unrecht], etc.” (Reinach 1913a [1989: 153 fn 1], English translation 2012: 49). Importantly, the morally right state of affairs that a morally valuable thing exists implies the duty (Verpflichtung) to realize the morally valuable thing (Reinach 1989i: 291ff, Eng. trans 99f). For instance, the action of helping a friend in dire straits is valuable. It therefore is morally right to help a friend in dire straits. But this just means that one ought to help a friend in dire straits, which is a state of affairs marked by a particular kind of deontic modality (ought-modality). Each of these entities can motivate the moral action to help the friend, but they do so in different ways, all of which bear on the moral evaluation of the agent. Thus for example the agent who acts solely on a duty (without awareness of its underlying value) is morally less praiseworthy than the agent who is solely motivated by feeling the value, and maybe even without explicit awareness of the corresponding duty (see von Hildebrand 1916).

Values are not valuings. The latter are psychological experiences, the former ideal objects that can be exemplified in the world. As for all objects, so it is at least in principle possible to grasp values. The experience in which values are given to us is feeling: e.g., we feel the generosity of an action, the beauty of a landscape, the cruelty of a practice, the elegance of a movement, the vibrancy of a department, the obscurity of a philosophical text. Feeling is not emoting, however. For one can feel values, without emotionally responding to the felt value. For instance, one can feel the injustice of a given action without any indignation at the unjust action.

Importantly, values stand in a hierarchical order: some values are higher than others (1913b [1989: 485–515]). Reinach shares the concept of a hierarchy of values with several phenomenologists, including von Hildebrand, and particularly Scheler (for a comparison between Reinach and Scheler, see J. Smith 2017, esp. 174–178). Higher values ground stronger duties, lower values weaker duties. The idea that duties have degrees of strength can now be brought to bear on the issue of immoral promises: if a subject promises an immoral action, are they morally compelled to keep the promise? It depends, argues Reinach: if the duty to omit the action is stronger than the duty to honor the promise, then the promisor ought not to act according to their promise (1913a [1989: 186f], English translation 2012: 45).

5. Reinach’s Legacy

Reinach’s ideas have been influential in shaping the thoughts of many early phenomenologists. One of those who most clearly and generously recognizes his debt towards Reinach is his close friend Dietrich von Hildebrand, who picks up and advances many of his insights. Most importantly, von Hildebrand develops an ontology that has the notion of value at its very core. This notion is explored with regard to its implications for our understanding of ethics (von Hildebrand 1959) and aesthetics (1977–1984), the foundations of which require values as indispensable and fundamental elements. By expanding on Reinach’s remarks about deliberation (1912/13), von Hildebrand contributes to our understanding of the phenomenology of action by distinguishing different kinds of conative experiences (desire, willing, intention) and their role in shaping our conduct (see his 1916; this is a project, which is pursued further by Hans Reiner in his 1927). Von Hildebrand also elaborates on Reinach’s idea of social acts by claiming that some of our emotions are in-need-of being heard. Romantic love, for example, which is only one particular kind of love, strives to be understood by its addressee (1930). Furthermore, he develops Reinach’s knowledge-first approach to epistemology in terms that are more explicit than those used by Reinach himself: the act of coming to know something, according to von Hildebrand, is factive insofar as it always makes its subject acquainted with a fact (1976).

Von Hildebrand follows Reinach, too, in arguing that philosophical knowledge is first and foremost knowledge of a priori states of affairs, meaning: states of affairs that are grounded in essences. This preoccupation with the very notion of essence is characteristic of the philosophical work of many early phenomenologists. An entire battery of publications on this topic, all of which refer to Reinach, were produced in the decades between the two World Wars. The most notable are by Jean Héring (1921), Roman Ingarden (1925), Herbert Spiegelberg (1930), and Wilhelm Pöll (1936).

