Phenomenal Intentionality

First published Mon Aug 29, 2016; substantive revision Tue Jan 29, 2019

Phenomenal intentionality is a kind of intentionality, or aboutness, that is grounded in phenomenal consciousness, the subjective, experiential feature of certain mental states. The phenomenal intentionality theory is a theory of intentionality according to which there is phenomenal intentionality, and all other kinds of intentionality at least partly derive from it. In recent years, the phenomenal intentionality theory has increasingly been seen as one of the main approaches to intentionality.

1. Introduction

The phenomenal intentionality theory is a theory of intentionality, the “aboutness” of mental states, on which phenomenal consciousness plays a central role in accounting for intentional states. Unlike many other contemporary theories of intentionality, which aim to account for intentionality in terms of causal relations, information, functional roles, or other “naturalistic” ingredients, the phenomenal intentionality theory’s main ingredient is phenomenal consciousness, the felt, subjective, or “what it’s like” (Nagel 1974) aspect of mental life. Accordingly, Pautz (2013) describes the general approach as taking a “consciousness first” approach to intentionality, since it claims that consciousness either grounds or is explanatorily prior to intentionality, and Kriegel (2011a, 2013a) describes the approach as one on which consciousness is the “source” of intentionality. (These ways of characterizing the phenomenal intentionality theory suggest a reductive picture, on which intentionality is reduced to or explained in terms of consciousness, but in section 2.3 we will see that some versions of the phenomenal intentionality theory are not reductive.)

By explaining intentionality in terms of phenomenal consciousness, the phenomenal intentionality theory challenges the received view of the past few decades that the mind divides into two mutually exclusive and independent types of states: intentional states and phenomenal states (see Kim 1998 for a clear articulation of the received view). According to the phenomenal intentionality theory, intentional states and phenomenal states are intimately related. Some intentional states are constituted by phenomenal states, and the rest are in some way importantly related to phenomenal states.

Phenomenal intentionality has been discussed under that label only recently (see, e.g., Horgan and Tienson 2002 and Loar 2003, and related influential work by Searle, Siewert, and others), but many modern philosophers have suggested a close relation between thought, which is characteristically intentional, and perception, which is characteristically phenomenal, or consciousness itself. For example, rationalists such as Descartes held that all cognition is conscious, while empiricists such as Hume and Locke held that all cognition is grounded in perceptual experience. Later, Brentano, Husserl and the phenomenologists that they influenced conceived of intentionality primarily as a conscious phenomenon. Like the phenomenal intentionality theory, the views of these figures can be understood as taking a “consciousness first” approach. For more on the history of the phenomenal intentionality theory, see Kriegel (2013a) and the entry Consciousness and Intentionality.

In this article we describe various versions of the phenomenal intentionality theory, their motivations, the challenges they face, and their relations to other views.

2. The phenomenal intentionality theory

2.1 The general view

Intentionality is the “aboutness” or “directedness”of mental states. For example, a thought that snow is white “says” or represents that snow is white. Similarly, your current visual experience might represent a blue cup or that there is a blue cup in front of you. When a state exhibits intentionality, it involves the instantiation of an intentional property, a property of representing something. What the state represents is its (intentional) content. In this article, we use the term “state” for instantantiations of properties, which are sometimes called token states. (See the entries Intentionality and Mental Representation.)

Phenomenal consciousness is the felt, subjective, or “what it’s like” aspect of mental states (see Nagel 1974). Paradigmatic examples of phenomenal states include perceptual experiences, pains, emotional feelings, episodes of mental imagery, and cognitive experiences such as the experience of déjà vu. Each of these states has a characteristic phenomenal character—there is something that it’s like to be in it. When there is something that it is like for a subject, we can say that she instantiates a phenomenal property, or that she has a phenomenal state. (See the entry Consciousness.)

Phenomenal intentionality is intentionality that is constituted by phenomenal consciousness. A phenomenal intentional state is an intentional state that is constituted by a subject’s phenomenal states. For example, someone who accepts phenomenal intentionality might say that a perceptual intentional state representing a red cube is constituted by a reddish-cube-ish phenomenal state—the reddish-cube-ish phenomenal experience automatically and necessarily results in the representation of a red cube. We will call intentional states that are not phenomenal intentional states non-phenomenal intentional state.

PIT takes phenomenal intentionality to play a central role in accounting for intentional phenomena. The next subsections discuss ways that this initial gloss on PIT can be precisified.

A central idea common to phenomenal intentionality theories is that phenomenal intentionality plays an important role in the mind. The next subsections discuss ways that this idea can be precisified.

2.2 Weak, Moderate, and Strong PIT

The following three theses about the relationship between phenomenal intentional states and intentional states are ways of precisifying the idea that phenomenal intentionality plays an important role in the mind:

Strong PIT: All intentional states are phenomenal intentional states.
Moderate PIT: All intentional states either are phenomenal intentional states or are at least partly grounded in phenomenal intentional states.
Weak PIT: Some intentional states are phenomenal intentional states.

The “all” in the above theses should be understood as quantifying over all actual intentional states, not all metaphysically possible intentional states. In the same way that some physicalist theories of intentionality allow that there are merely possible forms of intentionality that are independent of physical properties, PIT can allow that there are non-actual intentional states that have nothing to do with phenomenal consciousness. Of course, more specific versions of PIT might make stronger claims.

Of the three views mentioned above, Strong PIT asserts the strongest possible relationship between phenomenal intentionality and intentionality: it claims that phenomenal intentionality is the only kind of intentionality there is. Relatively few hold this view, but versions of it have been defended by Pitt (2004), Farkas (2008a), and Mendelovici (2010, 2018). The difficulty with this view, as we will see below, is that it is not clear that there are enough phenomenal states or phenomenal states of the right kind to constitute all intentional states. For example, it is not easy to see how standing beliefs like your belief that grass is green could be constituted by phenomenal states.

Moderate PIT is significantly weaker than Strong PIT. It is compatible with the existence of non-phenomenal intentional states but claims that any such non-phenomenal intentional states are at least partly grounded in phenomenal intentional states.

There are different ways of explicating the intuitive notion of grounding used in the definition of Moderate PIT. For our purposes here, we can say that A grounds B when B obtains in virtue of A. This gloss is itself in need of further analysis, but for now it is enough to know that grounding is an asymmetric relation of metaphysical determination (see Trogdon 2013 for an introduction to grounding). An example of grounding that is similar to the grounding relation posited by some proponents of Moderate PIT is the (alleged) grounding of linguistic meaning in speaker intentions: on many views of language, words have their meanings in virtue of speakers’ intentions toward them. To say that A is partly grounded in B is to that say that A is grounded in the combination of B and other factors.

There are different views of how phenomenal intentionality might partly ground non-phenomenal intentionality:

One view is that non-phenomenal intentional states are simply dispositions to have phenomenal intentional states and that these dispositions get their contents from the phenomenal intentional states that they are dispositions to bring about (Searle 1983, 1990, 1991, 1992). On this view, standing beliefs about grass that are not phenomenal intentional states are dispositions to have phenomenal intentional states with the same or related contents.

Another view is that non-phenomenal intentional states get their intentionality from functional relations they bear to phenomenal intentional states (Loar 2003a, Horgan & Tienson 2002, Graham, Horgan, & Tienson 2007). On this view, a standing belief that grass is green might have its content in virtue of being suitably connected to a host of phenomenal intentional states.

A third view is that non-phenomenal intentionality is a matter of ideal rational interpretation (Kriegel 2011a,b, Pautz 2013). On Kriegel’s view, for example, the relevant phenomenal intentional states are in the mind of a possible ideal rational interpreter.

More versions of Moderate PIT will be discussed below. Proponents of Moderate PIT (or something close to it) include Loar (1987, 1988, 1995, 2003a, 2003b), Searle (1983, 1990, 1991, 1992), Goldman (1993a,b), Siewert (1998), McGinn (1988), Kriegel (2003, 2011a,b), Horgan, Tienson & Graham (2003, 2004, 2006, 2007), Georgalis (2006), Pitt (2004, 2009, 2011), Farkas (2008a,b, 2013), Mendola (2008), Chalmers (2010: xxiv), Bourget (2010), Pautz (2010, 2013), Smithies (2012, 2013a, 2013b, 2014), and Montague (2016).

Weak PIT merely claims that there is phenomenal intentionality. It allows that there are non-phenomenal intentional states that have nothing to do with phenomenal consciousness. The proponents of Weak PIT are too many to list. As we will see below, Weak PIT is entailed by some widely accepted views in philosophy of mind, including many forms of representationalism about phenomenal consciousness, the view that phenomenal states are identical to intentional states (perhaps that meet certain further conditions).

