First published Mon Feb 9, 2004; substantive revision Wed Jul 5, 2023

We think of a boundary whenever we think of an entity demarcated from its surroundings. There is a boundary (a line) separating Maryland and Pennsylvania. There is a boundary (a circle) isolating the interior of a disc from its exterior. There is a boundary (a surface) enclosing the bulk of this apple. Sometimes the exact location of a boundary is unclear or otherwise controversial (as when you try to trace out the borders of a desert, the edges of a mountain, or even the boundary of your own body). Sometimes the boundary lies skew to any physical discontinuity or qualitative differentiation (as with the border of Wyoming, or the boundary between the upper and the lower halves of a homogeneous sphere). But whether sharp or blurry, natural or artificial, for every object there appears to be a boundary that marks it off from the rest of the world. Events, too, have boundaries — at least temporal boundaries. Our lives are bounded by our births and by our deaths; the soccer game began at 3pm sharp and ended with the referee’s final whistle at 4:45pm. It is sometimes suggested that even abstract entities, such as concepts or sets, have boundaries of their own (witness the popular method for representing the latter by means of simple closed curves encompassing their contents, as in Euler circles and Venn diagrams), and Wittgenstein could emphatically proclaim that the boundaries of our language are the boundaries of our world (1921: prop. 5.6). Whether all this boundary talk is coherent, however, and whether it reflects the structure of the world or simply the organizing activity of our mind, or of our collective practices and conventions, are matters of deep philosophical controversy.

1. Issues

Euclid defined a boundary as “that which is an extremity of anything” (Elements, I, def. 13). Aristotle defined the extremity of a thing as “the first thing beyond which it is not possible to find any part [of the given thing], and the first within which every part is” (Metaphysics, V, 1022a4–5). Together, these two definitions deliver the classic account of boundaries, an account that is both intuitive and comprehensive and offers the natural starting point for any further investigation into the boundary concept. Indeed, although Aristotle’s definition concerned primarily the extremities of spatial entities, it applies equally well in the temporal domain. Just as the Mason-Dixon line marks the boundary between Maryland and Pennsylvania insofar as no part of Maryland can be found on the northern side of the line, and no part of Pennsylvania on its southern side, so “the now is an extremity of the past (no part of the future being on this side of it), and again of the future (no part of the past being on that side of it)” (Physics, VI, 233b35–234a2). Similarly for concrete objects and events: just as the surface of an apple marks its spatial boundary insofar as the apple extends only up to it, so the referee’s whistle marks the temporal boundary of the game insofar as the game protracts only up to it. In the case of abstract entities, such as concepts and sets, the account is perhaps adequate only figuratively. Still, it is telling that one of the Greek words for ‘boundary’, ὅρος, is also a word for ‘definition’: as John of Damascus nicely put it, “definition is the term for the setting of land boundaries taken in a metaphorical sense” (The Fount of Knowledge, I, 8). Likewise, it is telling that in point-set topology the standard definition of a set’s boundary (from Hausdorff 1914, §7.2) reflects essentially the same intuition: the boundary, or frontier, of a set A is the set of those points all of whose neighborhoods intersect both A and the complement of A (where a neighborhood of a point p is, intuitively, a set of points that entirely “surround” p). It is not an exaggeration, therefore, to say that the Euclidean-Aristotelian characterization captures a general intuition about boundaries that applies across the board. Nonetheless, precisely this intuitive characterization gives rise to several puzzles that justify philosophical concern.

1.1 Owned vs. Unowned Boundaries

The first sort of puzzle relates to the intuition that a boundary separates two entities, or two parts of the same entity, which are then said to be in contact with each other. Following Smith (1997a: 534), imagine ourselves traveling from Maryland to Pennsylvania. What happens as we cross the Mason-Dixon line? Do we pass through a last point p in Maryland and a first point q in Pennsylvania? Clearly not, given the density of the continuum. As Aristotle put it, no two points can lie “in succession” to each other (Physics, VI, 231b6–9), so we should have to countenance an infinite number of further points between p and q, hence between the two States, contrary to their being in contact. But, equally clearly, we can hardly acknowledge the existence of just one of p and q, as is dictated by the standard mathematical treatment of the continuum (Dedekind 1872); either choice would amount to a peculiar privileging of one State over the other, an unacceptably arbitrary asymmetry. And it would seem that we cannot identify p with q, either, for we are speaking of two adjacent States; their territories cannot have any parts in common, not even pointy parts. So, where is the Mason-Dixon line, and how does it relate to the two adjacent entities it separates?

The puzzle can be generalized. Consider the dilemma raised by Leonardo da Vinci in his Notebooks (1938: 75–76): What is it that divides the atmosphere from the water? Is it air or is it water? Or consider Suárez’s worry in the Disputations (40, V, §58), repeatedly echoed by Peirce (1892: 546; 1893: 7.127): What color is the line of demarcation between a black spot and its white background? Perhaps figure/ground considerations could be invoked to provide an answer in this second case, based on the principle that the boundary is always owned by the figure — the background is topologically “open” (Jackendoff 1987, App. B). But what is figure and what is ground when it comes to two adjacent halves of the same black spot? What is figure and what is ground when it comes to Maryland and Pennsylvania? What happens when a seabird dives into the water? Indeed, it would be natural to suppose that all entities of the same sort behave alike — for instance, that all material bodies be figure-like entities, each possessing its own boundary. But then, how could any two of them ever be or come in contact, short of penetrability? (In this last form, the question goes back to Sextus Empiricus, Against the Physicists, I, 258–266, and is widely discussed in recent literature; see e.g. Kline and Matheson 1987, Godfrey 1990, Hazen 1990, Zimmerman 1996b, Lange 2002, §1.3, Hudson 2005, §3.1, Kilborn 2007, Sherry 2015.)

Consider also Plato’s classical version of the puzzle in regard to temporal boundaries (Parmenides, 156c–e): When an object starts moving, or a moving object comes to rest, is it in motion or is it at rest? As Aristotle later put it, the question arises precisely because “the now that is the extremity of both times must be one and the same”, for again, “if each extremity were different, the one could not be in succession to the other” (Physics, VI, 234a5–6). Of course, one could maintain that there is no motion at an instant, but only during an interval, as Aristotle himself held (231b18–232a18, 234a24–b9). Yet the question remains: Does the transitional moment belong to the motion interval or to the rest interval? (On this version of the puzzle, see Medlin 1963, Hamblin 1969, Strang 1974, Kretzmann 1976, Sorabji and Kretzmann 1976, Sorabji 1983, ch. 26, Mortensen 1985.)

Besides, the problem is not specific to the transition between motion and rest and admits of several variants that would seem to resist Aristotle’s solution. Gellius, for instance, tells us that the Middle Platonists were much concerned with the parallel question of whether a dying person dies when they are already in the grasp of death or while they still live (Noctes Atticae, VI, xiii, 5–6). This was thought to be a genuine insolubilis, short of conceding the absurdity that no one ever dies (Sextus Empiricus, Against the Physicists, I, 269), and the same could be said of the many variants discussed by later Platonists and by medieval and modern philosophers (see Strobach 1998 and Goubier and Roques 2018). Deep down, the puzzle is no less than a primary illustration of the paradoxical nature of instantaneous change (about which see the entry on change and inconsistency).