All of these works aim to illuminate the meaning of the term “essence”, which Reinach considered to be ambiguous (1912). One attempt at disambiguation is based on the idea that the “individual essence” of an entity (the essence that makes an entity the individual entity that it is) should be set apart from its “essentiality” (the essence that makes it an entity of the kind it is). These two notions should then be further distinguished from the essence in the sense of “idea” (this is the essence considered as such, i.e., as a stand-alone entity in isolation from its instances).

Reinach’s theory of states of affairs has also sparked a debate among phenomenologists focusing on whether Reinach’s maximally realist position about states of affairs should be moderated in some way to render it ontologically more parsimonious. For instance, some have argued against the idea of negative states of affairs (Ingarden 1964–65, see: Chrudzimski 2012), others against the idea of impersonal states of affairs (Pfänder 1921). Daubert draws a distinction between the state of affairs as such (described along the lines of Reinach’s notion of unitary complex) and the various ways in which the state of affairs can be apprehended and conceptualized (states of affairs “as cognized”, “as questioned”, “as commanded”, and so on, see Schuhmann 1987). Maximilian Beck (1938) rejects the idea of state of affairs as mind-independent entities altogether by claiming that these entities merely depend on minds.

Reinach’s investigations into legal and social entities has also influenced a number of phenomenologists. His theory of promises is at the basis of Wilhelm Schapp’s theory of contracts (1930) and has been reactivated recently to account for economic exchanges (Massin & Tieffenbach 2017; Salice 2022). Social acts are also discussed by Edith Stein in her account of the state (1925, see González-Di Pierro 2016; Taieb 2020) and by Gerda Walther in her account of social groups (1923, see Salice & Uemura 2018).

These are just a few specific examples of ways in which Reinach has shaped the phenomenological movement. However, Reinach also exerted a more general influence on the distinctive way in which early phenomenologists used to philosophize. Exactly in accordance with Reinach’s understanding of phenomenology, they focus on very specific problems in exchanges that often span decades. The discipline of phenomenology, on Reinach’s view, can neither be reduced to the activity of a single individual (or “ego”), nor should it be conceived on the model of a “rigorous science”. Rather, it is a collaborative exercise, which follows a specific philosophical method (De Santis 2022).

Reinach concludes his Marburg talk of 1914 with these words:

To future generations it will be just as unintelligible that an individual could devise philosophies as it is today that an individual might devise natural science. When continuity within philosophical work is attained, then that developmental process within world history in which one science after another separated off from philosophy will be realized within philosophy itself. Philosophy will become a rigorous science, not in that it imitates other rigorous sciences, but rather by keeping in mind that its problems require a peculiar method, the working out of which is the task of centuries. (Reinach 1914 [1989: 550], English translation [modified] 2012: 165)

Reinach’s historical role in forming and propelling the phenomenological movement is still not fully appreciated. But perhaps even more importantly, the same can be said of his systematic insights: many of his ideas still wait to be re-activated within contemporary debates especially in areas such as the philosophy of mind, philosophy of action, axiology, philosophy of law, and social ontology.


A. Works by Reinach


  • 1989, Sämtliche Werke. Textkritische Ausgabe [Collected Works: Critical Edition], edited by K. Schuhmann and B. Smith, 2 volumes, Munich: Philosophia Verlag.
  • 1921, Gesammelte Schriften, Halle: Max Niemeyer.