Since Moderate PIT is the strongest view that is endorsed by most proponents of the general approach, it is the view that has the best claim to being the phenomenal intentionality theory. For this reason, this article will focus mainly on Moderate PIT. Unless otherwise indicated, we will use “PIT” to refer to Moderate PIT. (Note that Strong PIT is a version of Moderate PIT, while Weak PIT is not a version of PIT at all, but rather a weakening of the view.)

2.3 Grounding, Identity, and Reductive PIT

Our definition of phenomenal intentional states is neutral between two types of views regarding how phenomenal states constitute intentional states. On grounding views, phenomenal intentional states are grounded in phenomenal states (either in individual states or in sets of such states). Since grounding is asymmetric, this view implies that phenomenal intentional states are distinct from the phenomenal states that ground them. In contrast, identity views take the relation that obtains between phenomenal intentional states and phenomenal states (in virtue of which the former are constituted by the latter) to be that of identity: certain instantiations of intentional properties are identical to instantiations of phenomenal properties. On this view, phenomenal intentional states are identical to individual phenomenal states or sets of phenomenal states.

Farkas (2008a,b), Pitt (2004) (though not in Pitt 2009), and Woodward (2016, forthcoming-a) defend a grounding version of PIT. It is also possible to read Horgan and Tienson (2002) as holding a grounding version of PIT, since they take the relevant relation between phenomenal intentionality and phenomenal consciousness to be that of “constitutive determination”, which might be understood as a kind of grounding relation. Other proponents of PIT, such as Mendelovici (2018), favor an identity view.

We can also distinguish between versions of PIT that are reductive and versions that are not. To a first approximation, a theory of intentionality is reductive if it specifies the nature of intentionality in terms that are supposed to be more basic or fundamental. A theory that is not reductive might either be neutral on the question of reduction or incompatible with reduction.

All grounding versions of (Moderate or Strong) PIT are reductive. Such views entail that all intentionality is ultimately grounded in phenomenal states. Since grounding is asymmetric, the grounding phenomenal states cannot themselves be intentional and are more fundamental than intentional states.

An identity version of (Moderate or Strong) PIT will be reductive if it holds or entails that phenomenal intentional states are identical to phenomenal states and that phenomenal descriptions are more fundamental than intentional descriptions (just as “H2O” descriptions are more fundamental than “water” descriptions). If such views are correct, it should be possible to understand phenomenal states independently of intentionality.

Versions of (Moderate or Strong) PIT that identify phenomenal intentional states with phenomenal states can also be nonreductive. On such nonreductive views, phenomenal descriptions of intentional states are not more fundamental then intentional descriptions. Exactly which versions of PIT that identify phenomenal intentional states with phenomenal states are reductive or nonreductive is an open question.

Regardless of whether PIT provides a reductive account of intentionality in general, versions of Moderate PIT that allow for non-phenomenal intentional states aim to reduce such states to phenomenal intentionality and other ingredients, so they provide a reductive account of at least some intentional states. We will discuss some of these views below.

2.4 Other dimensions of variation

An important dimension of variation between versions of PIT concerns the extent of phenomenal intentionality. The disagreement here cuts across the disagreement between Moderate and Strong PIT. For example, Loar (2003a), who falls in the Moderate PIT camp, mostly limits phenomenal intentionality to perceptual and other sensory states. In contrast, other advocates of Moderate PIT (for example, Strawson (1994) and Pitt (2004)) claim that many thoughts have phenomenal intentionality. Most theorists maintain that unconscious subpersonal states, such as states in early visual processing or unconscious linguistic processing, lack phenomenal intentionality, though Bourget (2010, forthcoming-b), Pitt (2009, Other Internet Resources), and Mendelovici (2018) claim that some such states might have phenomenal intentionality that we are unaware of.

Phenomenal intentionality theorists also disagree on which mental states, if any, have non-phenomenal intentionality. Horgan & Tienson (2002) and Kriegel (2011a) claim that at least some unconscious subpersonal states have non-phenomenal intentionality, while Searle (1990, 1991, 1992) and Mendelovici (2018) deny this. Searle (1990, 1991, 1992) takes at least some standing states, such as non-occurrent beliefs and desires, to have non-phenomenal intentionality, which Strawson (2008) and Mendelovici (2018) deny.

Another important question concerns the structure of phenomenal intentionality. Some proponents of phenomenal intentionality hold that it has a relational structure (Pautz 2010, 2013; Speaks 2015; Bourget forthcoming-a, forthcoming-c), while others (Farkas 2008a,b; Kriegel 2011a,b, 2013; Mendelovici 2018; Pitt 2009) deny this. We briefly discuss this question in Section 4.6.

3. The place of PIT in logical space

This section outlines some important relations between PIT and other views.

3.1 Alternative theories of intentionality

Reductive PIT stands in contrast with two well-known classes of reductive theories of intentionality: tracking theories (Stampe 1977, Dretske 1988, 1995, Millikan 1984, Fodor 1987), which take the content of mental states to be a matter of causal-informational-historical links between them and things in the environment (see the entries on causal theories of mental content and teleological theories of mental content), and conceptual role theories, which take the content of mental states to be a matter of their relations to other mental states and sometimes to the external world (Block 1986, Harman 1987, Greenberg & Harman 2007). (See the section Conceptual role in the entry on narrow mental content.) Reductive PIT also contrasts with primitivism, the view that intentionality cannot be reduced.

Reductive PIT is a competitor to tracking, conceptual role, and primitivist theories in that it is an alternative account of the grounds of intentionality. Versions of PIT that are not reductive are also competitors to these theories, but to a more limited extent: they only offer an alternative explanation of the grounds of non-phenomenal intentional states. Such views are compatible with reducing phenomenal intentional states to tracking states and similar states.

While PIT offers a different account of the grounds of intentionality than conceptual role and tracking theories, it is noteworthy that all versions of PIT are, strictly speaking, compatible with these theories. It could turn out that PIT is true but phenomenal consciousness reduces to conceptual role or tracking, making both PIT and the tracking or conceptual role theory true.

3.2 Other views of the relationship between consciousness and intentionality

Representationalism (or intentionalism) is the view that phenomenal states are intentional states that meet certain further conditions (Harman 1990, Dretske 1995, Lycan 1996, Tye 2000, Byrne 2001, Chalmers 2004; see also the entry Representational Theories of Consciousness). As in the case of PIT, some versions of representationalism are reductive while others are not. When one says that phenomenal states are intentional states that meet certain conditions, one might intend this as a reduction of phenomenal consciousness or one might merely intend to point out a true identity. As in the case of PIT, many proponents of representationalism take the view to be reductive.

The reductive versions of representationalism and PIT are incompatible: if consciousness reduces to intentionality, then intentionality does not reduce to consciousness, and vice-versa. However, versions of PIT and representationalism that are not reductive are compatible. It is common for the two views to be combined: many advocates of PIT also endorse a version of representationalism, claiming that all phenomenal states are also representational states (Horgan and Tienson 2002, Graham, Horgan, and Tienson 2007, Pautz 2010, Mendelovici 2013, 2018, Bourget 2010). In the other direction, representationalism, as we are understanding the view, is committed to Weak PIT, because it entails that some intentional states are phenomenal states.

Another view of the relationship between intentionality and consciousness is what Horgan & Tienson dub “separatism”, the view that consciousness and intentionality are wholly distinct mental phenomena (see e.g., Kim 1998). On this view, consciousness and intentionality do not bear interesting metaphysical relations to each other. For example, there is no identity or grounding relation between them (separatists reject both PIT and representationalism). Separatism is typically associated with the view that consciousness is limited to perceptual and sensory states, and intentionality is limited to beliefs, desires, and other propositional attitudes.

4. Arguments for PIT

This section overviews the main arguments and motivations for PIT.

4.1 The phenomenological case

Horgan and Tienson (2002) argue for the claim that “[t]here is a kind of intentionality, pervasive in human mental life, that is constitutively determined by phenomenology alone” (2002: 520). This is a (fairly strong) version of Weak PIT. They do so by arguing for the following two principles:

IOP: (The intentionality of phenomenology) Mental states of the sort commonly cited as paradigmatically phenomenal (e.g., sensory-experiential states such as color-experiences, itches, and smells) have intentional content that is inseparable from their phenomenal character. (Horgan and Tienson, 2002: 520)
POI: (The phenomenology of intentionality) Mental states of the sort commonly cited as paradigmatically intentional (e.g., cognitive states such as beliefs, and conative states such as desires), when conscious, have phenomenal character that is inseparable from their intentional content. (Horgan and Tienson, 2002: 520)

We take IOP to say that each paradigmatic phenomenal property has an associated intentional content such that, necessarily, all instances of the property have this associated content. We take POI to say that each paradigmatic intentional property has some associated phenomenal character such that, necessarily, all instances of the property have this associated phenomenal character.