1.2 Natural vs. Artificial Boundaries

A second sort of puzzle relates to the fact that Aristotle’s mereological (parthood-based) definition, and the common-sense intuition that it captures, seem to apply only to the realm of continuous entities. Modulo the above-mentioned difficulty, the thought that Maryland and Pennsylvania are bounded by the Mason-Dixon line is fair enough. But ordinary material objects — it might be observed — are not truly continuous and speaking of an object’s boundary is like speaking of the “flat top” of a fakir’s bed of nails (Simons 1991: 91). On closer inspection, the spatial boundaries of physical objects are imaginary entities surrounding swarms of subatomic particles, and their exact shape and location involve the same degree of idealization of a drawing obtained by “connecting the dots”, the same degree of arbitrariness as any mathematical graph smoothed out of scattered and inexact data, the same degree of abstraction as the figures’ contours in a Seurat painting. Similarly, on closer inspection a body’s being in motion amounts to the fact that the vector sum of the motions of zillions of restless particles, averaged over time, is non-zero, hence it makes no sense to speak of the instant at which a body stops moving (Galton 1994: 4). All this may be seen as good news vis-à-vis the generalized puzzles of Section 1.1, which would not even get off the ground (at least in the form given above; see Smith 2007 and Wilson 2008 for qualifications). But then the question arises: Is our boundary talk a mere façon de parler? Even with reference to the Mason-Dixon line — and, more generally, those boundaries that demarcate adjacent parts of a continuous manifold, as when an individual cognitive agent conceptualizes a black spot as being made of two halves — one can raise the question of their ontological status. Such boundaries are puzzling; but are they real? After all, they stem entirely from our social practices and from the organizing activity of our intellect. It might be argued, therefore, that belief in their objectivity epitomizes a form of metaphysical realism that cries for justification. Do such boundaries really exist?

We may, in this connection, introduce a conceptual distinction between “natural” or bona fide boundaries, which would be objective insofar as they are grounded in some physical discontinuity or qualitative heterogeneity betwixt an entity and its surroundings, and “artificial” or fiat boundaries, which are not so grounded in the autonomous, mind-independent world (Smith 1995, building on Curzon 1907). The coastline of Britain, or the boundary separating a black spot from its white background, might be examples of the former, but geopolitical boundaries such as the Mason-Dixon line, or the boundary between the top and the bottom halves of the black spot, are clearly of the latter sort. Moreover, just as fiat boundaries may be involved in the partitioning of larger wholes into proper parts, so they are often at work when we circumclude a number of smaller entities into larger wholes: think of Benelux or Polynesia, but also of the easiness with which we represent the world as consisting of forests, swarms of bees, constellations, or when we group our actions into baseball games, electoral campaigns, wars, etc. (Smith 1999b). Now, insofar as they are not truly continuous, even the surfaces of ordinary material objects — hence the boundaries of the individual trees, the individual bees, the individual stars — may be said to involve fiat demarcations of just the same sort. (Cf. Goodman: “We make a star as we make a constellation, by putting its parts together and marking off its boundaries”; 1980: 213.) On closer inspection, even the boundaries of our individual actions may be seen in this light, indeed even a person’s birth and death may to some extent reflect conventional decisions and stipulations, witness the controversies on abortion and euthanasia (see the entries on life and the definition of death). On closer inspection, even the extolled coastline of Britain is to some extent fixed by us, witness the proverbial elusiveness of its objective length and location (Mandelbrot 1967). So the question arises: are there any natural, mind-independent, genuine bona fide boundaries? The natural/artificial distinction is intuitively clear; but how robust is it? Are there any concepts that truly carve the world “at the joints”, as per Plato’s butchering guidelines (Phaedrus, 265e)? And, if not, is the fiat nature of our boundary talk a reason to justify an anti-realist attitude towards boundaries altogether?

The question has deep ramifications. For once the fiat/bona fide opposition has been recognized, it is clear that it can be drawn not merely in relation to boundaries, but also in relation to those entities that may be said to have boundaries (Smith and Varzi 2000; Smith 2001, 2019; Tahko 2012; Davies 2019). If (part of) their boundaries are artificial — if they reflect the articulation of reality that is effected through human cognition and social practices — then those entities themselves may be viewed as conceptual constructions, a product of our worldmaking, hence the question of the ontological status of fiat boundaries becomes of a piece with the more general issue of the conventional status of ordinary objects and events. This is not to imply that we end up with imaginary or otherwise unreal wholes: as Frege wrote, the objectivity of the North Sea “is not affected by the fact that it is a matter of our arbitrary choice which part of all the water on the earth’s surface we mark off and elect to call the ‘North Sea’” (1884, §26). Or as James wrote, echoing Michelangelo: “The mind works on the data it receives very much as a sculptor works on his block of stone; in a sense the statue stood there from eternity” (1890: I/188). It does, however, follow that the entities in question would only enjoy an individuality as a result of our selective strokes: their objectivity is independent of us, but their individuality — their being the sorts of thing they are, perhaps even their having the identity and persistence conditions they have — would depend on our choices and our identification and reidentification criteria (Sidelle 1989; Heller 1990; Zerubavel 1991; Jubien 1993; Varzi 2011, 2016; Azzouni 2017; Piras 2020).

These ramifications go well beyond the concerns of metaphysics; they extend across the board, especially insofar as we have a tendency to call “natural” exactly those boundaries that best suit our parochial interests. In the geopolitical domain, for instance, the rhetoric with which certain frontiers have been claimed to be drawn by the hand of Nature, if not by the hand of God, has been responsible for some of the most tragic vicissitudes in our history, as even Lord Curzon — the epitome of British imperialism — recognized (1907: 54). There is by now a large body of literature on this topic, stemming mostly from the classic works of Reclus (1905–1908), Febvre (1922), and Ancel (1938) (see Broek 1941 and, for recent overviews, Rankin and Schofield 2004 and Fall 2010). But similar considerations apply to all sorts of atrocities that we committed and continue to commit in all sorts of domains. That rhetoric is at work every time we invoke Plato’s carving guidelines fraudulently and surreptitiously, every time we stigmatize as a “bad butcher” whoever holds views or follows practices that don’t match our own as though they were “against nature”. This does not mean that the guidelines themselves are corrupt; the realist is still free to take them seriously, if cautiously. But is there any viable way to implement them irrespective of our ideological, cultural, and individual biases? We can hardly be wrong in attributing fiat status to a boundary that is manifestly drawn by us; but who can vet the objectivity of a natural joint? Recent work in feminist metaphysics and epistemology and in the philosophy and sociology of race has brought these issues to the fore (see the entries on feminist metaphysics, feminist epistemology and philosophy of science, race, and the critical philosophy of race). No theory of boundaries can ignore them.

