Russellian Monism

First published Wed Jul 3, 2019; substantive revision Tue Jul 4, 2023

Russellian monism is a theory in the metaphysics of mind, on which a single set of properties underlies both consciousness and the most basic entities posited by physics. The theory is named for Bertrand Russell, whose views about consciousness and its place in nature were informed by a structuralist conception of theoretical physics. On such a structuralist conception, physics describes the world in terms of its spatiotemporal structure and dynamics (changes within that structure) and says nothing about what, if anything, underlies that structure and dynamics. For example, as it is sometimes put, physics describes what mass and charge do, e.g., how they dispose objects to move toward or away from each other, but not what mass and charge are. Thus, Russell writes the following about the events physics describes:

All that physics gives us is certain equations giving abstract properties of their changes. But as to what it is that changes, and what it changes from and to—as to this, physics is silent. (Russell 1959: 18)

Russellian monism can be seen as breaking that silence. It posits properties that underlie the structure and dynamics that physics describes. Further, according to Russellian monism, those same properties are relevant to, and may at least partly constitute, consciousness.

1. The Content of Russellian Monism

1.1 Three Core Russellian Monist Theses

Russellian monism can be seen as combining three core theses: structuralism about physics, which states roughly that physics, at least current physics (see section 4.1), describes the world only in terms of its spatiotemporal structure and dynamics; realism about quiddities, which states that there are quiddities, that is, properties that underlie the structure and dynamics physics describes; and quidditism about consciousness, which states that quiddities are relevant to consciousness. We will discuss these theses in turn.

To understand the first core thesis, structuralism about physics, consider David J. Chalmers’s description of how physical theory characterizes its basic entities:

…physical theory only characterizes its basic entities relationally, in terms of their causal and other relations to other entities. Basic particles, for instance, are largely characterized in terms of their propensity to interact with other particles. Their mass and charge is specified, to be sure, but all that a specification of mass ultimately comes to is a propensity to be accelerated by certain forces, and so on. Each entity is characterized by its relation to other entities, and so on forever. …The picture of the physical world that this yields is that of a giant causal flux, but the picture tells us nothing about what all this causation relates. Reference to the proton is fixed as the thing that causes interactions of a certain kind, that combines in certain ways with other entities, and so on; but what is the thing that is doing the causing and combining? As Russell (1927a) notes, this is a matter about which physical theory is silent. (Chalmers 1996: 153)

Chalmers’s description expresses structuralism about physics vividly. But his claim that physical theory characterizes its basic entities only relationally could be challenged. Shape is usually counted among an object’s non-relational properties (Stoljar 2015). For example, contrast a ball’s sphericality, a non-relational property, with its tendency to roll when pushed, a relational property. So, if physical theory characterizes its basic entities partly in terms of their shapes, then Chalmers’s claim might seem doubtful.

Such considerations need not be taken to indicate that structuralism about physics is false. But they do seem to indicate that the relevant distinction between structural and non-structural properties—the one relevant to structuralism about physics—does not align with, and thus should not be explicated in terms of, the relational/non-relational distinction. (Henceforth we omit mention of dynamics because the relevant issues concern structure.)

Structuralism about physics is sometimes formulated in terms of the distinction between extrinsic and intrinsic properties (Chalmers 1996: 153–155; see the entry intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties). But those formulations have been challenged on similar grounds: a ball’s sphericality is usually counted among its intrinsic properties, as are other properties in terms of which physical theory characterizes its basic entities (Ney 2015; Stoljar 2015). (We will henceforth use ‘extrinsic’ and ‘relational’ interchangeably, and likewise for ‘intrinsic’ and ‘non-relational’.) It might therefore be preferable to explicate the structural/non-structural distinction in a different way.

One approach is to do so by distinguishing between relatively and absolutely intrinsic properties (Pereboom 2011: 92–97, 2014, 2015, 2016; for an alternative explication, see Chalmers 2010: 20, fn. 17; 2013: 256; cf. Alter 2016: 804–09). Roughly, relatively intrinsic properties are intrinsic properties that are nothing over and above extrinsic properties, whereas absolutely intrinsic properties are intrinsic properties that are not relatively intrinsic. (The relative/absolute intrinsicness distinction derives from Leibniz and Kant; see Leibniz to De Volder April 1702 [Leibniz G II, 240; 1969: 526–527]; Kant 1781/1787: A277/B333; Pereboom 1985: 413–23; 1991b; Van Cleve 1988; Langton 1998.)

We can articulate that distinction more precisely in terms of metaphysical grounding (or, on some conceptions, constitution; see the entries metaphysical grounding and material constitution) where A grounds (or constitutes) B just in case A metaphysically necessitates B and B exists in virtue of A, as follows (Pereboom 2016):

P is a relatively intrinsic property of X just in case P is an intrinsic property of X and P is grounded in extrinsic properties of either X or parts of X.

By contrast,

P is an absolutely intrinsic property of X just in case P is an intrinsic property of X and P is not grounded in extrinsic properties of either X or parts of X.

Thus, for example, it seems plausible that a ball’s sphericality is grounded in spatiotemporal relations among its parts (as Leibniz argued; Leibniz to De Volder April 1702 [G II, 240; 1969: 526–527]; see section 2.1 below) and is therefore merely relatively intrinsic. A similar point applies to other intrinsic properties described in physics. For example, although mass would seem to be an intrinsic property of material entities, in the passage quoted above Chalmers remarks that in physical theory, “all that a specification of mass ultimately comes to is a propensity to be accelerated by certain forces, and so on” (Chalmers 1996: 153). Accordingly, the only aspects of mass that physical theory describes are relatively, not absolutely, intrinsic.

Suppose structuralism about physics is explicated such that structural properties are construed as extrinsic properties or relatively intrinsic properties. In that case, the thesis is consistent with the claim that physical theory characterizes its basic entities partly in terms of its intrinsic properties, as long as those intrinsic properties are relatively and not absolutely intrinsic. (For further discussion of structuralism about physics, see section 4.1 below; and the entries structuralism in physics and structural realism.)

