Understood literally, a meritocracy is a society in which influence (of some sort) is possessed on the basis of merit (whatever that means). Meritocracy is of perennial interest and has shaped—for good or ill—political, economic, and cultural life in the East and the West. Yet meritocracy has received little direct philosophical attention. As David Miller puts it,
we don’t have a clear understanding of what meritocracy means, so we don’t have a proper measuring rod against which to gauge social realities, saying how far they do or do not conform to meritocratic criteria. (1999: 178)
And Amartya Sen:
The idea of meritocracy may have many virtues, but clarity is not one of them. (2000: 5)
This entry explains how philosophers (and others) have developed recognizably meritocratic ideas and summarizes the philosophical state-of-the-art. Throughout the entry, important lacunae in the literature are pointed out. Despite its long history, meritocracy remains ripe for philosophical study.
- 1. Meritocracy: A Brief History
- 2. Conceptual Issues
- 3. Meritocratic Governance
- 4. Meritocratic Justice
- 5. Objections
- 6. The Public Debate
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Meritocracy: A Brief History
By tradition, Michael Young is credited with coining “meritocracy” for his 1958 satire, The Rise of the Meritocracy. In fact, the term appeared in print two years earlier: In Jean Floud’s “Sociology and Education”, Alan Fox’s “Class and Equality”, and Paul Lamartine Yates’s “Fairer Shares”. Young claimed to have invented it, which is certainly possible given that all four were English academics who moved in similar, leftist circles. While only Young explained what he meant by “meritocracy” in any detail (and his sentiments towards it were mixed), for these academics, the term had a negative connotation.
Now it has been claimed that “meritocracy” first appeared in Hannah Arendt’s “1954” article “The Crisis in Education”. And there are copies of this article, so dated, circulating on the Internet which include the term. However, “The Crisis in Education” came out in 1958 (and was based on “a lecture delivered at Bremen, May 13, 1958”). Further, “meritocracy” does not appear in that original version of Arendt’s article. It does appear in edited reprints of it (e.g., Arendt 1961).
Only the briefest survey of the history of meritocracy can be provided here. For the ideas that government should be populated by the meritorious, and that a just distribution is merit-based, are ubiquitous. As Louis Pojman says,
it is interesting to observe how deeply the notion of justice as desert or merit is embedded in human history. It seems a prereflective, basic idea of primordial or Ur-justice. One finds it grounded in every known culture and religion. (1999: 90)
(Pojman surveys some history; Wooldridge 2021 is more comprehensive.)
There is an Eastern meritocratic tradition which has its roots in Confucius (551–479 BC). This tradition has influenced political and social institutions in Asia and beyond and remains vibrant (§3.1). (Meritocratic notions are found elsewhere in ancient Chinese thought, too; e.g., the Mohists [c. 400 BC] sought to “elevate the worthy” into government for utilitarian reasons. See Pines 2013.)
The core ideas of this tradition are found in Confucius, Mencius (372–289 BC), and Xunzi (c. 310–c. 235 BC). In short: The purpose of government is to promote the well-being and virtue of the people. That requires that political power be wielded not on the basis of noble blood—the prevailing system—but virtue and talent. Political leaders serve as role models and sage decision-makers, and to do that they must be meritorious.
Such a system will create hierarchies. For these meritocrats, that is not a problem. Indeed, it is natural and welcome:
That things are unequal is a matter of fact…. If you rank them the same, it will bring confusion to the world. If a roughly finished shoe sells at the same price as a finely finished one, who would make the latter? … How can one govern a state in this way? (Mencius, 3A.4, trans. Bai [2020: 103])
The most famous realization of the Eastern meritocratic tradition was the Imperial Examinations, which began in China during the Sui Dynasty (AD 581–618). Until that point, entry into the state bureaucracy was mainly controlled via nepotism and aristocratic influence. (Although there was some openness to granting political power to competent and virtuous people, even if they came from the lower class, since the Qin Dynasty [226–206 BC]. For a discussion of meritocratic practices before the Imperial Examinations, see Wang 2017.) The Imperial Examinations replaced, to some extent, that route to power with a single, impartial, rigorous examination, which was open to the public. Although the Imperial Examinations were discontinued in the early twentieth century, similar civil service examinations proliferated, and today are used world-wide (including in China).
The Eastern meritocratic tradition is largely concerned with governance. It does not hold that other social goods, like non-political jobs or income, should be distributed on the basis of merit. And its justification is largely consequentialist: People will be more virtuous, and better cared-for, if they are ruled by the meritorious. Although some meritocratic institutions, like the Imperial Examinations, might have laudable side-effects like improving social mobility, they are not generally justified on those grounds.
Plato’s (c. 428–c. 348 BC) meritocratic political theory (found primarily in the Laws, Republic, and Statesman) is similarly focused on governance. His argument for meritocracy and against democracy is simple: Managing a state is hard. It requires specific skills, like bravery, sobriety, graciousness, and love of wisdom. These skills are not found among the common people or the wealthy. If political power were entrusted to them, the “ship of state” (Republic 488a–89c) would run aground. Not to mention, the sailors—democratically-elected leaders—are always squabbling. Only a “true pilot”—a philosopher-king—can safely guide his ship to its destination. (See also, e.g., Republic 412a-e, 473c-d, and 484a ff.)
How Plato justifies meritocracy is a debated matter of interpretation. On one interpretation, meritocracy is desirable for its good consequences; to wit, it brings justice and happiness to the state (and, by analogy, citizens’ souls). On another interpretation, meritocracy constitutes justice and happiness, which are intrinsically desirable. (On this interpretive issue, see, e.g., Brown 2003 .)
Aristotle (384–322 BC) is different in that his concern (in the Nicomachean Ethics and the Politics) is the distribution of social goods generally—not just political offices. And his justification for merit-based distribution is squarely deontological. (At least, that is a common interpretation. On Aristotle’s theory of distributive justice, see, e.g., Keyt 1991.)
Justice is, for Aristotle, giving people what they deserve, and this happens when they are rewarded in proportion to their merit. (This view is arguably presaged by Plato in the Laws [757c] and the Republic [331e ff.]) Indeed, for Aristotle this is not just correct but obvious: “All men agree that what is just in distribution must be according to merit [ἀξία]” (NE, 1131a, trans. Ross ).
Aristotelian desert defines a notion of equality, known as proportional equality. (It is most frequently studied within social psychology, under the heading equity theory.) What Aristotle seeks to equalize are the ratios of merits to rewards between persons.
For example, suppose that there are 100 units of some good to be distributed among 3 persons. Persons A and B are equally meritorious; C is twice as meritorious as they are. Justice is done by giving 25 units of the good to A, 25 units to B, and 50 units to C. Note that an equal distribution is just only in the special case in which all recipients are equally meritorious.
Now, what is merit? For Aristotle, this is determined by the nature of the thing being distributed:
When a number of flute players are equal in their art, there is no reason why those of them who are better born should have better flutes given to them … the superior instrument should be reserved for him who is the superior artist. (Politics, 1282b, trans. Jowett )
Meritocratic ideas are found in Islamic philosophy, in which scholars developed political theories compatible with divinely revealed Islamic law (Sharī’a). For example, Al-Fārābī (also known as Alpharabius, AD c. 870–c. 950) sought a political system which would bring happiness and perfection to the people living under it. Democracy could not do this (although it had, for al-Fārābī, some admirable features). What is required, rather, is (i) a ruler who is a hybrid philosopher-king and prophet-imām, with qualifications drawn from both Platonic and Islamic thought, and (ii) an elaborated hierarchy between citizens. Similar ideas may be found in the work of Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna, AD c. 980–1037), Ibn Bājja (Avempace, AD c. 1085–c. 1139), and Ibn Rushd (Averroes, AD 1126–1198).
Francesco Patrizi of Siena (AD 1413–1494) argued that merit—understood as virtue—was a precondition for the legitimate exercise of political power. For Patrizi, a meritocratic state is justified, stable, and functional. Further, the state is responsible for inculcating virtue in its citizens so that they are sufficiently meritorious to participate in government. This requires, among other things, a public literacy program. Patrizi designed his political institutions to ensure that (i) only meritorious citizens (i.e., the educated and experienced) would be chosen as magistrates and senators, and (ii) wealthy and powerful families could not corrupt the political process. (On the almost-forgotten Patrizi, see Hankins 2023.)
