Word Meaning

First published Tue Jun 2, 2015; substantive revision Fri Aug 9, 2019

Word meaning has played a somewhat marginal role in early contemporary philosophy of language, which was primarily concerned with the structural features of sentence meaning and showed less interest in the nature of the word-level input to compositional processes. Nowadays, it is well-established that the study of word meaning is crucial to the inquiry into the fundamental properties of human language. This entry provides an overview of the way issues related to word meaning have been explored in analytic philosophy and a summary of relevant research on the subject in neighboring scientific domains. Though the main focus will be on philosophical problems, contributions from linguistics, psychology, neuroscience and artificial intelligence will also be considered, since research on word meaning is highly interdisciplinary.

1. Basics

The notions of word and word meaning are problematic to pin down, and this is reflected in the difficulties one encounters in defining the basic terminology of lexical semantics. In part, this depends on the fact that the term ‘word’ itself is highly polysemous (see, e.g., Matthews 1991; Booij 2007; Lieber 2010). For example, in ordinary parlance ‘word’ is ambiguous between a type-level reading (as in “Color and colour are spellings of the same word”), an occurrence-level reading (as in “there are thirteen words in the tongue-twister How much wood would a woodchuck chuck if a woodchuck could chuck wood?”), and a token-level reading (as in “John erased the last two words on the blackboard”). Before proceeding further, let us then elucidate the notion of word in more detail (Section 1.1), and lay out the key questions that will guide our discussion of word meaning in the rest of the entry (Section 1.2).

1.1 The Notion of Word

We can distinguish two fundamental approaches to the notion of word. On one side, we have linguistic approaches, which characterize the notion of word by reflecting on its explanatory role in linguistic research (for a survey on explanation in linguistics, see Egré 2015). These approaches often end up splitting the notion of word into a number of more fine-grained and theoretically manageable notions, but still tend to regard ‘word’ as a term that zeroes in on a scientifically respectable concept (e.g., Di Sciullo & Williams 1987). For example, words are the primary locus of stress and tone assignment, the basic domain of morphological conditions on affixation, clitization, compounding, and the theme of phonological and morphological processes of assimilation, vowel shift, metathesis, and reduplication (Bromberger 2011).

On the other side, we have metaphysical approaches, which attempt to pin down the notion of word by inquiring into the metaphysical nature of words. These approaches typically deal with such questions as “what are words?”, “how should words be individuated?”, and “on what conditions two utterances count as utterances of the same word?”. For example, Kaplan (1990, 2011) has proposed to replace the orthodox type-token account of the relation between words and word tokens with a “common currency” view on which words relate to their tokens as continuants relate to stages in four-dimensionalist metaphysics (see the entries on types and tokens and identity over time). Other contributions to this debate can be found, a.o., in McCulloch (1991), Cappelen (1999), Alward (2005), Hawthorne & Lepore (2011), Sainsbury & Tye (2012), Gasparri (2016), and Irmak (forthcoming).

For the purposes of this entry, we can rely on the following stipulation. Every natural language has a lexicon organized into lexical entries, which contain information about word types or lexemes. These are the smallest linguistic expressions that are conventionally associated with a non-compositional meaning and can be articulated in isolation to convey semantic content. Word types relate to word tokens and occurrences just like phonemes relate to phones in phonological theory. To understand the parallelism, think of the variations in the place of articulation of the phoneme /n/, which is pronounced as the voiced bilabial nasal [m] in “ten bags” and as the voiced velar nasal [ŋ] in “ten gates”. Just as phonemes are abstract representations of sets of phones (each defining one way the phoneme can be instantiated in speech), lexemes can be defined as abstract representations of sets of words (each defining one way the lexeme can be instantiated in sentences). Thus, ‘do’, ‘does’, ‘done’ and ‘doing’ are morphologically and graphically marked realizations of the same abstract word type do. To wrap everything into a single formula, we can say that the lexical entries listed in a lexicon set the parameters defining the instantiation potential of word types in sentences, utterances and inscriptions (cf. Murphy 2010). In what follows, unless otherwise indicated, our talk of “word meaning” should be understood as talk of “word type meaning” or “lexeme meaning”, in the sense we just illustrated.

1.2 Theories of Word Meaning

As with general theories of meaning (see the entry on theories of meaning), two kinds of theory of word meaning can be distinguished. The first kind, which we can label a semantic theory of word meaning, is a theory interested in clarifying what meaning-determining information is encoded by the words of a natural language. A framework establishing that the word ‘bachelor’ encodes the lexical concept adult unmarried male would be an example of a semantic theory of word meaning. The second kind, which we can label a foundational theory of word meaning, is a theory interested in elucidating the facts in virtue of which words come to have the semantic properties they have for their users. A framework investigating the dynamics of semantic change and social coordination in virtue of which the word ‘bachelor’ is assigned the function of expressing the lexical concept adult unmarried male would be an example of a foundational theory of word meaning. Likewise, it would be the job of a foundational theory of word meaning to determine whether words have the semantic properties they have in virtue of social conventions, or whether social conventions do not provide explanatory purchase on the facts that ground word meaning (see the entry on convention).

Obviously, the endorsement of a given semantic theory is bound to place important constraints on the claims one might propose about the foundational attributes of word meaning, and vice versa. Semantic and foundational concerns are often interdependent, and it is difficult to find theories of word meaning which are either purely semantic or purely foundational. According to Ludlow (2014), for example, the fact that word meaning is systematically underdetermined (a semantic matter) can be explained in part by looking at the processes of linguistic negotiation whereby discourse partners converge on the assignment of shared meanings to the words of their language (a foundational matter). However, semantic and foundational theories remain in principle different and designed to answer partly non-overlapping sets of questions.

Our focus in this entry will be on semantic theories of word meaning, i.e., on theories that try to provide an answer to such questions as “what is the nature of word meaning?”, “what do we know when we know the meaning of a word?”, and “what (kind of) information must a speaker associate to the words of a language in order to be a competent user of its lexicon?”. However, we will engage in foundational considerations whenever necessary to clarify how a given framework addresses issues in the domain of a semantic theory of word meaning.

2. Historical Background

The study of word meaning became a mature academic enterprise in the 19th century, with the birth of historical-philological semantics (Section 2.2). Yet, matters related to word meaning had been the subject of much debate in earlier times. We can distinguish three major classical approaches to word meaning: speculative etymology, rhetoric, and classical lexicography (Meier-Oeser 2011; Geeraerts 2013). We describe them briefly in Section 2.1.

2.1 Classical Traditions

The prototypical example of speculative etymology is perhaps the Cratylus (383a-d), where Plato presents his well-known naturalist thesis about word meaning. According to Plato, natural kind terms express the essence of the objects they denote and words are appropriate to their referents insofar as they implicitly describe the properties of their referents (see the entry on Plato’s Cratylus). For example, the Greek word ‘anthrôpos’ can be broken down into anathrôn ha opôpe, which translates as “one who reflects on what he has seen”: the word used to denote humans reflects their being the only animal species which possesses the combination of vision and intelligence. For speculative etymology, there is a natural or non-arbitrary relation between words and their meaning, and the task of the theorist is to make this relation explicit through an analysis of the descriptive, often phonoiconic mechanisms underlying the genesis of words. More on speculative etymology in Malkiel (1993), Fumaroli (1999), and Del Bello (2007).

The primary aim of the rhetorical tradition was the study of figures of speech. Some of these concern sentence-level variables such as the linear order of the words occurring in a sentence (e.g., parallelism, climax, anastrophe); others are lexical in nature and depend on using words in a way not intended by their normal or literal meaning (e.g., metaphor, metonymy, synecdoche). Although originated for stylistic and literary purposes, the identification of regular patterns in the figurative use of words initiated by the rhetorical tradition provided a first organized framework to investigate the semantic flexibility of words, and laid the groundwork for further inquiry into our ability to use lexical expressions beyond the boundaries of their literal meaning. More on the rhetorical tradition in Kennedy (1994), Herrick (2004), and Toye (2013).

Finally, classical lexicography and the practice of writing dictionaries played an important role in systematizing the descriptive data on which later inquiry would rely to illuminate the relationship between words and their meaning. Putnam’s (1970) claim that it was the phenomenon of writing (and needing) dictionaries that gave rise to the idea of a semantic theory is probably an overstatement. But the inception of lexicography certainly had an impact on the development of modern theories of word meaning. The practice of separating dictionary entries via lemmatization and defining them through a combination of semantically simpler elements provided a stylistic and methodological paradigm for much subsequent research on lexical phenomena, such as decompositional theories of word meaning. More on classical lexicography in Béjoint (2000), Jackson (2002), and Hanks (2013).

2.2 Historical-Philological Semantics

Historical-philological semantics incorporated elements from all the above classical traditions and dominated the linguistic scene roughly from 1870 to 1930, with the work of scholars such as Michel Bréal, Hermann Paul, and Arsène Darmesteter (Gordon 1982). In particular, it absorbed from speculative etymology an interest in the conceptual mechanisms underlying the formation of word meaning, it acquired from rhetorical analysis a taxonomic toolkit for the classification of lexical phenomena, and it assimilated from lexicography and textual philology the empirical basis of descriptive data that subsequent theories of word meaning would have to account for (Geeraerts 2013).

On the methodological side, the key features of the approach to word meaning introduced by historical-philological semantics can be summarized as follows. First, it had a diachronic and pragmatic orientation. That is, it was primarily concerned with the historical evolution of word meaning rather than with word meaning statically understood, and attributed great importance to the contextual flexibility of word meaning. Witness Paul’s (1920 [1880]) distinction between usuelle Bedeutung and okkasionelle Bedeutung, or Bréal’s (1924 [1897]) account of polysemy as a byproduct of semantic change. Second, it looked at word meaning primarily as a psychological phenomenon. It assumed that the semantic properties of words should be defined in mentalistic terms (i.e., words signify “concepts” or “ideas” in a broad sense), and that the dynamics of sense modulation, extension, and contraction that underlie lexical change correspond to broader patterns of conceptual activity in the human mind. Interestingly, while the classical rhetorical tradition had conceived of tropes as marginal linguistic phenomena whose investigation, albeit important, was primarily motivated by stylistic concerns, for historical-philological semantics the psychological mechanisms underlying the production and the comprehension of figures of speech were part of the ordinary life of languages, and engines of the evolution of all aspects of lexical systems (Nerlich 1992).

The contribution made by historical-philological semantics to the study of word meaning had a long-lasting influence. First, with its emphasis on the principles of semantic change, historical-philological semantics was the first systematic framework to focus on the dynamic nature of word meaning, and established contextual flexibility as the primary explanandum for a theory of word meaning (Nerlich & Clarke 1996, 2007). This feature of historical-philological semantics is a clear precursor of the emphasis placed on context-sensitivity by many subsequent approaches to word meaning, both in philosophy (see Section 3) and in linguistics (see Section 4). Second, the psychologistic approach to word meaning fostered by historical philological-semantics added to the agenda of linguistic research the question of how word meaning relates to cognition at large. If word meaning is essentially a psychological phenomenon, what psychological categories should be used to characterize it? What is the dividing line separating the aspects of our mental life that constitute knowledge of word meaning from those that do not? As we shall see, this question will constitute a central concern for cognitive theories of word meaning (see Section 5).

3. Philosophy of Language

In this section we shall review some semantic and metasemantic theories in analytic philosophy that bear on how lexical meaning should be conceived and described. We shall follow a roughly chronological order. Some of these theories, such as Carnap’s theory of meaning postulates and Putnam’s theory of stereotypes, have a strong focus on lexical meaning, whereas others, such as Montague semantics, regard it as a side issue. However, such negative views form an equally integral part of the philosophical debate on word meaning.