1.3 Sharp vs. Fuzzy Boundaries

A third worry relates to vagueness. Aristotle’s definition (as well as standard topology) suggests that there is always a sharp demarcation between the inside (interior) and the outside (exterior) of a thing. Yet it may be observed that ordinary objects and events, as well as the extensions of many ordinary concepts, may have boundaries that are in some sense fuzzy or indeterminate. Clouds, deserts, mountains, let alone the figures of an impressionist painting, all seem to elude the idealized notion of a sharply bounded entity. Likewise, the temporal boundaries of many events, let alone their spatial boundaries, seem to be indeterminate. When exactly did the industrial revolution begin? When did it end? Where did it take place? And certainly the concepts corresponding to many ordinary predicates, such as ‘bald’ or ‘heap’, do not possess definite boundaries, either. As again Frege famously put it, to such concepts there seems to correspond “an area that ha[s] not a sharp boundary-line all around, but in places just vaguely fade[s] away into the background” (1903: §56). How is such fuzziness to be construed?

One radical option would be to dismiss the question altogether. Wittgenstein, for instance, urged that “an indefinite boundary is not really a boundary at all” (1953: 45e). Or one might as well insist that the issue is purely epistemic: the fuzziness would lie exclusively in our ignorance about the exact location of the relevant boundaries, which in themselves would be perfectly sharp (Sorensen 1988; Williamson 1994). When taken at face value, however, the question is highly controversial. One may distinguish broadly between de re accounts and de dicto accounts. On a de re account, the fuzziness is truly ontological. Thus, pace Evans (1978), the boundary of, say, Mount Everest would be fuzzy insofar as there is no objective, determinate fact of the matter about which parcels of land lie on which side (Tye 1990; Copeland 1995; Morreau 2002; Hyde 2008). Similarly, a predicate such as ‘bald’ would be vague because it stands for a vague set, a set with a truly fuzzy boundary (Zadeh 1965; Goguen 1969). It is an open question, then, whether such boundary fuzziness would entail a corresponding indeterminacy in the identity conditions of the relevant bounded entities (see e.g. Noonan 2008 vs. Paganini 2017), just as it may be an open question whether it would entail an objective indeterminacy in the existence conditions of certain (other) entities, say, the mereological difference between Everest and the sum of its definite parts (see e.g. Hawley 2002 and Donnelly 2009). By contrast, a de dicto account would correspond to a purely linguistic or conceptual notion of vagueness. There is no fuzzy boundary demarcating Mount Everest on this view; rather, there are many distinct parcels of land, each with a precise border and precise existence and identity conditions, but our linguistic practices have not enforced a choice of any one of them as the official referent of the term ‘Mount Everest’ (Mehlberg 1958; Lewis 1986; McGee 1997). Similarly, on this view there is no such thing as a vaguely demarcated set of bald people; rather, our linguistic stipulations do not precisely specify which set of people, among the many that exist, corresponds to the extension of ‘bald’ (Fine 1975; Keefe 2000).

Whether the fuzziness of a given boundary should be construed de re or de dicto may be a case-by-case matter. No one thinks that all indeterminacy is a matter of worldly unsettledness, and the contrary claim, to the effect that boundary indeterminacy is always the product of semantic or representational imprecision, is highly contentious despite its distinguished pedigree (Russell 1923). Moreover, there is room for a middle third-way, according to which there is genuine ontological indeterminacy, but it doesn’t lie in the boundaries themselves; it would lie, rather, in the determinable/determinate structure of boundary properties (Wilson 20123), or in the fact that it is ontically indeterminate which precise boundaries things have (Akiba 2004; Barnes 2010; Abasnezhad and Hosseini 2014). Generally speaking, however, it would seem that the de re/de dicto alternative aligns rather closely with the bona fide/fiat opposition. With fuzzy boundaries of the fiat sort, a de dicto account suggests itself naturally: insofar as the process leading to the definition of a boundary may not be precise, the question of whether something lies inside or outside the boundary may be semantically indeterminate. On the other hand, this account does not sit well with boundaries of the bona fide sort. If any such boundary were fuzzy, it would be so independently of our cognitive or social articulations, hence a de re account would seem inevitable; the fuzziness of the boundary would lie in the way the world is (or isn’t). Thus, it would appear that a boundary may suffer from de dicto fuzziness if and only if it is of the fiat sort, and from de re fuzziness if and only if it is of the bona fide sort.

Either way, making room for fuzzy boundaries will open the door to the many difficulties that arise whenever vagueness phenomena are taken at face value. In particular, both de re and de dicto accounts will have to deal with the challenge of providing a way out of the sorites paradox: how can we ever cross a fuzzy boundary, if no single step can make a difference? And both accounts will have to provide a way of accommodating phenomena of higher order vagueness: not only may it be indeterminate whether something lies on one side or the other of a fuzzy boundary; it may also be indeterminate whether it is indeterminate whether it lies on one side or the other — and so on. (On these issues, see the entries on the Sorites paradox and vagueness.) Some authors think such challenges are insurmountable, and that de re and de dicto conceptions are equally misguided. There would be no words or entities with fuzzy boundaries; whenever we think there are, we are, rather, representing the world through concepts that are strictly speaking “boundaryless” (Sainsbury 1990).

1.4 Bodiless vs. Bulky Boundaries

A fourth source of concern relates to the intuition, implicit in Aristotle’s and Euclid’s definitions, that boundaries are lower-dimensional entities, i.e., have at least one dimension fewer than the entities they bound. The surface of a (continuous) sphere, for example, is two-dimensional (it has no “substance” or “divisible bulk”), the Mason-Dixon Line is one-dimensional (it has “length” but no “breadth”), and a boundary point such as the vertex of a cone is zero-dimensional (it extends in no direction). This intuition has become common currency in contemporary philosophy through Johnson (1922: 168; 1924: 163–164) and is germane to much of what we ordinarily say about boundaries. Yet it is problematic insofar as it contrasts with several independent intuitions that are of a piece with both common sense and philosophical theorizing. For instance, there is a standing tradition in epistemology (from Moore 1925 to Jackson 1977 and Gibson 1979) according to which boundaries play a crucial role in perception: we see (opaque) physical objects indirectly by seeing their surfaces. Yet it is not clear how one could see a whole just by seeing part of it (Chisholm 1957; Clarke 1965), even less how one could literally see parts that lack physical bulk altogether (Stroll 1986a, 1986b). Likewise, we often speak of surfaces as of things that may be pitted, or damp, or that can be scratched, polished, sanded, and so on, and it is unclear whether such predicates can be applied at all to immaterial entities. In such cases, it would rather seem that surfaces (and boundaries more generally; see Jackendoff 1991) are to be construed as “thin layers” that are schematized as having fewer dimensions than the wholes to which they apply. The same sort of schematization is commonplace in the geopolitical domain, where the boundary lines that we find depicted in ordinary maps and atlases may in fact correspond to border “belts”, or “zones”, of various kinds and widths (Prescott 1965). The very fact that the geographic notion of a natural boundary is often illustrated with reference to rivers, ravines, mountain ranges, etc. is indicative of this tendency. As Ratzel famously put it: “The border area is the reality, the border line the abstraction thereof” (1897: 448).