The second core Russellian monist thesis, realism about quiddities, states that there are (instantiated) properties of precisely the sort about which, according to structuralism about physics, physical theory is silent: properties that underlie the spatiotemporal structure physical theory describes. Those properties categorically ground the most basic physical dispositions that physics describes, in the way a ball’s spherical shape categorically grounds its disposition to roll when pushed. These underlying properties are often called quiddities (Lewis 2009; Chalmers 2012). They are also called inscrutables (Montero 2010). The latter designation is meant to indicate something on which many proponents of realism about quiddities agree: we know little about quiddities beyond the theoretical roles they are supposed to play.

One might reject realism about quiddities even if one accepts structuralism about physics. As Chalmers (2013: 254) writes, “There are respectable structuralist or dispostionalist views of physics on which physics involves just structure or dispositions all the way down” (e.g., Ladyman and Ross, with Spurrett and Collier 2007; Ney 2015; cf. Shoemaker 1980; Hawthorne 2001; McKitrick 2003). But Russellian monists and others (e.g., Lewis 2009) regard such structuralist or dispositionalist views as implausible. That is because such views “seem to yield a world devoid of substance or qualities” (Chalmers 2013 [2015: 254]). A world devoid of substance or qualities might or might not be possible. But according to realism about quiddities, the actual world is not like that.

The third core Russellian monist thesis, quidditism about consciousness, states that quiddities are relevant to consciousness. More specifically, it states that quiddities are relevant to phenomenal consciousness. For example, consider the feeling one has when suffering from a painful migraine or when seeing a brilliantly red sunset. As it is often put, there is something it is like to have a phenomenally conscious experience (Nagel 1974; see the entry consciousness; throughout, all references to consciousness refer to phenomenal consciousness). There is no consensus among Russellian monists on exactly how quiddities are relevant to consciousness (section 4). But many claim that phenomenal properties are constituted by quiddities, or by quiddities together with various structural properties.

One might reject quidditism about consciousness even if one accepts structuralism about physics and realism about quiddities. For example, one might combine the latter two theses with a dualist theory on which quiddities categorically ground the most basic physical dispositions physics describes but are not relevant to consciousness (perhaps on this theory consciousness is fundamental and not constituted by anything). By contrast, according to quidditism about consciousness, quiddities play both of those roles.

One could identify Russellian monism with the conjunction of all three core theses, where each thesis could be explicated in different ways, resulting in different varieties of the theory. For present purposes, that characterization will suffice (see below, sections 1.2 and 4; for an alternative characterization, see Pereboom 2011: 89; cf. Alter and Nagasawa 2012: 71–72.)

1.2 Varieties of Russellian Monism

While all Russellian monists maintain that quiddities are relevant to consciousness (section 1.1), some construe quiddities themselves as phenomenal properties (Maxwell 1978; Lockwood 1989, 1992; Rosenberg 2004; Strawson 2003, 2006a,b; Mørch 2014; Goff 2015, 2017; cf. Unger 2005). The result is a variety of Russellian monism known as Russellian panpsychism (Chalmers 2013 [2015: 246–247]). Russellian panpsychism is so called due to the assumption that phenomenality is ubiquitous: it occurs everywhere the most basic physical dispositions do. But as a terminological matter, one might allow that a Russellian monist theory counts as Russellian panpsychism if it specifies either that at least some of the most basic physical dispositions are underlain by phenomenal quiddities (Chalmers 2013 [2015: 246]) or that all such dispositions are so underlain (Strawson 2006a,b).)

Panpsychism has a long philosophical history (see the entry panpsychism; Skrbina 2005), but some find the doctrine incredible (Searle 1997; but see Chalmers 1997b; Alter and Nagasawa 2012: 90). Here it should be noted that Russellian panpsychists typically do not construe quiddities as macrophenomenal properties, that is, as familiar phenomenal properties such as those commonly associated with feeling pain and seeing red. More often, Russellian panpsychists construe quiddities as microphenomenal properties, that is, as phenomenal properties of microphysical entities. Microphenomenal properties might differ radically from the macrophenomenal sort (Chalmers 1996: 293–297; Strawson 2003, 2006a; Rosenberg 2004: 95). Some Russellian panpsychists construe quiddities as cosmophenomenal properties, that is, phenomenal properties of the whole cosmos, which might likewise differ radically from macrophenomenal properties (Goff 2017). So, the sorts of phenomenal properties that, according to Russellian panpsychism, underlie the most basic physical dispositions need not be much like any with which we are familiar. This might make panpsychism more palatable to some philosophers—though, some argue, if such properties differ enough from familiar macrophenomenal properties, one might doubt that they deserve to be called phenomenal at all (Kind 2006).

Another option for Russellian monists is to construe quiddities as what Chalmers calls protophenomenal properties, which he characterizes as follows:

protophenomenal properties are special properties that are not phenomenal (there is nothing it is like to have a single protophenomenal property) but that can collectively constitute phenomenal properties, perhaps when arranged in the right structure. (Chalmers 2013 [2015: 259])

The result is a variety of Russellian monism known as Russellian panprotopsychism. Russellian panprotopsychism does not entail panpsychism. Perhaps only entities in a limited class (e.g., some states of some animals) have protophenomenal properties that are arranged in a consciousness-constituting structure. In that case, on Russellian panprotopsychism consciousness would occur only in those entities and not elsewhere. There are also hybrid varieties of Russellian monism, on which some quiddities are phenomenal and others are protophenomenal (Holman 2008).

