Equality of Educational Opportunity

First published Wed May 31, 2017

It is widely accepted that educational opportunities for children ought to be equal. This thesis follows from two observations about education and children: first, that education significantly influences a person’s life chances in terms of labor market success, preparation for democratic citizenship, and general human flourishing; and second, that children’s life chances should not be fixed by certain morally arbitrary circumstances of their birth such as their social class, race, and gender. But the precise meaning of, and implications for, the ideal of equality of educational opportunity is the subject of substantial disagreement (see Jencks 1988). This entry provides a critical review of the nature and basis of those disagreements.

To frame the discussion we introduce three key factors that underscore the importance of treating equality of educational opportunity as an independent concern, apart from theories of equality of opportunity more generally. These factors are: the central place of education in modern societies and the myriad opportunities it affords; the scarcity of high-quality educational opportunities for many children; and the critical role of the state in providing educational opportunities. These factors differentiate education from many other social goods. We follow this with a brief history of how equality of educational opportunity has been interpreted in the United States since the 1950s and the evolving legal understandings of equality of opportunity. Our subsequent analysis has implications for issues that are at the center of current litigation in the United States. But our philosophical discussion is intended to have wider reach, attempting to clarify the most attractive competing conceptions of the concept.

1. Equality of Educational Opportunity as an Independent Concern

1.1 The Value of Education

Education has both instrumental and intrinsic value for individuals and for societies as a whole. As the US Supreme Court stated in its unanimous decision in Brown v. Board of Education (1954), “In these days, it is doubtful that any child may reasonably be expected to succeed in life if he is denied the opportunity of an education”. The instrumental goals of K–12 education for individuals include access to higher education and a constellation of private benefits that follow college education such as access to interesting jobs with more vacation time and better health care; greater personal and professional mobility, better decision-making skills (Institute for Higher Education Policy 1998) and more autonomy at work. Research further shows that education levels are correlated with health and wealth: the more education a person has, the healthier and wealthier she is likely to be. At the same time, education is also considered intrinsically valuable. Developing one’s skills and talents can be enjoyable or good in itself and a central component of a flourishing life, regardless of the consequences this has for wealth or health.

In addition to the instrumental and intrinsic value of education to an individual, education is also valuable for society. All societies benefit from productive and knowledgeable workers who can generate social surplus and respond to preferences. Furthermore, democratic societies need to create citizens who are capable of participating in the project of shared governance. The correlation between educational attainment and civic participation is strong and well-documented: educated citizens have more opportunities to obtain and exercise civic skills, are more interested in and informed about politics, and in turn, are more likely to vote (Verba, Schlozman, & Brady 1995: 432–437, 445).

It is therefore relatively uncontroversial to say that education is a highly valuable good to both individuals and to society, especially to democratic societies. This makes questions about who has access to high-quality educational opportunities, and how educational opportunities should be distributed, particularly important.

1.2 The Scarcity of High-Quality Educational Opportunity

Questions about the just distribution of educational opportunity are especially vexing given the scarcity of resources allocated to education. Although developed societies provide some education for free to their citizens, funding for education is always in competition with the need to provide citizens with other social goods. As Amy Gutmann writes: “The price of using education to maximize the life chances of children would be to forego these other social goods” (Gutmann 1999: 129). Other basic welfare needs (e.g., housing, healthcare, food), as well as cultural goods (e.g., museums, parks, concert halls), must be weighed against public funds allocated to education, thereby making high-quality education—even in highly productive societies—scarce to some degree.

This scarcity is evident on several fronts with respect to higher education in the United States, which attracts applicants from all over the world. There is fierce competition for admission to highly selective colleges and universities in the US that admit fewer than 10% of applicants. In this arena, wealthier parents sometimes go to great lengths to bolster their children’s applications by paying for tutoring, extracurricular activities, and admissions coaching—activities that can put applicants without these resources at a significant disadvantage in the admissions process.

A more urgent demonstration of the scarcity of educational opportunity in the US and many other societies is evident in how access to high-quality primary and secondary education is effectively limited to children whose families can afford housing in middle-class neighborhoods, or who have access to private schools via tuition or scholarships. Despite the Brown decision’s eradication of de jure, or state-sanctioned, segregation by race in schools, public schools in the US remain sharply segregated by race and by class due to de facto residential segregation. This segregation has significant consequences for poor and minority students’ educational opportunity. Given the strong correlation between school segregation, racial achievement gaps, and overall school quality, poor and minority students are disproportionately educated in lower performing schools compared to their white and more advantaged peers (Reardon 2015 in Other Internet Resources).

In view of the constellation of intrinsic and instrumental goods that flow from educational opportunity, and in the context of relative scarcity, questions about how educational resources should be distributed are especially pressing as a matter of social and economic justice.

1.3 The State Regulation of Education

A third consideration that underscores the importance of thinking about the distribution of educational opportunities is that in most developed societies, the vast majority of such opportunities are provided through and regulated by the state. All developed societies have a legal requirement that children attend school for a certain number of years. This means that, unlike other policy levers, education is typically under the control of state institutions and has the potential to reach the vast majority of the nation’s children across racial, religious, class, and gender-based divides. And given the myriad benefits that flow from education, it is arguably a state’s most powerful mechanism for influencing the lives of its members. This makes education perhaps the most important function of government.

Since education is an integral function of government, and because it is an opportunity that government largely provides, there are special constraints on its distribution. Justice, if it requires nothing else, requires that governments treat their citizens with equal concern and respect. The state, for example, cannot justly provide unequal benefits to children on the basis of factors such as their race or gender. Indeed, such discrimination, even when it arises from indirect state measures such as the funding of schools from property taxes, can be especially pernicious to and is not lost on children. When poor and minority children see, for example, that their more advantaged peers attend better resourced public schools—a conclusion that can be drawn in many cases simply by comparing how school facilities look—they may internalize the view that the state cares less about cultivating their interests and skills. Children in this position suffer the dignitary injury of feeling that they are not equal to their peers in the state’s eyes (Kozol 1991, 2005). This harm is especially damaging to one’s self-respect because it is the development of one’s talents that is at stake; whether or not one has opportunities to gain the skills and confidence to pursue their conception of the good is central to what Rawls calls “the social basis of self-respect” (Rawls 1999: sections 65 and 67; Satz 2007: 639).