Arguably, this conceptual tension between boundaries understood as lower-dimensional entities and boundaries understood as thin layers, or zones, reflects an irreducible ambiguity in ordinary speech (Stroll 1977, 1979). And, arguably, it is only the first conception that gives rise to the puzzles outlined in the foregoing sections; bulky boundaries and border zones can be treated as ordinary, extended proper parts of the bodies and regions they bound. Yet a general theory of boundaries should have something to say about the second conception as well — and more generally about the interaction between the mathematical idealization associated with the former conception and the physical, cognitive, and philosophical significance of the latter (Stroll 1988; Simons 1991; Galton 2007).

The issue also relates to the question of whether there can be extended mereological simples. The ancient atomists had no doubts, with Democritus famously holding that the ultimate constituent of reality, while indivisible, come in an infinite variety “differing in size and in shape” (Aristotle, Metaphysics, III, 203b2). Today it is more common to assume that the mereological structure of a thing always matches perfectly that of its spatio-temporal receptacle (what Varzi 2007 calls “mirroring” and Uzquiano 2011 “harmony”), which would imply the opposite answer. Nevertheless, in recent years several authors have rejected the assumption, seriously reviving the hypothesis of mereological simples that occupy extended regions of space and/or time (see e.g. Markosian 1998, Parsons 2000, Simons 2004, Braddon-Mitchell and Miller 2006, and McDaniel 2007 along with the entry on location and mereology). Insofar as the lower-dimensional nature of boundaries may be construed in terms of their being indivisible along one or more dimensions, as opposed to unextended along those dimensions (a conception encouraged also by some medieval philosophers, e.g. Ibn Sīnā, the Ilāhiyyāt of Kitāb al-Šifā, II, ii, 4–6), such a view would suggest that also a boundary’s spatio-temporal extension may transcend its mereological structure; the boundary would lack divisible bulk, but it might nonetheless possess divisible extent. A boundary point, for instance, would be pointy in that it has no proper parts, though it could extend over a (small) one-dimensional, a two-dimensional, or even a three-dimensional region. Again, such extended boundaries would be refreshingly unproblematic. As with their divisible bulky cousins, one could easily explain how we can see them, for instance, or polish them, scratch them, etc. However, they would also raise questions of their own. Above all: How would such boundaries connect to the things they bound? Would there be a further, unextended boundary separating the two (and matching the unextended boundary between the corresponding receptacles)? In the case of boundaries with divisible bulk, the answer to the latter question is obviously in the affirmative. It is an open question, however, whether the same answer should apply to extended indivisible boundaries.

2. Theories

So boundaries are, on the one hand, central to the common-sense picture of the world and yet, on the other, deeply problematic. We may accordingly distinguish two main sorts of theories, depending on whether one is willing to take the problems at face value (realist theories) or to bypass them altogether, treating boundaries as fictional abstractions of some sort (non-realist theories).

2.1 Realist Theories

Most realist theories about boundaries, construed as lower-dimensional entities, share the view that such entities are ontological parasites: points, lines, and surfaces cannot be separated and cannot exist in isolation from the entities they bound (pace Suárez, who thought that God would be capable of such marvels; see Disputation 40, V, §41). This view does justice to the intuition that boundaries, if real, are somewhat “less real” than the entities they bound, and as such it goes back to Aristotle (Metaphysics, XI, 1060b12–16) and has been defended e.g. by Boethius (Second Commentary I, xi, 14–21), revived by Abelard (Glosses on Porphyry, 8.1–4), and eventually backed up by Brentano (1976) and his pupils, especially Husserl in his third Logical Investigation (1901). Of course, the notion of ontological dependence is itself open to several interpretations (see Koslicki 2014 and the entry on ontological dependence). In the case of boundaries, it is generally agreed that the relevant relation is one of rigid existential dependence: if x is a boundary of y, then necessarily x exists only if y exists (Chisholm 1984, 1994). Realist theories may differ significantly, however, with regard to how such rigidly dependent, lower-dimensional entities relate to the extended entities they bound.

To illustrate, consider again the first puzzle of Section 1 (owned vs. unowned boundaries). Let A and B be any two extended entities separated by a common boundary, such as Maryland and Pennsylvania. Then we may distinguish four main views (Varzi 1997; Strobach 1998, pt. II).

(1) The boundary may belong neither to A nor to B. This was, ultimately, Leonardo’s view (1938: 76) and is perhaps the least popular among recent philosophers (though see e.g. Hestevold 1986 and Schmolze 1996). It implies that contact may obtain between A and B even if both A and B are topologically open, so long as nothing lies between them except for their common, outer boundary — i.e., so long as the closure of A (A plus its boundary) overlaps the closure of B (B plus its boundary). So, on this view, there is no last point p of Maryland just as there is no first point q of Pennsylvania: the States of the Union do not, strictly speaking, use up the whole territory. In the temporal realm, the view is somewhat more popular (Sorensen 1986), for it may be seen as providing a quietist way out of the transition puzzles mentioned in section 1.1. Cf. Epicurus: “Death is nothing to us, since so long as we exist, it is not with us; but when death comes, then we do not exist” (Letter to Menoeceus, 1926: 85). On the other hand, it is precisely on such grounds that some early modern Islamic philosophers, e.g. Mullā Ṣadrā, argued that change of substantial nature can never be instantaneous and must therefore be gradual: insofar as it is impossible for there to be “formless” matter, there can never be an instant when something has lost the previous form and not yet gained the new one (Asfār, IV, 274).

(2) The boundary belongs either to A or to B, though it may be indeterminate to which of A and B it belongs. This view builds on Bolzano’s classic analysis of the continuum (1851: §66), which in turn is mirrored by the standard account of point-set topology (see e.g. Kelley 1955). It implies that contact may obtain between A and B only when either A or B is topologically closed (i.e., contains its own boundary) in the relevant contact area while the other is topologically open, though the appeal to indeterminacy allows one to leave the matter unsettled. This indeterminacy, in turn, may be construed as semantic or as epistemic, if not metaphysical, depending on whether the relevant boundary is of the fiat sort, as with the Mason-Dixon line, or of the bona fide sort. (Similarly in the temporal realm; see e.g. Kamp 1980, Le Poidevin 2000, Pickup 2022.) All of this can be explained without resorting to the machinery of abstract set theory; a mereotopological account, where the relevant topological distinctions are elucidated in terms of the part-whole relation, provides a viable alternative (Smith 1996; Casati and Varzi 1999, Ch. 5; Varzi 2007, §2.4.1) and can be suitably adjusted to fit even the most liberal views of spatio-temporal receptacles (Hudson 2001). Nonetheless the view has its costs. From a naive perspective, the distinction between open and (semi-)closed entities may seem unwarranted, if not “monstrous” (as Brentano 1976: 146 put it). From a metaphysical perspective, it introduces asymmetries that may be found disturbing, e.g. when it comes to explaining why contact is only possible between entities of opposite sorts (Zimmerman 1996b), or why each sort will have different part-whole grounding properties (Smid 2015; Calosi 2018).

