# Arabic and Islamic Philosophy of Mathematics

*First published Sat Apr 9, 2022*

Philosophy of pure mathematics deals with two major groups of questions. One pertains to the ontology of mathematical entities and the other to the epistemology of mathematical concepts and judgments (Avigad 2007). The nature and existence of mathematical objects (e.g., numbers and geometrical shapes), the existence and qualifications of infinities (e.g., infinite magnitudes and infinite collections of numbers or numbered things), and the existence and qualifications of continua are some of the most significant ontological issues with which philosophers of mathematics are concerned. On the other hand, some of the most important and challenging epistemological issues about mathematics are the following: the mechanisms through which we grasp mathematical knowledge, the epistemic status of mathematical axioms and principles, the nature of mathematical proofs (that are writable on paper) and their connection to what goes on in the mind of mathematicians, and the role of mathematical knowledge in attaining a better understanding of the physical world.

It is very well known that the medieval Islamic civilization played a
pivotal role in the historical development of technical aspects of
mathematics. Standing on the shoulders of their pre-Islamic Greek,
Indian, and Persian ancestors, Muslim mathematicians have made
numerous innovations in various branches of mathematics and have
written a great number of books and essays introducing mathematical
notions and proving mathematical theorems (Al-Daffaʾ 1977; R.
Rashed 1984b [1994]; 1996 [2012]; 2015; Berggren 2016). However, it is
very difficult (if not impossible) to find a book from the medieval
Islamic era that is exclusively devoted to a comprehensive and
systematic study of philosophy of mathematics. Nevertheless, many of
the aforementioned philosophical issues about mathematics have been
addressed, by great Muslim medieval thinkers, in various works whose
central subject was mathematics, physics, metaphysics, or even
theology (*kalām*). Putting these scattered engagements
together, it becomes clear that although philosophy of mathematics has
never been treated as an independent discipline in the medieval
Islamic world, Muslim thinkers came up with very interesting and
profound ideas, insights, and arguments about at least some
philosophical issues related to mathematics. This entry briefly
reviews the most remarkable examples of such insights and arguments,
some of which have been the subject of long-standing debates and
discussions among Muslim thinkers. Accordingly, the technical
mathematical works of Arab and Muslim scholars will be discussed only
to the extent that they contain materials related to the
*philosophy* of mathematics.

- 1. Ontology of Mathematics
- 2. Epistemology of Mathematics
- 3. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Ontology of Mathematics

### 1.1 What Mathematical Objects Are Not

Traces of the philosophical views of Pythagoras and Plato regarding
the nature of mathematical objects can be found in the works of early
Muslim thinkers. This could be partially due to the early Arabic
translations of works by Pythagorean and Platonist mathematicians.
Most of the mathematicians in the tradition of Nicomachus, Proclus,
and Iamblichus were Pythagorean and Platonist (Endress 2003). Some of
their most important works have been translated into Arabic and have
influenced Muslim mathematicians and philosophers. For example,
Nicomachus’s *Introduction to Arithmetic* was translated
into Arabic by Ḥabīb Ibn Bahrīz (d. early ninth
century) from Syriac and by Thābit Ibn Qurra (d. 901) from Greek
(Brentjes 2022: sec. 1). The inspiration of the Pythagorean and
Platonist approaches to the philosophy of mathematics is easily
detectable in, for example, the works of the Brethren of Purity
(*Ikhwān al-ṣafāʾ*) and early Mutazilites
(The Brethren of Purity [Epistles]; Endress 2003: 132–33;
Marquet 2006; Fazlıoğlu 2014: 2; El-Bizri 2018; Baffioni
2022). The main characteristics of Pythagoreanism and Platonism
regarding the ontology of mathematics can be captured by the following
theses (Zarepour 2019: 198):

**Separateness of Mathematical Objects (SM):**Mathematical objects are independent immaterial substances, fully separate (*mufāriq*) from matter and material objects.**Principalness of Mathematical Objects (PM):**Mathematical objects are the principles (*mabādiʾ*) of natural things. Mathematical objects have some sort of primacy over natural forms which makes the latter dependent on (or grounded in or caused by) the former.

Plato was committed to both of these theses. By contrast, the
Pythagoreans endorsed only the latter thesis. This is so at least if
we trust Aristotle’s report (*Metaphysics*
987b23–987b25). Although Pythagoreanism considers numbers to be
the causes and principles of all other existing things, it does not
treat numbers as entities that are necessarily separate from matter
(Zhmud 1989; De Smet 2022). From our perspective today, this is to
some extent surprising because, compared to
(PM),
(SM) seems to enjoy more *prima facie* plausibility. But
precisely because of the presence of strong tendencies towards
Pythagoreanism in early Islamic thought (Brentjes 2022), (PM) was more
explicitly defended than (SM). In any case, Avicenna’s brutal
criticism of these two theses (along with his more general criticism
of the Platonic theory of separate universal forms) made
Pythagoreanism and Platonism extremely unpopular in post-Avicennian
philosophy. In the *Metaphysics of “The Healing”*,
Avicenna (d. 937) argues against (SM) and (PM) not only by rejecting
arguments attributed to the defenders of these two theses (Avicenna
[Mph]: chap. VII.2) but also by developing his own positive arguments
against them (Avicenna [MPh]: chap. VII.3).

According to an argument that Avicenna attributes to the defenders of (SM), on the one hand, mathematical objects are separate in definition (or in mind). They can be defined (or conceived) with no reference to matter or material beings. On the other hand, everything that is separate in definition (or in mind) is separate in existence. Therefore, the argument concludes, mathematical objects are separate in existence. They exist as fully separate beings which have no association with matter or material beings (Avicenna [MPh]: chap. VII.2, sec. 5). However, Avicenna finds this argument wanting. He argues that there is a difference between (a) defining (or conceiving) something without the condition of materiality and (b) defining (or conceiving) something with the condition of immateriality. He says that mathematical objects are separate in definition only in the sense of (a). But the second premise of the argument under discussion is true only if the separation in definition is considered in the sense of (b). The mere fact that something can be defined without the condition of materiality does not entail that that thing can exist in the extramental realm fully separate from matter. But mathematical objects cannot be defined with the condition of immateriality. It is not plausible to suppose immateriality as an essential component of the definitions of mathematical objects, or so Avicenna claims. Thus, this argument is fallacious and cannot establish (SM) (Avicenna [MPh], chap. VII.2, secs. 16–17; Marmura 2006: 360–63; Porro 2011: 292–93; Zarepour 2019: sec. 4.1).

A simple argument that Avicenna attributes to the advocates of (PM) goes as follows: Mathematical objects are separate. In other words, (SM) is true. Moreover, the principles (or causes) of material things cannot be themselves material. They must be separate. Therefore, mathematical objects are the principles of material (or, natural) things (Avicenna [MPh]: chap. VII.2, sec. 7). Avicenna thinks that this argument is not only unsound due to the falsity of (SM) but also invalid. Even if we accept both that mathematical objects are separate and that the principles of natural things must be separate, we cannot validly conclude that mathematical objects are the principles of natural things. There might exist other separate non-mathematical things which form the principles of natural beings. The argument in question is valid only if we presuppose that mathematical objects are the only separate existents. But this is something for which we have no proof. Therefore, this argument fails to establish (PM) (Avicenna [MPh]: chap. VII.2, sec. 21; Marmura 2006: 365–66; Porro 2011: 294; Zarepour 2019: sec. 4.2).