Meritocracy was an important Enlightenment value. Thinkers in Europe and elsewhere sought grounds for regarding people as individuals (rather than undifferentiated group members) and replacing monarchical politics.
For instance, Article VI of the Declaration of the Rights of Man and of the Citizen (1789) says:
All citizens, being equal in the eyes of the law, shall be equally eligible to all dignities, public positions and occupations, according to their ability, and without distinction except that of their virtues and talents.
This is almost precisely the meritocratic rule for distributing jobs (§4.2).
Napoleon lived up to this principle, adopting the slogan la carrière est ouverte aux talents—careers open to talents—and ascribing his success (not entirely, of course) to the meritocratic nature of his reign.
Across the Atlantic, Thomas Jefferson desired a “natural aristocracy” for his new nation, in which hierarchies would reflect “virtue and talents” rather than “wealth and birth”. Indeed, Jefferson regarded this natural aristocracy as “the most precious gift of nature, for the … government of society” (1813).
There is also a meritocratic ideal of justice associated with the United States. This is the American Dream, expressed by the person who coined the phrase thus:
It is not a dream of motor cars and high wages merely, but a dream of a social order in which each man and each woman shall be able to attain to the fullest stature of which they are innately capable, and be recognized by others for what they are, regardless of the fortuitous circumstances of birth or position. (James Adams 1931: 404)
The suggestion is that a just state is one in which there is equal opportunity and people are judged on their merits (§4).
2. Conceptual Issues
2.1 What is merit?
“Merit” connotes worth, quality, virtue, excellence, and more. If we are to build a society upon merit, as meritocrats desire, it seems necessary to understand exactly what merit is. Yet conceptual analysis of merit is nascent (see Clavero García 2023; Vlastos  also offers some comments).
One thing that is clear is that merit is a contextual phenomenon, as Aristotle suggested (§1). We cannot answer the question of whether some person (book, painting, etc.) is meritorious unless we have a context in mind. If, in the middle of a discussion about the all-time great baseball players, one asks, “was Albert Einstein meritorious?”, the appropriate answer is “no”. To be sure, we talk about people being meritorious simpliciter. We say things like, “Einstein was a meritorious man”. But in these cases we understand the context implicitly.
It is also possible to broadly condemn a person while conceding his merit within a narrow context. One may say that Hitler had merit as an artist without making any commitments to his merit in other contexts, or to his overall merit.
A crucial conceptual issue is the relationship between merit and its real-world effects. Especially when it comes to governance (§3), meritocracy is frequently justified by the good outcomes it creates. And this much seems incontrovertible: All else equal, a meritorious politician will make higher-quality decisions than an unmeritorious one.
But this is not necessarily true. Merit, which is internal, is distinct from the outcomes which issue from it. The outcomes are external, although they are sometimes used as evidence of merit. A Nobel Prize in physics is good evidence that Jones is a meritorious physicist. But it is no guarantee: Jones could have stolen the research that won him the Prize, falsely publishing it under his own name.
As Hume puts in the Treatise:
The external performance has no merit. We must look within to find the moral quality. This we cannot do directly; and therefore fix our attention on actions, as on external signs. But these actions are still considered as signs; and the ultimate object of our praise and approbation is the motive, that produc’d them. (1739–40: 3.2.1)
An example, which we will return to, illustrates the importance of the merit-outcomes distinction. Suppose that Daryl and John are applying for jobs at the widget factory. Daryl is more skilled than John, works faster, is more careful, more collegial, and so on. But this factory is filled with racists and Daryl belongs to the disfavored race. As a result, Daryl would perform worse—make fewer widgets per hour—than John would. (This is a case of taste discrimination—Becker 1957.)
Observe that, conceptually, Daryl remains more meritorious than John even though hiring John would generate better outcomes. Those who support hiring John rather than Daryl—utilitarians, say—would not claim otherwise. They would simply say that here there are good reasons to hire the less meritorious applicant.
Ronald Dworkin once held a contrary view:
If a black skin will, as a matter of regrettable fact, enable another doctor to do a different medical job better, then that black skin is by the same token “merit” as well. (1985: 299)
But later he recanted (as Segall  points out):
I do not mean … that black color is in itself a virtue or an aspect of merit…. We do not count a person’s height as a virtue or a merit. But someone who is tall may just for that reason be better able to contribute, on a basketball court, to one of a university’s traditional goals, and in the same way, though for sadder reasons, someone who is black may for that reason be better able to contribute to its other goals, in the classroom and dormitory and in the course of his or her later career. (2000: 404)
The meritocrat must decide whether merit-based distribution is desirable on consequentialist or categorical grounds. If the former, then meritocracy will be valuable only contingently. For at least in principle, merit-based distribution may lead to suboptimal outcomes. On other hand, meritocrats who say that merit-based distribution is categorically desirable—because, for example, it gives people what they deserve (§4)—must concede that their system will not always produce the best results.
2.2 Merit and desert
Merit’s closest conceptual cousin is desert, the concept underlying commonplace claims like “Joe deserves the job” and “workers deserve higher wages”. As we shall see (§4.1), some meritocrats explicitly invoke desert in their theories of justice. And desert is implicit in much other work on meritocracy. (Seminal research on desert includes Feinberg 1963, Kleinig 1971, and Sher 1987.)
There is no consensus about the precise link between merit and desert. Thomas Mulligan (2018b) argues that merit is an important basis for desert and thereby has moral force. Jeppe von Platz (2022) uses “desert” to describe an agent’s character and “merit” to characterize the real-world effects (e.g., achievements) of that character. John Lucas (1980) uses the terms in just the opposite way. Owen McLeod says that merit is “quite a specific kind of desert” (1999: 67). Pojman disagrees: “Merit is a broader concept, the genus of which desert is the species” (1999: 86). No attempt has yet been made to evaluate these disparate views, let alone reconcile them. Observe, too, that merit and desert are sometimes used synonymously—we might say that Sam “deserves the prize” or, apparently equivalently, Sam “merits the prize”.
Two of desert’s conceptual features are especially relevant to meritocracy. First, desert is a pre-institutional notion. What a person deserves is not, and cannot be, determined by the rules (organizations, practices, etc.) governing distribution. Rather, desert should determine those rules.
Imagine a race in which all blonde runners get a 10 second head start. The race is run, and a blonde beats a brunette by a nose. Institutionally—within the rules of this race—the blonde should get the medal. But she does not deserve it. The brunette deserves the medal; she was fastest. For the desertist, the brunette ought, morally, to receive it. The blonde is merely “entitled” to the medal. Further, for the desertist, this is a bad race; its rules ought to be changed so that institutional entitlements line up with deserts.
In contrast, a libertarian view of justice denies that there is a deeper, fiducial standard against which the institution can be judged (§5.4). So long as all the runners freely chose to participate in this race (and weren’t misled about the rules, etc.) the blonde ought, morally, to receive the medal. The fact that rules do not ensure that the fastest runner receive the medal is, for the libertarian, irrelevant to justice. (For discussion of desert-based versus entitlement-based arguments, see Olsaretti 2003a.)
Second, desert is often thought to contain principles of aboutness and fitness. The aboutness principle holds that the basis for desert must be “about” (somehow construed) the subject of a desert-claim for that claim to be bona fide. One cannot, for example, deserve prison on the basis of someone else’s crimes. One common construal of aboutness is responsibility—if a person is not responsible for a crime, he cannot deserve prison for it.
Arguments abound about the influence of luck on people’s character and achievements. Luck plausibly severs aboutness and thereby people’s claims to deserve on the basis of their merit. If Jones is the most meritorious applicant because of his hard work, he has a strong case to deserve the job. If Jones is meritorious because he had the good luck of being raised in a rich family, things are murkier.
The fitness principle holds that there is a natural connection between the basis for desert and the object being awarded. If a person commits a crime, he deserves prison—not a medal. Prison fits crime; a medal is unfitting.
As will be discussed in §4, meritocrats debate what the appropriate understanding of “merit” is when it comes to distributing political offices, jobs, income, and other goods. Does a just, meritocratic wage reflect a person’s skill? His effort? The contribution he makes? Or is “merit” conceptually primitive, unable to be defined in any of these terms?