3.1 Early Contemporary Views

By taking the connection of thoughts and truth as the basic issue of semantics and regarding sentences as “the proper means of expression for a thought” (Frege 1979a [1897]), Frege paved the way for the 20th century priority of sentential meaning over lexical meaning: the semantic properties of subsentential expressions such as individual words were regarded as derivative, and identified with their contribution to sentential meaning. Sentential meaning was in turn identified with truth conditions, most explicitly in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus logico-philosophicus (1922). However, Frege never lost interest in the “building blocks of thoughts” (Frege 1979b [1914]), i.e., in the semantic properties of subsentential expressions. Indeed, his theory of sense and reference for names and predicates may be counted as the inaugural contribution to lexical semantics within the analytic tradition (see the entry on Gottlob Frege). It should be noted that Frege did not attribute semantic properties to lexical units as such, but to what he regarded as a sentence’s logical constituents: e.g., not to the word ‘dog’ but to the predicate ‘is a dog’. In later work this distinction was obliterated and Frege’s semantic notions came to be applied to lexical units.

Possibly because of lack of clarity affecting the notion of sense, and surely because of Russell’s (1905) authoritative criticism of Fregean semantics, word meaning disappeared from the philosophical scene during the 1920s and 1930s. In Wittgenstein’s Tractatus the “real” lexical units, i.e., the constituents of a completely analyzed sentence, are just names, whose semantic properties are exhausted by their reference. In Tarski’s (1933) work on formal languages, which was taken as definitional of the very field of semantics for some time, lexical units are semantically categorized into different classes (individual constants, predicative constants, functional constants) depending on the logical type of their reference, i.e., according to whether they designate individuals in a domain of interpretation, classes of individuals (or of n-tuples of individuals), or functions defined over the domain. However, Tarski made no attempt nor felt any need to represent semantic differences among expressions belonging to the same logical type (e.g., between one-place predicates such as ‘dog’ and ‘run’, or between two-place predicates such as ‘love’ and ‘left of’). See the entry on Alfred Tarski.

Quine (1943) and Church (1951) rehabilitated Frege’s distinction of sense and reference. Non-designating words such as ‘Pegasus’ cannot be meaningless: it is precisely the meaning of ‘Pegasus’ that allows speakers to establish that the word lacks reference. Moreover, as Frege (1892) had argued, true factual identities such as “Morning Star = Evening Star” do not state synonymies; if they did, any competent speaker of the language would be aware of their truth. Along these lines, Carnap (1947) proposed a new formulation of the sense/reference dichotomy, which was translated into the distinction between intension and extension. The notion of intension was intended to be an explicatum of Frege’s “obscure” notion of sense: two expressions have the same intension if and only if they have the same extension in every possible world or, in Carnap’s terminology, in every state description (i.e., in every maximal consistent set of atomic sentences and negations of atomic sentences). Thus, ‘round’ and ‘spherical’ have the same intension (i.e., they express the same function from possible worlds to extensions) because they apply to the same objects in every possible world. Carnap later suggested that intensions could be regarded as the content of lexical semantic competence: to know the meaning of a word is to know its intension, “the general conditions which an object must fulfill in order to be denoted by [that] word” (Carnap 1955). However, such general conditions were not spelled out by Carnap (1947). Consequently, his system did not account, any more than Tarski’s, for semantic differences and relations among words belonging to the same semantic category: there were possible worlds in which the same individual a could be both a married man and a bachelor, as no constraints were placed on either word’s intension. One consequence, as Quine (1951) pointed out, was that Carnap’s system, which was supposed to single out analytic truths as true in every possible world, “Bachelors are unmarried”—intuitively, a paradigmatic analytic truth—turned out to be synthetic rather than analytic.

To remedy what he agreed was an unsatisfactory feature of his system, Carnap (1952) introduced meaning postulates, i.e., stipulations on the relations among the extensions of lexical items. For example, the meaning postulate

  • (MP)\(\forall x (\mbox{bachelor}(x) \supset \mathord{\sim}\mbox{married} (x))\)

stipulates that any individual that is in the extension of ‘bachelor’ is not in the extension of ‘married’. Meaning postulates can be seen either as restrictions on possible worlds or as relativizing analyticity to possible worlds. On the former option we shall say that “If Paul is a bachelor then Paul is unmarried” holds in every admissible possible world, while on the latter we shall say that it holds in every possible world in which (MP) holds. Carnap regarded the two options as equivalent; nowadays, the former is usually preferred. Carnap (1952) also thought that meaning postulates expressed the semanticist’s “intentions” with respect to the meanings of the descriptive constants, which may or may not reflect linguistic usage; again, today postulates are usually understood as expressing semantic relations (synonymy, analytic entailment, etc.) among lexical items as currently used by competent speakers.

In the late 1960s and early 1970s, Montague (1974) and other philosophers and linguists (Kaplan, Kamp, Partee, and D. Lewis among others) set out to apply to the analysis of natural language the notions and techniques that had been introduced by Tarski and Carnap and further developed in Kripke’s possible worlds semantics (see the entry on Montague semantics). Montague semantics can be represented as aiming to capture the inferential structure of a natural language: every inference that a competent speaker would regard as valid should be derivable in the theory. Some such inferences depend for their validity on syntactic structure and on the logical properties of logical words, like the inference from “Every man is mortal and Socrates is a man” to “Socrates is mortal”. Other inferences depend on properties of non-logical words that are usually regarded as semantic, like the inference from “Kim is pregnant” to “Kim is not a man”. In Montague semantics, such inferences are taken care of by supplementing the theory with suitable Carnapian meaning postulates. Yet, some followers of Montague regarded such additions as spurious: the aims of semantics, they said, should be distinguished from those of lexicography. The description of the meaning of non-logical words requires considerable world knowledge: for example, the inference from “Kim is pregnant” to “Kim is not a man” is based on a “biological” rather than on a “logical” generalization. Hence, we should not expect a semantic theory to furnish an account of how any two expressions belonging to the same syntactic category differ in meaning (Thomason 1974). From such a viewpoint, Montague semantics would not differ significantly from Tarskian semantics in its account of lexical meaning. But not all later work within Montague’s program shared such a skepticism about representing aspects of lexical meaning within a semantic theory, using either componential analysis (Dowty 1979) or meaning postulates (Chierchia & McConnell-Ginet 2000).

For those who believe that meaning postulates can exhaust lexical meaning, the issue arises of how to choose them, i.e., of how—and whether—to delimit the set of meaning-relevant truths with respect to the set of all true statements in which a given word occurs. As we just saw, Carnap himself thought that the choice could only be the expression of the semanticist’s intentions. However, we seem to share intuitions of analyticity, i.e., we seem to regard some, but not all sentences of a natural language as true by virtue of the meaning of the occurring words. Such intuitions are taken to reflect objective semantic properties of the language, that the semanticist should describe rather than impose at will. Quine (1951) did not challenge the existence of such intuitions, but he argued that they could not be cashed out in the form of a scientifically respectable criterion separating analytic truths (“Bachelors are unmarried”) from synthetic truths (“Aldo’s uncle is a bachelor”), whose truth does not depend on meaning alone. Though Quine’s arguments were often criticized (for recent criticisms, see Williamson 2007), and in spite of Chomsky’s constant endorsement of analyticity (see e.g. 2000: 47, 61–2), within philosophy the analytic/synthetic distinction was never fully vindicated (for an exception, see Russell 2008). Hence, it was widely believed that lexical meaning could not be adequately described by meaning postulates. Fodor and Lepore (1992) argued that this left semantics with two options: lexical meanings were either atomic (i.e., they could not be specified by descriptions involving other meanings) or they were holistic, i.e., only the set of all true sentences of the language could count as fixing them.

Neither alternative looked promising. Holism incurred in objections connected with the acquisition and the understanding of language: how could individual words be acquired by children, if grasping their meaning involved, somehow, semantic competence on the whole language? And how could individual sentences be understood if the information required to understand them exceeded the capacity of human working memory? (For an influential criticism of several varieties of holism, see Dummett 1991; for a review, Pagin 2006). Atomism, in turn, ran against strong intuitions of (at least some) relations among words being part of a language’s semantics: it is because of what ‘bachelor’ means that it doesn’t make sense to suppose we could discover that some bachelors are married. Fodor (1998) countered this objection by reinterpreting allegedly semantic relations as metaphysically necessary connections among extensions of words. However, sentences that are usually regarded as analytic, such as “Bachelors are unmarried”, are not easily seen as just metaphysically necessary truths like “Water is H2O”. If water is H2O, then its metaphysical essence consists in being H2O (whether we know it or not); but there is no such thing as a metaphysical essence that all bachelors share—an essence that could be hidden to us, even though we use the word ‘bachelor’ competently. On the contrary, on acquiring the word ‘bachelor’ we acquire the belief that bachelors are unmarried (Quine 1986); by contrast, many speakers that have ‘water’ in their lexical repertoire do not know that water is H2O. The difficulties of atomism and holism opened the way to vindications of molecularism (e.g., Perry 1994; Marconi 1997), the view on which only some relations among words matter for acquisition and understanding (see the entry on meaning holism).

While mainstream formal semantics went with Carnap and Montague, supplementing the Tarskian apparatus with the possible worlds machinery and defining meanings as intensions, Davidson (1967, 1984) put forth an alternative suggestion. Tarski had shown how to provide a definition of the truth predicate for a (formal) language L: such a definition is materially adequate (i.e., it is a definition of truth, rather than of some other property of sentences of L) if and only if it entails every biconditional of the form

  • (T) S is true in L iff p,

where S is a sentence of L and p is its translation into the metalanguage of L in which the definition is formulated. Thus, Tarski’s account of truth presupposes that the semantics of both L and its metalanguage is fixed (otherwise it would be undetermined whether S translates into p). On Tarski’s view, each biconditional of form (T) counts as a “partial definition” of the truth predicate for sentences of L (see the entry on Tarski’s truth definitions). By contrast, Davidson suggested that if one took the notion of truth for granted, then T-biconditionals could be read as collectively constituting a theory of meaning for L, i.e., as stating truth conditions for the sentences of L. For example,

  • (W) “If the weather is bad then Sharon is sad” is true in English iff either the weather is not bad or Sharon is sad

states the truth conditions of the English sentence “If the weather is bad then Sharon is sad”. Of course, (W) is intelligible only if one understands the language in which it is phrased, including the predicate ‘true in English’. Davidson thought that the recursive machinery of Tarski’s definition of truth could be transferred to the suggested semantic reading, with extensions to take care of the forms of natural language composition that Tarski had neglected because they had no analogue in the formal languages he was dealing with. Unfortunately, few of such extensions were ever spelled out by Davidson or his followers. Moreover, it is difficult to see how, giving up possible worlds and intensions in favor of a purely extensional theory, the Davidsonian program could account for the semantics of propositional attitude ascriptions of the form “A believes (hopes, imagines, etc.) that p”.

Construed as theorems of a semantic theory, T-biconditionals were often accused of being uninformative (Putnam 1975; Dummett 1976): to understand them, one has to already possess the information they are supposed to provide. This is particularly striking in the case of lexical axioms such as the following:

  • (V1) Val(x, ‘man’) iff x is a man;
  • (V2) Val(\(\langle x,y\rangle\), ‘knows’) iff x knows y.

