#### Supplement to Chaos

## Chaos Definition Counterexamples

All definitions discussed in the main text (§1.3) are based on the study of dynamical systems. Nevertheless, it isn’t difficult to find mathematical models that present counterexamples to every definition surveyed.

Begin with an example illustrating why WSD is insufficient to characterize chaos. Consider a two-dimensional dynamical system with a disc of radius \(\epsilon\) about the origin removed from the plane. Define a twist

\[\begin{aligned} {dx} \over {dt} &= -ry, \\ {dy} \over {dt} &= rx, \end{aligned}\]where \(r = \sqrt{x^2 + y^2}\) and \(x^2 + y^2 > \epsilon^2\). Neighboring solutions for this system rotate about the origin at different angular velocities and, on each invariant circle, every orbit forms an almost periodic sequence (ensuring that the time series generated for each solution of the dynamical system is almost periodic). This system exhibits WSD but has no positive global Lyapunov exponents nor any exponential growth of uncertainties. Hence, WSD fails to capture chaotic dynamics.

One motivation for the chaos hierarchy is that that definitions such as Chaos\(_{d}\), SD, Chaos\(_{te}\) or Chaos\(_{\lambda}\) can be mapped onto the ergodic hierarchy (Appendix: The Chaotic Hierarchy). Nonetheless, these candidate definitions run into problems from counterexamples. For instance, consider a discrete dynamical system with \(S = [0, \infty)\), the absolute value as a metric (i.e., as the function defining distance between two points) on \(\mathbf{R}\), and a mapping \(f: [(0, \infty) \rightarrow [0,\infty)\), \(f(x) = \alpha x\), where \(\alpha \gt 1\). In this dynamical system, all neighboring trajectories diverge exponentially fast, yet note that the forward-time autocorrelation function of \(f(x)\), a measure of the correlation of future states with past states, is one, meaning that past states are perfectly correlated with future states and, as expected for a linear relationship, there is no randomness in the system. Or consider the simple linear differential equation \(dx/dt = x\), whose solution is \(x = x_0 e^t\). The presence of a positive global Lyapunov exponent is insufficient to uniquely identify chaos.

Furthermore, all trajectories accelerate off to infinity for these latter two cases. In contrast, chaotic dynamics is usually characterized as being confined to some attractor a strange attractor (§5.1) in the case of dissipative systems, the energy surface in the case of Hamiltonian systems. This confinement need not be due to physical walls of some container. If, in the case of Hamiltonian chaos, the dynamics is confined to an energy surface (e.g., by the action of gravity), this surface could be spatially unbounded. Thus, at the very least some additional conditions are needed (e.g., that guarantee trajectories in state space are dense and confined), raising questions about whether additional conditions are needed for definitions such as SD, Chaos\(_{te}\) or Chaos\(_{\lambda}\). On the other hand, a well-studied example of a chaos, the Hénon system (conventionally called a map rather than a flow because it is a discrete system), while measure preserving, is unbounded. Perhaps the usual restriction of chaos definitions to bounded systems needs qualification.

Yet, even with the restriction to bounded systems, the presence of a positive global Lyapunov exponent is insufficient to define chaos. Consider the dynamical system

\[ \begin{aligned} {dx} \over {dt} &= -2ryt,\\ {dy} \over {dt} &= 2rxt, \end{aligned}\]where \(r = \sqrt{x^2 + y^2}\) and as before a disk of radius \(\epsilon\) about the origin is removed. The general solution of this dynamical system is

\[\begin{aligned} x(t) &= x_0 \cos(u) - y_0 \sin(u), \\ y(t) &= y_o \cos(u) + x_0 \sin(u), \end{aligned}\]where \(u = r_0(t^2 - 1)\)and angular frequency \(r_0 = \sqrt{x_0^2 + y_0^2}\). Considering the angular frequency, the arguments of the sine and cosine functions are equal to \(r_0(t^2 - 1) \text{mod} (2\pi)\) which, when divided by \(2\pi\) and sampled at equally spaced intervals \(t = n\), is the shift function \(r_0n^2 \text{mod} (1)\)for large \(n\). This shift map has a positive global Lyapunov exponent, but this system exhibits no exponential growth in uncertainty.