2. A Brief History of Equality of Educational Opportunity in the United States

Given the importance of education to individuals and to society, it is clear that education cannot be distributed by the market: it needs to be available to all children, even children whose parents would be too poor or too indifferent to pay for it. Furthermore, if education is to play a role in equipping young people to participate in the labor market, to participate in democratic governance, and more generally to lead flourishing lives, then its content cannot be arbitrary but rather must be tailored to meet these desired outcomes. We address considerations of education’s content in subsequent sections, turning first to how equality of opportunity has been interpreted in the US, where we can see some of the implications of a truncated understanding of equality of opportunity in stark form.

The United States Supreme Court’s Brown v. Board of Education (1954) decision, in finding racially segregated public schools unconstitutional, declared that the opportunity for an education, when provided for by the state, is a “right which must be available to all on equal terms”. But de facto racial segregation persists in the US and is coupled today with ever-growing class-based segregation (Reardon & Bischoff 2011). In 2014, 42.6% of African-American students in public schools attended high-poverty schools compared to just 7.6% of white students (see school poverty, in the National Equity Atlas, Other Internet Resources). The resulting, compounded educational disadvantages that poor, minority children face in the US are significant. As research continues to document, the racial/ethnic achievement gap is persistent and large in the US and has lasting labor market effects, whereby the achievement gap has been found to explain a significant part of racial/ethnic income disparities (Reardon, Robinson-Cimpian, & Weathers 2015).

Efforts to combat de facto segregation have been limited by US jurisprudence since the Brown decision. Although the Supreme Court previously allowed plans to integrate schools within a particular school district (see Swann v. Charlotte-Mecklenburg Board of Education, 1970), in Milliken v. Bradley (1974) the Court struck down an inter-district busing plan that moved students across district lines to desegregate the Detroit city and surrounding suburban schools. This limitation on legal remedies for de facto segregation has significantly hampered integration efforts given that most school districts in the US are not racially diverse. More recently, the US Supreme Court further curtailed integration efforts within the small number of districts that are racially diverse. In its Parents Involved in Community Schools v. Seattle School District decision (2006), the Court prohibited districts from explicitly using individual students’ race as a factor in school assignment plans, thereby condoning only race-neutral integration plans in what many regarded as the Court’s final retreat from redressing de facto segregation (e.g., Rebell 2009; Ryan 2007).

The persistence of race and class-based segregation in the US and the educational disadvantages that follow are rooted in the US system of geographically defined school districts, whereby schools are largely funded by local property taxes that differ substantially between communities based on property values. This patchwork system compounds the educational disadvantages that follow from residential segregation. The 50 states in the United States differ dramatically in the level of per pupil educational funding that they provide; indeed some of these interstate disparities are greater than the intra-state inequalities that have received greater attention (Liu 2006). The system for funding schools and the residential segregation it exacerbates—itself the product of decades of laws and conscious policies to keep the races separate—has produced and continues to yield funding inequalities that disproportionately affect poor Americans of color. The segregation of resources, with greater resources flowing to children from families in the upper quintiles of society, makes it highly unlikely that children from the lower quintiles can have an equal chance of achieving success. This is evident in recent research documenting the growing achievement gap between high and low-income students, which is now 30–40% greater among children born in 2001 than those born twenty-five years before (Reardon 2011: 91).

Given the judicial retreat from remedying de facto segregation, many advocates have shifted their attention to the school finance system. A landmark US Supreme Court decision in this arena was an initial setback to efforts to advance educational equality via federal school finance litigation. In this case, San Antonio Independent School District v. Rodriguez (1973), the Court found that there is no federal right to education, and that funding inequalities among school districts due to variations in property tax revenue are not unconstitutional. This decision further entrenched the educational inequalities that follow from the geographic happenstance of a child’s home. In contrast to the US, many other countries do not finance their schools through local property taxes (e.g., Finland funds its schools at the national level based on the number of students they educate, and it provides more funding to schools that educate more students who are immigrants or whose parents are unemployed or uneducated; Sahlberg 2011). Many other societies distribute educational resources in a more centralized way than does the United States, which leaves educational funding, and even educational standards, to a large extent in local hands.

The US Supreme Court did, however, leave an opening for state courts to act, and so legal advocates have adopted a state-by-state approach in the decades since Rodriguez. As this litigation has unfolded in almost every US state, a policy debate with philosophical underpinnings has emerged around the question: Should educational resources be distributed on an equal basis (an equity model), or according to a sufficiency threshold (adequacy model)? State constitutions differ as to the basis they suggest for the state’s interest in funding education.

In the legal and political sphere, the adequacy approach has been more successful in school finance litigation at the state level. But the philosophical elaboration of equity and adequacy as competing ideals is somewhat distinct from how they are used in legal battles and political discourse. As we describe below, some recent writing challenges the cogency of the sharp distinction often made between these two ways of justifying the distribution of educational resources.

3. The Meaning of and Debates about Equality of Educational Opportunity

Debates about the meaning and value of equality of educational opportunity—and about whether equal educational opportunity requires equality or adequacy—can be considered in the light of two questions.

The first question is that given the diverse goals of education—preparing individuals for the job market, for democratic citizenship, and to experience the intrinsic goods of education—is there only one justified rubric for distributing educational resources? For instance, distributional policies that support career preparation may be very different from those that support other goals like preparation for democratic citizenship. Since the labor market is a highly competitive sphere, education for labor market success appears to be a positional good, understood as a good whose value depends on one’s relative standing (i.e., the quality of my education for labor market success depends to a great extent on how good your education in this realm is since we will be vying for jobs). In a highly competitive job market with high stakes, distributing educational resources equally becomes especially important.

Conversely, education for human flourishing can be seen as a non-positional good because an individual’s attainment of the intrinsic goods of education (e.g., to enjoy literature, to be intellectually curious) is not compromised by others’ success in this realm; it is not a competitive field. In fact, one’s ability to enjoy the arts might be increased by others’ ability to do so too. An adequacy threshold for distributing educational opportunities directed at human flourishing may therefore be justified. As our educational goals vary, so too might the distributive principles for educational resources need to change.

The second question we must consider is about the best interpretation of the ideal of equality of educational opportunity. Is equality of opportunity achieved when everyone with similar talent gets the same results? When per pupil expenditures are equalized? When those with the same natural talent potential get the same opportunities?