Avicenna’s own argument against the separateness or immateriality of mathematical objects can be summarized as follows: There are some mathematical objects in the sensible world. Otherwise, we could not grasp their concepts (e.g., the concepts triangle, circle, two, etc.) (Avicenna [MPh]: sec. VII.3, sec. 1). Now, if there are also some fully separate mathematical objects (entirely detached from the sensible world), then these two groups of (sensible/non-separate and non-sensible/separate) mathematical objects must share similar essences and definitions (Avicenna [MPh]: chap. VII.3, sec. 2). Otherwise, there is no way we can know separate material objects. This is because it does not seem that we have any direct access to a realm of fully immaterial mathematical objects (This reminds us of Benacerraf’s (1973) epistemological challenge to mathematical Platonism). Even if such things exist, we know them only through the mediation of knowing their sensible counterparts. We have no justification for the existence of separate mathematical objects which have no sensible counterpart in the material world. But this leaves unjustified the claim that mathematical objects can essentially be immaterial and separate. Avicenna takes this argument as establishing that (SM) is implausible (Avicenna [MPh], chap. VII.3, sec. 3; Zarepour 2019: sec. 5). We will later see that this argument reveals interesting aspects of Avicenna’s accounts of the epistemology and ontology of mathematics.

Finally, Avicenna argues that even if separate mathematical objects exist, they cannot be the principles (or causes) of natural things. It seems intuitively plausible that if a separate mathematical object is the principle of any material existent, it must in the first place be the principle of its own sensible counterpart. Note that, according to Avicenna, the claim that a separate mathematical object, say a triangle, exists cannot be justified unless we have come to know it through knowing a sensible counterpart of it that exists in the material world. Now if that separate triangle is the cause of any material thing, it must in the first place be the principle of its own sensible counterpart, or so Avicenna believes. But if the sensible triangle is caused by the separate triangle, then we can legitimately ask why the former needs the latter. It is either the essence or (some of) the accidents of the sensible triangle that make it dependent on its separate counterpart. However, if it is due to the essence of the sensible triangle, then the separate triangle itself needs a principle. This is because the separate and the sensible triangles share the same essence. Thus, if it is the essence of the sensible triangle which makes it need the separate triangle, then the separate triangle (having the same essence as its sensible counterpart) must itself be caused by another separate triangle. Repeating the same line of argument, we can conclude that there must exist an infinite chain of causally connected triangles. Since such infinite regresses are unacceptable, what makes a sensible mathematical object need its separate counterpart is not their shared essence. But it is also impossible that (some of) the accidents of a sensible mathematical object make it dependent on its separate counterpart. The accidents of the sensible object do not exist unless that object itself exists. But it is also assumed that the sensible object itself does not exist unless the separate object exists. This means that the separate object has some sort of explanatory priority over the accidents of the sensible object. Therefore, the accidents of a sensible mathematical object cannot explain, in a non-circular way, why this object needs its separate counterpart (Avicenna [MPh]: chap. VII.3, sec 4). Thus, it seems that there is no convincing justification for why a separate mathematical object must be the cause of its sensible counterpart, let alone the cause (or principle) of any other natural thing. Avicenna takes this argument as refuting (PM).

These arguments show that mathematical objects are neither separate
entities fully detached from the sensible world nor the causes of
natural things. Avicenna’s refutation of Platonism and
Pythagoreanism regarding mathematical objects was so convincing and
influential that these approaches almost completely disappeared in
post-Avicennian philosophy. This was so despite the strong presence of
Pythagorean and/or Platonic elements in other (i.e., non-mathematical)
aspects of the philosophy of some post-Avicennian thinkers, like
Suhrawardī (d. 1191) (Walbridge 2000; De Smet 2022). The details
of some Avicennian criticisms of
(SM)
and
(PM)—which
were usually taken as auxiliary parts of Avicenna’s general
criticism of the Platonic account of universal forms—were of
course criticized by later philosophers (Arnzen 2011; Benevich 2019).
These criticisms did not revive mathematical Platonism and/or
Pythagoreanism in post-Avicennian Islamic philosophy. Having said
that, the discussions of the weakness and strength of the arguments
for and against mathematical Platonism continued to be of interest to
post-Avicennian philosophers. Perhaps the most important work in which
such arguments are collected is a book, entitled *The Platonic
Intelligible Forms*, written between 1329 and 1339, by an unknown
author (see the Arabic text of the book in Badawī 1947:
1–145, and its German translation in Arnzen 2011: Appendix
1).

### 1.2 What Mathematical Objects Are

Now that we know what mathematical objects are not for Muslim
philosophers, we must thus ask what they are. In his
*Metaphysics* (VI.1, 1026a13–19) Aristotle classifies
different theoretical sciences based on the ontological status of the
objects they study (Cleary 1994). Aristotle’s main criteria for
distinguishing different sciences from each other are the extent and
qualification of the association of the subject-matter of the sciences
with movement and materiality. Employing a similar approach, in his
*The Aims of Aristotle’s Metaphysics *(*Maqāla
fī aghrāḍ kitāb mā baʿd
al-ṭabīʿa*), al-Fārābī (d. 950)
argues that the subject matters of mathematics—i.e.,
mathematical objects—are abstracted (*mujarrad*) from
matter in estimation (*wahm*) but not in the extramental world.
On the one hand, mathematical objects are different from the objects
that metaphysics studies because the latter objects are fully detached
from matter both in estimation and in the extramental world. On the
other hand, mathematical objects are different from the sensible
physical objects because they cannot be separated from matter, either
in estimation or in the extramental world. Thus, mathematics occupies
an intermediate position between metaphysics and physics. The
association of mathematical objects with matter is stronger than that
of the objects of metaphysics but weaker than that of the objects of
physics. (The original Arabic of al-Fārābī’s book
can be found in al-Fārābi 1890: 34–38, and Kiankhah
2015: 147–57. For two English translations, see Bertolacci 2006:
66–72, and McGinnis & Reisman 2007: 78–81.)

In his *Enumeration of the Sciences*
(*ʾIḥṣāʾ al-ʿulūm*),
al-Fārābī puts forward a more detailed discussion of
the ontology of mathematics. He distinguishes applied/practical
(*ʿamalī*) mathematics from pure/theoretical
(*naẓarī*) mathematics. The objects of applied
arithmetic are numbers as they are associated with sensible things.
Applied arithmetic considers the number of sensible things existing in
the material world. By contrast, pure arithmetic considers an absolute
conception of number and plurality. It studies numbers that are
abstracted from all the numbered things in the sensible world.
Similarly, applied geometry considers the geometrical properties of
specific physical objects, whereas pure geometry deals with
geometrical shapes regardless of whether or not they are attached to
specific physical objects (al-Fārābi [Enum]: chap. 3;
Endress 2003: 139–40).

