#### Supplement to Chaos

## Quantum Chaos

Chaos studies, as discussed in the main article, focus on the macroscopic world of our everyday experience. Quantum mechanics (QM) focuses on the realm of elementary particles and atoms. Quantum chaos, or quantum chaology as it is more aptly called (Berry 1987; 1989)—though this term has been largely been rejected by physics journals—is the study of the relationship between chaotic dynamics in macroscopic models and systems and models in the microscopic realm of QM. The implications of chaos in macroscopic systems for quantum systems have received some intense study, with questions raised about the actual existence of chaos in the quantum domain and the viability of the correspondence principle between macroscopic and quantum physics, to name the most provocative.

Before looking at these questions, there is the thorny problem of defining quantum chaos. The difficulties in establishing an agreed definition of quantum chaos are actually more challenging than for classical chaos (§1.4). There are several subtleties involved in attempting to arrive at a consensus definition of classical chaos. One important proposal for a necessary condition is the presence of some form of stretching and folding mechanism associated with a nonlinearity in the system. However, since Schrödinger’s equation is linear, quantum mechanics is a linear theory, meaning quantum states starting out initially close remain just as close (in Hilbert space norm) throughout their evolution. Thus, in contrast to chaos in macroscopic physics, there’s no separation (exponential or otherwise) between quantum states under Schrödinger evolution. At most, wave packets can bifurcate and/or merge, which is a very different dynamics than that exhibited by classical trajectories.

Furthermore, another necessary condition for chaos is that a model or system be deterministic. Typically, QM is considered to be an example of an indeterministic theory. Although one can raise questions about the status of indeterminism in quantum mechanics, reasons for doubting that most, if not all, quantum systems are indeterministic are weak as these systems fail to exhibit unique evolution.

Moreover, global Lyapunov exponents cannot be defined in QM. Wave functions always must have finite sizes due to Heisenberg uncertainty, meaning infinitesimal separations cannot be defined and quantum-mechanical expectation values disagree with the state space average calculated for quasi-classical trajectories as in semi-classical approximations. Lyapunov exponents are only defined for trajectories in classical state spaces. Hence, along with aperiodic trajectories, most of the best candidates for necessary conditions for chaos appear to be missing from QM.

Even the toolkit for classical chaos is largely inapplicable in QM. Of course, techniques for calculating any kind of Lyapunov exponent are inapplicable. But strictly speaking, Poincaré surface-of-section plots are not well defined because surfaces in Hilbert space are not well defined for quantum systems. What usually happens in the quantum case is a switch to a semi-classical approximation involving letting Planck’s constant go to zero so that a surface can be defined.

Finally, an important difference between classical chaotic dynamics and quantum dynamics is that the state space of the former supports fractal structure while the state space of the latter doesn’t. Indeed, many of the issues just summarized can be traced back to the nature of the state space for quantum systems.

Researchers pursue, “the study of semiclassical, but nonclassical, phenomena characteristic of systems whose classical counterparts exhibit chaos” (Berry 1989, p. 335). It turns out that there are a number of remarkable behaviors exhibited by such quantized systems that are interesting in their own right. It’s these behaviors that raise questions about what form chaotic dynamics might take in the quantum domain and the validity of the correspondence principle. Moreover, these studies reveal further evidence that the relationship between the quantum and classical domains is subtle indeed.

Researchers in quantum chaology often focus on universal statistical properties that are independent of the quantum systems under investigation. In addition, studies focus on so-called simple quantum systems (i.e., those that can be described by a finite number of parameters or finite amount of information). The kinds of statistical properties studied in such systems include the statistics of energy levels and semi-classical structures of wave functions. These statistical properties are relevant for quantum state transitions, ionization, and other quantum phenomena found in atomic and nuclear physics, solid state physics of mesoscopic systems, and even quantum information. Some typical systems studied are quantum billiards (particles restricted to two-dimensional motions), the quantum kicked rotor, a single periodically driven spin, and coupled spins. Often, iterated maps are used in investigating quantum chaos just as in classical chaos.

Billiards are a particularly well-studied family of models. Think of a perfectly flat billiard table and assume that the billiard balls bounce off the edges of the table elastically. Such a model table at the macroscopic scale of our experience where the balls and edges are characterized by classical mechanics is called a classical billiard. Many analytic results have been worked out for classical billiards, making this a very attractive model to study. A chaotic billiard is a classical billiard where the conditions lead to chaotic behavior of the balls (e.g., aperiodic orbits and SDIC). Such analytical and computational riches have made quantum versions of billiards workhorses for studying quantum chaology. One can produce quantum billiards by using Schrödinger’s equation to describe particles reflecting off the boundaries (where one specifies that wave functions for particles are zero at a boundary), or one can start with the equations describing a classical billiard and quantize the observables (e.g., position and momentum), yielding quantized billiards.

To organize the discussion, isolated systems, where the energy spectra are discrete, will be treated first followed by interacting systems, where energy spectra are continuous. Some have argued that the isolation of quantum systems is important to whether chaos exists in the quantum realm.

### Q1 Does Quantum Chaos Exist? Isolated Systems

Classical chaotic dynamics has a continuous energy spectrum associated with its motion. As noted in the main article, classical chaos is usually considered to be a property of bounded macroscopic systems. In comparison, quantum dynamics in bounded, isolated systems has a discrete energy spectrum. Discrete spectra in dynamical systems theory are associated with integrable systems where chaotic behavior is impossible.

Moreover, phenomena such as SDIC could only be possible in quantum systems that appropriately mirror classical system behaviors. From semi-classical considerations, Berry et al. (1979) showed that semi-classical quantum systems (see below for how such systems are constructed) could be expected to mirror the behavior of their corresponding classical systems only up to the Ehrenfest time \(t_{E}\), of the order \(\ln(2\pi/h)\) secs, an estimate also known as the log time reflecting the exponential instability of classical chaotic trajectories. In these semi-classical studies, \(h/2\pi\) typically is treated as a parameter that is reduced in magnitude as the classical domain is approached. On this view, the smaller \(h/2\pi\), the more “classical” the system’s behavior becomes. For instance, assuming the value of Planck’s constant in KMS units, \(t_{E} \sim 80\) secs. As Planck’s constant decreases, \(t_{E}\) grows. In nonchaotic classical systems, orbits in state space are well isolated and well behaved for very long times.

In contrast for bound chaotic systems, orbits start coalescing in increasing numbers on the scale of \(t_{E}\), implying the semi-classical approximation fails once \(t_{E}\) is reached. On the other hand, a Gaussian wave packet centered on a classical trajectory is thought to be able to shadow that trajectory up to \(t_{E}\) before becoming too spread out over the energy surface since \(t_{E}\) is a measure of when quantum wave packets have spread too much to mimic classical trajectories and the Ehrenfest theorem breaks down. Hence, there are two effects at work in semi-classical systems over time: (1) the coalescing of classical chaotic trajectories and (2) the spreading of quantum wave packets. Given these effects and the linearity of Schrödinger’s equation, things look rather bleak for finding close quantum analogs of classical chaos.