Answers to these two fundamental questions enable philosophers to construct a conception of equality of educational opportunity. Of course, philosophical controversies remain even supposing the content of the conception can be settled. Some of these controversies concern clashes with other values, including that of the family and diversity: What limits do parental rights put on the pursuit of equality of educational opportunity? Is affirmative action required by or contrary to equality of educational opportunity? Other issues arise when we try to interpret what equality of educational opportunity means for those with disabilities, or when we attempt to define “merit” and “native talent potential”.

The following sections of this entry will describe the key maneuvers in different ways of answering these two questions: first, what the ideal can mean and what distributive principles realize it; and second, how to navigate tensions between this ideal and other values. The first section below introduces debates about the various definitions of equality of educational opportunity and its associated distributive principles. Some of the material covered in this section comes from the literature on equality of opportunity more generally, which we apply to educational aspects of these debates. The subsequent section surveys debates about how to negotiate the challenges faced by those looking to realize the ideal of equality of educational opportunity, including whether equality of educational opportunity can be reconciled with respecting the private sphere of the family.

3.1 What is Educational Opportunity?

Before we can say what an equal educational opportunity is, we need to say what an opportunity is in general. Peter Westen (1985) provides a helpful definition of an opportunity that can be applied to the education sphere. For Westen, an opportunity is a relationship between an agent or a set of agents, and a desired goal, mediated by certain obstacles, none of which are insurmountable. For instance, Alice has an opportunity to become educated mediated by obstacles such as enrolling at a school, putting in hard work, and the quality of her teachers.

To employ this concept in the context of education, we need to answer questions about who the proper agents are, what the appropriate goal or goals are, and what, if any, obstacles are legitimate. For example, if we take admission at a highly selective college as our goal, and the citizens of some country as our agents, we might think that meeting a certain academic requirement, such as passing an entrance exam, is a relevant obstacle that should be permitted to stand in the way of the goal. In this context, we will also think that an applicant’s race, sex or religious affiliation should not be obstacles. When the appropriate group faces only the relevant obstacles with respect to the appropriate goal we can say that equality of opportunity obtains between the members of that group.

For instance, Alice and Belle have equal opportunity to attend a selective university if, all other things being equal, the only obstacle they face is passing an entry test, which is a relevant obstacle. They do not have equal opportunity if Alice also faces an irrelevant obstacle, such as race-based discrimination, that Belle does not face.

Educational opportunities are those opportunities that aim to enable individuals to acquire knowledge and certain skills, and to cultivate certain capacities. As noted above, we may value educational opportunity in some instances for the intrinsic value of acquiring knowledge, while in other cases we may care more about its instrumental effects on individual welfare (e.g., labor market success). Whatever our rationale for caring about educational opportunity, in order for an individual to be said to have this opportunity, she must have no insurmountable, irrelevant obstacles to the particular educational goal we have in mind.

Most commonly we associate the goals that constitute educational opportunities with access to educational institutions such as schools and universities, but apprenticeships and professional development and training also provide educational opportunities. In addition, there are many informal types of educational opportunity. These include public debates and lectures as well as time spent reading, practicing, or thinking outside of a school context.

Most contributors to debates about equality of educational opportunity focus on opportunities that are made available through public K–12 and higher education institutions. The reasons for this are similar to our reasons for being concerned with educational opportunity in the first place. Those institutional opportunities are more easily regulated and under the state’s control, they educate the vast majority of children in the developed world, and they have a profound effect on the quality of our lives. As a result, most of the literature primarily concerns K–12 educational institutions and colleges. Nevertheless, a crucial question concerns the extent to which the state should try to address inequalities in educational opportunities that are generated through the family. For example, we know that parents who read to their children give their children an educational advantage (Hutton et al. 2015). Should the state seek to correct for the disadvantages of those children whose parents could not (or would not) read to them? More generally, parents pass on not only genetic traits to their children, but also characteristics that differentially prepare children for success at school, and even at jobs. Again, how should the state respond to these and other factors that influence children’s likelihood of success at school? Are these appropriate obstacles for children to face or not?

The next sections survey different interpretations of equal educational opportunity in view of these questions.

3.2 Formal Equality of Educational Opportunity

Formal equality of opportunity is the view that formal rules that make reference to personal or ascriptive characteristics should not be obstacles to achieving certain goals. Such characteristics include race, socio-economic class, gender, religion, and sexuality. It is essentially a concept of equality before the law. It is often understood as an anti-discrimination principle (See the entry on equality of opportunity for more discussion).

As applied to educational opportunity, formal equality of opportunity requires the removal of formal obstacles, in the form of laws or entrance criteria for educational institutions, which refer to ascriptive characteristics. For instance, formal equality of opportunity is opposed to legally segregated schools whose admissions policy states that students be white, male or belong to a certain religion. This conception is likewise opposed to laws that endorse or require segregation in schools. The Brown decision is certainly consistent with at least formal equality of opportunity. At the same time, it is worth noting that formal equality of opportunity is at odds with the tolerant attitude many societies take toward schools and colleges that are segregated by sex and religion. One possible way in which these practices might be reconciled with formal equality of educational opportunity would be to argue that this principle applies only to public educational institutions and not private schools and colleges. Some people accept that formal equality of opportunity is a sufficient norm to guide the distribution of educational opportunities, but most political and moral philosophers accept it as necessary but not sufficient. A principle of non-discrimination leaves open whether and to what extent the state needs to provide the resources that are required for education, or how those resources should be distributed (see Gutmann 1999: 127ff). Since resources are necessary for education—whether in the form of books and materials, teachers, facilities, and so on—formal equality of opportunity is compatible with some children failing to actually receive an education. Formal equality of opportunity fails to provide effective equality of opportunity.

Additionally, formal equality of educational opportunity is not concerned with the informal rules, social norms, or private discrimination that people in a society face that can have a profound effect on a child’s opportunities for education. Consider that formal equality of opportunity is compatible with school segregation, if school attendance zones were determined by residence and residence were segregated by race and social class (as is typically the case in the US). If integration is a moral imperative, formal equality of opportunity cannot achieve this goal (Anderson 2010). Many people believe that insofar as informal discrimination is an unfair obstacle to educational opportunity, it is a serious problem that requires policy attention.

