Philosophy in Mexico
Mexican philosophy has been influenced by a variety of traditions of thought, which have been combined and transformed to meet the specific demands and circumstances of Mexican life. The result has been a rich and original tradition that is more than 500 years old and that, together with Peruvian philosophy, is the oldest of the Americas.
Although Mexican philosophy has been concerned with every manner of theoretical inquiry, it might be characterized by a particular concern with ethical and political issues and the concrete consequences of philosophical inquiry. The questions concerning human nature and the relation between power and reason have been central to the development of Mexican philosophy, from early reflections on the justification of the Spanish conquest to recent debates about democratic reform or the Indian insurgence in Chiapas. The critique of philosophical eurocentrism is another central feature of Mexican philosophy.
The bibliography includes all the books and articles mentioned in this article and a selection of secondary texts in English.
- 1. Some Metaphilosophical Questions
- 2. Pre-Hispanic Philosophy
- 3. The Philosophy of the Conquest and Renaissance Humanism
- 4. The 16th Century: Scholasticism
- 5. The 17th Century: Scholasticism and the Baroque
- 6. The 18th Century: The Difficult Reception of Modernity
- 7. The 19th Century: Liberals and Positivists
- 8. The 20th Century
- 9. The 21st Century
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Some Metaphilosophical Questions
Throughout Latin America, philosophers have raised metaphilosophical questions about the originality and peculiarity of their own philosophy. Likewise, it is often claimed that philosophy in Mexico is not the same as Mexican philosophy, and that while philosophy in Mexico has a long and distinguished history, it is wrong to speak of Mexican philosophy, defined by the originality or authenticity of its debates or theses, the distinctness of its schools, or the uniqueness of its style or terminology (see Romanell 1975). Other scholars disagree and argue that there are indeed substantive, thematic, or stylistic continuities that underlie much of the philosophy produced in Mexico and that allow us to speak of Mexican philosophy as an original and authentic tradition. Still others believe that although philosophy in Mexico does not constitute a unified and distinct tradition yet, it has the potential to become one. (For an extended discussion of the difference between “Mexican philosophy” and “Philosophy in Mexico”, see Hurtado 2007, particularly chapter 2.)
To complicate the metaphilosophical discussion further, while philosophy has been produced in Mexico for over 500 years, it is misleading to speak of “Mexican philosophy” before Mexico won its independence from Spain in 1821. That is, with few exceptions did Mexican thinkers and philosophers living under colonial rule or before think of themselves or their work as Mexican. Even today, given that the development of Mexican philosophy is emerging largely as a collaborative effort among Mexican and Latinx philosophers, it is perhaps more accurate to speak of trans-Mexican philosophy—again, as a tradition not neatly defined by political borders. What we call trans-Mexican philosophy should not be confused with Mexican-American or Chicanx philosophy, although they are closely related (see the related entry on Latinx philosophy). Instead, it refers to a field of inquiry that focuses on the extension and application of Mexican philosophy outside of Mexico, particularly in the United States, and on the way in which the current developments in Mexican philosophy both in Mexico and the United States are mutually supportive.
Even allowing for a certain flexibility in how we define Mexican philosophy, not all philosophers in Mexico think that cultivating Mexican philosophy as a distinct tradition is a worthy goal. Many believe that we ought to leave the pursuit of national philosophies in the past. So, like Roger Bartra, who coined the phrase the post-Mexican condition (see Bartra 2002), we might speak of a post-Mexican philosophy, that is, of a philosophy that is produced in Mexico but which does not aim to represent Mexican culture at all.
We will not discuss these metaphilosophical issues further (see the related entry on Latin American philosophy: metaphilosophical foundations). Our primary concern is to provide a sketch of the history of philosophy in Mexico.
2. Pre-Hispanic Philosophy
During the early years following the Conquest, Spaniards quickly realized that pre-Conquest Mexicans possessed a complex and sophisticated system of beliefs about human beings and the universe. In his Historia general de las cosas de la Nueva España (1585 [1950–1982]), the Franciscan missionary Bernardino de Sahagún (1499–1590) reproduced the ancient Mexican worldview through documents and testimonials. Centuries later, with the discovery of new documents and a deeper knowledge of indigenous languages, we have improved our understanding of how the original inhabitants of Mesoamerica viewed the world.
The first historians of Mexican philosophy recognized the richness and sophistication of native cosmology, but they did not consider it philosophy per se. However, in 1955, Miguel León-Portilla (1926–2019) challenged the received view and renewed our interest in Mesoamerican thought by publishing his influential La filosofía náhuatl—emphasis on filosofía—a collection of recovered texts translated into Spanish that deal with cosmology, metaphysics, anthropology, ethics, and aesthetics. In his book, León-Portilla argues that the Mexica (i.e., how the Aztecs referred to themselves) in fact did philosophy, and he does so by reconstructing their philosophical tradition and comparing it to Ancient Greek philosophy. Years later, other authors followed his example and wrote extensive commentaries on Mayan texts such as Popol Vuh, which provide a deeper understanding of classical Mayan cosmology and anthropology.
The use of the term “philosophy” to speak of Mesoamerican thought has been applauded by those who believe that it is necessary to de-center the Western concept of philosophy. But it has been criticized by those who believe that calling pre-Hispanic thought “philosophy” fails to appreciate what distinguishes Western philosophy as an achievement from a worldview or body of beliefs, which of course all peoples possess. Thus, some scholars have claimed that to interpret pre-Conquest texts as philosophy is to retroactively attribute to them something that wasn’t there, specifically a certain level of self-consciousness, rational reflection, and critique. Others have even questioned the authenticity of historical sources.
For instance, Quetzalcóatl, a deity of Mesoamerican culture who was also the putative leader of the pre-Aztec Toltec people, challenges traditional religious mythology and offers an original conception of divinity, the universe, and human nature. According to Quetzalcóatl, the supreme god is Ometéotl, the god of duality. Ometéotl was masculine and feminine, the creator of all things, and played an active role in all aspects of reality. However, since it is not clear whether Quetzalcóatl was a historical or mythical figure, it is also not clear what to make of the ideas that we normally attribute to him and which have been fundamental in the development of our understanding of Náhuatl philosophy.
Among the tlamatinime—wise men who followed the intellectual tradition of Quetzalcóatl—Tezcoco’s King Nezahualcóyotl (1402–1472) was the most prominent. Tezcoco was a small kingdom and a military ally of the Aztecs. King Nezahualcóyotl developed a line of thought that has been preserved in his poetry and narrative prose, according to which he doubted the permanence of human life in a world defined by change and death. If gold and jade can splinter, he mused, then human beings must accept that their passage on earth is transitory. However, our finitude should not overwhelm us with sadness; instead, the human heart can find meaning in flor y canto (songs and flowers), which is how Nezahualcóyotl referred to art and beauty. Poetry and song persevere even as flowers wither and die, and it is our job to learn how to be patient and humble in the face of all that is beyond our ken, such as the gods’ plans, which will forever remain a mystery. Though his texts are fragmentary and poetic, we might consider Nezahualcóyotl a philosopher because he questions mythological and religious responses to traditional philosophical problems, such as essence, change, and the meaning of life. In fact, we might we might compare his thought and style to that of Heraclitus or Parmenides.
The connection between pre-Hispanic thought and Mexican philosophy has deepened in recent years. One example of this is the concept of nepantla, which Emilio Uranga (1921–1988) reintroduces in his book Análisis del ser del mexicano (1952). According to Uranga, nepantla refers to an ontological condition of existence that captures both the specific nature of Mexican being and the human condition more generally. Nepantla means to be in between two opposites without fully rejecting or adopting either. Several authors from both Mexico and the United States have since employed the concept of nepantla in novel ways to describe various aspects of our existence (e.g., Gloria Anzaldúa).
