Equality of Opportunity
Equality of opportunity is a political ideal that is opposed to caste hierarchy but not to hierarchy per se. The background assumption is that a society contains a hierarchy of more and less desirable, superior and inferior positions. Or there may be several such hierarchies. In a caste society, the assignment of individuals to places in the social hierarchy is fixed by birth. The child acquires the social status of his or her parents at least if their union is socially sanctioned. Social mobility may be possible in a caste society, but the process whereby one is admitted to a different level of the hierarchy is open only to some individuals depending on their initial ascriptive social status. In contrast, when equality of opportunity prevails, the assignment of individuals to places in the social hierarchy is determined by some form of competitive process, and all members of society are eligible to compete on equal terms. Different conceptions of equality of opportunity construe this idea of competing on equal terms variously.
- 1. Formal Equality of Opportunity
- 2. Substantive Equality of Opportunity
- 3. Social Mobility and Equality of Opportunity
- 4. The Scope of Equality of Opportunity
- 5. Widening the Equal Opportunity Ideals
- 6. Legal Enforcement of Equality of Opportunity
- 7. The Level Playing Field Conception: Luck Egalitarianism
- 8. A Kantian Interpretation of Equality of Opportunity
- 9. Equality of Opportunity and Meritocracy
- 10. Justifications of Equality of Opportunity
- 11. Critiques
- 11.1 The Libertarian Critique: Robert Nozick's Version.
- 11.2 The Libertarian Critique: Richard Epstein's Version
- 11.3 Genetics and the Relevance of Equality of Opportunity
- 11.4 The Morality of Inclusion
- 11.5 Relational Equality
- 11.6 The Leveling-down Objection
- 11.7 The Fairness-to-the-Worse-Off Critique of FEO
- 12. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Formal equality of opportunity requires that positions and posts that confer superior advantages should be open to all applicants. Applications are assessed on their merits, and the applicant deemed most qualified according to appropriate criteria is offered the position. Alternatively, applicants are winnowed by fair competition, and the winner or winners get the superior advantages.
Formal equality of opportunity might obtain in a variety of social settings. As defined here, this ideal does not presuppose that the production and distribution of goods and services are organized through a market economy with private ownership. For example, an autocratic society, in which economic life is organized by the commands of the autocrat, could satisfy equality of opportunity to this extent: the post of autocrat is open to all applicants, and selection is determined by the fitness of applicants for autocratic performance as indicated by the comparative merits of their applications. Moreover, the autocrat might organize economic life and distribute economic rewards by fair competitions. A communist society, in which political, social, and economic privileges accrue to communist party members, might conceivably be run in such a way that communist party membership is determined by competitive examination. If the examination were set so that the person who earns a top score is the best qualified for the post of party membership, and that person is offered party membership, formal equality of opportunity would be satisfied.
The ideal of formal equality of opportunity is associated with the liberation of economic practices and institutions from guild privileges and restrictions and with the development of competitive market economies. The slogan “careers open to talents” expresses the aspiration to establish a world where government posts go to the most qualified and economic opportunities may be seized by anyone independently of whether or not one's parents are of noble blood or cronies of the king. The ideal is opposed to nepotism, the distribution of what should be public offices to one's relatives and friends just because they are near and dear to the distributor and quite independently of their fitness for the post. In this entry for the most part the terms “formal equality of opportunity” and “careers open to talents” are used interchangeably to denote the same ideal.
A market economy conforms to formal equality of opportunity only if jobs offered by business firms are publicized in advance, so that anyone who might want to apply has a reasonable opportunity to do so. In this setting formal equality of opportunity also requires that applications from anyone are accepted, applications are judged on their merits, and the most qualified according to criteria that are relevant to job performance are offered positions. (A variant practice in which only current employees of a firm are eligible to apply to higher-level jobs might be deemed to satisfy equal opportunity provided entry-level jobs in the firm are open to all applicants.) In addition, equal opportunity in a market setting requires that the lending of money for investment purposes by banks should proceed by accepting applications from any interested party and deciding who should get loans according to the expected profit of lending to one rather than another of the various applicants. Equality of opportunity also requires that the access of economic firms to investment and operating capital by borrowing money through sales of bonds and through sales of shares in the ownership of the enterprise (stocks) should occur through processes that give all firms and economic agents the same opportunities for gain.
More generally, equality of opportunity in the market setting requires that firms and individuals deal with one another impartially as opportunities for gain. When formal equality of opportunity is satisfied in a market setting, each participant regards all others as potential partners for interaction and selects partners for a deal or a venture according to the extent to which interaction with those particular individuals or firms promises to further one's morally innocent economic goals. An alternative formulation would have it that when a market economy satisfies formal equality of opportunity, each market agent selects partners for interaction according to the extent to which interaction with those particular individuals or firms would further one's legally permitted goals.
The ideal of formal equality of opportunity has limited scope. Its sphere of application is public life, not private life. Where to draw this line between public and private for this purpose is itself an unsettled and controversial issue. Certainly decisions about whom to invite to be a dinner guest, whom to regard as a potential date or marriage partner, whom to cultivate with a view to forming a personal friendship are not decisions that fall within the sphere of equality of opportunity. This is not to deny that such decisions can be made in a way that reflects wrongful prejudice. This surely happens, and is morally criticizable. But equality of opportunity as normally understood is a norm that regulates a political and civil society, a common life in which all members participate, rather than every aspect of the conduct of individual lives. However, this scope restriction is open to challenge.
The idea of equality of opportunity tends also to be limited in scope along another dimension. Its domains are political societies or nation-states taken one at a time. If all Austrian universities are open to all Austrian youth and all Chinese universities are open to all Chinese youth, it is not ordinarily thought to be objectionable if Austrian universities are not open to Chinese and Chinese universities are not open to the Austrians. Thus limited in scope, formal equality of opportunity would be compatible with far greater educational opportunity being available to Austrian than to Chinese youth. However, nothing prevents broadening the scope of application of equality of opportunity. For example, one might uphold the ideal of a global marketplace in which all transactions conform to formal equality of opportunity applied world-wide.
It should be noted that formal equality of opportunity so understood puts moral constraints on market decisions. Equality of opportunity is violated if investors decline to invest in a company just because its CEO is a black, or a woman, and they are prejudiced against blacks and women. If one operates a business and provides a product or service to the public for sale, formal equality of opportunity is violated if one refuses to sell to some class of potential customers on grounds that are whimsical (no sales to people with brown hair, or wearing black shoes) or prejudiced (no sales to people of some disfavored race, religion, or skin color). By the same token, the ideal of formal equal opportunity puts constraints on the behavior of customers of firms and purchasers of goods and services as well as constraints on would-be providers. If a Jewish individual starts a business and people decline to purchase goods from her in virtue of the fact that she is Jewish, formal equality of opportunity is violated. In the same way, to refuse to purchase a product on the ground that its manufacture employed the labor of women in skilled jobs violates formal equality of opportunity.
Suppose the owner of a small business hires her family members or friends instead of advertising job openings and picking among the applicants according to the merits of their applications. This might be deemed a private matter and, for this reason, not a violation of formal equality of opportunity. However, if this same small business, a restaurant, serves whites only and refuses to accept blacks, Hispanics, and others as customers, this decision might well be deemed to lie in the public sphere and to constitute a violation of formal equality of opportunity. A perhaps controversial case of a type of decision that might be thought to lie in the public or in the private sphere with respect to the application of equality of opportunity would be decisions of business-oriented social clubs that are traditionally exclusively male or white in their membership to continue to deny membership to nonwhites and nonmales who might seek admission. Since valuable business contacts are made at these private social clubs, and business deals are sometimes made on the premises, the exclusion of women and minorities from membership in them might be deemed wrongfully discriminatory and a violation of equality of opportunity.
Notice that selection among applicants for a job by a random procedure that gives all applicants an identical chance of getting the job actually violates formal equality of opportunity as here interpreted (on equal opportunity as a lottery procedure, see Rae et al. 1981). At least, if there are relevant standards of merit that could be applied to the applicants and that would predict successful job performance, a lottery to select who gets the job would not qualify as selection according to merit. Only if all applicants are equally qualified or there is no feasible and cost-effective way to distinguish among the applicants according to their merit would a lottery satisfy the ideal of equality of opportunity.
The idea of being most qualified for a post is not transparently clear. One might hold that being qualified is meeting perfectionist criteria of excellence that are internal to roles and crafts. A good carpenter has the skills and other traits that render one competent at using wood to build things. The position or post is associated with a goal, and excellence is what enables nonaccidental successful pursuit of the goal.
If a post is associated with several goals, there may be no definitive ranking of their relative importance, hence no definitive precise notion of being more qualified than another candidate for the post. A good psychotherapist may help patients in several distinct ways, so there may be only partial commensurability in rankings of psychotherapists.
A post may be associated with quite different conflicting goals, some problematic. Suppose a mediocre professional hockey player tends to become embroiled in brawls during games. His thuggish conduct pleases fans, and raises ticket sale revenues. If the purpose of professional hockey is to create profits for hockey team owners, the mediocre hockey player may be more qualified for a position on the team than better players. The carpenter with excellent skills and an unwillingness to do shoddy work may not be qualified for a job with the construction firm whose profit-maximizing business strategy is to build cheap affordable houses. Similar issues can arise in the nonprofit sector. An international aid agency may do better to hire photogenic young aid workers, who will attract favorable press coverage, rather than workers more able to do the work that will help the agency's intended beneficiaries.
If airline business travelers prefer to be served by physically attractive women rather than attractive men or unattractive individuals of either sex, a profit-seeking firm will regard being female and attractive as job qualifications (Yuracko 2004a). If white workers rebel at being bossed around by a supervisor who is not white-skinned, being white-skinned may be a job qualification for the supervisor post. One response to these examples is to identify the most qualified applicant for a post as the one whose hiring will do most to advance the morally legitimate purposes of the enterprise. This formulation allows the construction firm to consider the excellent carpenter who insists on working to the highest standards as unqualified and likely guides us to regard hiring the airline stewards and stewardesses as a difficult borderline case. These verdicts are plausible. But notice that the firm that caters to the racist prejudices of its workers has the morally innocent aim of making profits. One problem here is that the firm pursues its aim by catering to wrongful desires, and indeed wrongful desires of just the type that equal opportunity aims to overcome. In contrast, selecting a black actor to play the lead role in Othello seems unproblematic, and so does selecting a female medical doctor to serve as a gynecologist for a clientele of women who feel more comfortable being treated by a woman rather than a man. However, the latter example is not beyond challenge. The judgment of the case may depend on the underlying motivation of the customers, as seems probable if we introduce variations of the example. We might imagine that the women who prefer a female gynecologist simply dislike men as such. In an alternative scenario, imagine that the women clients feel more comfortable being treated by a male gynecologist because they view the doctor's role as involving a social authority that properly belongs to males. Here there seem to be violations of formal equality of opportunity.
A society could satisfy the careers open to talents ideal even though the economy is overwhelmingly oriented to satisfying wrongful consumer desires for unhealthy food and cruel sports spectacles, just so long as the desires being satisfied are not wrongful by virtue of offending against an element of the formal equality of opportunity ideal. How to draw the line between desires that are offensive in this way and those that are not is a tricky matter. The desire of consumers not to purchase products in which the labor of those deemed lower-caste individuals is embedded in any except menial roles is clearly on the wrong side of the line. The desire of elderly women to be attended by female nurses is clearly not. Several factors may be in play. One is that desires that express hostile attitudes against people in virtue of their group membership are inherently inimical to careers open to talents. Another is that desires that reflect accurate statistical judgments are not inherently offensive to equal opportunity. Perhaps elderly women believe correctly that they are more apt to receive sensitive, caring treatment from members of their own sex. Desires that arise in group-hierarchical culture and would not have arisen in an equal opportunity society are arguably not just on this basis reasonably deemed offensive to careers open. Another factor that perhaps ought to guide classificatory judgments in this area is disparate impact (on which, see section 6.1).
The formulation toward which this discussion points is that for purposes of determining whether formal equality of opportunity is satisfied in given circumstances, any member of society must be allowed to apply for positions that confer advantage, applications must be judged on their merits, and selection of applicants for the position must proceed by selecting the top-ranked applicant first, then successively lesser-ranked applicants, in order of their fitness for the post as revealed by their applications. An application is meritorious to the degree that it shows that selecting this individual would better advance the morally legitimate aims of the enterprise by means that are not morally forbidden and specifically not wrongfully discriminatory than would selecting any other applicants. If an applicant would do better in a post by satisfying desires and choices of customers that are in violation of equality of opportunity, then hiring the applicant on that basis would also violate equality of opportunity (Wertheimer 1983).
This formulation does not rule out some selection decisions that some might want to classify as violations of formal equality of opportunity. Consider this example: Two lawyers apply for a job in a law firm. One is better at lawyering work but comes from a nonwealthy family background; the other is worse at lawyering work but comes from a wealthy family, has many wealthy friends, and can be expected to draw more wealthy clients and thus more revenue to the firm than her less connected fellow applicant. The wealthy applicant is chosen, because hiring her would do more for the firm's expected profits than hiring the other. The example illustrates that even if the ideal of formal equality of opportunity is uncontroversial if abstractly and vaguely stated, any detailed specification of the norm will be controversial.
Another controversial selection criterion is age. Suppose that state-funded openings for qualifying education for medical doctors are restricted to applicants whose age does not exceed some stated maximum. Or suppose there is a compulsory retirement age set by law for certain occupations, or set by some individual business firms. Are such public or private policies wrongfully discriminatory so as to render them violations of formal equality of opportunity? (On age discrimination, see also the discussion in section 2.3 of this entry.)
Another controversial selection criterion is physical appearance (see Post 2000). In January 1992, the City Council of Santa Cruz, California, considered a proposed city ordinance that would have prohibited discrimination against individuals on the basis of physical appearance. In the context of employment, such an ordinance would rule out disfavoring an application for hiring or promotion on the ground that the candidate is physically attractive or unattractive, and also on the grounds that the candidate fails to conform to conventional standards of dress or appearance. The proposed ordinance would have allowed an exception when physical appearance is a bona fide occupational qualification (BFOQ), when a certain appearance is required in order to carry out essential functions of the job. Would passage of such an ordinance represent an advance or a setback for the cause of formal equality of opportunity or careers open to talents?
The candidate ordinance clearly overreaches by casting its net of prohibition too widely. A business might aim to attract customers by presenting a dressed-up or dressed-down tone, and refusing to follow the appearance code for staff that is intended to achieve the desired tone should not be protected behavior under an antidiscrimination norm, even if appearance does not qualify as an essential job function. On the other hand, an appearance code can reinforce conventional beliefs that hinder disfavored groups from genuine equal access to the workplace. Suppose an appearance code requires women to use cosmetics and maintain their hair in expected styles while no comparable requirements are imposed on men in the same job role. How to draw boundary lines here is not easy to discern (see Yuracko 2004a,b).
Deborah Hellman proposes that wrongful discriminatory treatment occurs if and only if the discrimination demeans some of those who are being treated. In turn, to “demean is to treat someone in a way that denies her equal moral worth.” Hellman elaborates: “To demean is not merely to insult but also to put down, to diminish and denigrate” (Hellman 2008, at 29).
Hellman's proposal offers a principled way of resolving disputed boundary lines between acceptable and unacceptable discrimination, which set the standard of formal equality of opportunity. In this tangled area of thought, the success of the proposal is hard to judge. One worry is that even if the proposal gives a sufficient condition for wrongful discrimination, the proposal may fail as a necessary condition. Suppose a society's employment practices are set by a religion that reveres women but dictates that their proper role is that of traditional homemaker, and that the only public sphere employment suitable for women is temple prostitute (a highly regarded, indeed sacred calling). These practices of discrimination do not demean women, but their this-worldly consequences are seriously harmful to women and arguably, in virtue of this fact, wrongly discriminatory. Another concern is that the proposal may fail as a sufficient condition as well. Suppose a society countenances giving lesser weight, in public and private decision making, to the interests of severely cognitively disabled individuals than to the nondisabled, on the ground that these human individuals fail to have the rational agency capacities that qualify sentient beings as full persons. The practices of the society may demean the severely cognitively disabled without being wrongfully discriminatory. (On Hellman, and on wrongful discrimination generally, see Lippert-Rasmussen 2014, and on discrimination against the severely cognitively impaired, see McMahan 1996).
Formal equality of opportunity (careers open to talents) as characterized so far could be satisfied in a society with guild restrictions that are legally enforced, so long as the restricted economic positions and roles are open to all applicants and applications are assessed on their merits. This feature of the characterization is open to objection. Consider a society in which no one is allowed to practice law, medicine, college teaching, haircutting and manicure provision, real estate, carpentry, plumbing, taxicab driving, and so on without special schooling and a special state-supplied license, few of which are available for distribution. Even if the procedures for certifying schools and selecting recipients for licenses are impeccably fair and fairly administered, the system is subject to criticism on grounds of unfairness, and in particular, criticizable for denying equal opportunity as between the officially licensed provider of goods and services and the individual unlicensed to provide goods or services of that type who wants to sell them to willing customers.
It is possible that the restrictions on free trade just described amount to state-established cartels. If so, there is a case for maintaining that these restrictions constitute a denial of equality of opportunity in an intuitive sense and the definition of the term should be revised to accommodate this judgment.
It is also possible that the restrictions on free trade just described are justifiable on the ground that consumers lack the knowledge and judgment appropriately to determine whether the complicated services being provided are worth their price and best satisfy their preferences all things considered. If this is so, and if the restrictions qualify as justifiable paternalism—restriction of people's liberty against their will for their own good—then the restrictions would not plausibly be regarded as violating equality of opportunity rightly construed.