2.3 Equal opportunity
A classic example of meritocracy (perhaps first used by Lyndon Johnson in a 4 June 1965 address at Howard University) is a footrace. Justice is done—the race is fair—only if the medal is given to the runner who crosses the finish line first (and not, say, to the runner with the lightest skin). However, that is a necessary, not a sufficient, condition for justice. For if some runners had a head start—if there was unequal opportunity—then the race was unjust, and the “winner” has no moral claim on the medal. But if the medal is awarded purely on the basis of merit, and against a background of equal opportunity, then the winner deserves that medal, and justice has been done.
In a meritocracy there is an “equal starting line” (or, to use another common, athletic metaphor, a “level playing field”) from which people compete for scarce social goods. That equal starting line, when coupled with a merit-based distributive rule, provides a full theory of distributive justice. (For more on the connection between meritocracy and equal opportunity, see Arneson 2002 , Daniels 1978, Mulligan 2018b, and Goldman 1977.)
Sometimes the aforementioned idea of equal opportunity is referred to as “fair” or “substantive” equal opportunity, and the merit-based distributive rule as “formal” equal opportunity. When things are put in those terms, a meritocracy is simply a society in which there is equal opportunity (fair and formal).
While the equal starting line metaphor is handwavy, equal opportunity has been made rigorous (see Roemer 1998). And the ideal has clear ramifications for public policy, such as estate/inheritance taxes (so people don’t accrue wealth on the basis of family circumstances instead of merit) and public education (so that the children of poor families receive the same quality education as the children of the rich).
There are two salient debates within the equal opportunity literature important to meritocracy. The first is whether there is a moral difference between (i) social advantage, like being born into a rich family, and (ii) natural advantage—like intelligence (important: insofar as it is genetically- rather than environmentally-derived). The meritocrat is committed to nullifying the former through equal opportunity, but what about the latter? (Nullifying natural advantage would consist in providing extra resources to those who are naturally disadvantaged.)
The second debate involves the extent to which the state may interfere in family affairs to establish equal opportunity (see Fishkin 1983). Even with robust “external” measures (estate taxes, public education), different families will show different degrees of care for their children. That will lead to some inequality of opportunity.
Indeed, different kinds of care—not just parental attention versus neglect—may lead to inequalities of opportunity. One family may inculcate a love and aptitude for music in their child; another family may stress sports. The philosophical issues here are to explain what is problematic and what is not, and to draw the line between the government’s interest in establishing equal opportunity and the liberty of parents to raise their children as they see fit.
3. Meritocratic Governance
This section and the following one are the core of this entry. They address the two principal senses in which meritocracy has arisen within philosophy. This section considers meritocracy as a form of government.
Terminologically, these systems are referred to as “political meritocracies” in the Eastern philosophical literature and “epistocracies” in the Western literature. The latter term is due to David Estlund (2003) and stresses the superior knowledge—episteme—which meritocratic political rulers possess. This entry follows the former usage.
Three broad questions face proposals for meritocratic governance. The first asks what constitutes merit or, equivalently, “who are the meritocrats?” The meritocratic class could consist of citizens who are competent (somehow defined); who are more likely than others to produce good political results (which could be different from the class of competent citizens—§2.1); who are best able to represent their constituents; or something else.
The second question asks, “how should the meritocrats rule?” It is not enough to show that there is a well-defined meritocratic class. A particular form of government, harnessing the meritocrats, must be elaborated.
The third question asks, “is meritocracy justifiable?” That is, proponents of meritocracy must defend their system against the charge that it is unfair. Discussion of these challenges is delayed until §5.
With one deontological exception (to be discussed), meritocratic political systems are justified on consequentialist grounds. Meritocrats claim, that is, that their systems would produce better political outcomes—more justice and prosperity, say—than prevailing political systems do.
Many contemporary meritocrats are motivated by a perception that contemporary democracy is dysfunctional. They adduce a range of empirical research: voters don’t know basic political facts (e.g., Somin 2013); they treat politics as a sport, in which what is important is not achieving good social outcomes or even promoting their own interests but that their “team” win (Lenz 2012); they are afflicted by motivated reasoning, seeking out evidence to confirm existing beliefs and generating specious grounds to ignore disconfirming evidence (Flynn, Nyhan, & Reifler 2017); and more. (The relevant research was pioneered by Converse . Brennan  provides a contemporary survey.)
3.1 New Confucian meritocracy
In recent years, scholars have looked to the Confucian tradition (§1) to inspire and ground political theories. (See, e.g., Bai 2020; Bell 2006 and 2015; Bell & Li 2013; Bell & Wang 2020; Chan 2014; and Jiang 2013. The reader may also consult recent special issues of Culture and Dialogue [2020, volume 8, issue 2] and Philosophy & Social Criticism [2020, volume 46, issue 9], devoted to New Confucian meritocracy.) Incidentally, there has been insufficient interaction between the epistocracy literature and this one. That is an intersection ripe for research.
This literature is part political theory and part comparative politics. New Confucian meritocrats frequently point to China’s stability and economic success and contrast it with contemporary democratic dysfunction. That said, it should not be thought that the above-cited scholars, nor New Confucian meritocrats broadly, are apologists for the Chinese Communist Party. They are not.
These theories incorporate some liberal democratic features while rejecting others, like robust freedom of speech or the “one person, one vote” principle. All deny the truth and usefulness of regarding citizens as equals when it comes to voting. New Confucian meritocratic theories are, thus, best understood as hybrids of classical Confucianism and contemporary democratic theory.
They vary in their particulars. For example, Daniel Bell (2015), drawing from an ideal informing contemporary Chinese politics, calls for “democracy at the bottom, experimentation in the middle, and meritocracy at the top” (2015: 9). Bell’s meritocracy is purely political (he rejects meritocratic distribution of the sort discussed in §4), and mainly applicable to the highest political offices. Nevertheless, the political system is structured to funnel the most meritorious citizens to its apex (by using, e.g., examinations for public officials).
Tongdong Bai (2020), drawing from Mencius, endorses the “liberal” part of liberal democracy but not the democratic part. He argues for a government that is “for the people, of the people, but not by the people” (2020: 32). In Bai’s hybrid regime, liberal features like the rule of law and human rights do not emerge from Western values of individuality and equality but from classical Confucian values. Bai concedes that, so grounded, these features
may be more contextual and less absolute than the rights derived from an asocial and autonomous [i.e., Western] conception of the individual. (2020: 259)
Democracy should be rejected, according to Bai, because it is less legitimate than a meritocratic alternative. Political authority derives from service to the people, and democracy is not doing that well (because of, e.g., the aforementioned voter ignorance/irrationality). Bai invokes a notion common among meritocrats: There are real differences in virtue, intelligence, etc. between people; these differences render us appropriate for different positions in social and political hierarchies; and that sorting is in fact desirable (see also Bell & Wang 2020).
The idea that liberal features might emerge from Confucian principles has been most fully explored by Joseph Chan (2014), whose perfectionistic theory appeals to the Confucian conception of the good life. Chan describes this conception as one that
takes material well-being, moral self-cultivation, and virtuous social relationships as constituents … with the ideal of sagehood as the highest good. (2014: 44)
Chan’s preferred political system is one in which this account of the good life is best promoted. In his view, such a system will contain both liberal features, such as human rights, and meritocratic features. As regards the latter, Chan recommends a bicameral legislature, with one chamber chosen democratically and the other filled meritocratically (elite citizens selecting from a pool of experienced public servants).
Like Bai, Chan’s affinity for liberal features, like human rights, is not categorical. We do not possess rights because we are human; we possess them because they are instrumentally useful in promoting the Confucian good life. In fact, for Chan they are ever more contingent than that: They are merely a “fallback apparatus” for the non-ideal circumstances we find ourselves in. In ideal circumstances, in which all citizens were virtuous and able to resolve disputes through mediation, human rights would be unnecessary, even destructive.
In addition to the broad challenges that New Confucian meritocrats, qua meritocrats, face (§5), there are detractors within the Confucian tradition. Some “Confucian democrats” argue that democratic political participation is essential for cultivating Confucian virtues (see, e.g., Angle 2012, Hall & Ames 1999, and Tan 2004). These virtues include humaneness (ren, 仁), wisdom (zhi, 智), righteousness (yi, 義), ritual propriety (li, 禮), and integrity (xin, 信)—the “Five Constant Virtues”.
Sungmoon Kim’s (2017 and 2018) pragmatic Confucian democracy holds that democracy has instrumental power which meritocracy lacks. Democracy better promotes
legitimacy and order acquired through an effective and sustained coordination of complex social, economic, and political interactions among citizens who have profound moral and economic disagreement. (2018: 6)
Democracy, that is, is better able to cope with the disagreement and value-pluralism which marks contemporary political life.