Following the main line of al-Fārābī’s approach,
Avicenna develops a more detailed discussion of the division of the
sciences (Marmura 1980; Gutas 2003) according to which mathematical
objects exist in the extramental world in association with determinate
species of matter (e.g., wood, gold, etc.). Through the function of
the faculty of estimation, mathematical objects can be abstracted in
the mind from the specific species of matter they are attached to in
the extramental world. Nevertheless, they must still be conceived as
material things. In other words, mathematical objects in the mind are
separate from determinate species of matter, though not from
materiality itself (Avicenna [MPh]: chap. I.2; Di Vincenzo 2021:
20–27). Avicenna argues that numbers (*aʿdād*)
and magnitudes (*maqādīr*)—as the most general
representatives of the objects of arithmetic and geometry,
respectively—are accidents (*aʿrāḍ*) and
properties of physical objects existing in the sensible world
(Avicenna [MPh]: chap. III.3–4). Neither numbers nor magnitudes
have independent immaterial subsistence in the extramental world.
Magnitudes (or geometrical shapes, to be more specific) cannot be
detached from materiality even in the mind (Avicenna [MPh]: chap.
III.4 sec.2 and VII.2, sec. 21). By contrast, numbers can be
considered fully separate from matter and materiality. Nevertheless,
such a consideration of numbers is metaphysical, rather than
mathematical (Endress 2003: 142; Zarepour 2016: sec. 4). Numbers,
inasmuch as they are subject to mathematical studies, must be
receptive to decrease and increase. Therefore, even in the mind, they
must be conceived as properties of material things (Avicenna [MPh]:
chap. I.3, secs. 17–19). In sum, mathematical objects exist in
the extramental world as the properties of physical things constituted
of determinate species of matter. Mathematical objects can be
abstracted from these determinate species of matter in the mind. But
they must still be thought of as properties of material things.
Otherwise, they cannot be the subject of mathematical studies.
Avicenna’s discussion of the roles of the faculty of estimation
and the process of abstraction in mathematical studies has been
interpreted in two different ways. Some scholars (McGinnis 2006; 2017;
Ardeshir 2008; Fazlıoğlu 2014; Tahiri 2016; 2018) think that
mathematical objects are in the first place mental objects, and
abstraction is a mechanism for constructing mathematical objects.
Attributing a literalist view to Avicenna, some others (Marmura 1980;
2005; Zarepour 2016; 2021; McGinnis 2019) argue that mathematical
objects literally exist in the physical world and abstraction is a
cognitive process for grasping mathematical concepts, rather than
producing mathematical objects. These different interpretations remind
us of the contrast between the literalist (Mueller 1970; 1990) and the
abstractionist (Lear 1982; Hussey 1991) readings of Aristotle’s
ontology of mathematics. The most obvious objection to the literalist
view is that, unlike physical objects, which are inexact and
imperfect, mathematical objects seem to be perfect and exact (or
idealized). For instance, it seems that there exists no perfectly
circular physical object whose circumference is not (at least to a
modest extent) serrated. To rebut this objection against the
literalist reading of Avicenna’s ontology of mathematics, it has
been argued that he endorses the existence of perfect mathematical
objects in the physical world (Zarepour 2016: sec. 5; 2021: sec.
4).

This is probably due to the emphasis of Avicenna and
al-Fārābī on the role of estimation (*wahm*) in
conceiving mathematical objects that, in post-Avicennian philosophy,
mathematics is often referred to as an estimative (*wahmī*
or *mawhūm*) science (Pines 1974). Before or contemporary
with Avicenna, many Muslim thinkers had emphasized that mathematical
objects exist, in one way or another, in the physical world. For
instance, in *The Book of Instruction* (*Kitāb
al-tafhīm* ([Instr]), al-Bīrūnī (d. ~1048)
defends an account of the nature of mathematical objects which seems
to have strong affinities with the literalist reading of Avicenna
(Samian 2011; 2014). In the same vein, Ibn al-Haytham (d. 1040), in
the first pages of his *Resolution of Doubts* (*Ḥall
shukūk*, [Doubts]), argues that geometrical objects exist in
the sensible world. They can be abstracted from matter through the
activity of the faculty of imagination (*takhayyul*), whose
function in Ibn al-Haytham’s theory of mind is very similar to
the function of estimation in Avicenna’s psychology. However, by
contrast with Avicenna and Aristotle (*De anima*
428a5–18), Ibn al-Haytham thinks that imagined forms, that are
abstracted from physical objects, have a more real existence. For him,
the real (*ḥaqīqī*) existence of mathematical
objects is instantiated in imagination and distinction
(*tamyīz*)—another cognitive faculty in Ibn
al-Haytham’s philosophy of mind, which plays a crucial role in
grasping universal concepts through the mediation of imagined forms.
(See Ighbariah & Wagner 2018: secs. 79–81. R. Rashed [1993:
2:8–19] believes that there were two different Muslim thinkers
named ‘Ibn al-Haytham’. Sabra [1998; 2003] rejects
Rashed’s view and here I follow Sabra’s position.)

In post-Avicennian philosophy, the claim that mathematical objects are
mental (or estimative or imaginative) became the most popular view and
was increasingly emphasized by different thinkers. The inclination
towards this approach was partially due to powerful criticisms of
Avicenna’s account of the ontology of mathematics. For instance,
Suhrawardī offered strong objections to the existence of numbers
in the physical world as accidents of sensible things. Consider a
group of four individuals. Avicenna thinks that four-ness
(*ʾarbaʿīya*) is an accident of these four
persons. But Suhrawardī finds it untenable. He argues that

either ‘four-ness’ must be complete in each one of the individuals, which is not the case, or else there must be something of four-ness in each one, which can only be the unity. Therefore, either the totality of four-ness must have no locus other than the intellect, or else neither four-ness nor anything of four-ness can be in each one. On this latter supposition, too, four-ness is only in the intellect. (Suhrawardī

The Philosophy of Illumination[1999: 48])

He believes that it is only our mind which can impose a unity to a
plurality of four distinct sensible entities. There is nothing in the
extramental world which can naturally bind four detached things in
such a way that they collectively accept the accident of four-ness.
Thus, for Suhrawardī numbers (and mathematical objects in
general) are only mind-dependent (*iʿtibārī*)
things (Ziai 1990: 108; Walbridge 2000: 63 and 78–79). A similar
line of argument is developed by Mullā Ṣadrā (d.
1640). He accepts that there are pluralities in the extramental world.
But he insists that it is only through the activity of our mind that a
group of distinct objects can be considered a unity. There is nothing
in the extramental world which bestows unity to an arbitrary group of
distinct objects (Mullā Ṣadrā, *Al-Shawāhid
al-rubūbīya*, [1982: 65]). This line of argument against
the consideration of numbers as properties of physical objects reminds
us of Frege’s criticism of this idea (Frege 1884: §§
21–25).

A turning point in the rendition of mathematical objects as mental
objects is to appeal to the notion of *nafs al-ʾamr* to
describe the ontological status of mathematical objects and to clarify
the nature of the truth-makers of mathematical propositions. The
phrase ‘*nafs al-ʾamr*’ literally means
*the thing itself*. But its technical content is hard to
capture in translation. Although this phrase also appears in
Avicenna’s writings, it is probably Naṣīr al-Dīn
al-Ṭūsī (d. 1274) who used the phrase for the first
time in a technical and theory-laden sense. Different philosophers
have understood this phrase as referring to different things including
divine knowledge, the Active Intellect, the realm of ideas, etc.
(Kaş 2021; Spiker 2021). The significance of the theory of
*nafs al-ʾamr* for the philosophy of mathematics is that
it may enable us to preserve judgment-realism even without
object-realism. Some philosophers (e.g., Sayyid al-Sharīf
al-Jurjānī, d. 1413) have used this theory to show that
although mathematical objects are merely estimative
(*wahmī*) and have no mind-independent existence,
mathematical judgments are certain (*yaqīnī*), and
their truth-values are mind-independent. In other words, regarding
mathematics, judgment-realism can still be defended even when
object-realism is rejected (Fazlıoğlu 2014; Hasan 2017).