Russellian monism is a distinctive theory in the metaphysics of mind. Nevertheless, it is possible to identify varieties that correspond to more traditional theories, including physicalism, idealism, neutral monism, and (despite the name) even dualism (see the entries physicalism; idealism; neutral monism; and dualism). On physicalist Russellian monism, both quiddities and structural properties are physical (Stoljar 2001; Pereboom 2011, 2014, 2015, 2019; Coleman 2012, 2015; Montero 2015; Morris 2016; Brown 2017). On idealist Russellian monism, both quiddities and structural properties are mental (Bolender, 2001; Adams 2007; Schneider 2018; cf. Chalmers 1996: 155). On neutral monist Russellian monism, both quiddities and structural properties are neutral, where neutral properties are neither physical nor mental but underlie both physical and mental properties (Nagel 1986, 1998; cf. Stoljar 2015; Wishon 2016; also see the discussion of panqualityism in the entry panpsychism). Finally, Russellian monism could be combined with the traditional (e.g., Cartesian) dualist view that the concrete world includes two fundamentally distinct sorts of entities, the physical sort and the mental sort. This can be done by, for example, identifying structural properties with physical properties and quiddities with certain mental properties (cf. Chalmers 2010: 135).

Physicalist and neutral monist varieties of Russellian monism are most naturally understood as forms of Russellian panprotopsychism (Alter and Coleman 2020b; but see Morris 2016, Brown 2017), whereas idealist and dualist varieties are most naturally understood as forms of Russellian panpsychism (Chalmers 2013, Schneider 2018). Much of the recent literature on Russellian monism focuses on the physicalist variety, often called Russellian physicalism (Montero 2015). Russellian physicalism is usually presented as an alternative to, rather than a version of, traditional physicalism. But that might seem misleading. On many traditional physicalist theories, there are non-phenomenal properties that can collectively constitute phenomenal properties, perhaps when arranged in the right structure—microphysical properties, say. On those theories, such properties would qualify as protophenomenal properties by the characterization quoted above from Chalmers 2013 (Papineau 2002: 22–23, fn. 5).

Some traditional physicalist theories conflict with other aspects of Russellian monism. For example, (physicalist) analytic functionalism (Armstrong 1968; Lewis 1966, 1972, 1980) conflicts with the Russellian monist’s denial that structural truths alone a priori entail all phenomenal truths (see the entry functionalism; phenomenal truths are truths about consciousness). But other traditional physicalist theories are not similarly disqualified. For example, a posteriori physicalists also deny that structural truths alone a priori entail all phenomenal truths (see the entry physicalism). Nevertheless, in their view, there are non-phenomenal properties that can collectively constitute phenomenal properties, perhaps when arranged in the right structure. So, one might wonder why a posteriori physicalism does not qualify as Russellian physicalism.

Chalmers recognizes this problem. He therefore makes two further stipulations designed to help distinguish Russellian physicalism from traditional physicalist theories:

…(i) protophenomenal properties are distinct from structural properties and (ii) there is an a priori entailment from truths about protophenomenal properties (perhaps along with structural properties) to truths about the phenomenal properties that they constitute. (Chalmers 2013 [2015: 260])

Given those further stipulations, a posteriori physicalists would deny that there are protophenomenal properties. Similar considerations apply to other traditional physicalist theories. Russellian physicalism is different. (For other ways to distinguish among varieties of Russellian monism, see section 4; Alter and Nagasawa 2012; Chalmers 2013; Goff 2017.)

2. Russellian Monism in the History of Western Philosophy

2.1 Russellian Monism in the Seventeenth through Nineteenth Centuries

One could find views that resemble Russellian monism in certain respects throughout the history of philosophy. For example, panpsychism is very old indeed (and not distinctive to the west). But it is hard to find views approximating full-fledged Russellian monism before the early modern period. This is not a coincidence: the theory is closely tied to modern physics, which was first developed during that era. Yet it did not take long for the theory, or something akin to it, to emerge. Arguably, Russellian monism can be ascribed to various early modern figures, including at least Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, Immanuel Kant, and Arthur Schopenhauer.

Leibniz’s Russellian monist theory may be found in his critique of René Descartes’ theory of matter (Pereboom 2011: 92–97; cf. 1991a,b). In Descartes’ theory, material substance is essentially just extension in three spatial dimensions (Descartes Principia Philosophiæ, “Part Two: The Principles of Material Things” 1644 [1984: v. 1, 223–247; AT VIII 40–79]; see the entry Descartes’ physics). Leibniz contends that Descartes’ theory is unsatisfactory because, first, the extension of a physical object is (in the terminology introduced in section 1.1, which is Kantian (Kant 1781/1787: A277/B333)) a relatively intrinsic property of it, since it resolves into the plurality, spatial continuity, and temporal coexistence of its parts, and the extension of those parts resolves into those extrinsic properties of their parts, ad infinitum; and, second, any real thing, that is, any actual, concrete entity, cannot possess only extrinsic or relatively intrinsic properties: it must possess an absolutely intrinsic property as well. Leibniz writes: “there is no denomination so extrinsic that it does not have an intrinsic denomination at its basis” (Leibniz to De Volder April 1702 [Leibniz G II, 240; 1969: 526–527]). In his view, a conception of the physical world that does not include absolutely intrinsic properties is in an important sense incomplete. In effect, his complaint is that Descartes’ theory of matter describes only structure without describing a quiddistic ground for that structure, or even acknowledging the possibility of or the need for such a ground.

In Leibniz’s view, the absolutely intrinsic properties underlying real things are at least connected to primitive force (see the entry Leibniz’s philosophy of physics). Primitive force (which can appear to us phenomenally as physical force) generates a progression from one representation to the next in a series, in conformity with a law (Leibniz 1698 [1969: 504; 1989: 162–63]; Adams 1994: 352; Jorati 2018). On one interpretation, primitive forces are the fundamental elements, “the sole inhabitants of the ground floor” of Leibniz’s ontology (Jorati 2018); thus, the most basic substances, mind-like monads, “do not have forces, strictly speaking—they are forces” (Jorati 2018; cf. Adams 1994: 265, 378–379). On that reading, primitive forces are the absolutely intrinsic properties underlying real things. They might be called Leibnizian quiddities.