Horgan and Tienson defend IOP by appealing to broadly phenomenological considerations:

You might see, say, a red pen on a nearby table, and a chair with red arms and back a bit behind the table. There is certainly something that the red you see is like to you. But the red that you see is seen, first, as a property of objects. These objects are seen as located in space relative to your center of visual awareness. And they are experienced as part of a complete three-dimensional scene—not just a pen with table and chair, but a pen, table, and chair in a room with floor, walls, ceiling, and windows. This spatial character is built into the phenomenology of the experience. (Horgan & Tienson 2002: 521, footnote suppressed)

The basic idea is that introspective consideration of paradigmatic phenomenal states suggests that they are intentional. This argument echoes the transparency considerations for representationalism (see the entry Representational Theories of Consciousness).

Horgan and Tienson’s case for POI (the phenomenology of intentionality) rests primarily on detailed phenomenological observations purporting to show that there are phenomenological features corresponding to most contents of propositional attitudes as well as the attitudes of belief and desires. We discuss these arguments in section 5.

With IOP and POI in hand, Horgan and Tienson proceed to argue for the widespread existence of phenomenal intentionality. The following is a reconstruction of the key steps of their argument:

  1. The perceptual phenomenal states of a pair of phenomenal duplicates (creatures that have the same phenomenal experiences throughout their existence) necessarily share some contents, including many perceptual contents (from IOP).
  2. Therefore, the phenomenal duplicates necessarily have the same perceptual beliefs.
  3. Therefore, the phenomenal duplicates necessarily share many of their non-perceptual beliefs.
  4. Therefore, the phenomenal duplicates necessarily share many of their intentional contents at the level of perception, perceptual beliefs, and non-perceptual beliefs.

The general idea is that phenomenal states, with their phenomenally determined intentionality, bring in their train much of the rest of the “web of belief”.

Horgan and Tienson argue for the transition from (1) to (2) by articulating in some detail how the contents of perceptual experiences, either individually or in groups, bring in their train perceptual beliefs. A key idea, supported by POI, is that perceptual beliefs and other attitudes towards perceptible contents have phenomenal characters closely associated with them. For example, there is a phenomenology of accepting various contents as true. The suggestion is that once one has a vast number of perceptual experiences with their associated perceptual contents and feelings of accepting and rejecting some of these, one qualifies as having a number of perceptual beliefs.

Regarding the transition from (2) to (3), a key idea, again derived from POI, is that non-perceptual beliefs have extensive phenomenology. For example, according to Horgan and Tienson, there is something that it’s like to wonder whether to cook meatloaf for dinner. The phenomenology of such non-perceptual thoughts, together with one’s vast collection of perceptual beliefs and perceptual experiences, fixes a large number of non-perceptual beliefs and other non-perceptual propositional attitudes. (4) combines conclusions (1)(3).

The following considerations, while not exactly Horgan and Tienson’s, seem to go in the same direction as their line of argument: If all beliefs and desires have phenomenal characters unique to them, as Horgan and Tienson take themselves to have established, then phenomenal duplicates will share these phenomenal characters. By IOP, these phenomenal characters must determine contents. Plausibly, they determine the contents of the beliefs and desires that they characterize. So if an individual has a given belief with content C, then his or her phenomenal duplicate has this content as the content of a phenomenal experience. Moreover, the duplicate has a feeling of accepting C. It is then quite plausible that the duplicate believes C.

Horgan and Tienson’s argument establishes Weak PIT, but it does not yet establish any version of Moderate PIT. It could be that many intentional states are phenomenal intentional states but some intentional states are neither phenomenal intentional states nor grounded in phenomenal intentionality (Bailey and Richards (2014) point out related limitations of the argument). However, when combined with Horgan and Tienson’s arguments for the claim that many non-phenomenal intentional states are grounded in phenomenal intentionality (more on this view below), we have some support for Moderate PIT.

Mendelovici (2018) also argues for Moderate PIT on the grounds of metaphysical sufficiency: The ingredients invoked by alternative theories of intentionality, such as tracking and functional role theories, are not metaphysically sufficient for intentionality. For instance, it is unclear why having internal states playing certain functional roles should result in those internal states representing a particular content, or any content at all. Likewise, while tracking relations relate us to items that may seem to be well-suited to playing the role of content, such as objects, properties, and states of affairs, it is mysterious how tracking such items could make them psychologically relevant to us. For instance, it is unclear how merely tracking such items can make them introspectively accessible, available to reason with, or in any sense “entertained”. (See also BonJour 1998 for similar worries with tracking and functional role theories.) In contrast, PIT’s central ingredient, phenomenal consciousness, is arguably metaphysically sufficient for intentionality. For instance, it is arguably inconceivable for there to be someone with a reddish phenomenal experience who does not thereby represent redness. If all this is right, then there is reason to think that phenomenal consciousness alone is metaphysically sufficient for intentionality, which supports Moderate PIT.

4.2 Assessability for accuracy

Siewert (1998) argues for Weak PIT by arguing that phenomenal states are automatically assessable for accuracy. A key element of Siewert’s argument is his assumption that phenomenal characters can be identified with “how it seems for it to look some way to someone”. We take this to mean that phenomenal states are states of things seeming a certain way, where the relevant kind of seeming is the kind we are familiar with from cases where things look a certain way in perception (perhaps there are other kinds of seemings that are not phenomenal states). Siewert’s argument is contained in the following passage, in which we have added numbers corresponding to the premises:

First, consider some instance of its seeming to you as it does for it to look as if something is shaped and situated in a certain way, such as its seeming to you just as it does on a given occasion for it to look as if there is something X-shaped in a certain position. (1) If it seems this way to you, then it appears to follow that it does look to you as if there is something X-shaped in a certain position. (3) If this is right, then its seeming this way to you is a feature in virtue of which you are assessable for accuracy—(5) that is to say, it is an intentional feature. For, from what we have said, (2) if it seems to you as it does for it to look this way, then, if it is also the case that there is something X-shaped in a certain position, it follows that the way it looks to you is accurate. (Siewert 1998: 221)

Siewert suggests that this argument straightforwardly generalizes to a large number of perceptual experiences.

Let S be the phenomenal state in which it seems to you just as it does on a given occasion for it to look as if there is something X-shaped in a certain position. The argument in the above quotation can be broken down as follows:

  1. Necessarily, if you are in S, it looks to you as if things are a certain way W, in virtue of being in S.
  2. Necessarily, if it looks to you as if things are in way W, things being (or not being) W would make you accurate (or inaccurate).
  3. Therefore, if you are in S, you are assessable for accuracy with respect to things being W, in virtue of being in S.
  4. If you are assessable for accuracy in virtue of being in a certain state, this state has intentional content.
  5. Necessarily, S has intentional content.

Siewert does not explicitly defend premises (1) and (2). (4) is defended in section 6.2 of the book.

One might object that (3) does not follow from (1) and (2). Perhaps S is such that, necessarily, things being a certain way (or not) would make the bearer of S accurate (or not), but it is not in virtue of being in S that its bearer is assessable for accuracy. The assessability might come from the inevitable addition of an interpretation to S in all circumstances. Siewert argues against this possibility extensively between pages 222 and 245, ruling out various sources of interpretation.

Gertler (2001) objects that there is an alternative explanation of Siewert’s observations about the co-occurrence of phenomenal and intentional properties: intentional properties automatically give rise to phenomenal properties. Gertler argues that Siewert has not ruled out this alternative, and so fails to establish PIT. See Siewert 2004 for a response.

4.3 Internalism and brains in a vat

It is possible to argue for PIT on the basis of internalism about mental content, the view that what a subject’s mental states represent is fully determined by her intrinsic properties. (The alternative to internalism is externalism. Intentional content that is determined by a subject’s intrinsic properties is said to be narrow as opposed to wide. See the entries on narrow mental content and externalism about mental content.)

Loar (2003a) argues from internalism to PIT. First, Loar proposes the following two desiderata for a theory of intentionality: (1) The theory should be a non-referential theory, where a non-referential theory is a theory that does not take intentionality to be a matter of reference to external entities, for example, concrete or abstract objects. This desideratum is motivated by internalism. (Note that, for Loar, intentionality is not the same thing as reference, and so a non-referential theory of intentionality does not commit one to denying that there is such a thing as reference.) (2) The theory should accommodate externalism about reference and truth-conditions (see, e.g., Putnam 1975, Burge 1979, Kripke 1980).

Loar then argues that internalist views that do not appeal to phenomenal consciousness fail to meet desiderata (1) and (2). The first view he considers is short-arm functionalism, the view that causal interactions between brain states give rise to intentionality. The second view is a version of the descriptivist theory of reference combined with short-arm functionalism about its primitive representations. Having excluded these views, he argues that a version of PIT can meet his two desiderata. Phenomenal properties are inherently intentional in that they exhibit directedness, or purport to refer. Since purporting to refer is not the same thing as referring, the result is non-referential mental content. This satisfies the first desideratum.