(To be read, respectively, as “the predicate ‘man’ applies to x if and only if x is a man” and “the predicate ‘know’ applies to the pair \(\langle x, y\rangle\) if and only if x knows y”). Here it is apparent that in order to understand (V1) one must know what ‘man’ means, which is just the information that (V1) is supposed to convey (as the theory, being purely extensional, identifies meaning with reference). Some Davidsonians, though admitting that statements such as (V1) and (V2) are in a sense “uninformative”, insist that what (V1) and (V2) state is no less “substantive” (Larson & Segal 1995). To prove their point, they appeal to non-homophonic versions of lexical axioms, i.e., to the axioms of a semantic theory for a language that does not coincide with the (meta)language in which the theory itself is phrased. Such would be, e.g.,

  • (V3) Val(x, ‘man’) si et seulement si x est un homme.

(V3), they argue, is clearly substantive, yet what it says is exactly what (V1) says, namely, that the word ‘man’ applies to a certain category of objects. Therefore, if (V3) is substantive, so is (V1). But this is beside the point. The issue is not whether (V1) expresses a proposition; it clearly does, and it is, in this sense, “substantive”. But what is relevant here is informative power: to one who understands the metalanguage of (V3), i.e., French, (V3) may communicate new information, whereas there is no circumstance in which (V1) would communicate new information to one who understands English.

3.2 Grounding and Lexical Competence

In the mid-1970s, Dummett raised the issue of the proper place of lexical meaning in a semantic theory. If the job of a theory of meaning is to make the content of semantic competence explicit—so that one could acquire semantic competence in a language L by learning an adequate theory of meaning for L—then the theory ought to reflect a competent speaker’s knowledge of circumstances in which she would assert a sentence of L, such as “The horse is in the barn”, as distinct from circumstances in which she would assert “The cat is on the mat”. This, in turn, appears to require that the theory yields explicit information about the use of ‘horse’, ‘barn’, etc., or, in other words, that it includes information which goes beyond the logical type of lexical units. Dummett identified such information with a word’s Fregean sense. However, he did not specify the format in which word senses should be expressed in a semantic theory, except for words that could be defined (e.g., ‘aunt’ = “sister of a parent”): in such cases, the definiens specifies what a speaker must understand in order to understand the word (Dummett 1991). But of course, not all words are of this kind. For other words, the theory should specify what it is for a speaker to know them, though we are not told how exactly this should be done. Similarly, Grandy (1974) pointed out that by identifying the meaning of a word such as ‘wise’ as a function from possible worlds to the sets of wise people in those worlds, Montague semantics only specifies a formal structure and eludes the question of whether there is some possible description for the functions which are claimed to be the meanings of words. Lacking such descriptions, possible worlds semantics is not really a theory of meaning but a theory of logical form or logical validity. Again, aside from suggesting that “one would like the functions to be given in terms of computation procedures, in some sense”, Grandy had little to say about the form of lexical descriptions.

In a similar vein, Partee (1981) argued that Montague semantics, like every compositional or structural semantics, does not uniquely fix the intensional interpretation of words. The addition of meaning postulates does rule out some interpretations (e.g., interpretations on which the extension of ‘bachelor’ and the extension of ‘married’ may intersect in some possible world). However, it does not reduce them to the unique, “intended” or, in Montague’s words, “actual” interpretation (Montague 1974). Hence, standard model-theoretic semantics does not capture the whole content of a speaker’s semantic competence, but only its structural aspects. Fixing “the actual interpretation function” requires more than language-to-language connections as encoded by, e.g., meaning postulates: it requires some “language-to-world grounding”. Arguments to the same effect were developed by Bonomi (1983) and Harnad (1990). In particular, Harnad had in mind the simulation of human semantic competence in artificial systems: he suggested that symbol grounding could be implemented, in part, by “feature detectors” picking out “invariant features of objects and event categories from their sensory projections” (for recent developments see, e.g., Steels & Hild 2012). Such a cognitively oriented conception of grounding differs from Partee’s Putnam-inspired view, on which the semantic grounding of lexical items depends on the speakers’ objective interactions with the external world in addition to their narrow psychological properties.

A resolutely cognitive approach characterizes Marconi’s (1997) account of lexical semantic competence. In his view, lexical competence has two aspects: an inferential aspect, underlying performances such as semantically based inference and the command of synonymy, hyponymy and other semantic relations; and a referential aspect, which is in charge of performances such as naming (e.g., calling a horse ‘horse’) and application (e.g., answering the question “Are there any spoons in the drawer?”). Language users typically possess both aspects of lexical competence, though in different degrees for different words: a zoologist’s inferential competence on ‘manatee’ is usually richer than a layman’s, though a layman who spent her life among manatees may be more competent, referentially, than a “bookish” scientist. However, the two aspects are independent of each another, and neuropsychological evidence appears to show that they can be dissociated: there are patients whose referential competence is impaired or lost while their inferential competence is intact, and vice versa (see Section 5.3). Being a theory of individual competence, Marconi’s account does not deal directly with lexical meanings in a public language: communication depends both on the uniformity of cognitive interactions with the external world and on communal norms concerning the use of language, together with speakers’ deferential attitude toward semantic authorities.

3.3 The Externalist Turn

Since the early 1970s, views on lexical meaning were revolutionized by semantic externalism. Initially, externalism was limited to proper names and natural kind words such as ‘gold’ or ‘lemon’. In slightly different ways, both Kripke (1972) and Putnam (1970, 1975) argued that the reference of such words was not determined by any description that a competent speaker associated with the word; more generally, and contrary to what Frege may have thought, it was not determined by any cognitive content associated with it in a speaker’s mind (for arguments to that effect, see the entry on names). Instead, reference is determined, at least in part, by objective (“causal”) relations between a speaker and the external world. For example, a speaker refers to Aristotle when she utters the sentence “Aristotle was a great warrior”—so that her assertion expresses a false proposition about Aristotle, not a true proposition about some great warrior she may “have in mind”—thanks to her connection with Aristotle himself. In this case, the connection is constituted by a historical chain of speakers going back to the initial users of the name ‘Aristotle’, or its Greek equivalent, in baptism-like circumstances. To belong to the chain, speakers (including present-day speakers) are not required to possess any precise knowledge of Aristotle’s life and deeds; they are, however, required to intend to use the name as it is used by the speakers they are picking up the name from, i.e., to refer to the individual those speakers intend to refer to.

In the case of most natural kind names, it may be argued, baptisms are hard to identify or even conjecture. In Putnam’s view, for such words reference is determined by speakers’ causal interaction with portions of matter or biological individuals in their environment: ‘water’, for example, refers to this liquid stuff, stuff that is normally found in our rivers, lakes, etc. The indexical component (this liquid, our rivers) is crucial to reference determination: it wouldn’t do to identify the referent of ‘water’ by way of some description (“liquid, transparent, quenches thirst, boils at 100°C, etc.”), for something might fit the description yet fail to be water, as in Putnam’s (1973, 1975) famous Twin Earth thought experiment (see the entry on reference). It might be remarked that, thanks to modern chemistry, we now possess a description that is sure to apply to water and only to water: “being H2O” (Millikan 2005). However, even if our chemistry were badly mistaken (as in principle it could turn out to be) and water were not, in fact, H2O, ‘water’ would still refer to whatever has the same nature as this liquid. Something belongs to the extension of ‘water’ if and only if it is the same substance as this liquid, which we identify—correctly, as we believe—as being H2O.

Let it be noted that in Putnam’s original proposal, reference determination is utterly independent of speakers’ cognition: ‘water’ on Twin Earth refers to XYZ (not to H2O) even though the difference between the two substances is cognitively inert, so that before chemistry was created nobody on either Earth or Twin Earth could have told them apart. However, the label ‘externalism’ has been occasionally used for weaker views: a semantic account may be regarded as externalist if it takes semantic content to depend in one way or another on relations a computational system bears to things outside itself (Rey 2005; Borg 2012), irrespective of whether such relations affect the system’s cognitive state. Weak externalism is hard to distinguish from forms of internalism on which a word’s reference is determined by information stored in a speaker’s cognitive system—information of which the speaker may or may not be aware (Evans 1982). Be that as it may, in what follows ‘externalism’ will be used to mean strong, or Putnamian, externalism.

Does externalism apply to other lexical categories besides proper names and natural kind words? Putnam (1975) extended it to artifactual words, claiming that ‘pencil’ would refer to pencils—those objects—even if they turned out not to fit the description by which we normally identify them (e.g., if they were discovered to be organisms, not artifacts). Schwartz (1978, 1980) pointed out, among many objections, that even in such a case we could make objects fitting the original description; we would then regard the pencil-like organisms as impostors, not as “genuine” pencils. Others sided with Putnam and the externalist account: for example, Kornblith (1980) pointed out that artifactual kinds from an ancient civilization could be re-baptized in total ignorance of their function. The new artifactual word would then refer to the kind those objects belong to independently of any beliefs about them, true or false. Against such externalist accounts, Thomasson (2007) argued that artifactual terms cannot refer to artifactual kinds independently of all beliefs and concepts about the nature of the kind, for the concept of the kind’s creator(s) is constitutive of the nature of the kind. Whether artifactual words are liable to an externalist account is still an open issue (for recent discussions see Marconi 2013; Bahr, Carrara & Jansen 2019; see also the entry on artifacts), as is, more generally, the scope of application of externalist semantics.

There is another form of externalism that does apply to all or most words of a language: social externalism (Burge 1979), the view on which the meaning of a word as used by an individual speaker depends on the semantic standards of the linguistic community the speaker belongs to. In our community the word ‘arthritis’ refers to arthritis—an affliction of the joints—even when used by a speaker who believes that it can afflict the muscles as well and uses the word accordingly. If the community the speaker belongs to applied ‘arthritis’ to rheumatoids ailments in general, whether or not they afflict the joints, the same word form would not mean arthritis and would not refer to arthritis. Hence, a speaker’s mental contents, such as the meanings associated with the words she uses, depend on something external to her, namely the uses and the standards of use of the linguistic community she belongs to. Thus, social externalism eliminates the notion of idiolect: words only have the meanings conferred upon them by the linguistic community (“public” meanings); discounting radical incompetence, there is no such thing as individual semantic deviance, there are only false beliefs (for criticisms, see Bilgrami 1992, Marconi 1997; see also the entry on idiolects).

Though both forms of externalism focus on reference, neither is a complete reduction of lexical meaning to reference. Both Putnam and Burge make it a necessary condition of semantic competence on a word that a speaker commands information that other semantic views would regard as part of the word’s sense. For example, if a speaker believes that manatees are a kind of household appliance, she would not count as competent on the word ‘manatee’, nor would she refer to manatees by using it (Putnam 1975; Burge 1993). Beyond that, it is not easy for externalists to provide a satisfactory account of lexical semantic competence, as they are committed to regarding speakers’ beliefs and abilities (e.g., recognitional abilities) as essentially irrelevant to reference determination, hence to meaning. Two main solutions have been proposed. Putnam (1970, 1975) suggested that a speaker’s semantic competence consists in her knowledge of stereotypes associated with words. A stereotype is an oversimplified theory of a word’s extension: the stereotype associated with ‘tiger’ describes tigers as cat-like, striped, carnivorous, fierce, living in the jungle, etc. Stereotypes are not meanings, as they do not determine reference in the right way: there are albino tigers and tigers that live in zoos. What the ‘tiger’-stereotype describes is (what the community takes to be) the typical tiger. Knowledge of stereotypes is necessary to be regarded as a competent speaker, and—one surmises—it can also be considered sufficient for the purposes of ordinary communication. Thus, Putnam’s account does provide some content for semantic competence, though it dissociates it from knowledge of meaning.