(3) The boundary may belong both to A and to B, but the relevant overlap would be sui generis precisely insofar as it would involve lower-dimensional parts. Modulo the “extended simples” view mentioned in Section 1.4, boundaries do not take up space-time and so, on this view, it is not implausible to say that (for example) the Mason-Dixon line belongs to both Maryland and Pennsylvania. This was probably Aristotle’s own position, according to which “things are called continuous when the touching limits of each become one”, i.e., “one in number though two in definition” (Physics, V, 227a11, VIII, 262a20). In some cases, however, this theory may require a blunt rejection of the principle of non-contradiction (Priest 2006, chs. 11ff; Cotnoir and Weber 2015; Weber 2021, §1.3). With reference to the Suárez-Peirce puzzle, for instance, if the line of demarcation between a black spot and its white background belongs to both, then it must be both white and black. A way out would be to deny that boundaries, qua lower-dimensional, can enjoy the same sort of properties that characterize extended bodies, color properties being among them (Galton 2003: 167–168). It is unclear, however, whether this conservative strategy can be generalized. For instance, a contradiction would seem to resurface with reference to Plato’s puzzle and its variants in the temporal realm (Priest 1982, 1985; Tanaka 1998): at the instant when a (homogeneous) object undergoes the transition from being stationary to moving it would have to be both stationary and moving; at the instant when someone dies, the self-same person would have to be both alive and dead; and so on. Thus, on the face of it, this is really a theory that would take us straight to Hegel: “The limit is the mediation in virtue of which something and other each both is and is not” (1833: 99).

(4) There really are two boundaries, one belonging to A and one belonging to B, and these two boundaries are co-located — that is, they coincide spatially without overlapping mereologically. This view may be traced back to Suárez, Disputation 40 (though see Schmaltz 2019 and 2020, ch. 3, vs. Zimmerman 1996a), was distinctly endorsed by Brentano (1976), and in recent times has found many a follower, from Rhees (1938) to Sanford (1967) to Chisholm (1984, 1993, 1996), Smith (1997a, 1999a), and Baumann et al. (2014, 2016). It may also have been another aspect of Aristotle’s conception, insofar as he held that things can be in contact, or contiguous, without being continuous in the sense mentioned in (3): in that case, Aristotle writes, “their extremities are together”, i.e., “are in one primary place” (Physics, V, 226b22–23; see Bartha 2001, Pfeiffer 2018, ch. 7, Shatalov 2020, Sattler 2020, ch. 7, and Katz 2022 for extensive discussion). Apart from Aristotle’s peculiar distinction, however, the main motivation for this view is to do away with the “monstrous” ontological differentiation between closed and open entities while preserving the important distinction between contact and overlap. The spatial coincidence of boundaries would of course violate Locke’s impenetrability principle, to the effect that whatever exists anywhere at any time “excludes all of the same kind” (Essay, II-xxvii-1). Yet, again, the violation would be sui generis insofar as the entities in question do not take up any space, so one need not find it as outrageous as Bayle, for instance, made it sound (see Dictionary, art. Zeno, remark G). Indeed, it could be argued that a coincidence-based account has several derivative advantages when it comes to modeling a number of phenomena that are topologically problematic, such as the possibility of collision or the fusion and fission of material bodies (Cotnoir 2019). Whether such considerations are enough to block other worries, however, remains to be determined. For instance, to the extent that lines can be colored, it would follow — as Brentano (1976: 41) explicitly acknowledged — that the presence of a black spot on a white background would deliver two coincident boundaries, one black and one white. Would that result in something grey? (For discussion, see Massin 2018 and Nuñez Erices 2019; see also Chisholm 1980 and Strobach 1998, ch. II.2, for parallel worries in the temporal realm.)

These four views are mutually exclusive, but they need not be exhaustive and can be further articulated or integrated to address the issues raised by the other puzzles of Section 1. For example, with reference to the second puzzle (Section 1.2), Smith and Varzi (2000) consider a double-barred theory that is of type (2) with respect to bona fide boundaries and of type (4) with respect to fiat boundaries (so there is no coincidence of real boundaries but merely of fiat articulations). Similarly, the indeterminacy hypothesis advocated by type-(2) theories can be regarded as being of a piece with the sort of indeterminacy that is involved in the phenomenon of boundary fuzziness (Section 1.3). For fiat boundaries, for instance, a de dicto account may be applied in both cases: statements about such boundaries are true if and only if they are super-true, i.e., true under every admissible way of precisifying the relevant fiat articulations (Varzi 2001 and references therein). There are other options, too. For instance, Hudson (2001; 2005, ch. 3) offers an account of boundaries that permits instances of each of (1), (2) and (3) (and without forfeiting the principle of non-contradiction). It is also possible to reject the basic mereotopological setting that leads to the taxonomy above and, with it, the need to choose among (1)–(4). See, for instance, Breysse and De Glas (2007) for a formal proposal in this spirit and Galton (1996, 2004), Donnelly and Smith (2003), and Donnelly (2003, 2004) for theories where the treatment of boundaries of different dimensions (e.g. points as opposed to lines or surfaces) results in “layered” mereotopological systems. Finally, see Kraus (2016) for a theory that does away altogether with the assumption that boundaries must be dependent parts.

2.2 Non-realist Theories

Non-realist theories come in a large variety, especially insofar as the banishment of boundaries can be part of broader projects concerned with the social and cognitive construction of everyday reality. Perhaps the most radical view is that boundaries should not be reified for the simple reason that their character is purely qualitative, natural or artificial as the case may be. As H. H. Price once put it, “there is really no such entity as a surface; there are only solid things thus and thus surfaced” (1932: 106). By extension, there would really be no such things as boundaries, only entities thus and thus bounded. This is straightforward ontological eliminativism, as when one says that there are no holes but only objects thus and thus holed (Lewis and Lewis 1970: 206), or no colors but only things thus and thus colored (Quine 1948: 29–30). The main challenge, then, is to go beyond the informal suggestion and articulate a systematic way of dealing in a similar fashion with every ordinary sentence that seems to call for genuine reification. Can every boundary-referring noun-phrase be de-nominalized this way? Can every quantification over boundaries be reinterpreted as a quantification over bounded objects? Etc.

For the most part, however, non-realist accounts have concentrated on the more limited task of reinterpreting ordinary boundary talk in the context of geometric and topological theorizing. Generally speaking, such accounts are not necessarily expression of an eliminativist ontology. They are, rather, boundary-free. More precisely, they are free from any genuine commitment to boundaries understood as the lower-dimensional entities endorsed by the realist theories outlined in Section 2.1. The common idea, here, is that deep down all such talk involves some sort of “abstraction” — an idea that can be found already in the medieval and modern debates on anti-indivisibilism (Zupko 1993; Zimmerman 1996a; Holden 2004; Shapiro and Hellman 2021) and that made its way into contemporary formal theories via Lobačevskij’s New Principles (1835–1938). It is this idea that has recently become the focus of renewed attention in connection with the hypothesis that the universe might consist of “atomless gunk”, as Lewis (1991: 20) calls it, i.e., that either space and time or matter, or both, divide forever into smaller and smaller parts (Zimmerman 1996b; McDaniel 2006; Hudson 2007; Russell 2008). What sort of abstraction would be involved here? And how can one account for our ordinary and mathematical talk about boundaries if these are to be conceived of as mere abstractions?