Elena Ziliotti (forthcoming) argues on epistemic grounds: Because social well-being is an essential Confucian value, and because democracy is a better instrument toward that end than meritocracy is, democracy is more faithful to the Confucian tradition.
3.2 Restricted suffrage
A natural meritocratic approach is to limit political power to citizens who are sufficiently competent. American women did not secure a right to vote until 1920, with the passage of the Nineteenth Amendment to the Constitution. John Adams explains his reasoning why:
Their delicacy renders them unfit for practice and experience in the great businesses of life, and the hardy enterprises of war, as well as the arduous cares of state. (1776)
Unsurprisingly—given its history—restricted suffrage has found little philosophical purchase. But it’s worth remembering that we continue to deprive classes of people of political power without outcry. Children, for example, cannot vote. In Adams’ words, they “have not judgment or Will of their own”. (López-Guerra  argues for a full expansion of the suffrage, to include children.)
Jason Brennan (2011) is the salient exception to philosophers’ resistance to restricted suffrage. He argues that citizens have a right “not to be subject to high stakes decisions made by incompetent and morally unreasonable people” (2011: 702), and that this right is violated under universal suffrage.
Brennan analogizes electorates to juries: We would think a defendant’s rights had been violated if he were convicted by an ignorant, irrational, or morally unreasonable jury. And since real-world electorates are, according to Brennan, ignorant, irrational, and morally unreasonable, those affected by their decisions find their rights violated.
Brennan’s argument is distinctive not only because it defends restricted suffrage but because it gives a deontological justification for political meritocracy. The other justifications surveyed in this section are consequentialist. While such a justification for restricted suffrage might be given, Brennan’s concern is the alleged rights-violations that universal suffrage inflicts.
3.3 Plural voting
Perhaps the most famous meritocratic proposal in the Western literature is John Stuart Mill’s (1859a, 1859b, 1861) plural voting. Mill’s proposal integrates his liberal desire for universal suffrage with an anti-egalitarian streak:
If it is asserted that all persons ought to be equal in every description of right recognised by society, I answer, not until all are equal in worth as human beings. It is the fact, that one person is not as good as another; and it is reversing all the rules of rational conduct, to attempt to raise a political fabric on a supposition which is at variance with fact. (1859b: 23)
(Notice how similar this sentiment is to Mencius’ [§1].)
Mill’s proposal is simple: Everybody gets a vote (thereby satisfying universal suffrage) and some people get more than one (because they are, in some sense, of greater “worth”). Mill offers several justifications for plural voting (see Dale Miller 2015), including—unsurprisingly for the utilitarian Mill—that it will produce better political consequences.
An immediate challenge facing the plural voting proponent is how to specify voting weights. Mill (1859b: 25–26) gives one potential specification:
- Unskilled laborers: 1 vote
- Skilled laborers: 2 votes
- Foremen and “superintendents of labor”: 3 votes
- Farmers, manufacturers, and traders: 3–4 votes
- Professionals (e.g., lawyers, doctors, clergymen, “literary men”, artists, “public functionaries”): 5–6 votes
- University graduates and members of “learned societies”: At least as many votes as professionals.
While this assignment has prima facie plausibility, Mill does not provide a rigorous defense of it. It is surely sub-optimal (why 3 votes for foremen? Why not 2? Or 3.5?) And perhaps its prima facie plausibility is misleading. Maybe professionals possess biases which laborers do not, thereby making the former less likely than the latter to vote well. (The same may be said of Harwood’s  proposal.)
To overcome this difficulty, Mulligan (2018c) advances a statistical approach to plural voting which attempts to rigorously derive optimal voting weights from voting history. And Trevor Latimer’s (2018) “egalitarian” plural voting proceeds in two stages: The first operates under “one person, one vote” and determines voting weights; the second determines the substantive political question using those (generally unequal) weights.
Two technical notes: First, some forms of plural voting may de facto restrict the suffrage. For example, suppose that there are four voters. Voters A, B, and C have 2 votes each. Voter D has 1 vote. There are no voter coalitions in which D’s vote affects the result. He is effectively disenfranchised. The flip-side of this is that plural voting is compatible with democrats’ treasured “one person, one vote” principle: If voters are equally competent, a plural voting system will grant them an equal number of votes.
Second, there is no unique assignment of voting weights. For example, all weights in Mill’s system may be multiplied by 2, with the same results.
3.4 Limited epistocracy
The aforementioned proposals would radically change political practice. As such, they invite a criticism that they are insufficiently democratic (§5.3). This has led some philosophers to develop “limited epistocracies” which would improve political performance without straying too far from the democratic status quo.
Perhaps, for example, we can provide extra political influence to citizens who know “basic political facts” (Gibbons 2021)—facts which are both politically relevant and uncontroversial, like candidates’ policy platforms. Or perhaps “specialized institutions” (Jeffrey 2018), like the World Health Organization, can be granted unilateral—but narrow or temporary—political power via the democratic process.
There is no obvious dividing line between democracy and political meritocracy. All contemporary democracies seek to harness expertise, albeit to different extents and through different processes. The U.S. Senate, for example, was envisioned as a “portion of enlightened citizens” (Madison 1787: Tuesday, June 26) to serve as a bulwark against the “fickleness and passion” of the more democratic House of Representatives. Institutions like that plausibly qualify as limited epistocracies and might be defended on those grounds.
3.5 Other approaches
Although Brennan has written in support of restricting the suffrage (§3.2), his preferred form of governance is, apparently, what he calls government by simulated oracle (see Brennan 2016):
Every citizen may vote. When citizens vote, they (a) indicate their policy preferences or their preferred political outcomes, while (b) indicating their demographic information, and (c) taking a test of basic political knowledge. The government then uses data sets (a), (b), and (c) to determine, statistically, what a fully informed electorate would want, while correcting for the influence of race, income, sex, and/or other demographic factors on the vote. In short, government-by-simulated-oracle estimates what a demographically identical but fully informed electorate would want, and then implements that instead of what the uninformed electorate in fact wants. (Brennan 2018: 55–56)
What ought to count is not voters’ expressed preferences—which are affected by ignorance, irrationality, and the other dysfunctions which so trouble him and other meritocrats—but their enlightened preferences. If I cast a vote for X rather than Y because I hold false beliefs or am biased, then perhaps my vote should accrue to Y rather than X. For Y is what I would vote for, if not for my ignorance or irrationality.
While there has been significant work on enlightened preferences in economics and political science (e.g., Althaus 2003, Caplan 2007, and Gilens 2012), Brennan has not explored this system in any detail. (Ahlstrom-Vij  does so, and thinks the system qualifies as democratic, not meritocratic.) One challenge is that it’s unclear what is meant by demographic bias. Our political preferences are shaped by myriad elements of our identity, including our demographics. Evangelical Protestants are much more opposed to abortion than adherents of other religions (Pew 2022). Is this bias of the sort that must be neutralized? Or a predictable and bona fide consequence of a deeper ideology?
A second strategy for dealing with the voter ignorance/irrationality problem is distinguishing two political classes and assigning them different roles. On the one hand there are regular citizens, who are responsible for setting political goals and determining their society’s values. That is done democratically. On the other hand, there are legislators and bureaucrats. They are responsible for pursuing, in the manner they deem best, the ends identified by the regular citizens.
The ignorance/irrationality problem is thus putatively solved: While the latter task requires expertise which the public does not have, the former task does not. Indeed, perhaps the former task is enabled by the folk wisdom which legislators/bureaucrats lack. One is reminded of William F. Buckley’s quip:
I would rather be governed by the first 2,000 people in the telephone directory than by the Harvard University faculty. (Quoted in Meyer 1961: 143)
This approach, which has come to be known as values-only voting (Beerbohm 2012; Christiano 1996 & 2008), puts the public and legislators/bureaucrats in a principal-agent relationship. For instance, the public may decree, via the democratic process, that the economy ought to be more equal. That goal is adopted by the legislators/bureaucrats, who choose and implement the policies which, in their superior judgment, will best promote it. In doing so, they can avoid pitfalls which the general public might not, like levying a luxury tax whose burden falls on workers.