Leibniz might be the first Russellian monist. In his view, all the properties physics presents are either extrinsic or relatively intrinsic. This corresponds to structuralism about physics. He contends there are absolutely intrinsic properties, primitive forces on one reading, in which those extrinsic properties and relatively intrinsic properties are grounded. This corresponds to realism about quiddities. Those quiddities ground all of the other features of reality, including consciousness generally and macrophenomenal properties specifically. This corresponds to quidditism about consciousness. Thus, Leibniz seems to endorse versions of all three core Russellian monist theses. And because on his view all basic entities, including Leibnizian quiddities and the extrinsic and relatively intrinsic properties they ground, are mental, Leibnizian Russellian monism is a version of Russellian idealism.

Like Leibniz, Kant can be seen as a Russellian monist. Kant endorses a version of structuralism about physics: “All that we cognize in matter are nothing but relations. What we call the intrinsic determinations of it are intrinsic only in a relative sense…” (1781/1787: A285/B341; Pereboom 1985: 413–23, 1991a,b, 2011: 100–101; Van Cleve 1988; Langton 1998; cf. Holden 2004: 236–263). In material objects we discover only extrinsic properties and relatively intrinsic properties, never any properties that are absolutely intrinsic. Indeed, for Kant, matter itself does not have absolutely intrinsic properties. That is because he regards matter as “mere appearance”. Thus, he writes, “what it [matter] itself consists in is the mere relation of something in general to the senses” (1781/1787: A285/B341). If matter were instead a “thing-in-itself”, he implies, then it would need to have absolutely intrinsic properties. Nevertheless, in his view all features of appearance, including both matter and macrophenomenal consciousness, are grounded in things-in-themselves (or a thing-in-itself) and thus in absolutely intrinsic properties—a position that suggests both realism about quiddities and quidditism about consciousness.

Although Kant agrees with Leibniz that there must be absolutely intrinsic properties for the world to exist as we know it, he differs with Leibniz about forces. In Kant’s view, forces are relational and thus not absolutely intrinsic (1781/1787: A265/B321; 1786: 498–491). He does not say whether there are Leibnizian primitive forces. And he denies that we know much about the nature of the absolutely intrinsic properties that, he thinks, must exist. Such knowledge would be tantamount to substantive knowledge of things-in-themselves, and famously he contends that we lack such knowledge. He could therefore be described as endorsing an epistemological doctrine that many contemporary Russellian monists endorse (section 1.1): we know little about quiddities beyond the theoretical roles they are supposed to play.

Schopenhauer can be seen as another pre-twentieth century Russellian monist. In The World as Will and Representation, he affirms what might be described as versions of structuralism about physics and realism about quiddities. Natural causal explanation, he writes,

…really does nothing more than indicate the orderly arrangement according to which the states of matter appear in space and time… But it affords us absolutely no information about the intrinsic nature (das innere Wesen) of any one of these phenomena. (1818: Vol. 1, Bk. II, sect. 17, par. 5 [1961: 113])

And he implies that those phenomena do indeed have intrinsic natures, which suggests quidditism about consciousness.

So far, Schopenhauer’s view is similar to Kant’s. But Schopenhauer does something Kant would not do. He makes a further positive proposal about the nature of the absolutely intrinsic properties that underlie the orderly arrangement indicated by natural causal explanations. Specifically, in his view the will plays the key role: “indeed the answer to the riddle is given to the subject of knowledge who appears as an individual, and the answer is will” (1818: Vol. 1, Bk. II, sect. 18, par. 1 [1961: 115]). The absolutely intrinsic properties in which the orderly arrangement of the world of appearance is grounded are volitional—and hence the title of his famous book The World as Will and Representation (Schopenhauer 1818: Vol. 1, Bk. II, sect. 18, par. 1 [1961: 115]; see the entry Arthur Schopenhauer).

Some find Russellian monism in works by others in the modern period as well. Rebecca Copenhaver (2020) argues that George Berkeley can be seen as a Russellian idealist. Cole Mitchell (in correspondence) reports that there is a version of Russellian panprotopsychism discussed by Anthony Collins, in the 1707–08 Clarke-Collins Correspondence.

2.2 Russellian Monism in the Twentieth and Twenty-First Centuries

Contemporary Russellian monists often trace their view to Russell’s 1927 The Analysis of Matter, which they read as developing a structuralist account of physics. Indeed, some find in that book suggestions of not only structuralism about physics but the other main components of Russellian monism too (Lockwood 1992 [2015: 144–145]; Chalmers 1996: 166). On this interpretation, Russell there implied that what are now called quiddities might be identified with what he called percepts (Russell 1927a: 402). It has also been argued that he more explicitly endorsed the eponymous theory (though not by its current name) in some of his later writings, including Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits and My Philosophical Development (Wishon 2015; but see Stubenberg 2015).

Some argue that Russellian monism has historical roots not only in Russell’s writings but also in early twentieth century works by Arthur Eddington (Kadić 2017; cf. Strawson 2006a). In Eddington’s view, science does not describe what he calls the nature of the entities it posits, which he also refers to as the background of “pointer readings and similar indications” (Eddington 1928: 252). For instance, he contends, physics—modern physics, as opposed to the physics of the “Victorian physicist” for whom “Atoms were tiny billiard balls…”—describes atoms not in terms of their natures but rather in terms of pointer readings (Eddington 1928: 259). Thus, like Russell, Eddington seems to affirm a version of structuralism about physics (or something in the vicinity). Further, Eddington proposes that atoms, and perhaps everything else physics describes, might have “something of spiritual nature of which a prominent characteristic is thought” (Eddington 1928: 259). In support of that proposal, he writes,

But in one case—namely, for the pointer readings of my own brain—I have an insight which is not limited to the evidence of the pointer readings. That insight shows that they are attached to a background of consciousness. Although I may expect that the background of other pointer readings in physics is of a nature continuous with that revealed to me in this particular case, I do not suppose that it always has the more specialized attributes of consciousness. (Eddington 1928: 259–260)

Eddington’s reflections can be seen as suggestive of either Russellian panpsychism (Kadić 2017: 46), Russellian panprotopsychism, or perhaps a hybrid of the two.