While \(t_{E}\) represents an important limit for how long quantum state vectors can be expected to shadow classical trajectories, there are interesting behaviors in the semi-classical quantum models corresponding to classical chaotic systems on longer time scales. By performing a more detailed analysis, Tomsovic and Heller (1993) showed that comparing the full quantum solutions with suitably chosen semi-classical solutions for some billiards problems provided excellent agreement well after \(t_{E}\) including fine details of energy spectra. For their techniques, semi-classical mechanics remains accurate for modeling quantum systems up to a time that scales with \(1/\sqrt{(h/2\pi)}\).

The vast majority of these quantum chaology studies focus on three questions:

- What’s the behavior of quantized classically chaotic systems?
- Are there any quantum mechanical manifestations or “precursors” of classical chaos?
- Is there a rigorous distinction between chaotic and non-chaotic quantum systems?

The first two questions focus on different directions of research, both related to what is known as semi-classical mechanics. In the first, investigation starts with a classical chaotic system and seeks to quantize it to study its quantum behavior. To quantize a classical model, one replaces functions in the equations of motion with their corresponding quantum operators (e.g., position and momentum operators replace the classical variables for position and momentum). There are various results demonstrating that strongly ergodic classical billiards, when quantized, exhibit quantum ergodicity. But this isn’t the same as showing that a classical chaotic system, when quantized, exhibit the marks of classical chaotic behavior. There are no examples of the latter due to the reasons listed at the beginning of this subsection.

Furthermore, there are interesting numerical results on quantum
interference in quantized classical billiards (e.g., Casati and Prosen
2005). Consider a double slit with the source enclosed in a
two-dimensional wave resonator with the shape of a classical billiard.
Adjust the Gaussian wave packet’s initial average energy to be
one 1600^{th} of an excited state of the quantized billiard
and send it toward the resonator’s double slit opening. Let the
slit width be three de Broglie wavelengths, and suppose that the wave
packet is sharply peaked in momentum so that its spatial spread, by
the Heisenberg relations, is the width of the resonator. If the shape
of the resonator corresponds to a classical chaotic billiard, then
there is almost no quantum interference. In the classical case, the
multiply reflected waves would become randomized in phase. On the
other hand, if the shape of the resonator corresponds to a classical
regular billiard, then the well-known interference patterns emerge.
Hence, whether the corresponding classical billiard is chaotic or not
determines whether the quantized quantum analog exhibits
interference.

The second question starts with a quantum system that has some relationship with a classical chaotic system via an appropriate semi-classical limit. The classical-to-quantum direction often follows the pioneering work of Martin Gutzwiller (1971) using the Gutzwiller semi-classical trace formula. The quantum-to-classical direction is much more difficult and fraught with conceptual problems. Standard approaches, here, are to start with a quantum analog to a classical chaotic system and then derive a semi-classical system that represents the quantum system in some kind of classical limit (Berry 1987 and 2001; Bokulich 2008). This work results in statistics of suitably normalized energy levels for the semi-classical systems with universal features. For classical systems that behave non-chaotically, the energy levels of the semi-classical system approximate a Poisson distribution, where small level spacings dominate.

In contrast, when classical systems behave chaotically, the energy levels of the corresponding semi-classical systems take on a distribution originally derived by Eugene Wigner (1951) to describe nuclear energy spectra (for discussion see Guhr et al. 1998). These latter distributions depend only on symmetry properties (e.g., the presence or absence of time-reversal symmetry in the system). Wigner originally derived these distributions for complex (heavy) nuclei by assuming that, in the Heisenberg representation using typical basis vectors, the matrix elements of the Hamiltonian can be treated as if they are Gaussian random numbers. This produces a model, known as a random matrix model, that has no free parameters and is invariant under a wide range of change of bases. Wigner’s random matrix model was very successful in describing the energy spectra of complex quantum systems. Moreover, the presence of periodic orbits in the analog classical systems largely determine the properties of semi-classical systems (Berry 1977).

Regarding the third question, there’s no agreement on any one quantum property that could distinguish between non-chaotic quantum systems and quantum chaology (e.g., Weigert 1992).

Billiards system have been paradigm models for exploring chaotic dynamics, but typically these systems are modeled using point particles. Some have argued that exploring more physically realistic systems (e.g., particles of radius \(r > 0\) are better suited to studying quantum chaos. While it’s the case that tracking the motion of the center of a physical particle of finite radius is sufficient, transitioning from a point particle to one of finite radius is equivalent to making the billiard table smaller by a factor related to the size of the radius of the finite particle (i.e., a scale transformation). The interesting thing about this transition is that, for a billiard system with point particles exhibiting regular dynamics, transforming to finite particles can lead to chaotic behavior even though no parameter values have been changed in the equations describing the dynamical system. The reverse transition also is possible, where a chaotic billiards with finite-sized particles transitions to point particles will now exhibit regular orbits with no changes to parameter values. In essence, the particle radius becomes a parameter that must be taken into consideration when studying transitions to and from chaotic behavior.

One reason finite-sized particle billiards may be a more suitable context for studying quantum chaos in the semi-classical limit is that wave functions are always of finite size in quantum systems and global Lyapunov exponents are not definable in QM. Instead, the out-of-time-ordered correlator (OTOC) can be defined for quantum systems and, under some circumstances, exhibits exponential growth, which some have taken to be analogous to the global Lyapunov exponent in the semi-classical limit where Planck’s constant goes to zero (e.g., Rozenbaum, Ganeshan, and Galitski 2019). OTOCs were introduced in Larkin and Ovchinnikov (1969) to measure the instabilities of trajectories of electrons scattered by impurities in condensed matter physics. While it’s the case that OTOCs exhibit exponential growth for some semi-classical billiards (Rozenbaum, Ganeshan, and Galitski 2019), the analogy between OTOC and global Lyapunov exponents breaks down for other quantum systems (e.g., Rozenbaum, Ganeshan, and Galitski 2017). As well, some classical billiards exhibiting regular behavior have semi-classical quantum analogs that exhibit exponential growth of OTOCs (Rozenbaum, Ganeshan, and Galitski 2019; Hummel et al. 2019; Pilatowsky-Cameo et al. 2020), calling into question any classical-to-quantum correspondence in dynamics between classical and quantum (or semi-classical) billiards.

#### Q1.1 The Quantum Chaos Conjecture

Interestingly, many simple QM systems that have a “classical limit” where the corresponding classical models exhibit chaotic dynamics also display universal energy level fluctuations that are well described by Wigner’s methods (Casati, Guarneri, and Valz-Gris 1980; Bohigas, Giannoni, and Schmit 1984). These are low-dimensional systems with few degrees of freedom and no interactions taking place at different spatial scales, such as billiards systems. Work in this area has led to the quantum chaos conjecture:

**(Quantum Chaos Conjecture)** The short-range
correlations in the energy spectra of semi-classical quantum systems
which are strongly chaotic in a classical limit obey universal
fluctuation laws based on ensembles of random matrices without free
parameters.