As with Brennan’s government by simulated oracle, there is a dividing line problem here: What counts as an end and what counts as a means and can they be distinguished? Dimitri Landa and Ryan Pevnick give the example of a public that seeks to “minimize the innocent loss of life” (2020: 10). In response, legislators dutifully ban guns and abortion. It seems like a large portion of the public would be dissatisfied with how “its vision” was carried out. Landa and Pevnick also point out that under values-only voting, citizens may be unable to exert sufficient oversight—an example of a principal/agent problem which may afflict this division of labor.
Another proposal, most fully explored by Claudio López-Guerra (2011, 2014, 2020), uses lotteries to reduce political influence from the public broadly to a proper subset of it (see also Guerrero 2014; Landemore 2020; and Saunders 2010 & 2012). In López-Guerra’s envisioned system (which he does not unreservedly endorse and which, he says, qualifies as democratic), there is universal suffrage in the sense that virtually all citizens are eligible to vote. But for any given election, not all do. Some citizens are chosen at random to participate. The rest are disenfranchised (for that election). The chosen citizens engage in an “exhaustive informative program designed to acquaint them with the alternatives regarding the ballot” (López-Guerra 2011: 212). Then they cast their votes. That program ensures that all citizens who actually exercise political influence are well-informed.
In this way, all citizens are potential meritocrats, and the meritocratic class—which changes from election to election—is determined purely at random. All citizens, regardless of intelligence, race, age, etc. have an equal chance to exercise political influence.
A potential problem is the loss of aggregative power when the electorate is reduced in this way. The primary justification for this system is epistemic quality: We would get better political outcomes under it, according to López-Guerra, relative to the democratic status quo. But one important argument in favor of the status quo (§5.3) is that a large group of relatively incompetent voters may outperform a small group of relatively competent voters. Under López-Guerra’s system, the electorate is smaller but competence is higher. Absent modeling it is unclear how it would perform relative to democracy.
4. Meritocratic Justice
In its second sense, meritocracy is a theory of justice. It is a competitor to egalitarianism (in its various forms—strict, luck, Rawlsian, etc.), utilitarianism, libertarianism, and the other theories of justice. A meritocrat in this sense is someone who believes that a just state is a meritocracy.
Little work has been done on the relationship between meritocracy’s two senses—an approach to governance and a theory of justice (although see Mulligan 2022)—and it is unclear what, if any, connection there is between them. It certainly seems coherent to believe (e.g.) both (i) social goods should be distributed on the basis of merit and (ii) we should have a democratic, not a meritocratic, approach to politics.
Now, theories of justice across the aforementioned traditions may tentatively endorse meritocratic principles. For these principles may be instrumentally useful in promoting their preferred ideal of justice. For example, it is plausible that merit-based hiring (§4.2) promotes the general welfare, to some extent. Thus, a utilitarian may endorse meritocracy of that sort, instrumentally.
As Adam Swift and Gordon Marshall put this view,
a meritocratic allocation of individuals to occupations can be justified on the grounds that a society in which people are doing what they are best able to do will be optimally productive, but a meritocratic allocation of rewards to individuals can not be justified on the grounds that such an allocation gives people what they deserve. (1997: 44)
(See also Daniels 1978.)
This is certainly a defensible view of meritocracy’s allure, and it appears to be backed up empirically. As Roland Bénabou puts it,
the analysis generally validates the common intuition that meritocracy, appropriately defined, is desirable … on grounds of efficiency. (2000: 319)
But this instrumental connection between merit and good consequences is contingent (§2.1). The most vocal proponents of meritocracy hold that there is a deontological requirement to distribute on the basis of merit. And so any good consequences are, at best, a happy side-effect of adherence to a moral rule. But why does such a requirement exist?
While not endorsing it, Swift and Marshall previewed the principal answer to that question: In a meritocracy, people get what they deserve. And because, it is argued, justice is giving people what they deserve, meritocracy is just. Meritocrats thus follow in the Aristotelian tradition (§1) of seeking to match social goods, like jobs and income, with facts about the people who desire them, like their qualifications or economic contributions.
Like desert-based approaches to justice broadly, meritocracy has not been popular within contemporary philosophy. But there have been defenders. David Miller (1999) gives “two cheers” to the ideal. This qualification is rooted in Miller’s pluralistic view of justice. He identifies three “modes of human interaction”, with desert (meritocracy) governing one of them (viz. “instrumental association”). (Principles of equality and need govern the other two.)
Miller appeals to Aristotelian proportional equality (§1) to ground the desertist portion of his theory. Understanding “merit” as social contribution, he argues that a just society rewards people in proportion to their contributions (or, in the case of jobs, the qualities that will enable them to make contributions).
Hiring by merit is the policy that in general brings about the closest correspondence between individuals’ contributions and their rewards…. Nepotism or discrimination is unfair because it predictably creates a state of affairs in which there is a discrepancy between deserts and income rewards. Moreover, the best-qualified candidate who is passed over can legitimately complain that she is the victim of an injustice through being prevented from earning rewards commensurate with her potential contribution. (Miller 1999: 166)
Mulligan’s (2018b) meritocratic theory of justice is, in contrast to Miller’s, monistic. That is, Mulligan claims that justice is a matter of desert, and only a matter of desert. And doing justice to people—giving them what they deserve—is about establishing equal opportunity and judging them on their merits alone.
Mulligan advances several justifications for meritocracy, but most salient is meritocracy’s intuitive appeal. People feel that meritocratic distribution is just, and this sentiment appears stable across race, gender, socioeconomic class, political persuasion, and culture (cf. §6). The research adduced comes from equity theory (§1), experimental economics (e.g., Almås, Cappelen, & Tungodden 2020; Cappelen, Sørensen, & Tungodden 2010; Frohlich, Oppenheimer, & Kurki 2004), the child development literature (Baumard, Mascaro, & Chevallier 2012; Kanngiesser & Warneken 2012; Sloane, Baillargeon, & Premack 2014), evolutionary psychology (Aarøe & Petersen 2014; Baumard, André, & Sperber 2013; Petersen 2012), neuroeconomics (Cappelen, Eichele, et al. 2014; Vostroknutov, Tobler, & Rustichini 2012), and other fields of empirical study.
Other justifications for meritocratic norms have been given, independent of comprehensive theories of justice. George Sher (1987) gives one which is grounded in autonomy (sometimes put in terms of respect or dignity). When we distribute a scarce good on the basis of merit, we appeal only to attributes which constitute persons, and in particular those persons who are competing for the good. These attributes include skills, talents, and preferences. Meritocratic distribution thus provides people maximal control over their lives (or shows them maximal respect/dignity).
When we hire by merit, we abstract from all facts about the applicants except their ability to perform well at the relevant tasks…. We treat them as agents whose purposeful acts can make a difference in the world…. Selecting by merit is a way of taking seriously the potential agency of both the successful and the unsuccessful applicants. (Sher 1987: 121)
(See also Mason 2006 and Varga 2016. Dobos 2016 provides an overview of justifications for merit-based hiring.)
Another idea is that the social good itself—its very nature—points to merit as the morally proper basis for distribution. This Aristotelian notion (§1) is today more commonly put in terms of “fittingness” or “relevant qualifications”.
The idea may be elaborated in conceptual terms (see Sher 1987 and Williams 1973). It is morally fitting to give the job at the widget factory to the applicant who is best at making widgets, a fact which may be discerned from the concept of widget-making (cf. Williams: “The proper ground of distribution of medical care is ill health: this is a necessary truth” [1973: 240]).
Put differently, there is a conceptual connection between social goods and merit. There is no such connection between social goods and the other commonly-cited grounds for distribution, such as maximizing productivity or treating people equally. While in those cases connections doubtless exist and may seem weighty, they are external. They do not participate in our understanding of the social good itself.
The fittingness of merit-based distribution might be regarded as primitive and thus neither in need of nor amenable to further justification. As Joel Feinberg puts it,
I am not sure how, if at all, these judgments of moral appropriateness are to be verified; but I suspect that they resemble certain aesthetic judgments—for example that crimson and orange are clashing colors. (1963: 92)
4.2 The meritocratic distribution of jobs
Meritocratic hiring is often described using the language of discrimination. It is unjust, according the meritocrat, to discriminate against applicants for a job on any ground other than merit:
According to a widely held view, when there are a number of applicants for an available job, justice demands that the job be offered to the best-qualified applicant. We express this by saying that … the principle involved is one of hiring by merit. This is the principle that condemns discrimination on grounds of sex, race, or religion when hiring employees, as well, of course, as good old-fashioned nepotism. (David Miller 1999: 156)
This is the moral principle seemingly at work (as Schmidtz  points out) in Martin Luther King, Jr.’s famous “I Have a Dream” speech, in which King yearns that his children “not be judged by the color of their skin but by the content of their character”. For the meritocrat, racial discrimination is morally wrong because all non-merit-based discrimination is wrong.
