Everett's Relative-State Formulation of Quantum Mechanics

First published Wed Jun 3, 1998; substantive revision Tue Oct 23, 2018

Hugh Everett III’s relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics is a proposal for solving the quantum measurement problem by dropping the collapse dynamics from the standard von Neumann-Dirac formulation of quantum mechanics. Everett intended to recapture the predictions of the standard collapse theory by explaining why observers nevertheless get determinate measurement records that satisfy the standard quantum statistics. There has been considerable disagreement over the precise content of his theory and how it was suppose to work. Here we will consider how Everett himself presented the theory, then briefly compare his presentation to the many-worlds interpretation and other no-collapse options.

1. Introduction

Everett developed his relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics while a graduate student in physics at Princeton University. His doctoral thesis (1957a) was accepted in March 1957 and a paper (1957b) covering essentially the same material was published in July of the same year. DeWitt and Graham (1973) later published Everett’s longer, more detailed description of the theory (1956) in a collection of papers on the topic. The published version was revised from a longer draft thesis that Everett had given John Wheeler, his Ph.D. adviser, in January 1956 under the title “Wave Mechanics Without Probability”. While Everett always favored the description of the theory as presented in the longer thesis, Wheeler, in part because of Bohr’s disapproval of Everett’s critical approach, insisted on the revisions that led to the much shorter thesis that Everett ultimately defended.

Everett took a job outside academics as a defense analyst in the spring of 1956. While subsequent notes and letters indicate that he continued to be interested in the conceptual problems of quantum mechanics and, in particular, in the reception and interpretation of his formulation of the theory, he did not take an active role in the debates surrounding either. Consequently, the long version of his thesis (1956) is the most complete description of his theory. Everett died in 1982. See (Byrne 2010) for further biographical details and (Barrett and Byrne 2012) for an annotated collection of Everett’s papers, notes, and letters regarding quantum mechanics. See also (Osnaghi, Freitas, Freire 2009) for an excellent introduction to the history of Everett’s formulation of quantum mechanics.

Everett’s no-collapse formulation of quantum mechanics was a direct reaction to the measurement problem that arises in the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse formulation of the theory. Everett understood this problem in the context of a version of the Wigner’s Friend story. Everett’s solution to the problem was to drop the collapse postulate from the standard formulation of quantum mechanics then deduce the empirical predictions of the standard collapse theory as the subjective experiences of observers who were themselves modeled as physical systems in the theory. The result was his relative-state interpretation of pure wave mechanics.

There have been many mutually incompatible presentations of Everett’s theory. Indeed, it is fair to say that most no-collapse interpretations of quantum mechanics have at one time or another either been directly attributed to Everett or suggested as charitable reconstructions. The most popular of these, the many worlds interpretation, is often simply attributed to Everett directly and without comment even when Everett himself never characterized his theory in terms of many worlds.

In order to understand Everett’s proposal for solving the quantum measurement problem, one must first clearly understand what he took the quantum measurement problem to be. We will start with this, then consider Everett’s presentation of his relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics quantum mechanics and the sense in which he took it to solve the quantum measurement problem. We will then contrast Everett’s views the many-worlds interpretation and a number of other alternatives.

2. The Measurement Problem

Everett presented his relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics as a way of avoiding conceptual problems encountered by the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. The main problem, according to Everett, was that the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics, like the Copenhagen interpretation, required observers always to be treated as external to the system described by the theory. One consequence of this was that neither the standard collapse theory nor the Copenhagen interpretation can be used to describe the physical universe as a whole. He took the von Neumann-Dirac collapse theory to be inconsistent and the Copenhagen interpretation to be essentially incomplete. We will follow the main argument of Everett’s thesis and focus here on the measurement problem as encountered by the standard collapse theory.

In order to understand what Everett was worried about, one must first understand how the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics works. The theory involves the following principles (von Neumann, 1955):

  1. Representation of States: The state of a physical system \(S\) is represented by an element of unit length in a Hilbert space (a vector space with an inner product).
  2. Representation of Observables: Every physical observable \(O\) is represented by a Hermitian operator \(\boldsymbol{O}\) on the Hilbert space representing states, and every Hermitian operator on the Hilbert space corresponds to some observable.
  3. Eigenvalue-Eigenstate Link: A system \(S\) has a determinate value for observable \(O\) if and only if the state of \(S\) is an eigenstate of \(\boldsymbol{O}\). If it is, then one would with certainty get the corresponding eigenvalue as the result of measuring \(O\) of \(S\).
  4. Dynamics: (a) If no measurement is made, then a system \(S\) evolves continuously according to the linear, deterministic dynamics, which depends only on the energy properties of the system. (b) If a measurement is made, then the system \(S\) instantaneously and randomly jumps to a state where it either determinately has or determinately does not have the property being measured. The probability of each possible post-measurement state is determined by the system’s initial state. More specifically, the probability of ending up in a particular final state is equal to the norm squared of the projection of the initial state on the final state.

Everett referred to the standard von Neumann-Dirac theory the “external observation formulation of quantum mechanics” and discussed it beginning (1956, 73) and (1957, 175) in the long and short versions of his thesis respectively. While he took the standard collapse theory to encounter a serious conceptual problem, he also used it as the starting point for his presentation of pure wave mechanics, which he described as the standard collapse theory but without the collapse dynamics (rule 4b). We will briefly describe the problem with the standard theory, then turn to Everett’s discussion of the Wigner’s Friend story and his proposal for replacing the standard theory with pure wave mechanics.

According to the eigenvalue-eigenstate link (rule 3) a system would typically neither determinately have nor determinately not have a particular given property. In order to determinately have a particular property the vector representing the state of a system must be in the ray (or subspace) in state space representing the property, and in order to determinately not have the property the state of a system must be in the subspace orthogonal to it, and most state vectors will be neither parallel nor orthogonal to a given ray.

The deterministic dynamics (rule 4a) typically does nothing to guarantee that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property when one observes the system to see whether the system has that property. This is why the collapse dynamics (rule 4b) is needed in the standard formulation of quantum mechanics. It is the collapse dynamics that guarantees that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property (by the lights of rule 3) whenever one observes the system to see whether or not it has the property. But the linear dynamics (rule 4a) is also needed to account for quantum mechanical interference effects. So the standard theory has two dynamical laws: the deterministic, continuous, linear rule 4a describes how a system evolves when it is not being measured, and the random, discontinuous, nonlinear rule 4b describes how a system evolves when it is measured.

But the standard formulation of quantum mechanics does not say what it takes for an interaction to count as a measurement. Without specifying this, the theory is at best incomplete since it does not indicate when each dynamical law obtains. Moreover, if one supposes that observers and their measuring devices are constructed from simpler systems that each obey the deterministic dynamics, as Everett did, then the composite systems, the observers and their measuring devices, must evolve in a continuous deterministic way, and nothing like the random, discontinuous evolution described by rule 4b can ever occur. That is, if observers and their measuring devices are understood as being constructed of simpler systems each behaving as quantum mechanics requires, each obeying rule 4a, then the standard formulation of quantum mechanics is logically inconsistent since it says that the two systems together must obey rule 4b. This is the quantum measurement problem in the context of the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. See the section on the measurement problem in the entry on philosophical issues in quantum theory.

The problem with the theory, Everett argued, was that it was logically inconsistent and hence untenable. In particular, one could not provide a consistent account of nested measurement in the theory. Everett illustrated the problem of the consistency of the standard collapse theory in the context of an “amusing, but extremely hypothetical drama” (1956, 74–8), a story that was a few years later famously retold by Eugene Wigner.