Other authors have recovered categories coined by the survivors of indigenous peoples and have proposed alternatives to Western philosophy. For example, Carlos Lenkesdorf’s (1926–2010) Una filosofía en clave tojolabal (2002) offers a philosophical reconstruction of beliefs and practices of the Tojolabal natives who live in the state of Chiapas, Mexico. Lenkesdorf studies the language and everyday practices of the Tojolabal people to propose an entirely different way of understanding the relationship between persons, community, and nature. We can also find key concepts of indigenous Mexicans in the political thought of the members of the Zapatista Army of National Liberation (EZLN).
One recent effort to reconstruct pre-Hispanic thought is James Maffie’s Aztec Philosophy (2015). Using a broad selection of sources, old and new, Maffie offers a reconstruction of Aztec metaphysics that employs categories and concepts of Western metaphysics to demonstrate the originality of Nahuatl thinking.
3. The Philosophy of the Conquest and Renaissance Humanism
The conquest of the Americas and, in particular, of the Aztec Empire, was an event of global significance that immediately challenged Spanish-language philosophers and theologians to reflect on what it means to be human, whether war, colonization, and slavery are ever justified and under what conditions, as well as the meaning of and relationship between “America” and “Europe”.
A professor at the University of Salamanca, Francisco de Vitoria (1483–1546) questioned whether the Spanish colonization of the American continent constituted “just war”. Unlike other authors who had witnessed the cruelty of Spanish colonization firsthand and who doubted whether conquest and colonization could ever be rationally justified, Vitoria never traveled to America and thus had no direct experience in the matter.
Father Bartolomé de las Casas (1484–1566) did have extensive experience in Mexico and objected to Spanish colonization. In 1550–1551, he engaged in a famous debate with Juan Ginés de Sepúlveda about whether the indigenous people were fully human. Las Casas claimed that the natives were rational beings, not unlike Europeans, and should be considered fully human with the same right to be protected under natural law, to choose their own form of government, and to be free. Consequently, Las Casas believed that Spaniards did not have the right to enslave or otherwise rule them. The ideas of Las Casas proved crucial in the Laws of the Indies (1542), which required certain protections of indigenous people of the Americas.
In the middle of the 16th century, the influence of Erasmus’ humanism was manifest in authors who wanted to return to the doctrinal simplicity and moral purity of early Christianity, a neo-stoic reconciliation of Plato and Aristotle that emphasized human dignity. We can also trace the influence of Thomas More’s Utopia, which inspired social experiments conducted in New Spain.
Father Juan de Zumárraga (1468–1548) founded El Colegio de Tlatelolco, a school in which the natives were instructed in Christian theology and philosophy. He also helped install the first press in 1539, and he conceived the creation of the Royal and Pontifical University of Mexico (the predecessor to the National University of Mexico today). Zumárraga wrote several books that exhibit the influence of Erasmus and of the Spanish humanist Constantino Ponce, who was a chaplain in Charles I’s court and later accused by the Inquisition of being a Protestant.
Vasco de Quiroga (died 1565) founded hospital-towns in Michoacán that were inspired by the communities described in Thomas More’s Utopia. According to Vasco de Quiroga, the natives lived in a golden age as described by Lucian of Samosata in his Saturnalia.
Phillip II of Spain sent Francisco Hernández (died 1578) to study the flora and fauna of New Spain. Once in Mexico, Hernández wrote several philosophical works with commentaries on Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics.
Of course European intellectuals were not alone in thinking about the political and intellectual consequences of conquest and colonization. To represent the native perspective on conquest and colonization, Miguel León Portilla published La visión de los vencidos (The Broken Spears in its English translation) in 1959. And in 1958, Edmundo O’Gorman (1906–1995) published La invención de América, which challenges the assumption that Europeans “discovered” America, that is, that America was an undiscovered location that Columbus both knew of and went in search of. Instead, as O’ Gorman points out, Columbus went in search of Asia and only accidentally happened upon what Europeans would later call “America” ex post facto, making both the idea of America, its so-called discovery, and European attitudes toward it and its inhabitants, a construction based entirely on European assumptions and beliefs.
4. The 16th Century: Scholasticism
Because the Spanish Empire was characterized by its Catholic zeal, it did not allow Protestant, pagan, or “modern” philosophies to be studied in New Spain. Instead, Scholasticism was the only school of philosophy that was approved by colonial authorities and the Catholic Church. Nevertheless, a number of prominent philosophers in Mexico made lasting and original contributions to the Scholastic tradition.
Friar Alonso de la Veracruz (1507–1584) was the first philosopher of New Spain. A student of Vitoria, he was one of the first to teach Scholastic philosophy in the New World and was the first published philosopher of New Spain. He wrote several commentaries on Aristotle, such as Recognitio summularum (1554a), Dialectica resolutio (1554b), and Physica speculatio (1557), which were used as textbooks. Like Vitoria, Alonso also questioned the justification of the Conquest, but he was even more sympathetic toward the indigenous population. Alonso argued that the natives did not lose their right to their lands because they were pagans, and he claimed that the Spanish Crown had stolen them from their lawful owners. He also sustained that sovereignty ultimately belongs to the people, not the king.
The Jesuit priest Antonio Rubio stands out among the philosophers of the 16th century. Born in Spain, he established himself in New Spain from 1576 to 1600 and wrote a famous treatise of logic titled Lógica mexicana (1603). The University of Alcalá adopted Lógica mexicana as its primary logic textbook and many editions of an abridged version were printed in Europe. We know, for instance, that Descartes studied Rubio’s Lógica as a pupil in La Fleche. Rubio wrote other books in which he offered a complete course in philosophy but, while his works on natural philosophy were published, his work on metaphysics was not, perhaps due to the popularity of Francisco Suárez’s Disputationes metaphysicae (1597).
Another notable philosopher in New Spain from the 16th century is Tomás Mercado, who wrote several studies on logic and the philosophy of economics, specifically on the rationality and justice of commercial trade.
5. The 17th Century: Scholasticism and the Baroque
In the 17th century, the Dominicans, the Augustinians, the Jesuits, and the Franciscans continued to cultivate Scholastic philosophy, in accordance with their specific religious orientation. However, the practice of philosophy was almost always lacking in innovation or critique. A paradigmatic representative of this traditional view of philosophy is Francisco Naranjo, a scholar who was known for his ability to recite the entirety of Thomas Aquinas’ Summa Theologica by heart. Other philosophers from that same period include Diego Basalenque, Juan de Rueda, Alonso Guerrero, and Diego Martín Alcázar.
In Europe, the 17th century is known as the Spanish Golden Age, producing figures such as Francisco de Quevedo and Luis de Góngora in literature, and Diego Velázquez and Bartolomé Murillo in painting. Likewise, we can speak of a Golden Age in New Spain. Three extraordinary figures of the 17th century’s Mexican baroque period cannot be omitted from a history of Mexican philosophy: Father Miguel Sánchez, Carlos de Sigüenza y Góngora, and Sister Juana Inés de la Cruz. All three of them were born in Mexico, wrote in Spanish, and were familiar with the Náhuatl language and culture.
Father Miguel Sánchez (1594–1674) studied at the University of Mexico, but was eventually not accepted as a member of its faculty. Sánchez is the author of Imagen de la Virgen María (1648) in which he offers a theological and philosophical interpretation of the Virgin of Guadalupe. Even though the influence of Saint Augustine is dominant in his analysis, Sánchez was one of the first intellectuals to approach human history from a Latin American perspective.