Another important issue pertinent to the ontology of mathematics is
the nature of algebraic objects. An algebraic unknown (or, an
algebraic variable, as we call it today) can indifferently refer to
either a number or a geometrical magnitude. So, the nature of an
algebraic object is not the same as either numbers or geometrical
shapes. Unfortunately, the hybrid ontology of this special type of
mathematical objects has rarely (if at all) been discussed as an
ontology different from those of numbers and magnitudes. But it has
been argued that the familiarity of philosophers such as
al-Fārābī and Avicenna with the algebraic theory put
forward by al-Khwārizmī (d. 850) in his *Kitāb
al-jabr wa al-muqābala* inspired them to develop a general
ontology of things (*ashyāʾ*) that is neither
Platonic nor Aristotelian (R. Rashed 1984a; 2008; 2015: 716–18;
2018).

### 1.3 Infinity

The problem of infinity is one of the philosophical topics relating to
mathematics that was most extensively discussed in medieval Islamic
philosophy. There are many treatises which argue that no number can be
infinite. For instance, in response to a series of questions raised by
Abū Mūsā ʿĪsā Ibn Usayyid, Thābit
Ibn Qurra discusses the nature of numbers and argues that there is no
infinite number. Moreover, he shows that the infinite sets of numbers
can be of different sizes (Pines 1968; Sabra 1997; Mancosu 2009: sec.
2; M. Rashed 2009; Zarepour 2020b: sec. 4.2). Yaḥyā Ibn
ʿAdī (d. 974), in his *Treatise on the Infinite*
(*Maqala fī ghayr al-mutanāhī*), provides a
different set of arguments to establish that infinity is not
predicable upon numbers (McGinnis 2010: sec. 3). But the following
three arguments for finitism are probably the most discussed in the
Islamic tradition:

(1) *The Collimation Argument* (*burhān
al-musāmita*): Consider the line \(L\) which
begins from the center \(O\) of a circle \(C\),
intersects the circumference of \(C\),
and extends infinitely. Suppose, moreover, that
there is a distinct line \(L'\) that is parallel to \(L\)
and infinitely extended in both directions. Now
suppose that \(L\) starts to rotate around \(O\)
and gets closer to \(L'\), while \(L'\) is motionless
and fixed. As a result, \(L\) and \(L'\) intersect. So,
there is a time at which the two lines are parallel and there is a
time at which they are intersected. Therefore, there must be a moment
of time \(T\) and a point \(P\) on
\(L'\) at which the two lines intersect each other for the first time,
or so the argument goes. But obviously there are no such \(T\)
and \(P\). For every \(T\)
in which \(L\) and \(L'\) are
intersected, we can find an earlier moment of time \(T'\) (i.e.,
\(T' < T\)) in which the two lines were
already intersected. So, it seems that we have a contradiction. On the
one hand, there must be a first moment of intersection (or such is the
expectation of the defenders of the argument). On the other hand,
there cannot be such a moment. Therefore, the initial assumption of
the argument—that is the existence of infinite lines—must
be rejected. There is no infinite one-dimensional magnitude and,
consequently, no infinite magnitudes in general.

Figure 1

A variation of the above scenario—that likely originated from
Aristotle’s *De Caelo* (I.5, 272a8–20)—was
proposed by Abū Sahl al-Qūhī (d. 1000) to reject the
Aristotelian dogma that an infinite distance cannot be traversed in a
finite time. This is because the above argument shows that \(L\)
can traverse \(L'\) in a finite period of time equal
to half the time of the rotation of \(L\) around *O
*for one round (R. Rashed 1999; McGinnis 2010: sec. 3). By
contrast, Avicenna employs the Collimation Argument in certain places
(Avicenna *Al-Najāt* [1985: 233–44]; [Ph1]: chap.
II.8, [8]) to reject the possibility of circular motion in an infinite
void and in other places (Avicenna *ʿUyūn
al-ḥikma*, chap. 3, 20) to reject the actual infinitude of
magnitudes (Zarepour 2020b: sec. 3.1; R. Rashed 2016: 302–6;
2018: sec. 11.2). The Collimation Argument is criticized by, among
others, Abū al-Barakāt al-Baghdādī (d. 1165) in
his *Al-Muʿtabar* (vol. 2, 83–84 and 86),
al-Ṭūsī in his *Talkhīṣ
al-Muḥassal* ([1985: 217]), and al-Ḥillī (d.
1325) in his *Nihāya al-marām fī ʿilm
al-kalām* (vol. 1, 256–258). The argument is also
defended by, among others, Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (d.
1209) in his *Al-Mabāḥith al-mashriqīya* (vol.
1, 196) and Mullā Ṣadrā in his *Asfār*
(vol. 4, 21–23).

(2) *The Ladder Argument* (*burhān al-sullam*): If
infinite lines can exist, then there can be an acute angle whose sides
are infinite. Suppose that \(AB\) and \(AC\) are two infinite lines
which intersect at \(A\) and make such an acute angle.
\(AB\) and \(AC\) extend infinitely in the directions of \(B\)
and \(C\), respectively. Now consider
parallel lines \(B_{i} C_{i}\) (for integers \(i ≥1\)) which
intersects \(AB\) and \(AC\) so that the distance between every two
consecutive lines is equal to the distance of \(B_{1} C_{1}\) from \(A\).
Thus, each line is longer than the previous line by
a fixed length, say \(d\) (i.e., for every integer
\(i≥1,\) \(B_{i+1} C_{i+1} - B_{i}C_{i} = d\)). Now consider
\(BC\). It is farther than any \(B_{i}C_{i}\) from \(A\).
Thus, \(BC\) is longer than any \(B_{i}C_{i}.\) This
indicates that \(BC\) must be actually infinite. However, \(BC\) is
confined between two lines (i.e., \(AB\) and \(AC\)). It terminates at
\(B\) and \(C\). Therefore, it must be
finite as well. Accordingly, \(BC\) must be both finite and infinite.
This is impossible. So, the initial assumption we build the argument
upon is false. No infinite line (and, *a fortiori*, no infinite
magnitude) can exist (R. Rashed 2016; 2018: sec. 11.2; Zarepour 2020b:
sec. 3.2).

Figure 2

The Ladder Argument is a rehabilitation of an Aristotelian argument
presented in *De Caelo* (I.5, 271b26–272a7). Avicenna
discusses this argument in the *Physics of “The
Healing”* (Avicenna [Ph2]: chap. III.8, [7]). The argument
has been the subject of a long-standing debate in post-Avicennian
philosophy (McGinnis 2018). The argument was criticized by, among
others, Abū al-Barakāt in his *Al-Muʿtabar*
(vol. 2, 84–86) and Najm al-Dīn al-Kātibī
al-Qazwīnī (d. 1277) in his *Ḥikma
al-ʿayn* ([2002: 38–39]). On the other hand, defenses
of the Ladder Argument can be found in, among others,
al-Ṭūsī’s commentary on Avicenna’s
*Pointers and Reminders* (in Avicenna [Pointers]: namaṭ
I, 183–191) and Mullā Ṣadrā’s commentary
on al-Abharī’s *Hidāya* (*Sharḥ
Al-Hidāya al-Athīrīya*, 65–69).