Everett’s version of the Wigner’s Friend story involved an observer \(A\) who knows the state function of some system \(S\), and knows that it is not an eigenstate of the measurement he is about to perform on it, and an observer \(B\) who is in possession of the state function of the composite system \(A{+}S\). Observer \(A\) believes that the outcome of his measurement on \(S\) will be randomly determined by the collapse rule 4b, hence \(A\) attributes to \(A{+}S\) a state describing \(A\) as having a determinate measurement result and \(S\) as having collapsed to the corresponding state. Observer \(B\), however, attributes the state function of the room after \(A\)’s measurement according to the deterministic rule 4a, hence \(B\) attributes to \(A{+}S\) an entangled state where, according to rule 3, neither \(A\) nor \(S\) even has a determinate quantum-mechanical state of its own. Everett argued that since \(A\) and \(B\) make incompatible state attributions to \(A{+}S\), the standard collapse theory yields a straightforward contradiction.

It would be extraordinarily difficult in practice for \(B\) to make a Wigner’s Friend interference measurement that would determine the state of a composite system like \(A{+}S\), hence the “extremely hypothetical” nature of the drama. Everett was careful, however, to explain why this was entirely irrelevant to the conceptual problem at hand. Indeed, he explicitly rejected that one might simply “deny the possibility that \(B\) could ever be in possession of the state function of \(A{+}S\).” Rather, he argued, that “no matter what the state of \(A{+}S\) is, there is in principle a complete set of commuting operators for which it is an eigenstate, so that, at least, the determination of these quantities will not affect the state nor in any way disrupt the operation of \(A\),” nor, he added, are there “fundamental restrictions in the usual theory about the knowability of any state functions.” And he concluded that “it is not particularly relevant whether or not \(B\) actually knows the precise state function of \(A{+}S\). If he merely believes that the system is described by a state function, which he does not presume to know, then the difficulty still exists. He must then believe that this state function changed deterministically, and hence that there was nothing probabilistic in \(A\)’s determination” (1956, 76). And, Everett argued, \(B\) is right in so believing.

That Everett took the Wigner’s Friend story, which involves an experiment that, on the basis of decoherence considerations, would be virtually impossible to perform, to pose the central conceptual problem for quantum mechanics is essential to understanding how he thought of the measurement problem and what it would take to solve it. In particular, Everett held that one only has a satisfactory solution to the quantum measurement problem if one can provide a consistent account of nested measurement. And concretely, this meant that one must be able to tell the Wigner’s Friend story consistently.

Being able to consistently tell the Wigner’s Friend story then was, for Everett, a necessary condition for any satisfactory resolution of the quantum measurement problem.

3. Everett’s Proposal

In order to solve the measurement problem Everett proposed dropping the collapse dynamics (rule 4b) from the standard collapse theory and taking the resulting physical theory to provide a complete and accurate description of all physical systems in the context of all possible physical interactions. Everett called the theory pure wave mechanics. He believed that he could deduce the standard statistical predictions of quantum mechanics (the predictions that depend on rule 4b in the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics) in terms of the subjective experiences of observers who are themselves treated as ordinary physical systems within pure wave mechanics.

Everett described the proposed deduction in the long thesis as follows:

We shall be able to introduce into [pure wave mechanics] systems which represent observers. Such systems can be conceived as automatically functioning machines (servomechanisms) possessing recording devices (memory) and which are capable of responding to their environment. The behavior of these observers shall always be treated within the framework of wave mechanics. Furthermore, we shall deduce the probabilistic assertions of Process 1 [rule 4b] as subjective appearances to such observers, thus placing the theory in correspondence with experience. We are then led to the novel situation in which the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic. While this point of view thus shall ultimately justify our use of the statistical assertions of the orthodox view, it enables us to do so in a logically consistent manner, allowing for the existence of other observers (1956, 77–8).

Everett’s goal, then, was to show that the memory records of an observer as described by quantum mechanics without the collapse dynamics would agree with those predicted by the standard formulation with the collapse dynamics. More specifically, he wanted to show that observers, modeled as servomechanisms within pure wave mechanics, would have fully determinate relative measurement records and the probabilistic assertions of the standard theory will correspond to statistical properties of typical sequences of such relative records.

In his version of the Wigner’s Friend story, Everett insisted on three things simultaneously: (1) there are no collapses of the quantum-mechanical state, hence \(B\) is correct in attributing to \(A{+}S\) a state where \(A\) is in an entangled superposition of having recorded mutually incompatible results, (2) there is a sense in which \(A\) nevertheless got a fully determinate measurement result, and (3) such determinate results satisfy the standard quantum statistics.

The main problem in understanding what Everett had in mind is in figuring out precisely how the correspondence between the predictions of the standard collapse theory and the pure wave mechanics was supposed to work. Part of the problem is that the former theory is stochastic with fundamentally chance events and the latter deterministic with no mention of probabilities whatsoever, but there is also a problem even accounting for determinate measurement records in pure wave mechanics. In order to see why, we will consider how Everett’s no-collapse proposal plays out in a simple interaction like \(A\)’s measurement in the Wigner’s Friend story.

Consider measuring the \(x\)-spin of a spin-½ system. Such a system will be found to be either “\(x\)-spin up” or “\(x\)-spin down”. Suppose that \(J\) is a good observer. For Everett, being a good \(x\)-spin observer meant that \(J\) has the following two dispositions (the arrows below represent the time-evolution of the composite system as described by the deterministic dynamics of rule 4a):

\[\begin{align} \tag{1} \ket{\ldquo\ready\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \up}_S &\rightarrow \ket{\ldquo\spin\ \up\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \up}_S \\ \tag{2} \ket{\ldquo\ready\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \down}_S &\rightarrow \ket{\ldquo\spin\ \down\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \down}_S \end{align}\]

If \(J\) measures a system that is determinately \(x\)-spin up, then \(J\) will determinately record “\(x\)-spin up”; and if \(J\) measures a system that is determinately \(x\)-spin down, then \(J\) will determinately record “\(x\)-spin down” (and we assume, for simplicity, that the spin of the object system \(S\) is undisturbed by the interaction).

Now consider what happens when \(J\) observes the \(x\)-spin of a system that begins in a superposition of \(x\)-spin eigenstates:

\[ a\ket{\xspin\ \up}_S + b\ket{\xspin\ \down}_S \]

The initial state of the composite system then is:

\[ \ket{\ldquo\ready\rdquo}_J (a\ket{\xspin\ \up}_S + b\ket{\xspin\ \down}_S) \]

Here \(J\) is determinately ready to make an \(x\)-spin measurement, but the object system\( S\), according to rule 3, has no determinate \(x\)-spin. Given \(J\)’s two dispositions and the fact that the deterministic dynamics is linear, the state of the composite system after \(J\)’s \(x\)-spin measurement will be:

\[ a\ket{\ldquo\spin\ \up\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \up}_S + b\ket{\ldquo\spin\ \down\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \down}_S \]

On the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics, somehow during the measurement interaction the state would collapse to either the first term of this expression (with probability equal to \(a\) squared) or to the second term of this expression (with probability equal to \(b\) squared). In the former case, \(J\) ends up with the determinate measurement record “spin up”, and in the later case \(J\) ends up with the determinate measurement record “spin down”. But on Everett’s proposal no collapse occurs. Rather, the post-measurement state is simply this entangled superposition of \(J\) recording the result “spin up” and \(S\) being \(x\)-spin up and \(J\) recording “spin down” and \(S\) being \(x\)-spin down. Call this state \(\boldsymbol{E}\).