Quoted in this entry

  • 1908 [1989h], “Über impersonale Urteile”. Collected in Reinach 1989: 347–350. English translation by Barry Smith, 1982, “On Impersonalia”, in Parts and Moments. Studies in Logic and Formal Ontology, Barry Smith (ed.), Munich: Philosophia Verlag, 346–350.
  • 1910 [1989g] “Notwendigkeit und Allgemeinheit in Sachverhalt”. Collected in Reinach 1989: 351–354.
  • 1911a [1989e], “Die obersten Regeln der Vernunftschlüsse bei Kant”. Collected in Reinach 1989: 51–66. English translation by James M. DuBois, 1994, “The Supreme Rules of Rational Inference in Kant”, Aletheia. An International Journal of Philosophy, 6: 70–97.
  • 1911b [1989a], “Kants Auffassung des Humeschen Problems”, Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik, 141: 176–209. Collected in Reinach 1989: 67–94. English translation by J.N. Mohanty, 1976, “Kant’s Interpretation of Hume’s Problem”, Southwestern Journal of Philosophy, 7(2): 161–188. doi:10.5840/swjphil19767230
  • 1911c [1989d], “Zur Theorie des negativen Urteils”. Collected in Reinach 1989: 95–140. English translation by Barry Smith, 1982, “On the Theory of the Negative Judgment”, in Parts and Moments. Studies in Logic and Formal Ontology, Barry Smith (ed.), Munich: Philosophia Verlag, 315–346, 351–377.
  • 1912 [1989j], “Die Vieldeutigkeit des Wesensbegriffs”. Collected in Reinach 1989: 361–364.
  • 1912/13 [1989i], “Die Überlegung: ihre ethische und rechtliche Bedeutung”. Collected in Reinach 1989: 279–311. English translation by James Smith and Mette Lebech, 2017, “Reflection: Its Ethical and Legal Significance”, in Adolf Reinach. Three Texts on Ethics, James Smith and Mette Lebech (eds), Munich: Philosophia Verlag, 45–164.
  • 1913a [1989b], “Die apriorischen Grundlage des bürgerlichen Rechtes”, Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenlogische Forschung, 1(2): 685–847. Collected in Reinach 1989: 141–268. English translation by John F. Crosby, 2012, “The Apriori Foundations of the Civil Law” in The Apriori Foundations of the Civil Law. Along with the lecture “Concerning Phenomenology”, John F. Crosby (ed.), with an introduction by Alasdair McIntyre, Berlin: De Gruyter, 1–142. [Reinach 1913 available online (German)]
  • 1913b [1989f] “Einleitung in die Philosophie”. Collected in Reinach 1989: 369–514.
  • 1914 [1989c], “Über Phänomenologie”, lecture. Collected in Reinach 1989: 531–550. English translation by Dallas Willard, 2012, “Concerning Phenomenology” in The Apriori Foundations of the Civil Law. Along with the lecture “Concerning Phenomenology”, John F. Crosby (ed.), with an introduction by Alasdair McIntyre, Berlin: De Gruyter, 143–166.