Loar argues that his view satisfies the second desideratum by arguing that phenomenal properties do not by themselves secure reference or truth-conditions. Instead, reference and truth-conditions are a matter of externally-determined relations, as externalists such as Putnam (1975), Burge (1979), and Kripke (1980) claim. However, which externally-determined relations matter for reference depends on a subject’s non-referential internalist content. Horgan, Tienson, & Graham (2004) also suggest that PIT is the best available theory of narrow content and suggest that phenomenal intentionality can provide a basis for externalist content.

Another argument for PIT involves appeal to brain in a vat scenarios (see Loar 2003a and Horgan, Tienson & Graham 2004). A brain in a vat duplicate is an exact physical duplicate of a normally embodied human brain that is kept in a vat of life-sustaining liquids and is hooked up to a computer that delivers to it the same kinds of stimulation its embodied twin receives. It intuitively seems that a brain in a vat would have a mental life “matching” that of its embodied twin. The brain in a vat and its twin would have matching perceptual experiences, perceptual judgments, and beliefs. For example, when the embodied twin believes that she is lying on the beach sipping a frappé, the brain in a vat twin believes that they are lying on the beach sipping a frappé. However, while the normal subject’s belief might be true, the envatted subject’s beliefs, and many other of their mental states, would be false or non-veridical.

Farkas (2008a) agrees with Loar and Horgan et al. (2004) that PIT is the best available theory of narrow content but criticizes Loar (2003a) and Horgan et al. (2004) for making a concession to externalism by allowing for externally-determined reference, truth-conditions, or broad content. Instead, Farkas argues that internalist, phenomenally-constituted intentionality is all that a theory of intentionality needs.

Wilson (2003) objects to Loar’s appeal to brains in vats, claiming that intuitions concerning them are theoretical intuitions and are likely to be rejected by many of PIT’s opponents.

4.4 Aspectual shape

In an early defense of PIT, Searle (1990, 1991, 1992) puts forth an argument based on the “aspectual shapes” of intentional states. The argument is rather complex and open to several interpretations, but here is one simplified way of understanding it: Searle begins by noting that all intentional states have an aspectual shape, where an aspectual shape is a matter of how something is represented. For example, there is a difference between representing Hesperus and representing Phosphorus, or representing Superman and representing Clark Kent. The differences lie not in which objects are represented, but in how they are represented—these are differences in their aspectual shapes.

Searle then argues that no internal or external unconscious physical or functional facts can determine aspectual shapes. The only thing that can determine aspectual shape is consciousness. If that is so, then it looks like unconscious states can only have their aspectual shapes in virtue of their connections to conscious states. Searle concludes, more specifically, that unconscious intentional states involve dispositions to have conscious states, a thesis that he calls the connection principle. (Sometimes he says that unconscious states are potentially accessible to consciousness, apparently meaning that they can be introspected consciously (1992, p. 156), but other times he says what we say here: that unconscious states involve dispositions to have conscious states (1992, p. 159, 161–162). The latter is what Searle says as part of his argument for the connection principle, and this interpretation is more in line with the argument he deploys.)

In sum, the argument seems to go as follows:

  1. All intentional states have aspectual shape.
  2. Only states that are conscious or involve dispositions to have conscious states have aspectual shape.
  3. Therefore, all intentional states are either conscious or involve dispositions to have conscious states.

According to the argument’s conclusion, all intentional states are either phenomenal intentional states or involve dispositions to have such states. This is a version of Moderate PIT.

Searle’s arguments have elicited a large number of responses. Fodor and Lepore (1994) argue that there is no suitable way of cashing out what it would take for a state to be potentially conscious such that Searle’s claims are both plausible and tendentious (i.e., that they entail, as Searle claims, that much of cognitive science’s appeal to non-conscious intentional states is misguided). For a response, see Searle 1994. Davies (1995) argues that Searle might be right about a kind of intentionality but that there are other kinds of intentionality invoked in cognitive science that are not dependent on consciousness. Van Gulick (1995) argues that Searle’s notion of aspectual shape smuggles in the notion of consciousness, and that on a less contentious understanding of aspectual shape, his argument that consciousness is the only way of accounting for aspectual shape does not succeed. Baaren (1999) also takes issue with the notion of aspectual shape. See also the commentaries accompanying Searle 1990.

4.5 Arguments from content determinacy

Another line of argument for PIT similar to Searle’s aspectual shape argument is an argument from content determinacy. Graham, Horgan & Tienson (2007) and Horgan & Graham (2012) argue that it is difficult to see how unconscious neural activity, functional role, dispositions to behavior, and other possible physical bases of intentionality can yield the sorts of determinate contents we manifestly represent (see also Dennett 1987, Quine 1960: ch. 2, and Kripke 1982). For example, no causal, functional, or purely physical features of one’s brain or environment seem to make it the case that one is thinking about rabbits rather than undetached-rabbit-parts. A Martian looking down on Earth with complete knowledge of all Earthly physical facts could not tell whether we are representing rabbits or undetached rabbit parts. Thus, it appears that a physical-functional theory of intentionality will predict that one’s concept RABBIT is indeterminate between the two contents.

Similarly, nothing about our brains, their finite dispositions, or their environments indicates that our word “plus” means the plus operator rather than a Kripkean quus operator, an operator that works just like plus when the operands are less than 57 and returns 5 when either operand is 57 or greater (see Kripke 1982). If we do determinately represent plus and rabbits, something other than tracking relations, dispositions towards behaviors, internal functional roles, or brain states has to determine this. Along similar lines, Strawson (2008) argues that phenomenal intentional facts about what we take an intentional state to refer to play a key role in determining what an intentional state refers to.

Some argue that phenomenal consciousness is capable of explaining content determinacy. According to Graham, Horgan and Tienson, there is a phenomenal difference between representing rabbits and representing undetached-rabbit-parts. Since PIT claims that phenomenal intentional content is determined by phenomenal character, it allows that the two states have distinct contents. The supposition that there is high-level cognitive phenomenology corresponding to such abstract contents as rabbits and undetached-rabbit-parts is key to this argument. This is a controversial claim, but one that is quite central to many versions of PIT. We discuss this claim in section 5.

Arguments for PIT from content determinacy rely on the strong claim that the totality of physical facts do not fix content determinately and that content is fixed determinately. While PIT does not entail dualism about consciousness, PIT combined with this claim does (see Pautz 2013, who objects to arguments for PIT from content determinacy for related reasons). This claim will be resisted by anyone who thinks that physicalism about the mind is well-motivated. One might say that the intuition that physical facts cannot fix determinate contents arises from the fact that we do not have a suitably good understanding of how intentionality arises from physical facts; had we such an understanding, the intuition would disappear.

4.6 Intentional states about non-existents

Relationalism about intentionality is the view that intentionality is a relation to distinctly existing entities that serve as contents. Non-relationalism about intentionality is the view that intentionality is not a relation to distinctly existing entities that serve as contents.

Kriegel (2007, 2011a) argues that a non-relational view of intentionality provides the best explanation of how we can represent things that don’t exist, such as Bigfoot, and that PIT is the best candidate non-relational view of intentionality. Kriegel first argues that the following three intuitively appealing claims are inconsistent:

  • (a) One can represent non-existents.
  • (b) One cannot bear a relation to non-existents.
  • (c) Representing something involves (constitutively) bearing a relation to it. (Kriegel 2007: 308)

One of these claims needs to be rejected. Kriegel argues that it is (c), the claim that asserts relationalism. His’s argument proceeds by a process of elimination.

Kriegel considers rejecting (a). On this proposal, when we seem to represent dragons, Bigfoot, or Santa Claus, we either fail to have an intentional state or we represent something else. One reason Kriegel rejects the first option is that it implies that there is a gap between trying to represent and representing, which he takes to be implausible. On the second option, when we seem to represent non-existent concrete entities, we are really just representing something else, such as existent abstract entities (e.g., universals or propositions), existent mental entities (e.g., sense data or ideas), or existent possible but non-actual entities. But Kriegel takes this option to be highly counterintuitive. When we seem to be thinking about concrete flesh-and-blood Bigfoot, we are in fact thinking about an abstract or mental entity. (See, however, Mendelovici 2018, section 9.3.1 for a response to this line of argument.) Another worry is that accounting for the representation of non-existents seems like the wrong kind of reason to accept the existence of these abstract, mental, or merely possible entities.

Another option is to reject (b). Kriegel argues that just as a monadic property cannot be instantiated without an existing particular that instantiates it, so too a relation cannot be instantiated without existing particulars that instantiate it. In short, it is a general rule that relations require relata. Rejecting (b) is tantamount to claiming that the intentionality relation is an exception to this general rule, which is implausible.