Given that the restrictions could conceivably be sustaining cartels, one might hold that the notion of formal equality of opportunity should be reinterpreted to accommodate this possibility. An opposed view would urge that the examples of restraint of trade are objectionable, but not an offense against the ideal of equality of opportunity, rather an offense against the different ideal of free trade. In favor of holding cartel-establishing restraints on free trade to be a violation of equality of opportunity is this consideration. It is plausible to judge that if the king imposes unjustified restrictions on people's opportunities to interact with each other on mutually agreeable terms, that in itself counts as violation of the ideal of careers open to talents or equal opportunity in the formal sense. Here is an alternative formulation of formal equality of opportunity that accommodates this judgment: Careers open to talents requires that individuals be free, under justified regulation, to buy and sell goods and services on mutually agreeable terms and that enterprises that confer positions of advantage select individuals to fill these posts through competitions open to all, with applications assessed by relevant criteria of merit. Promotions and advancement of individuals in positions of advantage should be conducted in a similar meritocratic way.
Although whimsical hiring violates formal equality of opportunity just as much as discrimination against some applicants done because the applicant is a member of a socially disfavored group, the latter is evidently a more serious violation of formal equality of opportunity. Whereas being the object of discrimination because one belongs to a group that has been targeted for oppressive treatment in the past is likely to be a wound to one's sense of dignity and self-respect, being the victim of whimsical or idiosyncratic hiring practices is less likely to inflict a significant psychic wound over and above the loss of the job itself. Also, since whimsical discrimination is idiosyncratic, it will not lead to cumulative harm by causing anyone to be the object of economic discrimination time after time (unless whimsical hiring were common and one were extremely unlucky). Also, in the context of a competitive market, there is the pressure of market competition that punishes whimsical economic decisions that lead to subpar economic performance, so one expects whimsy to be a marginal economic phenomenon.
Discrimination on the basis of group membership might under certain conditions be rational behavior on the part of economic agents and might lead to efficient outcomes. Market competition would not tend to drive out such discrimination. Consider stereotypes, rough generalizations about traits of groups. If a stereotype is “sufficiently” accurate, it can make sense to treat all group members the same for some purpose without investing resources in determining the actual traits possessed by individual group members. For example, if an employer seeking factory workers values steady attendance at work, and absenteeism is known to be somewhat higher among African-American youths than other youth, the employer might simply set aside all applications from African-American youth and choose workers among the remainder of the applicant pool. Discrimination that is cost-effective in this way and does not involve any misuse of available information is sometimes called statistical discrimination. The results for people who become the objects of statistical discrimination can obviously be bad. But this does not mean that statistical discrimination violates formal equality of opportunity. Does it?
As so far specified, formal equality of opportunity requires that applicants be assessed by appropriate criteria relevant to performance on the post and that the most qualified candidate be offered the post. But it would be excessively demanding to require that no expense be spared to discover, so far as is possible, which candidate is really most qualified. If the general idea of formal equality of opportunity in a market setting is that all agents must be treated equally as potential means of gain, then those means of selecting candidates should be required that maximize the hiring firm's prospects for gain (unless the firm's prospects register wrongfully discriminating behavior by its customers or suppliers). Seen this way, statistical discrimination would not violate formal equality of opportunity.
In some societies, the law of equal opportunity forbids statistical discrimination when the basis of the discrimination is race or sex. The employer must base hiring and promotion decisions on facts about the individual applicants other than their being black or white, male or female, or the like (even if basing decisions on accurate stereotypes is the most cost-effective way to proceed). The rationale for this legal policy might be to ensure that historically invidious forms of discrimination are not continued by prohibiting forms of discrimination that are superficially similar and reminiscent of past evils. Formal equality of opportunity as characterized in this entry would not rationalize this legal policy.
Discrimination against members of a group might be based on aversion to the group, which might exist quite independently of the actual characteristics of actual group members. For example, an employer might simply dislike Catholics or Jews or women, and be averse to hiring them, or to hiring them for other than unskilled low-paid jobs. One might suppose that if one has a taste for discrimination of this sort, one must incur costs if one acts on it (Becker 1971). If one refuses to hire Catholics or Jews or women even when they are most qualified, the product one offers for sale will be more costly to produce as a result, and if the market for this product is competitive, one cannot raise the price at which one sells it but must accept lesser profit than one would have obtained had one's hiring decisions been unprejudiced. On this basis one might speculate that competitive markets will tend to drive out such discrimination. However, if large numbers of people share a discriminatory social norm, one can see that the market will reward compliance with the norm and punish noncompliance, so there will in that case be no tendency for the market to squeeze out discriminatory behavior. For example, if consumers will not purchase widgets that are manufactured with the skilled labor of Catholics, Jews, or women, and if skilled Protestant male workers employed in the widget industry will not cooperate with Catholics, Jews, or women if they are hired as skilled co-workers, the widget manufacturer who simply wishes to maximize her profits will be led to comply with the social norm against the employment of the targeted groups in skilled jobs (Akerlof 1976, 1980).
Discrimination against people on the basis of their observable group traits is an enemy of equality of opportunity. This is a common-sense observation. If all discrimination were statistical discrimination, the common-sense observation would be true only to a very limited degree. If observable group traits such as skin color or sex are correlated with traits that employers reasonably value, hiring on the basis of the observable group traits can be rational from the standpoint of the employer seeking both to hire qualified workers and minimize hiring search costs.
Discrimination can also express and reinforce group status hierarchies. If possession of white skin confers status and attracts the esteem of others, derogating nonwhite individuals can help to build and sustain a top position for whites in the skin color hierarchy. Discrimination can take the form of favoring whites in hiring and promotion decisions, but can also take the form of participating in caste rituals and practices that proclaim the superiority of whites over others. Discrimination of this sort aims to preserve caste subordination. A successful discriminatory regime produces economic advantages for the dominant caste members, and also sweeping social advantages, so that sheer possession of white skin will predict that one will enjoy better life prospects than those who lack white skin. Group status hierarchies are entrenched and sustained by social norms that dictate costly individual behaviors directed at favoring fellow group members if one belongs to the superior group and at exhibiting deferential and submissive behavior if one belongs to a disfavored group. Conformity to the norms is rewarded and deviations punished (McAdams 1995).
The stability of group status hierarchy regimes raises the question, what motivates individuals to follow the norms that sustain the regime and to punish those who deviate even though following and punishing incur costs and often run against the individual's self-interest. Part of the answer appears to be that in an ongoing status hierarchy, people internalize the norms and esteem those who follow the norms, and the desire for this esteem motivates one to conform. Expressing admiration of those who adhere to social norms one accepts is often not costly behavior for an individual, but rather a pleasant activity. Moreover, we humans evidently have a native disposition to be rule-following punishers, who tend to accept current dominant social norms and to desire to punish those who violate them even when doing so is disadvantageous for us (Bicchieri 2006: chapter 3 and Henrich and Henrich 2006: chapters 7–8). The same generic trait that leads us to be disposed to punish those who steal and lie and neglect their children can also lead us to be disposed to punish those who challenge established group status hierarchy norms such as white supremacy. State-enforced laws can help create and sustain such a regime, as with Jim Crow segregation laws in the U.S. South in the twentieth century, but discriminatory social norms can arise and thrive and confer benefits on dominant caste members in the absence of legal enforcement.
Group status hierarchy can form on the basis of any arbitrary observable trait—skin color, supposed race, ethnicity, sex, heterosexual or nonheterosexual sexual behavior, age, and so on—but a trait that is exploited for this purpose will not be regarded as arbitrary by those who uphold the hierarchy. If the basis of the status hierarchy is white skin color, white skin will be prized as inherently attractive and as a marker for other valuable qualities such as intelligence and virtue. Those who uphold the status hierarchy can then see themselves not simply as advancing group self-interest but as defending a desirable moral order. A status hierarchy then will be ideological, based on false beliefs that serve some people's interests.
This thumbnail sketch of derogatory discrimination and group status hierarchy helps explain how and why public policy measures to enhance equality of opportunity tend to be controversial in complicated ways. When a group status hierarchy is officially dismantled, people may disagree widely on such questions as whether the underlying prejudiced attitudes have disappeared or have persisted in subtler and less overt forms.
The problem with formal equality of opportunity is that it is merely formal. Imagine a society ruled by a hereditary warrior class (as in B. Williams 1962). Reformers bring about a change. From now on, membership in the warrior class will not be drawn exclusively from the wealthy stratum of the society. Warriors will instead be selected on the basis of a competitive examination in military prowess administered to any young adult member of society who seeks admission into this elite class. However, it turns out that only scions of the wealthy stratum pass the exam and become warriors. Everyone in society except the wealthy is poorly nourished, and being well nourished is a prerequisite for developing the military skills needed to succeed on the competitive examination. In this setting, advocates for the nonwealthy strata of society might object that none but members of the traditional wealthy elite have a chance to satisfy the eligibility requirements for admission to the warrior class.
Even if all are eligible to apply for a superior position and applications are judged fairly on their merits, one might hold that genuine or substantive equality of opportunity requires that all have a genuine opportunity to become qualified. In the example just sketched, this would mean that all members of society have the opportunity to develop the needed military skills. One can imagine the society taking a variety of steps to provide opportunities to all. Nutrition supplements are made available to those whose diet is inadequate. Scholarships to military academies can be won by poor children. Warrior skills coaches are dispatched to every village. As more is done to provide opportunities that enable ambitious and talented youth from any social group to acquire proficiency at warrior skills, at some point the complaint that none but the wealthy have a chance to enter the warrior class begins to sound hollow. At some point it might be held that sufficient or good enough opportunities to become qualified have been provided to all. The idea would be that substantive equality of opportunity prevails with respect to some desirable position or ranked order of positions just in case all members of society are eligible to apply for the position, applications are fairly judged on their merits and the most meritorious are selected, and sufficient opportunity to develop the qualifications needed for successful application is available to all.
Further development of this proposal would give an account of what level of opportunity provision is “good enough.” Evidently the level would be set by balancing the costs and benefits of greater provision of opportunities versus the costs and benefits measured in terms of other values with which opportunity provision conflicts. But wherever the “good enough” level of provision is set, it could be that members of society still have unequal opportunities to become qualified for formal equality of opportunity contests. Scholarships are provided for some poor children, but wealthy parents can hire private fencing and jousting tutors. Some families own horses and can impart horse riding skills to their children, which gives them a competitive advantage over others. And so on.
Pursuing to the limit the idea of reducing the competitive advantages that favorable circumstances confer on some individuals, one arrives at the ideal that John Rawls has called “fair equality of opportunity” (Rawls 1999: section 12 and Rawls 2001: section 13). Fair equality of opportunity (FEO) is satisfied in a society just in case any individuals who have the same native talent and the same ambition will have the same prospects of success in competitions that determine who gets positions that generate superior benefits for their occupants. In other words, if Smith and Jones have the same native talent, and Smith is born of wealthy, educated parents of a socially favored ethnicity and Jones is born of poor, uneducated parents of a socially disfavored ethnicity, then if they develop the same ambition to become scientists or Wall Street lawyers, they will have the same prospects of becoming scientists or Wall Street lawyers if FEO prevails. Rawls writes that
assuming there is a distribution of natural assets, those who are at the same level of talent and ability, and have the same willingness to use them, should have the same prospects of success regardless of their initial place in the social system. (Rawls 1999: 63)
It should be noted that the specification of FEO just given departs from the specification in Rawls 2001. There Rawls defines FEO so it requires only that the socio-economic status into which one is born has no impact on one's competitive prospects. There is also the issue to be discussed below, whether the rights of parents to raise their children as they choose take priority over FEO and constrain its fulfillment. The eminent Rawls interpreter Samuel Freeman roundly declares that even setting aside the family freedom issue, we should see that all in all “Rawls does not understand FEO as requiring equal chances for the equally endowed” (Freeman 2007: 98). He sees FEO as instead demanding that all individuals especially including the disadvantaged should have opportunities to develop their talents. What extent of opportunities? This formulation looks like weak tea. Rawls exegesis aside, the formulation that sees FEO as requiring equal chances for the equally well endowed, a perfect meritocracy if you will, is interesting, controversial, and resonates with concerns about chances for mobility in the context of modern market economies. In the remainder of this entry, FEO refers to this broader ideal.
FEO articulates the ideal of a classless society of a sort. If the mark of a class society is that positions in the social hierarchy are passed along from generation to generation, then the society that satisfies the FEO ideal is classless in so far as parents can pass along advantages to their children only by genetic inheritance and by socialization that instills ambition. (Notice that FEO so understood is violated if some individuals gain significant advantages by gift or inheritance. One could amend FEO so that it permits gift and inheritance, deemed private transactions, and imposes constraints only on public sphere competitions.) Otherwise the advantages that well-off parents can confer on their children by providing better education and socialization than others receive or by providing access to a social network of well-off individuals are entirely eliminated or offset in the FEO society. If wealthy parents provide high-quality day care and nursery school and private tutoring for their children, society arranges public education practices so that children of nonwealthy parents get the same or equivalent advantages. In the same spirit, if some parents, rich or poor, are more strongly motivated than others to help their children get ahead in life, these efforts are somehow exactly offset, so having the good luck to have especially concerned parents does not affect one's comparative life prospects. The end result is that one can try to give one's own children a leg up in social competition, but whatever boost one provides will be met by a similar boost provided for other children whose native talent is the same as that of one's own children. (In passing it should be noted that when better-off parents provide various amounts of special boost for their children, FEO taken strictly and literally requires that whatever is the maximal special aid provided for individuals with a certain genetic talent endowment and ambition, the equivalent of that aid must also be provided to all other individuals, including individuals of better-off parents who are getting less than the maximal aid.)
FEO as characterized here is a demanding ideal. What if FEO becomes impossible to satisfy if inequalities in outcome become too extreme? In that case FEO requires extinguishing any inequalities in outcome among members of one generation that would bring it about that FEO cannot be satisfied among members of subsequent generations. In the Rawlsian system of nested and hierarchically ordered principles, FEO has less priority than the basic equal liberties principle. If FEO could be satisfied only by encroaching on free speech or the right to vote or other basic liberties, then according to Rawls it should give way. Up to conflict with equal basic liberties, FEO rules the roost.
FEO might be adopted in conjunction with formal equality of opportunity or by itself as a freestanding moral requirement. The difference between FEO alone and FEO paired with formal equality of opportunity emerges when one pictures a society that satisfies FEO but not formal equality of opportunity. A society might be composed equally of members of two hostile groups, who discriminate against each other at every opportunity. If the groups command the same amount of economic resources, it could happen that formal equality of opportunity is always violated, because in every context of interaction people favor members of their own group regardless of their qualifications. If men discriminate against women, and women against men, these effects might counterbalance so that freestanding FEO is still satisfied. The following discussion of FEO for the most part interprets it as an inclusive doctrine containing formal equality of opportunity.
Fair equality of opportunity can seem an inspiring ideal or a nightmarish vision reminiscent of George Orwell's 1984. The ideal of a classless society that has shed all trace of caste hierarchy is inspiring to many. But any scheme to implement FEO would apparently require extensive meddling by government or some other agent of society in family life, and such meddling can appear nightmarish (Fishkin 1983). The negative response to the prospect of implementation of FEO might not reflect rejection of the principle itself but merely a sense that this ideal should not be pursued wholeheartedly whatever the cost to other values. Equality of opportunity is typically advanced as a justice value, and the mark of justice norms is that they take priority over others. Even so, equality of opportunity might be one among several justice norms, and not the top-rated.
One might also question the assumption that the pursuit of FEO could not proceed to a significant extent without invasive interference in family life. For example, society could resolve to devote far greater resources to the education of children of poor and uneducated parents than to the education of other children. This would be done knowing that educated and wealthy parents will be inclined by affection for their children to give them special socialization and education advantages and that these will roughly counterbalance the special state expenditures on disadvantaged children. Policies of this sort could be pursued without sending out state inspectors to monitor the degree to which middle-class parents provide extra educational resources or informal props to self-efficacy and self-esteem that other children are not getting. Also, if the members of a society were committed to the ideal of FEO, they would not find reasonable and cost-effective measures to achieve it to be onerous. The issue becomes, how great a value is FEO, and to what extent does its pursuit warrant sacrifices in other values.
FEO might be thought to conflict with the freedom of individuals to raise their own children as they choose. A parent (or someone else entrusted with the guardian role over a child) might want to impart his culture and values to his children, and the result of parents with different culture and values acting with that goal will predictably bring it about that children who have the same native talent and ambition but are raised in different ways will have unequal chances of competitive success. Parents might want to encourage the development of their children's potential talents. If parents vary in how strongly they are moved to act on this desire and in how effective they are at boosting their children's personal development, the result again will be that individuals with the same native talent and the same ambition will come to have unequal chances of competitive success, in violation of FEO. An alternative view on the conflict between family life and fulfillment of FEO is that the freedom to mate with anyone on mutually agreeable terms and raise children as one sees fit within broad limits is a basic liberty that takes priority over FEO. But a large question is now open: to what extent exactly is the fulfillment of FEO limited by the basic liberty of family freedom?
Harry Brighouse and Adam Swift propose that it would be morally wrong to insist on complete fulfillment of FEO, because parents have legitimate interests in helping their children to have good life prospects. There is a legitimate interest in acting for their children's sake, and also a legitimate interest, an important constituent of the parent's good, in creatively expressing themselves in how they fulfill the parent role and in developing and sustaining special asymmetrical friendship bonds with their children that are unique to parent-child relations. As they put it, parents have a “nonfiduciary interest in being able to play a fiduciary role” with respect to their children” (Brighouse and Swift 2009: 54.). They work to distinguish inequality-promoting parental behaviors such as reading bedtime stories to children that are essential to achieving the special values of parent-child relations and other inequality-promoting behaviors such as sending children to expensive private schools that do not make essential contributions to parental relations and that might be discouraged or taxed or even prohibited without inflicting damage on parent-child relations.