(3) *The Mapping Argument* (*burhān
al-taṭābuq or al-taṭbīq*): Consider an
actually infinite line \(AC\) which starts from \(A\)
and extends infinitely in the direction of \(C\).
Remove a finite segment \(AB\) from the beginning of \(AC\). Suppose
that \(B^{*}C^{*}\) is a copy of (and, accordingly, of the same length
as) \(BC\). Compare the size of \(B^{*}C^{*}\) with \(AC\) by mapping
the former upon the latter so that the two lines are parallel and
\(B^{*}\) is right in front of \(A\). \(B^{*}C^{*}\)
must extend infinitely in the direction of \(C^{*}\). Otherwise,
\(B^{*}C^{*}\) would be finite. This means that \(BC\) would be finite
too. As a result, \(AC\)—which is the sum of \(BC\) with the
finite segment \(AB\)—would be finite. Since this contradicts
the initial assumption that \(AC\) is actually infinite,
\(B^{*}C^{*}\) must extend infinitely in the direction of \(C^{*}\).
But if so, then \(B^{*}C^{*}\) and \(AC\) correspond to each other, in
the sense that no part of one of them remains uncovered by the other.
So, based on the fourth common notion of the first book of
Euclid’s *Elements*—according to which things which
correspond to one another are equal to one another ([1908: vol. 1,
155])—we can conclude that \(AC\) is equal to \(B^{*}C^{*}\).
This indicates that \(AC\) would also be equal to \(BC\), which is a
proper part of \(AB\). However, the fifth Euclidean common notion
states that such a whole-part equality is absurd ([1908: vol. 1,
155]). Therefore, \(AC\) cannot be equal to \(BC\). Consequently, the
initial assumption that \(AC\) can be an actually infinite line must
be rejected. There can be no such actually infinite magnitude.

Figure 3

Earlier versions of the Mapping Argument can be found in different places of al-Kindī’s oeuvre (Rescher & Khatchadourian 1965; Shamsi 1975; Adamson 2007: chap. 4; Zarepour 2020b: n. 52). More precise versions of this argument are presented by Avicenna (Marmura 1960; McGinnis 2010: sec. 4; Zarepour 2020b). The strength and accuracy of the versions of the argument these thinkers provide depend, partially at least, on the precision of their construal of the notion of equality of geometric magnitudes. It has been shown that some of Muslim thinkers have pretty detailed accounts of this notion (R. Rashed 2019).

Like the other two arguments, the primary goal of the Mapping Argument
is to show that no infinite continuous magnitude actually exists.
Having read Euclid’s *Elements* (bks 7–9), Muslim
thinkers knew that numbers could be easily represented by magnitudes.
Therefore, any argument for the impossibility of infinite magnitudes
can be taken as an argument against the infinity of numbers. But how
about infinite collections? None of the three arguments is directly
applicable to infinite collections of discrete entities. Nevertheless,
it has been argued that Avicenna was likely aware that the Mapping
Argument could be modified so that it is applicable to infinite
collections of discrete numbered things (Zarepour 2020b: sec. 4). The
sizes of two collections of discrete entities can be compared by
employing the very notion of ‘mapping’ that we previously
used in the case of continuous magnitudes. However, in the case of the
collections of discrete entities, this notion must be cashed out in
terms of one-to-one correspondence between the elements of the two
collections in question. Two collections of discrete entities
correspond to each other if every member of one collection can be
paired with one (and only one) member of the other so that no member
of any of these collections remains unpaired. Avicenna seems to have
been aware that an infinite collection of discrete entities can be put
in one-to-one correspondence with some of its proper subcollections.
And he finds this as absurd as the correspondence of an infinite
magnitude with its proper submagnitude. He explicitly mentions that
the Mapping Argument can rule out the possibilities of both infinite
magnitudes and infinite collections of discrete entities (e.g.,
numbers and numbered things). However, he does not himself make it
explicit how this argument actually works in the case of discrete
things. He does not provide any concrete example of the application of
the Mapping Argument to the case of the infinite collections of
objects. Such an example can be found in the works of post-Avicennian
philosophers like Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (*Sharḥ
ʿUyun al-ḥikma, al-Ṭabīʿīyāt*
[1994: 53]). Al-Ghazālī (d. 1111) has mentioned the Mapping
Argument in his *Maqāṣid* ([2000: 97–98]) and
the earliest transmission of this argument to the Latin tradition is
probably through the Latin translation of *Maqāṣid*
in the third quarter of the twelfth century.

These arguments are usually discussed in the context of physics. This
is because they are devised in the first place to show that no
infinite can actually exist in the physical world. But if, endorsing
literalism, we consider mathematical objects as properties of physical
objects, then the impossibility of the existence of actual infinites
in the physical world implies the impossibility of infinitely extended
geometric lines and infinite sets of numbers. But those who reject
literalism about the ontology of mathematics have different views
regarding the applicability of such arguments to mathematical objects.
For instance, Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī believes that the
Mapping Argument cannot reject the infinitude of the collection of
natural numbers because he renders mathematical objects as
mind-dependent and fully immaterial entities (*Sharḥ
ʿUyun al-ḥikma, al-Ṭabīʿīyāt*
[1994: 53–57]). Although we can appeal to the Mapping Argument
to reject the existence of an infinite collection of distinct physical
objects in the extramental world, this argument cannot reject the
existence of an infinite number of mind-dependent objects like
numbers, or so al-Rāzī seems to believe (Zarepour 2020b:
4.1).

Interestingly, some Muslim philosophers have argued that even the mind has its own limitations in terms of perceiving infinite things. For instance, Ibn al-Haytham believes that although we can imagine finite lines of any arbitrary length (i.e., regardless of how long they are), we cannot imagine an actually infinite line. Accordingly, although we can imagine a finite line longer than the size of the universe, we cannot conceive an actually infinite line. Ibn al-Haytham contends that actual infinities do not exist either in the extramental world or even in the mind (Masoumi Hamedani 2013; Ighbariah & Wagner 2018: 80).

### 1.4 Continuity

The views of Muslim thinkers regarding mathematical continuum are intertwined with the position they uphold in the debate between atomism and hylomorphism about the nature of the physical world. For Avicenna there is no gap between the physical world and the realm of mathematical objects. This is so at least if we accept interpretations of Avicenna as a literalist regarding the ontology of mathematics. He believes that geometrical magnitudes are continuous in the sense that they have no actual part. Correspondingly, physical dimensions are continuous and have no actual parts. We can of course divide any continuous magnitude into smaller parts. In the physical world, there is a practical lower limit for the length of the physical dimensions which can in practice be broken down into smaller magnitudes. By contrast, in our faculty of estimation, this limit disappears, and all magnitudes are potentially infinitely divisible. Despite this practical difference, theoretically speaking, there is no difference between the structure of geometrical lines and physical dimensions. As a result, geometrical continuity implies that physical atomism is false. Indeed, Avicenna appeals to mathematical continuity to reject physical atomism (Avicenna [Ph2]: chap. III.3–5; Lettinck 1999; Dhanani 2015; McGinnis 2019: sec. 3).