This conjecture, also known as the Bohigas, Giannoni, and Schmit (1984) conjecture, proposes a relationship between classical chaos and random matrix theory, a model for describing the statistics of quantum spectra and wave functions that captures diverse properties of matrices with entries representing random probability distributions (Fyodorov 2011). Random matrix theory was introduced into nuclear physics and developed by Wigner in the 1950s (1955, 1957, 1958, 1967; see also Dyson 1962a,b,c, 1963a,b). The successful application of random matrices to the statistics of nuclei led to their broader application in other areas of physics.

The quantum chaos conjecture is motivated by accumulated evidence over the decades that the energy spectra of very simple non-integrable semi-classical models derived from classically chaotic models contain fluctuations that qualify as a universality class described by random matrix theory. Ian Percival (1973) was the first to propose that the statistics of random matrices could be used to formally distinguish the behavior of semi-classical quantized classically chaotic systems from the behavior of semi-classical quantized integrable systems lacking chaotic dynamics (though he mentions “random distributions” rather than random matrices). The assumption is that classical dynamics are a limit of quantum dynamics through the correspondence principle, implying that the kind of behavior exhibited by the classical dynamics related in this way should be reflected in the corresponding spectra.

Michael Berry and Michael Tabor (1977) demonstrated that, in the semi-classical limit, integrable systems of two or more degrees of freedom exhibit the same statistical properties as a pure random process (the exception being pathological cases, such as the harmonic oscillator). In effect, the energy levels are arranged with statistical independence as if one was drawing marbles out of a jar. Along with the original computer simulations of Bohigas, Giannoni, and Schmit (1984), other numerical and theoretical support for the conjecture taking a variety of approaches has been provided by Sieber and Steiner (1990), Andreev et al. (1993), Zirnbauer (1996), Horvat and Prosen (2003), Müller et al. (2005), Müller et al. (2009), and Atland et al. (2015). Some of these results are only valid for times up to \(t_{E}\), where quantum and classical motions are supposed to be indistinguishable. Nevertheless, a proof of the conjecture remains an open problem.

The spectra of quantum billiards in a semi-classical limit corresponding to a classical billiards exhibiting chaos being given by a Gaussian ensemble of real random matrices is a standard example of the conjecture. A hydrogen atom in a strong magnetic field and the excitation spectrum of nitrogen dioxide molecules, among other atomic and molecular systems, also are characterized by Gaussian ensembles of real random matrices. The theoretical and experimental results yield an inference to the best explanation of qualified support for the quantum chaos conjecture.

Given random matrix theory’s successful application to nuclear spectra and these classical results, seeking analog results for quantum systems with chaotic systems as an appropriate limit is reasonable. The quantum chaos conjecture basically means that the energy spectra for the semi-classical analog of classical chaotic systems are structurally the same as those in classical systems. Since this is a conjecture about semi-classical systems, the structure of the energy spectra of semi-classical systems is strictly dependent on chaos in the corresponding classical systems not on any chaotic behavior in quantum or semi-classical systems. But it’s important to remember that there are many non-chaotic system whose energy and other statistics are described by random matrices. The fact that any given system, quantum, semi-classical, or classical, may have characteristics described by random matrices is not a distinguishing mark of chaos though some of the quantum chaos literature suffers from this confusion (e.g., Ullmo 2016). Similar problems arise for taking the thermalization that results from chaotic dynamics in classical statistical mechanics and using thermalization in quantum systems as a mark of chaos (e.g., Rigol, Dunjko, and Olshanii 2008; Hallam, Morley, and Green 2019). There are many ways systems can approach thermodynamic equilibrium rendering thermalization an inappropriate signature of chaotic dynamics.

As in the discussion of chaos definitions (§1.4), something like chaos\(_{d\text{exp}}\) is needed but neither statistical signatures, such as random matrices, nor thermalization tell us anything distinct about chaotic dynamics, hence by themselves cannot distinguish chaos from other kinds of complex behavior.

#### Q1.2 Quantum-to-Classical Questions

One can raise serious questions about these quantum-to-classical studies, however. Semi-classical systems are derived using various asymptotic procedures (Berry 1987 and 2001), but these procedures don’t yield the actual classical systems assumed to be the limiting cases of the quantum systems. More importantly, the limiting relations between quantum and classical domains are different from those typically considered in semi-classical approaches (§Q3 below). The relationship between the mathematical results and actual quantum and classical physical systems is delicate. One of the reasons the quantum chaos conjecture remains unproven likely is that inappropriate notions of “classical limit” are being used. Even though energy level statistics for quantum billiards in the semi-classical counterparts to classical billiard systems share universal properties, actual behavior of the trajectories in classical and quantum systems is substantially different (e.g., under Schrödinger evolution Hilbert space vectors never diverge from one another).

Another fundamental problem is that classical chaos is a function of nonlinearities whereas Schrödinger’s equation describing quantum systems is linear. Empirical investigation of quantum chaology, hence, usually focuses on scattering processes (e.g., quantum billiards) and externally driven quantum systems (see next section). The focus in these studies is on the unpredictability of the time evolution of such systems and processes along with the structure of their energy levels. Although predictability limits is a feature of classical chaotic systems, there are many reasons why the time evolution of quantum systems may be as unpredictable (e.g., if commuting observables undergo complicated dynamics). It’s not clear unpredictability in scattering processes and externally driven quantum systems is due to any form of chaos.

Quantum systems do sometimes exhibit bifurcations. For instance, rotating molecules under some circumstances will undergo several consecutive qualitative changes interpreted as bifurcations (Zhilinskii 2001 and 2009). Whether there’s a series of bifurcations in such systems that could eventually lead to a transition to some form of quantum chaotic behavior is currently unknown. One reason to doubt such a transition is that the qualitative behaviors exhibited by quantum bifurcations don’t lead to a series of limit cycles as observed in the logistic map and other classical chaotic models. What typically happens in the quantum case in isolated systems is energy levels get reorganized among energy bands (Pierre, Sadovskii, and Zhilinskii 1989), or the quantum system transitions to a superposition of states, whereas the corresponding classical chaotic system chooses one or the other branch of a pitchfork bifurcation (Goto 2016; compare with Bishop 2023, p. 46, Figure 4.5).

There’s another fundamental limitation on any quantum system exhibiting the marks of classical chaos for bounded isolated systems. The time scale at which the evolution of such systems will become dominated by quantum fluctuations is given by the Heisenberg time, \(t_h = 2h\rho\), where \(\rho = dE_n/dn\)is the density of states. For the simple quantum systems we have been discussing, \(t_h\)is extremely short and offers little opportunity for chaotic behavior before it would be swamped out by fluctuations.