The principle has been operationalized. In “blind auditions”, pioneered by symphony orchestras, applicants play behind screens so that the jury cannot discover their race, sex, appearance, etc. and can only assess the quality of the performance.
In the United States, the Civil Rights Act of 1964 was defended, in part, on meritocratic grounds (see Kershnar 2003). The Act prohibits discrimination on the basis of race, color, religion, national origin, and sex. (The U.S. Supreme Court later decided—in Bostock v. Clayton County—that discrimination on the basis of sexual orientation and gender identity runs afoul of the Act’s injunction against sex-based discrimination, and so is illegal.)
Lacking a theory of merit (§2.1), it is not always clear which features of applicants count as merits and which do not. In toy cases—say, hiring a new bricklayer—things are simple. A bricklayer must be strong, reliable, precise in his work, and so on. Race, gender, and appearance are obviously irrelevant to bricklaying.
In the real world, things are murkier. One example of this is “reaction qualifications” (Wertheimer 1983). These are
qualifications that count as such because of the reactions of recipients, where the recipients are those with whom the successful candidate will interact as a result of filling the relevant position. (Mason 2017: 49)
The taste discrimination case considered in §2.1 involves a reaction qualification which is not a bona fide merit. Racist customers may react positively to a saleswoman of their preferred race. But her race is not a merit. On the other hand, customers will buy more widgets from a saleswoman who is personable, and that is a merit.
Between these there are difficult cases. Suppose the saleswoman is beautiful, and her beauty entices customers to buy from her when they otherwise would not. Is beauty a merit in the context of selling widgets? In the context of modeling? Working at McDonalds? Is being a woman a merit in the context of gynecology (because many women would prefer a female doctor)? A satisfying conceptual analysis of merit would distinguish meritocratic reaction qualifications from non-meritocratic reaction qualifications.
A salient and philosophically interesting issue is affirmative action. Some forms of affirmative action do not appear to conflict with meritocratic hiring. For example, making special efforts to solicit applicants from historically underrepresented groups and then judging those applicants (along with everyone else) on the basis of merit seems compatible.
But the crux of affirmative action—quotas and preferential treatment—is incompatible with meritocratic hiring. As Robert Fullinwider (2002 ) says, “the aims of real world affirmative action make race and ethnicity (and sometimes gender) salient, not personal desert or merit”. (See also Nagel 1973.)
Affirmative action thus helpfully puts the question to meritocratic justice. For some, affirmative action’s incompatibility with meritocracy reveals that affirmative action is unjust. For others, this incompatibility is evidence that meritocracy is an erroneous view of justice.
Three notes on this. First, meritocrats’ resistance to affirmative action should be viewed in light of their commitment to equal opportunity (§2.3). Their argument is not that there are no racial injustices, but that the proper remedy is bolstering equal opportunity rather than quotas / preferential treatment.
Second, affirmative action again illustrates the cleavage between merit and consequences. It might be the case that hiring on the basis of race or gender produces better consequences, owing to, for instance, the benefits of a diverse workforce. For the meritocrat, that is irrelevant—it remains unjust, because discriminatory.
Third, all that said, meritocratic hiring and affirmative action are not necessarily incompatible. Suppose, for example, that there exists “implicit bias” against some group—that is, selectors unconsciously regard members of that group as less meritorious than they actually are. If so, then by showing “preference” to members of this group, selectors would merely nullify the bias and ensure that every candidate is judged on his merits. Obviously, whether implicit bias exists is an empirical issue. As of now, it is a hotly debated one (see, e.g., Jussim et al. forthcoming).
4.3 The meritocratic distribution of income
Meritocrats most commonly hold that economies ought to compensate people on the basis of their contributions. That is, when it comes to the distribution of income (and thus wealth, being merely a stock of unspent income), “merit” should be interpreted as economic contribution. (For discussion of the matters arising in this section, see Dekker 2010, Hsieh 2000, Mankiw 2010, David Miller 1989 and 1999, Mulligan 2018b, Riley 1989, Sheffrin 2013, Von Platz 2022, and Weinstein 2011.)
Imagine a garden which produces a harvest (the “output”) as a result of citizens’ contributions to it—seeding, watering, weeding, fertilizing, and so on (“inputs”). The meritocrat holds that each citizen deserves a share of the harvest proportional to her contribution to it. If Lane contributes twice as much during the growing season as Rory, then Lane deserves twice as much in return. (This is, again, Aristotle’s notion of proportional equality.)
Before we examine this metaphor—its complexities and whether it is apposite in the first place—it is worth noting that this distributive principle is idiosyncratic, politically. To many, the idea that people who contribute more should be paid more, an obviously inegalitarian idea, sounds conservative. And it has been defended by conservatives (e.g., Mankiw ).
Yet this is at the very same time the rule favored by Marx (in “Critique of the Gotha Program”) for his penultimate, socialist phase of history. This is, in part, why it is fair to say that “Marx is more a meritocrat than Rawls, Nielsen, Dworkin, and most contemporary liberal political philosophers” (Pojman 1999: 93).
An obvious question for this distributive view is how to interpret “contribution”. For some scholars, the proper index is willingness-to-pay (WTP)—the maximum price a person will pay for some good or service. Thus, if a person P produces X, by aggregating the WTP for X across consumers we obtain a measure of P’s contribution.
A slightly different interpretation relies on the concept of consumer surplus. Observe that if a consumer pays exactly her WTP for X, in a sense she has received no benefit. For at that price she is, by definition, indifferent between buying X and saving her money. Whereas, if there is a large difference between her WTP and X’s price, then her welfare (as measured in dollars) increases when she buys X. That increase is the consumer surplus.
The typical person’s WTP for a diamond ring is high and WTP for a jug of water is low. But plausibly the producer of the latter contributes more than the producer of the former.
Standard (neoclassical) economic theory also provides an interpretation of contribution, as marginal product. This is the change in economic output a person’s economic participation creates, holding all else fixed. In simple models, this in fact is how economies remunerate. In these models, compensation equals contribution.
Still, it is important that compensation be proportional to contribution, since, in general, total output will not equal the sum of marginal products. (It’s true only for the special case of constant returns to scale.) But in all cases, proportional compensation is possible.
All of these interpretations of “contribution” rely on the standard idea that economic value is subjective—that goods and services are valuable because, and only insofar as, they are desired by consumers. That might be disputed. Perhaps producers of firearms and social media make no contribution at all or indeed are destructive. That possibility is not captured in any of the aforementioned interpretations, and would require elaboration by a meritocrat so inclined.
Another question is how to disentangle individuals’ contributions from the collective economic effort. In particular, people’s contributions emanate not only from their labor, but from capital as well.
Suppose a worker produces 100 widgets per day in a factory. On his own, the worker could produce nothing. Without workers, the factory would sit idle. How many of those 100 widgets reflects the worker’s contribution? How many reflect the contribution of the capitalist who owns the factory?
This entanglement problem speaks to the essential role that equal opportunity plays in a meritocracy. If the capitalist inherited the factory from his father, it is hard to see why he should be rewarded on meritocratic grounds. His contributions do not reflect his merit. If, in contrast, the capitalist bought the factory himself, with money he earned via his economic contributions, that seems meritocratic.
An issue which has arisen in the literature, which is empirical rather than philosophical, is how well actual economies approximate this meritocratic ideal. One important way they do not is the presence of economic rent (see Lamont 1997 and Mulligan 2018a).
Classically, economic rents were payments for “free gifts of nature”, like unimproved land. Imagine a wild orchard controlled by O, who charges people for the right to harvest it. That portion of O’s income is economic rent. The orchard makes its contribution—bears fruit—whether O receives an income or not. This is obviously different from typical compensation, which is necessary to bring factors of production into use. If you want a person to make widgets, you have to pay him. Economic rents are, thus, payments to a person unrelated to his economic contribution. And unlike typical forms of income, economic rents can be taxed without loss of economic efficiency.