In contrast with Avicenna, there are philosophers who endorse
mathematical continuity and physical atomism simultaneously. For
instance, Shahrastānī (d. 1153) insists that the judgment of
the faculty of estimation is not reliable enough to convince us that
the physical magnitudes can bear potentially infinite divisions. He
believes that physical magnitudes are not infinitely divisible. The
number of their parts, either actual or even potential, is finite.
Shahrastānī reminds us that although the size of the
universe is imaginable to be infinite, philosophers usually reject
that the universe is infinite. Relying on a similar approach,
Shahrastānī contends that although every magnitude is
imaginable as infinitely divisible, there are strong arguments which
show that the faculty of estimation is mistaken in this case and no
physical magnitudes are infinitely divisible. Infinite extendibility
of the size of the universe in the estimation is compatible with the
universe being finite. Similarly, infinite divisibility of magnitudes
in the estimation could be compatible with their having only a finite
number of (potential) parts in the extramental world, or so
Shahrastānī seems to believe (al-Shahrastānī
*Summa philosophiae*, 513; McGinnis 2019). This means that if
we take mathematical objects as merely estimative constructions, then
we can reconcile purely mathematical continuity with physical
atomism.

Proposing a subtle modification, Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī
(*Al-Manṭiq*, vol. 6, chapter 6, 63) argues against
Democritus that everything that is divisible in imagination is
divisible in the extramental world. He believes that there is a lower
limit to the length of divisible magnitudes that we can imagine. It is
not true that every magnitude, no matter how small, is divisible in
the estimation. He does not reject that in Euclidean geometry
magnitudes are infinitely divisible. But he seems not to accept that
it is possible to make a visual image (through the faculty of
estimation) of every magnitude we can talk about in the context of
Euclidean geometry. Embracing physical atomism (in his later works),
al-Rāzī denies that continuous Euclidean geometry can
represent the real structure of the extramental world (Setia 2006;
Eftekhari 2018; 2019). The claim that continuity has no reality other
than in the faculty of estimation is often restated in the works of
the later atomists like ʿAḍūd al-Dīn
al-ʾĪjī (d. 1355) (Hasan 2017: 233–35).

## 2. Epistemology of Mathematics

### 2.1 Grasping Mathematical Concepts

Most Muslim thinkers who have talked about the epistemology of
mathematical concepts believe that these concepts are formed through
some cognitive mechanisms whose first input is the data we receive
through our external senses. The details of such mechanisms are
spelled out in different ways by different philosophers, depending on
their general picture of human cognitive psychology. For instance,
Avicenna puts forward a thought experiment showing that no
mathematical concepts can be grasped in the absence of sense
perception (Avicenna [MPh], chap. VII.3, sec. 1; Zarepour 2019: sec.
5; 2021, sec. 3). This indicates that Avicenna endorses some sort of
concept empiricism about mathematics. On the literalist interpretation
of Avicenna’s ontology of mathematics, mathematical objects
exist in the sensible world as non-sensible connotational attributes
(*maʿānī*) of physical objects. Like all other
connotational attributes, mathematical entities are perceived by the
faculty of estimation. For instance, it is the faculty of estimation
which perceives two-ness when we see two books. In such an experience,
the sensible data collected by the external senses would be
transferred to the faculty of estimation through the mediation of the
faculty of common sense (*ḥiss mushtarak*). Estimation
enables us to overlook all other characteristics of the experience we
have had and to perceive two-ness that is not directly accessible to
our external senses.

Even on the literalist account of the ontology of mathematics, there
are still many mathematical entities with which mathematicians might
engage but which do not exist in the extramental world (e.g., a
complex and extraordinary geometrical shape with no counterpart in the
sensible world). Avicenna believes that the faculty of imagination
(*mutakhayyila*) can construct mental images of such objects by
analyzing, synthesizing, separating, and combining the images of
simpler items that have previously been perceived by and stored in our
cognitive faculties (Zarepour 2021: sec. 3). But if we endorse the
abstractionist construal of Avicenna’s ontology of mathematics,
then *all* mathematical objects are mental constructions. There
exists no mathematical object in the extramental world which could
directly be perceived by the estimation. On this interpretation, the
faculty of estimation cooperates with the faculty of imagination to
produce idealized objects, none of which has a counterpart outside our
minds. It is the mental acts conducted by these faculties which enable
us to construct geometric shapes and numbers (Ardeshir 2008; Tahiri
2016; 2018).

In any case, since estimation is a bodily faculty, it cannot engage
with fully immaterial things. So, it perceives mathematical entities
as things associated with matter (though not with specific species of
it). The objects of estimation are not intelligible universal
concepts. So, the cognitive process of grasping mathematical concepts
must be completed by adding the Active Intellect to our story
(Zarepour 2021). On one reading of Avicenna’s epistemology
(Nuseibeh 1989; Davidson 1992: chap. 4; Goodman 1992 [2006]; Black
2014), the act of the faculty of estimation prepares our soul to
receive the universal concepts that will be *emanated* by the
Active Intellect. On another account of Avicenna’s epistemology
(Hasse 2001; Gutas 2012), the Active Intellect is merely a reservoir
of intelligible concepts to which we find access because of the
preparatory and ineliminable function of the internal faculties. In
sum, the acquisition of mathematical concepts is a process that begins
with sense perception and ends with the function of the Active
Intellect. And between these two stages, the operation of the internal
faculties in general and the faculties of estimation and imagination
in particular is necessary and inescapable.

Very similar, though much less sophisticated, pictures of the
procedure of grasping mathematical concepts are presented in the works
of Avicenna’s contemporary scientists. For example, Ibn
al-Haytham talks about only two faculties: imagination
(*takhayyula*) and distinction (*tamyīz*).
Imagination is the faculty which constructs idealized mathematical
objects according to the impressions that are left to us through our
sense perceptions. For instance, imagination enables us to abstract
geometrical magnitudes from the sensible bodies we see in the external
world. However, the transition from the images of mathematical objects
to mathematical concepts is something that must be carried out by the
faculty of distinction. This faculty plays a twofold role. On the one
hand, it contributes to analyzing, synthesizing, separating, and
combining previously perceived (or produced images). This role is
assigned to *mutakhayyila* in Avicenna’s psychology. On
the other hand, the faculty of distinction is a replacement of the
Active Intellect. In Ibn al-Haytham’s philosophy, the final step
of the conceptualization is carried out by the faculty of distinction.
It has been argued that the Active Intellect and the divine light do
not play any significant role in Ibn al-Haytham’s theory of
knowledge (Ighbariah & Wagner 2018).

Developing an account more or less similar to that of Avicenna,
al-Bīrūnī accepts that some mathematical entities like
lines and points exist in the physical world but they cannot be
grasped by our external senses. Nevertheless, the data we receive
through our sense experiences enable us to perceive these objects
and/or to produce idealized constructions that do not exist in the
extramental world (Samian 2011). However, he does not seem to have a
clear picture of cognitive psychology in which the roles of different
faculties are explicitly distinguished. That is why he wavers between
two pictures, in one of which estimation (*wahm*) is the first
faculty to apprehend mathematical objects, while in the other, this
role must be played by intellect (*ʿaql*). On the latter
view, nothing below the level of the intellect can perceive
mathematical objects. Al-Bīrūnī’s hesitation
between the two rival views becomes more apparent especially when we
accept that both the Persian and Arabic versions of *Kitāb
al-tafhīm* are written by himself. For instance, in the
Arabic version, he claims that points cannot be conceived by any
faculty other than the intellect (al-Bīrūnī [Astro]:
3). By contrast, in the Persian version, he attributes this role to
estimation (al-Bīrūnī [Instr]: 7). He does not seem to
consider any clear boundary between the intelligible
(*maʿqūl*) and the estimative
(*mawhūm*).