Carlos Sigüenza y Góngora (1645–1700) was a remarkable scientist, historian, and philosopher. He taught astronomy and mathematics at the Royal and Pontifical University of Mexico, and he became known for his opposition to the belief that comets were harbingers of catastrophes. In his book, Libra astronómica y filosófica (1690 ), Sigüenza y Góngora was one of the first intellectuals in New Spain to examine the advancements of Galileo Galilei, Descartes, and Kepler with scientific rigor. He was also well versed in pre-Columbian thought and culture, and rescued the moral and political practices and beliefs of the ancient Aztecs, presenting them as an example to live by.
Sister Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651–1695) was not allowed to enroll in the Royal and Pontifical University of Mexico because she was a woman. However, she became world-renowned for her wisdom and literary talent. Although Juana Inés de la Cruz was not a philosopher by trade, her writings contain elements of philosophy, from stoicism and hermeticism to post-Cartesian philosophy. Her long poem Primero sueño (1692) is an erudite reflection on epistemology and theology based on several classical and contemporary works. Juana Inés de la Cruz is also well-known as an early feminist who described the unfavorable conditions under which women were forced to produce their own philosophy. Her “Respuesta a Sor Filotea de la Cruz” (1691) is a feminist reflection avant la lettre in which she argues that men and women should be allowed to develop fully under the same conditions. In that brilliant and erudite text, she famously claims that “if Aristotle would have been a cook, he would have written even more”.
6. The 18th Century: The Difficult Reception of Modernity
In both the 17th and 18th centuries, it was responsibility of the main religious orders to teach philosophy in New Spain, in accordance with their specific doctrinal orientation. Franciscans adopted the philosophy of Duns Scotus; Dominicans, that of Thomas Aquinas; and the Jesuits were more receptive to modern philosophy. However, in the 18th century, the most influential philosophers struggled to reconcile the apparent tension between religion and science and between the modern and Scholastic tradition.
In the 18th century, the Jesuits were leaders in education and culture in New Spain. Their work is of central importance, not only because they adapted modern European thought to their own circumstances, but also because they helped to instill a sense of national identity that would result in political independence from Spain in the 19th century. However, in 1767, at the height of their influence (and precisely because of their influence), the Spanish Crown expelled the Jesuits from its territories. This was a heavy blow to the development of modern philosophy in Mexico, and it fueled a nascent sense of Mexican national identity among the subjects of Spanish colonial rule.
Among the main Jesuits of New Spain who were forced to leave their homeland were two prominent philosophers: Diego José Abad and Francisco Javier Clavijero. Diego José Abad taught a complete course on philosophy in which he studied modern philosophers such as Descartes and Gassendi. Abad tried to reconcile modern philosophy and Scholasticism by trying, for example, to reconcile atomism and Aristotelian hylomorphism. Francisco Javier Clavijero (1731–1787) wrote Storia antica del Messico (1780 ) in which he examines pre-Columbian history using the model of Greco-Roman classical history. He also wrote a Cursus philosophicus, of which only one section has been preserved: Physica particularis (1765).
Other influential philosophers, educators, and students of contemporary philosophy are Juan Benito Díaz de Gamarra (1745–1783), author of Elementa recentioris philosophiae (1774); the polymath José Antonio Alzate (1737–1799), a ferocious critic of Aristotle; and José Mariano Mociño (1757–1820), a distinguished expert in botany. All three proved influential in challenging the Colonial rule of Spain by challenging the dominance of tradition for the sake of tradition.
7. The 19th Century: Liberals and Positivists
The 19th century was a time of upheaval in Mexico. In 1808 Napoleon invaded Spain and King Ferdinand VII abdicated the throne, forcing the citizens of Spanish America to re-examine the concept of sovereignty. Specifically, they wondered whether, in the absence of a monarch, the colonies possessed the right to govern themselves until the monarch returned to the throne.
Appealing to the philosophy of the Enlightenment—though not always explicitly—several Mexican thinkers and political activists argued that the colonies did possess the right to self-government. Such was the case of Miguel Hidalgo (1753–1811), one of the fathers of Mexican Independence. Hidalgo was well known for his predilection for French ideas and for his opposition to Scholastic theology, as is demonstrated in his Disertación sobre el verdadero método de estudiar teología escolástica (1784). Francisco Severo Maldonado (1775–1832) was another philosophically-minded priest who wrote in favor of independence and about the philosophical foundations of nationalism.
After Mexico won its independence in 1821, and throughout the 19th century, an intense debate took place regarding the tenets of liberal philosophy and its application to Mexican reality. Liberals wanted the Mexican Constitution to resemble the Constitution of the United States, which defended individual rights, freedom of speech, and freedom of press. They also believed in the separation of church and state, and argued that the wealth and land owned by the Mexican Church should be expropriated to promote economic development. Liberals believed that everyone is equal before the law and they tried to erase the racial and cultural inequality that prevailed in the nation, particularly the position of indigenous communities. Among the authors who defended liberal ideas were José María Luis Mora (1794–1850), Melchor Ocampo (1814–1851), Ignacio Ramírez (1818–1879), and Ignacio Manuel Altamirano (1834–1893). (See the related entry on liberalism in Latin America.)
There were also influential conservatives who believed that Mexico ought to preserve its Spanish heritage, such as Lucas Alamán (1792–1853). While conservatives also promoted legislation to protect indigenous peoples and local industry, many argued that the Catholic tradition was needed to maintain national cohesion. So, while Enlightenment philosophy began to spread throughout the Americas in the 19th century, some notable Scholastics remained, such as Clemente de Jesús Munguía (1810–1868), author of Del pensamiento y su enunciación (1852).
In the middle of the 19th century, the debate between liberals and conservatives had important political ramifications. On the one hand, Mexican liberals had elected the first president of indigenous ancestry, Benito Juarez, who helped establish liberal reform throughout Mexico in the 1850s. On the other hand, from 1862 to 1867, conservatives supported the pro-French Mexican monarchy, headed by Maximilian of Hapsburg, ousting Juarez for a time. After the collapse of the Empire and the execution of Maximilian, the Conservative Party lost most of its influence as it was associated with supporting foreign powers.
Throughout the 19th century, Mexican intellectuals entertained a wide variety of philosophical schools, including liberalism, utilitarianism, sensualism, materialism, and socialism. Some also developed anarchist and romantic ideas, such as Juan Nepomuceno Adorno, a romantic whose La armonía del universo (1862) proposes a deistic philosophy and a utopian conception of human nature and society. But the main school of philosophy that dominated the second half of the century was positivism, understood broadly to encompass authors as varied as Auguste Comte, Herbert Spencer, Hyppolite Taine, and John Stuart Mill.
The main representative of positivism in Mexico was Gabino Barreda (1818–1881). In his “Oración cívica”(1867), Barreda offers an interpretation of Mexican history inspired by Comte’s philosophy of history, according to which history develops in three stages—the religious, the metaphysical, and the scientific. Barreda believed that the victory of the Liberal Party was ultimately grounded in positivist theses. He also believed that national reform should not be founded on religion or speculative metaphysics, but on the experimental methods of science. With this in mind, he promoted education reform that eliminated theology and speculative philosophy from the curriculum in public schools, thus initiating a long debate on the role of philosophy in public education that continues today.
For Mexican positivists the challenge was to reconcile freedom and order, both moral and natural. In his essay “De la educación moral” (1863), Barreda sustained that freedom does not amount to the freedom to do whatever one wants (i.e., freedom from constraint). True freedom is always constrained by the law, just as a free falling object falls according to the laws of nature. Likewise, moral freedom and progress is constrained by the moral law and must be consistent with the laws of science.