With special reference to the boundaries of spatio-temporal particulars, we may distinguish two main approaches. (Our taxonomy, here, will be rather sketchy; for a fuller picture, see Vakarelov 2007, Hahmann and Grüninger 2012, and the monographs by Gorzka 2003 and Gruszczyński 2016.)

(A) Substantivalists about space-time may see the abstraction as stemming from the relationship between a particular and its spatio-temporal receptacle, relying on the topology of space-time to account for our boundary talk when it comes to specific cases. It has been held, for instance, that material bodies are the material content of open regions of space, more specifically regular open regions, boundary contact between bodies being explained in terms of overlap between the closures of their receptacles. (An open region is regular if it is equal to the interior of its own closure. This rules out, for instance, regions lacking what would commonly be described as a single interior point, or regions with ingrowing boundary “cracks”.) This view can be traced back to Descartes (Principles II.15) and has been explicitly articulated by Cartwright (1975). It does, to be sure, yield a hybrid account, an account that does away only with the boundaries of material bodies (and, by extension, events); their receptacles are typically subject to a standard topology in which boundaries are treated as per theory (2) above. Yet this account is enough to bypass the puzzles of Section 1 (especially 1.1) insofar as there is no pressing problem in assuming a standard topology for space-time and, with it, the distinction between open and closed regions. The main problem for the theory is, rather, to justify the claim that only some regions (open regular regions, for instance) are receptacles. (See Hudson 2002 for a challenge to this view, and Uzquiano 2006 for a defense.) On the other hand, there are more radical, non-hybrid theories that do away with boundaries also with regard to the structure of space-time. Topological theories of this sort may be found e.g. in Johanson (1981), Randell, Cui, and Cohn 1992), Asher and Vieu (1995), Forrest (1996), Roeper (1997), Pratt-Hartmann (2007), and Hellman and Shapiro (2018), but see also Gerla (1990) for a geometric account, Skyrms (1993) and Arntzenius (2008) for measure-theoretic alternatives, and Lando and Scott (2019) for a robust approach combining both topology and measure theory. In the temporal realm, the same approach has inspired much work in so-called interval semantics for tense logic, beginning with Hamblin (1971) and Humberstone (1979).

(B) If one is not a substantivalist about space and/or time, the abstractionist approach is even more tempting. For if space and/or time are themselves abstractions emerging from concrete relations among material bodies and/or events, then, as Whitehead put it, it seems illegitimate to “assume sub silentio” that boundary elements are among the latter (1919: 5). In particular, it seems natural to treat them as mere “conceptual limits” emerging from the progressive contemplation of ever thinner layers of the bounded entities with which we are directly acquainted (1916: 730). The best formulation of this idea is Whitehead’s own theory of “extensive abstraction”, originally developed in purely mereological terms and later refined in mereotopological terms from suggestions by De Laguna (1921, 1922) and Nicod (1924: I.4) (see Whitehead 1929, Part IV) and variously endorsed by Broad (1923: ch. 1), Russell (1927: ch. 28), Stebbing (1930: ch. 23), and eventually Menger (1940) and others. On this account, boundary elements are no longer viewed as lower-dimensional entities; they are, rather, higher-order constructs, viz. equivalence classes of convergent series of nested bodies “packed one within the other like the nest of boxes of a Chinese toy” (Whitehead 1920: 61), but with no smallest box. For example, the series of all concentric spheres included in a given sphere converges to the point at the center, the series of all concentric right cylinders of equal length included in a given cylinder converge to the axial line, and so on. Call a convergent series of this sort an abstractive class if and only if it has no bottom, i.e., if and only if no object is part of every member of the class. And call two co-convergent abstractive classes equivalent if and only if every member of the first class has a member of the second as part, and vice versa. For instance, an abstractive class of spheres is equivalent to the class of all the cubes inscribed in the spheres, which converge to the same point at the center, etc. Then each boundary element can be viewed as an equivalence class of suitably defined converging abstractive classes, and if things are done properly, one can eventually reconstruct ordinary talk about lower-dimensional boundaries as talk about such higher-order entities. (For details, see Clarke 1985 and Varzi 2021.) This approach has analogues also in the temporal realm, where instants can be construed more directly as convergent classes of nested time intervals, which in turn can be construed as sets of overlapping events. (The locus classicus, directly inspired by Whitehead’s thinking, is Russell 1914, but see also Walker 1947, Kamp 1979, van Benthem 1983, and Vakarelov 2015.) Moreover, the approach itself is amenable to several variants, depending on exactly which primitives one assumes. Whitehead himself eventually settled on a framework based on a primitive binary relation of topological connection; a popular alternative formulation, following Tarski (1929), uses instead parthood along with as a special unary primitive ‘x is a sphere’, defining e.g. a geometric point as the class of all spheres that are concentric — in a suitably defined sense — with a given one. (For details and developments of this alternative approach, see Bennett 2001, Gruszczyński and Pietruszczak 2008, Betti and Loeb 2012, and Clay 2017; for extensions and further variants, Borgo and Masolo 2010, Borgo 2013, and Gerla and Gruszczyński 2017.) Another influential variant, though developed independently, is the point-free topology of Grzegorczyk (1960), which is based on parthood along with a primitive notion of ‘spatial body’ and a binary relation of separation, i.e., the opposite of connection. This theory is closely related to Whitehead’s (see Biacino and Gerla 1996) and has recently been worked out in full detail by Gruszczyński and Pietruszczak (2018, 2019). (Point-free topologies were initially called pointless topologies, following Johnstone 1983, but the terminology has aptly been updated.)

From a technical viewpoint, these two approaches tend to overlap in many ways. In particular, Whitehead’s technique is often used also in the context of substantivalists theories, as with the “Region Connection Calculus” of Randell et al. (1992), which has proved highly influential in the computational treatment of boundary-free spatial reasoning. Moreover, both sorts of theories face a number of common questions when it comes to specifying the ontological assumptions on which they rest. Formally they are all boundary-free, which means that, in a logical setting, their variables are meant to range exclusively over extended regions or bodies. Yet not all such things are equal; is there room for interesting distinctions? For instance, should these theories have room for the standard topological distinction between open and closed entities? Should they preserve the distinction between regular entities and irregular ones? Some authors find such distinctions unintelligible from a boundary-free perspective. Randell et al. (1992), for instance, rule them out at the outset, and Bostock (2010) rules them out by argument. However others disagree, beginning with Clarke (1981), who actually provides detailed instructions on how to retrieve all standard topological distinctions within the framework of Whitehead’s theory. (For other theories, see Cohn and Varzi 2003.) Of course, retrieving them formally doesn’t mean much; the distinctions may still collapse. But do they — or should they — collapse?