On the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link (rule 3) \(\boldsymbol{E}\) is not a state where \(J\) determinately records “spin up”, neither is it a state where \(J\) determinately records “spin down”. So Everett’s interpretational problem is to explain the sense in which \(J\)’s entangled superposition of mutually incompatible records represents a determinate measurement outcome that agrees with the empirical prediction made by the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics when the standard theory predicts that \(J\) either ends up with the fully determinate measurement record “spin up” or the fully determinate record “spin down”, with probabilities equal to \(a\)-squared and \(b\)-squared respectively. More specifically, here the standard collapse theory predicts that on measurement the quantum-mechanical state of the composite system will collapse to precisely one of the following two states:

\[ \ket{\ldquo\spin\ \up\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \up}_S \text{ or } \ket{\ldquo\spin\ \down\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \down}_S \]

and that there is thus a single, simple matter of fact about which measurement result \(J\) recorded.

Everett, then, faced two closely related problems. The determinate-record problem requires him to explain how a measurement interaction like that just described might yield a determinate record in the context of pure wave mechanics. And the probability problem requires him to somehow recover the standard quantum statistics for such determinate records.

Everett took the key to the solution of both problems to be the principle of the fundamental relativity of states:

There does not, in general, exist anything like a single state for one subsystem of a composite system. Subsystems do not possess states that are independent of the states of the remainder of the system, so that the subsystem states are generally correlated with one another. One can arbitrarily choose a state for one subsystem, and be led to the relative state for the remainder. Thus we are faced with a fundamental relativity of states, which is implied by the formalism of composite systems. It is meaningless to ask the absolute state of a subsystem—one can only ask the state relative to a given state of the remainder of the subsystem. (1956, 103; 1957, 180)

One might understand Everett as adding the fundamental principle of relativity of states to pure wave mechanics to allow for a richer interpretation of states than that provided by just the eigenvalue-eigenstate link (rule 3). The resulting theory is the relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics. Central to this theory is the distinction between absolute and relative states. This distinction played an essential explanatory role for Everett.

While the absolute state \(\boldsymbol{E}\) is one where \(J\) has no determinate measurement record and \(S\) has no determinate \(x\)-spin, each of these systems also has relative states by dint of the correlation between \(J\) recording variable and \(S\)’s \(x\)-spin. In particular, in state \(\boldsymbol{E}, J\) recorded “\(x\)-spin up” relative to \(S\) being in the \(x\)-spin up state and that \(J\) recorded “\(x\)-spin down” relative to \(S\) being in the \(x\)-spin down state.

So while \(J\) has no absolute determinate record in state \(\boldsymbol{E}\), in each of these relative states, \(J\) has a determinate relative record. It is these relative records that Everett’s takes to solve the determinate record problem:

Let one regard an observer as a subsystem of the composite system: observer + object-system. It is then an inescapable consequence that after the interaction has taken place there will not, generally, exist a single observer state. There will, however, be a superposition of the composite system states, each element of which contains a definite observer state and a definite relative object-system state. Furthermore, as we shall see, each of these relative object system states will be, approximately, the eigenstates of the observation corresponding to the value obtained by the observer which is described by the same element of the superposition. Thus, each element of the resulting superposition describes an observer who perceived a definite and generally different result, and to whom it appears that the object-system state has been transformed into the corresponding eigenstate. (1956, 78).

Absolute states, then, provide absolute properties for complete composite systems by way of the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link, and relative states provide relative properties for subsystems of a composite system. And on Everett’s account of the empirical faithfulness of pure wave mechanics, he identifies an observer’s determinate measurement records with the modeled observer’s relative memory states.

In particular, it is that each relative memory state describes a relative observer with a determinate measurement result that explains determinate measurement records on Everett’s view. Why this was enough to fully explain our experience of determinate measurement records ultimately rests on his understanding what it means for a physical theory to be empirically faithful.

4. Empirical Faithfulness

While the physicist Bryce DeWitt would later argue for his own particular reconstruction of Everett’s theory (see below), when DeWitt first read Everett’s description of pure wave mechanics, he objected because its surplus structure made the theory too rich to represent the world we experience. In his 7 May 1957 letter to Everett’s adviser John Wheeler, DeWitt wrote

I do agree that the scheme which Everett sets up is beautifully consistent; that any single one of the [relative memory states of an observer] ... gives an excellent representation of a typical memory configuration, with no causal or logical contradictions, and with “built-in” statistical features. The whole state vector ... , however, is simply too rich in content, by vast orders of magnitude, to serve as a representation of the physical world. It contains all possible branches in it at the same time. In the real physical world we must be content with just one branch. Everett’s world and the real physical world are therefore not isomorphic. (Barrett and Byrne 2012, 246–7)

The thought was that the richness of pure wave mechanics indicated an empirical flaw in the theory because we do not notice other branches. As DeWitt put it:

The trajectory of the memory configuration of a real observer ... does not branch. I can testify to this from personal introspection, as can you. I simply do not branch. Barrett and Byrne (eds) (2012, 246)

Wheeler showed Everett the letter and told him to reply. In his 31 May 1957 letter to DeWitt, Everett began by summarizing his understanding of the proper cognitive status of physical theories.

First, I must say a few words to clarify my conception of the nature and purpose of physical theories in general. To me, any physical theory is a logical construct (model), consisting of symbols and rules for their manipulation, some of whose elements are associated with elements of the perceived world. If this association is an isomorphism (or at least a homomorphism) we can speak of the theory as correct, or as faithful. The fundamental requirements of any theory are logical consistency and correctness in this sense. Barrett and Byrne (eds) (2012, 253)

In the final long version of his thesis, Everett further explained in a footnote that “[t]he word homomorphism would be technically more correct, since there may not be a one-one correspondence between the model and the external world” (1956, 169). The map is a homomorphism because (1) there may be elements of the theory that do not directly correspond to experience and because (2) a particular theory may not seek to explain all of experience. It is case (1) that is particularly important here: Everett considered the surplus experiential structure represented in the various branches of the absolute state to be explanatorily harmless.

In his letter to DeWitt, Everett described how he understood the aim of physical inquiry: “There can be no question of which theory is ‘true’ or ‘real’ — the best that one can do is reject those theories which are not isomorphic to sense experience” (Barrett and Byrne 2012, 253). The task then was to find our experience in an appropriate way in the relative-state model of pure wave mechanics.

So, for Everett, a theory was empirically faithful and hence empirically acceptable if there was a homomorphism between its model and the world as experienced. What this amounted to here was that pure wave mechanics is empirically faithful if one can find observers’ experiences appropriately associated with modeled observers in the model of the theory. In short, Everett took pure wave mechanics to be empirically faithful because one could find quantum mechanical experience in the model as relative memory records associated with relative modeled observers.

While he left significant room in precisely how one might interpret the theory, the core of Everett’s interpretation involved four closely related arguments.

5. Four Arguments

Together the following four arguments indicate the sense in which Everett took pure wave mechanics to be empirically faithful and, hence, to recapture the empirical predictions of the standard collapse theory.

5.1 Experience is found in the relative memory records of observers

As suggested earlier, Everett held that one can find our actual experience in the model of pure wave mechanics as relative measurement records associated with modeled observers. In the state \(\boldsymbol{E}\), for example, since \(J\) has a different relative measurement record in each term of the superposition written in the determinate record basis and since these relative records span the space of quantum-mechanically possible outcomes of this measurement, regardless of what result the actual observer gets, we will be able to find his experience represented as a relative record of the modeled observer in the interaction as described by pure wave mechanics.