On an alternative view (Devitt 1983), competence on ‘tiger’ does not consist in entertaining propositional beliefs such as “tigers are striped”, but rather in being appropriately linked to a network of causal chains for ‘tiger’ involving other people’s abilities, groundings, and reference borrowings. In order to understand the English word ‘tiger’ and use it in a competent fashion, a subject must be able to combine ‘tiger’ appropriately with other words to form sentences, to have thoughts which those sentences express, and to ground these thoughts in tigers. Devitt’s account appears to make some room for a speaker’s ability to, e.g., recognize a tiger when she sees one; however, the respective weights of individual abilities (and beliefs) and objective grounding are not clearly specified. Suppose a speaker A belongs to a community C that is familiar with tigers; unfortunately, A has no knowledge of the typical appearance of a tiger and is unable to tell a tiger from a leopard. Should A be regarded as a competent user ‘tiger’ on account of her being “part of C” and therefore linked to a network of causal chains for ‘tiger’?

3.4 Internalism

Some philosophers (e.g., Loar 1981; McGinn 1982; Block 1986) objected to the reduction of lexical meaning to reference, or to non-psychological factors that are alleged to determine reference. In their view, there are two aspects of meaning (more generally, of content): the narrow aspect, that captures the intuition that ‘water’ has the same meaning in both Earthian and Twin-Earthian English, and the wide aspect, that captures the externalist intuition that ‘water’ picks out different substances in the two worlds. The wide notion is required to account for the difference in reference between English and Twin-English ‘water’; the narrow notion is needed, first and foremost, to account for the relation between a subject’s beliefs and her behavior. The idea is that how an object of reference is described (not just which object one refers to) can make a difference in determining behavior. Oedipus married Jocasta because he thought he was marrying the queen of Thebes, not his mother, though as a matter of fact Jocasta was his mother. This applies to words of all categories: someone may believe that water quenches thirst without believing that H2O does; Lois Lane believed that Superman was a superhero but she definitely did not believe the same of her colleague Clark Kent, so she behaved one way to the man she identified as Superman and another way to the man she identified as Clark Kent (though they were the same man). Theorists that countenance these two components of meaning and content usually identify the narrow aspect with the inferential or conceptual role of an expression e, i.e., with the aspect of e that contributes to determine the inferential relations between sentences containing an occurrence of e and other sentences. Crucially, the two aspects are independent: neither determines the other. The stress on the independence of the two factors also characterizes more recent versions of so-called “dual aspect” theories, such as Chalmers (1996, 2002).

While dual theorists agree with Putnam’s claim that some aspects of meaning are not “in the head”, others have opted for plain internalism. For example, Segal (2000) rejected the intuitions that are usually associated with the Twin-Earth cases by arguing that meaning (and content in general) “locally supervenes” on a subject’s intrinsic physical properties. But the most influential critic of externalism has undoubtedly been Chomsky (2000). First, he argued that much of the alleged support for externalism comes in fact from “intuitions” about words’ reference in this or that circumstance. But ‘reference’ (and the verb ‘refer’ as used by philosophers) is a technical term, not an ordinary word, hence we have no more intuitions about reference than we have about tensors or c-command. Second, if we look at how words such as ‘water’ are applied in ordinary circumstances, we find that speakers may call ‘water’ liquids that contain a smaller proportion of H2O than other liquids they do not call ‘water’ (e.g., tea): our use of ‘water’ does not appear to be governed by hypotheses about microstructure. According to Chomsky, it may well be that progress in the scientific study of the language faculty will allow us to understand in what respects one’s picture of the world is framed in terms of things selected and individuated by properties of the lexicon, or involves entities and relationships describable by the resources of the language faculty. Some semantic properties do appear to be integrated with other aspects of language. However, so-called “natural kind words” (which in fact have little to do with kinds in nature, Chomsky claims) may do little more than indicating “positions in belief systems”: studying them may be of some interest for “ethnoscience”, surely not for a science of language. Along similar lines, others have maintained that the genuine semantic properties of linguistic expressions should be regarded as part of syntax, and that they constrain but do not determine truth conditions (e.g., Pietroski 2005, 2010). Hence, the connection between meaning and truth conditions (and reference) may be significantly looser than assumed by many philosophers.

3.5 Contextualism, Minimalism, and the Lexicon

“Ordinary language” philosophers of the 1950s and 1960s regarded work in formal semantics as essentially irrelevant to issues of meaning in natural language. Following Austin and the later Wittgenstein, they identified meaning with use and were prone to consider the different patterns of use of individual expressions as originating different meanings of the word. Grice (1975) argued that such a proliferation of meanings could be avoided by distinguishing between what is asserted by a sentence (to be identified with its truth conditions) and what is communicated by it in a given context (or in every “normal” context). For example, consider the following exchange:

  • A: Will Kim be hungry at 11am?
  • B: Kim had breakfast.

Although B does not literally assert that Kim had breakfast on that particular day (see, however, Partee 1973), she does communicate as much. More precisely, A could infer the communicated content by noticing that the asserted sentence, taken literally (“Kim had breakfast at least once in her life”), would be less informative than required in the context: thus, it would violate one or more principles of conversation (“maxims”) whereas there is no reason to suppose that the speaker intended to opt out of conversational cooperation (see the entries on Paul Grice and pragmatics). If the interlocutor assumes that the speaker intended him to infer the communicated content—i.e., that Kim had breakfast that morning, so presumably she would not be hungry at 11—cooperation is preserved. Such non-asserted content, called ‘implicature’, need not be an addition to the overtly asserted content: e.g., in irony asserted content is negated rather than expanded by the implicature (think of a speaker uttering “Paul is a fine friend” to implicate that Paul has wickedly betrayed her).

Grice’s theory of conversation and implicatures was interpreted by many (including Grice himself) as a convincing way of accounting for the variety of contextually specific communicative contents while preserving the uniqueness of a sentence’s “literal” meaning, which was identified with truth conditions and regarded as determined by syntax and the conventional meanings of the occurring words, as in formal semantics. The only semantic role context was allowed to play was in determining the content of indexical words (such as ‘I’, ‘now’, ‘here’, etc.) and the effect of context-sensitive structures (such as tense) on a sentence’s truth conditions. However, in about the same years Travis (1975) and Searle (1979, 1980) pointed out that the semantic relevance of context might be much more pervasive, if not universal: intuitively, the same sentence type could have very different truth conditions in different contexts, though no indexical expression or structure appeared to be involved. Take the sentence “There is milk in the fridge”: in the context of morning breakfast it will be considered true if there is a carton of milk in the fridge and false if there is a patch of milk on a tray in the fridge, whereas in the context of cleaning up the kitchen truth conditions are reversed. Examples can be multiplied indefinitely, as indefinitely many factors can turn out to be relevant to the truth or falsity of a sentence as uttered in a particular context. Such variety cannot be plausibly reduced to traditional polysemy such as the polysemy of ‘property’ (meaning quality or real estate), nor can it be described in terms of Gricean implicatures: implicatures are supposed not to affect a sentence’s truth conditions, whereas here it is precisely the sentence’s truth conditions that are seen as varying with context.

The traditionalist could object by challenging the contextualist’s intuitions about truth conditions. “There is milk in the fridge”, she could argue, is true if and only if there is a certain amount (a few molecules will do) of a certain organic substance in the relevant fridge (for versions of this objection, Cappelen & Lepore 2005). So the sentence is true both in the carton case and in the patch case; it would be false only if the fridge did not contain any amount of any kind of milk (whether cow milk or goat milk or elephant milk). The contextualist’s reply is that, in fact, neither the speaker nor the interpreter is aware of such alleged literal content (the point is challenged by Fodor 1983, Carston 2002); but “what is said” must be intuitively accessible to the conversational participants (Availability Principle, Recanati 1989). If truth conditions are associated with what is said—as the traditionalist would agree they are—then in many cases a sentence’s literal content, if there is such a thing, does not determine a complete, evaluable proposition. For a genuine proposition to arise, a sentence type’s literal content (as determined by syntax and conventional word meaning) must be enriched or otherwise modified by primary pragmatic processes based on the speakers’ background knowledge relative to each particular context of use of the sentence. Such processes differ from Gricean implicature-generating processes in that they come into play at the sub-propositional level; moreover, they are not limited to saturation of indexicals but may include the replacement of a constituent with another. These tenets define contextualism (Recanati 1993; Bezuidenhout 2002; Carston 2002; relevance theory (Sperber & Wilson 1986) is in some respects a precursor of such views). Contextualists take different stands on nature of the semantic contribution made by words to sentences, though they typically agree that it is insufficient to fix truth conditions (Stojanovic 2008). See Del Pinal (2018) for an argument that radical contextualism (in particular, truth-conditional pragmatics) should instead commit to rich lexical items which, in certain conditions, do suffice to fix truth conditions.

Even if sentence types have no definite truth conditions, it does not follow that lexical types do not make definite or predictable contributions to the truth conditions of sentences (think of indexical words). It does follow, however, that conventional word meanings are not the final constituents of complete propositions (see Allot & Textor 2012). Does this imply that there are no such things as lexical meanings understood as features of a language? If so, how should we account for word acquisition and lexical competence in general? Recanati (2004) does not think that contextualism as such is committed to meaning eliminativism, the view on which words as types have no meaning; nevertheless, he regards it as defensible. Words could be said to have, rather than “meaning”, a semantic potential, defined as the collection of past uses of a word w on the basis of which similarities can be established between source situations (i.e., the circumstances in which a speaker has used w) and target situations (i.e., candidate occasions of application of w). It is natural to object that even admitting that long-term memory could encompass such an immense amount of information (think of the number of times ‘table’ or ‘woman’ are used by an average speaker in the course of her life), surely working memory could not review such information to make sense of new uses. On the other hand, if words were associated with “more abstract schemata corresponding to types of situations”, as Recanati suggests as a less radical alternative to meaning eliminativism, one wonders what the difference would be with respect to traditional accounts in terms of polysemy.

Other conceptions of “what is said” make more room for the semantic contribution of conventional word meanings. Bach (1994) agrees with contextualists that the linguistic meaning of words (plus syntax and after saturation) does not always determine complete, truth-evaluable propositions; however, he maintains that they do provide some minimal semantic information, a so-called ‘propositional radical’, that allows pragmatic processes to issue in one or more propositions. Bach identifies “what is said” with this minimal information. However, many have objected that minimal content is extremely hard to isolate (Recanati 2004; Stanley 2007). Suppose it is identified with the content that all the utterances of a sentence type share; unfortunately, no such content can be attributed to a sentence such as “Every bottle is in the fridge”, for there is no proposition that is stably asserted by every utterance of it (surely not the proposition that every bottle in the universe is in the fridge, which is never asserted). Stanley’s (2007) indexicalism rejects the notion of minimal proposition and any distinction between semantic content and communicated content: communicated content can be entirely captured by means of consciously accessible, linguistically controlled content (content that results from semantic value together with the provision of values to free variables in syntax, or semantic value together with the provision of arguments to functions from semantic types to propositions) together with general conversational norms. Accordingly, Stanley generalizes contextual saturation processes that are usually regarded as characteristic of indexicals, tense, and a few other structures; moreover, he requires that the relevant variables be linguistically encoded, either syntactically or lexically. It remains to be seen whether such solutions apply (in a non-ad hoc way) to all the examples of content modulation that have been presented in the literature.