Kriegel concludes that we should reject (c). He calls his non-relational view “adverbialism”, since it draws its inspiration from the adverbialist views of perception of Ducasse (1942) and Chisholm (1957). According to Kriegel’s adverbialism, representing Bigfoot is not standing in a relation to an entity, but rather instantiating a non-relational intentional property, which we might describe as the property of representing Bigfoot-wise.

So far, this only motivates adverbialism. The final step of the argument motivates PIT: One objection to adverbialism is that it is mysterious what non-relational intentional properties are. What is it to represent Bigfoot-wise? Kriegel suggests that a plausible account of these properties is that they are phenomenal properties. Phenomenal properties are usually taken to be non-relational and there is independent reason to think they give rise to intentionality (see the other arguments in this section). The resulting picture is one on which phenomenal intentionality is non-relational. Kriegel suggests that this view can be combined with the view that non-phenomenal intentionality is derived from phenomenal intentionality and is relational.

In short, Kriegel’s argument attempts to show that PIT is the best way to account for the representation of non-existents.

This argument motivates non-relational versions of PIT. However, it does not motivate relational versions of PIT, on which intentionality is relational. Loar (2003a), Pitt (2009), Kriegel (2007, 2011a), and Mendelovici (2010, 2018) hold non-relational versions of PIT, while Pautz (2013) and Bourget (forthcoming-a, forthcoming-c) defend a relational version of PIT, on which both phenomenal properties and intentional properties are relational. Speaks (2015) also defends a relational view of phenomenal representation (without endorsing PIT).

Arguing in the direction opposite the preceding considerations, some have challenged PIT on the grounds that intentionality is relational. Ott (2016) raises worries for PIT along such lines, arguing that most versions of PIT fail to adequately explain how phenomenal consciousness can give rise to intentionality, which he takes to necessarily involve a relation to extra-mental reality.

There are two lines of response open to phenomenal intentionalists: One is to maintain that phenomenal consciousness is itself relational in the relevant way. Pautz (2010) and Bourget (forthcoming-a, forthcoming-c) argue that consciousness is a relation to items in extra-mental reality, such as clusters of abstract properties or abstract propositions. Of course, this response gives up on the benefits of non-relational PIT alleged by Kriegel. (Bourget (forthcoming-c) responds to some of Kriegel’s arguments against relationalism.)

Another response is to deny that intentionality secures the required relation to extra-mental reality. Along such lines, Mendelovici (2018, sections 1.3.4 and 9.3.4) argues that it is a substantive question whether intentionality on its own or with the help of additional ingredients secures such a relation. Of course, whether this is so depends on what exactly we mean by “intentionality”. If intentionality involves such a relation by definition, then there is no further substantive question to be asked. But if, as Mendelovici (2010, 2018) and Kriegel (2010) suggest, the core notion of intentionality leaves open this aspect of its nature, it might very well turn out that intentionality does not involve such relations.

Even if intentionality does not involve a relation to extra-mental reality, one might worry that it should at least play a role in facilitating such a relation and that PIT cannot allow for this. But Ott (2016) suggests that PIT can in fact connect us to extra-mental reality through relations of resemblance. Similarly, Mendelovici (2018, chapter 9) argues that intentionality does not involve a connection to extra-mental reality but that truth and reference do and that truth and reference are a matter of a special kind of superficial resemblance called “matching”. Woodward (forthcoming-b) and Bourget (forthcoming-b) challenge Mendelovici’s account of truth and reference for non-relational versions of PIT.

4.7 The argument from predictive accuracy

Another line of argument for PIT begins by noting that theories of intentionality, combined with certain facts about the world, often make predictions as to what particular intentional states represent. For example, a causal theory of intentionality combined with the fact that cows often cause tokens of the concept COW might predict that COW represents the content cow, which might be the property of being a cow.

One line of argument for PIT is based on the claim that PIT makes correct predictions in certain paradigm cases of intentionality that other theories fail to accommodate. One such case is that of color experience: It is plausible (though not undisputed) that color experiences represent what Chalmers (2006) calls “Edenic colors”—primitive, non-physical, qualitative properties (see also Pautz 2006a, 2009). This might be supported by introspection, epistemic considerations, and considerations of psychological role. But since Edenic colors are arguably not instantiated, it is difficult for causal, informational, teleological, and other “tracking” theories of intentionality to allow us to represent them. Instead, such theories predict that perceptual color representations represent the likes of particular dispositions to reflect, emit, or transfer light of particular wavelengths. In contrast, since Edenic colors “match” the phenomenal characters of color experience, PIT has the resources to make the correct predictions in the case of color experiences. Mendelovici (2018) refers to this as the argument from matching for PIT. Pautz (2006b) makes a related argument against tracking representationalism and for primitivist representationalism based on a structural mismatch between the contents represented by color experience and the properties color experiences track. See also Causal Theories of Mental Content.

The argument from predictive accuracy purports to show that PIT is the only theory of intentionality that stands a chance of being empirically adequate (whether it can indeed handle all the cases depends on whether it can deal with challenging cases, such as those discussed in section 6). It does not make a complete case for PIT, but it is an important consideration as part of the overall case for PIT.

4.8 Other arguments for PIT

We will briefly mention a few other lines of argument for PIT.

One revolves around the idea that norms of rationality are constitutive of (non-phenomenal) intentional states. Pautz writes:

Consciousness grounds rationality because it is implicated in basic epistemic norms. … In turn, the facts about rationality help to constitutively determine belief and desire (Davidson, Lewis). So consciousness also ultimately grounds belief and desire. (Pautz 2014: 176)

This line of argument combines two claims that have been defended independently. The first is a view of non-phenomenal states (chiefly, propositional attitudes) on which they derive their contents from norms of rationality (Davidson 2001, Lewis 1983, Chalmers 2012). The second is the view that consciousness plays a role in determining rational norms (Siewert 1998, Campbell 2002, Smithies 2012, 2014). In addition to the above passage from Pautz, this argument for PIT is also made in Chalmers 2012: 467 and Pautz 2013: 226.

Another line of argument for PIT is that there is nothing to determine who a given non-conscious state of mind belongs to unless that state consists in a disposition to produce a conscious mental state of the right sort (Ludwig 1996). Kriegel (2003) similarly argues that only PIT can account for the fact that intentional states have a subjective or “for-me” character.

5. Cognitive phenomenology

Many defenses and elaborations of PIT maintain that occurrent thoughts have a rich and varied phenomenology. Such a view of thought is required by versions of PIT that claim that the contents we normally attribute to thoughts are phenomenal contents (see section 6.2). Cognitive phenomenology is also a widely debated topic independently of any connection to PIT (see, e.g., Cognitive Phenomenology, edited by Bayne and Montague 2011).

Advocates of PIT that take thought content to be phenomenal content mainly focus on arguing for the following two claims:

(Proprietary) Thoughts have proprietary phenomenal characters.
(Individuative) Thoughts have individuative phenomenal characters.

The term “proprietary” is due to David Pitt (2004). Thought has a proprietary phenomenal character just in case the phenomenal characters of thoughts are special or unique to thought, i.e., they are not perceptual, verbal, bodily, or affective phenomenal characters, or other phenomenal characters that are present in mental states other than thoughts. Following current usage, we call all of the aforementioned kinds of phenomenology sensory phenomenology and the putative proprietary phenomenology of thought cognitive phenomenology. The claim that thought has a proprietary phenomenology is then just the claim that it has a non-sensory phenomenology.

Thoughts have individuative phenomenal characters just in case thoughts with different intentional contents have different phenomenal characters and thoughts with different phenomenal characters have different intentional contents. (We use “individuative” in the way Bayne and Montague (2011: ch. 1) use it. Pitt (2004) uses the term “distinctive” for a similar notion and the term “individuative” to mean something else.)

While most advocates of PIT take thoughts to have individuative phenomenal characters, this isn’t required by PIT. Grounding PIT can allow that there is a one-many grounding relation between contents and phenomenal characters. For example, phenomenal properties r1 and r2 might both ground the intentional property of representing red421. If all intentional properties were grounded in this way, PIT would be true, but (Individuative) might not be.

It is possible for thoughts to have proprietary but not individuative phenomenal characters. For example, suppose every thought came with either a generic feeling of understanding or a generic feeling of confusion. These phenomenal characters might be proprietary in that they do not occur outside of thoughts, but they are not individuative, since thoughts with different intentional contents might have the same phenomenal characters.

It is also possible for thoughts to have individuative but not proprietary phenomenal characters. For example, suppose every thought came with a different kind of perceptual imagery. Then thoughts with different contents would have different phenomenal characters, but these phenomenal characters would not be special to thoughts, since perceptual states could have them too.

In addition to the claims that there is a proprietary and an individuative phenomenology of thought, advocates of PIT usually aim to establish that thought’s content is phenomenal intentional content and thus that thought’s intentional properties are obtained in the requisite way from phenomenal properties.