The assumption that achieving FEO would require limiting parents' freedom to raise their children as they choose, so that if either parents have moral rights to this freedom or it is morally desirable on other grounds to sustain it, we must accept less than complete fulfillment of FEO, has some plausibility but does not survive reflection. In principle, society could allow parents to act pretty much as they please and simultaneously maintain in place flexible policies that adjust the social provision of aid to children so that whatever parents do that would result in nonfulfillment of FEO if its impact were left standing is entirely offset, so the end result is that FEO is completely fulfilled. If wealthy parents give their children special tennis lessons and fancy tutorial assistance, social agencies increase aid to children whose parents do not or cannot lavish such resources on their upbringing, so the inequality-boosting tendency of the special parental provision is entirely nullified. In principle no limits on parental freedom would be needed to achieve FEO completely (though limits on secret parental helps might need to be curbed, and what might strike us as privacy-violating intrusions on family life to monitor effects of special parental provision would be needed). This possible public policy stance sounds bizarre only because its costs would clearly be enormous, and arguably not worth the moral gain in extra fulfillment of FEO they would achieve.
The question then is raised, to what degree the fulfillment of FEO should take priority, or rather take a back seat, when this moral aim conflicts with others that might be regarded as justice aims or on other grounds morally mandatory aims.
Although FEO carries the idea of offsetting the advantages of being well-born to its logical limit, it should be noted that by allowing differential ambition legitimately to affect individuals' life chances, FEO may not go far enough toward defining an ideal of genuine equal opportunity. The simple elimination of ambition from the FEO formula would be implausible. Let us stipulate that two individuals are equally ambitious with respect to some goal when they desire it with equal fervor and are disposed to work equally hard to achieve it. If Sally desires to go to a selective college and works hard at her high school classes whereas equally talented Samantha does not have the same strong desire and avoids doing her high school classwork, no reasonable conception of substantive equality of opportunity is violated when Sally gains admission to an elite college and Samantha does not. The FEO ideal embodies a division of responsibility between individual and society, with ambition falling on the side of individual not social responsibility.
But other cases are different and call in question this division of responsibility. Suppose that FEO obtains in a society but overwhelmingly boys develop the ambition to pursue challenging and lucrative careers and girls overwhelmingly do not. The explanation is that boys and girls alike are subjected to a rigid form of socialization which instills ambition in boys and quashes it in girls. In this case one might say that even though FEO is not violated when Sam and Ben become lawyers and doctors and Sally and Samantha, equally talented as Sam and Ben but far less ambitious, become homemakers and check-out clerks in convenience stores, genuine substantive equality of opportunity has not yet been achieved. In the society with rigid sex-stereotyped socialization, Sally and Samantha have not had a fair opportunity to develop the ambition that Ben and Sam have developed because only the latter benefited from the good luck of receiving favorable socialization. One might modify FEO so that if two people have the same native talent, but one ends up with lesser prospects of success in competitions for positions of advantage because her ambition has been reduced by prejudicial or discriminatory socialization, then FEO is violated (on this issue, see Okin 1991). (Again, to satisfy modified FEO one must either effectively prevent parents and other guardian figures from rearing their children in ways that distort ambition formation or effectively institute social policies that entirely offset this untoward influence on children's upbringing. Also, to fully implement modified FEO one would be required either to eliminate diffuse social distortions operating on ambition formation or effectively counteract them.)
The idea of one person having the same native talent as another, invoked in the statement of FEO, is unclear. Consider a simple example. Suppose we could install just one of two educational programs in a two-person society consisting of Smith and Jones. One provides more intensive education, the other a more relaxed schooling. Under the intensive regime, Jones ends up with higher earnings prospects, and under the relaxed regime, Smith ends up with higher earnings prospects. Which to choose? Equality of fair opportunity does not say. Or taken strictly, with the construal that the capacity to respond to schooling is a talent, FEO requires only that persons with identical dispositions to develop exactly the same skill level in any schooling and socialization regime qualify as having the same talent, and the proposal is silent about choices that would produce different results for different individuals with different talents in this strict sense. Since in practice we only discover what talents people have by subjecting them to one or another schooling regime, FEO, which had looked severely strict, now looks to be lax and undemanding. What must be added to FEO to respond to this difficulty is some sensible continuity requirement, so that if two individuals' capacities to develop skills through schooling are “close”, the developed skills they acquire (and ultimately their competitive success) should not be “too dissimilar.”
Equal opportunity norms are linked to the ideal of a society in which wrongful discrimination does not occur. Regarding fair equality of opportunity, the linkage is not tight.
What look to be wrongful discrimination and fulfillment of FEO could coexist, if FEO is not construed as incorporating formal equality of opportunity but as a freestanding requirement. Suppose society is divided into mutually hostile racial and ethnic groups, each of which has roughly the same wealth, population, and social power. Members of each group favor their own in economic decision making. The result is that the economy is divided into racial and ethnic spheres of influence. People of Scandinavian ancestry dominate the winter resort industry; people of Asian ancestry dominate the financial services industry, and so on. Formal equality of opportunity is routinely violated, because applicants of Scandinavian background are favored in winter resort hirings, applicants of Asian background are favored in competition for financial service posts, and so on. But overall, it happens to turn out that those with equal talent and equal ambition have overall equal prospects for success in competitions for positions that confer advantages, so FEO is satisfied. (Either members from each group form only ambitions for success in the types of enterprises in which members of their particular group are dominant, or for each person with given talents, lack of opportunity in one range of competitions for advantage is exactly offset by above-average opportunity is some other range of competitions for advantage, so each person with the same talent and same ambition has the same prospects for competitive success.) The situation just described might seem unlikely to persist, but we might imagine government policy operating to sustain the conditions in which non-inclusive FEO is fulfilled even though formal equality of opportunity is not.
We might also imagine a more benign version of a society in which members of each separate and distinct group in society cluster together and favor each other in economic and social interactions. We would then see industrial and occupational clumping: Those of Korean descent might dominate the hotel industry, while those of Hispanic descent might dominate construction; women might be more likely to be lawyers and doctors, men more likely to be business entrepreneurs, and so on. We might imagine that group members are not moved by prejudice or animus against members of other groups. Rather people find it more comfortable to work with fellow group members rather than outsiders; trust is easier to build and sustain within groups than across them. We would expect opportunities to be vastly unequal across group lines when this situation obtains, but it is conceivable that this is not so: suppose non-inclusive FEO is satisfied. The situation might be one in which reasonable statistical discrimination is rampant: the fact that one is a woman is a good indicator one will prove to be a good team member in a law firm consisting of women lawyers, and so on. If this is so, the society exhibiting social group clustering in economic cooperation might satisfy formal equality of opportunity as well as non-inclusive FEO. Another possibility is that formal equality of opportunity is massively violated in this society, yet non-inclusive FEO is satisfied. The example presses on our attention the issue, which norm should take priority, have greater weight, formal equality of opportunity or non-inclusive FEO, when they come in conflict.
Equality of opportunity ideals apply to the process that selects political rulers and political decisions. Consider two conceptions of democratic equality. Formal democratic equality requires that all long-term residents of a political society be eligible to become citizens and that all citizens are eligible to vote and stand for office in free and fair elections that pick law-makers for the society. In addition, formal democratic equality requires that influential officials charged with executing the law should either be (1) elected in fair and free elections or (2) appointed by the law-makers or (3) appointed through some process that selects applicants according to their qualifications. As sketched, formal democratic equality could be satisfied in a society in which only wealthy individuals are in practice able to run for political office and only graduates of certain elite schools are able to have any influence at all on the policy decisions and laws enacted by the government. One might then espouse a substantive ideal of democratic equality, which would be satisfied in a formally democratic society just in case any individuals with the same political talent and the same ambition to influence public policy have the same prospect of influencing public policy choice (Rawls 1999, 2001; Christiano 1996).
Substantive democratic equality is akin to Rawlsian fair equality of opportunity in the sphere of politics. (Only “akin to”, because the former requires that those with equal developed political talent and political ambition have the same prospects of political influence, whereas the latter requires equal prospects for those with equal native talent and equal ambition.) One can view recent political controversies regarding initiatives to limit the impact of lobbyists and wealthy political donors on the democratic political process through the lens of this ideal. A society might institute public funding of political campaigns and restrictions on private donations to political campaigns in order to make progress toward approximating the democratic equality ideal.
Implementing the substantive ideal of democratic equality might conflict with other justice norms (Estlund 2000). Suppose that restrictions on campaign financing and lobbying by interest groups reduce the influence of the wealthy on political policy choices, so that democratic equality is more nearly fulfilled. It might be the case that the now prohibited extra contributions of the wealthy would have enhanced the quality of political deliberation and produced better informed and substantively more just political decisions and hence more just laws and public policies. If it was discovered that a trade-off of this sort exists, one might believe that the pursuit of substantive democratic equality should be curtailed and that an optimal balance among the conflicting justice values should be defined. Some might hold that the point of democratic politics is to produce just laws and policies and substantively just outcomes generally and that substantive democratic equality should have no weight against this fundamental aim and should be pursued just to the extent it is a means to substantive justice.
Fair equality of fair opportunity is a severe doctrine. Its requirements extend far beyond the injunction to eschew public-sphere discrimination. How stringent the policy implications of FEO become depends on the relative priority assigned to this principle as against other fundamental moral requirements.
The question arises whether there is some plausible intermediate position that renders equality of opportunity more demanding than formal equality of opportunity but less demanding than FEO. One such intermediate position already described combines formal equality of opportunity with the additional requirement that society provide good enough opportunities for all its members to develop their native talents so as to become qualified for competitive positions. The idea here would be that there is some threshold level of opportunity to develop one's native talents into skills to which all are entitled. The challenge for one attracted to this position would be to develop a theory of the “good enough.”
Another possible intermediate position combines formal equality of opportunity with the requirement that present effects of past wrongful violations of formal equality of opportunity should be fully offset. According to this conception of equal opportunity, if Catholics suffered violations of formal equality of opportunity for many years in a nation in which Protestantism was the officially privileged state-established religion, and these wrongful violations reduced the wealth of Catholics and their descendants, ceasing now to impose any further violations of formal equality of opportunity on Catholics does not establish a regime of genuine equality of opportunity, since some continue to benefit, others to suffer, from past wrongs. But once recompense is made for past wrongful discrimination, formal equality of opportunity suffices. An extension of this view would hold that the effects of all unjust policies and practices insofar as they affect people's present opportunities to become qualified for competitions regulated by formal equality of opportunity should be undone (Buchanan et al. 2000: chapter 3).
A third possible intermediate position combines formal equality of opportunity with the requirement that state action should treat all citizens equally and not confer arbitrary advantages on some along with arbitrary disadvantages on others. On this view, even the substantive aspect of equality of opportunity is a deontological requirement, a moral constraint on permissible action, not a specification of a goal that morally ought to be achieved. Call this position the deontological requirement interpretation of equality of opportunity. Unlike FEO, the deontological requirement does not hold that substantive equality of opportunity is violated if some parents provide better educational opportunities for their children than other parents. The deontological requirement does not specify that a society must establish a system of state-funded education. But if the state does operate schools or provides funds to defray the costs of some children's education, the state violates the deontological requirement if its schools or disbursements of funds to parents earmarked for children do not operate in an evenhanded manner but instead arbitrarily confer advantages on some over others. Operating schools for Roman Catholics only or paying for the school tuition only of children who attend Roman Catholic schools would be clear cases of violation of the deontological interpretation. A perhaps more controversial example would be the operation by the state of public schools funded by general tax revenues that are formally open to all resident children but are physically accessible only to children who can walk normally or set at a level such that some severely retarded or otherwise cognitively impaired children can gain no benefit from the instruction that is provided. According to the deontological requirement of equal treatment, these policies would be violations of equality of opportunity if and only if they arbitrarily advantage some children and disadvantage others.
The equal treatment norm, strictly interpreted, is a significant constraint on policy choice. Suppose equal treatment is interpreted as requiring that a government service that is provided to some citizens shall be provided to all without discrimination against any group of citizens. Next imagine that the government proposes to provide health care coverage to all citizens and to ration coverage so as to maximize the number of quality-adjusted years of life (QALYs) secured by health care. Any scheme of this sort will recommend discrimination against disabled citizens, in the sense that the scheme will tend to recommend provision of treatment to an otherwise able person afflicted with some illness while recommending against treatment of a disabled person afflicted with a comparable case of the same illness (this recommendation occurs whenever this course of action is QALY-maximizing) (Brock 2000). Virtually any distributive norm that recommends raising or lowering the level of benefits to be provided for individuals depending on a comparison of costs of provision to well-being gains achieved for the recipient will conflict with equal treatment interpreted as requiring no discrimination among citizens on such a basis.
A problematic but illuminating case is age discrimination (Daniels 1988, McKerlie 1989, 1999, 2013; Temkin 1993: chapter 8). A society might establish a state policy that mandates transfers of resources from older to younger citizens, by using public funds to operate schools for the education of children. A society might also follow a health care policy that rations life-preserving care made available to the very old in order to reduce the extent to which expensive medical technology extends the lifespans of very old people with reduced quality of life. In the same spirit, the society might tilt health care policies toward saving the lives of very young people threatened with premature death. In short, the society enacts coercive state policies that favor the young over the old. Such a policy counts as denial of equal treatment if the units to be treated equally are persons (of any age) at a given time. The policy is arguably consistent with equal treatment if the units to be treated equally are individuals over their whole lives. At least, this would be so if all individuals lived through youth to the same old age. In the world in which everyone lived to old age, discrimination against the old would be unlike discrimination in favor of Catholics and against Protestants, or in favor of men and against women, or in favor of whites and against Hispanics. The exception to all these cases, discrimination against the old would be consistent with equal treatment of each individual over the course of her life. If the unrealistic assumption that all live to the same old age is dropped, then equal treatment with the units to be treated equally being individuals over the course of their lives would seem to forbid any expenditure at all on the health care of the old who have already received more than those who died at a young age.
The example of age discrimination either discredits the equal treatment norm or indicates that it cries out for further interpretation. Surely some denials of literal equal treatment do not violate any plausible equal opportunity norm. If the state provides health care coverage to all citizens, the sick will get treatment and the well will get no treatment, but this is not an invidious inequality. One might say all equally are eligible for health care if they need it. But in general, many seemingly morally acceptable state policies will have different effects on different groups of citizens. If a law is passed instituting policies to preserve the environment for future generations, some present citizens will benefit, and some, such as loggers who have been working on old-growth redwoods, will lose. One might interpret the equal treatment norm as requiring that in the aggregate over the long haul, coercive state policies should benefit roughly all citizens to an equal extent. (But why must benefits in the long run be equal for all?) On this view, society acting through the state is not required to do anything to offset inequalities it has not caused (included in this set of inequalities are many that would be eliminated under a Rawlsian FEO policy). But if the state acts in a way that affects people's life prospects, it should act in an evenhanded way that boosts everyone's life prospects to roughly the same extent. Notice that the equal treatment norm would be unproblematically satisfied by a state that did nothing for its citizens. Also, if children of wealthy parents will receive excellent education whatever the state does and will have fine life prospects that can be boosted only by a little bit by state provision of education, then equal treatment would seem to require the state to provide only small amounts of state-provided or state-funded education with benefits spread so none get a significantly bigger boost than the children of the wealthy get from state aid. (But see Pogge 1989: 44–46.)
The variety of conceptions of equality of opportunity suggests the complexity of the task of assessing what are called “affirmative action” programs in societies that are marred by a history of caste hierarchy and systematic discrimination that excludes some groups in the population from any significant access to the fruits of social cooperation.
Consider a stylized example. Suppose that in the U.S., whites have enjoyed superior social status, enforced by law and social custom, for decades, going back to times in which blacks were enslaved. Now whites on the average have greater wealth and education and blacks have less. Suppose that formal equality of opportunity is now proclaimed as the law of the land and embraced by popular morality. Still, most superior positions in society continue to go to whites. In this context a variety of measures might be adopted with the aim of increasing the effective opportunities enjoyed by blacks. Special educational resources might be channeled to them. For a time, to unsettle the status quo in which whites enjoy the lion's share of social privileges, quotas might be imposed by law or social custom. The quota requires that special preference be given to blacks when employment decisions are made until blacks and whites share in the superior positions and posts of society in proportion to their numbers.
Affirmative action programs of this sort might be justified on the ground that in a world where discrimination persists, coercive imposition of quotas helps here and now to bring about greater fulfillment of formal equality of opportunity. The quota might exert an effect that roughly counter-balances the opposite effect of continuing unacknowledged discrimination. Here is a stylized example that illustrates how this could occur. Suppose that those responsible for making hires are prejudiced, and this takes the form of (in effect) assigning extra points to white applicants. A white applicant who merits 60 points on a 100 point scale gets assigned 70 points. If we respond by legally requiring the assignment of 10 extra points to all nonwhite applicants, to offset the bias, the hiring officials might unconsciously respond by boosting the scores of white applicants still further, so that the tilt in favor of hiring whites remains intact. In these circumstances, if (a big if) the social planner can estimate what proportion of nonwhite applicants will be more qualified than whites, a rigid quota that requires the hiring of a specified proportion of nonwhite to white applicants can bring about hiring results that do better at achieving formal equality of opportunity than either the policy of letting firms hire as they please or the policy of requiring firms to favor nonwhite applicants by boosting the merit ratings of their applications.
Another, more likely scenario is that the two components of the Rawlsian FEO might come into conflict in situations of persistent disadvantage imposed on people on the basis of their supposed race or skin color. Suppose that educational opportunities for nonwhites, compared to those provided for whites, are subpar. The result is that individuals of different races with the same native talent and the same ambition face very unequal prospects of competitive success—greater if they are white, lesser if they are nonwhite. Now imagine that an affirmative action plan of reverse discrimination is put into effect. In violation of formal equality of opportunity, nonwhite applicants are favored over equally qualified whites. Depending on the details of the affirmative action plan, especially the extent to which the plan favors nonwhites over whites, the result might be that while formal equality of opportunity is violated, substantive equality of opportunity (those with the same native talent and the same ambition have the same prospects of competitive success) is more nearly achieved than it would have been had formal equality of opportunity been sustained.