Even if formal equality of opportunity could be defended as a just distributional principle outside of the educational context, perhaps because going beyond it violates certain rights (see Nozick 1997), it cannot be defended in the context of schooling. No democratic society can justify failing to educate the children of its poorest students. (Additionally, see Friedman & Friedman, 1990, for a libertarian argument for universal education based on its third party effects.)

3.3 Meritocratic Equality of Educational Opportunity

Proponents of meritocratic equality of opportunity argue that no other obstacle besides merit should stand in the way of achievement of the desired goals. This view requires that educational goods be distributed solely in accordance with individual merit. In the context of education, merit is often measured by entrance requirements, aptitude tests, or grades on exams. Of course, merit could be defined in some other way—by how hard a student works, by how much a student improves, or by classroom participation, although all of these indicators pose measurement challenges.

Meritocratic equality of opportunity has well-known limitations, especially with respect to children. If educational opportunities should be given to those who have the most merit in terms of the best scores on entrance tests, we will overlook the fact that merit is endogenous to education, which is to say, educational opportunity itself creates merit (Satz 2007). The more educational opportunities an individual child has, the more “merit” that child may come to have. This might suggest that we should pay more attention to individuals’ underlying potential rather than to their assessed merit. Yet few people believe that we should give opportunities to those who have the most underlying but uncultivated ability at the expense of those who have less underlying ability or who are less qualified but have worked hard (Miller 1996).

To illustrate a second limitation with the meritocratic conception of equal educational opportunity, imagine that all highly selective university places have been awarded to members of the upper class through cronyism, and that a progressive new government is suddenly elected into power to enforce meritocratic admissions. After generations of consolidating superior education, jobs and wealth at the expense of the poor, the upper-classes are in a far better place, particularly if private schooling is available, to ensure that their children end up being the most meritorious, thereby preserving vast social inequalities between members of different classes. Although some opportunities are open to all equally, opportunities to develop “merit” are not distributed equally (Williams 1962). Intergenerational transmission of opportunities to cultivate merit would generate a deeply divided and unequal society, which is at odds with the ideal of equality of educational opportunity.

Two further limitations concerning meritocratic equality of opportunity in the context of education are worth noting. The first, as has already been mentioned, is that the definition of merit itself can be contentious. Is there an account of merit that is wholly independent of conceptions of justice (Sen 2000)? Is merit simply what maximizes productivity? Should merit be based solely on test scores or also take into account moral attributes like the ability to work cooperatively with others?

The second is that while conditioning educational opportunities on “merit” may look compelling when dealing with young adults, it is deeply problematic when applied to very young children. As Michael Walzer (1983: 203) notes, the job of the reading teacher is to teach children to read, not merely to offer the opportunity to learn to read. And this job presumably includes all children in a classroom—even those who are not especially “meritorious”. Perhaps this is also why the educational “tracking” of very young children on the basis of ability seems especially objectionable—there are certain capacities that need to be cultivated in all children (Satz 2007).

3.4 Fair Equality of Educational Opportunity

Because of the limits of formal equality of opportunity, John Rawls developed a conception he calls Fair Equality of Opportunity (FEO). FEO requires that social offices and positions be formally open to all, and that individuals who are similarly talented and motivated should have a roughly equal chance to attain these positions, independent of their social class background (Rawls 2001: 42–44). FEO holds that all citizens of a society count as the relevant agents, the desired goal is offices and positions, and the obstacles people should not face includes their social class background. The obstacles people may legitimately face include having fewer developed abilities or less willingness to use them.

When applied to education, this principle may support educational measures that close the achievement gap between the rich and the poor with the same high talent potentials, assuming that these children can be identified. This is because such students from poorer backgrounds should fare as well as their wealthier peers with the same potentials. The Rawlsian principle of FEO aims to eliminate the effects of social background and economic class on educational achievement. Fair equality of opportunity therefore offers a radical interpretation of equality of educational opportunity.

3.5 Debates about Fair Equality of Educational Opportunity

Debates about FEO have focused on the relative importance of the goods it regulates (i.e., access to offices and positions) and the fact that it regards inequalities in inborn potentials as relevant obstacles generally, and in the education arena.

In A Theory of Justice, Rawls accords the fair equality of opportunity principle priority over access to other types of advantages such as income and wealth. Disputing this priority, some have argued that the opportunities that FEO regulates are not more important than these other goods and that we should prefer a principle (known, for example, in Rawls’ work as the difference principle) that ensures that the least advantaged are as well-off as possible in terms of income (or according to some critics, well-being) (Alexander 1985; Arneson 1999; Clayton 2001; Miklosi 2010). Richard Arneson presses this complaint forcefully in his paper “Against Rawlsian Equality of Opportunity”. Rawls’ argument for FEO over the difference principle comes from a commitment to individuals’ self-respect and the contribution that the ability to compete for offices and social positions on fair terms make to that self-respect. But Arneson argues that those among us with lesser capacities might reasonably reject according such weight to the self-respect of the talented. After all, the self-respect derived from the results of a “natural lottery” is unequally distributed. The untalented among us, Arneson argues, would prefer increases in well-being to a principle of self-respect that confers no benefit to them.

In terms of education, rather than ensuring that those with the same inborn talent potential and ambition have the same level of educational achievement, Arneson would emphasize that educational opportunities should aim at promoting the welfare of the least advantaged. This is more important, as he sees it, than ensuring that future competitions for jobs are fairly structured. But Rawls and his defenders have argued that wealth and welfare are different in kind from the goods that FEO regulates, and that FEO pertains to more important goods that are closely connected to autonomy, the social bases of self-respect, and what he calls the two moral powers. This explains their priority and irreducibility (Taylor 2004; Shields 2015; Shiffrin 2004). Further, if everyone had a decent minimum, then the additional contribution of wealth to well-being is less significant. In subsequent work however, Rawls does acknowledge that the priority of FEO over his difference principle may be less stringent than he thought.

Some philosophers criticize FEO as insufficiently egalitarian. This criticism has taken two forms. First, some claim that by making fair opportunities relative to motivation, FEO has insufficient bite in a non-ideal world in which inequality frequently produces diminished aspirations in the oppressed. If women have been socialized for centuries to think that certain positions in society are beyond their capacities, and accordingly they are not motivated to pursue such positions, does FEO have the resources to criticize this?