While much of the discussion of the phenomenology of thought involves careful argumentation and consideration of cases, it is worth mentioning that many advocates of a proprietary phenomenology of thought find the view obvious and the negation of the view clearly false or even absurd. Strawson writes:

To deny this [cognitive phenomenology], one must hold that the total lifelong character of our lived experience—everything that life is to us experientially—consists entirely of bare or pure sensation or feeling of one kind or another. It must, for example, be false to say that anguish at someone’s death includes conscious comprehending believing entertaining of the proposition that he is dead. (Strawson 2011a: 295, italics in original)

In a similar vein, Kriegel writes:

For my part, I am persuaded of the existence of cognitive experience […] most vividly by something like everyday experiential overwhelm: it simply seems that my inner life is much more interesting to me than it would be if my conscious experience consisted merely in perceptual experiences. (Kriegel 2011a: 50)

In what follows we discuss the main arguments that have been offered to supplement such appeals to the alleged obviousness of cognitive phenomenology.

5.1 Phenomenal contrast cases

Phenomenal contrast cases are cases of two thoughts that are alike in sensory phenomenal character but differ in thought content.

Siewert (1998) asks his readers to compare an experience of hearing or reading a sentence without understanding, as when one reads a difficult passage without paying attention to it, and an experience of hearing or reading a sentence with understanding. There is clearly a phenomenal difference between these cases. Siewert argues that the difference is not a difference in verbal or perceptual imagery, since the verbal and perceptual imagery might be the same in both cases. The best explanation of the phenomenal contrast is that thought involves proprietary cognitive phenomenology.

Strawson (1994) argues for a kind of “understanding experience” by contrasting the cases of a monolingual English speaker and a monolingual French speaker listening to the news in French. The experiences of the two subjects differ in a way that is not fully explained by a difference in sensory phenomenology. The best explanation involves a difference in cognitive phenomenology. Siewert (1998) also employs examples involving the comparison of hearing sentences in familiar versus unfamiliar languages.

As it stands, Strawson’s argument can only establish that thought has a proprietary phenomenology, but Kriegel (2011a: 49) extends it to argue that thought has an individuative phenomenology. He asks us to imagine a case of two languages involving graphically and phonetically identical words such that the same report can be interpreted in one language as describing a faraway war and in the other language a children’s bedtime story. Monolingual speakers of each language will experience different phenomenal characters upon reading or hearing this report. The best explanation of this involves a difference in cognitive phenomenology. This supports the claim that cognitive phenomenology is individuative.

Other arguments from phenomenal contrast cases aim to create the contrasting experiences in the reader herself. Horgan and Tienson (2002) present the reader with sentences that are likely to give rise to two different interpretations, such as the following:

(Relatives) Visiting relatives can be boring.

On one reading, the sentence is about the act of visiting relatives. On another reading, the sentence is about relatives that visit. Both readings are likely to generate the same verbal imagery, but they differ in content. Horgan and Tienson encourage the reader to notice that they also differ in phenomenal character. If this is right, then this suggests that thought has a proprietary and individuative phenomenology.

The following sentences are also used to generate phenomenal contrast cases:

(Dogs) Dogs dogs dog dog dogs. (Horgan and Tienson 2002)
(Time) Time flies! (Horgan and Tienson 2002)
(Bar) Before she had a chance to pass the bar, she decided to change directions, but she was not so pleasantly surprised with where she wound up. (Siewert 1998: 279)

(Dogs) might at first be read without understanding, but might subsequently be read with understanding, giving rise to a phenomenal contrast case. (Time) can be read as a cliché or as a command at the insect races. (Bar) can be read as being about an aborted legal career or a trip around town. Again, the claim is that these different readings of the sentences give rise to different phenomenal experiences and that the best explanation of this is that thought has a proprietary and individuative phenomenology.

Though instances of pairs of thoughts differing in intentional content and differing in phenomenal character provide some evidence for the existence of individuative cognitive phenomenology, in order for the thesis that thought has a individuative phenomenology to be true, there have to be no cases of thoughts that are alike in content but that differ in phenomenal character. This latter kind of case would be a counterexample to (Individuative). Wilson (2003) responds to Horgan and Tienson by accepting their observations in their phenomenal contrast cases but attempting to provide such a counterexample:

In the spirit of Horgan and Tienson’s appeal for a reader to “pay attention to your own experience” ([2002] p. 521), I have just done the decisive experiment: I thought first that George Bush is President of the United States, and had CNN-mediated auditory and visual phenomenology that focussed on one of his speeches. I then took a short break, doodled a little, wandered around the room, and then had a thought with that very same content and … nothing. Or at least nothing distinctly Bush-like, as in the first case. (Wilson 2003: 417)

If Wilson is right, this not only shows that arguments based on phenomenal contrast ultimately fail, but also provides positive considerations against (Individuative), since it shows that there can be thoughts with the same contents that fail to have the same phenomenal character.

Versions of PIT that require only a one-many relation between phenomenal intentional content and phenomenal character, and hence that do not need to endorse (Individuative), can accommodate observations such as Wilson’s putative observation, since they allow that multiple phenomenal characters can ground or constitute the same phenomenal intentional content.

Another kind of objection to arguments from phenomenal contrast involves agreeing that there is a phenomenal difference between the relevant cases but claiming that this difference is exhausted by sensory phenomenology, where this might include the phenomenology of perceptual imagery, affective experience, or verbal imagery (see, e.g., Lormand 1996, Tye and Wright 2011, Levine 2011, Robinson 2011, Carruthers and Veillet 2011). What makes the phenomenal contrast cases described above vulnerable to this kind of objection is that they do not control for all potential accompanying perceptual imagery. This leaves open the possibility that the observed phenomenal differences are fully accounted for by such imagery.

Chudnoff (2013) provides a phenomenal contrast case that he claims avoids this reply. He asks his readers to compare the experience of an array of dots to an experience of the same array of dots experienced as part of a proof for a mathematical theorem. In the second experience, but not in the first, the perceptual experience involves cognitive phenomenology. The array of dots is in some sense experienced as part of a larger whole, representative of something, or in some sense meaningful. (Chudnoff 2015a,b also contain extensive critical discussions of phenomenal contrast cases.)

One might worry that, like the original phenomenal contrast cases, Chudnoff’s case does not control for certain forms of accompanying imagery, in this case, verbal imagery. The adamant opponent of cognitive phenomenology might insist that just as the phenomenal differences in the phenomenal contrast cases involving sentences might be explained by perceptual imagery, the differences in Chudnoff’s cases can be accounted for by differences in verbal phenomenology.

It might seem that what is needed is a phenomenal contrast case that plausibly controls for both verbal and perceptual phenomenology, as well other kinds of sensory phenomenology. Mendelovici (2010: 107) argues that thoughts about chiliagons (one-thousand sided figures) and megagons (one-million sided figures) might involve the same mental imagery (both shapes effectively look like circles) and so might provide the basis for such cases. Imagine a person who mistakenly uses the word “megagon” to mean chilliagon. Compare her experience of viewing a chilliagon and thinking that it is a chilliagon with your experience of viewing a megagon and thinking that it is a megagon. Since you both use the word “megagon” to describe the shape you are thinking about, and since the two shapes are perceptually similar, you will likely have the same perceptual and verbal imagery. If there is a phenomenal difference between the two cases, it is plausibly attributed to a difference in thought content.

5.2 Spontaneous thoughts

Siewert (1998, 2011) claims that sudden realizations are cases in which cognitive phenomenology is particularly noticeable.

[Y]ou are standing at the door to your house, reaching in your pants pocket for the door key, and find it empty. You feel a sudden panic; you think perhaps you have locked yourself out; you try to remember where you put the keys, then recall switching them to your coat pocket earlier; you reach and find them there—relief. (Siewert 1998: 277)

I meet a friend, and she asks me, “Did you bring the book?” For a moment I am at a loss as to what book she’s talking about—and then I realize in an instant what book it is. (Siewert 2011: 258)

Siewert claims that such realizations needn’t involve any verbal or perceptual imagery. In the case of the first example, you don’t think the words “I have locked myself out” or visualize your keys. Siewert takes these and other similar examples to show that thought has a proprietary phenomenology.

Similarly, in order to argue that the phenomenal properties of thought are not merely associated with verbal imagery, Horgan and Tienson (2002) point to examples of spontaneous thoughts we have when engaging in activities such as cooking or working in a garage or woodshop:

There is something that it is like to think that a certain tool is just there—in that cabinet, say—but such beliefs are typically not verbalized either vocally or subvocally or by way of verbal imagery. (Horgan and Tienson 2002: 523)

Like Siewert’s examples, this example helps motivate the claim that thought has a proprietary phenomenology.