In the late twentieth century, Grover Maxwell (1978) and Michael Lockwood (1989, 1992) each endorse a theory that they attribute to Russell and is often interpreted as Russellian monism (see, for example, Chalmers 1996, 2013). Maxwell presents his theory in the course of defending the mind-brain identity theory (Place 1956; Smart 1959; Lewis 1966; see the entry the mind/brain identity theory) against Saul Kripke’s (1972) influential challenge. Kripke’s challenge concerns how to reconcile that identity theory with the “apparent contingency of the connection between the mental state and the corresponding brain state…” (Kripke 1972 [1980: 152]). Maxwell rejects an assumption on which, he claims, that challenge relies: the assumption that “we know from common sense, from physics, from neurophysiology, etc., what brain events are like” (Maxwell 1978: 134). In his view, those sources tell us about structural properties but not about brain events’ underlying non-structural properties—a line of reasoning suggestive of both structuralism about physics and realism about quiddities. He also seems to endorse something like quidditism about consciousness. In the case of brain events that are, in his view, identical to macrophenomenal experiences, he implies that their underlying non-structural properties might be phenomenal properties—a claim suggestive of Russellian panpsychism. Lockwood (1989, 1992) develops a theory similar to Maxwell’s, remarking that it “seems to me the only approach to the philosophical mind–body problem, currently on offer, that holds out the slightest promise” (Lockwood 1992 [2015: 145]).

More recent discussions of Russellian monism have followed Maxwell and Lockwood’s lead. The view is advanced as offering a plausible response not only to Kripke’s challenge but also to related anti-materialist arguments (section 3). Daniel Stoljar’s “Two Conceptions of the Physical” (2001) is widely considered the classic expression of that idea (see also Stoljar 2006, 2009, 2014, 2015). The idea is also developed by Chalmers (1996, 1997a, 2003, 2010: ch. 6, 10) and others (Rosenberg 2004; Alter 2009, 2016; Montero 2010, 2015; Pereboom 2011, 2014, 2015, 2016; McClelland 2013; Brown 2017; Goff 2017). Chalmers (1997a) introduced the name “Russellian monism,” and his work on the topic has been highly influential. Another main source of the contemporary interest in Russellian monism is Galen Strawson’s (2003, 2006a,b) seminal work on consciousness and physicalism.

3. Arguments for and Objections to Russellian Monism

3.1 Arguments for Russellian Monism

Russellian monists usually support their theory by arguing that it has significant theoretical benefits. We will describe three such arguments, which appeal to closely related considerations. (For other arguments for Russellian monism see, for example, Rosenberg 2004; Strawson 2006a; Goff 2017; Schneider 2018.)

The first argument is based on the claim that Russellian monism combines theoretical virtues of traditional dualism with those of traditional physicalism, while avoiding their main drawbacks (Chalmers 2013). The reasoning behind that claim could be stated as follows. Traditional physicalism has the virtue of allowing consciousness to be integrated into physical causation. But this comes at the cost of disregarding or distorting the distinctive features of consciousness. Traditional dualism avoids that cost. But by separating consciousness from the physical world, traditional dualism prevents consciousness from being integrated into physical causation. The latter cost is famously articulated by Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia, in her criticism of Cartesian dualism (Elisabeth to Descartes, 21 May, 1643 [1984: v. 3, 218; AT III 665]; see the entry Elisabeth, Princess of Bohemia), and by related causal arguments for physicalism such as the following:

Many effects that we attribute to conscious causes have full physical causes. But it would be absurd to suppose that these effects are caused twice over. So the conscious causes must be identical to some part of those physical causes. (Papineau 2002: 17; cf. Kim 1989, 1998).

By contrast, Russellian monism seems to avoid those costs of both traditional physicalism and traditional dualism. On Russellian monism, the properties that constitute consciousness—quiddities and (perhaps) structural properties—play indispensable roles in physical causation. Consciousness —or at least the components of consciousness —is thus integrated into physical causation. Yet the distinctive features of consciousness are neither disregarded nor distorted. Those features are attributed to quiddities and their special (e.g., constitutive) relationship to consciousness.

A second argument for Russellian monism is based on the claim that this theory offers an elegant, unified solution to two distinct philosophical problems (Lockwood 1989, 1992; Chalmers 1996, 2013 [2015: 254]; Rosenberg 2004; Goff 2017; cf. Russell 1927a, 1927b: 116). One of those problems is how to provide a foundation for the spatiotemporal structure physics describes. The other is how to integrate consciousness into physical causation. When considered from the perspective of a Russellian monist, these two problems seem made for each other. The requisite foundation of spatiotemporal structure is provided by (proto)phenomenal quiddities. Because those same quiddities (partly or wholly) constitute consciousness, consciousness thereby plays a distinctive role in physical causation—or at least the components of consciousness play that role. Thus, the reasoning runs, both problems are solved at once.

A third argument for Russellian monism is based on the claim that Russellian monism provides a plausible response to anti-materialist arguments such as the conceivability argument and the knowledge argument (see the entries zombies and qualia: the knowledge argument and Alter 2023). The conceivability argument is often formulated in terms of a zombie world (Chalmers 1996): a physical and functional duplicate of the actual world but without consciousness. It is first argued that a zombie world is ideally conceivable, which means roughly that such a world cannot be ruled out as incoherent by a priori reasoning (Chalmers 2002). It is then argued that the ideal conceivability of such a world entails its metaphysical possibility. Finally, it is argued that the metaphysical possibility of such a world entails that physicalism is false. The knowledge argument begins with Frank Jackson’s (1982, 1986, 1995) case of Mary, the brilliant scientist in the black-and-white room, who comes to know the complete physical truth by reading black-and-white science books and watching science lectures on a black-and-white monitor. If physicalism were true, Jackson reasons, then Mary would thereby know everything there is to know about seeing in color: she could deduce that information from her physical knowledge. But, he claims, this is not the case. On the contrary, when Mary leaves the room she learns truths about what it is like to see in color – truths she did not already know.