More generally, if one performs a sequence of measurements, it follows from the linearity of the dynamics and Everett’s model of an ideal observer that every quantum-mechanically possible sequence of determinate measurement results will be represented in the entangled post-measurement state as relative sequence of determinate measurement records. This is also true in the theory if one only relatively, rather than absolutely, makes the sequence of observations. In this precise sense, then, it is possible to find our experience as sequences of relative records in the model of pure wave mechanics.

Everett took such relative records to be sufficient to explain the subjective appearances of observers because in an ideal measurement, every relative state will be one where the observer in fact has, and, as we will see in the next section, would report that she has, a fully determinate, repeatable measurement record that agrees with the records of other ideal observers. As Everett put it, the system states observed by a relative observer are eigenstates of the observable being measured (1957, 188). For further details of Everett’s discussion of this point see (1956, 129–30), (1955, 67), (1956 121–3 and 130–3), and (1957, 186–8 and 194–5).

Note that Everett did not require a physically preferred basis to solve the determinate record problem to show that pure wave mechanics was empirically faithful. The principle of the fundamental relatively of states explicitly allows for arbitrarily specified decompositions of the absolute universal state into relative states. Given his understanding of empirical faithfulness, all Everett needed to explain a particular actual record was to show that is that there is some decomposition of the state that represents the modeled observer with the corresponding relative record. And he clearly has that in pure wave mechanics under relatively weak assumptions regarding the nature of the actual absolute quantum mechanical state.

5.2 Pure wave mechanics predicts that one would not ordinarily notice that there are alternative relative records

It was important to Everett to explain why one would not ordinarily notice the surplus structure of pure wave mechanics. In his reply to DeWitt, Everett claimed that pure wave mechanics “is in full accord with our experience (at least insofar as ordinary quantum mechanics is) ... just because it \(is\) possible to show that no observer would ever be aware of any ‘branching,’ which is alien to our experience as you point out” Barrett and Byrne (eds) (2012, 254).

There are two distinct arguments that Everett seems to have had in mind.

First, one would only notice macroscopic splitting if one had access to records of macroscopic splitting events, but records of such events will be rare precisely insofar as measurements that would show that there are branches where macroscopic measurement apparata have different macroscopic measurement records for the same measurement would require one to perform something akin to a Wigner’s Friend measurement on a macroscopic system, which, as Everett indicated in his characterization of his version of the Wigner Friend story as “extremely hypothetical,” would be extraordinarily difficult to do. The upshot is that, while not impossible, one should not typically expect to find reliable relative measurement records indicating that there are branches corresponding to alternative macroscopic measurement records.

Second, Everett repeatedly noted in his various deductions of subjective appearances that it follows directly from the dynamical laws of pure wave mechanics that it would seem to an ideal agent that he had fully determinate measurement results. Albert and Loewer presented a dispositional version of this line of argument in their presentation of the bare theory (a version of pure wave mechanics) as a way of understanding Everett’s formulation of quantum mechanics (Albert and Loewer 1988, and Albert 1992; see also the bare theory chapter of Barrett 1999).

The idea is that if there are no collapse of the quantum mechanical state an ideal modeled observer like \(J\) would have the sure-fire disposition falsely to report and hence to believe that he had a perfectly ordinary, fully sharp and determinate measurement record. The trick is to ask the observer not what result he got, but rather whether he got some specific determinate result. If the post-measurement state was:

\[ \ket{\ldquo\spin\ \up\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \up}_S \]

then \(J\) would report “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down”. And he would make precisely the same report if he ended up in the post-measurement state:

\[ \ket{\ldquo\spin\ \down\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \down}_S \]

So, by the linearity of the dynamics, \(J\) would falsely report “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down” when in the state \(\boldsymbol{E}\):

\[ a\ket{\ldquo\spin\ \up\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \up}_S + b\ket{\ldquo\spin\ \down\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \down}_S \]

Thus, insofar as his beliefs agree with his sure-fire dispositions to report that he got a fully determinate result, it would seem to \(J\) that he got a perfectly determinate ordinary measurement result even when he did not (that is, he did not determinately get “spin up” and did not determinately get “spin down”).

So, while which result \(J\) got in state \(\boldsymbol{E}\) is a relative fact, that it would seem to \(J\) that he got some determinate result is an absolute fact. (See the discussion below and Albert (1992) and Barrett (1999) for further details regarding such dispositional properties. See Everett (1956, 129–30), (1955, 67), (1956, 121–3 and 130–3), and (1957, 186–8 and 194–5) for parallel discussions in pure wave mechanics.)

5.3 The surplus structure of pure wave mechanics is in principle detectable and hence isn’t surplus structure at all

While sometimes extremely difficult to detect, Everett insisted that alternative relative states, even alternative relative macroscopic measurement records, were always in principle detectable. Hence they do not, as DeWitt worried, represent surplus structure at all. Indeed, since all branches, in any basis, are in principle detectable, all branches in any decomposition of the state of a composite system were operationally real on Everett’s view. As he put it in the long thesis:

It is ... improper to attribute any less validity or “reality” to any element of a superposition than any other element, due to [the] ever present possibility of obtaining interference effects between the elements, all elements of a superposition must be regarded as simultaneously existing (1956, 150).

While Everett understood decoherence considerations, he did not believe that they rendered the detection alternative measurement records impossible. Indeed, as indicated in his discussion of the Wigner’s Friend story above, Everett held that it was always in principle possible to measure an observable that would detect an alternative post-measurement branch, and it was this that he used to argue the other direction. It is precisely because the linear dynamics requires that all branches of the global wave function are at least in principle detectable that pure wave mechanics requires that all branches are equal real.

And, again, note that this does not mean that only branches in one physically preferred basis are real. Rather, it means that every branch in every decomposition of a composite system is real in Everett’s operational sense of ‘real’ since any such state might in principle entail observational consequences. That Everett considered alternative branches of the universal wave function to be in principle empirically detectable and hence operationally real represents a significant difference between his position and most subsequent many-worlds interpretations, where alternative worlds are typically assumed to be undetectable.

Because alternative branches are required by the linear dynamics and in principle detectable, they do not represent surplus structure on Everett’s view. In this sense, pure wave mechanics provides the simplest possible theory compatible with the operational consequences of the linear dynamics.

One upshot is that pure wave mechanics allows one to have a specific sort of inductive empirical evidence in favor of the theory. In particular, since real for Everett means has observable consequences, any experiment that illustrates quantum interference provides empirical evidence for the operational existence of alternative Everett branches on some decomposition of the state. Again, Everett was an operational realist concerning all branches in every basis insofar as they might be detected. Specifically, one provides increasingly compelling evidence in favor of pure wave mechanics correctly describing macroscopic measurement interactions the closer one gets to being able to perform something like a Wigner’s Friend interference experiment.

5.4 One should expect to find the standard quantum statistics in a typical relative sequence of measurement records

Everett did not solve the probability problem by finding probabilities in pure wave mechanics. Indeed, as suggested by his original thesis title, he repeatedly insisted that there were no probabilities and took this to be an essential feature of the theory. Rather, what it meant for pure wave mechanics to be empirically faithful with respect to the statistical predictions of quantum mechanics is that one can find the standard quantum statistics we experience in the distribution of a typical relative relative sequence of a modeled observer’s measurement records. In explaining this, Everett appealed to a measure of typicality given by the norm squared of the amplitude associated with each relative state in an orthogonal decomposition of the absolute state. See Barrett (2017) for a detailed discussion of the notion of typicality in Everett.