This line of argument relies heavily on introspection. Unfortunately, detractors of cognitive phenomenology (for example, Robinson 2011 and Tye & Wright 2011) claim that their own observations of sudden realization reveal less phenomenology, resulting in an apparent stalemate.

5.3 The tip-of-the-tongue phenomenon

Some experiences with a cognitive character seem to make a fairly good case for a minimal amount of proprietary phenomenology of thought. For example, Goldman (1993a) invokes the tip-of-the-tongue phenomenon to argue that thought has a proprietary phenomenology, an argument he attributes to Jackendoff (1987).

When one tries to say something but can’t think of the word, one is phenomenologically aware of having requisite conceptual structure, that is, of having a determinate thought-content one seeks to articulate. What is missing is the phonological form: the sound of the sought-for word. The absence of this sensory quality, however, does not imply that nothing (relevant) is in awareness. Entertaining the conceptual unit has a phenomenology, just not a sensory phenomenology. (Goldman 1993a: 24)

The tip-of-the-tongue phenomenon occurs when one cannot think of a word, so it involves the absence of verbal phenomenology corresponding to that word. But instances of this phenomenon do involve some phenomenology. Goldman proposes that this phenomenology is non-sensory.

Lormand (1996) responds to this suggestion by providing an alternative account of the relevant phenomenology on which it is sensory, which he also takes to be supported by Jackendoff 1987. According to Lormand, the relevant phenomenology involves a sensory phenomenal experience of a void, which is akin to hearing silence, along with an experience of effort, whose phenomenology is also sensory.

5.4 Epistemic markers of consciousness

Phenomenal consciousness has various epistemic markers: It gives rise to (at least the appearance of) an explanatory gap (see Levine 1983 and the entry on consciousness), it is susceptible to zombie thought experiments (see Chalmers 1996 and the entry on zombies), and it is susceptible to the knowledge argument (see Jackson 1982 and the entry Qualia: The Knowledge Argument). These arguments usually focus on sensory phenomenal consciousness. For example, Levine’s central example is that of pain and Jackson’s is that of experiencing red.

The initial plausibility of these kinds of arguments might be taken to serve as an indicator of phenomenal consciousness: plausibly, if these arguments have some traction with some mental state, then that mental state is likely to have phenomenal properties. Some have used the presence or absence of such markers to argue for or against cognitive phenomenology.

Goldman (1993b) argues that a version of Jackson’s (1982) thought experiment can be run with propositional attitudes, such as doubt and disappointment:

Jackson’s example is intended to dramatize the claim that there are subjective aspects of sensations that resist capture in functionalist terms. I suggest a parallel style of argument for attitude types. Just as someone deprived of any experience of colors would learn new things upon being exposed to them, viz., what it feels like to see red, green, and so forth, so (I submit) someone who had never experienced certain propositional attitudes, e.g., doubt or disappointment, would learn new things on first undergoing these experiences. There is “something it is like” to have these attitudes, just as much as there is “something it is like” to see red. (Goldman 1993b: 365)

In other words, Goldman argues that Jackson’s thought experiment is compelling in the case of propositional attitudes and that this supports the claim that propositional attitudes have proprietary phenomenal properties above and beyond functional properties. (Presumably, Goldman intends his argument to apply only to occurrent propositional attitudes, since he takes standing states to be purely dispositional (1993b: 366).) Goff (2012) makes similar observations.

Horgan (2011a) also uses epistemic indicators of phenomenal consciousness to argue for cognitive phenomenology. He argues that since partial zombies lacking cognitive phenomenology are conceivable and phenomenally different from us, we have cognitive phenomenology.

Interestingly, Carruthers and Veillet (2011) use epistemic indicators to argue against cognitive phenomenology. They claim that thought is not susceptible to the explanatory gap, and thus that there is no cognitive phenomenology.

5.5 Self-knowledge

Pitt (2004) argues that there is a kind of self-knowledge that can only be explained by cognitive phenomenology. Pitt’s argument not only aims to establish that there is a proprietary and individuative cognitive phenomenology but also that this phenomenology is constitutive of thought’s content, i.e., that thought’s content is phenomenal intentional content.

Pitt’s argument runs as follows: Normally, we can consciously, introspectively, and non-inferentially (1) distinguish an occurrent thought from other mental states, (2) distinguish an occurrent thought from other occurrent thoughts, and (3) identify which occurrent thoughts we are thinking. Pitt considers various explanations of these abilities, and argues that the only plausible explanation is that thought has a proprietary, individuative, and constitutive phenomenology. Thought’s proprietary phenomenology explains how we can tell the difference between thoughts and other kinds of mental states, thought’s individuative phenomenology explains how we can tell the difference between one thought and another, and thought’s phenomenology being constitutive of its content explains how we can identify which thoughts we are thinking.

Levine (2011) argues that Pitt (2004) fails to rule out an alternative explanation of the relevant kind of self-knowledge: immediate self-knowledge is a matter of non-inferentially coming to have an intentional state that represents that one is thinking what one is in fact thinking. In having such a state, one is automatically aware of its content. Pitt (2011) responds that, when properly understood, Levine’s proposal can’t work unless there is the contested kind of cognitive phenomenology.

Goldman (1993a,b) also uses considerations from self-knowledge to argue for a phenomenology of thought. He argues that the way we can tell what mental states we are in is not through their functional roles or neural properties, but through their phenomenal properties. In the case of cognitive states, the best explanation for how we can discriminate between different strengths of desires or degrees of belief is that thoughts have an accompanying phenomenology.

6. Challenges for PIT

PIT faces both in-principle challenges and empirical challenges. We have already discussed the in-principle worry that phenomenal consciousness is not metaphysically sufficient for intentionality (see section 4.1). Here, we focus on the empirical challenges PIT faces in accommodating specific kinds of mental states.

The problematic mental states are those that might reasonably be taken to have intentionality without having phenomenal intentionality. Here we will discuss four types of mental state that give rise to challenges of this kind: thoughts, standing propositional attitudes, wide intentional states, and occurrent unconscious states. These states don’t seem to be phenomenal intentional states, so it is not immediately clear how PIT can accommodate them.

There are three general strategies for handling a problematic state: eliminativism, inflationism, and derivativism. Eliminativism consists in denying the existence of the putative intentional state (or denying that it is an intentional state). Inflationism consists in claiming that the state in question is a phenomenal intentional state. In the case of thought, this strategy often involves arguing for rich cognitive phenomenology (see section 5). Derivativism agrees that the problematic state is not a phenomenal intentional state, but maintains that it nonetheless derives its content in part from phenomenal intentional states and so is at least partly grounded in such states. We will now discuss these strategies in more detail in relation to the four problematic kinds of states.

6.1 Thoughts

Thoughts are occurrent conceptual states, the kinds of states we have when we think, reflect, or muse over something. Examples of thoughts include judgments, occurrent beliefs, and occurrent desires. Thoughts, especially thoughts about abstract ideas such as democracy and the square root function, might seem to lack phenomenal properties. Even if thoughts have phenomenal properties, it does not seem that these phenomenal properties are rich or determinate enough to fully account for their intentional properties. For example, these phenomenal properties might seem to be limited to verbal and visual imagery.

Inflationism is the most widely endorsed strategy for dealing with occurrent thoughts, at least in cases of thoughts that do not seem to have wide contents (see 6.3 below for the latter). Strawson (1994, 2008), Siewert (1998), Horgan & Tienson (2002), Horgan, Tienson & Graham (2004), and Pitt (2009) all hold that occurrent thought has a phenomenology that is rich and determinate enough to fix its intentional contents. Horgan & Tienson (2002), Horgan, Tienson & Graham (2004), and Pitt (2009) also argue that the difference between beliefs, desires, and other kinds of attitudes is phenomenally constituted. The case for this approach rests on the arguments for cognitive phenomenology we discuss above.

In contrast, Loar (2003a,b), Bourget (2010, 2015), and Mendelovici (2010, 2018) maintain that thoughts have a fairly impoverished phenomenology that cannot fully constitute all the contents we might want to attribute to them. Loar (2003a,b) endorses a derived content strategy on which much of thought’s content is determined by the “lateral connections” between thoughts and other mental states. The network of interconnected states eventually derives its content from phenomenal intentional states. Bourget (2010) adopts a derived content strategy on which thoughts derive their contents from phenomenal intentional states through a variety of derivation mechanisms.

Mendelovici (2010, 2018) has a largely eliminativist take on the intentionality of thought. Like Pitt (2004, 2009), she holds that all intentional states are phenomenal intentional states, but unlike Pitt, she maintains that the phenomenology of thought is too impoverished to capture all the contents we might pre-theoretically want to attribute to thoughts. However, she recognizes the existence of derived representational contents, which capture the rich contents we tend to attribute to thoughts. Derived representational states are not strictly speaking intentional states, but they fill the role that intentional states with rich contents have been thought to play.