One might doubt that any good would come of attempts to achieve the substantive equality of opportunity component of FEO by violating formal equality of opportunity. Hiring the unqualified will bring it about that they flounder in their posts, the jobs are less well done, social conflict increases, and society suffers. So one might speculate. This dismal outcome might or might not come about. Violating formal equality of opportunity to fulfill substantive equality need not dictate hiring the unqualified, just the less qualified. The affirmative action plan might be constrained by a rule that forbids stretching the preference given to nonwhites to the point that basic competence to perform the tasks associated with the post that is being filled is lacking in those selected. In some cases, those denied educational advantages but natively talented may if hired respond with alacrity to the demands of the position in which they find themselves, and learn on the job faster than might have been expected. But whether the expected consequences generated by an affirmative action plan that violates formal equality of opportunity are bad, good, or neutral, there remains the violation of formal equality of opportunity, which some will view as in itself a grave injustice.
Defenders of affirmative action programs that violate the careers open to talents norm might respond in either of two ways to the concern that "Don't discriminate against applicants on the basis of race, sex, creed, or color" is a strict deontological requirement, a constraint on just public policy.
One response would be to uphold the substantive equality of opportunity component of Rawlsian FEO as itself a strict deontological requirement and one that trumps careers open to talents. Another response would be to defend affirmative action on the ground that its judicious deployment would be likely to increase the extent to which FEO is fulfilled in the long run. Here the idea presumably would be that the existence of quotas would unsettle expectations and lead to changes in socialization and belief formation. The factual claims on which this type of justification rests might be disputed. But disputes might also pit the two components of FEO, formal and substantive equality of opportunity, against each other. To settle such disputes would require a definitive assessment of the conceptions of equality of opportunity and an authoritative determination of the weight that equality of opportunity on its various construals should have against other justice values.
Does a society that embraces and fulfills equality of opportunity (rightly interpreted) necessarily provide social mobility? In a word, No. To illustrate the point, consider a society whose population is divided into deciles by household income (the income of adult partners combined and of each adult living alone and as sole head of household). Identify social mobility in this society with the chance that any given individual will as an adult live in a household that places in a higher decile of household income than the one in which he was placed as a child, along with the chance that he will end up in a lower decile. Social mobility in the society is high to the degree that knowing an individual's decile of family origin is not predictive of his own decile and low to the degree that this information is predictive.
A low degree of social mobility may be an indicator that the idea of careers open to talents is significantly violated. Children of poor families are not eligible to apply for plummy positions, or if they are eligible and do apply, their applications are discounted, not fairly assessed on their merits with a guide to choosing who gets offered the positions. A low degree of social mobility might also be an indicator the society fails by a very wide margin to satisfy FEO. Of course learning that society fails to satisfy FEO would hardly be a surprise: surely no modern society has ever done so. But a society might be closer or further from satisfying FEO, and low social mobility might indicate that the society's divergence from FEO is very large indeed.
But what might be so here is not necessarily so. A society could in theory perfectly satisfy careers open to talents while the position in the social hierarchy into which an individual is born entirely determines the prospects for becoming qualified for desirable competitive posts and being selected to fill them. A perhaps more interesting possibility is that a society could perfectly satisfy FEO or some other version of substantive equality of opportunity and also exhibit a very low degree of social mobility or even none at all. In the illustrative example, this scenario unfolds if the family of origin income decile of every member of society perfectly predicts that person's own family income.
There are two ways, both of them disturbing and unsettling, by which a society of zero social mobility could simultaneously satisfy FEO. One is that the rank order of each person's genetically given native talent endowment mirrors the rank order of each person's family of origin income. If there are 100 persons in the current generation of individuals and your native talent endowment is overall 40th-best, your family of origin income is also 40th-best, and the same holds for every other member of the current generation. If any two people in society have the same native talent endowment and the same ambition, they have the same prospects for competitive success, and their family of origin incomes will also be the same. Another possible mechanism is that ambition formation tracks family of origin income position (via some process that does not itself violate FEO), so that no persons with the same native talent endowment and different family of origin incomes have the same ambition, so their having different prospects of competitive success does not violate FEO. There could also be social dynamics that involve mixes of the two ways to produce satisfaction of FEO along with zero social mobility.
Many contemporary societies have made undeniable progress toward satisfying careers open to talents, and some have at least moved forward by inches toward the distant goal of satisfaction of FEO. In these societies one can detect seeds that could blossom into a highly meritocratic society with no social mobility.
Here is a stylized description of the recent history of affluent industrialized societies. Social barriers to women's participation in the labor market and in the full range of economic roles are gradually dismantled, and women do come to participate on more equal terms with men. These developments increase the degree to which careers open to talents and FEO are fulfilled. There is real progress. The twist is that one might speculate that via assortative mating, over time those with more native talent than others are more successful and have children who have more native talent than others and in turn are more successful. In the long run, native talent endowment and family of origin social class position run together for all members of society. Even now, “The winners in the new economy are marrying each other and consolidating their gains”, a sociologist describing U.S. marriage trends comments (Cherlin 2010: 179; see also Esping-Anderson 2009: 59–70).
Of course the couples described in this statement are consolidating their gains not simply by passing on their genes to their offspring but also by investing resources in their children to give them a special boost over others in the social competitions they will face as adults. So the trend involves behavior that if unopposed produces continuous large violations of FEO. But notice that in theory a sorting of people with more favorable genetic endowment into higher income classes could yield a situation in which the favorably endowed rich lavish resources on their children to enhance their competitive skills, so rich kids get far better education and socialization than poor kids, yet those with the same native talent potential and the same ambition still end up with the same chances of competitive success, so FEO is satisfied. In theory a perfect meritocracy (satisfying both careers open and non-inclusive FEO) can be a rigidly stratified class hierarchy with no movement of individuals from the social class of their birth.
Even if the scenario just described in empirically far-fetched, its conceptual possibility raises questions about equal opportunity norms. Should we view the envisaged triumph of meritocracy with equanimity or moral alarm? One response is that this line of thought just reinforces the point that these two equal opportunity norms do not add up to a full theory of social justice. Maybe satisfaction of equal opportunity norms is necessary but not sufficient for social justice. Another response is that reflection on the idea of a meritocracy drives home the point that the various norms of equal opportunity can in practice come into conflict with each other and with other social justice ideals. To some extent our wholehearted embrace of equal opportunity may be supported by a tendency to imagine that increasing fulfillment of equal opportunity goes hand in hand with increasing fulfillment of several social justice desiderata. A halo effect influences our judgment. A recognition of this bias in judgment prompts the question, how much if at all we ought to care about equal opportunity norms for their own sakes, when their greater fulfillment comes at the cost of lesser fulfillment of other values.
The relationships among the various values and norms jostling for position here are complex. Notice that if our foremost concern were to establish and sustain a society in which careers open to talents along with the substantive equality component of FEO is satisfied and there is also a high level of social mobility, one strategy would be to ban assortative mating or enact policies that discourage it. “Assortative mating” simply refers to people choosing to cohabit with those who are like themselves along some favored dimensions of similarity. These dimensions might include race, religion, national origin, level of education, inherited wealth, physical attractiveness, charm, or marketable talent. The assortative mating that reduces social mobility involves sorting by factors that give rise to unequal income, wealth, and status. Although many might dislike the outcomes of such assortative mating, few would countenance restrictions on individual liberty to date and marry in whatever way people happen to come together by mutual consent. However, social policies could alter people's incentives without directly restricting their liberty to date and mate as they choose. For example, highly progressive taxation rates on income and wealth would reduce the financial gains that two well-off persons could achieve by getting married.
The question also arises whether we should care about maintaining a high level of social mobility for its own sake, as opposed to caring about other features of society with which social mobility might be contingently associated and causally linked. For example, it might be the case that establishing and sustaining a society of democratic equality in which all members share a fundamental equal status and relate as equals might be incompatible with a skewed distribution of income and wealth beyond some threshold level and with lack of social mobility below some threshold level. If so, then if we have good reason to care about democratic equality either for its own sake or instrumentally we also have good reasons to care about increasing social mobility as its prerequisite.
There is a dimension of equality of opportunity not yet mentioned. Imagine a warrior society in which only martial prowess and accomplishment confer status and reward. The society might perfectly conform both to formal and substantive equality of opportunity. Any adult member of society is encouraged to apply for any warrior post that becomes open and all applications are assessed fairly on their merits. The most qualified candidate is offered the post and, if she turns down the offer, the second-most-qualified receives an offer, and so on. Moreover, educational arrangements bring it about that any two persons in the society with the same ambition and native abilities will have the same prospects of success in competition for warrior posts. Despite fulfilling formal and substantive equality of opportunity, the society just sketched is deficient from the standard of equality of opportunity. To see this, consider that no talents and accomplishments except those of warriors are encouraged, developed, and rewarded. Those who have the ability to be artists, farmers, singers, story-tellers, rock musicians, or anything else, are just out of luck. These people have a complaint that their abilities have no scope for expression.
The example suggests that equality of opportunity prevails in a society only when all worthy human capacities are encouraged, developed, and rewarded. The wider the range of worthy capacities and abilities that a society fosters, other things being equal, the greater the extent to which it achieves equality of opportunity. The more this condition is met in a society, the wider the scope it provides for equality of opportunity (see Schaar 1967 and Galston 1986). Feminists have raised this concern with emphasis on its application to the condition of women. A society could satisfy even stringent equal opportunity norms even though dominant males control resources and set the goals of institutions so that opportunities to develop capacities that men tend to favor are plentiful and opportunities to develop capacities that suit women are scarce.
The wide-scope condition on an equality of opportunity ideal admits of stronger and weaker versions. On the strong version, all worthy human capacities must be equally encouraged, developed, and rewarded. On the weakest version, each of these worthy human capacities must be encouraged, developed, and rewarded to some extent. One could concoct requirements of intermediate strength. The strong version seems demanding to a bizarre extreme, and illustrates the point that an equality of opportunity ideal only seems uncontroversial when left vague and unspecified. An alternative view of scope requirements would hold that certain social processes that restrict the scope of opportunity are unacceptable, but no particular extent of scope is mandatory for a society.
The equality of opportunity ideals canvassed to this point have been designed mainly for application to the economic sphere of life broadly construed. When opportunities are equal, people have equal opportunities to get ahead. However, it is not obviously the case that when people advance equal opportunity claims, the background ideal to which they are appealing is limited to any one sphere of social life. Historic struggles have been waged to secure equal voting rights and equal rights to participate in the political process for disenfranchised groups including women, those disfavored on racial grounds, and members of lower-ranked castes. The vote can be used to advance one's economic interests but its significance is not limited to that. Having the freedom to participate in political affairs on the same terms as other members of society is an element in being a full member of society equal in fundamental status to all others.
At least two possible generalizations of equal opportunity norms are worth consideration. One generalization is to all public sphere interactions. Another is to all interactions across the board, private as well as public.
Public sphere formal equality of opportunity obtains in a society if and only if all public sphere institutions and practices and associations are open to all members of society, with selection for especially favorable treatment or appointment to any position in any sphere being made on a meritocratic basis. Anyone is eligible to apply for favorable treatment or special appointment, applications are judged on their merits, according to relevant criteria of merit for that particular institution, practice, or association, and selection proceeds in order of merit. Public sphere substantive equality of opportunity obtains if and only if formal public sphere equal opportunity obtains and in addition all members of society have some substantial opportunity to develop traits that would render them qualified for any public sphere positions they might seek. Public sphere fair equality of opportunity (FEO) obtains if and only if any two individuals with the same native talent potential for becoming qualified for any type of public sphere position and the same ambition to become qualified have identical prospects of success in the competition for such positions.
What these wide equal opportunity norms require depends on how one should draw the line between public and private spheres. Institutions established and run by the state are in the public sphere, as are business firms that seek to sell products and services to individuals or to other businesses. A club devoted to playing a sport or promoting a hobby is in the public sphere, as is a league of such clubs. Friendships are in the private sphere. Dating and mating are in the private sphere. Many aspects of family relations involving socializing among family members are in the private sphere. Several friends cooperating together on a project or activity are engaged in private sphere association, but establishing a club or association to promote a general purpose is engaging in the public sphere. The line between public and private for purposes of applying the public sphere equal opportunity norms will no doubt be blurry and indefinite, but that does not per se drain the norms of content or significance.
When wide formal equality of opportunity is satisfied in a society, people receive equal treatment in the judicial system, in the sense that one's likelihood of success in legal proceedings depends only on the merits of one's case and not at all on other factors such as one's race, creed, color, sex or sexual orientation, and so on. In criminal proceedings, juries are not more likely to convict or acquit a defendant just because she is white or black or brown, Catholic or Hindu or atheist, male or female, heterosexual or nonheterosexual, and so on. Nor are judges more or less likely to treat one as one ought to be treated according to one's legal rights, depending on one's particular group memberships.
Consider the practice of racial profiling in police work (Risse and Zeckhauser 2004). Suppose that police stop and frisk individuals who appear, by a variety of indicators, to be engaged in criminal activity, and that among the indicators is the apparent race or ethnicity of the individual. Does such a practice violate wide formal equality of opportunity? The policy might just reflect racial and ethnic prejudice and animus on the part of those who control police practices, but might instead reflect statistical discrimination, if individuals vary by apparent race or ethnicity in their proclivity to criminal activity. In the latter case, racial profiling might not violate wide formal equality of opportunity. If people engaged in crime are more likely to target as victims members of their own social groups, then failure to engage in racial profiling might bring it about that being of one or another race or ethnicity makes it more likely that one will be a victim of crime, and that fact might violate wide fair equality of opportunity.
When wide formal equality of opportunity is satisfied in a society, people receive equal treatment at the hands of state administrative agencies and also in noncompetitive receipt of services from business firms and nonprofit agencies. If you are in medical need, and have purchased the same medical insurance coverage, you do not receive better or worse care depending on how treatment providers are disposed to respond to your salient group memberships. Same goes if you are a customer in a restaurant, a client of a professional golf trainer, an applicant for a driver's license or for social security benefits to which one might be entitled, and so on.
A still wider interpretation of equal opportunity norms extends the domain of equal opportunity to all domains both public and private. Call this universal equal opportunity. Formal universal equal opportunity obtains in a society if and only if in any and all interactions among members of society, partners and participants for interaction are selected according to relevant criteria, depending on the nature of the interaction proposed. Substantive universal equal opportunity requires that all members of society have substantial opportunity to develop traits that would render them eligible for any type of interaction they might seek, and universal fair equality of opportunity (FEO) is defined in a similar way.
Universal equality of opportunity has some appeal (see Lippert-Rasmussen 2014). Consider selection of friends and romantic mates and marriage partners. In present-day society, barriers of culture, social status, race, and class stand in the way of personal relationships that might otherwise form. If I am white and Christian, and feel an inchoate aversion to blacks and Jews, I do not form friendships with members of these groups, or such friendships with them as I do strive to build are fraught and unstable. In the society of universal formal equality of opportunity, no one is moved by any such bias of discriminatory animus or prejudice; we all are color-blind and race-blind and ethnicity-blind and social status-blind and creed-blind in selecting participants in temporary and long-term schemes of interaction. If this universal freedom from prejudice and distrust is common knowledge among members of society, or close to that, one might plausibly conjecture that this common knowledge becomes a basis of social solidarity and general civility.
Objection: partners for friendship and romance are not selected according to “relevant criteria for interaction”, or at least, are not only selected by any selective process. One can simply become attracted to another person or group of persons from any arbitrary cause, and establishing interaction in this arbitrary way is not just appropriate for many kinds of informal interaction but is quintessentially appropriate.
Reply to objection: For informal interaction, the relevant criteria for selection may include brute attraction on any basis. For some forms of interaction, the only relevant criterion is brute attraction on any basis. For such basically merit-free interactions, universal formal equality of opportunity still plays a regulatory role. The role consists of ruling out as inappropriate brute attraction on discriminatory grounds. The way you wear your hat, the way you sing off-key, and virtually anything else may render you eligible for someone's affection, but not your skin color, your race, your ethnic background, your social or economic status, and so on. Notice that statistical discrimination is not per se objectionable from the standpoint of formal equality of opportunity, and this holds for the wider extensions of equal opportunity as well. So selecting a friend in part on the basis of accurate stereotypes (not prejudices) about the traits of members of her salient social group, that may be predictive of likely successful and fruitful friendship, does not per se violate formal universal equality of opportunity. However, if someone's group membership traits are predictive of successful friendship with me because I have a brute or prejudiced aversion to members of certain salient social groups, hooking together for interaction on that basis offends against that wide equal opportunity norm. To sum up: Formal universal equality of opportunity is not inherently inappropriate for the assessment of people's engagement in personal and private and intimate interaction. Moreover, the norm would have substantive content in this application, and restrain the types of interaction formation in which people engage. The ideal is essentially the ideal of a social world in which people lack irrational prejudice and animus against members of other groups, and this ideal is just as attractive in private as in public settings. Just as it would be morally wrong for me to decline to write a letter of recommendation for someone for a job because I harbor hostility to his racial makeup, it would be morally wrong for me to decline an offer of friendship from the same person just from aversion to his racial makeup.
State enforcement of universal formal equality of opportunity in its private sphere applications would almost certainly do more harm than good. However, the fact that we do not want the police arresting people who choose friends on some allegedly prejudiced basis does not rule out enforcement of this universal social norm. Enforcement of social norms including this one might be carried out effectively by enlightened public opinion expressing itself in attitudes and private sphere choices. One might hold that for a genuine social norm to be in place in a society, there must be some enforcement mechanism in place. The norm states what in some sense you ought to do, and what you will be in some sense punished for not doing.
Although informal enforcement of wide equal opportunity norms is possible, one might question the desirability of the ideals and the acceptability of their enforcement. Maybe any feasible social norm of this sort would exercise too much regulatory control over matters that are best left to wide unencumbered individual freedom, and dampen too much that is merely idiosyncratic, eccentric, or just nondeliberative and spontaneous.