According to Russellian monism, those arguments might show that structure alone does not fully determine (metaphysically necessitate) the nature or even the existence of consciousness. But it does not follow that physicalism is false. At most, it follows that traditional physicalist theories are false, because those theories limit the physicalist’s resources to the structural. Russellian physicalism, on which the class of physical truths includes not only structural truths but quiddistic truths as well, is not threatened (Stoljar 2001). Further, this anti-structuralist thesis comports well with the claim that consciousness consists at least partly in non-structural quiddities—a claim that is central to Russellian monism generally, not just the physicalist variety (section 1).

That response can be developed in different ways, such as rejecting epistemic premises on which the anti-materialist arguments rely (for other ways, see Chalmers 2010: 134–135; Pereboom 2011; Alter and Nagasawa 2012: 83–86). Regarding the conceivability argument, Russellian physicalists can argue as follows. On reflection, a zombie world is not ideally conceivable. If such a world initially appears conceivable, this is because we mistake a zombie world for a structural zombie world: a consciousness-free world that (minimally) duplicates all of the actual world’s structural features. If there is an ideally conceivable world in the vicinity, then that world is a structural zombie world. There is no good reason to accept the ideal conceivability of a full-fledged zombie world, which would lack consciousness despite duplicating not only the actual world’s structural features but its quiddistic features as well. Regarding the knowledge argument, Russellian physicalists can argue that because Mary’s black-and-white science lessons leave out quiddistic information, those lessons teach her only part of the physical truth. If so, then the truths she learns when she leaves might be physical. They would be non-structural quiddistic truths but physical truths nonetheless.

3.2 Objections to Russellian Monism

One objection to Russellian monism concerns the combination problem: how do (proto)phenomenal quiddities (or quiddities and structural properties) combine to constitute macrophenomenal properties (Seager 1995; Chalmers 2003)? Suppose someone is having a phenomenally blue experience. If constitutive Russellian monism is true, then the phenomenal blueness of that experience consists wholly in certain quiddities, perhaps structured in a certain way (for the distinction between constitutive and non-constitutive Russellian monism, see Section 4.2). But on many varieties of Russellian monism, quiddities are micro-level features. On the face of it, it seems possible that those (or any) micro-level quiddities could be instantiated without anyone having that (or any) experience—and that seems possible no matter how they are structured. If that is possible, then how could phenomenal blueness consist wholly in (structured) quiddities, as constitutive Russellian monists hold? Essentially the same problem seems to arise for other varieties of constitutive Russellian monism, such as those on which quiddities are construed as cosmophenomenal features (Goff 2009; Pereboom 2011, 114; Chalmers 2013, 2017).

That is one version of the combination problem, but there are others. Consider one raised for a version of constitutive Russellian panspsychism, according to which microphenomenal quiddities, perhaps together with structural properties, combine to constitute macrophenomenal properties. The problem can be stated as an objection, as follows. The constitutive Russellian panpsychist is committed to the following two claims. First, corresponding to each instance of a microphenomenal quiddity underlying a physical disposition there is a unique conscious subject: a microsubject distinct from the microsubjects that correspond to other such instances of microphenomenal quiddities. Second, multiple microsubjects corresponding to microphenomenal quiddities combine to constitute a single macrosubject. But it is unclear how that second claim could be true. As William James (1890: 162) suggests, given any group of subjects and any further subject, it seems possible for the group to exist without that further subject existing. This is known the subject-summing problem (Goff 2009, 2017; Chalmers 2013, 2017; Coleman 2014).

Some respond to such combination problems by appealing to a Leibnizian underrepresentation thesis (Pereboom 2011: 114–115), on which introspective awareness of phenomenal states fails to represent them as having microfeatures they do in fact have (Leibniz, Discourse on Metaphysics, §30 [G IV, 458–59; IV, 574–575]; Pereboom 1991b, 2011: 9, n. 1; cf. Stoljar 2001: 276). Consider the version of the combination problem stated two paragraphs back, involving the constitution of phenomenal blueness. On the Leibnizian underrepresentation thesis, even if one introspects one’s experience as featuring only noncomplex phenomenal blueness, phenomenal blueness might in fact be constituted by an unrepresented array of (proto)phenomenal quiddities. To support that claim, one might draw an analogy to a macrophenomenal property that is constituted by other macrophenomenal properties. For example, a taste experience might appear simple and unconstituted even if in fact it is constituted by a combination of sweet, sour, salty, bitter, and umami (as Louis DeRosset has suggested in conversation; see Pereboom 2011: 115). Likewise, the response continues, perhaps all macrophenomenal features are constituted by (proto)phenomenal quiddities, or by quiddities and structural features, which introspection fails to reveal.

However, that response is only partial. It might show that introspection alone does not rule out the possibility that macrophenomenal properties are constituted by quiddities or by quiddities and structure. But the response does not explain how macrophenomenal properties might result from such constituents. Although some explanations have been proposed (e.g., Rosenberg 2004, 2015, Mørch 2019), many regard the combination problem for Russellian monism as unsolved and serious (see the entry panpsychism; Brüntrup and Jaskolla 2017; Chalmers 2017).