In the context of the theories of *nafs al-ʾamr* proposed
by later Muslim thinkers, external senses, estimation, and intellect
all cooperate with each other to give us a conception of mathematical
entities as they are in *nafs al-ʾamr*. However, the
process through which we can have access to and know about the realm
of *nafs al-ʾamr* is by no means less mysterious than the
role of the Active Intellect in Avicenna’s philosophy.

### 2.2 Epistemological States of the Principles of Mathematics

Every proposition is an ordered structure constituted from concepts.
But to know a proposition, it does not suffice just to know its
conceptual components. We also need to take some further steps.
Following Aristotle and Euclid, most (if not all) Muslim philosophers
believe in foundationalist/axiomatic accounts of epistemology,
according to which all instances of knowledge are eventually built
upon the foundations (*mabādi’*) of basic concepts
and propositions which can be known directly and immediately.
Non-basic concepts and propositions can be derived from basic ones by
definitions (*taʿārīf* or
*ḥudūd*) and syllogisms
(*qiyāsāt*), respectively. This means that after
acquiring the conceptual components of a proposition *P* we
still need to take the following three steps:

- ordering and combining the acquired concepts to form
*P*as a structured unity, - assenting to the truth (
*taṣdīq*) of foundational propositions, and - establishing the truth of
*P*with some syllogisms from the foundational propositions.

For Avicenna, the faculty of imagination plays crucial roles in steps (1) and (3). Imagination enables us to arrive at meaningful propositions by exploring our storage of previously grasped concepts and combining them to make various ordered structures of concepts (and to examine whether or not they form a meaningful proposition). Moreover, imagination enables us to consider combinations of propositions in order to find the suitable (series of consecutive) syllogism(s) which can lead us to the desired proposition. The most crucial part of this process is to find suitable middle terms for the syllogisms which can lead us to the desired conclusion. In Avicenna’s philosophy, the faculty of imagination undertakes this search operation. An immediate question regarding this view is how imagination, as a bodily faculty, can entertain universal concepts that are supposed to be fully immaterial intelligible entities. Various possible answers to this question are investigated by, among others, Gutas (2001), Adamson (2004), and Black (2013). In Ibn al-Haytham’s philosophy, this is the faculty of distinction that plays the central role regarding (1) and (3). (More on (3) will be said in the next section).

Things get more complicated when we turn to
(2).
Following the ancient Greek tradition, Muslim philosophers categorize
the foundational principles of the demonstrative sciences into three
groups: common notions/axioms (*al-uṣūl
al-mutaʿārafa*), hypotheses (*al-uṣūl
al-mawḍūʿa*), and postulates
(*muṣādarāt*). Roughly speaking, common notions
are the most obvious propositions that we can know—the first
principles that we grasp. Hypotheses and postulates are not as obvious
as axioms. They in principle need to be proved. These two groups of
principles are usually distinguished based on the epistemic attitude
of the student who is learning them. Hypotheses are the foundational
principles that seem plausible to the student even though she has no
proof for them. By contrast, postulates seem dubious to the student,
in the sense that she might have some feelings and ideas against the
plausibility of these principles. The most often repeated example of
postulates in the works of medieval Muslim thinkers is probably the
parallel postulate of Euclidean geometry. This classification is
defended by, among others, al-Nayrīzī (d. 922; in Besthorn
& Heiberg 1893: 14–26), al-Fārābi
(*Al-Manṭiq*, chaps. 87–90), Avicenna
(*al-Burhān*, chap. I.12), and al-Ṭūsī
(*Asās al-ʾiqtibās*, chap. V.1.15).

Since mathematical hypotheses and postulates must eventually be proved
based on previously known propositions, it seems that the epistemic
status of mathematical propositions depends, in the end, on how we
grasp the most obvious of these principles. In other words, it seems
that all mathematical propositions can be derived from axioms through
the fully *a priori* (= sense-experience-independent) mechanism
of demonstrative syllogism.

Muslim thinkers have no consensus regarding the epistemic status of
the principles of mathematics and the cognitive mechanisms through
which we assent to the truth of these principles. For example, it can
be shown that, according to Avicenna, every basic proposition of
mathematics is included in either *awwalīyāt*
(primary data) or *fiṭrīyāt* (or, more
completely, *muqaddamāt fiṭrīyāt
al-qiyās*, which is translated to ‘data with built-in
syllogisms’ by Gutas (2012)). ‘The whole is greater than
the part’ and ‘four is even’ are two of the most
famous examples, respectively, of *awwalīyāt* and
*fiṭrīyāt*. According to Avicenna,
*awwalīyāt* have no middle terms and, therefore, no
syllogism can be made to demonstrate them. They are too basic and
obvious to need a proof (or to be provable at all). As soon as we
grasp all the concepts from which an *awwalī* proposition
is constituted, we immediately assent to the truth of that
proposition. These propositions are self-evident and necessary. No one
can have a rational doubt about them. Unlike
*awwalīyāt*, *fiṭrīyāt* have
middle terms and must be proved. However, the syllogism through which
a *fiṭrī* proposition must be established is so
simple that as soon as the minor term (i.e., subject) and the major
term (i.e., predicate) are grasped, the middle term appears in the
mind and the truth of that proposition is assented to. For example,
immediately after grasping the concepts four
and even, the concept divisible-by-two
appears in our mind and we can
affirm the fact that ‘(every) four is even’ through the
following syllogism (Mousavian & Ardeshir 2018):

(Every) four is divisible by two.

(Every) divisible by two is even.

Therefore:

(Every) four is even.

The truths of both *awwalīyāt* and
*fiṭrīyāt* are assented to through the natural
operation (*fiṭra*) of the intellect. So, after grasping
the conceptual components of them, we can grasp these propositions
without appealing to the data we receive from our sense experiences.
These propositions are constituted from *non-a priori*
concepts. But after we grasp the conceptual components of them, these
propositions can be justified through *a priori* mechanisms. We
should be cautious, however, that *a priority* does not entail
innateness in the sense of being given at birth. Avicenna rejects that
we possess any instance of propositional knowledge at birth. (For
different views regarding the epistemic status of the Avicennian
*awwalīyāt* and *fiṭrīyāt*,
see Zarepour 2020a; 2020c; Gutas 2020.)

More or less similar accounts of the basic propositions of mathematics
can be found in philosophers like al-Fārābi and
al-Ṭūsī. However, both some of Avicenna’s
contemporaries and some post-Avicennian thinkers took a more empirical
and/or more skeptical approach to the truth of mathematical
propositions. For example, in his first commentary on Euclid’s
*Elements*, *Sharḥ musạ̄darāt*,
Ibn al-Haytham follows the mainstream view that basic propositions of
mathematics are self-evident, necessary, and rationally indubitable.
But, in his second commentary, *Ḥall shukūk*
([Doubts]), he endorses a more empirical position and argues that we
acquire these instances of knowledge by facing frequent use of them in
daily life. Consider, for example, the common notion ‘things
which correspond with one another are equal to one another’. Ibn
al-Haytham says that we accept this proposition because we have
repeatedly seen that when a body is mapped or superposed upon another
body and the lengths of them do not exceed each other, our intellect
(*ʿaql*) judges that these bodies (or, more precisely,
their lengths) are equal. Without having such experiences, we could
not come to assent to the truth of this axiom. Therefore, our
knowledge of such axioms is somewhat sense-experience-dependent (Ibn
al-Haytham [Doubts]: 31; R. Rashed 2019).