At best, quantum chaology in isolated systems has produced results having interesting relationships with integrable and non-integrable classical systems and some important experimental results (e.g., Bayfield and Koch 1974; Berry 2001; Casati, Chirikov, Izrailev, and Ford 1979; Casati, Chirikov, and Shepelyanski 1984; Fishman, Grempel, and Prange 1982) These relationships are all statistical. One issue with studying isolated, closed quantum systems is that the state spaces of these systems don’t allow the formation of the state-space structures typically associated with classical chaotic systems. There are some exceptions discussed in the literature, but it’s ambiguous if these are genuine cases of chaos. One example discussed in the literature is a quantum Hamiltonian operator for an \(N\)-dimensional torus: \(\frac{1}{2}(g_{k} n_{k} + n_{k} g_{k})\), where \(n_{k} = -i\partial / \partial \theta_{k}\) and \(\theta_{k}\) is an angle variable, and \(d\theta_{i} /dt = g_{i}(\theta_{k})\)for \(i, k = 1, 2,3,\ldots, N\) (Chirikov, Izrailev, and Shepelyanski 1988, p. 79). The probability density for momentum grows exponentially fast, which looks like a parallel to SDIC for trajectories in the classical case. But this is different from the growth in uncertainties exhibited by classical chaotic systems. And there’s no principled reason for considering exponential growth in some quantity by itself as a mark of chaos (see examples in Supplement: Chaos Definition Counterexamples).

Building on the numerical results of the double-slit/billiard wave resonator described above, it may be possible to apply quantum chaology to the quantum measurement problem. Typically, models for quantum measurement describe the destruction of coherent quantum states as an effect of external noise or the environment. These quantum chaology results could allow the development of a dynamical theory of quantum decoherence due to the interaction between a classical chaotic (or at least non-integrable) system and coherent quantum states producing the incoherent mixtures observed in measurement devices. These considerations lead us to interacting systems.

### Q2 Does Quantum Chaos Exist? Interacting Systems

In bounded systems, quantum interference effects tend to rapidly suppress any features resembling the chaotic dynamics for macroscopic chaotic models that are quantized. In interacting quantum systems, the same statistical behavior as captured by random matrix models often occurs (e.g., Chan et al. 2022; Dağ et al. 2023) along with thermalization of quantum systems (e.g., Chan, De Luca, and Chalker 2021), so quantum chaology exists for such systems under suitable parameter settings. But as discussed earlier, it’s misleading to call these signatures of chaos. It’s possible in driven quantum many-body systems to take combinations of operators, such as the dual transfer matrix product, and find them characterized by exponentials with exponents that often get called “Lyapunov exponents.” But the dual transfer matrix product grows exponentially with system size (e.g., Chan, De Luca, and Chalker 2021). While this may have a connection with the thermodynamic limit, it has nothing to do with chaotic dynamics or Lyapunov exponents for that matter.

The failure to find the features of classical chaos in quantum systems is usually diagnosed as due to the linear nature of Schrödinger’s equation. And the evidence from isolated quantum systems discussed above substantiates this diagnosis. What about interacting quantum systems (also known as open quantum systems)? At first glance, one can argue that the linearity of Schrödinger’s equation implies nearby quantum states will always remain nearby as they evolve in time. However, some alternative possibilities for possible chaotic behavior have been proposed for interacting quantum systems.

Fred Kronz (1998, 2000) has argued that focusing on the separable/nonseparable Hamiltonian distinction is more appropriate than nonlinearity for quantum chaos (§1.5). Although Schrödinger’s equation is linear, there are many examples of nonseparable Hamiltonians in QM. A prime example would be Hamiltonians describing interaction between measurement devices and quantum systems. In such situations, the quantum system-measurement apparatus compound system can evolve from a tensor product state to a nonseparable entangled state represented by an irreducible superposition of tensor product states. A second ubiquitous example would be the famous Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen correlations. Although many, such as Robert Hilborn (1994, 549–569), have argued that the unitary evolution of quantum systems makes SDIC impossible for quantum mechanics, these arguments don’t take into account that interacting quantum systems typically have nonseparable Hamiltonians.

For interacting quantum systems, Schrödinger’s equation is no longer valid and one typically turns to so-called master equations to describe evolution (Davies 1976). Such equations typically have nonseparable Hamiltonians. In general, the time evolution of the components of such interacting systems is nonunitary, implying there’s no formal prohibition against quantum states diverging from each other. Moreover, an important contrast between isolated and interacting quantum systems is that while the former have discrete energy spectra, the latter have continuous spectra. A continuous energy spectrum is characteristic of classical macroscopic systems. Nevertheless, work in interacting quantum systems largely has only uncovered the same kinds of universal statistical characteristics of energy spectra and fluctuations as found in isolated systems (e.g., Filikhin, Matinyan and Vlahovic 2011; Guhr, Müller-Groeling and Weidenmüller 1998; Ponomarenko, et al. 2008). One reason for this situation, is interacting quantum systems have an infinite number of degrees due to dissipation or noise introduced by an environment (e.g., a “heat bath”) that has infinite degrees of freedom. Although the usual procedure is to find some way to trace over or integrate out the infinite degrees of freedom, producing a finite number, this doesn’t adequately resolve the mismatch between infinite degrees of freedom in quantum open systems versus the finite degrees of freedom possessed by their classical counterparts.

It’s often the case that the quantum chaos literature uses a broader notion of chaos as behavior that “cannot be described as a superposition of independent one-dimensional motions” (Ponomarenko, et al. 2008, p. 357)—in other words, a form of inseparability. Still, the chaology in interacting quantum systems looks to be the same as in isolated systems: “Quantum mechanically, chaotic systems are characterized by distinctive statistics of their energy levels, which must comply with one of the Gaussian random ensembles, in contrast to the level statistics for the nonchaotic systems described by the Poisson distribution” (p. 357). This is largely due to the fact that quantum chaology is closely tied to universal statistical patterns in quantum systems that share some relationship with classical chaotic counterpart systems as discussed in §Q.1 above.

One of the measures used to detect chaotic behavior in classical systems is a positive Kolmogorov entropy, which can be related to Lyapunov exponents (e.g., Atmanspacher and Scheingraber 1987). Unfortunately, there are no appropriate analogs for Lyapunov exponents in QM. One could use alternative entropy measures, for instance, the von Neumann, Connes-Narnhofer-Thirring, or reduced density linear entropies. However, there are many open questions about which, if any, of these entropy measures is the appropriate quantum analog (likely they are each appropriate for particular research purposes depending on the question being pursued). Moreover, while these measures have a relationship to the statistics of energy levels and states characteristic of quantum chaology, there currently are no other known features of quantum systems that these measures could relate to corresponding to chaotic behavior observed in classical trajectories. For instance, the reduced density linear entropy has been used to estimate the growth of entanglement in quantum decoherence for quantum systems that have a classical counterpart exhibiting chaos (e.g., Furuya, Nemes, and Pellegrino 1998; Zurek and Paz 1995), but the estimated exponential increase in environmental entanglement has no relationship to the global Lyapunov exponent discussed in chaos literature or any other discernible marks of classical chaos. Such quantum effects are interesting in their own right, but to call them “chaos” is misleading.

There has been work in driven quantum systems that seems to show a relationship between pitchfork bifurcations of some classical Hamiltonian dynamical systems and changes to ground state entanglement in their corresponding quantum analogs (e.g., Hines, McKenzie, and Milburn 2005; Nemes et al. 2006; Schneider and Milburn 2002). Consider a quantum system whose semi-classical limit exhibits a pitchfork bifurcation (not necessarily a bifurcation in the context of a sequence of period doublings as in the logistic map; this depends on the nature of the specific semi-classical system dynamics). The quantum system exhibits a phase transition at a critical point corresponding to parameter values where the corresponding semi-classical system exhibits a pitchfork bifurcation of its fixed point attractor. This quantum critical point is a point of peak entanglement with respect to parameters such as the coupling strength between quantum spins or the linear entropy of the system. Nevertheless, such interesting behavior bears no relationship to classical chaotic dynamics.