B. References and Further Readings

  • Austin, John L., 1962, How to Do Things with Words (William James Lectures 1955), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Baltzer-Jaray, Kimberly, 2009, “Adolf Reinach is not a Platonist”, Symposium: Canadian Journal of Continental Philosophy, 13(1): 100–112. doi:10.5840/symposium20091316
  • Beck, Maximilian, 1938, Psychologie. Wesen und Wirklichkeit der Seele, Leiden: A.W. Sijthoff’s Uitgeversmaatscappij N.V.
  • Burkhardt, Armin (ed.), 1990, Speech Acts, Meaning, and Intentions: Critical Approaches to the Philosophy of John R. Searle (Foundations of Communication and Cognition = Grundlagen der Kommunikation und Kognition), Berlin/New York: W. de Gruyter. doi:10.1515/9783110859485
  • Chrudzimski, Arkadiusz, 2012, “Negative States of Affairs: Reinach versus Ingarden”, Symposium: Canadian Journal of Continental Philosophy, 16(2): 106–127. doi:10.5840/symposium201216230
  • Conrad, Theodor, 1953–1954, Überblick über die im Wintersemester 1953/54 und Sommersemester 1954 in der “Münchener Philosophischen Gesellschaft” durchgeführten phänomenologischen Untersuchungen über das Wesen der phänomenologischen Methode als spezifischem Zugang zur Philosophie, unpublished, Ana 378, V 2; transcribed by Daniele De Santis, forthcoming in The New Yearbook for Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy (Volume 22), London: Routledge.
  • Crosby, John F., 1983, “Reinach as a Philosophical Personality”, Aletheia. An International Journal of Philosophy, 3: xi–x.
  • –––, 1990, “Speech Act Theory and Phenomenology”, in Burkhardt 1990: 62–88.
  • De Santis, Daniele, 2022, “Theodor Conrad, Zum Gedächtnis Edmund Husserls (Ein unveröffentlichter Aufsatz aus der Bayerischen Staatsbibliothek)”, Husserl Studies, 38(1): 55–66. doi:10.1007/s10743-021-09289-8
  • DuBois, James M., 1994, “An Introduction to ‘The Supreme Rules of Rational Inference According to Kant’”, Aletheia. An International Journal of Philosophy, 6: 70–80.
  • –––, 1995, Judgment and Sachverhalt: An Introduction to Adolf Reinach’s Phenomenological Realism (Phaenomenologica 132), Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers. doi:10.1007/978-94-015-8470-8
  • –––, 2002, “Adolf Reinach: Metaethics and the Philosophy of Law”, in Phenomenological Approaches to Moral Philosophy (Contributions to Phenomenology 47), John J. Drummond and Lester Embree (eds), Dordrecht/Boston: Kluwer, 327–346. doi:10.1007/978-94-015-9924-5_17
  • Fine, Kit, 1994a, “Essence and Modality: The Second Philosophical Perspectives Lecture”, Philosophical Perspectives, 8: 1–16. doi:10.2307/2214160
  • –––, 1994b, “Senses of Essence”, in Modality, Morality, and Belief: Essays in Honor of Ruth Barcan Marcus, Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), New York: Cambridge University Press, 53–73 (ch. 5).
  • –––, 1995, “The Logic of Essence”, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 24(3): 241–273. doi:10.1007/BF01344203
  • Friedrich, Daniel and Nicholas Southwood, 2011, “Promises and Trust”, in Promises and Agreements: Philosophical Essays, Hanoch Sheinman (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 275–292.
  • Gilbert, Margaret, 2018, Rights and Demands: A Foundational Inquiry, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198813767.001.0001
  • González-Di Pierro, Eduardo, 2016, “The Influence of Adolf Reinach on Edith Stein’s Concept of the State: Similarities and Differences”, in Edith Stein: Women, Social-Political Philosophy, Theology, Metaphysics and Public History (Boston Studies in Philosophy, Religion and Public Life 4), Antonio Calcagno (ed.), Cham: Springer International Publishing, 93–105. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-21124-4_9
  • Héring, Jean, 1921, “Bemerkungen über das Wesen, die Wesenheit und die Idee”, Jahrbuch für Philosophie und Phänomenologische Forschung, 4: 495–543.
  • Hume, David, 1739, A Treatise of Human Nature, London: John Noon. Modern edition, David Hume: A Treatise of Human Nature, second edition, Lewis Amherst Selby-Bigge and P. H. Nidditch (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1978. doi:10.1093/actrade/