A second objection points out that inequalities in social luck (e.g., being born into a poor family, which FEO requires institutions to correct for) and inequalities in natural luck (e.g., being born with less talent potential, which FEO does not require institutions to correct for) should be treated the same. It is easy to think that both types of luck are equally arbitrary from a moral point of view, and that this arbitrariness is a source of injustice. Indeed, some of Rawls’ own remarks seem to suggest this. Why, we might ask, should educational institutions help close the gap between the talented rich and talented poor but do nothing to close the gap between talented and untalented students, when being untalented is, just like social class, totally unavoidable. Matthew Clayton and Richard Arneson press this complaint against Rawls. Clayton claims that Rawls’ own reasoning appears to privilege consistency about both types of luck. So Rawls should either accept a different principle applying to both natural and social luck, or else he must condone a type of natural aristocracy for both talent and wealth.

Part of a response to these objections would have to defend the resources that Rawlsian theory has for dealing with race and gender as obstacles to fair equality of opportunity as well as the importance of the specific goods that FEO protects. Rawls himself singled out certain goods as having a higher priority than the goods of income and wealth alone. In defense of Rawls on the first objection, Seana Shiffrin (2004) has argued that FEO is a “robust anti-discrimination principle”, which should not be read out of its context within Rawls’ two principles as a whole. Moreover, it

would be difficult to provide the sort of educational training necessary to fulfill the principle’s commands without thereby engaging in teaching that also combatted the stereotypes that produce significant differentiation of ambitions. (2004: 1650, fn31)

On her view, the social bases of self-respect require the robust anti-discrimination principle that FEO provides. In defense of Rawls on the second objection, Robert Taylor (2004) has attempted to show that self-realization has a crucial place in the hierarchy of goods on the Kantian interpretation of Rawls’ principles. He claims that FEO therefore has priority over the difference principle because it regulates goods that are more central to the exercise of our moral powers and our highest order interests. However, his defense of Rawls has been criticized for being overly perfectionist and therefore not politically liberal. If this criticism is sound, then it may seem to imply that while perfectionist Rawlsians can justify FEO, political liberal Rawlsians cannot. Liam Shields (2015) argues that there is a non-perfectionist account of self-realization and that this leads us to supplement the principle of FEO with a principle of sufficient self-realization. This may be one way to defend FEO against those who favor a strict focus on welfare.

However, these responses would not satisfy those who believe that we should adopt prioritarianism with respect to especially important goods, distributing them in a way that gives priority to those who have the least (Schouten 2012). Prioritarianism is a controversial view, and has some controversial implications for the distribution of K–12 education. For example, a prioritarian view might endorse providing no state supported educational resources at all for those who are extremely talented, unless it could be shown that doing so improves the lot of the least well off. But many people will reject this implication, believing that the state does have educational obligations to the talented in their own right. Prioritarianism is also inattentive to inequalities that obtain elsewhere in the distributional scheme, for example, between those at the median and those at the very top. Many egalitarians will be disturbed by disproportionate opportunities going to the top 1%, even if the very bottom of the distribution is improved. Rawls’ view is not a simple prioritarian one, but instead endorses a complex set of principles—some of which are egalitarian such as FEO, and some of which give special attention to the least well off, such as the difference principle.

A final issue with FEO concerns our understanding of, and ability to determine, natural levels of talent. It can be very hard to know who has the most potential even when children are well into their schooling. This suggests that it is not an appropriate or feasible benchmark for the regulation of social institutions since we could never know whether it was satisfied (Gomberg 1975).

3.6 Equality of Educational Opportunity for Flourishing

One goal of education is to enable young people to grow into adults who have flourishing lives. What would it mean to give children the equal opportunity for flourishing lives? Again, that depends on the view one should have about the appropriate obstacles. At the most extreme, some have argued all people should face only the obstacle of their own choices. The view makes sense of many of our intuitions. For example, we tend to think that victims of bad luck, those born with disabilities, or those who are severely harmed by natural disasters, are entitled to aid. Meanwhile, those who gamble and lose are not usually viewed as having any case for compensation.

The view so stated has very radical implications for educational institutions since it charges them with ensuring that all students have equal prospects for living well, regardless of differences in their natural potentials. Thus, educational institutions organized in accordance with equality of opportunity for flourishing would not only have to provide compensatory support and resources for those from disadvantaged family backgrounds, but also for those who have genetic disadvantages.

Many philosophers have taken issue with this general view. Some have argued that its unmitigated emphasis on choice and responsibility would lead to stigma (e.g., Anderson 1999; Wolff 1998). Imagine a letter to parents saying that the state is offering your child extra opportunities because your genes create significant disadvantages. Moreover, as has already been noted, any view emphasizing choice so heavily seems especially out of place when dealing with young children.

We also need an account of the flourishing that should be the aim of educational opportunities. Is it to be understood in terms of preference satisfaction? Or something else? Would it require autonomy? In choosing an account of flourishing, we have to respond to these questions and also be attentive to concerns about sectarianism. How can an undoubtedly controversial account of what makes a human life valuable (e.g., that a good life is an autonomous life) be a suitable basis for educational policy in a pluralistic society? Many liberals argue that families may justifiably reject, and request exemption from, an education that conflicts with their religious, cultural, or political views. They argue that an educational system driven by a principle of equality of opportunity for flourishing will not respect individuals’ entitlement to pursue their own account of how they wish to live, in accordance with their own reason (Rawls 2005). Of course, it might be pointed out in reply, that educational decisions made by parents affect not only their own views of how to live but also, and more importantly, their children’s.

3.7 Equality of Educational Opportunity for the Labor Market

A second key goal for education, which plays a prominent role in public discourse, is to prepare individuals for productive employment. Education for the labor market has significant benefits for the state (e.g., GDP growth) and for individuals (e.g., remunerative and rewarding employment and all its associated benefits, including more discretionary income, more leisure time, and in the US, better healthcare). This function of education is critically important as a matter of justice. Education aimed at preparing individuals for employment has become especially pressing in view of the income inequalities that leading economists have highlighted (Piketty 2014; Saez & Zucman 2014). And since education for employment is a highly positional good given a competitive labor market, it matters all the more how educational opportunity in this arena is distributed.