In contemporary economies, economic rents are diverse. They include income that (i) executives receive by gaining control over their own pay-setting (see, e.g., Bebchuk & Fried 2004); (ii) is obtained through luck (Bertrand & Mullainathan 2001); (iii) is connected to unproductive activity (think: hedge funds that exploit technical inefficiencies in markets, Bivens & Mishel 2013); and (iv) attractive people make because they are attractive—the beauty premium (Hamermesh & Biddle 1994).
Typically, when economists and philosophers object to economic rent it is on the grounds that it is inefficient. For the meritocrat, it is worse than that: It is unjust.
The most famous opponent of economic rent is Henry George, who states his opposition in recognizably meritocratic terms:
When all rent is taken by taxation for the needs of the community, then will the equality ordained by nature be achieved. No citizen will have an advantage over any other citizen save as is given by his industry, skill, and intelligence; and each will obtain what he fairly earns. Then, but not till then, will labour get its full reward, and capital its natural return. (1879: book VIII, chapter III, last paragraph)
One might wonder: Just how unequal would a meritocracy be? While the precise distribution of jobs, income, and wealth will depend on the particulars of the meritocratic theory, meritocracy would be egalitarian by contemporary standards. Observe that, in a meritocracy, differences in merit may arise in only two ways: differences in natural traits and differences in individual choice (about which skills to develop, what career to pursue, how much to work, etc.) (A meritocrat could even hold that equal opportunity requires nullifying differences in natural traits—§2.3—leaving individual choice as the sole source of inequality.)
In addition, in a meritocracy there is little to no inheritance of wealth. This is for the same reason that there is no inheritance of hereditary titles and their concomitant privileges: It violates equal opportunity. Inherited wealth also severs the critical connection between contribution and income. If one doesn’t deserve some wealth—which one doesn’t, if it’s inherited—then one doesn’t deserve the investment income it produces.
Further, the largest divergences between contribution and income are seen at the top of the distribution. Economic rents, for instance, are extracted by the very rich. Meritocratic policies to remedy the problem of rent have the effect of redistributing wealth from the top of the distribution downward.
All philosophical theories garner objections. Meritocracy is unusual in that its critics come from all over: egalitarians and libertarians; liberals and conservatives; leftists and reactionaries.
In A Theory of Justice, Rawls assures his readers that his theory would not produce a meritocratic society. That is not to say that there is no common ground between Rawls and meritocrats. Both agree that equal opportunity is an essential element of a just society. But Rawls pairs equal opportunity not with a meritocratic distributive rule, but with his Difference Principle. A just society, according to Rawls, will respond to merit only insofar as that benefits the worst-off members of society. Conceivably, by allowing meritorious citizens to earn more than non-meritorious citizens, we can grow the social pie and thereby enable greater redistribution to the worst-off. If that is the case, and only if that is the case, will Rawls’ theory pay any heed to merit. But merit’s role in Rawlsian distribution will always be mild, instrumental, and contingent.
Rawls has four other objections to meritocracy. The first targets desert-based theories of justice broadly. Rawls claims that no one deserves anything because all bases for desert originate in “fortunate family or social circumstances”. A person is intelligent, for instance, either because she has a naturally high IQ or because she was raised in an environment that cultivated that trait. Either way, that kind of “fortune” undermines desert-based distribution. (Marx makes a similar argument in “Critique of the Gotha Program”.)
Second, Rawls regards meritocracy as unworkable. It may just be practically impossible to track people’s merits in sufficient detail to enable merit-based distribution.
Third, perhaps meritocracy is only justified by “comprehensive doctrines”, and does not emerge from free and equal people in a system of cooperation (Rawls 1993). If that is so (and if Rawlsian public reason is sound), then that is a problem. But Margaret Holmgren (1986) and James Sterba (1974) argue that Rawlsian contractors would in fact choose a desert-based system of justice, like meritocracy.
Fourth, Rawls says that meritocracy is insufficiently democratic. This is interesting because later in A Theory of Justice he suggests an openness to meritocratic governance:
Now the ship of state is in some ways analogous to a ship at sea; and to the extent that this is so, the political liberties are indeed subordinate to the other freedoms that, so to say, define the intrinsic good of the passengers. Admitting these assumptions, plural voting may be perfectly just. (1971: 233)
5.2 Relational egalitarianism
By definition, egalitarians regard the ideal of equality as morally salient. Meritocrats, on the other hand, regard equality as irrelevant or even inimical to justice. (Unless we are talking about Aristotelian proportional equality.)
One important class of equality-based objections to meritocracy comes from relational egalitarians like Elizabeth Anderson (1999) and Harry Brighouse (1996), who argue that it is morally important that people be able to relate to each other as equals. That seems threatened in a meritocracy, in which differences in merit create differences in political power, social goods, or both. How could an unmeritorious person regard a meritorious person as an equal, especially when the latter is wealthier, or has more votes, than the former? Mightn’t there be problems of oppression, domination, and hierarchy in a meritocracy? Don’t meritocrats even celebrate hierarchies?
Relational egalitarianism is used to defend democratic political arrangements. Brighouse, for example, advances the “equal availability of political influence [EAPI]”, which includes the “one person, one vote” principle:
The argument for EAPI is that guaranteeing that equal influence will be available to them over our collective circumstances is a requisite of expressing respect for our fellow citizens. (1996: 123)
Thus for Brighouse, a meritocratic political arrangement (that, e.g., violated “one person, one vote”) would obstruct citizens’ mutual respect, and therefore be morally unacceptable. Analogous objections to meritocracy would be lodged by other relational egalitarians, with specifics depending on the particular relational egalitarian theory.
5.3 Democratic theory
Unsurprisingly, democrats object to meritocratic politics. There are three main classes of objection.
For epistemic democrats (e.g., Goodin & Spiekermann  and Landemore ), democracy is valuable and legitimate because of its ability to make correct (e.g., just) decisions. They either resist meritocrats’ claims (§3) about the ignorance and irrationality of the democratic voter or, more commonly, reject the inference from individual dysfunction to collective dysfunction. This is the most direct objection to meritocracy given that nearly all arguments for meritocratic governance are epistemic in character.
The most commonly-adduced argument for the “wisdom of the [democratic] crowd” is Condorcet’s Jury Theorem (Condorcet 1785). In its simplest form, the theorem considers a group of voters choosing between two alternatives (e.g., a Democrat and a Republican). Each voter has a probability of choosing the “correct” (e.g., more just) candidate. That probability is shared and >50%. Assuming votes are statistically independent and the group uses “one person, one vote”, Condorcet’s theorem tells us that (i) the larger the group gets, the more likely it is to choose correctly and (ii) the probability that the group chooses correctly goes to 100% as the number of voters goes to infinity.
The meritocrat may avail himself of three broad rejoinders here. First, he may deny the relevance of the model on the grounds that its assumptions are violated in the real world. (Statistical independence is particularly troublesome given the many ways voters interact.) Second, he may concede that the collective performance of democracy is good for Condorcetian reasons, but insist that meritocracy does better. For it too may enjoy benefits from aggregation. Third, he may reply that the theorem itself commends unequal political influence: When some citizens are more competent than others, “one person, one vote” is (generally) suboptimal. The group does better if more competent voters are given more influence (see, e.g., Nitzan & Paroush 1985).
Epistemic democrats have drawn on other theoretical grounds. Perhaps “diversity trumps ability” (Hong & Page 2004): Democracy effectively harnesses diversity within contemporary electorates, and thereby does better, epistemically, than meritocracy does. Or perhaps while democratic voters do frequently err, as meritocrats claim, those errors cancel out to allow an accurate minority to prevail—the “miracle of aggregation” (Surowiecki 2004).
Procedural democrats take a different tact. For them, what justifies democracy and rules out meritocracy is adherence to certain morally necessary procedures. For (pure) proceduralists, whether meritocracy “tracks the truth” or makes decisions better than democracy does is irrelevant (if indeed these notions make sense at all).
If, for example, some voting procedure—like “one person, one vote”—is required by justice, and democracy embodies this procedure while meritocracy rejects it, no further analysis is necessary: Democracy is justified and meritocracy is not. Many relational egalitarian arguments (§5.2) are proceduralist, and other kinds of proceduralist theories have been developed (see, e.g., Habermas 1992  and Waldron 1999).
Finally, Estlund (2008) has advanced an influential objection which is a hybrid of the epistemic and proceduralist approaches—epistemic proceduralism. Estlund argues against pure proceduralist approaches on the grounds that if procedural fairness were all we cared about, democracy would be no better than simply flipping a coin. In both cases, all citizens have an equal chance of affecting an election (because, in the latter case, none has any chance at all). So there must be an epistemic component to political justification.