Equality of opportunity in its various guises would appear to be apt for legal enforcement. Equal opportunity is proclaimed to be an essential plank in the edifice of social justice, and justice demands are obligatory not optional. The moral presumption is that justice demands should be enforced, and in the absence of anarchy, the state has the role of coercive enforcement of justice.
In practice, in modern societies, the modes of legal enforcement are various, and pursued with varying degrees of commitment. For example, vigorous enforcement of prohibitions of violent assault across a territory would contribute to the equal opportunity of women along with men to move freely and with safety across the territory. Here wide formal opportunity of opportunity is at stake.
We might move in the direction of fair equality of opportunity by maintaining public schools financed by general tax revenue. Further moves are possible. A state might require that local governments equalize spending per pupil across school districts of varying wealth. A state might mandate extra spending per pupil in low-income school districts, with a view to offsetting extra resources provided to children with affluent and well-educated parents. A state might mandate mixing students from different neighborhoods in comprehensive schools so that children from low-income and high-income families are evenly spread across area schools. A state might ban privately financed schools at the primary and secondary level in order to prevent high-income parents from avoiding measures to promote equal opportunity in public schools. And so on. In the contemporary U.S., even the first-mentioned of these FEO-promoting measures is controversial.
As with almost any legal rule, the hope is that enforcing equal opportunity norms will not simply coerce people's behavior but will contribute to changing the hearts and minds of men and women so that the norms become internalized. Liberals propose free debate, along with justified coercion of behavior, as the engine propelling this change. Limits on freedom of expression might be proposed to the same purpose. Catharine MacKinnon observes that
it is impossible for an individual to receive equality of opportunity when surrounded by an atmosphere of group hate. (MacKinnon 1993)
In this spirit, section 319(2) of the Canadian Criminal Code states that
Every one who, by communicating statements, other than in private conversation, willfully promotes hatred against any identifiable group
is guilty of a criminal offense, except that there are exceptions for any statements that are true, good faith religious argument, good faith contributions to public debate on matters of public interest, and statements that call attention to hate-promoting conditions with a view to their removal. Some other nations have similar provisions against hate speech.
In the same vein, some feminists have argued that some of what used to be regarded as obscene materials should be reclassified as pornography that constitutes a violation of the civil rights of women and counts as discrimination against them. The antifemale pornography that these arguments target is sexually explicit material that portrays women as inferior or as apt for subordination or other forms of mistreatment. Some suggest that the publication and dissemination of this material impinges on the freedom of speech of women by creating a social atmosphere in which their would-be contributions are not taken seriously and not treated on their merits in public debate and in some cases cannot be understood (so some members of the public are effectively unable to make certain assertions) (Mackinnon 1987, 1993; Langton 1993). The issues raised here can serve as illustration of the ways in which pressing an equal opportunity agenda might not only unsettle traditional views about how to balance conflicting political values but might also transform our understanding of exactly what values are in play in such a balancing exercise.
In modern societies, legal prohibitions and restrictions of discrimination clearly aim in some sense at establishing and sustaining equal opportunity. In what sense? Legal doctrines of discrimination are complex and differ from country to country. In many jurisdictions the law distinguishes between disparate treatment and disparate impact.
For example, U.S. employment law forbids disparate treatment of protected groups in an employer's decisions about hiring, promotion, and conditions and benefits of work. Disparate treatment includes denying an applicant a position for which she is otherwise qualified on the basis of her race. The law also regulates disparate impact, as follows. If an employer uses a hiring procedure that has a disparate impact on members of protected groups, defined by race, color, religion, sex, and national origin, that fact establishes a prima facie case. Disparate impact occurs if the proportion of protected-category applicants who are hired is smaller than their proportion in the relevant labor pool. If the employer is sued, and a prima facie case is established, she can rebut the prima facie case by showing that the hiring procedure in question is job-related and justified by business necessity, unless the government agency or individuals bringing suit can propose an alternative hiring test that is just as good for the purpose and would not have disparate impact. The comparable Canadian law requires that an employer make “reasonable accommodation, short of undue hardship” to avoid disparate impact roughly as just described.
The disparate treatment of U.S. employment law forbids statistical discrimination against members of protected groups. For example, an employer might consider being prone to absenteeism a decisive disqualification for a particular job, and have sound statistical evidence that women (who might have caretaking responsibilities that prevent them from coming to work) and blacks (who must rely on unreliable public transportation to arrive at the work site) are more likely than white and Hispanic males to display absenteeism, and restrict hiring to white and Hispanic males on this basis. The law requires that an employer's decision to hire should be based on particular evidence about individual candidates not statistical generalizations.
Some have raised doubts about the justifiability of disparate impact restrictions on employers. The claim is that disparate treatment involves wrongful discrimination, an appropriate target of legal prohibition. In contrast, disparate impact restriction targets a supposed bad effect that arises from the aggregate of many innocent acts by business firms making employment decisions. If the point of the law is to bring about a more just distribution of opportunities, this should be done by public policy instruments that spread the burden of advancing this desirable social goal across all members of society in some fair manner. There is no basis for singling out the group of employers whose practices happen to result in disparate impact and requiring them to shoulder the load for all of us.
Some go further and raise doubts about whether disparate impact legal restrictions can be justified as seeking to promote (what should be regarded as) a just distribution of opportunities. Further doubts concern whether these laws, even if aimed at a genuine justice goal, are an effective means to any such goal.
However, the contrast between laws that aim to advance a public policy aim and laws that aim to prohibit or restrict wrongful conduct may be ill drawn. Suppose that disparate impact laws amount to a mild form of affirmative action. The law requires that if an employer can choose among several alternative employment practices, all roughly equally effective in advancing her business aims, she must choose the one that does the most to advance the hiring and promotion of members of protected and under-represented groups. If the affirmative action goals the law promotes are worthwhile, and disparate impact is a reasonably effective means of advancing them, then the individual arguably does wrong by not cooperating in this social justice initiative by conforming to law. The wrong does not consist in conduct that can be characterized as immoral apart from the existence of the law, but is simply wrongful violation of a justified law. (An alternative view would be that if there was a widespread voluntary practice of accepting certain restrictions on conduct to advance a social justice goal, an individual who deviates from the practice without good reason would be unfairly failing to contribute her bit to this justice-promoting practice and hence behaving wrongly.) This train of thought assumes that the scheme to advance the social justice goal does not unfairly disadvantage an affected class of people, but this constraint does not necessarily demand equal sharing of burdens among all members of society. Sometimes the fact that one is uniquely well placed to advance a worthy goal at small expense to oneself warrants requiring one to absorb the costs of taking the necessary steps.
Affirmative action, as already noted in this entry, might serve several distinct equal opportunity goals. Affirmative action including disparate impact restrictions might simply be a cost-effective means to squash disparate treatment that would otherwise escape legal constraints. In a situation where disparate treatment exists but would be hard to prove, disparate impact may be easier to prove. If so, disparate impact laws would be aimed at increasing the degree to which the ideal of careers open to talents is fulfilled.
Affirmative action might in some circumstances involve imposing temporary violations of careers open to talents in order to increase the long-term fulfillment of this ideal. Affirmative action might serve as a form of redress for past wrongs, compensating victims of wrongful discrimination in the past for their losses. Affirmative action might be a means to advance fair equality of opportunity (FEO) or some other substantive ideal of equality of opportunity.
Any or all of these proposed rationales might be challenged either on the ground that the rationale itself is normatively objectionable or that the means used to advance it are unfair or unduly restrictive of liberty or the like.
The conceptions of equality of opportunity canvassed so far are intended to be components of a theory of justice, but not all of it or even the central core of it. The general idea is that on some unspecified basis, a social hierarchy with superior and inferior positions is justified. The question then arises, on what basis should individuals gain access to superior positions (and be relegated to inferior positions)? Equality of opportunity is proposed as an answer or partial answer to that question. Equality of opportunity for access to superior positions might also be advanced as a condition that must be satisfied (among others) if the social hierarchy itself is to be morally acceptable.
Equality of opportunity of a sort has also been proposed as an answer to a quite different question. In this role equality of opportunity is conceived to be playing the central core role in a theory of distributive justice. The central question of distributive justice might be formulated in this way: Under what conditions is the distribution of liberties, opportunities, and goods that society makes available to persons just or morally fair? The equality-of-opportunity distributive justice theorist answers that the distribution is just only if it satisfies the norm of equality of opportunity, which requires that unchosen and uncourted inequalities should be eliminated and allows that when some individuals are worse off than others but could have avoided this condition by taking care or by making choices that would have been reasonable to make, given equal initial conditions and a fair framework for interaction, these inequalities may be left standing. (This condition might be claimed to be sufficient for just distribution as well as necessary.) This conception of equal opportunity proposed as the central element of distributive justice has been called the level playing field ideal (Roemer 1995, 1998), and is also known as luck egalitarianism (Cohen 1989, 2004, 2009; Mason 2006; Segall 2013; for criticism, see Anderson 1999, 2010; Pogge 2000; Buchanan et al. 2000; Scheffler 2003, 2005; and Fleurbaey 1995, 2008; for a response, see Tan 2008, 2012). The term “luck egalitarianism” was introduced by Elizabeth Anderson. The idea is that justice requires levelling the playing field by rendering everyone's opportunities equal in an appropriate sense, and then letting individual choices and their effects dictate further outcomes.
If equality of opportunity is a constraint on acceptable social hierarchy, luck egalitarian equality of opportunity presses the constraint so far as to subvert the idea of acceptable social hierarchy. When luck egalitarianism is fully satisfied, the only inequalities that are acceptable are such that those who get the short end of the stick could have become as well off as anyone else by pursuing a course of action it would have been reasonable for them to take and not impossible for them to take and not so difficult to pursue that it would be unreasonable to hold them responsible for not pursuing it. Hence one advocate characterizes luck egalitarianism as “socialist equality of opportunity” (Cohen 2009).
Another way to mark the difference between formal and substantive equality of opportunity on the one hand and level-the-playing-field (luck egalitarian) equality of opportunity on the other is to note that the former sets conditions on people fairly gaining advantageous positions in society but says nothing about the amount and kind of advantages that should attach to these positions. In contrast, the latter view when fully elaborated will specify both when and to what extent it is morally acceptable that some people are better off, enjoy greater advantages, than others.
A complication is that one might conceivably formulate a version of luck egalitarianism so that it says that all those who try equally hard or are otherwise equally meritorious or virtuous—regardless of their native talent or talent potential—should have the same prospects of gaining especially advantageous or better than average outcomes, while leaving it entirely open what should be the spread between the best and worse outcomes available in the society. This version of luck egalitarianism would be a more demanding version of substantive equality of opportunity than FEO. In contrast, luck egalitarianism as characterized here specifies that people's condition should be equal unless those who get the short end of the stick are appropriately held responsible for their condition. In addition to taking equality to be the moral default position, a fully elaborated luck egalitarian doctrine would specify the factors that determine, when inequality is warranted, what degree of inequality is warranted. For example, the view might be that when inequalities are voluntarily courted or chosen via fair interaction, whatever spread between worse off and better off develops is acceptable. A different elaboration would hold that when people are unequally well off, each person's level of advantages enjoyed ought to be in proportion to her degree of deservingness as fixed by some standard of desert.
Luck egalitarian equal opportunity theorists start by distinguishing unchosen circumstances and individual choices. The former are matters imposed on an individual in ways that she could not have influenced or controlled; these matters are just given. It makes no sense to hold the individual responsible for anything that falls in the category of circumstances. Prominent circumstances include the socialization and early environment provided by one's parents or other guardians, one's genetic makeup, and the features of the world in which one finds oneself prior to any opportunity for responsible choice. People face very unequal circumstances, but this inequality, due to unchosen good or bad luck, should be eliminated: People's initial circumstances should be made equal. But once individuals make choices to lead their lives in one or another way starting from initial equality, justice does not demand further compensation if risks taken happen to turn out badly and in fact justice demands that further compensation should not occur. At least this is so if people are making choices under conditions of interaction that are fair and no sheer good or bad luck beyond anyone's power to foresee or control intervenes. “Fair conditions for interaction” may be taken to be an environment in which individuals are free to make deals on mutually agreeable terms and contracts are enforced, individuals are prohibited from deliberately harming each other by physical assault, extortion, coercion, fraud, theft of property and the like. Also, individuals are either prevented from imposing the costs of their activities on others who do not consent to be so involved or they are required to pay appropriate compensation for harm done that is tortious in this way. Fair conditions of interaction also include an initial equality of circumstances. Different luck egalitarian equality of opportunity theorists propose different conceptions of how to draw the line between circumstances to be equalized and choices for which individuals themselves are properly held responsible. They also propose different conceptions of how to assess circumstances for purposes of distributive justice and how to measure them so that one can determine when one individual's circumstances overall are equal or unequal to another's.
The most prominent and explicit luck egalitarian conception of distributive justice is that advanced by Ronald Dworkin in two essays published in 1981 (reprinted along with other essays in Dworkin 2000; see also Arneson 1989; Cohen 1989; Nagel 1991; Temkin 1993; and Sen 1992). Dworkin distinguishes brute luck that simple befalls an individual and option luck, which is
a matter of how deliberate and calculated gambles turn out—whether someone gains or loses through accepting an isolated risk he or she should have anticipated and might have declined. (Dworkin 2000: 73)
According to Dworkin, egalitarian justice requires correcting for brute luck inequalities but letting stand inequalities arising from option luck. But Dworkin's views in this connection are intricate; he has himself repudiated the label “luck egalitarian” as suggesting an inaccurate interpretation of his social justice views.
For further discussion of these conceptions of distributive justice, see the entries on affirmative action, egalitarianism, equality, and distributive justice in this Encyclopedia.
Two lines of thought converge to support a conception of distributive justice that may be regarded as luck egalitarian. One responds to conservative and libertarian critics of social justice doctrines that demand that everyone's condition be equal in some way. Another suggests that the ethical view underlying formal equality or careers open to talents drives one to accept a presumption in favor of equality of condition provided that those holding the short end of the stick have not made themselves responsible for this condition by their own conduct.
A familiar conservative objection to the idea that justice demands the maintenance of equality of condition across persons is that starting from an equal position (or for that matter from any distribution of advantages and disadvantages taken to be just), individuals left free to choose will use their resources and opportunities in different ways, so that initial equality among free persons inevitably gives way to inequalities across persons. Given equal money holdings, some will save and some will consume and some will invest and produce, and soon people end up with very unequal money holdings. To sustain equality of condition one would have to do one of two things: either restrict people's liberty by forbidding them to pursue their individual projects and plans in ways that lead to inequality, or continually redistribute resources from those with more to those with less, roughly from those who save and work (ants, in the fable) to those who consume and play (grasshoppers, in the same fable). Either of these policies would be morally unacceptable. So pursuing sustained social equality is a fool's errand.
The luck egalitarian responds that we should distinguish between inequalities for which people can and cannot reasonably be held responsible. If people begin life with equal opportunities, against the background of a fair framework for economic and personal interaction and cooperation, and then use and abuse their opportunities in different ways, the resultant inequalities in their condition do not call for redress. The egalitarian should uphold equality of opportunity not equality of outcome.
A second line of thought also supports an equality of opportunity conception of distributive justice. This line of thought is discernible in chapter two of John Rawls's classic treatise on justice (Rawls 1999; see also Barry 1989: chapter 6). If we accept that people ought to enjoy formal equality of opportunity or careers open to talents, we should be concerned that morally arbitrary good and bad fortune can determine whether individuals have the opportunity to develop their potential talents and become qualified for positions that confer special advantages and favorable life prospects. If we accept that this morally arbitrary good and bad fortune should not determine people's prospects, we are led to accept FEO. This substantive equal opportunity doctrine is satisfied when all those with the same native talent and the same ambition have the same prospects of competitive success.
When FEO is satisfied, the luck beyond one's power to control of being born in a favorable or an unfavorable social environment does not play any role in determining one's life prospects. The effects of unfavorable initial circumstances are entirely smoothed out by equalizing policies we institute. However, from the standpoint of preventing people's life prospects from being unduly influenced by morally arbitrary factors entirely beyond their power to control, there remains a residual unfairness even when FEO is completely satisfied. In that circumstance, an individual's prospects for doing well in public sphere interactions with others depend not just on her own ambition and effort but also on her native talent endowment—her genetic endowment considered as a potential for talent development. But if anything just befalls a person and is beyond her power to control, it is her native talent endowment. As Rawls writes,
once we are troubled by the influence of either social contingencies or natural chance on the determination of distributive shares, we are bound, on reflection, to be bothered by the influence of the other. (Rawls 1999: 64)
FEO demands that those with the same native talent and the same ambition to exercise that talent toward competitive success should have equal competitive prospects. The further assertion that the natural lottery of talent potential is also morally arbitrary yields the idea that those with the same ambition should have equal prospects. This idea needs interpretation. It can hardly be a plausible principle of justice that demands that social arrangements should bring it about that slow runners have just the same chances of winning foot races as fast runners with the same desire to win, or that the medically incompetent and competent should have the same chances of becoming medical doctors and having successful careers in that profession, and so on. The sensible thought here is that the benefits that economic and social cooperation yield should go in equal amounts to equally responsible and ambitious individuals regardless of the social contingencies and natural chance factors that enable some to succeed more than others in competitive social life. This is roughly the luck egalitarian or level playing field conception of equality of opportunity, now proposed as the distributive justice standard for assessing institutions and practices.
Dworkin's contributions clarify and sharpen the idea of luck egalitarianism just described and move the idea in a particular direction. Suppose we ask, what fixes whether a distribution of benefits or opportunities across people is equal? Dworkin urges that a distribution is equal just in case people have equal resources to pursue whatever aims and ambitions they might have. A distribution of material resources across persons can be regarded as equal when no one would prefer to have any one else's bundle. A hypothetical implementation of this idea would involve imagining people assigned equal bidding resources and holding an auction to distribute the material resources at hand, with the auction concluded only when no one wishes to change her bid for any bit of the stuff being divided by auction.