Or consider a Bose-Hubbard boson system for \(N\) interacting bosons (e.g., Fisher et al. 1989; Le Boité, Orso, and Ciuti 2014). As an interacting system, the master equation is based on this Hamiltonian. Everything about the master equation is deterministic. In simple terms, in Bose-Hubbard systems bosons hop from site to site (think of atoms hoping from one lattice point to another or photons tunneling from one optical cavity to another), where creation and annihilation operators describe the hoping dynamics as the annihilation of a boson at a site and the creation of a boson at a neighboring site. A boson will hop to one site with a probability independent of all other bosons. Hence, there is a finite probability that there will be zero, all, or any number in between of bosons at a given site. This means there is a probabilistic possibility for bosons to interact with each other. The drive function (often a laser) can be manipulated to produce a context where bosons are more localized, which is equivalent to reducing the amount of hopping (i.e., reducing the probabilities for interaction among bosons). Often, a mean-field approximation is used to reduce the multi-site Hamiltonian to an effective single-site Hamiltonian. To connect the quantum dynamics to a semi-classical model, an approximation can be used, where the quantum master equation gets replaced by a semi-classical equation and the attractor solutions for both equations compared (e.g., Ivanchenko et al. 2017).

For the stationary state case where the system isn’t driven, a change from a distribution of bosons at one location to a bimodal distribution (occupation of bosons at two locations) occurs as the interaction strength among the bosons is increased. This change in distribution is interpreted as a quantum pitchfork bifurcation. Both the master and mean-field equations exhibit this transition and the transition in the mean-field case can be related to the pitchfork bifurcation from one stable attractor to a stable period two attractor in the semi-classical model. Increasing the interaction strength can produce a bifurcation with three maxima for the boson occupation distribution so long as the tunneling amplitude is small (so-called hopping). However, the latter quantum bifurcation has no semi-classical counterparts. Quantum bifurcations manifest in structural changes in the stationary density matrix (i.e., the boson location occupations in the quantum ground state); there’s no instability in the quantum system’s steady state. This behavior contrasts with how pitchfork bifurcations in the logistic map mark when a stable fixed point has become an unstable one (Bishop 2023). Moreover, some of the behavior exhibited by the quantum Hamiltonian model is absent from the mean-field model.

When the periodic drive is turned on, the classical analog manifests a period doubling sequence leading to chaotic dynamics similar to the logistic map. For the mean-field model, it’s possible to drive the system through a series of period doublings and produce a plot reminiscent of classical chaos, but no analysis has been done to study anything beyond the surface similarities of the plots of maxima in the diagonal matrix elements (compare figures 4a and 4b in Ivanchenko et al. 2017). Instead, to resolve the details using the quantum Hamiltonian, many more particles are needed and Ivanchenko et al. switch to what is sometimes called the quantum trajectory method but actually is a Monte Carlo method for tracking quantum jumps (Plenio and Knight 1998). Hence, despite its name, there are no trajectories (a source of confusion in the literature). This calculation yields expectation values for the number of particles at the first site at different discrete moments in time. Sampling the data points at these discrete times produces a series of maxima and minima in the diagonal elements of the asymptotic density matrix resembling the structure of the mean-field model, but the authors don’t make clear what chaos means for the quantum Hamiltonian model given there are no trajectories. It’s also possible to drive a bifurcation in the latter model that has no correspondence to either the mean-field or semi-classical models.

Similarly, for other work on interacting Bose-Hubbard models. Consider a ring of three coupled cavities and a chiral drive for photons in the cavities (Dahan, Arwas, and Grosfeld 2022). Photons are bosons, so one can consider a Bose-Hubbard Hamiltonian for the photons with a driving term coherent with respect to both frequency and momentum. In a classical model developed through a mean-field approximation (little photon-photon interaction, cavities become classical coupled nonlinear oscillators), a classical setting can be achieved and the dynamics of the oscillators exhibit a positive Lyapunov exponent and a strange attractor can appear due to dissipation in the system. But when photon interactions are too strong, no classical model can be approximated nor can the boson statistics of the photons be modeled by any classical means. Again, the photon occupations are tracked by a reduced density matrix for the coupled cavities. The authors use a Monte Carlo simulation for the evolution of the boson system from an initial vacuum state. The simulations produce dense occupation of an attractor in state space, OTOC sensitive dependence on the strength of weak perturbations from the chiral drive, and exponential growth in the OTOC. Remarkably, they use the term “classical chaotic basin” of attraction without any discussion of the differences between the classical and quantum state spaces, the lack of trajectories in the latter, or even the meaning of correlation functions in the case of classical trajectories versus discrete hopping of photons from one cavity to another in the quantum case. Given that strange attractors are only supported by classical state spaces, there’s something sloppy going on here. This is an example of how confusing classical and quantum concepts and observables can lead to inappropriate characterizations of quantum behavior. The authors can only mean that some of the characteristics of quantum chaology show up in their quantum system under chiral driving while the analog classical system, living in a different state space with a different algebra of observables, exhibits marks of chaotic dynamics.

There is an interesting physical model of a charged particle in a unit square having periodic boundary conditions with an external electromagnetic field that occasionally gives it a kick (turns on and off). Mathematically, this model is a generalization of the quantized Arnold cat map (Arnold and Avez 1968; Weigert 1990 and 1993). Physically, it represents a charged particle confined to a torus-shaped energy surface that receives kicks from an external field. The classical model has trajectories exhibiting the stretching and folding process that seems to be a necessary condition for chaos, has positive Lyapunov exponents, and is algorithmically complex, one of the measures used to detect classical chaos. Its trajectories have many of the marks of chaos. For the quantum model, the kick of the electromagnetic field has the effect of mapping the quantum labels of state vectors that are initially close together to labels which do not necessarily ever come close again. This is somewhat reminiscent of the divergence of classical chaotic trajectories except that it’s the change in the state labels that’s the phenomenon of interest. This leads to an absolutely continuous quasi-energy spectrum (the quasi-energy is defined as the set of numbers representing the “energy” in the evolution operator acting on state vector labels). The expectation value of the particle position becomes unpredictable with respect to the initial state label after long times and one can show that the sequence of shifts of the quantum state labels is algorithmically complex. Moreover, a “distance” between the labels can be defined that increases exponentially with time.

This is the most convincing example in quantum chaology of behavior analogous to classical chaos. Nonetheless, there are questions about whether the behavior of the sequences of quantum state labels is enough to qualify the system as chaotic. For one thing, the quantum chaos conjecture is inapplicable to this system due to the continuous spectrum of the quasi-energy. More importantly, as discussed in the main article, exponential divergence by itself is neither necessary nor sufficient to characterize a system as chaotic (hence neither is algorithmic complexity). There are many examples of systems that are algorithmically complex but aren’t chaotic. For instance, long randomly generated bit strings, no matter how they were obtained, are algorithmically complex but need not have any relationship to chaos.