On the other hand, the fact that some meritocratic system might do better than democracy is insufficient to justify it. Our political system, Estlund argues, must be “generally acceptable” to all reasonable citizens (i.e., this is a public reason argument). According to Estlund, of all the generally acceptable systems, democracy does best.
The conflict between meritocracy and libertarianism is most obvious when one considers right-libertarian theories, like Robert Nozick’s (1974). But conflict exists, too, for left-libertarian theories that have some common ground with meritocracy, like an affinity for equal opportunity (e.g., Otsuka’s ). (For a full discussion, see Mulligan 2018d.)
To begin with, the meritocrat’s distributive rule—hire, compensate, etc. on the basis of merit—violates a libertarian right to contract. For libertarians, business owners are free to hire whomever they want. They are not obligated to hire the most meritorious applicant. An owner may wish to hire on the basis of race, or gender, or with an eye toward maximizing profits. She may wish to hire a friend or family member. So long as owner and employee enter into their contract freely (and without fraud and the other typical caveats), libertarian justice is done.
A meritocratic government may enforce an alignment between contribution and compensation. But that requires government interventions into market exchanges which are unacceptable to the libertarian. These interventions could include, for example, high top marginal income tax rates and limits on executive compensation in order to disincentivize economic rent (§4.3).
Most libertarians also reject equal opportunity, and certainly the demanding form required under meritocracy. In a meritocracy, extensive redistribution enables (among other things) education and healthcare for the children of the poor. Coercive taxation is part and parcel of redistribution. Equal opportunity may also require that the government confiscate and redistribute estates. All of this is problematic from the libertarian perspective. (Although see Bird-Pollan 2013 and Braun 2010 for arguments that libertarianism is compatible with estate taxes.)
Friedrich Hayek (1960) explicitly criticizes merit-based distribution. He gives two arguments. First, he correctly observes that a meritocratic economy may not be optimally efficient.
We do not wish people to earn a maximum of merit but to achieve a maximum of usefulness at a minimum of pain and sacrifice and therefore a minimum of merit. (1960: 96)
Hayek’s point is that one way to distribute (the right way, to his mind) is with an eye toward maximizing the economic surplus; another way is to distribute on the basis of merit. This objection does not rest in a Nozickian freedom of contract but in libertarianism’s classical liberal tradition, which typically appeals to the consequentialist benefits of free markets.
Second, Hayek objects to the idea of a “merit czar” who would monitor market activity and intervene to enforce merit-based distribution. That would be tyrannical. However (as Schmidtz & Boettke [2012 ]) point out), this is not a normative objection to meritocracy but an objection to central planning. Indeed, Hayek’s argument can be turned around: Perhaps we should prefer market economies to central planning on the grounds that the former does a better job than the latter at recognizing merit.
One final objection, sometimes attributed to Hayek, is that meritocracy is heartless. In the actual world, the objection goes, “losers” can somewhat justifiably attribute their condition to having grown up poor or to external factors, like racial discrimination. Those are psychologically useful excuses. But in a meritocracy, in which there is equal opportunity and people are judged on their merits, those excuses are unavailable.
5.5 Other objections
Meritocracy promises efficiency benefits and other good consequences, but only contingently. Meritocracy is not a utilitarian theory, and focused utilitarian objections have been lodged against it (see, e.g., Durlauf 2008).
Meritocracy strikes some as insufficiently attentive to the needs of the poorest citizens; it is not a prioritarian theory (Wilson 2003). (Although if the poor are underpaid given their merit, and the rich are overpaid, as many meritocrats claim, then meritocracy will do better than the status quo from the prioritarian point-of-view. Meritocratic equal opportunity will also have an enormous effect.) Richard Arneson (1999) rejects Rawls’s Fair Equality of Opportunity (§5.1) as an unacceptable “compromise with meritocracy” because it constrains the prioritarian Difference Principle.
Some scholars make what is essentially an empirical argument, denying the existence of an elite class of citizens on which meritocratic governance can rely (Gunn 2019; Hannon 2022; Mendéz 2022; Reiss 2019). If the “meritocrats” are not more knowledgeable than common people, or if they suffer from unique and damaging biases, then, whatever its theoretical virtues, meritocracy cannot be operationalized.
6. The Public Debate
There’s been a flurry of recent, public-facing work on meritocracy. This work addresses meritocracy as a theory of justice (§4), and is largely critical (e.g., Carneval et al. 2020; Littler 2018; Mandler 2020; Markovits 2019; and Sandel 2020).
The public debate tends to be convoluted for two reasons. First, commentators often fail to make clear what they mean by “meritocracy”. The meritocratic ideal is more or less compelling depending on how it is defined (e.g., with robust equal opportunity or without). To avoid talking past each other, it is critical that commentators have a common definition in mind.
Second, one sees the classic conflation of the normative and the positive. This entry is concerned with the normative question: Ought we live in a meritocracy? (Or, almost equivalently, is meritocracy just?)
But then there is the positive question: Is the world meritocratic? Do people enjoy equal opportunity? All else equal, do poor children and rich children face equal prospects? Are jobs and income being distributed on the basis of merit? Or are non-meritocratic features—race, gender, family connections, appearance, luck, and so on—playing roles as well?
It is useful to partition commentators on meritocracy along the normative/positive dimensions. Some commentators (e.g., Mankiw ) believe that meritocracy is both desirable and largely realized in the actual world. Others (Mulligan [2018b]) think that meritocracy is desirable but that we do not live in one. Still others (Markovits ) say that we live in a meritocracy and that this is a bad thing. Finally, there are some (Gheaus ) who think that meritocracy is neither achieved nor a worthy ideal in the first place.
Further complicating matters is the way perceptions of merit affect the public’s normative evaluation of policy. Consider affirmative action. While divisive, many supporters of affirmative action and many opponents appear to agree morally: Both want the most meritorious applicant to be hired. What they disagree about is whether affirmative action contributes to or detracts from this shared goal. Supporters think that affirmative action nullifies racial bias and other forms of disadvantage, ensuring that the most meritorious applicant gets hired. Opponents of affirmative action think that the policy violates meritocratic hiring by giving some applicants advantage (and others, perforce, disadvantage) on the basis of race (see, e.g., Reyna et al. 2005).
As Suhay, Tenenbaum, and Bartola describe things,
Even controlling for partisanship and various demographic characteristics, perceptions of whether the U.S. economy is meritocratic are strongly associated with people’s views on taxation, social welfare policy, affirmative action, and presidential candidates…. If citizens could develop a shared understanding of the ways in which the American economy fails to deliver meritocratic outcomes, perhaps they would demand the two parties find common ground on policies designed to combat inequality. (2022: 9 ff.)
The way the public perceives social and economic realities—as meritocratic or not—appears to play a crucial role in their moral assessment of those realities.
A curious feature of the debate is how both opponents and supporters of meritocracy appeal to the same facts in making their cases. Michael Sandel (2020), for example, attacks today’s culture of “credentialism” (also known as “pedigree”), in which a diploma from an elite college is a de facto requirement for entry into elite professions. Frequently, a less meritorious but credentialed person (from, say, Harvard) is preferred to a more meritorious but uncredentialed person (UMass). Credentialism is, by Sandel’s lights, a feature of meritocracy.
Mulligan (2018b) also attacks credentialism, arguing that meritocracy is the solution to it rather than its cause. A Harvard education is not markedly better than a UMass education, but the returns to a Harvard education are enormously better than the returns to a UMass education. The returns to a Harvard education are, thus, largely rent (§4.3), and so credentialism is unmeritocratic.
The meritocracy debate is, to put it mildly, unsettled. This is a reflection of its philosophical richness. While meritocratic ideas have been expressed and implemented for millennia, we still struggle to say exactly what meritocracy is and if it is desirable. We do not have full answers to those questions. But perhaps we are now, at least, beginning to understand them.
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A number of scholars supported this work by providing comments on drafts or expert advice. I thank, in particular, Alex Andersson, Tongdong Bai, Nathan Ballantyne, Dan Bell, Huub Brouwer, Pete Groff, Jim Hankins, Jesse Hill, Greg Mankiw, Toby Napoletano, and an anonymous referee. I also wish to acknowledge the New Orleans Public Library, which provided valuable research support.