Although there is a clear correlation between educational attainment, income, and employment rates (see 2016 US Bureau of Labor Statistics, Other Internet Resources), the link between academic achievement as measured on tests and labor market outcomes has been found to be more attenuated (Bowles, Gintis, & Osborne 2001). Recent scholarship has shown that “soft skills” (e.g., personality traits like tenacity; individual’s goals and preferences) may be more predictive of success than cognitive abilities measured by test scores (Heckman & Kautz 2012). Moreover, schooling that is most directly targeted at employment—vocational education—has a history in the US of entrenching race and class-based inequalities (e.g., Oakes 1985). Although the relationship between traditional academic skills and labor market success may be less significant than previously thought, and despite the checkered history of vocational education, formal schooling still has a critical role to play toward equipping individuals for labor market success on several fronts.

First, students do acquire soft skills in formal school settings. One study found that student achievement on tests accounts for just 20% of the effects of educational attainment on earnings (Bowles, Gintis, & Osborne 2001), which indicates that schools are cultivating non-cognitive skills that tests do not measure, and that are consequential in the labor market (Levin 2012). Second, educational attainment has long been seen to have a signaling function in the labor market (Spence 1973), whereby employers rely upon job candidates’ educational credentials as a proxy for future productivity. Educational attainment itself, then, apart from applicants’ demonstration of particular skills, is central to screening and differentiating candidates. Finally, a college diploma has become especially consequential in recent years as the income gap between those with and without one has grown; individuals with a bachelors degree earn 84% more over their lifetime than those with just a high school diploma (see Carnevale, Rose & Cheah 2011). Lesley Jacobs’ notion of stakes fairness (2004) underscores the importance of equality of educational opportunity when it comes to preparation for the labor market. Ideally, the stakes attached to education for labor market success would not be nearly as high as they are now, whereby a winner-takes-all competition for a job can determine an individual’s access to social goods like healthcare, leisure time, and discretionary income. When the (non-ideal) stakes are this high, equality of educational opportunity matters all the more (Jacobs 2010).

3.8 Equality of Educational Opportunity for Citizenship

Another important goal for providing educational opportunities is the development of students’ capacities associated with being a good citizen and maintaining democratic institutions over time (Callan 1997; Galston 2001; Gutmann 1999). It might be argued that just as equality of opportunity to become a flourishing individual is a matter of justice, so too is equality of opportunity to develop civic skills, and to participate effectively in political deliberations.

The structure and appropriate content of civic education is debated extensively. While some argue that citizenship education can be narrowly construed so as to not encroach upon individuals’ private commitments, others claim it is a far more demanding educational endeavor. A key part of this debate is the extent to which education requires the cultivation of autonomy, and if does, the nature of the autonomy that is required. Some claim that since some groups in pluralistic democracies reject the idea of an autonomous life, education for autonomy cannot be imposed upon them even for civic purposes, and so education should not entail the cultivation of individual autonomy (Galston 1989). Rawls’ own solution to the potential clash between civic education for autonomy and individuals’ private commitments is to advocate only a limited form of autonomy, political autonomy, which “leaves untouched all kinds of doctrines—religious, metaphysical, and moral” and yields a relatively thin civic education (Rawls 2005: 375). Others take issue with this view, arguing that civic education requires an encompassing form of autonomy that has unavoidable spillover effects into the private sphere of individuals’ lives, and that may clash with some religious convictions (Callan 1997; Gutmann 1995; see also Arneson & Shapiro 1996, for a discussion of Wisconsin v. Yoder (1972), a US Supreme Court case about religious exemptions from compulsory education).

Another dimension of ongoing debates about equality in the realm of civic education concerns the scope of the community for which we are educating students to become members. Is the right unit of analysis a particular nation state or the global community? If it is a particular nation state, how can we cultivate in students a sense of their national identity and the disposition to respect their state’s institutions and laws (and to advocate reform when needed), while also making them sensitive to what they owe non-citizens as a matter of justice? A key component of this debate is whether students should receive a patriotic civic education—that is, one that prioritizes shoring up their allegiance to their state over their capacity to reflect critically upon its potential shortcomings. Galston (1989) has notably argued that students need a civic education that is more rhetorical than rational, while a number of liberal theorists have criticized his view on grounds of democratic legitimacy, its status-quo bias, and the related possibility of ossifying existing inequalities (e.g., Brighouse 1998; Callan 1997; see also the related entry on civic education). On the other hand, if we instead have a cosmopolitan view of civic education and aim to cultivate “citizens of the world” (e.g., Nussbaum & Cohen 1996), what are the relevant capacities that need to be made effective? There is no world state for students to participate in.

Whatever one believes about the appropriate scope and content of civic education, a pressing issue is students’ extremely uneven access to educational opportunities that prepare them for participatory citizenship. Meira Levinson’s recent work on the “civic achievement gap” highlights this corollary to the much-more discussed achievement gap and underscores vast inequalities across student groups in terms of what youth know about how government works, and their ability to participate effectively in civic life (Levinson 2012). These low rates of participation and engagement also have consequences for how the interests of the poor are treated. Indeed, even if one rejects equality of opportunity in this domain, there is ample evidence that many societies are not doing enough to enable their poorer and less educated citizens to effectively and competently participate in public life.

3.9 Equality and Adequacy in the Distribution of Educational Opportunities

A longstanding debate in the literature juxtaposes the view that we should prioritize equality in the distribution of educational opportunities with the view that an “adequacy” approach is the right one (on this debate, see Reich 2013). Those who advocate the equality view may insist on equal outputs (i.e., educational outcomes, like the mastery of particular skills) or inputs (i.e., educational resources, like equal per pupil funding or qualified teachers). The adequacy view, by contrast, is seen as holding that what matters most is meeting a specified educational threshold.

In the context of school finance litigation in the US, advocates often invoke these two distributive ideals together rather than regarding them as being at odds (Rebell 2009: 21–22; Ryan 2008: 1232–1238). Although most school finance litigation in the US today is pursued from an adequacy framework given its greater political viability, litigators often make comparative claims about students’ educational opportunities to bolster their case. Conversely in contexts where lawyers pursue equality claims, they frequently appeal to a conception of educational quality (e.g., achieving literacy, numeracy, and civic skills) to anchor their claims, and to avoid the leveling-down problem whereby equality is achieved by making everyone worse off, without regard for the realization of particular educational goals.