Or consider the dynamical system

\[\begin{aligned} {dx} \over {dt} &= -2yt \\ {dy} \over {dt} &= 2xt \end{aligned}\]whose solution is a linear combinations of sine and cosine functions. The average autocorrelation function is zero everywhere except at \(x = y = 0\), so the behavior of solutions is random, but there is no SDIC (or even WSD) and no exponential growth in uncertainty. The solutions are algorithmically complex but exhibit no indications of chaotic dynamics.

In summary, the behavior of the quantum labels for a kicked particle is irregular to be sure, and while the quantum label dynamics may be algorithmically complex, the actual temporal evolution of the state vectors is algorithmically compressible, so not irregular in any way.

It’s the case that very interesting behavior is explored in quantum chaology, but any connections to the characteristics of classical chaotic dynamics is tenuous at best. Yet, these quantum chaotic properties have actual-world implications. For instance, in quantum computing, it is challenging to prevent information loss in quantum states due to decoherence (e.g., entanglement with the environment). Protocols taking advantage of quantum chaology can actually counteract decoherence effects by spreading information among quantum states preserving information from the initial state (e.g., Harris, Yan, and Sinitsyn 2022). Interestingly, whereas classical chaotic processes tend to spread initial state information over the entire accessible state space, thereby losing information, quantum chaology properties tend to preserve initial state information.

### Q3 The Validity of the Correspondence Principle

The kind of behavior observed in quantum chaology involves the statistics of energy states in quantum systems that have some kind of relationship to semi-classical chaotic systems. Important features of classical chaos, such as SDIC and the exponential growth in uncertainty, the period doubling route to chaos, aperiodic trajectories, apparent randomness, among others, are absent from both closed and interacting quantum systems so far as we currently know. Indeed, some physicists and philosophers recognize there are no direct analogs of classical chaos in quantum systems, so the most that can be hoped for is interesting quantum chaology signatures in quantum systems where the corresponding classical system exhibits chaotic dynamics (e.g., Cushing 2000; Emary and Brandes 2003). These signatures do not resemble classical chaos. Instead, the quantum signatures are features such as the statistics of random matrices, repulsion among energy levels, specific forms of energy level dynamics, and growth in quantities such as OTOCs or entanglement in ground states. Hence, it’s much better to use the term “quantum chaology” rather than “quantum chaos” as the latter misleadingly draws readers into thinking of classical chaos.

The strong distinction between quantum chaology and classical chaos
has led to arguments that the correspondence principle between quantum
and classical mechanics fails and that the former may be incomplete
(e.g., Ford 1992). The correspondence principle can be understood
broadly to mean that, as a quantum system system is scaled up to
macroscopic size, its behavior should become more like a classical
system. Alternatively, the behavior of a quantum model should
reproduce the behavior of macroscopic classical models in the limit of
large quantum numbers. The correspondence principle is sometimes
conceived as letting Planck’s constant go to zero. Nevertheless,
all these conceptions are problematic. Since *h*
is a constant of nature, it can never change value, much less go to
zero. One always has to speak of relevant limits of ratios of the
classical to quantum actions, for example. In such limits,
Planck’s constant maintains its value. Moreover, these limits
are singular, meaning the smooth behavior of a quantity or pattern is
disrupted, often by becoming infinite (Friedrichs 1955; Dingle 1973;
Primas 1998). There’s no straightforward sense in which quantum
models become increasingly similar to macroscopic systems as quantum
numbers get large. The behavior of semi-classical systems actually
illustrates this discontinuity.

Joseph Ford offers a different construal of the correspondence
principle: “any two valid physical theories which have an
overlap in their domains of validity must, to relevant accuracy, yield
the same predictions for physical observations.” In the case of
quantum and Newtonian mechanics, this means “quantum mechanics
must, in general, agree with the predictions of Newtonian mechanics
when the systems under study are macroscopic” (1992, p. 1087).
He goes on to spell out in his *American Journal of Physics*
article that “The very essence of correspondence lies in the
notion that quantum mechanics can describe events in the macroscopic
world without any limit taking. Were this not the case, then there
would be no overlap in the quantal and classical regions of
validity” (1992, p. 1088). Sir Michael Berry is even more
direct: “all systems,” even our orbiting moon, “obey
the laws of quantum mechanics” (Berry 2001, p. 42). The upshot
for chaos is that “if there is chaos (however defined) in the
macroscopic world, quantum mechanics must also exhibit precisely the
same chaos, else quantum mechanics is not as general a theory as
popularly supposed” (Ford 1992, p. 1088).

Gordon Belot and John Earman (1997) offer another version of the problem. A weak enough correspondence principle will (1) apply only to physically realistic classical models, and (2) require only that predictions from classical models and their quantized quantum counterparts applied to macroscopic situations agree within experimental error. Weakening this to just requiring QM “reproduce to within experimental error the verifiable predictive successes of [classical mechanics] in macroscopic experiments on actual physical systems,” removes the need for QM to reproduce results of classical models that haven’t been applied to actual physical systems. Then Belot and Earman claim that the failure of such a weak correspondence principle would “be a direct challenge to either the completeness or the truth of QM” (p. 163).

Belot and Earman try to overcome this problem by appealing to two cases. First, for very short times, wave packets in some quantum systems mirror classical trajectories, where these wave packets exhibit exponential divergence from each other. As discussed in the main article, however, there’s no reason to think mere exponential divergence by itself is a mark of chaotic behavior. Second, for long times (i.e., in the \(t \rightarrow \infty\) limit), there’s an appropriate classical limit where strong mixing emerges, but strong mixing is neither necessary nor sufficient by itself to be a mark of chaotic behavior (§1.3)

As seen in this entire supplement, classical chaotic behavior isn’t recovered in quantum chaology, and this leads to Ford’s dilemma: Either the correspondence principle is false or QM is incomplete. Ford rejects the first horn of the dilemma. Therefore, the problem must lie with QM: Its lack of chaos reveals some incompleteness in the theory. Something is missing.

This dilemma represents a false forced choice, however. The way Ford (and to some degree Berry, Belot and Earman, among others) describes things bespeaks a common misconception of the relationship between the quantum and classical domains. Much as he makes of the subtlety of limiting relations—and they are subtle and singular—his discussion of the correspondence principle turns on an overly simple relationship between the quantum and classical domains. That overly simple relationship presupposes QM fully explains or reproduces classical phenomena. Under such a presupposition, if the marks of classical chaos either are absent in QM or if the latter cannot explain or reproduce classical chaos, then QM is incomplete.

The relationship between the quantum and classical domains is nontrivial. First, it doesn’t involve a “classical limit,” but a series of limits of the ratio of quantum observables involving Planck’s constant and classical physical observables, where these ratios go to zero (e.g., relevant classical and quantum actions), or limits involving the separation of nuclear and electronic frames of motion (in the case of chemistry) among others. All of these limits involve singular asymptotic series; hence, the relationship between quantum classical phenomena isn’t one involving anything like bridge laws relating the two domains as Nagelian and other forms of reduction would require. There’s a change in the character of the states and observables going from quantum to classical domains. Classical states and observables are neither a function of nor straightforwardly related to intrinsic states and observables in quantum mechanics (e.g., Bishop 2019).