  • Husserl, Edmund, 1900–01, Logische Untersuchungen, 2 vols., Halle a. d. S: M. Niemeyer; second edition, 1913; translation of the second edition as Logical Investigations (International Library of Philosophy and Scientific Method), J. N. Findlay (trans.), London/New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1970.
  • Ingarden, Roman Witold, 1925, “Essentiale Fragen. Ein Beitrag zum Problem des Wesens”, Jahrbuch für Philosophie und Phänomenologische Forschung, 7: 125–304.
  • –––, 1931, Das literarische Kunstwerk. Eine Untersuchung aus dem Grenzgebiet der Ontologie, Logik und Literaturwissenschaft, Halle: Max Niemeyer, 1931; third edition, 1965; translated as The Literary Work of Art, G. G. Gabowicz (trans.), Evanston, IN: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
  • –––, 1964–65, Der Streit um die Existenz der Welt, Tübingen: Neimeyer Verlag.
  • Massin, Olivier and Emma Tieffenbach, 2017, “The Metaphysics of Economic Exchanges”, Journal of Social Ontology, 3(2): 167–205. doi:10.1515/jso-2015-0057
  • Meinong, Alexius, 1904, “Über Gegenstandstheorie”, in Untersuchungen zur Gegenstandstheorie und Psychologie, A. Meinong (ed.), Leipzig: Johann Ambrosius Barth, 1–51; collected in Meinong 1968: Vol. II: 481–535.
  • –––, 1910, Über Annahmen, second edition, Leipzig: johann Ambrosius Barth; collected in Meinong 1968: Vol. IV: xv–xxv and 1–384.
  • –––, 1968, Gesamtausgabe, 7 volumes, Rudolf Haller and Rudolf Kindinger (eds.), with help from Roderick M. Chisholm for the last 3 volumes, Graz: Akademische Druck- u. Verlagsanstalt.
  • Michael, John, 2022, The Philosophy and Psychology of Commitment, London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315111308
  • Mulligan, Kevin (ed.), 1987, Speech Act and Sachverhalt. Reinach and the Foundations of Realist Phenomenology, Dordrecht/Boston: Martinus Nijhoff. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-3521-1
  • –––, 2004, “Essence and Modality: The Quintessence of Husserl’s Theory”, in Semantik und Ontologie: Beiträge zur philosophischen Forschung (Philosophische Forschung; Philosophical research 2), Mark Siebel and Markus Textor (eds.), Frankfurt: Ontos, 387–418. doi:10.1515/9783110327236.387
  • –––, 2014, “Knowledge First — a German Folly?”, in Liber Amicorum Pascal Engel, Julien Dutant, Davide Fassio, and Anne Meylan (eds), Genève: Université de Genève, 380–400 (ch. 25). [Mulligan 2014 available online (pdf)]
  • Pfänder, Alexander, 1921, “Logik”, Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung, 4: 139–494. [Pfänder 1921 available online]
  • Pöll, Wilhelm, 1936, Wesen und Wesenserkenntnis. Untersuchungen mit besonderer Berücksichtigung Husserls und Schelers, München: Reinhardt.
  • Potter, Michael D., 2008, Wittgenstein’s Notes on Logic, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199215836.001.0001
  • Reiner, Hans, 1927, Freiheit, Wollen und Aktivität. Phänomenologische Untersuchungen in Richtung auf das Problem der Willensfreiheit, Halle: Niemeyer.
  • Salice, Alessandro, 2009, Urteile und Sachverhalte. Ein Vergleich zwischen Alexius Meinong und Adolf Reinach, München: Philosophia Verlag.
  • –––, 2022, “Wilhelm Schapp and the Standard Theory of Exchanges”, in Vassilicos and Erhard 2022: 132–150.
  • Salice, Alessandro and Genki Uemura, 2018, “Social Acts and Communities: Walther Between Husserl and Reinach”, in Gerda Walther’s Phenomenology of Sociality, Psychology, and Religion (Women in the History of Philosophy and Sciences 2), Antonio Calcagno (ed.), Cham: Springer International Publishing, 27–46. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-97592-4_3
  • Scanlon, Thomas, 1990, “Promises and Practices”, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 19(3): 199–226.
  • Schapp, Wilhelm, 1930, Die neue Wissenschaft vom Recht, Eine phänomenologische Untersuchung (Volume I), Berlin-Grunewald: Rothschild.