In addition to Comte’s philosophy, Mexican intellectuals applied Spencer’s social evolutionism to theories about Mexican history and society, as can be seen in the works of Justo Sierra (1848–1912) and Francisco Bulnes (1847–1924). According to social evolutionism, nations are like animal species: their organs have evolved to fulfill specific purposes, primarily survival. In his book El porvenir de las naciones hispanoamericanas (1899), Bulnes claimed that Mexico would have to make major changes to survive in its struggle against the Anglo-Saxons. From a political point of view, Spencer’s social evolutionism was the foundation of the view that progress in Mexico would result from a slow, deliberately planned evolution, not another revolution. For instance, Justo Sierra’s Evolución política del pueblo mexicano (1902) was used by some to justify the ongoing dictatorship of General Porfirio Díaz, who ruled Mexico for almost three decades leading up to the Mexican Revolution of 1910.
In the fields of logic and epistemology, Mill’s influence was widely accepted. Perhaps most influential in these areas was Porfirio Parra’s (1845–1912) Nuevo sistema de lógica inductiva y deductiva (1903), in which he defends an idealist version of empiricism.
8. The 20th Century
8.1. Philosophy and the Mexican Revolution (1910–1930)
The Mexican Revolution, which began in 1910, was the most significant event in modern Mexican history. While it was primarily a military campaign in defense of political democracy and equality, comprehensive agrarian reform, and workers’ rights, some argue that it was deeply influenced by a “climate of ideas”, including classical and social liberalism, the social doctrine of the Catholic Church, socialism, anarchism, spiritism, Bergsonism, and pragmatism. Some of the Revolution’s most influential intellectuals were activists first and foremost, such as Ricardo Flores Magón and Francisco Madero, both of whom fought against the dictatorship of Porfirio Díaz. From 1904 until his death in 1922, Flores Magón lived in the United States, first as an exile and then as a prison inmate. In many of his writings, distributed through the clandestine journal Regeneración, he developed a conception of society based on socialist and anarchist philosophy. And Madero, who was elected President of Mexico and who is perhaps best known for his La sucesión presidencial en 1910 (1908), was also an important defender of Allen Kardec’s branch of spiritism.
If some revolutionaries were primarily activists, others were primarily artists and intellectuals who became the voice of their generation. Such was the case of a young group of students who gathered in Mexico City and referred to themselves as the “Ateneo de la Juventud”. Antonio Caso (1883–1946) and José Vasconcelos (1882–1959) were two of its most prominent members, both of whom criticized the predominance of positivism, which they found culturally demoralizing. In particular, they rejected the positivist view that humanity is moved by selfish calculation, that morality is accountable to the laws of nature, and that the universe is governed by deterministic laws. The members of the Ateneo stated that humans are free, creative, and spiritual, capable of using intuition to understand the world, and inspired by moral feelings that transcend the laws of nature. This conception of human beings and the world can also be considered an essential part of the climate of ideas surrounding the Mexican Revolution.
Antonio Caso was the leading figure of Mexican philosophy in the first decades of the 20th century, and was most influential as a charismatic professor who inspired generations of students to pursue philosophy. Caso also created the Department of Philosophy at the National University of Mexico and helped to introduce Mexicans to contemporary European philosophers and schools of thought. His most important work, Existencia como economía, como desinterés y como caridad (1919), was a challenge to Darwin’s theory of biology, Spencer’s social evolutionism, Nietzsche’s doctrine of the Übermensch, and Max Stirner’s radical egoism, and it drew inspiration from sources as diverse as Bergson, Tolstoy, and Christianity.
According to Caso, human existence has three levels: the biological or economic, the disinterested or aesthetic, and the charitable. Caso considered this last level the highest expression of human dignity and applied this distinction to other moral, political, and aesthetic problems. In the 1930s, Caso defended academic freedom and the autonomy of the university and decried the changes to the 1933 Mexican Constitution that would reform public education along the lines of historical materialism. For example, he famously debated with the Mexican Marxist Vicente Lombardo Toledano (1894–1968) about congress’s plan to make public education socialist. In La persona humana y el estado totalitario (1941), Caso defends democracy against fascism and communism. For a comprehensive overview of Caso’s philosophy, see Mexican philosopher Rosa Krauze de Kolteniuk’s (1923—2003) La filosofía de Antonio Caso (1961).
José Vasconcelos was one of the most influential thinkers and promoters of Mexican culture in the 20th century. His reputation as an intellectual, politician, and writer is stronger than his reputation as a philosopher. However, he cannot be passed over in a history of Mexican philosophy. His theoretical works can be divided into two groups. The first group includes the writings in which he developed a philosophical system, from Estética (1936) to Lógica (1945), specifically an overarching metaphysical view that he had sketched out as early as 1916 in his Pitágoras, una teoría del ritmo. Vasconcelos believed that his main contribution to philosophy was the notion of an aesthetic a priori, as well as a list of metaphysical categories based on music rather than logic or science. According to him, the universe is more like a symphony than a logical treatise, and understanding requires the emotions as much as the intellect.
Unfortunately, his philosophical legacy was compromised by his abrasive personality and self-imposed isolation, and because he was not, like Caso, a professor of philosophy. Vasconcelos considered his writing on Latin American history and culture—the second group of writings—secondary to his philosophical work. Nevertheless, his account of Latin American history and culture have been more influential than his work on philosophy. His most influential work, La raza cósmica (1925), is a prophetic essay in which he considers Latin America the fountain of a mixed, cosmic race that will synthesize the four human races and lead humanity to the height of its development: the aesthetic. Although Vasconcelos believed that philosophy should be studied for its own sake, and for the universality of its ideas, he also claimed that Latin American nations should use philosophy to resist political, economic, and intellectual domination of the countries to the north (see his Ética, 1932).
In the late 1920s the pedagogical and social ideas of John Dewey were influential in Mexican education. Vasconcelos believed that Dewey’s philosophy was a vehicle for US imperialism and wrote a criticism of Dewey titled De Robinson a Odiseo (1935).
8.2. The Forming of Professional Philosophy (1930–1960)
The intellectual atmosphere of the 1930s underwent dramatic changes: the new generation of students, many of whom were protégés of Caso and Vasconcelos, were not interested in the debate between determinism and freedom or materialism and spirit. To them, values, objectivity, and social responsibility were the central issues of the day. They rejected the intuitionism and the irrationalism of Caso and Vasconcelos and favored a renewed rationalism and universalism. Critical reflection on what it means to be Mexican also started to gain importance, although it was not until the end of the 1940s that it reached full prominence.
At the time, Mexican philosophers also gained confidence in their role on the international stage. On the one hand, post-revolutionary Mexican culture was enjoying something of a golden age of creativity, particularly concerning its own authentic national identity. On the other hand, the two world wars convinced many intellectuals that the future of Western Civilization was to be found in America. The construction of an American philosophy and, in particular, of Mexican philosophy, was seen as the only way the philosophical tradition of Ancient Greece could be rescued from European decadence and savagery.
In the 1930s and 1940s, former students of Caso, such as José Romano Muñoz (1890–1967), Samuel Ramos (1897–1959), Adalberto García de Mendoza (1900–1963), Oswaldo Robles (1905–1969), Edmundo O’Gorman (1906–1995), Francisco Larroyo (1908–1981), Eduardo García Máynez (1908–1993), Antonio Gómez Robledo (1908–1994) and Guillermo Héctor Rodríguez (1910–1988) adopted and promoted philosophical currents from Germany, such as Neo-Kantianism of the Marburg and Baden schools, Dilthey’s historicism, Husserl’s phenomenology, Heidegger’s existentialism, Kelsen’s legal positivism and, above all, the philosophy of values of Scheler and Hartmann. José Ortega y Gasset, specifically his journal Revista de Occidente, also influenced that generation.