Dworkin adds that the ideal of equality of resources should be conceived as operating over time, so that if Smith is assigned a certain resource bundle including arable land and works the land so that the resource bundle increases, one does not envy Smith's augmented bundle if one could have achieved the same augmentation with the same work output but prefers not to sacrifice present consumption for future profit in this way. Dworkin adds a further twist: he affirms that personal traits such as native charm and intelligence potential and physical strength should also be regarded as resources, so equality of resources demands compensation for shortfalls in personal trait endowments. He suggests that the appropriate compensation measure would consist of hypothetical insurance markets, in which individuals equally situated, knowing the disabilities they might have and their incidence but not whether they themselves have them or not, and knowing their personal traits but not what prices their use might fetch in market trading, have the opportunity to purchase insurance against the possibility of being afflicted with disabilities or of having a trait endowment of low market value.
This equality of resources ideal can be compared to an alternative equality of welfare approach that Dworkin rejects. Consider various examples in which someone becomes worse off than others in some respect and the question becomes whether level playing field justice requires compensation to restore equality across people in that respect. The measure used to assess people as better or worse off interacts with notions of personal responsibility regarded as shaping egalitarian requirements. Suppose one person subscribes to a religion that requires expensive ritual displays by its adherents. In principle, the disadvantages in welfare that the religious adherent incurs would ground a claim for compensation from the standpoint of welfarist egalitarian justice. If the believer has chosen his religion in such a way that he can reasonably be deemed responsible for this choice, equal opportunity for welfare would not require equalizing compensation, but if the believer cannot reasonably be regarded as responsible for his religious commitment, equal opportunity for welfare would demand equalizing compensation. For Dworkin, one cannot coherently demand compensation for any aspect of one's aims and commitments and tastes and ideals that one is glad to have. One cannot both be happy to be motivated by an aim and also regard having that aim as an affliction for which one should get compensation. This constraint applies to religious commitment and also to expensive taste. I cannot both be glad that I have a discerning taste in wine or opera performances and yet regard these expensive tastes as afflictions for which I should get equalizing compensation (Williams 2002). In Dworkin's phrase, distribution should be ambition-insensitive but endowment-sensitive. You are not owed more from society by way of fair shares in virtue of the fact that your ambitions are large rather than small, demanding rather than undemanding, but you are owed more from society by way of fair shares in virtue of the fact that your initial resource holdings are scant or the fact that your native talent endowment is more meager than that of others.
An objection lurks here. Dworkin distinguishes between my circumstances, for which I am not reasonably held responsible, and my ambitions, for which I am reasonably held responsible, and includes native talent endowment among circumstances. But my native talent endowment may unfortunately leave me with poor value-forming and ambition-forming and choice-making ability, so that shortfalls in my condition that result from my acting on my ambitions may just express a shortfall in my native talent endowment. So according to Dworkin I both am and am not reasonably held responsible for my condition.
The distinction between one's ambition and the rest of one's circumstances as deployed by Dworkin draws a certain concern for individual freedom and responsibility into the account of distributive justice. If we start from initial fair shares, and then you pursue fancy vegetable farming, risky but potentially lucrative, and I put my resources in a bank account, and you end up with a more intrinsically rewarding and lucrative work life than I manage to get, the differences in life outcomes at which we arrive are not inequalities that register as unfair or as demanding equalizing compensation in Dworkin's framework. Welfare or well-being inequalities across people are not a concern of social justice, in that framework.
In Dworkin's later writings on distributive justice, hypothetical insurance assumes a more prominent role than in his 1981 essays. Dworkin had written that although the hypothetical ideal auction and insurance markets for talent and handicap cannot be implemented, we ought to set in place institutional arrangements that will mimic as closely as possible the results we calculate these ideal mechanisms would deliver. Later, a somewhat different thought becomes central. This is the idea that what we owe to one another by way of health care policy, unemployment compensation, other welfare state arrangements, and inheritance tax and transfer schemes is set by what level of insurance coverage in each of these policy domains the average member of the community would take under full knowledge of actual and expected circumstances modified by a veil of ignorance adjusted to be fair for each particular policy domain. To yield just outcomes, these imaginary insurance decisions should be made against the backdrop of a fair framework for interaction including a free market economy based on private ownership of resources with appropriate contract law and tort law and regulation of externalities. To appreciate the flavor of these proposals, notice that the level of health care coverage the average member of the community would purchase under the hypothetical conditions would vary depending on what afflictions one might suffer, what medical care can do to prevent or alleviate such conditions with expected available medical technology, and what else one might do, and with what personal benefit, with the money one is imagining having available to spend on one's health insurance. The hunch that lies behind Dworkin's idea of justice as fair insurance is that the various factors that would affect the hypothetical insurance choices people would make are factors relevant to the determination of what we owe one another by way of fair shares and that the hypothetical insurance construction accurately registers the determining weight they should have.
Whatever the merits of Dworkin's ideal of distributive justice as fair insurance, it looks to be rejecting the idea of justice as luck egalitarianism. Whereas the luck egalitarian holds that chosen and courted inequalities do not qualify for compensation to restore initial equality, Dworkin's hypothetical insurance schemes would allow compensation for health woes triggered by voluntary behavior and unemployment compensation for the person who loses her job through her faulty conduct (but for a contrary interpretation, see Ripstein 2007: 100). Whether compensation ought to be carried out depends on what the average member of the community would purchase under the imaginary conditions deemed to be fair. Moreover, whether compensation is owed to a particular individual does not depend on the particular values, desires, risk preferences, aims and ambitions, and so on of the particular individual, rather on what the average member of the community would choose. The key divide for distributive justice is no longer, in Dworkin's mature view, the divide between what lies within the individual's power to control and what does not. Depending on how one evaluates Dworkin's later views, one might regard the divergence between later Dworkin and luck egalitarian or level-playing-field equality of opportunity as either a criticism of the former or of the latter (for criticisms of Dworkin's views from opposed perspectives, see Anderson 1999; Scheffler 2003; Cohen 2004; and Fleurbaey 2008: chapters 6–10).
The Dworkinian ideal of justice as fair insurance both incorporates a particular notion of personal responsibility into distributive justice and displaces the identification of justice and equal opportunity. Provided society brings it about that you get the fair insurance payout, and maintains a fair framework of interaction, how you fare is your responsibility in the sense that others are under no obligation to eliminate shortfalls in advantage that might come about as the result of your own choices. The initial opportunities for individuals that justice guarantees need not be equal across individuals, because what anyone is owed is set by the insurance decisions the average member of the community would make. Bringing about equal resources broadly understood among able and disabled individuals would be incredibly costly, so choosing insurance in ignorance of one's actual disability status, one would not choose a coverage that would yield initial equality across able and disabled, Dworkin supposes.
Justice as fair insurance supposes that an ex ante perspective determines what we owe one another; fair shares are set by simulated choices made in ignorance of what disabilities any one actually has and in ignorance of what payoffs one's risky choices will bring about. Some reject this ex ante perspective. If money will be of more use to people in the event that they are able than it will be in the event that they are disabled, people in the hypothetical insurance market might tend to choose insurance that pays out if they turn out to be able and requires them to pay in if they turn out to be disabled—but then distributive justice would require transfers from worse off people to better off people on the basis not of any actual choices they make but on the basis of their presumed hypothetical choices—some find this a perverse result (on Dworkin and insurance, see Roemer 2002 and Fleurbaey 2008).
If we assume that the parties involved in hypothetical insurance choice know that in the aftermath of their choice they will live in a market economy with private ownership and that the insurance against misfortune they are selecting will be implemented by general taxation of income and wealth and some form of redistribution, they will regard themselves as in effect gambling on their prospects. If they turn out to be winners in the market economy they will do better with a low tax rate for redistributive purposes, and if they are losers in the market economy they will do better with a higher tax rate and more redistribution. It is not clear why their preferences over this risk should fix what count as fair shares in the theory of distributive justice. Stipulating with Dworkin that the preferences of the average member of the community should be the determining preferences in this exercise does not clarify the issue.
Let us set aside Dworkin's intricate revisionism and return to the basic luck egalitarian project. To reiterate, the basic idea is that justice establishes a moral presumption in favor of equality in the advantages people have (in different versions of the view the idea of “advantage” is variously interpreted). The presumption is overturned when people have the opportunity to be as well off as others but make choices or behave in ways that (a) render them worse off than others and (b) make it the case that compensating them or ameliorating their condition to restore equality of condition between them and others is morally inappropriate or at least not a high priority moral desideratum. The b condition admits of two broadly different construals. One is that when an individual behaves in a way that renders him worse off than others, if some reasonable choice he might have made or reasonable behavior he might have performed would have lessened the probability that he would end up worse off, then there is less egalitarian reason to eliminate this shortfall in his advantage level. Another is that when an individual's faulty or undeserving choice or behavior renders him worse off than others, there is no, or less, egalitarian reason to eliminate this shortfall in his advantage level. The difference between these construals becomes evident if we imagine a person performing an heroic rescue, when she might reasonably and without blame have held back from rescue, and suffers misfortune as a result (Eyal 2007 and Temkin 2011).
The basic idea might be stated in the language of personal responsibility. If some are worse off than others, under what conditions are those who are worse off appropriately held responsible for their unequal condition in the sense that no one has any moral obligation (or responsibility) to make good their shortfall? The luck egalitarian answer is that if your coming to be in a bad state compared to others lay within your power to control, you bear responsibility for your being in that state. The condition you are in is properly attributable to you. We then need an account of what renders individuals responsible in these ways. If hard determinism is true, no one is ever responsible in the requisite way, and the luck egalitarian equality of opportunity conception of distributive justice dictates equality of condition across persons. On other conceptions, people can be responsible for their varying fortunes, when the right background is in place, and when this is so, equal opportunity can coexist with inequality of outcome.
In other words, we should level the playing field on which competition for superior positions in the social hierarchy will eventually take place. The playing field is leveled when unchosen circumstances of individuals are equalized, so that individuals can reasonably be held responsible for their choices that determine their eventual places in the social hierarchy. One might picture level-playing-field (LPF) equality of opportunity as operating in the sphere of education and socialization and health care to prepare young people for adult status when responsible agency in a field of social competitions will be expressed. Opportunities are equalized when unchosen circumstances including native talents are counterbalanced so that nothing but the quality of people's choices (to the degree they can reasonably be held responsible for them) and their foreseeable effects determines their fate in social competitions. The effects of unchosen luck are to be eliminated.
Consider educational policy from the standpoint of the LPF conception of equal opportunity. The aim of educational policy in this perspective would be to bring it about that individuals have equal opportunity for labor market and entrepreneurial success. If some individuals enter school with greater potential for market success due to favorable genetic makeup and early childhood socialization, then extra educational resources should be expended on the unlucky so that so far as is possible, when all individuals leave school, all who exhibit equal ambition and perseverance in working toward chosen goals will have the same prospects of lifetime economic success. Or perhaps we had better say that educational resources are deployed so that anyone who works as hard as can reasonably be expected in school will leave school with the benchmark equal prospect of market success.
One could consider health care policy from the same perspective. The object of the LPF equal opportunity advocate would be to design a health care policy that compensates individuals for bad luck in unchosen health care circumstances, offsetting adverse unchosen health conditions so that lifetime health prospects for all who behave equally responsibly are the same. (Segall 2009).
One difficulty this approach faces is to clarify the basis for holding people responsible for their choices and the extent to which people will be held responsible for the effects of their choices that fall on themselves. John Roemer has developed a framework for addressing this difficulty. His idea is one that societies with different notions of how much responsibility for choice to assign to individuals could use to determine what equal opportunity would require given their favored notion of individual responsibility (Roemer 2002 and 2003; for criticism, see Risse 2002 and Hurley 2003).
Roemer proposes that the population be divided into types on the basis of characteristics for which society deems individuals not reasonably to be held responsible. One then examines the distribution of a good such as education or health care or labor market success. For each such good, there is assumed to be a single measure of effort for which individuals are to be held responsible. This might be years of persevering in school, for example. If there are many individuals in each type, one takes the effort distribution for the type as a feature of the type and hence something for which the individual should not be held responsible. What the individual is deemed accountable for is the amount of effort she puts forth by comparison with the effort put forth by others of her type. The Roemerian equality of opportunity norm regards those who are at the same centile of effort for their type to have exercised a comparable degree of responsibility. Ideally society should equalize outcomes for each centile of every type, but in general this will not be possible, so one seeks a logically possible approximation to this ideal and identifies this as equality of opportunity. Roemer offers his account as an ecumenical proposal that a society could employ whatever its own collective opinion as to what characteristics of individuals should be deemed to be effectively beyond their power to control and hence to identify relevant types for purposes of defining the requirements of equality of opportunity.
Since Roemer does not offer a full theory of justice within which his LPF version of equality of opportunity would be included, one cannot say what sort of social hierarchy he envisions, fair access to which is to be regulated by this level playing field conception of equality of opportunity. (He might be espousing a radical version of substantive equality of opportunity or instead uphold the background idea that equality of condition should be sustained unless considerations of personal responsibility provide reasons to deviate from it.) But a difficulty he himself notes raises a worry about the attractiveness of the approach (Roemer 1998: chapter 12). If society needs excellent basketball players, ballet dancers, bankers, medical researchers, nuclear scientists, and so on, then society needs to train the best individuals for those social roles, and if the social roles are valuable, no doubt special advantages and rewards should be attached to them. To say that “society needs” such elite education is to speculate that with elite education all members of society can be made better off than they would be if elite education is foregone. But this means that many social justice principles will imply that the LPF conception of equal opportunity should not be pursued because giving special advantages to people on the basis of unchosen circumstances such as their native possession of specially valued talents works to everyone's advantage including especially the advantage of the worse off fraction of society. However, Roemer can reply that one can uphold LPF equal opportunity as part of justice without insisting it is the entirety of justice. Justice might favor equality of opportunity and also favor more and better opportunities for people rather than fewer and worse.
According to Immanuel Kant's doctrine of right, the existence of a state is required to establish a condition of equal freedom for all. In this condition each is free to use her person and property in ways consistent with everyone else's similar freedom. In the absence of a functioning coercive state that specifies who is entitled to what property, no one has determinate rights; there is no clear “mine” and “thine”. The state enforces a set of rules binding on all that partly establishes and partly constitutes a condition of equal freedom. People are morally obligated to cooperate with others to create a state if no effective legal order exists and to cooperate to sustain an existing state that rules them, even a very defective state.
The rightful condition of freedom that a functioning state sustains is the freedom to act for any innocent purpose one chooses with one's body and whatever means one owns, along with the right not to be forced to act to serve the purposes of other people or to suffer one's property being used to serve the purposes of others. Everyone has the same freedom, and others acting freely may bring it about that one's opportunity to achieve one's desires may be sharply curtailed. Other people's legitimate exercise of their freedom does not lessen your freedom in the relevant sense, even if their choices put you at a disadvantage or preclude your attaining any particular level of welfare or well-being. For example, others might purchase all the food at the store, leaving you with no opportunity to buy any. No matter, from the Kantian perspective. So long as you are not subject to the will of others, forced to serve their purposes in the absence of your voluntary agreement to do so, your equal freedom is neither reduced nor compromised.
Equal freedom for all sets limits to your subjecting yourself to the will of others: an agreement to become the slave or serf of another is void. Becoming utterly impoverished, so that one must beg or subject oneself to the will of another to survive, is also incompatible with equal freedom for all; so the state must establish some public policies to keep the poor from falling into a state of utter dependence on others.
The equal freedom that the state establishes and sustains is a formal freedom. Being equally free along with all fellow members of society does not guarantee that I have the option to achieve the purposes they can achieve or indeed any particular set of purposes at all. Others having lots of property and me having very little is compatible with all of us enjoying equal freedom and none being a master of any other, controlling the will of some other person. Nor does your having many more valuable options and fruitful courses of action available to choose than I have constitute any deprivation of my right to equal freedom. Nor does your having the good fortune to be born with a large endowment of talent potential and no disabilities and born into a nurturing family possessing lots of means while I have bad fortune in these respects amount to any erosion of the condition of equal freedom that a rightful legal order yields for us.
The equal formal freedom that the rightful state sustains according to the Kantian doctrine can be regarded as a species of formal equal opportunity. If the Kantian doctrine of right can be defended, then we have good grounds to uphold a version of formal equal opportunity without being under normative pressure of good reasons to go further and embrace any substantive equal opportunity doctrine. In a nutshell, the Kantian claim will be that embracing more expansive notions of equal opportunity, substantive equal opportunity or the yet more expansive luck egalitarian family of doctrines, will prove incompatible with maintaining formal equal freedom for all and with sustaining the condition in which no adult person is the master of any other (if substantive equality is sustained, then some people are being forced to use their persons and forced to suffer their property being used for the private purposes of others—a fundamental violation of right). This may be one of those argumentative standoffs in which, as Brian Barry once remarked, one man's reductio ad absurdum is another's Quod Erat Demonstrandum. (For Kant's views on equal freedom and the doctrine of right, see Guyer 2000 and Ripstein 2009). For more on Kantian moral and political philosophy, see other entries in this Encyclopedia.
As characterized here, formal and substantive equality of opportunity ideals regulate the procedures by which individuals come to acquire especially advantageous positions. The scope of equality of opportunity is broader, the wider the range of worthy capacities and abilities that are fostered and rewarded in the society that satisfies these equal opportunity ideals.
Neither of these principles attempts to address the issue, what extent of inequality across the individuals in society and across the social positions that social arrangements establish or engender is morally acceptable. Equality of opportunity would have no application if all social positions were equally advantageous and desirable. But equality of opportunity does not say whether the gap between the top rung of society and the bottom rung should be large or small. Equality of opportunity principles assert that if there is to be inequality in the rewards and remuneration and status dispensed by social arrangements, all members of society should have equal opportunity suitably defined to gain the superior positions. (To reiterate, just in this respect luck egalitarianism takes a different stance.)