The thought then is that if an observer supposes that his relative measurement records will be faithfully represented by a typical relative sequence of measurements records, in Everett’s norm-squared measure of typicality, he will expect to observe the standard statistical predictions of quantum mechanics.

Everett got to the result in two steps. First, he found a well-behaved measure of typicality over relative states whose value is fully determined by the model of pure wave mechanics. Then he showed that, in the limit as the number of measurement interactions gets large, almost all relative sequences of measurement records, in the sense of almost all given by the specified measure, will exhibit the standard quantum statistics. Note that it is typically false that most relative sequences by count will exhibit the standard quantum statistics, and Everett knew this. This is why his explicit choice of how to understand typicality is essential to his account of the standard quantum statistics. (See Everett 1956, 120–30) and 1957, 186–94) for discussions of typicality and the quantum statistics.

note that if one assumes that one’s relative records are typical, in the precise sense that Everett specified, then they should be expected to exhibit the standard quantum statistics. Were such an assumption added to the theory, then one should expect to see the standard quantum statistics as determinate relative records. But note also that one cannot derive the standard quantum probabilities, or anything else about probabilities, without an auxiliary assumption that somehow ties Everett’s notion of typicality to one’s probabilistic expectations. Such an assumption would represent a significant addition to pure wave mechanics.

For his part, Everett did not try to deduce probabilities from pure wave mechanics. Rather, he simply argued that the sequence of results in a typical branch, in his specified sense of typical, should be expected to satisfy the standard quantum statistics. It was this this that Everett took to establish that his relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics was empirically faithful over the standard quantum statistics.

6. Faithfulness and the Problem of Empirical Adequacy

Pure wave mechanics, then, is empirically faithful since (1) one can find an observer’s determinate measurement records as the relative records of an idealized modeled observer in the theory and (2) the model of pure wave mechanics provides a typicality measure over relative states corresponding such that a typical relative sequence of measurement records in that measure will exhibit the standard quantum statistics. The first result is Everett’s resolution of the determinate record problem, and the second his resolution of the probability problem.

The upshot is that if one associates one’s experience with relative records and if one expects one’s relative sequence of records to be typical in the norm-squared-amplitude sense, then one should expect one’s experience to agree with the standard statistical predictions of quantum mechanics, wherever it makes coherent predictions. And where the standard collapse theory and the Copenhagen interpretation do not make coherent predictions, as in the Wigner’s Friend story, one should expect to see evidence that the linear dynamics always correctly describes the evolution of every physical system whatsoever. So while pure wave mechanics explains why one would not typically observe other branches, it also predicts that other branches are in principle observable, and hence do not represent surplus structure.

One might, of course, want more than empirical faithfulness from a satisfactory formulation of quantum mechanics. In keeping with his view that pure wave mechanics is quantum mechanics without probabilities, Everett simply conceded that every relative state under every decomposition of the absolute state in fact obtains. The resulting problem, one might feel, is that empirical faithfulness, in Everett’s sense at least, is a relatively weak form of empirical adequacy. This can be seen by considering how one should understand the very notion of having a differential expectations when every physically possible measurement result is in fact fully realized in the model of the theory.

For Everett to call his norm-squared-amplitude measure a measure of typicality might suggest that a sample relative state is somehow selected with respect to the measure. If that were the case, then it would be natural to expect, by stipulation as suggested earlier, one’s relative sequence of measurement records to be typical. But then it would also be natural to suppose that it would be probable that a relative sequence of measurements records exhibit the standard quantum statistics, and, for Everett, there were no probabilities in the theory. And indeed, there are no probabilities whatsoever in the statement of the theory, and hence no way to derive them without adding something to the theory.

But the problem here is more fundamental that that might suggest. Insofar as a probability is a measure over possibilities where precisely one is in fact realized and insofar as all possibilities are realized in pure wave mechanics, there simply can be no probabilities associated with alternative relative sequences of measurement records. Similarly, any understanding of typicality that somehow involves the selection of a typical relative sequence of records rather than an atypical sequence of records is incompatible with pure wave mechanics since the theory describes no such selection. Neither can the typicality measure represent an expectation of the standard quantum statistics obtaining for one’s actual relative sequence of measurement records at the exclusion of the rest since all such sequences are equally actual in Everett’s operationalist sense of actual. Insofar as the theory describes any possible result as occurring, it describes every possible result as occurring, so there is no particular sequence of measurement records that is realized satisfying, or failing to satisfy, one’s prior expectations.

That Everett’s notion of empirical faithfulness is a relatively weak version of empirical adequacy, then, is exhibited in what pure wave mechanics, being empirically faithful, does not explain. In particular, it does not explain what it is about the physical world that makes it appropriate to expect one’s relative sequence of records to be typical in the norm-squared-amplitude sense, or any other sense. In short, while one can get subjective expectations for future experience by stipulation, the theory itself does not describe a physical world where such expectations might be understood as expectations concerning what will in fact occur. One might take Everett’s typicality measure to determine the subjective degree to which I should expect a particular relative sequence of records being (relative) mine, but to get even this would require careful explanatory amendments to Everett’s presentation of the theory. One can get a concrete sense of what such a strategy would involve by contrasting pure wave mechanics with something like Bohmian mechanics the many-thread or many-maps formulations of quantum mechanics where one has a clear notion of subjective quantum probabilities (see below and Barrett 1999 and 2005 for discussions of this approach).

7. Many Worlds

While he was initially skeptical of Everett’s views, DeWitt became an ardent proponent of the many-worlds interpretation, a theory that DeWitt presented as the EWG interpretation of quantum mechanics after Everett, Wheeler, and DeWitt’s graduate student R. Neill Graham. In his description of the many-worlds interpretation DeWitt (1970) emphasized that its central feature was the metaphysical commitment to physically splitting worlds. DeWitt’s description subsequently became the most popular understanding of Everett’s theory. See Barrett (2011b) for further discussion of Everett’s attitude toward DeWitt and the many-worlds interpretation. See Lewis (2016) and Saunders, Barrett, Kent, and Wallace (eds) (2010) for discussions of recent formulations of the many-worlds interpretation.

DeWitt described the theory in the context of the Schrödinger’s cat thought experiment.

The animal [is] trapped in a room together with a Geiger counter and a hammer, which, upon discharge of the counter, smashes a flask of prussic acid. The counter contains a trace of radioactive material—just enough that in one hour there is a 50% chance one of the nuclei will decay and therefore an equal chance the cat will be poisoned. At the end of the hour the total wave function for the system will have a form in which the living cat and the dead cat are mixed in equal portions. Schroödinger felt that the wave mechanics that led to this paradox presented an unacceptable description of reality. However, Everett, Wheeler and Graham’s interpretation of quantum mechanics pictures the cats as inhabiting two simultaneous, noninteracting, but equally real worlds. (1970, 31)

DeWitt took this view to follow from “the mathematical formalism of quantum mechanics as it stands without adding anything to it.” More specifically, he claimed that EWG had proven a metatheorem that the mathematical formalism of pure wave mechanics interprets itself:

Without drawing on any external metaphysics or mathematics other than the standard rules of logic, EWG are able, from these postulates, to prove the following metatheorem: The mathematical formalism of the quantum theory is capable of yielding its own interpretation. (1970, 33)

He gave Everett credit for the metatheorem, Wheeler credit for encouraging Everett, and Graham credit for clarifying the metatheorem. DeWitt and Graham later described Everett’s formulation of quantum mechanics as follows:

[It] denies the existence of a separate classical realm and asserts that it makes sense to talk about a state vector for the whole universe. This state vector never collapses and hence reality as a whole is rigorously deterministic. This reality, which is described jointly by the dynamical variables and the state vector, is not the reality we customarily think of, but is a reality composed of many worlds. By virtue of the temporal development of the dynamical variables the state vector decomposes naturally into orthogonal vectors, reflecting a continual splitting of the universe into a multitude of mutually unobservable but equally real worlds, in each of which every good measurement has yielded a definite result and in most of which the familiar statistical quantum laws hold (1973, v).