Second, even starting with the quantum domain, there are different classical worlds resulting from taking these various limits in different orders. Since these limits correspond to different physical transitions, changing the order of the limits changes the order of physical transitions yielding physically inequivalent macroscopic domains. Given the physical incompatibility among these different macroscopic worlds, the actual physical transitions between the quantum and classical must occur in a particular order to recover the classical domain of our experience.

Of course, there’s much discussion of the “approximately classical” or “quasi-classical” trajectories for quantum systems derived from semi-classical considerations (e.g., Berry 1987 and 2001). But such quasi-classical behavior is exhibited only for limited times (except for overly idealized models) and under very special initial conditions for ground states only (Pauli 1933, p. 166). Excited energy eigenstates never show classical behavior. Appeal to Ehrenfest’s theorem doesn’t help, because all it guarantees for such very special, short-lived dynamics is that the usual physics practice of averaging the values of the quantum observables tends to wash out the errors or differences between the classical and quantum calculations for contextually relevant situations and times. Moreover, the theorem is neither necessary nor sufficient for classical behavior. For instance, applying Ehrenfest’s theorem to a quantum harmonic oscillator yields average quantities for the position and momentum that track with the classical quantities for some brief time. Yet, the quantum oscillator’s discrete states yield thermodynamic properties very different from a classical oscillator. Hence, satisfying the theorem is insufficient to guarantee classical behavior.

Third, the emergence of our classical world isn’t merely a matter of environmental decoherence (e.g., Omnés 1994; Berry 2001; Wallace 2012). For one thing, there’s no context-free limit of infinitely many degrees of freedom because this limit always has uncountably infinitely many physically inequivalent representations. Moreover, it’s simply false that an improper mixture of quantum states “allows one to interpret the state of the [quantum] system in terms of a classical probability distribution,” such that “it is useful to regard ‘mixed states’ as effectively classical,” so that “one can interpret the system described by [a nonpure density operator] in terms of a classical ‘mixture’ with the exact state of the system unknown to the observer” (Zurek 1991, 46–47). Impure quantum states can be interpreted as classical mixtures if and only if their components are described by disjoint states. For a classical mixture of two pure states, the pure states are disjoint if and only if there exists a classical observable such that the expectation values with respect to these states are different. It’s this disjointness that makes it possible to distinguish states in a classical manner (think water and oil).

One might turn to Bohmian mechanics (Bohmian Mechanics and Philosophical Issues in Quantum Theory) for an approach to QM’s relationship to chaos. As is well-known, following David Bohm’s (1952) proposal produces a separation of Schrödinger’s equation into a set of coupled equations describing how particles (and their trajectories) behave under the guiding action of a quantum potential. Bohm restricted the phase of the wave function to a subset that satisfies a continuity equation to ensure the gradient of the phase is single-valued. Otherwise, there’s a larger set of solutions that violate this continuity condition and yield statistical predictions at odds with QM.

James Cushing (2000), like others, acknowledges that the actual issue is the relationship between the quantum and classical domains. Peter Holland (1993) has a good discussion of the problematic nature of various correspondence-principle-like approaches to reducing classical mechanics to Bohmian mechanics (e.g., such as letting Planck’s constant go to zero or using a limit of large quantum numbers) and why not to expect everything in classical mechanics to be captured by a Bohmian approach. From this perspective, the “classical limit” is when the quantum potential goes to zero meaning that it makes negligible contributions to the behavior of classical particles and systems. But since the quantum potential depends on the wave function for the system, not all quantum systems should be expected to have a classical limit corresponding to a classical macroscopic system.

Even the idea of the classical realm being a limit of the quantum realm when the quantum potential goes to zero is misleading given that the Bohmian ontology already represents an algebra of observables for quantum particles that are classical (e.g., position and momentum for particle trajectories); it’s the quantum potential that does all the “quantum work” as the wave function serves as guide for the classical trajectories. Hence, systems in Bohmian mechanics already are quantum/classical systems. Furthermore, there are examples where trajectories are chaotic in Bohmian mechanics but regular in the corresponding classical system in the limit when the quantum potential goes to zero (e.g., Cushing 2000; Contopoulos and Tzemos 2020). Finally, one has to seek the specific conditions under which the quantum/classical system in Bohmian mechanics goes over into a purely classical system as the quantum potential becomes negligible.

Nevertheless, using Bohmian mechanics, there has been effort concentrated on finding aperiodic trajectories that diverge from each other exponentially quickly. And given the quantum/classical nature of the systems and the presence of classical trajectories, it’s not surprising that for open or interacting systems, some marks of classical chaos, such as SDIC, appear among the classical variables describing the trajectories (e.g., Dürr, Goldstein, Zanghi 1992; Faisal and Schwengelbeck 1995; Ivanov, Nam, and Kim 2019; Polavieja 1996; Bonfim, Florencio, and Sá Barreto 1998).

Of course, there are issues with Bohmian mechanics and chaos. First, particle trajectories are undetectable at quantum length scales, raising questions about how one should interpret any putative marks of classical chaos at these scales. Second, Bohmian quantum systems don’t generally exhibit the marks of quantum chaology. Third, even though Bohmian mechanics is deterministic and nonlinear, chaos isn’t produced by stretching and folding mechanisms, as in classical dynamical systems, but by trajectories coming close to the nodal points, where the equations of motion become singular when the wave function equals zero (Contopoulos and Tzemos 2020). Hence, the mechanism generating chaos in Bohmian mechanics is different from the mechanisms in classical systems. This result has implications for thinking that classical physical systems are a limiting case of Bohmian systems as the quantum potential goes to zero, returning us to the question of the relationship between QM and the macroscopic world.

In summary, there’s nothing in the quantum domain by itself that determines the character of the classical domain (though the former provides some necessary conditions for the latter). Hence, classical chaos, along with many other classical features, is emergent in a more complex, subtle sense than Ford and others allow (§6.2). The correspondence principle must reflect emergent classicality if it’s to be a viable principle, which means that the implicit assumption of reductionism in Ford’s discussions of quantum chaology should be abandoned. Once the reductionist assumption is removed, the disparity between quantum chaology and classical chaos no longer calls an appropriately formulated, nuanced correspondence principle into question. This resolves the first horn of the dilemma.

The second horn of the dilemma likewise is resolved. It’s worth recalling that the state spaces of dynamical systems of classical physics are distinctly different from the Hilbert spaces of QM. For instance, the latter cannot support the infinitely repetitive structure of strange attractors though the former can—different observables, different dynamics, different state spaces. It’s not as if something is missing from QM as Ford and others would have it. The quantum domain is qualitatively different from the macroscopic domain of classical mechanics, hydrodynamics, and the like.