The term “meritocracy” is sometimes used to refer to a society that fulfills formal and substantive equality of opportunity norms. It should be noted that the term sometimes names a broader ideal. A meritocracy in this broader sense is a society in which (a) equality of opportunity obtains and (b) rewards and remuneration gained by individuals are proportional to their individual desert. The difference between narrow and broad meritocratic norms is that the latter assert a standard for assessing social arrangements in so far as they attach rewards and remunerations to positions and fix the extent of social inequality. These arrangements should give individuals what they deserve, and what they deserve is at least partly fixed independently of existing social arrangements and so can serve as a standard for criticizing them (see Daniels 1978; Sher 1987; Scheffler 1992, 2000; and Miller 1999: chapters 7–9).
According to the broad meritocracy ideal, a justification for equality of opportunity is that its fulfillment is necessary if it is to be the case that individuals genuinely get what they deserve. If equality of opportunity is violated, then either the less qualified are selected over the more qualified or not all individuals have equal chance to become qualified. Equality of opportunity is then either a means to meritocracy or partly constitutive of it.
It should be noted that broad meritocracy might be upheld either as a complete view of social justice or as one justice value to be balanced against others.
Theories of desert are various. Principles of desert can be comparative or noncomparative. A comparative desert principle specifies what makes people more or less deserving relative to one another. A noncomparative desert principle associates a proper amount of recognition, remuneration, or reward with an individual's particular level of deservingness. For example, the claim that medical doctors and business executives are paid too much compared to what manual workers get is a claim of comparative desert. The assertions that no one deserves to starve and that those guilty of perpetrating torture-murder deserve the death penalty are claims of noncomparative desert. An individual is rightly regarded as deserving only on the basis of some personal characteristic such as her traits or doings (on varieties of desert principles, see Hurka 2003, and for a systematic exploration of desert, see Kagan 2012).
Some hold that what makes any person fundamentally deserving of good or bad fortune is her level of virtue or moral merit. Other theorists hold that there are plural bases of desert that in different settings establish what people deserve and what treatment society should accord them (Sher 1987). On this view, desert comes in different flavors. For example, deserving athletes should be cheered, deserving poets should be appreciated for their insight and aesthetic merit. This view provides a critical standard. If a society jeers at its good athletes and poets, it is deficient, and its practices should be reformed so that the deserving are rewarded in due proportion.
If economic desert or merit is regarded as measurable and the desert theorist holds that in a just political economy, individuals are remunerated and rewarded in proportion to their level of desert, justice as deservingness becomes a candidate theory of justice. In principle, the view fixes what inequalities in people's conditions of life are morally acceptable. Whereas the libertarian holds that social justice is achieved when Lockean rights are respected, and the Rawlsian holds that justice in general requires that society be arranged to maximize the primary social goods holdings of the least advantaged, the desert theorist asserts that justice is meritocracy. In a meritocracy, each individual has good fortune in proportion to her deservingness (Rawls 1999; Nozick 1974; Miller 1999).
The idea that individuals become economically deserving in so far as they are economically productive (as measured by what people are willing to pay for their goods and services) comes under pressure from two directions. On the one side, a well-functioning competitive market is responsive to supply and demand. The ensemble of circumstances that determine supply and demand and hence what remuneration anyone gets for her market activity varies capriciously in ways that confront economic agents as sheer luck. For example, what equally hard-working and skilled auto workers will earn in Germany and China is affected enormously by different economic conditions in the two countries, including actions by other agents, their level of wealth, and so on. There is no remotely sensible notion of individual desert that varies with the benefits that people gain from their economic production. This is not any defect of markets; there is no reason to expect them to somehow distribute benefits according to any common-sense norms of desert.
So if it was thought morally imperative that the ordinary operation of a market economy should proportion rewards to desert, we would have to entirely redesign and remake economic institutions with this end in view. But if one asks, why markets should be reformed so they reward the deserving, the notion of desert in play here looks under scrutiny to be too insubstantial to justify the demanded changes. The thought that people deserve in proportion to their meritorious doings runs up against the fact that all such accomplishments depend to an indeterminate extent on native talent and favorable early socialization, sources of meritorious agency that are entirely beyond the individual's power to control. This is not to say there is nothing in one's conscientious strivings for which one can take credit, but what one can take credit for is so intermingled with what simply falls on one's plate as good or bad luck that the idea of rewarding desert in any fine-grained way is impractical. The idea that people become economically deserving by being economically productive and should be remunerated according to their productivity is at odds with the effective functioning of actual markets. To try to revamp the economy so it rewards the truly deserving would be a fool's errand. (Rawls 1999: sections 47 and 48; but see Miller 1999: chapters 7–9).
The ideal of a society in which people do not suffer disadvantage from discrimination on grounds of supposed race, ethnicity, religion, sex, sexual orientation is widely upheld as desirable in itself. For many, the ideal is more compelling than any argument that might be offered to support it.
However, what is objectionable is wrongful discrimination. Distinguishing wrongful from innocent discrimination is tricky (Alexander 1992). Statistical discrimination is not per se wrong. A black man may correctly perceive black skin to be roughly correlated with traits such as common experiences and outlook that he values in friends, and prefer blacks as friends on this basis. This is surely not morally wrong. Nor would it be wrong to desire on the same basis to be employed in a firm that employs mainly blacks. It might well be the case, however, that acting on such a desire in concert with others might have significant negative consequences for others. Heterosexuals flocking together in the workplace might tend sharply to limit employment opportunities available to nonheterosexuals. On grounds of equal opportunity, then, law and social custom might be framed to restrict or prohibit acting on the desire to club together with others whom one identifies as like oneself in certain salient ways, even though this sort of discrimination is not deemed per se wrong.
Formal and substantive equality of opportunity ideals require more than avoidance of discrimination. These broader ideals might be regarded as morally valuable per se and unconditionally. They might also be justified on instrumental grounds. For example, when women are excluded from the labor force, markets function less efficiently, and the ensemble of people's desires can in many settings be satisfied more fully if equal opportunity for men and women is secured.
Since formal and substantive equality of opportunity norms are proposed as components of a moral theory of justified social inequality, the full justification of any candidate conception of equality of opportunity must be sought by way of examining the justification of the full theory of justice in which the candidate conception is to play a part. In much the same way, one examines a component of a car, a candidate design for a carburetor for instance, by seeing how the component would function in the car and how well the car with that component in place would perform.
A conception of equality of opportunity, deemed to be morally valuable per se, might be deemed so either as a deontological requirement or as a valuable state of affairs to be promoted. A deontological requirement specifies ways in which each agent should always treat other people. An absolute deontological requirement demands to be obeyed come what may, a less than absolute requirement may be overridden if conformity to it produces an excessively bad outcome or conflicts with other deontological requirements that taken together have greater moral weight.
Rawls himself says surprisingly little by way of justification of fair equality of opportunity. In his theory of justice, justice concerns are nested in strict lexical priority relations. First priority is assigned to a principle that demands equal basic liberties such as freedom of speech for all. Second priority goes to fair equality of opportunity, which is interpreted as a prerequisite for justified inequalities in the distribution of social primary goods, basic resources suitable for advancing a wide range of plans of life. Inequalities in people's holdings of primary social goods must (a) be attached to positions and offices open to all according to fair equality of opportunity and (b) must work to the maximal advantage of the least advantaged social group. In Rawls's system, (a) takes strict lexical priority over (b). In broad terms, Rawls insists that fair equality of opportunity rules out improving the condition of the worst off by instituting practices that generate inequalities that fail to satisfy FEO.
One argument in support of the Rawlsian priority for FEO assumes that FEO regulates opportunities for self-realization whereas the principle that demands maximization of the social primary goods holdings of the worst off regulates consumption activities. If we add that self-realization should take strict lexical priority over mere consumption activities in anyone's reasonable plan of life, we get an argument for the priority of FEO (Taylor 2004). Another argument starts from the observation that Rawls says nothing about why FEO should get less priority than the principle that protects basic liberties. This suggests a strategy for defending FEO: find arguments that support the priority of the basic liberties, and explore to what extent they also support giving priority to FEO as well (Shiffrin 2004). Following this strategy of argument, some have proposed that FEO protects the opportunity to contribute to social cooperation by engaging in challenging, meaningful work, and having this opportunity helps one to fulfill one's basic moral interest in developing and exercising a sense of justice. Not by self-interest alone does man live. Another consideration is that self-respect is of utmost importance for any individual, so one should give priority to sustaining the social bases of self-respect, and a society that strictly protects basic liberties and FEO sustains the social bases of self-respect.
In reply: the arguments that purport to defend the priority of FEO look vulnerable. Many goods, including free time apart from paid work and income, are useful for self-realization, so the assumed priority of self-realization does not support priority for FEO. If inequalities in people's distributive shares work to advance the interests of the worse off, there is good reason to accept them even if they violate FEO. Anyway consumption activities, even if generally less valuable than self-realization, have some value, so a lot of consumption gains may outweigh a small bit of self-realization gains, contrary to the claim of lexical priority for FEO. If meaningful work is a great good, crucial for human fulfillment, that consideration arguably supports the justice requirement that all people have genuine opportunities to participate in meaningful work, not merely the right to equal chances for meaningful work for all with equal native talent and ambition that FEO entails.
A complication here is that Rawls does not anyway insist on FEO come what may, even though the heavens should fall. We should probably follow Rawls on this point. An insistence on equality in Rawls is really a insistence on a presumption of equality. He proposes equal basic liberties for all, but allows that some restrictions of basic liberties might be needed to strengthen the system of basic liberties over time, and such restriction, even unequal restriction, is acceptable provided the lesser liberty is acceptable from the standpoint of those who suffer the basic liberty deficit. In a similar way he proposes that social and economic inequalities are acceptable only if attached to positions that are open to all under FEO, but allows that inequalities of opportunity ruled out by FEO can yet be acceptable provided they “enhance the opportunities of those with lesser opportunity” (Rawls 1999: 266).
The idea seems to be that allowing some socially advantaged persons to have greater chances of competitive success than equally natively endowed socially disadvantaged persons is unacceptable if the talented socially disadvantaged are compensated just in terms of income and wealth. FEO is a constraint on allowable inequality. But suppose the prospects for competitive success, and so access to desirable positions and offices offering meaningful work, can be made unequal in such a way that those with the short end of the stick have more such opportunities than they would have if it were demanded that FEO must be upheld even in this case. Here insistence on FEO might seem to be biting off one's nose to spite one's face. Here Rawls says deviation from FEO is morally acceptable. Example: if we allow socially privileged entrepreneurs access to competitive success in violation of FEO, they do things that stimulate employment growth, and those denied equal competitive opportunity end up with better competitive opportunity. Why not?
This proposal raises several questions. One is whether an important moral line can be drawn between denial of equal opportunity that merely yields higher income and wealth and denial of equal opportunity that yields better job opportunities for those denied the condition of FEO. After all, noble projects have material prerequisites, and the extra income I might get if unequal opportunity is permitted might be crucial to my life fulfillment. Another worry is that the elaborate set of rules seems to give undue weight to the interests of those who are natively talented but socially disadvantaged as opposed to those who are both socially and native-talent-wise disadvantaged. Suppose I am one of the latter truly disadvantaged types, and the contemplated relaxation of FEO affects the competitive success prospects only of better-off individuals and promises mere income and wealth benefits to people like me. Whether the relaxation of FEO is justifiable then hinges on what it does for the competitive success opportunities of the better off people and not at all on the impending benefits to worse-off types.
These questions are not posed as conversation stoppers. The justifiability of FEO seems to be a wide open question, yet to be answered. Rawls's reticence does not show there is nothing cogent to be said in defense of FEO or another norm in the wider family of substantive equality of opportunity norms. Sometimes it is said that insistence on FEO preserves the status of all members of society as free and equal persons, but this claim seems to presuppose that dropping or downgrading FEO would be unjustified. If dropping or downgrading would be justified, free and equal persons could accept this without forfeiting their status.
According to the Lockean libertarian, justice is done when each person respects every other person's Lockean rights (see Nozick 1974). One's Lockean rights roughly amount to the right to do whatever one chooses with whatever one legitimately owns so long as one does not thereby harm others in certain ways that either violate or infringe their rights. The “certain ways” of harming are specified by a list: no theft, fraud, breach of contract, extortion, coercion or forcing, assault, infliction of physical damage on persons or their property. Violations of rights are forbidden infringements. One must not violate anyone's rights, come what may. Infringements of rights include violations and mere infringements. The latter may permissibly be done provided compensation is paid to any victim who suffers harm as a result of having one's rights infringed. Each adult person is the full rightful owner of herself, unless she has forfeited this right of dominion by grave misconduct or signed it away by exchange or free gift or waiver. The Lockean libertarian holds that a self-owning person may appropriate unowned land and moveable parts of the earth and thereby become their full rightful owner; these rights may then be transferred to others by gift or exchange or forfeited under certain circumstances.
The bearing of these claims on the moral validity of equal opportunity norms is supposed to arise from the consideration that if one legitimately owns property, one is not morally bound to use it in ways that satisfy equality of opportunity. If one owns a factory, one may let it sit unused and allow no one to trespass on the premises, or one may invite anyone one chooses to enter the premises and work in the factory one owns on any mutually agreeable terms. One's Lockean rights fill the moral space that conceptions of equal opportunity are thought to occupy and as it were leave no room for them. Just as one may choose to become friends with anyone on any mutually agreeable terms, rather than offer one's friendship to all who might wish it and to choose among applicants according to the merits of the applications, one may do the same with any property one owns. Lockean property rights preclude its being the case that anyone is morally entitled to be treated according to equality of opportunity norms or that anyone is morally obligated to treat anyone according to such norms (unless one has signed a contract or promised to do so).
The Lockean critique or rather counter-assertion of libertarian rights in the face of contrary claims that people have rights to equal opportunity applies to formal as well as to substantive equal opportunity ideals. According to the Lockean libertarian, a white male landowner who wishes to hire laborers to work his fields may refuse to hire people of any religion, ethnicity, sex, sexual orientation, or the like that he chooses to regard as a bar to employability. Or he can decide to hire blacks and women and Hindus only for low-skill jobs and whites and men and Christians exclusively for skilled and managerial jobs. These decisions might be subject to appropriate moral criticism. What one has a moral right to do may nonetheless be morally wrong. The claim that one has a moral right to do X implies that others should not coercively interfere with one's doing X or violate any of one's rights to prevent one from doing X. The libertarian denies that anyone has a moral right in this sense to be treated in accordance with equal opportunity norms. This stricture applies to formal equality of opportunity and a fortiori to substantive equal opportunity and level-the-playing-field conceptions as well.
The Lockean libertarian can also be viewed as proposing a minimalist conception of equal opportunity that should supersede the more expansive notions of equal opportunity. The libertarian view is that people's opportunities are equal in the relevant sense when each person equally faces other possible interaction partners in a regime in which everyone's Lockean rights are respected. This requires that no state or government prohibit persons from transacting with others on any mutually agreeable terms (that do not impose harms of certain sorts on nonconsenting others). Laws that coercively enforce Jim Crow racial exclusion (no blacks are legally permitted to work at skilled jobs or enter learned professions or form certain sorts of entrepreneurial business partnerships and so on) would violate libertarian equal opportunity so conceived.
The Lockean libertarian proposes that everyone's Lockean rights should be respected by everyone as inherently just and fair. Respecting Lockean rights is deemed morally valuable for its own sake, not merely for the sake of good consequences it might bring about.
One can also regard Lockean rights as instruments, morally valuable not in themselves but for the consequences compliance with them brings about. On this approach, to the extent that rigid adherence by individuals or the government to Lockean rights would not produce the best consequences, adherence should be selectively abandoned.
Richard Epstein recommends something rather close to a regime of Lockean libertarian rights on the ground that compliance with this regime of rights is utility maximizing (increases aggregate well-being of persons) over the long run (Epstein 1995: chapter 1). Epstein himself is doubtful of interpersonal utility comparison, so he tends to favor policy moves that are Pareto improvements, improving someone's utility while reducing no one's. Still, one might countenance interpersonal comparison and try to defend Lockean libertarian rights on aggregative utility-maximizing grounds. The Epstein regime of rights is only a rough approximation of a strict Lockean libertarian regime, for the former approves utility-promoting curtailment of individual rights. For example, in an Epstein but not a strict Lockean regime, a hiker caught in a blizzard in the mountains who stumbles upon a privately owned cabin may trespass and use the cabin without prior permission of the owner provided compensation is paid for any damage done to the cabin and its provisions. But Epstein holds that enforcement of nondiscrimination norms and equality of opportunity would tend to lessen not promote people's long-run utility. As this formulation suggests, Epstein is concerned with the question, what rules and norms should be enforced by force of law. As against the simple rule that permits all and only deals that elicit the voluntary consent of the participants, the rule forbidding discrimination is costly to administer and enforce, charges of discrimination being easy to make and difficult to prove. According to Epstein, competitive markets pressure people to do what is cost-effective, which generally means hiring the most qualified applicant and selling to any willing customer who is able to pay.
The conjecture here is that over time competitive markets tend in a rough and ready way to come close enough to satisfying formal equality of opportunity. One might also postulate a tendency in competitive markets to move closer over time to satisfaction of FEO, but this tendency would be offset by, for example, the extra benefits of interacting with socially well connected people as opposed to equally natively talented people who lack lucrative social connections. Moreover, training a talented socially disadvantaged person so she becomes productive generates wide positive externalities, and one does not expect a competitive market automatically to deliver these in optimal qualities. Epstein is doubtful that ham-fisted government regulation can (except in rare cases) in practice improve on the mix of benefits and losses a competitive market economy tends to deliver. In short, according to Epstein, by facilitating mutually profitable interactions among strangers, the competitive market promotes a cultural atmosphere of tolerance and prosperity more effectively than governmental regulation would do.