For his part, DeWitt conceded that this constant splitting of worlds whenever the states of systems become correlated was counterintuitive:

I still recall vividly the shock I experienced on first encountering this multiworld concept. The idea of \(10^{100}\) slightly imperfect copies of oneself all constantly splitting into further copies, which ultimately become unrecognizable, is not easy to reconcile with common sense. Here is schizophrenia with a vengeance (1973, 161).

That said, he strongly promoted the theory at every turn, and Everett’s views quickly came to be identified with DeWitt and Graham’s many-worlds interpretation.

While Everett’s presentation of his theory was unclear at several points, DeWitt’s exegesis did little to help clarify pure wave mechanics. Since a number of these confusions persist in discussions of Everett, we will briefly consider DeWitt and Graham’s interpretation and compare it against Everett’s description of the relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics.

To begin, since purely mathematical postulates entail only purely mathematical theorems, one cannot deduce any metaphysical commitments whatsoever regarding the physical world from the mathematical formalism of pure wave mechanics alone. The formalism of pure wave mechanics might entail the sort of metaphysical commitments that DeWitt and others have envisioned only if supplemented with sufficiently strong metaphysical assumptions, strong enough to determine a metaphysical interpretation for the theory. Concerning the claim that pure wave mechanics interprets itself by way of a metatheorem that Everett proved, on even a broad understanding of what might count as such a metatheorem, there is nothing answering to DeWitt’s description in either the long or short versions of Everett’s thesis.

Second, contrary to what DeWitt, Graham, and others have supposed, Everett was not committed to causally isolated worlds. In contrast, as we have seen, Everett held that it is always in principle possible for branches to interact. More specifically, he argued that “no matter what the state of [Wigner’s Friend] is, there is in principle a complete set of commuting operators for which it is an eigenstate, so that, at least, the determination of these quantities will not affect the state nor in any way,” he denied that there are fundamental restrictions about the “knowability of any state functions,” and he believed that the sense in which all branches of the global state are equally actual is given by the ever-present possibility of interaction between branches. So while one clearly can describe situations where there is no post-measurement interference between the branches representing incompatible measurement records, one can also describe interactions where there is, and for Everett there was no special physical distinction to be made between the two cases.

Third, there was no consensus between Everett, Wheeler, DeWitt, and Graham concerning what Everett’s theory was. In particular, we know what Everett thought of Graham’s formulation of the theory. In his personal copy of DeWitt’s description of the many worlds interpretation, Everett wrote the word “bullshit” next to the passage where DeWitt presented Graham’s exegesis of Everett’s views (See Barrett and Byrne 2012, 364–6 for scans of Everett’s handwritten marginal notes).

Finally, as indicated in the discussion of empirical faithfulness above, Everett’s understanding of pure wave mechanics was decidedly non-metaphysical. In particular, He carefully avoided talk of multiple, splitting worlds, his understanding of the reality of branches was purely operational, and he explicitly denied that the aim of physics was to produce true theories. That the proper aim, rather, was to produce empirically faithful theories in the sense that he described, was an essential part of Everett’s argument for why his theory was not only acceptable but ought to be preferred to the other formulations of quantum mechanics that he knew (which explicitly included the standard collapse theory, the Copenhagen interpretation, and Bohmian mechanics; see Barrett and Byrne 2012, 152–5).

For Everett, the relative states of its subsystems provided a way to characterize branches of the absolute state of a composite system. Insofar as the principle of the fundamental relativity of states allows one to consider the quantum-mechanical state in any specified basis, there is no canonical way to individuate branches. This makes it natural perhaps to think of the existence of branches operationally, as Everett did. Rather than take the branches determined by a physically preferred basis or those determined by, or roughly determined by, some decoherence condition to determine which physically possible worlds were real, he took every branch in any basis to have observational consequences and hence to be real in his operational sense. Given how he understood branches and their role in determining the empirical faithfulness of the theory, Everett never had to say anything concerning how a particular physically preferred basis is selected because none was required.

While Everett himself did not do so, one might nevertheless designate a special set of branches of the global absolute state, say those that satisfy exhibit an appropriate sort of stable diachronic identity, to represent worlds, or emergent worlds, or approximate emergent worlds. But how one understands such physical entities cannot be determined solely by the mathematical formalism of pure wave mechanics.

This has led recent many-worlds proponents like David Wallace (2010 and 2012) to add explicit interpretative assumptions to the formalism of pure wave mechanics. In contrast with DeWitt, who seems to have taken worlds to be basic entities described by the global absolute state, Wallace takes the quantum state as basic, then seeks to characterize worlds as emergent entities represented in its structure. The analogy he gives is that pure wave mechanics describes the quantum state just as classical field theory describes physical fields (2010, 69). Worlds then are understood as physically real but contingently emergent entities that are identified with approximate substructures of the quantum state, or as Wallace puts it, “mutually dynamically isolated structures instantiated within the quantum state, which are structurally and dynamically ‘quasiclassical’” (2010, 70). Just a bit more carefully, one would expect such emergent worlds to be more or less isolated depending on the physical situation and properties one seeks to describe and the degree of decoherence in fact exhibited by the systems as characterized.

On this account, there is no simple matter of fact concerning what or even how many emergent worlds there are because such questions depend on one’s level of description and on how well-isolated one requires the worlds to be for the explanatory considerations at hand. But, however one individuates them, the emergent worlds correspond to approximately determinate decoherent substructures of the quantum state. Hence, only some relative states describe physically real worlds.

In contrast, as we have seen, when Everett claimed that all branches were equally real, he had something less metaphysical and more empirical in mind, which, in turn, suggests a quite different understanding of branches. In particular, since every branch in every decomposition of the state has potential empirical consequences for the results of one’s future observations, every branch, not just those represented in a favored decohering basis, is operationally real. In short, every relative state describes something that the linear dynamics requires one to take as real in the only sense that Everett understood.

There is certainly a place for a decoherence account of quasiclassicality akin to the sort that Wallace and others favor as an extension of Everett’s project insofar as it yields a yet richer sense in which one might find our experience in the model of pure wave mechanics. But, given how he understood his theory and what was required for it to be empirically acceptable, Everett’s explanatory goals were arguably more modest than those of many Everettians and hence more readily attained.

Consider probability again. If one were to take pure wave mechanics to be directly descriptive of the real physical world, one might feel that one should explain what it is about the world that makes it appropriate to expect one’s relative sequence of records to be typical in the norm-squared-amplitude sense when every physically possible outcome is in fact realized as a relative state. For his part, however, Everett believed that all that was required to explain the standard quantum statistics was that one be able to find them somehow associated in a precise and unambiguous way with the relative records of an ideal modeled observer. And he arguably did just this. That such an account does not, without additional assumptions, explain why one should expect one’s measurement records to exhibit the standard quantum statistics in a world directly described by pure wave mechanics is a weakness of the account, but, arguably, one that need not have worried Everett given the relatively modest explanatory aim of empirical faithfulness. (See the entry on the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics for further details regarding the approach.)