Some philosophers, such as Samuel Ramos, employed European models and ideals to reflect inwardly on what Ramos referred to as “the Mexican psyche”. Ramos was a famous critic of Caso’s philosophical style and defense of irrationalism, and he believed that the country needed a new philosophy that could diagnose the flaws in the Mexican character, specifically one that committed Mexicans to universal values, especially the use of reason. Thus, although Ramos philosophized about the Mexican character, he ultimately believed that Mexican philosophy ought to be dedicated to the rigorous study of being human and the objective field of values. Ramos also became interested in aesthetics and promoted the professionalization of philosophy. Some of his most important works are: Perfil del hombre y la cultura en México (1934), Hacia un nuevo humanismo (1940), and Filosofía de la vida artística (1950).
Not all philosophers were enthusiastic about applying philosophy to Mexican themes. For example, Francisco Larroyo was the main representative of Neo-Kantianism in Mexico, and wrote many books in defense of Neo-Kantian views on philosophy, science, and education, including La filosofía de los valores (1936) and La lógica de las ciencias (1938). Larroyo claimed that Mexico’s progress required a rigorous, rationalist, and scientific philosophy. Another well-known Neo-Kantian and Kelsenian was Guillermo Héctor Rodríguez.
Aside from defending neo-Kantianism, some philosophers defended and refined neo-Thomism, such as Oswaldo Robles, who sought to reconcile Neo-Thomism, phenomenology, and psychoanalysis. Among his books we might mention La teoría de la idea en Malebranche y la tradición filosófica (1937) and Esquema de antropología filosófica (1942).
Finally, a complete history of the first half of the 20th century Mexican philosophy would be remiss if it did not discuss the development of Marxism in Mexico, particularly the work of Vicente Lombardo Toledano. Like many of the intellectuals in our survey, the philosophical contribution of Lombardo Toledano is complicated by the fact that he was, perhaps first and foremost, a labor leader and a politician—a scholar-activist—and because he developed many of his ideas through public debate and discourse (cf. the debate between Caso and Lombardo mentioned above). Nevertheless, Lombardo wrote one of the first philosophical analyses of the Mexican Revolution and his works are essential reading for those interested in Marxist interpretations of Mexican themes in the first half of the 20th century.
Some philosophers stretched the concept of philosophy to combine historical, philosophical, and literary analysis to both Mexican and universal themes. For instance, in his essay “Del arte o de la monstruosidad” (1940), the distinguished historian and philosopher Edmundo O’Gorman maintained that the study of Pre-Columbian art should be based on different categories from those used to evaluate European art. In Crisis y porvenir de la ciencia histórica (1947), he criticized positivist historiography from the point of view of historicism and existentialism, and set the theoretical foundations for his subsequent notion of “the invention of America”. Likewise, while Alfonso Reyes (1889–1959) and Octavio Paz (1914–1998) were not professional philosophers, they authored texts that should not be excluded from a history of Mexican philosophy. In El deslinde (1944), Reyes offered a theory of literature using tools of phenomenology and in El arco y la lira (1956), Paz wrote a literary theory that used elements from existentialism and structuralism.
Concerning the professionalization of philosophy in Mexico, Eduardo García Máynez stands out both for his philosophical and for his administrative contributions. In 1940–41, García Máynez founded and was the first director of the Centro de Estudios Filosóficas, which was eventually renamed the Instituto de Investigaciones Filosóficas, and he founded the influential journal Filosfía y Letras, which continued to be published until 1958. His book Los principios de la ontología formal del derecho y su expresión simbólica (1953) marked the beginning of the logical turn in Mexican philosophy, anticipating the linguistic turn of analytic philosophy in Mexico a decade later. Some of his other works include: La definición del derecho. Ensayo de perspectivismo jurídico (1948) and Filosofía del derecho (1974). García Máynez claimed that the validity of the law depends on the existence of objective values, but he added that, in spite of their objectivity, values are subject to several forms of relativism in relation to culture, concrete practice, and geography. Like Ramos, García Máynez believed Mexico needed an objectivist axiology to progress socially. He also claimed that legal freedom was a “second order” right, that is, a normative right to exercise certain independent faculties through choice. The development of this thesis forced him to sustain that any system of normativity that is axiomatic and formal contains a priori principles. His “theory of the three circles” maintains that the definitions of law as formally valid, as intrinsically valid, and as a positive right are not theoretically compatible, though they are compatible in practice.
8.3. The Spanish Exiles
The Spanish Civil War (1936–1939) forced some of the most prominent Spanish philosophers to move to Mexico. Joaquín Xirau (1895–1946), José Gallegos Rocafull (1895–1963), Wenceslao Roces (1897–1992), José Gaos (1900–1969), Luis Recasens Siches (1903–1977), Eugenio Ímaz (1900–1951) and Eduardo Nicol (1907–1990), would live, spend their careers, and die in Mexico. Juan David García Bacca (1901–1992) and María Zambrano (1907–1991) spent part of their exile in Mexico. Adolfo Sánchez Vázquez (1915–2011), Ramón Xirau (1924–2017), and Carmen Rovira (b. 1923) arrived in Mexico at a young age, and completed their studies in their newly adopted country. All of them left a valuable imprint on Mexican philosophy through their creativity, teaching, and translations.
Joaquín Xirau wrote several books on metaphysics, the history of philosophy, and the philosophy of education. After arriving in Mexico, he wrote Amor y mundo (1940), a reflection on love understood as Eros and caritas. His ontology is dialectical, and he claims that being and value, as well as subject and object, are merely abstract ideas if they are considered static realities outside change. His premature death at the age of 50 prevented him from being more influential than he should have been.
José Gaos wrote the majority of his published material in Mexico, and he is remembered, above all, for his extraordinary influence as a professor and mentor. For his own part, Gaos defended a radical version of perspectivism: for Gaos, philosophy is a personal confession, so no philosophy is better or worse than another since each is, in the end, the expression of an individual. His most important works are: Del hombre (1970) and De la filosofía (1962). His research in the history of ideas in Mexico and Latin America were also extremely influential. His ideas on how to teach philosophy were included in the curricula of several departments of philosophy throughout the country. Among his students were some of the most important philosophers of the second half of the 20th century.
Luis Recasens Siches, a philosopher of law, wrote many books in which the influence of José Ortega y Gasset was apparent. Among them is Vida humana, sociedad y derecho (1940).
Eduardo Nicol founded the Metaphysics Seminar at the Department of Philosophy of the National Autonomous University of Mexico, where he taught with rigor and brilliance, and in 1955 he founded the influential journal Dianoia, still published today. For Nicol, philosophy ought to recover its place as the primary science. His metaphysics, dialectical in essence, wanted to reconcile being and representation, and truth and history. All of his works were written in Mexico, including: La idea del hombre (1946), Metafísica de la expresión (1957), and Los principios de la ciencia (1965).
8.4. The Hyperion Group
In 1934, Samuel Ramos published one of the most important books on Mexican culture, Perfil del hombre y la cultura en México, an analysis of history, culture, and the Mexican character, which he believed suffered from an inferiority complex. According to Ramos, Mexicans had set goals that were impossible to accomplish, particularly because they had tried to imitate more developed nations, and this had instilled in them a feeling of inferiority that explains their individual and collective behavior, as well as many of the problems of Mexican society and politics. Ramos’s book was very controversial and prompted similar studies of Mexican being, such as Octavio Paz’s El laberinto de la soledad (1950).