One might object to the substantive and level playing field conceptions of equality of opportunity canvassed so far in this entry on the ground that they all presuppose a world of individuals of given genetic makeup. Given a population of individuals each with a particular genetic makeup that fixes for that individual a profile of native talent, the question for the equal opportunity theorist is what must be done to or for such individuals if they are to be rightly regarded as enjoying equal opportunity. This framework of discussion takes for granted that native talent differentials are an unalterable natural fact. The objection is that what this framework presupposes may not be so or may eventually not be so. Advances in biological knowledge suggest that at some time in the future people can by deliberate choice alter the genetic makeup of their children or the children born in their society in order to eliminate unwanted traits and augment desired traits. The genetic influences on human traits will become subject to human control. This might occur by using genetic knowledge either to alter the genetic constitution of individuals yet to be born or to provide therapeutic interventions on already existing individuals to alter their genetic makeup. Along this line some argue that advances in genetic knowledge unsettle current moral conceptions including conceptions of equal opportunity by falsifying their factual presuppositions (Buchanan et al. 2000: chapters 3 and 7).
Of course affecting the genetic makeup of children by deliberate choice is not new. Assortative mating done with the hope that by selection of a mate with desirable traits one will affect the likelihood that one's children will have similar desirable traits is a means of influencing the genetic makeup of individuals that does not require advanced genetic knowledge. What is new is the possible scope for deliberate choice in the world of advanced genetic knowledge that is just now being glimpsed.
At least, a question becomes more salient as genetic knowledge increases: What does fairness require by way of care and due regard in the design of individuals? What kinds of persons should be brought into existence? Call the answers justice in conception. Although this question is of undoubted importance, it does not in any obvious way render equality of opportunity in its various guises a consideration of no importance. In the future world with greater genetic knowledge and techniques of control of human reproduction, a population of individuals will emerge, whether in ways that conform to justice in conception or in ways that offend it. Either way, the institutions and practices into which this population is born might bring about a caste hierarchy or a different sort of hierarchy that satisfies equality of opportunity norms. Nothing said so far suggests the difference between caste hierarchy and the society that eliminates caste hierarchy is not morally significant.
Recall that Fair Equality of Opportunity (FEO) requires social arrangements that bring it about that any persons with the same native talent and the same ambition will have roughly equivalent competitive prospects. Suppose there is enhanced technological capacity to alter people's genetic makeup, and hence their native talents, now or in the future. This change might be thought to put pressure on the advocate of FEO to revise her principle to require equalization of native talents so that all individuals with the same ambition will enjoy roughly equivalent prospects for competitive success (and why not consider the proclivity to be ambitious a trait like another that might be altered by social engineering in the service of a strong equal opportunity principle?). The issue here turns on what the fundamental underlying rationale for FEO is thought to be, or should be thought to be.
The problems posed by the existence of individuals with severe disabilities might suggest an objection against formal and substantive conceptions of equality of opportunity or at least raise doubts about their ethical importance. Consider a society in which formal equality of opportunity and Rawlsian FEO are perfectly achieved. All posts and positions that confer superior advantages and benefits go to individuals selected by fair competitions that satisfy both formal equality of opportunity and FEO. All of this is compatible with the existence of a class of individuals who lack qualifications for any positions whatsoever. These individuals are effectively excluded from participation in society. The jobs and positions that confer superior rewards might require complex cognitive skills, and some cognitively deficient individuals are incapable of performing these complex tasks. Jobs might also require complex physical dexterity, which some physically impaired individuals are incapable of developing. Despite perfectly conforming to demanding equality of opportunity norms, the society as so far described might appear to be unjust by too stingy provision of opportunity to its least qualified members.
Unease on this score is increased with the reflection that what qualifies a person as able or disabled (or for that matter as talented or untalented) is not simply a function of her natural attributes but is rather a function of the mesh between her natural attributes and the traits that are valued by people given the organization of society (Buchanan et al. 2000: chapter 3 and 7; Wikler 1983). In a complex technological society, individuals are excluded from participation in its main activities who would be included in a different form of society. A person who could manage an ox cart might be unable to drive a car and hence significantly handicapped in a social order that relies on transportation by car. A person who could carry out valuable tasks in a hunter-gatherer society might be incapable of sophisticated mathematical and literacy skills required in a complex modern economy. The question then arises, to what extent must society be organized so that all of its members are able to participate as full members in the activities that constitute a decent life in the society?
For many, this question will trigger a belief that even a society that perfectly implements equality of opportunity and in which superior positions always go to those who most merit them could not be a substitute for a more complete theory of justice that addresses the issue, what sorts of social hierarchy are morally acceptable. Equality of opportunity is not the full story about social justice. It might also turn out that reflection on the morality of inclusion might yield the result that equality of opportunity is only a rather thin chapter in the story of social justice. A decent society might tolerate in the name of justice significant deviations from perfect equality of opportunity in order to achieve other justice values. For example, inclusion of people with low native talent might be achieved by channeling extra educational resources to them and by subsidizing their hiring by private and public firms even at substantial cost to FEO and even to the less controversial careers open to talents.
It might be useful to compare the concern about the morality of inclusion discussed in this section with the concern about the scope of equality of opportunity discussed in section 3. A society provides too little scope of opportunity if it provides insufficient ways for a wide range of worthy human talents to be recognized, developed, and exercised. A society fails to be sufficiently inclusive if in order to shape institutions and practices in order to increase the satisfactions they offer (or to achieve some other goal) it sets educational and occupational and related standards so high that some individuals are unfairly prevented from participating in any meaningful way in the activities and practices valued by the society. A society could satisfy appropriate scope demands but fail to be sufficiently inclusive, or it could be sufficiently inclusive but fail to satisfy appropriate scope demands.
The luck egalitarian conception of equal opportunity has attracted the criticism that distributive justice should not be interpreted as calling for the elimination of inequalities between persons arising from natural endowments rather than social arrangements (Nagel 1997 and Anderson 1999). On its face, this is a puzzling claim, because whether being born with a propensity to be tall rather than short turns out to be an advantage or disadvantage depends on social arrangements—on whether the individual gets adequate nutrition to grow tall, and on whether activities that are better performed by tall persons are valued in the society, and so on. The idea might be that if having a native propensity to acquire a trait will give rise to advantage or disadvantage given ordinary upbringing and ordinary free market arrangements, the propensity counts as a natural endowment advantage On this view, luck egalitarianism goes wrong by overreaching, insisting on undoing unproblematic inequalities.
Those who voice this criticism sometimes couple it with another: that the equality that is morally compelling is equality of status as a free and equal person in democratic society, not any sort of distributive equality guaranteeing that all should have the same or be treated the same. On this view, fair shares of resources need not involve initial equal opportunity for resources or welfare or any other sort of advantage. Rather, distributive justice requires that the distribution of resources across members of society should not subvert the status of all as free and equal. All should have opportunity to participate in democratic society on a footing of equality (Scheffler 2003, 2005; Anderson 1999); for critical response, see Tan 2008). Moreover, the moral imperative of sustaining equal opportunity to be a full participating member of society is not dampened or extinguished when members of society behave in ways others regard as imprudent or unvirtuous or undeserving. Being a responsible member of society might be a good thing but one's moral entitlement to equality of status is not conditional on good behavior.
In response: A society could satisfy the democratic equality ideal (sustaining equal opportunity for all to be participants in democratic society) even though some portion of its members ends up with meager provision and meager material opportunities and squalid unfulfilling lives. Some might hold that distributive justice principles should register such a condition as injustice. Also, while a reasonable conception of fair shares might require more than initial equal opportunity, and might require that individuals who start to make a mess of their lives be given second, third, or fourth chances, that does not gainsay the responsibility of individuals to use the opportunities they have judiciously and the imperative of integrating a sensible norm of personal responsibility into sensible norms of distributive justice. (See the entries on egalitarianism and on distributive justice.)
Any doctrine that asserts that it is morally desirable or morally required per se or for its own sake that everyone should be equally well off attracts the leveling down objection. The objection is simply that if equality of condition is noninstrumentally morally valuable, then it is morally better, in one respect, if those currently better off than others are made worse off (so long as they do not fall below the average level), even if worsening the condition of these people brings about no gain or benefit for anyone else—but it is implausible to hold that such leveling-down changes in and of themselves improve the situation in any respect. The objection applies to any ideal of equality of condition and also to any ideal of equality of treatment. Recall an ancient quip attributed to the philosopher Sidney Morgenbesser. Roughed up and arrested by the police in the course of student protests at Columbia University, he was asked whether he thought he had suffered unfair, unjust treatment. He replied that the treatment unleashed by the police was unjust (because beating up innocent people is unjust) but not unfair (because “they were beating everybody”). The proponent of the leveling down objection denies that it is in any respect better to beat up more innocent people rather than fewer in order to achieve equality of treatment across innocent people.
Applying to any view that says people should have the same or enjoy the same condition or be treated the same, the leveling down objection applies to equality of opportunity views. As characterized in this entry, formal equality of opportunity just insists on no wrongful discrimination, but the leveling down objection denies that it would be in any respect noninstrumentally morally better to discriminate equally across a group of people who do not merit this treatment as opposed to discriminating against some but not all in the group. The leveling down objection applies straightforwardly to FEO and to level-the-playing-field or luck egalitarian distributive justice doctrines. (On the leveling down objection, see Parfit 2000; Holtug 2010: chapter 7, and for criticism, Temkin 1993: chapter 9.) However, this claim is just a suggestion in the absence of some proposed metric for determining how to rank possible deviations from FEO and luck egalitarian doctrines. The hunch to be confirmed is that for any plausible measure, the result will be that this version of equality will say that there is something to be said in favor of moving close to equality (of opportunity) by making better offs worse off without offering any improvement in the condition of worse offs. The counterclaim will be that there is no respect in which leveling down improves the situation.
Related to the leveling-down objection but distinct from it is the suggestion that opportunities should be maximized, or maximined, rather than equalized. To illustrate the suggestion, consider a world in which formal equality of opportunity and Rawlsian fair equality of opportunity are perfectly fulfilled. In this situation, there will be a certain number of opportunities that are regulated by these equal opportunity principles that are available to those who have the least of these opportunities. For simplicity suppose these opportunities consist of places in attractive postsecondary colleges and universities and other schools (where the number of applicants for slots exceeds the number of available slots), employment opportunities consisting of starting places in public and private firms and promotions in these enterprises, bank loans available for investment purposes including self-employment and starting a business, and licenses provided by the state that are legally required for engaging in certain occupations. Issues will arise here as to how to individuate and count opportunities; just suppose we can limit our attention to situations in which judgments that more or fewer opportunities are available to groups are uncontroversialy unproblematic. Now consider the hypothesis that if equal opportunity regulations were reduced or eliminated, opportunities overall would increase, and in particular opportunities available to those who have the fewest opportunities available would increase. We should not be impressed if the number of opportunities increases by multiplying the number of very bad opportunities available to people, so let it be stipulated that opportunities increase only if the lucrativeness of some options, the nonpay desirable characteristics of some options, the significant variety of equally good options, and the overall desirability of options rated best by every individual, all increase. The suggestion is that when this hypothesis holds, it would be morally inappropriate to insist on maintenance of equal opportunity. One might propose amending an equal opportunity principle to allow deviations from it when deviations increase the regulated opportunities available to those who have the least such opportunities. Rawls allows deviations from his fair equality of opportunity norm when this condition is met.
The suggestion that insistence on equal opportunity might reduce the opportunities available to the worst off in this regard might prompt a broader rejection of equal opportunity principles. The rejectionist proposes dropping equal opportunity norms altogether in favor of maximining competitive opportunities. A less egalitarian development of the suggestion would favor maximization of such opportunities rather than maximizing the opportunities available to those who enjoy the least of them.
The fact that both formal and substantive conceptions of equality of opportunity and the rival level playing field conception as well are proposed as ancillary requirements or supplements to a theory of justified social hierarchy poses a general issue concerning their justification. The setting in which equal opportunity is proposed is one in which a theory of justified hierarchy is on hand. Equal opportunity asserts that the desirable positions in the social hierarchy should be accessible to all members of society according to the equality of opportunity norm. But the social hierarchy itself is justified on some independent basis. Let us suppose that in general the theory of justice holds that a social hierarchy is desirable to the extent that it produces morally desirable consequences. The theory of justice identifies the morally desirable consequences that institutions and practices are to be arranged to promote. For example, in John Rawls's theory of justice, it is asserted that institutions and practices should be arranged so that the worst off are as well off over the long run as possible. More specifically, Rawls proposes that inequalities in social and economic benefits (other than basic civil liberties that are regulated by another principle) are just or fair if they satisfy two conditions--they are attached to positions and offices open to all under fair equality of opportunity and they work to the maximal advantage of the worst off members of society.
It might be the case that the inequalities that would maximize the advantage level of the worst off would also as a matter of fact also satisfy fair equality of opportunity. Still, one might ask if fair equality of opportunity is justified as a free-standing moral requirement or as instrumental to the achievement of other justice goals (for criticism of FEO as a free-standing requirement, see Pogge 1989, chapter 4). To investigate the issue, one must look at possible cases in which the fair equality of opportunity norm constrains the pursuit of other justice values (Arneson 1999, 2013).
In some, perhaps many circumstances, FEO will be a nonbinding constraint on the maximization of the primary social goods prospects for the least advantaged. In such cases FEO either helps boost the advantages of the least advantaged or is a nonfactor. But it may well be that sometimes adherence to FEO requires us to forego hierarchy that would work to the advantage of the worst off. In such cases, why insist on FEO? For example, allowing the rich to buy a head start for their children, though it violates FEO, may cause many to try harder to become rich and might thereby greatly enhance economic effort to the benefit of all. For another example, the resources needed to police individual behavior so that FEO is even remotely close to satisfied might well be enormous. These resources could instead be diverted into public expenditure intelligently designed to improve the condition of the worse off.
There is a more general conflict in this area. One might not uphold the maximizing of primary goods prospects for those in society who are worst off in this respect as a high-priority justice principle. One source of doubt is the thought that the ultimate justice aim should be promoting genuinely good lives for people with good fairly distributed. From this welfarist perspective, how big a pile of resources and opportunities society enables one to attain is not of fundamental moral importance; what matters is what one is enabled to accomplish and does accomplish with whatever resources and opportunities one gets. Another source of doubt is the thought that the Rawlsian difference principle, the identification of distributive justice with maximizing the prospects of the very worst off (subject to the FEO constraint), is too extreme in the priority it assigns to achieving gains for the very worst off. The difference principle in effect says that one should prefer a penny more for the worst off when that group has one member to the alternative of bringing about gains of any magnitude however large for any number of better than worst off persons however huge. Priority for the worse off plausibly takes a less extreme form. So in considering the plausibility of the fair equality of opportunity constraint on boosting the advantages of the worst off when enabling inequalities is the best means to helping the worst off, the difference principle should serve as a stand-in for whatever broadly egalitarian distributive justice aims we take to be most compelling. FEO does not become more acceptable if the Rawlsian principle to which FEO is attached as a constraint is deemed implausible. So conflict between fair equality of opportunity and the Rawlsian difference principle is merely illustrative of further conflict.
For concreteness, suppose that the advantages for the worst off members of society could be maximized by a regime that combines libertarian labor markets with high taxation of incomes and redistribution that enhances the quality of life of the worst off. But under libertarian labor markets, neither formal nor substantive equality of opportunity is required. Instead contract at will prevails. In this society, if markets come to operate more as networks of trade among people who know and trust one another than as textbook exchange among strangers, networks might follow lines of family, clan, and ethnicity, so that even formal equality of opportunity is violated. In this setting, consider a white woman who is denied a promotion in her firm just because she is white and a woman. She suffers a disadvantage, the denial of the promotion, merely because of features of herself that are either unalterable or that she should not be expected to alter in order to gain fair access to economic opportunity. But if the society that tolerates these violations of equality of opportunity thereby maximizes the advantage level enjoyed by the worst off, then there is no way to alter social laws and practices so as to render this woman and people who suffer similar disadvantage better off by enforcing careers open to talents without thereby making someone worse off than she and they are who is also disadvantaged by features of herself that are beyond her power to control. The person with small talent who finds herself in the worst- off class in a properly functioning society that rewards talent in order to stimulate economic productivity and ultimately the benefit level of the worst off might well regard herself as having a stronger claim to consideration than the better off person with significant talent who finds herself disadvantaged by the failure of society to enforce equality of opportunity when equal opportunity norms are not effective means to boost the long-run advantage of the least advantaged.
In the situation envisaged, FEO assigns priority to helping a better off person in a certain respect: enable the person to have the same prospects of competitive success as anyone else with the same native talent and ambition. In contrast, priority to the worse off says institute whatever policies will increase a function of aggregate well-being that gives greater weight to achieving gains for a person, the worse off she would otherwise be. The claim then will be that if the weights are properly set, priority appropriately balances the desirability of achieving benefits for better-off and worse-off people. From this standpoint, FEO goes wrong in several ways—in privileging resources over welfare outcomes, in failing to allow inequalities that advance priority-weighted well-being if the FEO constraint cannot be satisfied, and in demanding that resources flow to better-off people, when required to fulfill the FEO constraint, even when those resources would do more priority-weighted good by being deployed elsewhere, such as to the worse off.
Faced with this example, many will insist that equality of opportunity norms should prevail, or at least have some weight against other justice values. But one wonders if the underlying rationale for this insistence is not the residual shadow of a meritocratic belief that the person with superior native talent has a strong entitlement to gain any superior rewards that society dispenses if society does not insist on strict equality of benefits for all. Why else adopt norms that in the example above favor the talented woman disadvantaged through no fault of her own (because she is white and a woman) over the worse off untalented person also disadvantaged through no fault of her own (because she had the bad luck of being born untalented)?
The slogan “equality of opportunity” commands wide allegiance among the members of contemporary societies. Under scrutiny, equality of opportunity divides into several different ideals, some of them being opposed rivals. It is controversial which of these ideals, if any, are morally acceptable, and which, if any, should be coercively enforced as requirements of justice. (For a moderately skeptical overview, see Cavanagh 2002.) Debates about the seemingly banal norm of equality of opportunity reveal profound disagreements as to the nature of fair terms of cooperation in the modern world.
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