What about systems that exhibit SDIC and generate dense periodic orbits but lacks topological transitivity? Consider a state space with periodic orbits of different sizes centered round rational points, where no two periodic orbits intersect each other. The nature of rational numbers implies that for, arbitrarily small deviations in initial conditions, the system ends up in completely different orbits and hence diverging trajectories with no given point ending up in any open set challenging definitions, such as Chaos\(_{d}\), SD, Chaos\(_{te}\) or Chaos\(_{\lambda}\).

As a third counterexample, consider horocyclic flows on a compact surface of negative curvature. For instance, the set of vectors orthogonal to a Euclidean circle tangent to a boundary in the upper half-plane pointing inward is a stable horocycle. Aperiodic horocyclic flows on a compact surface of negative curvature are ergodic, so these flows are dense in the state space and topologically mixing (Frustenberg 1973; Marcus 1975), meaning that they exhibit topological transitivity. Note that periodic horocyclic flows are not dense but the points initiating periodic orbits are. There are very few invariant ergodic measures for these aperiodic flows, meaning that some of these flows can escape to infinity, so restrict attention to those having invariant measure. It can be shown that these orbits do not diverge (see Schapira 2017), hence the global Lyapunov exponents computed for such trajectories would be zero and we do not even have WSD, raising questions about Chaos\(_{d}\), since conditions (2) and (3) for Chaos\(_{d}\) should imply WSD but do not for these flows. On the other hand, the periodic flows can have a positive global Lyapunov exponent, but are not dense in the subspace, so this counterexample also challenges SD, Chaos\(_{te}\), and Chaos\(_{\lambda}\).

Even considering a single property, such as strong mixing (see Appendix: The Chaotic Hierarchy), to be a necessary condition for chaotic dynamics runs into subtleties. Consider KAM-type systems, which are integrable systems with small perturbations and can have regions of both regular and irregular (stochastic) dynamics (see Lichtenberg and Liebermann 1992, pp. 166ff; Ott 1993, pp. 229ff). For an integrable Hamiltonian, follow a trajectory as it orbits the energy surfaces (think tori such as a doughnut) and look at its Poincaré section of surface under small perturbation. Even though KAM-type systems are not ergodic—hence, possess no properties on the ergodic hierarchy—because the circles in the surface of section representing rational winding numbers get destroyed, meaning that the state space gets separated into two distinct parts, the invariant curves on the energy surfaces get confined to different portions of the state space and cannot cross over any invariant tori (for discussion, see Berkovitz, Frigg, and Kronz 2006, pp. 680–685). There are many examples of concrete instantiations of such systems that have regions of both regular and aperiodic orbits, the latter spreading across their restricted portion of state space (e.g., the Hénon system and Chirikov standard map). Yet, KAM-type systems are not even ergodic, let along strong mixing. One at least has to restrict the claims for strong mixing as a necessary (or sufficient) condition to only those regions in state space where irregular behavior exists.

If one settles on Chaos\(_{d}\), or equivalently, strong mixing as the definition of chaotic dynamics (e.g., Werndl 2009), then one is committed to classifying a large range of linear dynamical systems as chaotic. Indeed, there is a burgeoning research field called “linear chaos” (e.g., Gilmore 2020; Grosse-Erdmann and Peris Manguillot 2011). In linear dynamics, a dynamical system is hypercyclic if there is an \(x \subset S\), an infinite-dimensional vector space, such that the orbits of the dynamical system are dense in \(S \). By Birkhoff’s transitivity theorem (1922) such a dynamical system has the property of being topologically transitive. Hence, by Chaos\(_{d}\), any infinite-dimensional linear dynamical system that is hypercyclic is chaotic even though the system never exhibits SD. Nevertheless, it is not clear why these systems should be classified as chaotic given that if one waits long enough any linear dynamical system will grow uncertainties large enough to cause some form of limitations on predictions of future states though these linear systems lack other properties of chaos such as exponential growth in uncertainty.