The Hyperion Group was a group of young philosophers from the National Autonomous University of Mexico that included Leopoldo Zea (1912–2006), Jorge Portilla (1918–1963), Ricardo Guerra (1928–2007), Emilio Uranga (1921–1988), and Luis Villoro (1922–2014). It was active between 1948 and 1952, and its purpose was to employ the categories of existentialism to analyze Mexico and Mexican being, an analysis that was meant to reveal the reality of Mexico and Mexican being and encourage Mexicans to transform their reality.
Jorge Portilla’s posthumously published Fenomenología del relajo (1966) is a phenomenological study of the complexity of Mexican morality and behavior.
Arguably the most important work of the Hyperion group was Análisis del ser del mexicano (1952) by Emilio Uranga. This book proposes an ontology of mexicanidad and a philosophy of Mexican culture. According to Uranga, the negative traits that characterize the Mexican, such as resentment, melancholy, and zozobra, are expressions of a constitutive mode of Mexican existence that he calls “accidentality”. (Here Uranga is employing the Scholastic distinction between accident and substance.) Uranga argues further that although Mexicans had been made to feel inferior throughout their history—specifically, although Europeans had argued that Mexicans were less than fully human—Mexicans were in fact closer to the essence of being human, defined as accidentality. As a result, it was the European who had a lesson to learn from the Mexican, not the other way around. If the Conquest of Mexico tried to assimilate Mexican culture to European culture, what Uranga did was try to assimilate the whole of what it means to be human to the Mexican experience of humanity, that is, to make humanity recognize and value its repressed accidentality. By identifying mexicanidad with accidentality, Uranga transforms Mexican being into an ontological category.
The filosofía de lo mexicano (the philosophy of Mexicanness) was a creative and original movement that impacted other areas of culture. However, after the 1960s the desire to treat Mexico as the object of philosophical inquiry declined, and it is only in the last few years that a small group of Mexican and Mexican-American philosophers have, in collaboration, attempted to rescue elements of that movement to think about Mexico from a philosophical point of view and to think about philosophy from a Mexican point of view.
8.5. Leopoldo Zea
Leopoldo Zea was the most influential Mexican philosopher in the second half of the 20th century, particularly in Latin America and the former Soviet Bloc. Some of his books are: El positivismo en México (1943), América en la historia (1957), La filosofía americana como filosofía sin más (1969), and Discurso desde la marginación y la barbarie (1988).
In his essay “En torno a una filosofía americana” (1945), Zea sustained that Latin American philosophy should devote itself to topics that are specifically Latin American, in addition to the universal problems of any other philosophy. In “La filosofía como compromiso” (1948), he claims that Latin American philosophy should aim to transform the reality of the philosopher, not just understand it. From that point forward, Zea’s work adopts a clearly defined ideological and political purpose of emancipating Latin America and the “Third World”.
In a word, Zea considers philosophy an instrument of liberation. He strongly objected to a Eurocentric account of human nature, history, and reason—a critique that would evolve more fully decades later with postmodernism and post-colonialism. During most of the second half of the 20th century, Zea promoted “Latin American philosophy”, understood as an academic discipline that combines the interdisciplinary study of society, thought, and history in this region of the world.
Other Mexican philosophers who have contributed to the development of Latin American philosophy are Joaquín Sánchez McGregor (1925–2008), Abelardo Villegas (1934–2001), Mario Magallón Anaya (b. 1946) and Horacio Cerutti (b. 1950).
8.6. Luis Villoro
Luis Villoro was a diligent student of the most important philosophical currents of the second half of the 20th century: existentialism, phenomenology, Marxism, analytic philosophy, and multiculturalism. However, in his reflections one can observe a common thread of lasting questions concerning the metaphysical understanding of alterity, the limits and boundaries of reason, the relationship between knowledge and power, community, an ethical reflection of injustice, a defense of and respect for cultural diversity, and a critical examination of the role of philosophy. Some of his books are: Los grandes momentos del indigenismo en México (1950), Creer, saber, conocer (1982), El concepto de ideología (1985), and El poder y el valor (1997).
In Creer, saber, conocer, a book that belongs to the analytical tradition, Villoro develops an epistemology that eliminates truth from the definition of knowledge in order to make sense of the historical and political dimensions of epistemology in practice. For Villoro, “to know p” is “to believe p with sufficiently objective reasons”. And one’s reasons for believing that p are sufficiently objective if they are conclusive, complete, and coherent, regardless of who sustains p. However, one’s reasons can be sufficiently objective in one epistemic community but not another. This leads to an epistemic relativism accepted by Villoro as the only way to respond to the challenge of skepticism (see related entry on epistemology in Latin America). In “Filosofía y dominación” (1978), he sustained that philosophy must always critique inherited and imposed beliefs by exercising the independent use of reason, that is, without becoming ideological.
In El poder y el valor, Villoro reflects on the nature of political power and moral values. After a comprehensive and insightful analysis, Villoro sustains that we should give priority to the values that bind individuals to their community, without, of course, undermining either individual freedom or social order. Ultimately, Villoro defends a form of radical democracy according to which political power is concentrated in the hands of ordinary people immersed in concrete social networks. Villoro believed that indigenous communities of Mexico are a living model of the variety of social and political egalitarianism he endorsed, and any intellectual biography of Villoro would be incomplete without mentioning that Villoro was a secret member of The Zapatista Army of National Liberation, and had a philosophically rich correspondence with Subcomandante Marcos.
8.7. The Years of Expansion (1960–2000)
In the 20th century, several Mexican philosophers developed forms of humanism and metaphysics from perspectives as dissimilar as Hellenism, Thomism, and existentialism.
Antonio Gómez Robledo (1908–1994) was a distinguished humanist and jurist who studied and defended the value of Greco-Latin and Christian cultures elegantly and non-dogmatically. Among his works are: Ensayo sobre las virtudes intelectuales (1957), Meditación sobre la justicia (1963), and Sócrates y el socratismo (1966). He also translated Plato’s Republic, Aristotle’s Politics, Marcus Aurelius’ Meditations, and other classics. His studies of the principles of international law and the Spanish tradition of law should also be included in the history of Mexican philosophy.
Ramón Xirau wrote philosophy, literary criticism, and poetry, and combined them in enriching ways. Xirau wrote about the relationship between philosophy and poetry as two different forms of knowledge, and about the ontological nature of being human, understanding ser and estar as different categories. Among his best-known books are: Introducción a la historia de la filosofía (1964), Poesía y conocimiento (1979), and El tiempo vivido (1985).
Juliana González (b. 1936) was a student of Eduardo Nicol. She has taught and written about the main problems of philosophical and moral anthropology as well as about Nietzsche, Freud, and Heidegger. González’s ethics are grounded in a complex vision of the human being, which emphasizes our capacity to choose. González has also dealt with the ethical and metaphysical dimension of psychoanalysis and genomics. Some of her books include Ética y libertad (1989a), El malestar en la moral (1989b), and El poder del Eros (1999).
Carmen Rovira (b. 1923) was a student of Gaos. Over the course of her long academic career, she has labored to introduce and analyze the history of ideas in Mexico, particularly medieval philosophy in Mexico. In addition to all her edited collections, Rovira authored Eclécticos portugueses del siglo XVIII y algunas de sus influencias en América (1958) and Francisco de Vitoria. España y América. El poder y el hombre (2004).