In his *Optics* (Sabra 1989), Ibn al-Haytham puts forward an
interesting treatment of the principle ‘the whole is greater
than the part’, which has striking similarities with
Avicenna’s treatment of *fiṭrīyāt.* He
argues that this principle can be proved through the following
argument:

The whole exceeds the part.

Everything which exceeds something else is greater than it.

Therefore:

The whole is greater than the part.

The premises themselves of this argument must be justified through the
operation of the intellect or the faculty of distinction (to use Ibn
al-Haytham’s own terminology) upon the data we receive through
our senses (Sabra 1989: vol. I, 133–34; Ighbariah & Wagner
2018). The traces of these attitudes towards the axioms and common
notions can be found in the works of Fakhr al-Dīn
al-Rāzī and some of later *mutikallimūn*
(Morrison 2014: 220–22; Hasan 2017: sec. 2.4.2; Ighbariah and
Wagner 2018: 66–68).

### 2.3 *Ars Analytica* and *Ars Inveniendi*

It is worth mentioning that Muslim thinkers have also developed interesting theories of how we can arrive at the unknown propositions of mathematics from the known ones. In other words, they have offered detailed accounts of how step (3)—introduced in the previous section—can be taken in the context of mathematics in general and geometry in particular. A central question in this context was if and how (and to what extent) what is going on in the mind of a mathematician when she discovers (or invents) a mathematical truth corresponds to what she presents as the proof of this discovery (or invention) on paper. In particular, it was important for Muslim thinkers to know whether or not the order of the steps a mathematician takes to discover a mathematical truth is identical to the order of different stages of the justifications she provides for that truth.

One of the earliest attempts in this context is Thābit Ibn
Qurra’s theory of the psychology of mathematical invention.
However, it was probably his grandson, Ibrāhīm Ibn
Sinān (d. 946), who established an independent area of studies
pertinent to the aforementioned questions in his *On the Method of
Analysis and Synthesis in the Problems of Geometry* (R. Rashed
& Bellosta 2000: chap. I). He categorizes geometrical problems
into different groups based on different criteria and, providing
concrete examples, explains how each group of problems must be
analyzed (*taḥlīl*) and how a solution for them can
be synthesized (*tarkīb*). He highlights the possible
errors and mistakes that one might make in the process of analysis and
synthesis and elaborates how they can be avoided. The next important
figure in this area is al-Sijzī (d. ~1020), who wrote a book
(*Geometrical Treatise on Problem Solving*) on different
methods which can facilitate the procedure of problem solving in
geometry. But the most mature work among these kinds of studies is
perhaps Ibn al-Haytham’s *Fī al-taḥlīl wa
al-tarkīb* (*On Analysis and Synthesis*; R. Rashed
2006 [2017: 219–304]). An interesting issue discussed in this
area of philosophy of mathematics was the nature of undecidable
problems; claims for whose truth or falsity we have no proof. This
issue was discussed in particular by al-Samawʾal (d. 1180) in the
context of the classification of geometrical problems in his
*al-Bāhir fī al-jabr*. His classification project can
be understood as a succession to that of Ibn Sinān (R. Rashed
1984b [1994: 41–43]; 2008: sec. 3; 2015: 726–32).

### 2.4 Applicability and Reliability of Mathematics

If we take mathematical objects as pure mental or estimative
(*mawhūm*) objects that are constructed by the mechanism
of abstraction and have no extramental reality, then it is hardly
justifiable that mathematics and/or mathematical models on their own
can give us reliable knowledge of the extramental world. It should
come as no surprise that those who endorse a non-Platonic,
non-literalist account of the ontology of mathematics will find this
science less certain and perhaps less valuable than sciences like
physics and metaphysics. That is why some contemporary scholars, who
have read Avicenna as defending a purely abstractionist account of the
ontology of mathematics, argue that for him, mathematics is less
useful and inferior to the other two sciences (Hasan 2017:
225–26; Fazlıoğlu 2014: 11–13). This rendition
of Avicenna’s view is of course problematic if we take him as a
literalist regarding the nature of mathematical objects. Motivated by
similar concerns, Averroes believes that the fact that the realm of
mathematical objects is detached from the extramental reality makes
mathematics play a less significant role in human perfection than
physics and metaphysics (Endress 2003: 150).

Doubts about the capability of mathematics to represent the extramental world accurately are even more prevalent among atomists (Dhanani 1994: 101–40; Pines 1936 [1997: 110]). For instance, endorsing physical atomism in his later works, Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī believes that since magnitudes are supposed to be continuous in Euclidean geometry, this science cannot present an accurate picture of the discontinuous atomistic world (Setia 2006: 126–28).

In his *Al-Mawāqif*, al-ʾĪjī challenges the
reliability of mathematical sciences due to their engagement with
estimative entities that are frailer (*awhan*) than a
spider’s web. This analogy refers to the Quran 29:41
(Fazlıoğlu 2014: 6–7). A similarly skeptical view of
mathematics is defended by Shams al-Dīn Muḥammad
al-Bukhārī (d. 1429) in his commentary on
al-Kātibī al-Qazwīnī’s *Ḥikma
al-ʿayn*. Like many of his predecessors, al-Bukhārī
contends that, compared to physics and metaphysics, mathematics is a
less reliable source of knowledge regarding the concretely existing
things. It is in response to such views that al-Jurjānī
appeals to the machinery of *nafs al-ʾamr* to defend the
reliability of mathematics. He accepts that mathematical objects are
estimative and imaginary. But he believes that they are imagined
correctly and in accordance with the extramental reality. In this
respect, they are entirely different from fictional entities, like
*ruby mountains* or *two-headed men*, which do not
reflect anything in the extramental reality (Hasan 2017: 7). Although
mathematics originates from estimation, it can still express
significant truths about things as they are in *nafs
al-ʾamr*. He therefore believes that the judgment of
estimation can in principle conform to that of intellect; particularly
in the context of mathematics where the products of estimation are
constructed in accordance with what we perceive from the extramental
world through our senses. Although mathematical objects are estimative
entities, they are not the outcome of a fanciful imagination which has
no connection to reality, or so al-Jurjānī seems to believe
(Fazlıoğlu 2014; Hasan 2017). The theory of *nafs
al-ʾamr* was, among other things, the most promising attempt
by Muslim thinkers to reconcile an anti-realist account of the
ontology of mathematics with a realist account of mathematical truths.
This theory is intended to provide an explanation of how mathematics,
as the study of purely estimative entities, can be useful in the study
of the physical world. Unfortunately, the extent of the success of
this project has not been comprehensively studied yet.

## 3. Conclusion

What is presented here is just a brief report of the interesting philosophical views that medieval Muslim thinkers developed about mathematics. It is by no means exhaustive. Many aspects of the views I discussed here have not yet been studied in the secondary literature. It is no exaggeration to say that the philosophy of mathematics of many Muslim philosophers has not been sufficiently addressed by contemporary historians of philosophy. But I hope that the things brought together in this entry have shown that the Islamic tradition is a rich resource for innovative ideas and theories pertinent to the philosophy of mathematics (and not—as is usually thought—only to the technical aspects of mathematics).

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