Other questions may be more or less pressing depending on one’s general philosophical concerns. For example, a common objection to type-(B) theories is that the abstractness of boundaries would seem to run afoul of the abstractness of set-theoretic constructions. One can see and paint the surface of a table, and in principle one could even see and paint an infinite series of ever thinner layers of table-parts; but one cannot see or paint the set of these parts, even less an equivalence class of such sets (Simons 1991: 96). Even de Laguna, one of the very first sponsors of Whitehead’s method, remarked that the identification of points and other boundaries with abstractive sets is open to serious misinterpretation: “Although we perceive solids, we perceive no abstractive sets of solids […] In accepting the abstractive set, we are as veritably going beyond experience as in accepting the solid of zero-length” (1922: 460). This is not a formal objection. Indeed, there are philosophers who, such as Maddy (1980), believe that sets can be perceived, at least sets of physical objects such as tables. Nonetheless, the perceptibility of an infinite equivalence class remains problematic. It is especially problematic if, as in Whitehead’s case, the motivation for going boundary-free is grounded on a broadly empiricist epistemology.

Finally, there is room for speculations concerning different non-realist strategies one might consider besides type-(A) and type-(B) theories. At the moment, the main option that received some attention in the literature appears to be an “operationalist” account of the sort advocated by Adams (1984, 1996), where the abstractive process by which boundary elements are constructed out of concrete observables is explained in terms of “operational tests”. Such an account might meet De Laguna’s worries. Arguably, however, it is best regarded as a parallel story. It may offer an explanation of our empirical knowledge concerning boundaries, but it remains ultimately neutral with regard to their ontological status.

3. Other Topics

The issues and theories outlined above define the main coordinates within which the nature of boundaries has been a subject of philosophical concern since antiquity. To this, we may add that in recent times the range of concerns has broadened significantly, with ramifications that extend well beyond the scope of formal metaphysical theorizing.

3.1 Border Studies

We already mentioned, in this regard, the growing interest in the use and abuse of boundary concepts in the geopolitical domain, particularly in reference to the traditional opposition between so-called natural borders and artificial borders (Section 1.2). Geopolitical borders are the spatial records of very complex patterns of interaction — through political agreement, unilateral stipulation, or warfare — between neighboring communities. They are, as Foucher (2007: 28) put it, “traces of time inscribed in space”, always in flux between division and union, between the “scars” of history (Mozer 1973: 14) and the “seams” of geography (Cinalli and Jacobson 2020: 43). Even in times of peace there are entire industries (of real estate law, cadastral registration, land surveying) as well as a host of administrative offices (of passport control, customs and immigration check, etc.) that are devoted to the maintenance of such traces (Crawford 2022). The ancient Romans actually had a god, Terminus, presiding over all boundary markers, with a major “Terminalia” festival celebrated yearly on the last day of their calendar (Dionysius, Roman Antiquities, II, 74; Ovid, Fasti, II, 639–684; Plutarch, Roman Questions, XV, Numa, XVI).

It is hard to regard all of this as being merely about some abstract façon de parler. But it is equally hard to locate the source of its enormous importance in our political and social lives, disentangling myth from science, culture from nature, power from government. The emergence of “border studies” as a broadly interdisciplinary field of research bears witness to the increasing awareness of these difficulties and of their practical and theoretical importance (see Wastl-Walter 2011 and Wilson and Donnan 2012 for comprehensive handbooks). And while the interdisciplinary nature of the field draws primarily from geography, anthropology, sociology, environmental psychology, economics, political science, and law, deep down the issues belong to the very core of political philosophy and deliver further perspectives from which to assess the philosophical significance of borders, frontiers, and boundaries more generally. (See e.g. the recent publication of Cooper and Tinning 2019.)

3.2 Boundaries in the Life Sciences

Similar considerations apply to the growing interest in boundary-related issues in the life sciences and the philosophy thereof. By themselves, the remarks of section 1.2 on the natural/artificial opposition are already enough to suggest a boundary-based reading of many contemporary debates on, say, the foundations of biology. Biological taxonomies are the result of “circumscribing” and classifying individual organisms into taxa of various ranks (species, genera, families, etc.), so any controversy between realists vs. antirealists, essentialists vs. conventionalists, or even monists vs. pluralists may to some extent be seen as stemming from different ways of assessing the ontological status of the relevant taxonomic boundaries (cf. Hull 1974, Dupré 1993, Kitcher 2001, Ereshefsky 2001). The vicissitudes of the chimera, in ancient mythology (Ebbesen 1986) as well as in contemporary genetics (Bonnicksen 2009, Hyun and De Los Angeles 2019), are perhaps the best illustration of science’s constant struggling with the status of such boundaries, with all that it entails, on ethical and scientific grounds, in the special case of the boundaries that define the human species (see the entry on human/non-human chimeras).

Yet this is only one way in which boundaries are at work, and open to philosophical theorizing, in the field of biology. Another, equally important way emerges in the study of the organism-environment relations that are so central to the understanding of evolution. Consider, for instance, the partitioning of the ecological environment effected by what biologists call “niche construction” (Odling-Smee et al. 2003; Sultan 2015). There are niches that are fully enclosed within a physical retainer, such as an egg, a closed oyster shell, or a larval chamber; niches that, like a kangaroo pouch or a bear’s cave, are bound partly by a physical boundary and partly by an immaterial boundary marking (more or less vaguely) the opening through which the organism is free to leave; niches that are bounded by a physical retainer to a very low extent, as with the niche of the oxpecker removing ticks from the back of an African rhinoceros (bounded by a part of the rhinoceros’s hide); and, finally, niches that lack a physical retainer altogether and are bordered entirely by boundaries of the fiat sort, as with a fish orbiting underwater or a falcon in the sky circling above the area where its prey is to be found.

It is remarkable how closely such a variety of niche structures mirrors the variety of boundary structures that we find in the geopolitical world (Smith and Varzi 1999, 2002). The prima facie strength and protective function of any particular niche — what Gibson (1979) calls its “affordance character” — is to a large degree determined by the sort of boundaries that delimit it. And just as the history of geopolitical boundaries is, to a great extent, a history of the “razor’s edge” on which hang suspended all issues “of life or death to nations” (Curzon 1907: 7), so the history of evolution and biological survival is, in many ways, a history of the growth in complexity of “the constant interplay of the organism and the environment” (Lewontin 1978: 215). The mechanisms of what has come to be called “autopoiesis” (Maturana and Varela 1972) can similarly be described in terms of a system’s ability to maintain and renew itself by regulating its composition and conserving its boundaries. And once we see things from this perspective, it is a short step to see the same mechanisms at work also in the structuring of our relations with the social environment, from personal space (Hull 1966) to human territoriality at large (Sack 1986; Taylor 1988). In all these cases, the question is not only what boundaries are; it is how they function and how they serve the things they bound (Ludu 2016; Werner 2021, 2022).

3.3 Boundary Perception

Lastly, it needs stressing that boundaries occupy a prominent position also in the mapping of reality that emerges from our individual cognitive acts. Above all, the contents of perception tend to be structured in terms of figure-ground organization, which is to say the organization of the visual field into objects that stand out from their surroundings (Rubin 1915), and here again we find a tension between bona fide and fiat articulations whose philosophical significance extends well beyond the remarks of Section 1.2.