Elsa Cecilia Frost (1928–2005) was also a student of Gaos, as was O’Gorman and Leon-Portilla. Her main interests lay with the history of colonial philosophy and the processes of acculturation that created modern Mexican culture. Her text Categorias de la cultura mexicana (1972) is a widely studied and well-regarded text in the philosophy of Mexican culture.
José Sánchez Villaseñor (1911–1961), Fernando Sodi Pallares (1917–1980), Héctor González Uribe (1918–1988), José Sanabria (1924–2002) and Miguel Mansur (1928–1993) all taught Neo-Thomism at the Universidad Iberoamericana. Carlos Llano (1932–2010), Virginia Aspe (b. 1952), Héctor Zagal (b. 1963) and Luis Xavier López Farjeat (b. 1973) all studied the Aristotelian tradition at the Universidad Panamericana. In Monterrey, Agustín Basave Fernández del Valle (1923–2006), developed what he called an integralismo metafísico antroposófico. Among his many books we can single out Tratado de metafísica. Teoría de la habencia (1982).
Socialist and Marxist thought was a popular ideology during the Mexican Revolution. In addition to the work of Lombardo Toledano who employed a Marxist framework to explain Mexico’s situation, José Revueltas (1914–1976) was an unorthodox Marxist who discussed philosophical themes in his literary and political writings. Despite the influence of Lombardo and Revueltas, however, academics didn’t take Marxism seriously until the 1970s. Two central figures of Marxism in the Mexican academy during that period were Eli de Gortari (1918–1991) and Adolfo Sánchez Vázquez.
De Gortari was one of the first academic philosophers of science in Mexico. He studied the foundation of dialectical logic and the applications of logic to science, and worked on the philosophy of mathematics and physics, the mechanization of propositional calculus, and the history of science in Mexico. In 1955 he founded the Seminar of Scientific and Philosophical Problems. Among his books are La ciencia de la lógica (1950) and Dialéctica de la Física (1964).
Adolfo Sánchez Vázquez was very young when he arrived in Mexico and he began his philosophical studies in Mexico. He produced a solid body of work dealing with the concepts of Marxist ethics and aesthetics. One contribution to Marxist philosophy was his critical reflection on the concept of praxis, and he was critical of the aesthetic doctrine of Socialist realism. Among his main books we can mention: Las ideas estéticas de Marx (1965), Una filosofía de la praxis (1967), and Ética (1969). Many Mexican Marxist philosophers of subsequent generations studied under him, and there was an important debate between Sánchez Vazquez and Villoro concerning the concept of ideology.
The Cuban Revolution had a profound impact among many Latin American intellectuals. After the 1960s, the number of Marxists increased exponentially, both at and outside the university, and Marxism became the dominant school of thought in some Mexican universities. The books of Gramsci, Marcuse, and Althusser were read by many young students, as were the writings of José Martí, José Carlos Mariáteguí and Paolo Freire. The main Mexican Marxist philosophers of that period were: Porfirio Miranda (1924–2001), author of Marx y la Biblia (1971); Enrique González Rojo (b. 1928); Cesáreo Morales (b. 1936); Jaime Labastida (b. 1940), author of Producción, ciencia y sociedad: de Descartes a Marx (1969); Gabriel Vargas Lozano (b. 1947), author of Más allá del derrumbre (1994); and Aureliano Ortega (b. 1952). Carlos Pereyra (1940–1988) was a philosopher of history and a well-known left-wing intellectual. His philosophical papers were collected in Filosofía, historia y política (2010). Bolívar Echeverría (1941–2010) wrote La modernidad de lo barroco (1998), in which he offers a critique of capitalist modernity from a Latin American perspective.
Mentioned above, Rafael Sebastián Guillén Vicente (b. 1957), also known as “Subcomandante Marcos” of the EZLN, has been a very influential post-Marxist thinker who has put his ideas into action. His correspondence with Luis Villoro is included in La alternativa. Perspectiva y posibilidades de cambio (Villoro 2015).
After the fall of the Berlin Wall there was an abrupt decline in Marxist philosophy. As intellectuals debated how best to reform the Mexican state, they began to read other foreign political philosophers, such as Weber, Arendt, Rawls, Bobbio and Habermas. Some of the philosophers who have focused on the nature of democracy, justice, and poverty include: Luis Aguilar Villanueva (b. 1938); Paulette Dieterlen (b. 1947), author of La pobreza: un estudio filosófico (2003); Luis Salazar (b. 1949); León Olivé (1950–2017); Griselda Gutiérrez (1951); María Pía Lara (b. 1954), author of Moral textures (1998); Ambrosio Velasco (b. 1954); Rodolfo Vázquez (b. 1956), author of Entre la libertad y la igualdad (2006); Mario Teodoro Ramírez (b. 1958), author of De la razón a la praxis (2003); and Enrique Serrano (b. 1958).
Mexican political philosophy played an important role in two public debates of that period. One concerned the extent to which leftist political groups were willing accept electoral democracy as opposed to armed revolution, like that of Cuba. Another concerned whether Mexico was better described as a homogenous mestizo nation or a racially and culturally diverse country.
The philosophy of liberation was a movement that originated in South America in the early 1970s. In the beginning, it mixed elements of liberation theology, dependency theory, and Latin American philosophy. Enrique Dussel (b. 1934 in Argentina) is the main representative of the philosophy of liberation in Mexico. Among his numerous works, which have been translated widely into other languages, are Filosofía de la liberación (1977 ) and Ética de la liberación en la edad de la globalización y la exclusión (1998 ). Dussel has offered a comprehensive critique of Western history and philosophy from the point of view of the poor and the excluded, particularly in Latin America. The Dusselian branch of the filosofía de la liberación is a vigorous movement with students all over the world. (See the related entry on the philosophy of liberation)
Beginning in the early 1960s, philosophers began to study analytic philosophy, particularly authors such as Russell, Carnap, Wittgenstein, Strawson, and Quine. At the time, it was claimed that a philosophy inspired by science was required to modernize Mexico, not unlike the positivist turn in the second half of the 19th century. The creation of the journal Crítica in 1967 accelerated the popularity of analytic philosophy in Mexico. At the end of the 1960s, the Institute for Philosophical Research of the National Autonomous University of Mexico became the main center of analytic philosophy in the country and in Latin America. The main promoters of analytic philosophy during that period were Alejandro Rossi (1932–2009), author of Lenguaje y significado (1969), and Fernando Salmerón (1925–1997), who also wrote extensively on the history of Mexican philosophy.
By the end of the 1970s, a group of analytic philosophers had distinguished themselves: Enrique Villanueva (b. 1938), José Antonio Robles (1938–2014), Margarita Valdés (b. 1941), Hugo Margáin (1942–1978), and Olbeth Hansberg (b. 1943), author of La diversidad de las emociones (b. 1996). In the 1980s, more analytic philosophers joined the Institute of Philosophical research, among them: Raúl Orayen (1942–2003), who wrote Lógica, significado y ontología (1989); Ulises Moulines (b. 1946), a structuralist philosopher of science; Mark Platts (b. 1947), author of Ways of Meaning (1979); León Olivé (1950–2017), who wrote several books of philosophy of science and culture; and Adolfo García de la Sienra (b. 1951), a theologian and philosopher of economics.
Mexican analytic philosophy has followed the dominant trends of analytic philosophy since the 1960s. In the beginning, it had strong ties to Oxford, but today it has developed working relationships with other philosophical departments around the world. Some Mexican analytic philosophers have studied abroad and have remained outside Mexico, such as Agustín Rayo (b. 1973). Others work in Mexico but publish most of their work in English, such as Mario Gómez Torrente (b. 1967). Others write in both English and Spanish, such as Mayté Ezcurdia (1966–2018). Still others write mainly in Spanish, like Alejandro Tomasini Bassols (b. 1952), who has written a large number of books that develop an original interpretation of Wittgenstein’s philosophy.