6.2 Standing propositional attitudes

Standing propositional attitudes are states one is in independently of what one is thinking about or experiencing at the time (i.e., independently of one’s occurrent states). For example, five minutes ago you had the standing belief that monkeys like bananas even though you weren’t occurrently thinking that content. Standing propositional attitudes do not seem to have phenomenal properties, and so, it seems their intentionality is not phenomenal intentionality.

As far as we can tell, no one has applied the inflationist strategy to standing propositional attitudes—no one claims that they are phenomenal intentional states.

Strawson (2008) and Mendelovici (2010, 2018) adopt the eliminativist strategy as part of their defenses of PIT: they deny that standing beliefs and other standing propositional attitudes are intentional states. As Strawson puts it, “To have a belief is not to be in any contentful mental state.” (p. 271) Rather, it is to be disposed to be in such a state. Horgan & Tienson (2002) are not eliminativists about the intentionality of standing states, but they do not consider them part of the scope of their version of PIT.

Searle (1990, 1991, 1992), Bourget (2010), and Kriegel (2011a,b) favor derivativism about standing states. Searle holds that non-phenomenal intentional states have their intentionality in virtue of subjects’ dispositions to have conscious states. This account applies most naturally to standing propositional attitudes. Bourget (2010) holds a similar but more nuanced view according to which standing propositional attitudes derive from connections to occurrent thoughts, which themselves either are phenomenal intentional states or derive their contents from distinct phenomenal intentional states (see the next section on the derivativist strategy for thoughts).

The simple derived content approach defended by Searle and Bourget is open to well-known objections. One of these objections, discussed by Peacocke (1998), is that a state that causes occurrent thoughts to the effect that P is not a belief that P unless it is accompanied by the right behavior. Imagine someone who claims not to be sexist and tends to form occurrent non-sexist thoughts but who behaves in demonstrably sexist ways. Such an individual is naturally said to have unconscious sexist beliefs.

Kriegel’s (2011a,b) account aims to explain standing states and unconscious occurrent states in a unified way. On his account, which he calls interpretivism, a non-phenomenal state s has a certain derived intentional content C just in case an ideal interpreter is disposed to ascribe C to s. An ideal interpreter is a being that is perfectly rational and knows all the phenomenal and non-phenomenal (but not derivatively intentional) facts about the world. On the resulting derivativist view, non-phenomenal intentional states derive from an ideal interpreter’s phenomenal intentional states.

The disagreement between eliminativism and derivativism about standing states might be partly terminological. Most of the above-mentioned theorists agree that standing states are a matter of a certain kind of disposition to have phenomenal states. What they disagree on is whether the potentially conscious or dispositional states count as intentional states.

6.3 Wide intentional states

Wide intentional states are intentional states that depend on relations to items in our environments. They are states for which externalism is true (see section 4.3). Prime candidates of wide intentional states are thoughts about natural kinds (e.g., H2O) and thoughts about individual objects (e.g., Bill Gates). Arguably, subjects that are phenomenally alike and have all the same phenomenal intentional states can nonetheless differ in their wide intentional states. So, it seems that wide intentional states are not phenomenal intentional states.

A Twin Earth case helps illustrate the options available in the case of wide intentional states (see Putnam 1975). Consider two individuals, Alice and Twin Alice. Alice lives on Earth, while Twin Alice lives on a copy of Earth located far away from us in this world. Let us suppose that Alice and Twin Alice are phenomenal duplicates: they instantiate all the same phenomenal properties throughout their existences.

Alice and Twin Alice each have a brother called “Bob”. When Alice thinks a thought that she would express by making the sounds “Bob is happy”, it seems that her thought is true at just the worlds where Bob is happy. By contrast, it seems that the thought that Twin Alice expresses with “Bob is happy” in her idiolect is one that is true at just the worlds where Twin Bob is happy. So it looks like the Alices’ thoughts have different truth conditions. This suggests that the Alices’ thoughts have different contents. Alice’s thought represents that Bob is happy, while Twin Alice’s thought represents that Twin Bob is happy. The Alices’ “Bob”-thoughts are paradigmatic examples of putatively broad intentional states.

Few advocates of PIT seem to endorse an inflationist strategy for broad intentional states. Even advocates of PIT who take consciousness to be relational seem to agree that what a subject gets related to in consciousness depends solely on her intrinsic properties (Pautz 2010). However, Campbell (2002) holds that perceptual experience is broad and intentional, and his view might be counted as a type of phenomenal intentionality theory.

Siewert (1998), Kriegel (2007), and Farkas (2008a) adopt an eliminativist strategy with respect to broad intentional states. Their views are the same in broad outline. On their views, the two Alices’ thoughts have the same content, and that content is narrow. We can account for the fact that the two Alices’ thoughts are made true by different Bobs by adding contextual parameters to their shared content: their shared content is not a function from possible worlds to truth values but a function from possible worlds and relevant elements of context to truth values. The introduction of contexts enables us to account for the fact that the Alices’ thoughts are true at different worlds. For example, one (over-simplistic) view along these lines could state that the shared content of the two Alices’ thoughts can be modeled as a function from worlds W and contexts of use C that returns true just in case the person that bears the name “Bob” in C is happy in W. Given that different contexts are relevant to Alice and Twin Alice, different worlds can satisfy the common thought they express as “Bob is happy”. If this is the right way to think about content, the Bobs’ case and other cases motivating broad content do not force us to recognize broad contents.

Pitt (1999, 2011) also endorses an eliminativist strategy, arguing against externalist intuitions. Mendelovici (2010, 2018) also endorses eliminativism but claims that she can capture many externalist intuitions through the notion of derived mental representation (see the previous section).

Derivativist strategies have also been applied to broad contents (Loar 2003a,b, Horgan and Tienson 2002, Horgan, Tienson & Graham 2004, Bourget 2010, Chalmers 2010). The idea here is that broad intentional states have two contents: a phenomenally constituted narrow content, and a broad content that is determined by the narrow content together with relevant factors in the environment. So Alice’s thought has two contents: one narrow and one broad. The broad content of her thought is true at just the worlds where Bob is happy. The narrow content is true at the worlds where a person bearing certain Bob-like characteristics is happy. The relevant Bob-like characteristics might, for example, centrally involve being called “Bob” by people of a certain community.

Of course, such a derivativist approach is compatible with other accounts of the narrow content of Alice’s thought. The options available to proponents of PIT are the same as for theories of narrow content in general. For instance, this derivativist approach can draw on all the resources of two-dimensional theories of narrow content (see Chalmers 2002a and the entries on two-dimensional semantics and narrow mental content).

Pautz (2008, 2013, 2017) offers a related derivativist approach that he dubs consciousness-based best systems theory. On this view, facts about (sensory) phenomenal states and their internal causal roles fix the facts about what is rational for an agent to believe. These facts about rationality in turn fix the narrow contents of an individual’s beliefs. Wide contents are fixed by causal relations between beliefs and the environment.

6.4 Unconscious occurrent states

Cognitive science posits various kinds of occurrent unconscious representation, e.g., dorsal stream states and internal representations of syntactic structures. It seems that such states have intentional properties but lack phenomenal properties, so their intentionality cannot be phenomenal intentionality.

Some supporters of PIT adopt an eliminativist strategy towards such unconscious states. Searle (1990, 1991, 1992) argues, roughly, for the claim that only conscious or potentially conscious states exhibit intentionality. Since most unconscious states posited by cognitive science are not potentially conscious, they are not intentional. Searle presents this view of unconscious states as being in conflict with cognitive science. In contrast, Graham, Horgan, and Tienson (2007) and Mendelovici (2018) highlight the agreement between the assumptions of cognitive science and eliminativism about unconscious states: everyone agrees that unconscious states play functional roles, bear tracking relations to things in the environment, and have no phenomenal properties. Everyone also agrees that it can be fruitful to treat unconscious states as if they represented certain contents. The main disagreement is over whether unconscious states really do qualify as intentional.

Bourget (2010, 2015) and Pitt (2009, Other Internet Resources) suggest that an inflationist strategy may be acceptable in case of at least some unconscious occurrent states. On their views, we can have phenomenal states that we are not aware of. Unconscious occurrent states could be such states.

A derived content strategy is also an option in the case of some unconscious occurrent states. Bourget (2010) argues for this strategy by arguing for the claim that the low-level systems that allegedly support unconscious occurrent intentional states don’t seem intentional when they are taken out of the organisms in which they belong. Kriegel’s interpretivism (2011a,b) is also meant to apply to unconscious occurrent states (see section 6.2).


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Other Internet Resources


Many thanks to David Chalmers, Daniel Stoljar, and SEP’s anonymous referees for extensive comments and discussion. Thanks also to Kati Farkas, Adam Pautz, and David Pitt for very helpful comments on previous drafts of this entry.

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David Bourget <>
Angela Mendelovici <>

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