  • Scheler, Max, 1913, Der Formalismus in der Ethik und die Materiale Wertethik, Halle: Niemeyer; translated, fifth edition, as Formalism in Ethics and Non-Formal Ethics of Values: A New Attempt toward the Foundation of an Ethical Personalism (Northwestern University Studies in Phenomenology & Existential Philosophy), Manfred S. Frings and Roger L. Funk (trans.), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
  • Schuhmann, Karl, 1987, “Johannes Dauberts Kritik der ‘Theorie des negativen Urteils’ von Adolf Reinach”, in Mulligan 1987: 227–238.
  • Schuhmann, Karl and Barry Smith, 1987, “Adolf Reinach: An Intellectual Biography”: in Mulligan 1987: 3–28.
  • Searle, John R., 1969, Speech Acts: An Essay in the Philosophy of Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139173438
  • Smith, Barry, 1987, “On the Cognition of States of Affairs”, in Mulligan 1987: 189–225.
  • –––, 1990, “Towards a History of Speech Act Theory”, in A. Burkhardt 1990: 29–61.
  • Smith, James, 2017, Wert, Rechtheit und Gut: Adolf Reinach’s Contribution to Early Phenomenological Ethics (Ad Fontes = Studies in Early Phenomenology 7), Nordhausen: Traugott Bautz.
  • Spiegelberg, Herbert, 1930, “Über das Wesen der Idee. Eine ontologische Untersuchung”, Jahrbuch für Philosophie Und Phänomenologische Forschung, 11: 1–228.
  • –––, 1982, The Phenomenological Movement: A Historical Introduction, third revised and enlarged edition, (Phaenomenologica 5/6), Hague/Boston: M. Nijhoff.
  • Stavenhagen, Kurt, 1931, Achtung als Solidaritätsgefühl und Grundlage von Gemeinschaften, Riga: Verlag der Buchhandlung G. Löffler.
  • Stein, Edith, 1925, “Eine Untersuchung über den Staat”, Jahrbuch für Philosophie und Phänomenologische Forschung, 7: 1–124; English translation by M. Sawicki, 2006, An Investigation Concerning the State, as The Collected Works of Edith Stein (Volume 10), Washington, D.C.: ICS Publications. [Stein 1925 available online]
  • Taieb, Hamid, 2020, “Acts of the State and Representation in Edith Stein”, Journal of Social Ontology, 6(1): 21–45. doi:10.1515/jso–2019-0017
  • Tedeschini, Marco, 2015, Adolf Reinach. La fenomenologia, il realismo, Macerata: Quodlibet.
  • Tomasello, Michael, 2020, “The Moral Psychology of Obligation”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 43: e56. doi:10.1017/S0140525X19001742
  • Vassilicos, Basil and Christopher Erhard (eds), 2022, “Reinach and Contemporary Philosophy”, in The New Yearbook for Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy, XIX, London: Routledge, 1–174 (Part 1). doi:10.4324/b23065
  • Von Hildebrand, Dietrich, 1916, “Die Idee der sittlichen Handlung”, Jahrbuch für Philosophie und Phänomenologische Forschung, 3: 126–252.
  • –––, 1930, Metaphysik der Gemeinschaft, Untersuchungen über Wesen und Wert der Gemeinschaft, Augsburg: Haas & Grabherr; reprinted in his GW: vol. IV (1975).
  • –––, 1959, “Ethik”; reeprinted in in his GW: vol. II.
  • –––, [GW] 1971–1984, Dietrich von Hildebrand Gesammelte Werke, 10 volumes, Dietrich von Hildebrand Gesellschaft (ed.), Stuttgart: Kohlhammer.
  • –––, 1976, “Was ist Philosophie?”, in his GW: vol. I.
  • –––, Ästhetik, 2 volumes
    • 1977, 1. Teil, in his GW: vol. V
    • 1984, 2. Teil, in his GW: vol. VI
  • Walther, Gerda, 1923, “Zur Ontologie der sozialen Gemeinschaften”, Jahrbuch für Philosophie und Phänomenologische Forschung, 6: 1–158.
  • Williamson, Timothy, 2000, Knowledge and Its Limits, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/019925656X.001.0001
  • Zaibert, Leo and Barry Smith, 2007, “The Varieties of Normativity: An Essay on Social Ontology”, in Intentional Acts and Institutional Facts: Essays on John Searle’s Social Ontology (Theory and Decision Library), Savas L. Tsohatzidis (ed.), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, 157–173. doi:10.1007/978-1-4020-6104-2_7

Other Internet Resources


Alessandro Salice’s sincere thanks go to Jason Dockstader and Danny Forde for reading previous drafts of this entry and to Daniele De Santis, who made his transcription of Theodor Conrad’s unpublished manuscript (Ana 378, V 2) available for quotation.

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