Another suggestion for resolving the state space mismatch problem is to switch to the Koopman approach (Koopman 1931; Kooopman and von Neumann 1932; Belot and Earman 1997), where everything quantum and classical is defined in a suitable Hilbert space. However, this shifts the objects for analysis away from trajectories to probability distributions and their dynamics. The implication is that all the properties and tools for characterizing chaos are inapplicable and one is left with the dynamics of energy distributions, random matrices, diffusion processes and so forth. In other words, one is left with the properties and tools of quantum chaology, which we have seen are insufficient to distinguish chaotic dynamics from other kinds of dynamics. Hence, the Koopman approach is ineffective for chaos studies.

Two examples illustrate how subtle the quantum-classical relationship is.

#### Q3.1 Born-Oppenheimer Systems and Chaos

The Born-Oppenheimer procedure (Born and Oppenheimer 1927) implements a stability condition representing the physical significance of nuclear mass, accounting for nuclear motion being much slower than that of electrons. This basic stability condition lies behind all adiabatic procedures, and involves an asymptotic ratio of electron to nuclear masses that becomes singular in the limit of large nuclear mass. This amounts to treating the nucleus as if it’s almost stationary with respect to electron motions resulting in (1) breaking entanglements between electron and nuclear frames, (2) breaking permutation, rotational and translational symmetries, and (3) distinguishable electrons. Indeed, the so-called clamped nucleus assumption (e.g., Born-Oppenheimer and other adiabatic procedures) is the only known approach yielding self-adjoint Hamiltonians for quantum chemistry (Sutcliffe and Woolley 2012). Such systems are characterized by new mixed quantum/classical algebras of observables (having classical observables as their center among quantum observables) describing the motion of nucleons and electrons.

The resulting quantum/classical system is nonlinear, hence a possibility for chaotic dynamics. When studying a one-dimensional molecule, a Poincaré surface of section plot can be used to track the classical position and momentum phase space. Under the constraint of a harmonic potential with particular parameter choices, Blümel and Esser (1994) report evidence for chaotic dynamics though they don’t offer details from the usual classical marks for chaotic behavior. Instead, they turn for verification to the quantum variables, plotting the amplitudes for different initial conditions on the Bloch sphere. These amplitudes diverge from each other with exponential separation characterized by a positive “Lyapunov exponent.” But Blümel and Esser don’t explain why this exponent is an appropriate analog for Lyapunov exponents in macroscopic contexts given that the quantum variables don’t permit appropriate notions of trajectory associated with such exponents. The most they’ve demonstrated is (1) emergence of a quantum/classical system and (2) this system has a characteristic from the quantum chaology zoo, while the classical variables tracked in a Poincaré surface of section look chaotic.

As is typical, classical variables, treated as a dynamical subsystem, exhibit marks of classical chaos while quantum variables don’t.

#### Q3.2 Tunneling and Chaos

Tunneling is a quintessential quantum phenomenon. There’s some evidence that when a classical model is chaotic, its quantum analog will exhibit effects on quantum tunneling. Consider a particle in a double-well potential. In the textbook case with no driving force, a low energy particle is confined to one well of the potential, while for high-energies the particle may cross over the hump, moving from one well to another. The hump in the energy barrier provides a natural separation of the low-energy from high-energy orbits in the position-momentum phase space. Applying an oscillating driving force produces a chaotic layer in phase space, whose size depends on the amplitude and frequency of the driving force (Reichl and Zheng 1984). This chaotic layer influences which orbits of various energies may cross from one well to the other.

In the quantum analog textbook case, even though the energy barrier between wells is classically impenetrable, quantum tunneling leads to a probability for particles to pass from one well to another. Now apply a periodic driving force and the tunneling rate will be significantly greater than the textbook case in those regions of phase space of the quantum model corresponding to the aperiodicity of the chaotic layer in the classical case (Lin and Ballentine 1990). The driven model is developed by taking the classical driven system’s Hamiltonian and replacing the classical position and momentum variables by their quantum operator counterparts, a semi-classical approximation. The presence of chaos in the classical state space determines the tunneling rate in the corresponding semi-classical quantum model, with particles starting in regions of the semi-classical state space corresponding to classically regular orbits exhibiting normal tunneling rates while those in regions corresponding to classically chaotic orbits exhibit significantly higher tunneling rates. Interestingly, quantum particles starting off in phase space regions corresponding to classically regular orbits can tunnel to other regions corresponding to classically regular orbits avoiding any phase space regions associated with classical chaos. These tunneling particles maintain their coherence oscillating back and forth between phase space regions corresponding to classically regular orbits and never spread into regions corresponding to classically chaotic orbits as if ignoring what can be a rather large zone of chaotic behavior in the corresponding classical state space.

Similar behavior is seen in more complex semi-classical models involving multiple degrees of freedom such as two coupled quartic oscillators (e.g., Tomsovic and Ullmo 1994). Note that the double-well potential is a one-degree-of-freedom model. For the classical model, with zero coupling between the two oscillators, the system only exhibits regular oscillatory motion. As the coupling is increased, the system enters a quasi-integrable regime, where some chaotic regions begin to appear, and finally reaches a regime where the state space exhibits widespread aperiodic orbits and SDIC.

To obtain the quantum analog model, position and momentum variables in the Hamiltonian for the classical case are replaced by quantum operators and Planck’s constant is allowed to increase from zero. Tunneling between the two quantized oscillators is affected in regions of the state space corresponding to chaotic dynamics in the classical model state space as the coupling increases and Planck’s constant increases. This produces erratic energy splittings for the discrete energy levels of the oscillators, the statistics of which are described by random matrices. Once again, the chaotic dynamics of the classical model affects the tunneling in the corresponding semi-classical quantum model.

Hence, there is no reason to suspect that there is some kind of inadequacy in QM if features such as chaos are contextually emergent in the classical domain, unless one is wedded to reductionism (Bishop, Silberstein, and Pexton 2022). Neither the generality nor the validity of QM is in question. Nor does the complex, subtle emergent relationship between the quantum and classical domains imply that the two domains are nonoverlapping or disjoint. Rather, the overlap between the quantum and classical is partial and nontrivial. QM is universally applicable in providing some necessary conditions for the existence of the macroscopic world (no electrons, protons, and neutrons, no weather systems), but this in no way implies QM alone universally governs macroscopic behavior. QM contributes some of the necessary conditions for classical properties and behaviors, but no sufficient conditions. One indicator of this is that classical mechanics is formulated in terms of continuous trajectories of individual particles through spacetime, while QM is formulated in terms of probabilities and wave functions. There are deep conceptual differences between the classical and the quantum. Even if one uses Bohm’s version of QM, which has continuous particle trajectories in spacetime, there still are important conceptual and physical/metaphysical differences as noted above (e.g., the presence of an all-pervasive quantum potential in Bohm’s theory).

This suggests that we shouldn’t expect individual continuous trajectories to result from QM in contextually inappropriate limits nor that QM should exhibit the full range of classical behaviors, contrary to Ford and others. Instead, we should expect that quantum probabilities recover the classical probabilities in the contextually appropriate situations and that there should be some nontrivial relationships between quantum and classical properties and behaviors, particularly in the mesoscopic domain. The interesting statistical regularities discovered in quantum chaology fit with this emergent, nontrival overlapping relationship nicely (see §6.2).