Recent philosophical work has similarly undercut the sharp equality/adequacy distinction and shows how the two ideals are closely intertwined in the pursuit of educational justice. These approaches (e.g., Satz 2007; Anderson 2007) argue that adequacy in education has a relative and comparative component because the educational threshold depends on the knowledge and skills that others have, and so it is necessarily a moving target. For example, what it takes to serve on a jury, or to have an adequate opportunity for college, depends on the knowledge and skill levels of others. This “relational” approach to adequacy can respond to one of the strongest concerns proponents of equality raise: that because many of the benefits of education are positional, which is to say, their value depends upon one’s position relative to others, equality is the right distributive principle for educational opportunities. The meritocratic distribution of jobs, where the most qualified candidate is appointed (rather than the individual who is merely well-qualified), ensures that positionality is decisive in many cases. Conceptions of adequacy that are attentive to relevant comparative claims can address this issue and thereby deflate the tension between adequacy and equality approaches to distributing educational opportunities.

However one interprets equality of educational of opportunity, a number of important challenges face anyone who believes that the ideal is a crucial component of a fair and just society. Several of these challenges are philosophical in nature. For instance, one can ask whether certain values (e.g., respecting family autonomy) compete with the demands of equality of opportunity in education in ways that trump or are trumped by concerns about educational equality. One can also ask whether equal educational opportunity requires affirmative action, and what it may require for students with disabilities and special educational needs. One can accept equality of educational opportunity with respect to some goods and adequacy of educational opportunity with respect to others (Callan 2016). There are other challenges that are not philosophical but practical, such as how we can convince policymakers to allocate sufficient funds to meet students’ educational needs, and how we might increase public support for the ideal of equality of educational opportunity more generally.

4. Equality of Educational Opportunity’s Tensions with Other Values

4.1 Education and the Family

Family background has long been recognized as a source of significant inequalities. Even before we consider that children have quite different personalities and needs, inequality in family wealth and differences in family priorities and wield influence over a child’s prospects in the labor market, in civic participation, and in overall well-being. Although the number of parents who choose to pay tuition to have their children educated in private schools may be relatively small, purchasing elite private schooling can result in compounding advantages for some students (and thus relative disadvantages for others). Only about 10% of primary and secondary students in the US attend private schools (see NCES’s the Condition of Education 2016 in Other Internet Resources), while students who attended private secondary schools have comprised nearly 30% or more of matriculating classes at some highly selective American universities in recent years (see, for example, online profiles of the 2016 freshman class at Harvard, Stanford, and Yale listed in Other Internet Resources). Students at some public schools may also suffer more immediate disadvantages from the absence of the positive peer effects of being in a school with higher achieving students and more engaged parents. Smaller class sizes, more highly qualified teachers, and more extra-curricular opportunities may enable private school students to benefit from the compounding advantages of greater success in the college admissions process and subsequent labor market. And since employment opportunities and elite college places are scarce goods that are closely linked to other benefits in health, wealth, and overall well-being, these inequalities can be highly consequential.

While some of these inequalities might be remedied by social policies that address employment practices, gender and racial inequality, and wealth inequality, we have reasons to think that some inequality in opportunity will remain in a just society simply because parents should be able to treat their children differently from other people’s children in ways that are to their children’s advantage. For example, a parent may read bedtime stories to his children but if he does he does not also need to read them to other children, even if a failure to read to everyone exacerbates inequality. There are limits to what the state can do without intruding on the life of the family. At the same time, concern for mitigating inequality that is rooted in familial relations has to grapple with the fact that different parenting styles have value as well as downsides, and that the middle-class norm of trying to maximize children’s potential (“concerted cultivation”; Lareau 2011) is no exception in terms of having certain disadvantages for children.

There are several possible approaches to the conflict between equal educational opportunity and the family. One approach subordinates our concern for equality of educational opportunity to our concern with the family. To support this view we might try to argue that the goods of family life are especially weighty, or, that as a matter of value pluralism, the state cannot impose complete uniformity on childrearing practices. Conversely, we could subordinate our concern for the family to our concern with equality of educational opportunity. If this were to happen, however, we could end up abolishing the family as we know it, since the family and partiality run contrary to equal opportunity. One cannot, it seems, have the family and have perfect equality of opportunity. Plato famously advocated raising children in common within communities in The Republic (though not out of concern for equality). But most philosophers, including Rawls, believe that abolishing the family is far too high a price to pay for equality (this is discussed in Munoz-Dardé 1999; Brighouse & Swift 2009; Schoeman 1980; Schrag 1976; see also Miller 2009 on different conceptions of equality of opportunity and how the family fits within them).

Alternatively, we might think that some careful weighing of the values at stake is required. For instance, we might think that only some of the demands of familial partiality, those related to intimacy such as reading bedtime stories, are sufficient to outweigh concern for equality of educational opportunity. Other aspects of familial partiality that appear to be unconnected to intimacy, such as paying tuition for private schools, would not be justified. This view would enjoin us to equalize children’s educational opportunities whenever we can, without sacrificing the goods central to the family (Brighouse & Swift 2014). Yet it can be very difficult in practice to determine whether an advantage parents provide their child is constitutive of the family or not.

4.2 Disability

Individuals with cognitive and physical disabilities have been marginalized, denied resources, and even denied an education. Can a conception of equality of educational opportunity accommodate those with cognitive and physical disabilities? Some critics claim that theories of justice focus unduly on meeting the demands of reciprocity and cooperation as a pre-condition to equal opportunity and other demands of justice, and in doing so, exclude some individuals with disabilities from those entitlements. Some argue that we need new theories (Kittay 1999) while others argue that existing theories and approaches can be applied to or extended to include individuals with disabilities (Stark 2013; Robeyns 2006; Brighouse 2001). In education, treating individuals with disabilities the same as those without does not always suffice to treat all equally, for disabilities sometimes give rise to special needs and requirements and this raises challenges for ‘inclusion’ (Warnock 2005). In order to avoid these challenges it seems that we might need to endorse differential treatment, which can lead to stigma and division and has been associated with educational segregation. This gives rise to what has been called the “dilemma of difference” and pertains to decisions about whether students with disabilities should be educated in the same class as students without disabilities. Placing disabled children in mainstream schools or classes may lead to bullying, as Mary Warnock (2005) has noted, but placing disabled children in separate settings may further entrench the wide-spread social stigma associated with disability, even when there is much that can be done to ensure disability is not an obstacle to learning. Further debates focus on the extent to which (at least some of) the disadvantages of disability may be detached from the disability itself and the extent to which they are attached only in virtue of social organization or social attitudes, which we could and should alter. For instance, if the dominant modes of communication in our society were sign-based rather than spoken, perhaps deafness would not be considered a disability. Likewise, where braille translations are readily available, the blind do not face a disability with respect to reading (Sparrow 2005). In the case of education, the design of the school or the curriculum can determine whether a disability is an obstacle to learning. For some discussion of this debate see Terzi 2005.