Several other objections to Russellian monism have been raised in the recent literature, of which we will describe four. The first is related to the combination problem and applies only to Russellian panprotopsychism. It is argued that Russellian panprotopsychism faces the following sort of “revenge” problem. Russellian monism is motivated partly by its ability to provide plausible responses to influential anti-physicalist arguments, such as the conceivability and knowledge arguments (section 3.1). Those arguments usually begin by attacking allegedly implausible epistemic commitments of certain traditional physicalist views (such as analytic functionalism), such as the claim that structural truths alone a priori entail all phenomenal truths. However, some argue, parallel considerations undermine the Russellian panprotopsychist’s claim that protophenomenal truths and structural truths together a priori entail all phenomenal truths (Strawson 2006a,b; Goff 2015, 2017). Thus, for example, it is argued that while still in the black-and-white room Mary can come to know all the protophenomenal truths just as easily as she can come to know all the structural truths, and still not thereby be positioned to know what it is like to see red (for related objections to Russellian monism, see Cutter 2019, Botin 2023, and Mendelow forthcoming).

In response, some deny that the two a priori entailment claims are on a par (Alter 2018). Mary could come to know any structural truth while still in the room, the response runs, because any structural truth can be fully conveyed in the colorless language of objective science. But protophenomenal properties are non-structural. So, perhaps some protophenomenal truths cannot be fully conveyed in such colorless language. If so, then the Russellian panprotopsychist’s a priori entailment claim might not meet the same fate as the one associated with certain traditional physicalist theories.

A second recent objection, developed by Amy Kind (2015), is that Russellian monism is unmotivated. The theory is often advanced as providing insight into the mind–body problem: insight that has eluded traditional dualists and traditional physicalists (section 3.1). However, Kind points out, Russellian monism fails to resolve the most central issue in the debate: whether consciousness is a fundamental component of the universe. On Russellian panpsychism consciousness is a fundamental component of the universe, whereas on Russellian panprotopsychism it is not. Thus, Russellian monism leaves us “essentially back where we started” (Kind 2015: 420; cf. Liu 2021, which compares the view to Thomistic hylomorphism and claims that Russellian monism has similar problems). In response, it has been argued that this charge misunderstands Russellian monism’s aims (Alter and Coleman 2020a). Russellian monism does not purport to settle whether consciousness is a fundamental component of the universe. Rather, the theory is meant to provide a framework in which that issue (and others) can be more productively addressed—a framework provided by neither traditional physicalism nor traditional dualism.

A third recent objection is that Russellian monism, despite its aims, fails to adequately integrate consciousness into physical causation. One version of this objection begins with the premise that, on Russellian monism, a single type of physical disposition might have been grounded by a distinct quiddity from the quiddity that actually grounds it (Howell 2015; cf. Robinson 1993). For example, if in the actual world quiddity Q1 grounds negative charge, then there is a metaphysically possible world in which a distinct quiddity Q2 grounds negative charge; the grounding relationship between quiddities and physical dispositions is in this way metaphysically contingent. If so, the argument continues, then quiddities (even if they exist) do not make any distinctive contribution to physical causation. With respect to physical causation, quiddities are “just along for the causal ride” (Howell 2015: 34). On another version of the objection, even if quiddities contribute to physical causation, consciousness does not thereby inherit any physical efficacy, contrary to what Russellian monists claim (Robinson 2018; cf. Chan 2020, 2021).

In response to the first version of that objection, on which quiddities lack physical efficacy, some reject the assumption that any such conclusion follows from the premise that a single type of physical disposition might have been grounded by a distinct quiddity from the quiddity that actually grounds it (Hawthorne 2002, Alter and Coleman 2020a, 2021). Causal relations, it is argued, do not in generally hold with metaphysical necessity. So, why must the relationship between quiddities and dispositions hold with such necessity, if quiddities are to be physically efficacious? Another response is to reject the premise that on Russellian monism that relationship is metaphysically contingent (Chalmers 2013 [2015: 264–265]; Mørch 2014, 2019; Gundersen 2015; Kadić 2017; Alter and Coleman 2020a, 2021). In response to the second version of the objection, on which consciousness does not inherit any physical efficacy from that of quiddities (even if quiddities partly or wholly constitute consciousness), one might argue that this charge is just an instance of a general worry concerning micro-to-macro causal exclusion, which does not concern consciousness or Russellian monism specifically. (See the entry mental causation; Goff 2017: 153–158)

A fourth recent objection to Russellian monism targets the distinction between the structural and the non-structural. Some argue that this distinction cannot be explicated in the way that Russellian monism requires. As noted above (section 1.1), some have made proposals for how to explicate that distinction. Those proposals render structuralism about physics consistent with the claim physics describes some intrinsic properties, thus safeguarding structuralism about physics from one line of attack. But whether any of those proposals is fully adequate for the purposes of Russellian monism is disputed (Stoljar 2015). Other, related objections have been raised, e.g., that the dispositional/categorical distinction does not apply to physical properties in the way that Russellian monism implies (Hiddleston 2019; but see Alter and Pereboom 2023; for other objections concerning the Russellian monist’s structural/non-structural distinction, see Stoljar 2006, 2009, 2014, 2015; Ney 2015; for responses, see Pereboom 2011, 2014, 2015; Alter 2009, 2016).

4. Further Issues

4.1 Structuralism about Physics

As noted above (section 1.1), Russellian monism can be identified with the conjunction of the three theses: structuralism about physics, realism about quiddities, and quidditism about consciousness. But one might question whether Russellian monists are committed to structuralism about physics, at least if that thesis is understood as saying that physical theory is completely silent on the existence and nature of quiddities. Given Russellian monism, terms for the basic entities in physical theory, such as “mass” and “charge”, perhaps refer to quiddities, to entities that have quiddities. One might take that point alone to belie the structuralist’s complete-silence claim. Further, one might wonder, why should Russellian monists rule out the possibility of physical theory expressing substantive information about the referents of its terms (Hawthorne 2002)?

In response, one might argue that physical theory itself is neutral between a Russellian monist interpretation according to which terms like “mass” and “charge” refer to quiddities, and a structuralist interpretation according to which such terms do not refer to quiddities (Ladyman and Ross, with Spurrett and Collier 2007). That is, one might argue that the commitments of physical theory itself, by contrast with a metaphysical interpretation of physical theory, do not go beyond the structural. Structuralism about physics could thus be viewed as a thesis only about physical theory itself. In that case, the considerations mentioned in the preceding paragraph do not challenge the claim that Russellian monists are committed to structuralism about physics.