Finally, minimalism (Borg 2004, 2012; Cappelen & Lepore 2005) is the view that appears (and intends) to be closest to the Frege-Montague tradition. The task of a semantic theory is said to be minimal in that it is supposed to account only for the literal meaning of sentences: context does not affect literal semantic content but “what the speaker says” as opposed to “what the sentence means” (Borg 2012). In this sense, semantics is not another name for the theory of meaning, because not all meaning-related properties are semantic properties (Borg 2004). Contrary to contextualism and Bach’s theory, minimalism holds that lexicon and syntax together determine complete truth-evaluable propositions. Indeed, this is definitional for lexical meaning: word meanings are the kind of things which, if one puts enough of them together in the right sort of way, then what one gets is propositional content (Borg 2012). Borg believes that, in order to be truth-evaluable, propositional contents must be “about the world”, and that this entails some form of semantic externalism. However, the identification of lexical meaning with reference makes it hard to account for semantic relations such as synonymy, analytic entailment or the difference between ambiguity and polysemy, and syntactically relevant properties: the difference between “John is easy to please” and “John is eager to please” cannot be explained by the fact that ‘easy’ means the property easy (see the entry on ambiguity). To account for semantically based syntactic properties, words may come with “instructions” that are not, however, constitutive of a word’s meaning like meaning postulates (which Borg rejects), though awareness of them is part of a speaker’s competence. Once more, lexical semantic competence is divorced from grasp of word meaning. In conclusion, some information counts as lexical if it is either perceived as such in “firm, type-level lexical intuitions” or capable of affecting the word’s syntactic behavior. Borg concedes that even such an extended conception of lexical content will not capture, e.g., analytic entailments such as the relation between ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried’.

4. Linguistics

The emergence of modern linguistic theories of word meaning is usually placed at the transition from historical-philological semantics (Section 2.2) to structuralist semantics, the linguistics movement started at the break of the 20th century by Ferdinand de Saussure with his Cours de Linguistique Générale (1995 [1916]).

4.1 Structuralist Semantics

The advances introduced by the structuralist conception of word meaning are best appreciated by contrasting its basic assumptions with those of historical-philological semantics. Let us recall the three most important differences (Lepschy 1970; Matthews 2001).

  • Anti-psychologism. Structuralist semantics views language as a symbolic system whose properties and internal dynamics can be analyzed without taking into account their implementation in the mind/brain of language users. Just as the rules of chess can be stated and analyzed without making reference to the mental properties of chess players, so a theory of word meaning can, and should, proceed simply by examining the formal role played by words within the system of the language.
  • Anti-historicism. Since the primary explanandum of structuralist semantics is the role played by lexical expressions within structured linguistic systems, structuralist semantics privileges the synchronic description of word meaning. Diachronic accounts of word meaning are logically posterior to the analysis of the relational properties statically exemplified by words at different stages of the evolution of the language.
  • Anti-localism. Because the semantic properties of words depend on the relations they entertain with other expressions in the same lexical system, word meanings cannot be studied in isolation. This is both an epistemological and a foundational claim, i.e., a claim about how matters related to word meaning should be addressed in the context of a semantic theory of word meaning, and a claim about the dynamics whereby the elements of a system of signs acquire the meaning they have for their users.

The account of lexical phenomena popularized by structuralism gave rise to a variety of descriptive approaches to word meaning. We can group them in three categories (Lipka 1992; Murphy 2003; Geeraerts 2006).

  • Lexical Field Theory. Introduced by Trier (1931), it argues that word meaning should be studied by looking at the relations holding between words in the same lexical field. A lexical field is a set of semantically related words whose meanings are mutually interdependent and which together spell out the conceptual structure of a given domain of reality. Lexical Field Theory assumes that lexical fields are closed sets with no overlapping meanings or semantic gaps. Whenever a word undergoes a change in meaning (e.g., its range of application is extended or contracted), the whole arrangement of its lexical field is affected (Lehrer 1974).
  • Componential Analysis. Developed in the second half of the 1950s by European and American linguists (e.g., Pattier, Coseriu, Bloomfield, Nida), this framework argues that word meaning can be described on the basis of a finite set of conceptual building blocks called semantic components or features. For example, ‘man’ can be analyzed as [+ male], [+ mature], ‘woman’ as [− male], [+ mature], ‘child’ as [+/− male] [− mature] (Leech 1974).
  • Relational Semantics. Prominent in the work of linguists such as Lyons (1963), this approach shares with Lexical Field Theory the commitment to a style of analysis that privileges the description of lexical relations, but departs from it in two important respects. First, it postulates no direct correspondence between sets of related words and domains of reality, thereby dropping the assumption that the organization of lexical fields should be understood to reflect the organization of the non-linguistic world. Second, instead of deriving statements about the meaning relations entertained by a lexical item (e.g., synonymy, hyponymy) from an independent account of its meaning, for relational semantics word meanings are constituted by the set of semantic relations words participate in (Evens et al. 1980; Cruse 1986).

4.2 Generativist Semantics

The componential current of structuralism was the first to produce an important innovation in theories of word meaning: Katzian semantics (Katz & Fodor 1963; Katz 1972, 1987). Katzian semantics combined componential analysis with a mentalistic conception of word meaning and developed a method for the description of lexical phenomena in the context of a formal grammar. The mentalistic component of Katzian semantics is twofold. First, word meanings are defined as aggregates of simpler conceptual features inherited from our general categorization abilities. Second, the proper subject matter of the theory is no longer identified with the “structure of the language” but, following Chomsky (1957, 1965), with speakers’ ability to competently interpret the words and sentences of their language. In Katzian semantics, word meanings are structured entities whose representations are called semantic markers. A semantic marker is a hierarchical tree with labeled nodes whose structure reproduces the structure of the represented meaning, and whose labels identify the word’s conceptual components. For example, the figure below illustrates the sense of ‘chase’ (simplified from Katz 1987).

a tree of the form [.((Activity)_{[NP,S]}) [.(Physical) [.(Movement) (Fast) [.((Direction of)_{[NP,VP,S]}) ((Toward Location of) _{[NP,VP,S]}) ] ] ] [.(Purpose) ((Catching) _{[NP,VP,S]}) ] ]

Katz (1987) claimed that this approach was superior in both transparency and richness to the analysis of word meaning that could be provided via meaning postulates. For example, in Katzian semantics the validation of conditionals such as \(\forall x\forall y (\textrm{chase}(x, y) \to \textrm{follow}(x,y))\) could be reduced to a matter of inspection: one had simply to check whether the semantic marker of ‘follow’ was a subtree of the semantic marker of ‘chase’. Furthermore, the method incorporated syntagmatic relations in the representation of word meanings (witness the grammatical tags ‘NP’, ‘VP’ and ‘S’ attached to the conceptual components above). Katzian semantics was favorably received by the Generative Semantics movement (Fodor 1977; Newmeyer 1980) and boosted an interest in the formal representation of word meaning that would dominate the linguistic scene for decades to come (Harris 1993). Nonetheless, it was eventually abandoned. As subsequent commentators noted, Katzian semantics suffered from three important drawbacks. First, the theory did not provide any clear model of how the complex conceptual information represented by semantic markers contributed to the truth conditions of sentences (Lewis 1972). Second, some aspects of word meaning that could be easily represented with meaning postulates could not be expressed through semantic markers, such as the symmetry and the transitivity of predicates (e.g., \(\forall x\forall y (\textrm{sibling}(x, y) \to \textrm{sibling}(y, x))\) or \(\forall x\forall y\forall z (\textrm{louder}(x, y) \mathbin{\&} \textrm{louder}(y, z) \to \textrm{louder}(x, z))\); see Dowty 1979). Third, Katz’s arguments for the view that word meanings are intrinsically structured turned out to be vulnerable to objections from proponents of atomistic views of word meaning (see, most notably, Fodor & Lepore 1992).

After Katzian semantics, the landscape of linguistic theories of word meaning bifurcated. On one side, we find a group of theories advancing the decompositional agenda established by Katz. On the other side, we find a group of theories fostering the relational approach originated by Lexical Field Theory and relational semantics. Following Geeraerts (2010), we will briefly characterize the following ones.

Decompositional Frameworks Relational Frameworks
Natural Semantic Metalanguage Symbolic Networks
Conceptual Semantics Statistical Analysis
Two-Level Semantics
Generative Lexicon Theory

4.3 Decompositional Approaches

The basic idea of the Natural Semantic Metalanguage approach (henceforth, NSM; Wierzbicka 1972, 1996; Goddard & Wierzbicka 2002) is that word meaning is best described through the combination of a small set of elementary conceptual particles, known as semantic primes. Semantic primes are primitive (i.e., not decomposable into further conceptual parts), innate (i.e., not learned), and universal (i.e., explicitly lexicalized in all natural languages, whether in the form of a word, a morpheme, a phraseme, and so forth). According to NSM, the meaning of any word in any natural language can be defined by appropriately combining these fundamental conceptual particles. Wierzbicka (1996) proposed a catalogue of about 60 semantic primes, designed to analyze word meanings within so-called reductive paraphrases. For example, the reductive paraphrase for ‘top’ is a part of something; this part is above all the other parts of this something. NSM has produced interesting applications in comparative linguistics (Peeters 2006), language teaching (Goddard & Wierzbicka 2007), and lexical typology (Goddard 2012). However, the approach has been criticized on various grounds. First, it has been argued that the method followed by NSM in the identification of semantic primes is insufficiently clear (e.g., Matthewson 2003). Second, some have observed that reductive paraphrases are too vague to be considered adequate representations of word meanings, since they fail to account for fine-grained differences between semantically neighboring words. For example, the reductive paraphrase provided by Wierzbicka for ‘sad’ (i.e., x feels something; sometimes a person thinks something like this: something bad happened; if i didn’t know that it happened i would say: i don’t want it to happen; i don’t say this now because i know: i can’t do anything; because of this, this person feels something bad; x feels something like this) seems to apply equally well to ‘unhappy’, ‘distressed’, ‘frustrated’, ‘upset’, and ‘annoyed’ (e.g., Aitchison 2012). Third, there is no consensus on what items should ultimately feature in the list of semantic primes available to reductive paraphrases: the content of the list is debated and varies considerably between versions of NSM. Fourth, some purported semantic primes appear to fail to comply with the universality requirement and are not explicitly lexicalized in all known languages (Bohnemeyer 2003; Von Fintel & Matthewson 2008). See Goddard (1998) for some replies and Riemer (2006) for further objections.