Disability may be thought to pose problems for various conceptions of equality of educational opportunity and can strengthen well-known objections. For example, it poses problems for those who endorse a meritocratic allocation of advantageous positions, such as FEO. If one of the primary goals of an education system is to ensure fair competition for jobs, many people with disabilities will likely face greater and even insurmountable obstacles to becoming the most meritorious candidate. Recall that FEO requires equal prospects for the equally naturally talented and ambitious. Some of those with disabilities do not have similar or equal natural talent with others vying for opportunities, even if these differences could be compensated for through education. Meritocratic equality of opportunity also appears to neglect some people with disabilities, by interpreting merit in terms of inborn potentials. FEO and meritocratic equality of opportunity are consistent with providing very low or even no educational opportunities to some cognitively disabled persons, but that hardly seems like an acceptable outcome. Adequacy accounts may also struggle to explain what to do when disabilities are so severe that individuals cannot achieve adequate educational levels, or do so only at enormous cost. If an adequate education involved at least acquiring a high school diploma, it is not possible for some cognitively impaired persons to reach this level. Since the focus of adequacy is on achieving that level, and these people cannot do so, it appears that when educational adequacy is set at these levels no entitlement to education for the cognitively disabled can be derived from it. This sort of example puts a lot of pressure on accounts of adequacy to explain at what cost adequacy is worth pursuing, and also challenge those who deny that native ability is relevant to equality of opportunity.

One way to avoid such outcome would be to supplement these views of equality or adequacy of educational opportunity with other principles. For example, it might be held that we owe some educational resources even to the severely cognitively disabled not on grounds of equality of opportunity but on grounds of humanity.

4.3 The Target of Equal Educational Opportunity: Individuals or Groups?

Opportunities belong to agents. However, when we are concerned with equality of opportunity we may be concerned that each individual has the same opportunities or that certain groups (classified by race, gender, socio-economic class, sexuality or religion) have the same opportunities. In other words, our concern may be that people’s opportunities are not affected by their membership of some disadvantaged group rather than being concerned that each individual has equal opportunity within groups. Imagine two societies. In society A, all those who gain entrance to selective colleges on the basis of test scores are white. In society B, all those who gain entrance on the basis of test scores are white or non-white in proportionate to their percentages in the overall population. Should we care about whether we are in society A or B? If our concern is with individuals alone, then so long as our conception of equality of opportunity is met, then there is no difference between society A and B. Of course, we may suspect that society A violates our conception of equality of opportunity. But suppose that it does not.

Do we have any reason to favor a college admissions policy that moves us from A to B? Those who advocate for affirmative action in admissions argue that we have reason to depart from a color-blind standard. Some of those arguments appeal to the illegitimacy of the standards used (e.g., tests scores), which critics say are biased. Others argue that we should expect to see equality of outcomes with respect to relevant social groups. For example, John Roemer (1998) defends a conception of equality of opportunity according to which members of groups that have been subordinated (women, racial minorities) should have the same probabilities of achieving success as the members of the dominant group. This is because he thinks the obstacles these groups face should be the same and if we assume that they have equal distributions of talent within them, then different outcomes means there are different obstacles. Roemer uses the example of smoking to illustrate this. Smoking rates vary by social class: the poorer you are, the more likely it is that you will smoke. On Roemer’s view, this means that it is harder for a poor person to stop smoking than a wealthy person. So we should not penalize a poor person who smokes to the same extent that we penalize a wealthy person. Of course, which social groups should be included in this exercise is controversial. Conservatives and liberals differ as to whether individuals face different obstacles simply by virtue of their group membership.

A different argument for moving to society B is given by Glenn Loury (1987) who argues that the dynamic effects of a society like A would prevent poor but talented minorities from achieving equality of educational opportunity because they would lack access to the social networks upon which jobs and other opportunities depend. In society A, disadvantages would cluster. Because equality of opportunity does not, as we have seen, easily extend to the private sphere of family and intimate associations, it is compatible with the continued practice of racial discrimination in such practices, even when there is legal, formal equality.

Loury thus sees a role for preferential policies in higher education that would move us from a society like A to a society like B. One of the more controversial reforms associated with higher education and equality of opportunity is affirmative action, which reserves preferential treatment for historically disadvantaged groups. Affirmative action has been criticized by those who think that merit, and not race or class, should be the only criterion for selecting college applicants. Others argue that it can lead to the unintended stigmatization of members of disadvantaged groups who attend college as not deserving of their place. However, this is to forget that opportunities to develop merit are themselves unfairly distributed between groups historically. Notwithstanding this response, affirmative action remains a controversial response to a very difficult social problem (Guinier 2016).

5. Conclusion

This entry has provided analysis of key positions in debates about equality of educational opportunity. We began by describing the reasons for being concerned about equality in this arena and then surveyed debates about the value and distribution of such opportunities. As the above discussion highlights, the realization of the ideal of equality of educational opportunity may be frustrated by competing conceptions of what equality itself entails, and also by other important values that are in tension with equalizing education opportunities (e.g., respecting family autonomy). Social scientific advances in recent years have clarified our understanding of the mechanisms behind children’s unequal access to educational opportunities, and the consequences of those inequalities for social mobility (e.g., Chetty et al. 2014; Duncan & Murnane 2011). This knowledge enables policymakers to target interventions to areas that will be most impactful (e.g., growing recognition of the importance of early childhood education). But value tensions of the sort highlighted in this entry will persist, and they warrant ongoing attention by philosophers as our understanding of the causes and consequences of educational inequalities sharpens.


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Copyright © 2017 by
Liam Shields <liam.shields@manchester.ac.uk>
Anne Newman <arnewman@stanford.edu>
Debra Satz <dsatz@stanford.edu>

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