Carlos Pereda (b. 1944) has also written several important books, including Vértigos argumentales (1994), Crítica de la razón arrogante (1999), and Sobre la confianza (2009). He develops Aristotle’s notion of phronesis and Kant’s view that practical reason is universal to recommend strategies to help navigate the temptations and ambiguities of life. Pereda offers a peculiar diagnosis of the entanglements and pathologies of reason, including what he calls argumentative vertigo, that is, a kind of intellectual or moral dizziness that blinds us to other points of view or that makes us stubborn and insensitive to the feelings of others.
The main exponent of philosophical hermeneutics, Mauricio Beuchot (b. 1950), distinguished himself early as a historian and a translator of the philosophy of New Spain and medieval philosophy (e.g., La filosofía del lenguaje en la Edad Media, 1981), as well as for his synthesis of Thomism and analytic philosophy (e.g., Lógica y ontología, 1986). In the 1990s, however, he turned to hermeneutics. In his Tratado de hermenéutica analógica (1997), he developed a system that he called “analogical hermeneutics”. His thesis is that, to avoid the excesses of positivist “univocalism” or postmodern “equivocalism”, one must adopt analogy as the primary method of interpretation. Beuchot’s analogical hermeneutics has inspired a philosophical movement with hundreds of students around the world.
Although Mexican women have had full legal access to higher education since the beginning of the 20th century, they were discouraged from pursuing advanced degrees or careers as professors of philosophy. With a few notable exceptions, it wasn’t until after 1960—not incidentally, the year birth control was made widely available—that women began to publish their own philosophy more regularly. In addition to several of the women mentioned above (e.g., Krauze, Frost, Rovira), Vera Yamuni Tabush (1917–2003), another student of Gaos, wrote about philosophy in the Spanish language, Arabic philosophy, and feminism. See, for example, her highly-regarded Conceptos e imágenes en pensadores de lengua española (1951).
As women started to pursue advanced degrees in philosophy, they began to philosophize about the role of women in Mexican culture and the challenges facing aspiring female intellectuals and artists. The long list of Mexican feminists, which stretches back as far as Sor Juana, includes Paula Gómez Alonso (1896–1972), the first graduate of philosophy of the University of México, whose master’s thesis was titled La cultura femenina (1933); Rosario Castellanos (1925–1974), a famous author, who wrote a philosophical essay called Sobre cultura femenina (1950); and Graciela Hierro (1928–2003), the main proponent of feminist philosophy and founder of the Centro de Estudios de Género of the National Autonomous University of Mexico. Two of her books are Ética y feminismo (1985), and De la domesticación a la educación de las mexicanas (1989).
As in other Latin American countries, the history of philosophy is a popular area of research, largely because most philosophy departments tend to teach the discipline from a historical rather than thematic or analytic perspective. The most popular periods of philosophy are ancient philosophy, modern philosophy, phenomenology, and German existentialism. Among the historians of philosophy today, we can mention: Laura Benitez (b. 1944), Alberto Constante (b. 1949), Antonio Zirión (b. 1950), Enrique Hülsz (1954–2019), Gustavo Leyva (b. 1959), Pedro Stepanenko (b. 1960), Efraín Lazos (b. 1962), Ernesto Priani (b. 1962), Ricardo Salles (b. 1965), Faviola Rivera (b. 1967), and Ángel Xolocotzi (b. 1969).
9. The 21st Century
Not unlike other areas of Mexican culture, the production of philosophy has been concentrated in Mexico City. However, today dozens of philosophy departments throughout the Mexican Republic are growing in size and influence. Many universities now offer graduate degrees and some publish their own journals and books, such as the state universities of Guanajuato, Michoacán, Puebla, Veracruz, and Zacatecas.
There are several philosophical associations in Mexico, though the Asociación filosófica de México is the largest. Since 1975, the AFM (which serves a role similar to the American Philosophical Association (in the United States) hosts a large biannual conference that plays an essential role in forming a national philosophical community (see Other Internet Resources below).
Philosophy also continues to play an important role in Mexican secondary education. Although philosophy has been taught in public high schools since the 19th century, in 2009 the Mexican government tried to eliminate philosophical instruction from public education (not unlike the second half of the 19th century under the guidance of Barreda’s positivist curriculum, and Cardenas’s attempt to make education in Mexico socialist in 1933). However, in response, a group of academics founded the Observatorio Filosófico de México, which eventually thwarted government interference (see Other Internet Resources). The Observatorio’s defense of philosophy in Mexico was so successful that in 2019, the government made a constitutional amendment recognizing philosophical instruction as the right of all Mexicans.
This official commitment to the value of philosophy is not without precedent; it represents a long history of questioning and reaffirming the role of philosophy in Mexican life. Other events in this history (discussed above) include the war for Mexican independence, guided by Enlightenment philosophy; Gabino Barreda’s effort to define Mexican national identity through positivist education; the Ateneo’s critique of positivism during the Mexican Revolution; amendments to the 1933 Constitution, which sought to make public education socialist; and the philosophy of lo mexicano, a philosophical expression and critique of 20th century Mexican nationalism.
One challenge to studying Mexican philosophy outside Mexico, particularly in the United States, has been the lack of resources in English. However, over the past several years, a group of scholars have begun to produce translations of and commentaries on canonical texts. One notable example is Mexican Philosophy in the 20th Century: Essential Readings, edited by Carlos Alberto Sánchez and Robert Eli Sanchez, Jr. (For future projects related to making Mexican philosophy more widely available in English, and related to building a binational community dedicate to the development of Mexican philosophy, see 20th Century Mexican Philosophy in Other Internet Resources.) The APA’s Newsletter on Hispanic and Latino Issues in Philosophy is another valuable source of information and research (see Other Internet Resources).
Today, Mexican philosophy is a professional, pluralistic, and growing field of study. Thanks in large part to the collaboration among philosophers in Mexico and United States, the resources required to advance research are now easily accessible in both Spanish and English. And with the ongoing emergence of new translations, commentaries, and histories, as well as regular binational meetings, it is now reasonable to expect that the philosophy produced in Mexico and about the Mexican (or Mexican-American) experience will continue to attract new scholars and will soon be recognized for its impressive contribution to world philosophy.
Primary and Secondary Sources in Spanish
- Adorno, Juan Nepomuceno, 1862, La armonía del universo. Ensayo filosófico en busca de la verdad, la unidad y la felicidad, México: Tipografía de Juan Abadiano.
- Barreda, Gabino, 1863 , “De la educación moral”, El Siglo XIX, 839(3 May 1863). Reprinted in Barreda 1941: 113–125.
- –––, 1867 , “Oración cívica”, speech at Guanajuato, 16 September 1867. Printed in Barreda 1941: 69–100.
- –––, 1992, Estudios, José Fuentes Mares (ed.), México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México.
- Bartra, Roger, 2002, Blood, Ink, and Culture: Miseries and Splendors of the Post-Mexican Condition, Mark A. Healey (trans.), Durham: NC: Duke University Press.
- Beuchot, Mauricio, 1981, La filosofía del lenguaje en la edad media, México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México.
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We would like to thank Kim Díaz, Gregory Pappas, Fanny del Río, Carlos Alberto Sánchez, Aurelia Valero Pie, and Manuel Vargas for their valuable comments on previous versions of this paper.