Alternatively, one might give up the claim that Russellian monists are committed to structuralism about physics (Alter and Pereboom 2023; but see Brown 2023). What is at the core of Russellian monism, one might contend, is only that there are quiddities that both underlie structural features physics describes and are relevant to consciousness. So, of the three claims we have described as core Russellian monist theses, perhaps only the second and the third qualify as such. Or instead, Russellian monists might retain structuralism about physics but explicate it in a way that is relatively uncontroversial (or at least less controversial than it often is), e.g., as a view about currentphysics.

4.2 Constitution and Emergence

As noted above (section 1.1), many Russellian monists claim that macrophenomenal properties are constituted by quiddities, or by quiddities and structure. But not all do. Instead, some claim that macrophenomenal properties emerge from quiddities, or from quiddities and structure (Goff 2015), where emergence is taken to be a (diachronic or synchronic) causal relation.

However, some object that the causal-emergence construal undermines the claim that on Russellian monism consciousness is integrated into physical causation (Alter and Nagasawa 2012: 81; Chalmers 2013 [2015: 253–259]). The objection could be stated as follows. On the causal-emergence construal, there are causal laws connecting quiddities (or quiddities and structural properties) to macrophenomenal consciousness: laws that are neither a priori entailed nor metaphysically necessitated by the structural truths that physical theory describes. In this respect, such laws would be just like psychophysical laws posited by traditional interactionist dualism. And it is precisely because of the need to posit such psychophysical laws that traditional interactionist dualism is charged with failing to integrate consciousness adequately into physical causation (Smart 1959). Thus, on the causal-emergence construal, that charge would apply equally to Russellian monism (but see Goff 2015: 294–97; 2017: Part II passim).

4.3 Physical Quiddities

Much (though by no means all) of the recent discussion of Russellian monism focuses on Russellian physicalism, on which quiddities are physical properties. But there is no well-developed conception of physical quiddities, or at least none that is widely accepted. This has prompted speculation as to what such properties might be like.

Derk Pereboom (2011: ch. 5) identifies some candidates for physical quiddities in the history of philosophy. One comes from the Aristotelian tradition, on which matter is made up at least partly of prime matter. Prime materiality could be understood as a physical quiddity that underlies matter, which is structural. On Thomas Aquinas’s (1252–56) Aristotelian view, for instance, matter consists in extension in three dimensions, i.e., quantity. But quantity is a form, and in Aquinas’s view a form must inhere in something. That something, he thinks, is prime matter. Unlike quantity, prime materiality is not (in the terminology of section 1.1) a relatively intrinsic property of matter. Instead, it is an absolutely intrinsic property of matter, and it could be seen as a physical quiddity (Pereboom 2011: 85, 113). Admittedly, Aquinas held that prime matter is unintelligible. But other Aristotelians did not (Pasnau 2009).

Another candidate for a physical quiddity that Pereboom identifies is due to John Locke (1690). In Locke’s conception, solidity is the categorical basis for impenetrability, which is dispositional. Lockean solidity is “that which hinders the approach of two bodies when they move toward one another” (Locke 1690: II, iv, emphasis added). Lockean solidity is also what differentiates matter from space, and is a defining property of matter. On one plausible interpretation, Pereboom (2011: 97–100) suggests, Locke regards that property as an absolutely intrinsic property of matter and as a physical quiddity.

A third candidate for physical quiddities, which is similar to Lockean solidity, may be found in contemporary metaphysics. Many contemporary metaphysicians accept that there exist non-Humean causal powers (see the entry dispositions). Humeans identify causal powers with mere tendencies, which can be fully explicated by means of subjunctive conditionals such as, “If an electron were in the vicinity of a proton, it would attract that proton” (Jacobs 2011). By contrast, non-Humeans identify causal powers with properties that categorically ground tendencies—much as Lockean solidity grounds impenetrability. Such categorical properties are truthmakers for, and not explicable in terms of, subjunctive conditionals. For example, the causal power of an electron is a categorical property that makes subjunctive conditionals such as the one just specified (“If an electron…”) true (Jacobs 2011; cf. Heil 2003, Jaworski 2016). Such truthmakers could be construed as physical quiddities (Gundersen 2015, Pereboom 2016, 2019).

So, there are at least some candidates for what physical quiddities might be like (for others, see, e.g., Chalmers 2013 [esp. 2015: 270–274]; Rosenberg 2004; Coleman 2012, 2015). Still, one might wonder if any of the candidates just described—Aristotelian prime materiality, Lockean solidity, or non-Humean causal powers—can serve all of the Russellian physicalist’s purposes. Russellian physicalists argue that positing physical quiddities safeguards their theory from the conceivability and knowledge arguments (section 3.1). But suppose those quiddities are construed as non-Humean causal powers of physical entities such as electrons. Wouldn’t Mary be in a position to fully understand such powers while she is still in the room? (Pereboom 2011: 113–114). If so, then the proposed construal would seem to undermine the Russellian physicalist’s basis for denying that her pre-release physical knowledge is incomplete. Similarly, one might argue that the proposed construal would undermine the Russellian physicalist’s contention that while a structural zombie world is ideally conceivable, a full-fledged zombie world is not. Parallel concerns arise for Aristotelian prime materiality and Lockean solidity. Even if those properties could be construed as physical quiddities, they would not appear to facilitate the Russellian physicalist’s objective of providing a plausible response to the conceivability and knowledge arguments (cf. Botin 2023).

5. Final Words

Chalmers writes:

If we can find a reasonable solution to the combination problem for either [Russellian panpsychism or Russellian panprotopsychism], this view would immediately become the most promising solution to the mind–body problem. (Chalmers 2013 [2015: 274])

Whether or not Chalmers is right about this, many philosophers of mind believe that Russellian monism merits serious attention.


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