8. Other Interpretations of Everett

8.1 The Bare Theory

What Albert and Loewer have called the bare theory of quantum mechanics (Albert and Loewer, 1988, and Albert, 1992) is pure wave mechanics with the standard interpretation of states. On this reading of Everett, one supposes that he intended to drop the collapse dynamics from the standard theory and keep the standard eigenvalue-eigenstate link as the theory’s only interpretational principle. Here there is no special distinction between absolute and relative states nor does one require the addition of a special notion of typicality to the theory. Rather, one uses Everett’s model of an idealized observer to argue that it would appear to such observers that they had the perfectly determinate measurement outcomes predicted by the collapse dynamics when they in fact did not. This captures Everett’s thought of deducing the standard predictions of quantum mechanics as the subjective appearances of observers who are themselves treated within the theory.

We have already seen the basic argument here. Since \(J\) would report that he had a determinate result in post-measurement state

\[ \ket{\ldquo\spin\ \up\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \up}_S \]

and would report that he had a determinate result in post-measurement state

\[ \ket{\ldquo\spin\ \down\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \down}_S \]

\(J\) would, by the linearity of the dynamics, have the surefire disposition to falsely report that he had when in post measurement state

\[ a\ket{\ldquo\spin\ \up\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \up}_S + b\ket{\ldquo\spin\ \down\rdquo}_J \ket{\xspin\ \down}_S \]

More concretely, in the superposed state he would be in a superposition of reporting “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down” (relative to the first branch) and reporting “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down” (relative to the second branch), which sounds precisely like the absolute report “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down.”

Thus, if one assumes that the observer’s reports are in fact true of his experience, it would appear to \(J\) (as a simple, absolute fact) that he got a perfectly determinate ordinary measurement result even when he did not (that is, he did not determinately get “spin up” and did not determinately get “spin down”).

One can similarly argue from the linear dynamics and the properties of an ideal observer that if \(J\) repeats his spin measurement, he will end up with the sure-fire disposition to report that he got the same result for the second measurement as for the first (even when he did not in fact get an ordinary determinate result for either). Hence, it will appear to him that there has been a collapse of the quantum-mechanical state when there has been no collapse, splitting of worlds, or anything else that would produce an ordinary determinate measurement record. The subjective appearance of a collapse here is an illusion produced by the linear dynamics together with the observer’s dispositions.

The linear dynamics also entails a sort of inter-subjective agreement between different observers. If a second observer were to check \(J\)’s measurement result, the second observer would end up believing that her result agreed with his (even when neither observer in fact has an ordinary determinate measurement record). In this sense, there is subjective agreement on the apparent result of the apparent collapse.

Finally, one can show that an observer who repeats a measurement on an infinite sequence of systems in the same initial state will approach a state where he reports that his measurement results were randomly distributed with the standard quantum relative frequencies (when in fact he got no ordinary determinate results for any of his measurements). This is the feature of quantum mechanics without the collapse postulate that Everett himself found the most compelling. (See Albert (1992) and Barrett (1999) for further discussion of the suggestive properties of the bare theory. See Everett (1956, 129–30), (1955, 67), (1956, 121–3 and 130–3), and (1957, 186–8 and 194–5) for his discussions of these properties.)

While one can tell such stories about the sort of illusions that an observer would experience (each corresponding to specific argument that Everett himself gave in both his long and short theses), there are at least two serious problems with the bare theory. One is that the bare theory is not empirically coherent: if the theory were true, it would be impossible to ever have reliable empirical evidence for accepting it as true given the radical sort of illusions it predicts (See Barrett (1996) for a discussion of the idea of empirical coherence). Another is that if the bare theory were true, one would most likely fail to have any determinate beliefs at all since, on the linear dynamics, one would expect the global state to almost never be an eigenstate of any particular observer being sentient (or even existing). (For a further discussion of how experience is supposed to work in the bare theory and some the problems it encounters see Albert 1992; Bub, Clifton, and Monton, 1998; and Barrett, 1994, 1996 and 1999.)

8.2 Many Minds

Everett held that on his formulation of quantum mechanics “the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic” (1973, p. 9). Albert and Loewer (1988) capture this feature directly in their many-minds theory by distinguishing between an observer’s physical state, which evolves in a continuous, deterministic way, and the observer’s mental state, which evolves in a discontinuous, stochastic way.

A curious feature of this theory is that in order to get the observer’s mental state in some way to supervene on his physical state, Albert and Loewer associate with each observer a continuous infinity of minds. The observer’s physical state, like all other physical systems, always evolves in the usual deterministic way, but each mind jumps randomly to a mental state corresponding to one of the Everett branches that is produced in each measurement-like interaction. The probability that a particular mind will experience an Everett branch associated with a quantum-mechanical amplitude \(q\) is equal to \(q\) squared. On the mental dynamics, then, one should expect \(a\)-squared proportion of \(J\)’s minds to end up associated with the result “spin up” (the first term of the expression above) and \(b\)-squared proportion of \(J\)’s minds to end up associated with the result “spin down” (the second term of the expression above). The mental dynamics is also memory-preserving so that once a mind is associated with a particular branch, the mental state of the mind remains compatible with the measurement records represented in that branch.

An advantage of many-minds theory over DeWitt’s original version of the many-worlds theory is that there is no need for a physically preferred basis here. One must choose a preferred basis in order to specify the mental dynamics completely but this choice has nothing to do with any physical facts; rather, it can simply be thought of as part of the description of the relationship between physical and mental states. Another advantage of the many-minds theory is that, unlike the standard variety of many-worlds theories where worlds and observers split and are copied in measurement-like interactions, the many-minds theory simply predicts the standard forward-looking quantum probabilities for the future experiences of each particular mind. This, of course, requires one to understand the minds as having transtemporal identities, which Albert and Loewer clearly do as part of their unabashed commitment to a strong mind-body dualism. Finally, the many-minds theory is one of the few formulations of quantum mechanics that are manifestly compatible with special relativity. (For a discussion of why it is difficult to solve the quantum measurement problem under the constraints of relativity see Barrett 2000 and 2002, for discussions of locality in the many minds theory, see Hemmo and Pitowski 2003, and Bacciagaluppi 2002, and for the relationship between relativity and the many worlds theory see Bacciagaluppi 2002.)

The main problems with the many-minds theory concern its commitment to a strong mind-body dualism and the question of whether the sort of mental supervenience one gets is worth the trouble of postulating a continuous infinity of minds associated with each observer. Concerning the latter, one might well conclude that a single-mind theory, where each observer has precisely one mind that evolves randomly given the evolution of the standard quantum mechanical state and determines the observer’s experiences and beliefs, would be preferable. (See Albert, 1992 and Barrett, 1995 and 1999, for further discussions.)

Both the single-mind and many-minds theories can be thought of as hidden-variable theories like Bohmian mechanics. But instead of position being made determinate, as it is in Bohm’s theory, and then assuming that the determinate positions of particles will provide observers with determinate measurement records, it is the mental states of the observers that are directly made determinate here, and while this is a non-physical parameter, it is guaranteed to provide observers with determinate measurement records.

8.3 Many Threads

On the standard sort of many-worlds theory, worlds are taken to split over time as new branches are produced in measurement-like interactions. One problem with this is that the forward-looking probability of an observer getting each quantum-mechanically possible outcome for a measurement is simply one inasmuch as each possible measurement outcome is in fact recorded by some future copy of the observer one of the post-measurement branches. One way to get the right forward-looking probabilities, the standard probabilistic predictions of quantum mechanics, is to postulate worlds that never branch. Such worlds might be characterized by their complete histories. If one is in such a world, then one simply experiences its history.