For NSM, word meanings can be exhaustively represented with a metalanguage appealing exclusively to the combination of primitive linguistic particles. Conceptual Semantics (Jackendoff 1983, 1990, 2002) proposes a more open-ended approach. According to Conceptual Semantics, word meanings are essentially an interface phenomenon between a specialized body of linguistic knowledge (e.g., morphosyntactic knowledge) and core non-linguistic cognition. Word meanings are thus modeled as hybrid semantic representations combining linguistic features (e.g., syntactic tags) and conceptual elements grounded in perceptual knowledge and motor schemas. For example, here is the semantic representation of ‘drink’ according to Jackendoff.

\[\left[ \begin{align*} &\text{drink} \\ &\mathrm{V} \\ &\underline{\phantom{xxxi}}\langle \text{NP}_j \rangle \\ &[_{\text{Event}} \text{CAUSE} ([_{\text{Thing}}\quad]_i, [_{\text{Event}} \text{GO} ([_{\text{Thing}} \text{LIQUID}]_j, \\ &\quad [_{\text{Path}} \text{TO} ([_{\text{Place}} \text{IN} ([_{\text{Thing}} \text{MOUTH OF} ([_{\text{Thing}}\quad]_i)])])])])] \end{align*} \right]\]

Syntactic tags represent the grammatical properties of the word under analysis, while the items in subscript are picked from a core set of perceptually grounded primitives (e.g., event, state, thing, path, place, property, amount) which are assumed to be innate, cross-modal and universal categories of the human mind. The decompositional machinery of Conceptual Semantics has a number of attractive features. Most notably, its representations take into account grammatical class and word-level syntax, which are plausibly an integral aspect of our knowledge of the meaning of words. However, some of its claims about the interplay between language and conceptual structure appear more problematic. To begin with, it has been observed that speakers tend to use causative predicates (e.g., ‘drink’) and the paraphrases expressing their decompositional structure (e.g., “cause a liquid to go into someone or something’s mouth”) in different and sometimes non-interchangeable ways (e.g., Wolff 2003), which raises concerns about the hypothesis that decompositional analyses à la Jackendoff may be regarded as faithful representations of word meanings. In addition, Conceptual Semantics is somewhat unclear as to what exact method should be followed in the identification of the motor-perceptual primitives that can feed descriptions of word meanings (Pulman 2005). Finally, the restriction placed by Conceptual Semantics on the type of conceptual material that can inform definitions of word meaning (low-level primitives grounded in perceptual knowledge and motor schemas) appears to affect the explanatory power of the framework. For example, how can one account for the difference in meaning between ‘jog’ and ‘run’ without ut taking into account higher-level, arguably non-perceptual knowledge about the social characteristics of jogging, which typically implies a certain leisure setting, the intention to contribute to physical wellbeing, and so on? See Taylor (1996), Deane (1996).

The neat dividing line drawn between word meanings and general world knowledge by Conceptual Semantics does not tell us much about the dynamic interaction of the two in language use. The Two-Level Semantics of Bierwisch (1983a,b) and Lang (Bierwisch & Lang 1989; Lang 1993) aims to provide such a dynamic account. Two-Level Semantics views word meaning as the result of the interaction between two systems: semantic form (SF) and conceptual structure (CS). SF is a formalized representation of the basic features of a word. It contains grammatical information that specifies, e.g., the admissible syntactic distribution of the word, plus a set of variables and semantic parameters whose value is determined by the interaction with CS. By contrast, CS consists of language-independent systems of knowledge (including general world knowledge) that mediate between language and the world (Lang & Maienborn 2011). According to Two-Level Semantics, for example, polysemous words can express variable meanings by virtue of having a stable underspecified SF which can be flexibly manipulated by CS. By way of example, consider the word ‘university’, which can be read as referring either to an institution (as in “the university selected John’s application”) or to a building (as in “the university is located on the North side of the river”). Simplifying a bit, Two-Level Semantics explains the dynamics governing the selection of these readings as follows.

  1. Because ‘university’ belongs to the category of words denoting objects primarily characterized by their purpose, the general lexical entry for ‘university’ is \(\lambda x [\textrm{purpose} [x w]]\).
  2. Based on our knowledge that the primary purpose of universities is to provide advanced education, the SF of ‘university’ is specified as \(\lambda x [\textrm{purpose} [x w] \mathbin{\&} \textit{advanced study and teaching} [w]]\).
  3. The alternative readings of ‘university’ are a function of the two ways CS can set the value of the variable x in its SF, such ways being \(\lambda x [\textrm{institution} [x] \mathbin{\&} \textrm{purpose} [x w]]\) and \(\lambda x [\textrm{building} [x] \mathbin{\&} \textrm{purpose} [x w]]\).

Two-Level Semantics shares Jackendoff’s and Wierzbicka’s commitment to a descriptive paradigm that anchors word meaning to a stable decompositional template, all the while avoiding the immediate complications arising from a restrictive characterization of the type of conceptual factors that can modulate such stable decompositional templates in contexts. But there are, once again, a few significant issues. A first problem is definitional accuracy: defining the SF of ‘university’ as \(\lambda x [\textrm{purpose} [x w] \mathbin{\&} \textit{advanced study and teaching} [w]]\) seems too loose to reflect the subtle differences in meaning among ‘university’ and related terms designating institutions for higher education, such as ‘college’ or ‘academy’. Furthermore, the apparatus of Two-Level Semantics relies heavily on lambda expressions, which, as some commentators have noted (e.g., Taylor 1994, 1995), appears ill-suited to represent the complex forms of world knowledge we often rely on to fix the meaning of highly polysemous words. See also Wunderlich (1991, 1993).

The Generative Lexicon theory (GL; Pustejovsky 1995) takes a different approach. Instead of explaining the contextual flexibility of word meaning by appealing to rich conceptual operations applied on semantically thin lexical entries, this approach postulates lexical entries rich in conceptual information and knowledge of worldly facts. According to classical GL, the informational resources encoded in the lexical entry for a typical word w consist of the following four levels.

  • A lexical typing structure, specifying the semantic type of w within the type system of the language;
  • An argument structure, representing the number and nature of the arguments supported by w;
  • An event structure, defining the event type denoted by w (e.g., state, process, transition);
  • A qualia structure, specifying the predicative force of w.

In particular, qualia structure specifies the conceptual relations that speakers associate to the real-world referents of a word and impact on the way the word is used in the language (Pustejovsky 1998). For example, our knowledge that bread is something that is brought about through baking is considered a Quale of the word ‘bread’, and this knowledge is responsible for our understanding that, e.g., “fresh bread” means “bread which has been baked recently”. GL distinguishes four types of qualia:

  • constitutive: the relation between an object x and its constituent parts;
  • formal: the basic ontological category of x;
  • telic: the purpose and the function of x;
  • agentive: the factors involved in the origin of x.

Take together, these qualia form the “qualia structure” of a word. For example, the qualia structure of the noun ‘sandwich’ will feature information about the composition of sandwiches, their nature of physical artifacts, their being intended to be eaten, and our knowledge about the operations typically involved in the preparation of sandwiches. The notation is as follows.

const = {bread, …}
form = physobj(x)
tel = eat(P, g, x)
agent = artifact(x)

Qualia structure is the primary explanatory device by which GL accounts for polysemy. The sentence “Mary finished the sandwich” receives the default interpretation “Mary finished eating the sandwich” because the argument structure of ‘finish’ requires an action as direct object, and the qualia structure of ‘sandwich’ allows the generation of the appropriate sense via type coercion (Pustejovsky 2006). GL is an ongoing research program (Pustejovsky et al. 2012) that has led to significant applications in computational linguistics (e.g., Pustejovsky & Jezek 2008; Pustejovsky & Rumshisky 2008). But like the theories mentioned so far, it has been subject to criticisms. A first general criticism is that the decompositional assumptions underlying GL are unwarranted and should be replaced by an atomist view of word meaning (Fodor & Lepore 1998; see Pustejovsky 1998 for a reply). A second criticism is that GL’s focus on variations in word meaning which depend on sentential context and qualia structure is too narrow, since since contextual variations in word meaning often depend on more complex factors, such as the ability to keep track of coherence relations in a discourse (e.g., Asher & Lascarides 1995; Lascarides & Copestake 1998; Kehler 2002; Asher 2011). Finally, the empirical adequacy of the framework has been called into question. It has been argued that the formal apparatus of GL leads to incorrect predictions, that qualia structure sometimes overgenerates or undergenerates interpretations, and that the rich lexical entries postulated by GL are psychologically implausible (e.g., Jayez 2001; Blutner 2002).

4.4 Relational Approaches

To conclude this section, we will briefly mention some contemporary approaches to word meaning that, in different ways, pursue the theoretical agenda of the relational current of the structuralist paradigm. For pedagogical convenience, we can group them into two categories. On the one hand, we have network approaches, which formalize knowledge of word meaning within models where the lexicon is seen as a structured system of entries interconnected by sense relations such as synonymy, antonymy, and meronymy. On the other, we have statistical approaches, whose primary aim is to investigate the patterns of co-occurrence among words in linguistic corpora.

The main example of network approaches is perhaps Collins and Quillian’s (1969) hierarchical network model, in which words are represented as entries in a network of nodes, each comprising a set of conceptual features defining the conventional meaning of the word in question, and connected to other nodes in the network through semantic relations (more in Lehman 1992). Subsequent developments of the hierarchical network model include the Semantic Feature Model (Smith, Shoben & Rips 1974), the Spreading Activation Model (Collins & Loftus 1975; Bock & Levelt 1994), the WordNet database (Fellbaum 1998), as well as the connectionist models of Seidenberg & McClelland (1989), Hinton & Shallice (1991), and Plaut & Shallice (1993). More on this in the entry on connectionism.

Finally, statistical analysis investigates word meaning by examining through computational means the distribution of words in linguistic corpora. The main idea is to use quantitative data about the frequency of co-occurrence of sets of lexical items to identify their semantic properties and differentiate their different senses (for overviews, see Atkins & Zampolli 1994; Manning & Schütze 1999; Stubbs 2002; Sinclair 2004). Notice that while symbolic networks are models of the architecture of the lexicon that seek to be psychologically adequate (i.e., to reveal how knowledge of word meaning is stored and organized in the mind/brain of human speakers), statistical approaches to word meaning are not necessarily interested in psychological adequacy, and may have completely different goals, such as building a machine translation service able to mimic human performance (a goal that can obviously be achieved without reproducing the cognitive mechanisms underlying translation in humans). More on this in the entry on computational linguistics.

5. Cognitive Science

As we have seen, most theories of word meaning in linguistics face, at some point, the difficulties involved in drawing a plausible dividing line between word knowledge and world knowledge, and the various ways they attempt to meet this challenge display some recurrent features. For example, they assume that the lexicon, though richly interfaced with world knowledge and non-linguistic cognition, remains an autonomous representational system encoding a specialized body of linguistic knowledge. In this section, we survey a group of empirical approaches that adopt a different stance on word meaning. The focus is once again psychological, which means that the overall goal of these approaches is to provide a cognitively realistic account of the representational repertoire underlying knowledge of word meaning. Unlike the approaches surveyed in Section 4, however, these theories tend to encourage a view on which the distinction between the semantic and pragmatic aspects of word meaning is highly unstable (or even impossible to draw), where lexical knowledge and knowledge of worldly facts are aspects of a continuum, and where the lexicon is permeated by our general inferential abilities (Evans 2010). Section 5.1 will briefly illustrate the central assumptions underlying the study of word meaning in cognitive linguistics. Section 5.2 will turn to the study of word meaning in psycholinguistics. Section 5.3 will conclude with some references to neurolinguistics.

5.1 Cognitive Linguistics

At the beginning of the 1970s, Eleanor Rosch put forth a new theory of the mental representation of categories. Concepts such as furniture or bird, she claimed, are not represented just as sets of criterial features with clear-cut boundaries, so that an item can be conceived as falling or not falling under the concept based on whether or not it meets the relevant criteria. Rather, items within categories can be considered more or less representative of the category itself (Rosch 1975; Rosch & Mervis 1975; Mervis & Rosch 1981). Several experiments seemed to show that the application of concepts is no simple yes-or-no business: some items (the “good examples”) are more easily identified as falling under a concept than others (the “poor examples”). An automobile is perceived as a better example of vehicle than a rowboat, and much better than an elevator; a carrot is more readily identified as an example of the concept vegetable than a pumpkin. If the concepts speakers associate to category words (such as ‘vehicle’ and ‘vegetable’) were mere bundles of criterial features, these preferences would be inexplicable, since they rank items that meet the criteria equally well. It is thus plausible to assume that the concepts associated to category words are have a center-periphery architecture centered on the most representative examples of the category: a robin is perceived as a more “birdish” bird than an ostrich or, as people would say, closer to the prototype of a bird or to the prototypical bird (see the entry on concepts).