The idea here is closely related to many-history tradition of interpreting Everett. Gell-Mann and Hartle (1990) characterized Everett’s theory as one that describes many, mutually decohering histories. On this sort of theory, one might think of each physically possible trajectory through the Everett branches as a thread that defines a world.

One can most clearly see how a many-threads theory provides forward-looking probabilities by considering how one might construct such a theory from Albert and Loewer’s many-minds theory. To this end, consider each full trajectory that a particular mind of an observer might take through the Everett branches. On the associated many-threads theory, there is precisely one world for each such full trajectory. What the mind would see is what in fact happens in this world. In this way, each of an observer’s minds determines a non-branching world. one then takes the quantum-mechanical amplitude associated with the threads to determine a probability over the set of worlds. This is represents the prior epistemic probability of each possible non-branching world being in fact ours. These probabilities are then updated as one learns more about the actual history of our world. Since such worlds and everything in them have perfectly ordinary transtemporal identities there is be no special problem here in talking about forward-looking probabilities. The forward-looking probability for a future event is just the epistemic probability that the event in fact occurs in the world we in fact inhabit.

There is a close relationship between a no-collapse hidden-variable theory like Bohmian mechanics and a non-branching many-worlds theory like the many-threads theory. In Bohmian mechanics the wave function always evolves in the usual deterministic way, but particles are taken to always have fully determinate positions. For an \(N\)-particle system, the particle configuration can be thought of as being pushed around in \(3N\)-dimensional configuration space by the flow of the norm squared of the wave function just as a massless particle would be pushed around by a compressible fluid (the compressible fluid here is the probability distribution in configuration space given by the standard wave function). Here both the evolution of the wave function and the evolution of the particle configuration are fully deterministic. Quantum probabilities are the result of the distribution postulate. The distribution postulate sets the initial prior probability distribution equal to the norm squared of the wave function for an initial time. One learns what the new effective wave function is from one’s measurement results, but one never knows more than what is allowed by the standard quantum statistics. Indeed, Bohm’s theory always predicts the standard quantum probabilities for particle configurations, but it predicts these as epistemic probabilities. Bohm’s theory is supposed to give determinate measurement results in terms of determinate particle configurations (say the position of the pointer on a measuring device). (See Barrett (1999) and the entry on Bohmian mechanics for more details.)

If one chooses position as the preferred physical observable and adopts the particle dynamics of Bohm’s theory, then one can construct a many-threads theory by fixing the initial wave function and the Hamiltonian and by considering every possible initial configuration of particles to correspond to a different full history for a possible world. Here the prior probabilities are given by the distribution postulate in Bohm’s theory, and these probabilities are Bayesian updated on the results of measurements. The updated epistemic probabilities yield the effective Bohmian wave function. So the only difference between Bohm’s theory and the associated many-threads theory is that the many-threads theory treats all possible Bohmian worlds as simultaneously existing worlds, only one of which is ours. A many-threads theory can be constructed for virtually any determinate physical quantity just as one would construct a hidden-variable or a modal theory. (See the entry on modal interpretations of quantum mechanics.)

The comparison with Bohmian mechanics makes clear the sense in which the single-mind theory, the many-minds theory, and the many-thread theory are hidden-variable theories. In each case, it is the determinate value of a “hidden” variable (i.e. a variable not determined by the standard quantum-mechanical state alone) that determines our measurement records, and it is the dynamics of this variable together with the prior probabilities that yields the standard quantum statistics. For his part, Everett explicitly considered such hidden-variable theories but held that his relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics did not need the addition of such a variable to explain the experience of the modeled observers. This is a good reason to take such theories are failing to capture Everett’s preferred formulation of quantum mechanics.

8.4 Relative Facts

An approach that is close in spirit to Everett’s relative-state interpretation of pure wave mechanics is to simply to deny that there are any salient absolute matters of fact about the properties of physical systems or the records, experiences, and beliefs of observers and insist that all physical facts relevant to explaining our experience are relative (see Saunders, 1995, 1997, and 1998, Conroy 2012, and relational quantum mechanics for examples of how this might work). In the experiment above, a relational formulation of quantum mechanics would not describe the observer \(J\) as believing that his result was “spin up” and it would not describe him as believing that his result was “spin down”. Rather, there would be no simple fact of the matter regarding what result \(J\) recorded. Here \(J\) recorded that his result was “spin up” relative to \(S\) being x-spin up and \(J\) recorded that his result was “spin down” relative to \(S\) being x-spin down. Similarly, the state of \(S\) is x-spin up relative to \(J\) believing that his result was “spin up”, etc. On this reading of Everett, physical facts are essentially relative, and there are, hence, typically no simple matters of fact about the properties of any individual physical system.

One way to understand this is to think of Everett branches as an indexical akin to time. Just as one might have different incompatible physical states obtain at different times, here one might have different, incompatible physical states obtain at the same time but at different branches. Rather than account for determinate measurement records at a time, one denies that there typically is any simple matter of fact concerning what an observer’s measurement record is at a time. Insofar as there is a matter of fact concerning the value of a measurement record, it is a fact at a time and at a branch. On this proposal, one might propose a different branch indexical for each complete basis one might specify. But the complete set of relative facts at a time, the set of relative facts that one gets by considering every possible branch indexical at a time, does not require one to specify a preferred basis for the theory.

Quantum probabilities here would not be descriptive of which Everett branch is actual, since they all are. Rather, quantum probabilities would presumably be descriptive of the structure of the branch indexical perhaps somewhat as temporal duration is descriptive of the time indexical. While it is unclear, at least on a standard account of rational choice, why an agent should care to have such probabilities inform her decisions, it is not impossible that one might formulate a compelling story, perhaps akin to how temporal facts may affect an agent’s preferences. (See relational quantum mechanics for a further discussion of such approaches.)

9. Summary

Everett took his version of the Wigner’s Friend story to reveal the inconsistency of the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics and the incompleteness of the Copenhagen interpretation. The problem was that neither could make sense of nested measurement. And since pure wave mechanics allowed one to provide a consistent account of nested measurement, he took it to immediately resolve the measurement problem. The task then was to explain the sense in which pure wave mechanics might be taken to be empirically faithful over determinate measurement records exhibiting the standard quantum-mechanical statistics.

Everett’s relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics has a number of salient virtues. It eliminates the collapse dynamics and hence immediately resolves the potential conflict between the two dynamical laws. It is consistent, applicable to all physical systems, and perhaps as simple as a formulation of quantum mechanics can be. And it is empirically faithful in that one can find an observer’s quantum experience as relative records in the model of pure wave mechanics and one can find a measure over relative sequences of records such that most such sequences exhibit the standard quantum statistics.

Insofar as Everett’s standard of empirical faithfulness just involved finding measurement records associated with a modeled observer in the theory that agree with one’s experience, it is a relatively weak variety of empirical adequacy. The relative weakness of this condition is illustrated by the fact that the way that one’s experience is found in the model of pure wave mechanics does not explain why one should expect to have that particular experience in a world described by the theory. Judging a theory to be empirically adequate when it tells us that there is a sense in which everything physically possible in fact happens clearly puts pressure on the very idea of empirical adequacy. But one might nevertheless argue that the empirical faithfulness of the relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics represent a nontrivial empirical virtue.

There remain a number of alternative reconstructions of Everett’s relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics. Insofar as one takes pure wave mechanics to provide a clear starting point for addressing the quantum measurement problem, one might find such alternatives naturally compelling.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with further suggestions.]


I would like to thank Peter Byrne for his very helpful suggestions on an earlier version of this article.

Copyright © 2018 by
Jeffrey Barrett <jabarret@uci.edu>

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