Although nothing in Rosch’s experiments licensed the conclusion that prototypical rankings should be reified and treated as the content of concepts (what her experiments did support was merely that a theory of the mental representation of categories should be consistent with the existence of prototype effects), the study of prototypes revolutionized the existing approaches to category concepts (Murphy 2002) and was a leading force behind the birth of cognitive linguistics. Prototypes were central to the development of the Radial Network Theory of Brugman (1988 [1981]) and Lakoff (Brugman & Lakoff 1988), which proposed to model the sense network of words by introducing in the architecture of word meanings the center-periphery relation at the heart of Rosch’s seminal work. According to Brugman, word meanings can typically be modeled as radial complexes where a dominant sense is related to less typical senses by means of semantic relations such as metaphor and metonymy. For example, the sense network of ‘fruit’ features product of plant growth at its center and a more abstract outcome at its periphery, and the two are connected by a metaphorical relation). On a similar note, the Conceptual Metaphor Theory of Lakoff & Johnson (1980; Lakoff 1987) and the Mental Spaces Approach of Fauconnier (1994; Fauconnier & Turner 1998) combined the assumption that word meanings typically have an internal structure arranging multiple related senses in a radial fashion, with the further claim that our use of words is governed by hard-wired mapping mechanisms that catalyze the integration of word meanings across conceptual domains. For example, it is in virtue of these mechanisms that the expressions “love is war”, “life is a journey”) are so widespread across cultures and sound so natural to our ears. On the proposed view, these associations are creative, perceptually grounded, systematic, cross-culturally uniform, and grounded on pre-linguistic patterns of conceptual activity which correlate with core elements of human embodied experience (see the entries on metaphor and embodied cognition). More in Kövecses (2002), Gibbs (2008), and Dancygier & Sweetser (2014).

Another major innovation introduced by cognitive linguistics is the development of a resolutely “encyclopedic” approach to word meaning, best exemplified by Frame Semantics (Fillmore 1975, 1982) and by the Theory of Domains (Langacker 1987). Approximating a bit, an approach to word meaning can be defined “encyclopedic” insofar as it characterizes knowledge of worldly facts as the primary constitutive force of word meaning. While the Mental Spaces Approach and Conceptual Metaphor Theory regarded word meaning mainly as the product of associative patterns between concepts, Fillmore and Langacker turned their attention to the relation between word meaning and the body of encyclopedic knowledge possessed by typical speakers. Our ability to use and interpret the verb ‘buy’, for example, is closely intertwined with our background knowledge of the social nature of commercial transfer, which involves a seller, a buyer, goods, money, the relation between the money and the goods, and so forth. However, knowledge structures of this kind cannot be modeled as standard concept-like representations. Here is how Frame Semantics attempts to meet the challenge. First, words are construed as pairs of phonographic forms with highly schematic concepts which are internally organized as radial categories and function as access sites to encyclopedic knowledge. Second, an account of the representational organization of encyclopedic knowledge is provided. According to Fillmore, encyclopedic knowledge is represented in long-term memory in the form of frames, i.e., schematic conceptual scenarios that specify the prototypical features and functions of a denotatum, along with its interactions with the objects and the events typically associated with it. Frames provide thus a schematic representation of the elements and entities associated with a particular domain of experience and convey the information required to use and interpret the words employed to talk about it. For example, according to Fillmore & Atkins (1992) the use of the verb ‘bet’ is governed by the risk frame, which is as follows:

Protagonist: The central agent in the frame.
Bad: The possible bad outcome.
Decision: The decision that could trigger the bad outcome.
Goal: The desired outcome.
Setting: The situation within which the risk exists.
Possession: Something valued by the protagonist and endangered in the situation.
Source: Something or someone which could cause the harm.

In the same vein as Frame Semantics (more on the parallels in Clausner & Croft 1999), Langacker’s Theory of Domains argues that our understanding of word meaning depends on our access to larger knowledge structures called domains. To illustrate the notion of a domain, consider the word ‘diameter’. The meaning of this word cannot be grasped independently of a prior understanding of the notion of a circle. According to Langacker, word meaning is precisely a matter of “profile-domain” organization: the profile corresponds to a substructural element designated within a relevant macrostructure, whereas the domain corresponds to the macrostructure providing the background information against which the profile can be interpreted (Taylor 2002). In the diameter/circle example, ‘diameter’ designates a profile in the circle domain. Similarly, expressions like ‘hot’, ‘cold’, and ‘warm’ designate properties in the temperature domain. Langacker argues that domains are typically structured into hierarchies that reflect meronymic relations and provide a basic conceptual ontology for language use. For example, the meaning of ‘elbow’ is understood with respect to the arm domain, while the meaning of ‘arm’ is situated within the body domain. Importantly, individual profiles typically inhere to different domains, and this is one of the factors responsible for the ubiquity of polysemy in natural language. For example, the profile associated to the word ‘love’ inheres both to the domains of embodied experience and to the abstract domains of social activities such as marriage ceremonies.

Developments of the approach to word meaning fostered by cognitive linguistics include Construction Grammar (Goldberg 1995), Embodied Construction Grammar (Bergen & Chang 2005), Invited Inferencing Theory (Traugott & Dasher 2001), and LCCM Theory (Evans 2009). The notion of a frame has become popular in cognitive psychology to model the dynamics of ad hoc categorization (e.g., Barsalou 1983, 1992, 1999; more in Section 5.2). General information about the study of word meaning in cognitive linguistics can be found in Talmy (2000a,b), Croft & Cruse (2004), and Evans & Green (2006).

5.2 Psycholinguistics

In psycholinguistics, the study of word meaning is understood as the investigation of the mental lexicon, the cognitive system that underlies the capacity for conscious and unconscious lexical activity (Jarema & Libben 2007). Simply put, the mental lexicon is the long-term representational inventory storing the body of linguistic knowledge speakers are required to master in order to make competent use of the lexical elements of a language; as such, it can be equated with the lexical component of an individual’s language capacity. Research on the mental lexicon is concerned with a variety of problems (for surveys, see, e.g., Traxler & Gernsbacher 2006, Spivey, McRae & Joanisse 2012, Harley 2014), that center around the following tasks:

  • Define the overall organization of the mental lexicon, specify its components and clarify the role played by such components in lexical production and comprehension;
  • Determine the internal makeup of single components and the way the information they store is brought to bear on lexical performance;
  • Describe the interface mechanisms connecting the mental lexicon to other domains in the human cognitive architecture (e.g., declarative memory);
  • Illustrate the learning processes responsible for the acquisition and the development of lexical abilities.

From a functional point of view, the mental lexicon is usually understood as a system of lexical entries, each containing the information related to a word mastered by a speaker (Rapp 2001). A lexical entry for a word w is typically modeled as a complex representation made up of the following components (Levelt 1989, 2001):

  • A semantic form, determining the semantic contribution made by w to the meaning of sentences containing w;
  • A grammatical form, assigning w to a grammatical category (noun, verb, adjective) and regulating the behavior of w in syntactic environments;
  • A morphological form, representing the morphemic substructure of w and the morphological operations that can be applied on w;
  • A phonological form, specifying the set of phonological properties of w;
  • An orthographic form, specifying the graphic structure of w.

From this standpoint, a theory of word meaning translates into an account of the information stored in the semantic form of lexical entries. A crucial part of the task consists in determining exactly what kind of information is stored in lexical semantic forms as opposed to, e.g., bits of information that fall under the scope of episodic memory or general factual knowledge. Recall the example we made in Section 3.3: how much of the information that a competent zoologist can associate to tigers is part of her knowledge of the meaning of the word ‘tiger’? Not surprisingly, even in psycholinguistics tracing a neat functional separation between word processing and general-purpose cognition has proven a problematic task. The general consensus among psycholinguists seems to be that lexical representations and conceptual representations are richly interfaced, though functionally distinct (e.g., Gleitman & Papafragou 2013). For example, in clinical research it is standard practice to distinguish between amodal deficits involving an inability to process information at both the conceptual and the lexical level, and modal deficits specifically restricted to one of the two spheres (Saffran & Schwartz 1994; Rapp & Goldrick 2006; Jefferies & Lambon Ralph 2006; more in more in Section 5.3). On the resulting view, lexical activity in humans is the output of the interaction between two functionally neighboring systems, one broadly in charge of the storage and processing of conceptual-encyclopedic knowledge, the other coinciding with the mental lexicon. The role of lexical entries is essentially to make these two systems communicate with one another through semantic forms (see Denes 2009). Contrary to the folk notion of a mental lexicon where words are associated to fully specified meanings or senses which are simply retrieved from the lexicon for the purpose of language processing, in these models lexical semantic forms are seen as highly schematic representations whose primary function is to supervise the recruitment of the extra-linguistic information required to interpret word occurrences in language use. In recent years, appeals to “ultra-thin” lexical entries have taken an eliminativist turn. It has been suggested that psycholinguistic accounts of the representational underpinnigs of lexical competence should dispose of the largely metaphorical notion of an “internal word store”, and there is no such thing as a mental lexicon in the human mind (e.g., Elman 2004, 2009; Dilkina, McClelland & Plaut 2010).

In addition to these approaches, in a number of prominent psychological accounts emerged over the last two decades, the study of word meaning is essentially considered a chapter of theories of the mental realization of concepts (see the entry on concepts). Lexical units are seen either as ingredients of conceptual networks or as (auditory or visual) stimuli providing access to conceptual networks. A flow of neuroscientific results has shown that understanding of (certain categories of) words correlates with neural activations corresponding to the semantic content of the processed words. For example, it has been shown that listening to sentences that describe actions performed with the mouth, hand, or leg activates the visuomotor circuits which subserve execution and observation of such actions (Tettamanti et al. 2005); that reading words denoting specific actions of the tongue (‘lick’), fingers (‘pick’), and leg (‘kick’) differentially activate areas of the premotor cortex that are active when the corresponding movements are actually performed (Hauk et al. 2004); that reading odor-related words (‘jasmine’, ‘garlic’, ‘cinnamon’) differentially activates the primary olfactory cortex (Gonzales et al. 2006); and that color words (such as ‘red’) activate areas in the fusiform gyrus that have been associated with color perception (Chao et al. 1999, Simmons et al. 2007; for a survey of results on visual activations in language processing, see Martin 2007).

This body of research originated so-called simulationist (or enactivist) accounts of conceptual competence, on which “understanding is imagination” and “imagining is a form of simulation” (Gallese & Lakoff 2005). In these accounts, conceptual (often called “semantic”) competence is seen as the ability to simulate or re-enact perceptual (including proprioceptive and introspective) experiences of the states of affairs that language describes, by manipulating memory traces of such experiences or fragments of them. In Barsalou’s theory of perceptual symbol systems (1999), language understanding (and cognition in general) is based on perceptual experience and memory of it. The central claim is that “sensory-motor systems represent not only perceived entities but also conceptualizations of them in their absence”. Perception generates mostly unconscious “neural representations in sensory-motor areas of the brain”, which represent schematic components of perceptual experience. Such perceptual symbols are not holistic copies of experiences but selections of information isolated by attention. Related perceptual symbols are integrated into a simulator that produces limitless simulations of a perceptual component, such as red or lift. Simulators are located in long-term memory and play the roles traditionally attributed to concepts: they generate inferences and can be combined recursively to implement productivity. A concept is not “a static amodal structure” as in traditional, computationally-oriented cognitive science, but “the ability to simulate a kind of thing perceptually”. Linguistic symbols (i.e., auditory or visual memories of words) get to be associated with simulators; perceptual recognition of a word activates the relevant simulator, which simulates a referent for the word; syntax provides instructions for building integrated perceptual simulations, which “constitute semantic interpretations”.

Though popular among researchers interested in the conceptual underpinnings of semantic competence, the simulationist paradigm faces important challenges. Three are worth mentioning. First, it appears that imulations do not always capture the intuitive truth conditions of sentences: listeners may enact the same simulation upon exposure to sentences that have different truth conditions (e.g., “The man stood on the corner” vs. “The man waited on the corner”; see Weiskopf 2010). Moreover, simulations may overconstrain truth conditions. For example, even though in the simulations listeners typically associate to the sentence “There are three pencils and four pens in Anna’s mug”, the pens and the pencils are in vertical position, the sentence would be true even if they were lying horizontally in the mug. Second, the framework does not sit well with pathological data. For example, no general impairment with auditory-related words is reported in patients with lesions in the auditory association cortex (e.g., auditory agnosia patients); analogously, patients with damage to the motor cortex seem to have no difficulties in linguistic performance, and specifically in inferential processing with motor-related words (for a survey of these results, see Calzavarini, to appear; for a defense of the embodied paradigm, Pulvermüller 2013). Finally, the theory has difficulties accounting for the meaning of abstract words (e.g., ‘beauty’, ‘pride’, ‘kindness’), which does not appear to hinge on sensory-motor simulation (see Dove 2016 for a discussion).

5.3 Neurolinguistics

Beginning in the mid-1970s, neuropsychological research on cognitive deficits related to brain lesions has produced a considerable amount of findings related to the neural correlates of lexical semantic information and processing. More recently, the development of neuroimaging techniques such as PET, fMRI and ERP has provided further means to adjudicate hypotheses about lexical semantic processes in the brain (Vigneau et al. 2006). Here we do not intend to provide a complete overview of such results (for a survey, see Faust 2012). We shall just mention three topics of neurolinguistic research that appear to bear on issues in the study of word meaning: the partition of the lexicon into categories, the representation of common nouns vs. proper names, and the distinction between the inferential and the referential aspects of lexical competence.

Two preliminary considerations should be kept in mind. First, a distinction must be drawn between the neural realization of word forms, i.e., traces of acoustic, articulatory, graphic, and motor configurations (‘peripheral lexicons’), and the neural correlates of lexical meanings (‘concepts’). A patient can understand what is the object represented by a picture shown to her (and give evidence of her understanding, e.g., by miming the object’s function) while being unable to retrieve the relevant phonological form from her output lexicon (Warrington 1985; Shallice 1988). Second, there appears to be wide consensus about the irrelevance to brain processing of any distinction between strictly semantic and factual or encyclopedic information (e.g., Tulving 1972; Sartori et al. 1994). Whatever information is relevant to such processes as object recognition or confrontation naming is standardly characterized as ‘semantic’. This may be taken as a stipulation—it is just how neuroscientists use the word ‘semantic’—or as deriving from lack of evidence for any segregation between the domains of semantic and encyclopedic information (see Binder et al. 2009). Be that as it may, in present-day neuroscience there seems to be no room for a correlate of the analytic/synthetic distinction. Moreover, in the literature ‘semantic’ and ‘conceptual’ are often used synonymously; hence, no distinction is drawn between lexical semantic and conceptual knowledge. Finally, the focus of neuroscientific research on “semantics” is on information structures roughly corresponding to word-level meanings, not to sentence-level meanings: hence, so far neuroscientific research has had little to say about the compositional mechanisms that have been the focus (and, often, the entire content) of theories of meaning as pursued within formal semantics and philosophy of language.

Let us start with the partition of the semantic lexicon into categories. Neuropsychological research indicates that the ability to name objects or to answer simple questions involving such nouns can be selectively lost or preserved: subjects can perform much better in naming living entities than in naming artifacts, or in naming animate living entities than in naming fruits and vegetables (Shallice 1988). Different patterns of brain activation may correspond to such dissociations between performances: e.g., Damasio et al. (1996) found that retrieval of names of animals and of tools activate different regions in the left temporal lobe. However, the details of this partition have been interpreted in different ways. Warrington & McCarthy (1983) and Warrington & Shallice (1984) explained the living vs. artifactual dissociation by taking the category distinction to be an effect of the difference among features that are crucial in the identification of living entities and artifacts: while living entities are identified mainly on the basis of perceptual features, artifacts are identified by their function. A later theory (Caramazza & Shelton 1998) claimed that animate and inanimate objects are treated by different knowledge systems separated by evolutionary pressure: domains of features pertaining to the recognition of living things, human faces, and perhaps tools may have been singled out as recognition of such entities had survival value for humans. Finally, Devlin et al. (1998) proposed to view the partition as the consequence of a difference in how recognition-relevant features are connected with one another: in the case of artifactual kinds, an object is recognized thanks to a characteristic coupling of form and function, whereas no such coupling individuates kinds of living things (e.g., eyes go with seeing in many animal species). For non-neutral surveys, see Caramazza & Mahon (2006) and Shallice & Cooper (2011).

On the other hand, it is also known that “semantic” (i.e., conceptual) competence may be lost in its entirety (though often gradually). This is what typically happens in semantic dementia. Empirical evidence has motivated theories of the neural realization of conceptual competence that are meant to account for both modality-specific deficits and pathologies that involve impairment across all modalities. The former may involve a difficulty or impossibility to categorize a visually exhibited object which, however, can be correctly categorized in other modalities (e.g., if the object is touched) or verbally described on the basis of the object’s name (i.e., on the basis of the lexical item supposedly associated with the category). The original “hub and spokes” model of the brain representation of concepts (Rogers et al. 2004, Patterson et al. 2007) accounted for both sets of findings by postulating that the semantic network is composed of a series of “spokes”, i.e., cortical areas distributed across the brain processing modality-specific (visual, auditory, motor, as well as verbal) sources of information, and that the spokes are two-ways connected to a transmodal “hub”. While damage to the spokes accounts for modality-specific deficits, damage to the hub and its connections explains the overall impairment of semantic competence. On this model, the hub is supposed to be located in the anterior temporal lobe (ATL), since semantic dementia had been found to be associated with degeneration of the anterior ventral and polar regions of both temporal poles (Guo et al. 2013). According to more recent, “graded” versions of the model (Lambon Ralph et al. 2017), the contribution of the hub units may vary depending on different patterns of connectivity to the spokes, to account for evidence of graded variation of function across subregions of ATL. It should be noted that while many researchers converge on a distributed view of semantic representation and on the role of domain-specific parts of the neural network (depending on differential patterns of functional connectivity), not everybody agrees on the need to postulate a transmodal hub (see, e.g., Mahon & Caramazza 2011).

Let us now turn to common nouns and proper names. As we have seen, in the philosophy of language of the last decades, proper names (of people, landmarks, countries, etc.) have being regarded as semantically different from common nouns. Neuroscientific research on the processing of proper names and common nouns concurs, to some extent. To begin with, the retrieval of proper names is doubly dissociated from the retrieval of common nouns. Some patients proved competent with common nouns but unable to associate names to pictures of famous people, or buildings, or brands (Ellis, Young & Critchley 1989); in other cases, people’s names were specifically affected (McKenna & Warrington 1980). Other patients had the complementary deficit. The patient described in Semenza & Sgaramella (1993) could name no objects at all (with or without phonemic cues) but he was able to name 10 out of 10 familiar people, and 18 out of 22 famous people with a phonemic cue. Martins & Farrayota‘s (2007) patient ACB also presented impaired object naming but spared retrieval of proper names. Such findings suggest distinct neural pathways for the retrieval of proper names and common nouns (Semenza 2006). The study of lesions and neuroimaging research both initially converged in identifying the left temporal pole as playing a crucial role in the retrieval of proper names, from both visual stimuli (Damasio et al. 1996) and the presentation of speaker voices (Waldron et al. 2014) (though in at least one case damage to the left temporal pole was associated with selective sparing of proper names; see Martins & Farrajota 2007). In addition, recent research has found a role for the uncinate fasciculus (UF). In patients undergoing surgical removal of UF, retrieval of common nouns was recovered while retrieval of proper names remained impaired (Papagno et al. 2016). The present consensus appears to be that “the production of proper names recruits a network that involves at least the left anterior temporal lobe and the left orbitofrontal cortex connected together by the UF” (Brédart 2017).

Furthermore, a few neuropsychological studies have described patients whose competence on geographical names was preserved while names of people were lost: one patient had preserved country names, though he had lost virtually every other linguistic ability (McKenna & Warrington 1978; see Semenza 2006 for other cases of selective preservation of geographical names). Other behavioral experiments seem to show that country names are closer to common nouns than to other proper names such as people and landmark names in that the connectivity between the word and the conceptual system is likely to require diffuse multiple connections, as with common nouns (Hollis & Valentine 2001). If these results were confirmed, it would turn out that the linguistic category of proper names is not homogeneous in terms of neural processing. Studies have also demonstrated that the retrieval of proper names from memory is typically a more difficult cognitive task than the retrieval of common nouns. For example, it is harder to name faces (of famous people) than to name objects; moreover, it is easier to remember a person’s occupation than her or his name. Interestingly, the same difference does not materialize in definition naming, i.e., in tasks where names and common nouns are to be retrieved from definitions (Hanley 2011). Though several hypotheses about the source of this difference have been proposed (see Brédart 2017 for a survey), no consensus has been reached on how to explain this phenomenon.

Finally, a few words on the distinction between the inferential and the referential component of lexical competence. As we have seen in Section 3.2, Marconi (1997) suggested that processing of lexical meaning might be distributed between two subsystems, an inferential and a referential one. Beginning with Warrington (1975), many patients had been described that were more or less severely impaired in referential tasks such as naming from vision (and other perceptual modalities as well), while their inferential competence was more or less intact. The complementary pattern (i.e., the preservation of referential abilities with loss of inferential competence) is definitely less common. Still, a number of cases have been reported, beginning with a stroke patient of Heilman et al. (1976), who, while unable to perform any task requiring inferential processing, performed well in referential naming tasks with visually presented objects (he could name 23 of 25 common objects). In subsequent years, further cases were described. For example, in a study of 61 patients with lesions affecting linguistic abilities, Kemmerer et al. (2012) found 14 cases in which referential abilities were better preserved than inferential abilities. More recently, Pandey & Heilman (2014), while describing one more case of preserved (referential) naming from vision with severely impaired (inferential) naming from definition, hypothesized that “these two naming tasks may, at least in part, be mediated by two independent neuronal networks”. Thus, while double dissociation between inferential processes and naming from vision is well attested, it is not equally clear that it involves referential processes in general. On the other hand, evidence from neuroimaging is, so far, limited and overall inconclusive. Some neuroimaging studies (e.g., Tomaszewski-Farias et al. 2005, Marconi et al. 2013), as well as TMS mapping experiments (Hamberger et al. 2001, Hamberger & Seidel 2009) did find different patterns of activation for inferential vs. referential performances. However, the results are not entirely consistent and are liable to different interpretations. For example, the selective activation of the anterior left temporal lobe in inferential performances may well reflect additional syntactic demands involved in definition naming, rather than be due to inferential processing as such (see Calzavarini 2017 for a discussion).


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