On the one hand, the objects we see and track most easily are those that stand out by virtue of the natural boundaries they seem to enjoy. The use of edge-detection techniques for object recognition in computer vision (see e.g. Davies 2012) is motivated precisely by this consideration, for in normal circumstances such boundaries correspond to salient discontinuities in the depth and brightness of the perceived scene. The very fact that humans, from the time they are infants, tend to reify such non-entities as holes and shadows just as easily as they do with regard to material objects (Giralt and Bloom 2000; Nelson and Palmer 2001) lends evidence to the importance of “natural” discontinuities in the segmentation of the visual scene: the possession of a genuine boundary is a sign of objecthood.

On the other hand, it is also a fact that sometimes we parse the visual scene in terms of boundaries that involve the creative contribution of our perceptual apparatus, which, as we know from Schumann’s classic work on illusory contours, tends to articulate reality in terms of continuous borders even when such borders “are objectively not there” (1900: 26). Kanizsa’s triangle (1955) is perhaps the example that best epitomizes this phenomenon. But the same could be said of many other ways in which fiat boundaries emerge from the figure-ground organization of the visual field through the basic factors studied by Gestalt psychologists, such as proximity, continuity, closure, color and texture similarity, good form, etc. (Wertheimer 1923; Koffka 1935). There is, we said, no bona fide boundary in a Seurat painting, except perhaps around each individual color spot; yet we see each “figure” as though it possessed a regular contour.

In Section 1.2 we noted that such considerations are relevant to the metaphysical question of whether all boundaries — and, with them, the identity and persistence conditions of those things that have boundaries — are on closer look the product of our own worldmaking, a sign of that mismatch between appearance and reality that may lead one to embrace an across-the-board anti-realist stance towards the ontology of ordinary objects and events. That is one important line of philosophical inquiry. But one may also want to know more about the structure of appearance as such. One may be interested in the mechanisms of perceptual organization insofar as they may reveal something about us. This is a distinguished subject of inquiry in philosophy over and above its significance for psychology (see Wagemans 2015 for a representative collection of recent work). It is, for sure, an important subject of further inquiry for anyone interested in the surreptitious, pervasive, stubborn, enigmatic intrusion of boundaries in our picture of the world.

4. Excerpts from the Literature

The entry concludes with a sample of significant passages from the philosophical literature, listed in approximate chronological order. Some come from texts cited explicitly in the foregoing sections; the others provide further indicative evidence of the many dimensions along which the boundary concept has been analyzed and subjected to philosophical inquiry throughout history.

Zhuangzi, Essentials for Nurturing Life, 2 (1994: 26–27)
The cook put down his cleaver and responded. […] In accord with the natural grain, I slice at the great crevices, lead the blade through the great cavities. Following its inherent structure, I never encounter the slightest obstacle even where the veins and arteries come together or where the ligaments and tendons join, much less from obvious big bones. A good cook changes his cleaver once a year because he chops. An ordinary cook changes his cleaver once a month because he hacks. Now I’ve been using my cleaver for nineteen years and have cut up thousands of oxen with it, but the blade is still as fresh as though it had just come from the grindstone.
Plato, Phaedrus, 265e (1997: 542)
[The goal of the method of division] is to be able to cut up each kind according to its species along its natural joints, and to try not to splinter any part, as a bad butcher might do.
Plato, Parmenides, 156c–d (1997: 388)
[A thing] won’t be able to undergo being previously at rest and later in motion or being previously in motion and later at rest without changing. […] Yet there is no time in which something can, simultaneously, be neither in motion nor at rest. […] Yet surely it also doesn’t change without changing. […] Is there, then, this queer thing in which it might be, just when it changes? — What queer thing? — The instant. The instant seems to signify something such that changing occurs from it to each of two states. For a thing doesn’t change from rest while rest continues, or from motion while motion continues. Rather, this queer creature, the instant, lurks between motion and rest.
Aristotle, Physics, VI, 234a24–b9 (1984: 395–396)
[N]othing can be in motion in a now. […] Nor can anything be at rest. […] Inasmuch as it is the same now that belongs to both the times [past and future], and it is possible for a thing to be in motion throughout one time and to be at rest throughout the other, and that which is in motion or at rest for the whole of a time will be in motion or at rest in any part of it in which it is of such a nature as to be in motion or at rest: it [would] follow that the same thing can at the same time be at rest and in motion; for both the times have the same extremity, viz. the now. […] It follows then that the motion of that which is in motion and the rest of that which is at rest must occupy time.
Aristotle, Metaphysics, V, 1022a4–5 (1984: 1613).
We call a limit the last point of each thing, i.e., the first point beyond which it is not possible to find any part, and the first point within which every part is. [Note: This standard translation differs from the one given in Section 1 above, which did not use the word ‘point’. The Greek text only says ‘the last’ and ‘the first’, without accompanying sortals, so a generic word such as ‘thing’ seemed more appropriate in the present context than ‘point’.]
Aristotle, Metaphysics, XI, 1060b12–17 (1984: 1675–1676)
If we are to suppose lines or what comes after these (I mean the primary surfaces) to be principles, these at least are not separable substances, but sections and divisions — the former of surfaces, the latter of bodies (while points are sections and divisions of lines); and further they are limits of these same things; and all these are in other things and none is separable.
Euclid, Elements, I, defs. 1–3, 5–6, 13 (1926: 153)
A point is that which has no part. A line is breadthless length. The extremities of a line are points. […] A surface is that which has length and breadth only. The extremities of a surface are lines. […] A boundary is that which is an extremity of anything.
Ovid, Fasti, II, 657–660 (2000: 47)
The simple neighborhood meets and celebrates the feast, and chants your praises, holy Terminus: You confine peoples and cities and great kingdoms; all land would be disputed without you. You seek none’s favour, you are bribed by no gold; you guard entrusted lands with pledge of law.
Plutarch, Numa, XVI, 1–2 (1914: 363)
Terminus signifies boundary, and to this god they make public and private sacrifices where their fields are set off by boundaries; of living victims nowadays, but anciently the sacrifice was a bloodless one, since Numa reasoned that the god of boundaries was a guardian of peace and a witness of just dealing, and should therefore be clear of slaughter. […] He knew that a boundary, if observed, fetters lawless power; and if not observed, convicts of injustice.
Aulus Gellius, Noctes Atticae, VI.xiii.5–6 (1795: 2/32)
It was asked, When a dying man could be said to die; at the time he actually expired, or when he was on the point of expiring? When a person rising could be said to rise; when he actually stood, or when he was but just sitting? He who learned any art, at what time he became an artist; when he was really one, or when he was just not one? If you assert any one of these, you assert what is absurd and ridiculous; yet it will appear more absurd, if you assert both or allow neither.
Sextus Empiricus, Against the Physicists, I, 269 (2012: 52–53)
Socrates dies either while being or while not being. […] Well, when he is and is alive, he does not die; after all, he is alive; but again, he does not die having died, since then he will be dying twice, which is absurd. So Socrates does not die.
Sextus Empiricus, Against the Physicists, I, 260–264 (2012: 51–52)
[A] whole does not reasonably touch a whole; for if a whole touches a whole, it will not be touching but a unification of them both, and the two bodies will be one body. […] Then again, it is not possible for a part to touch a part. For the part is conceived as a part in virtue of its state in relation to the whole, but in terms of its own limits it is a whole. […] Then again, nor does a whole touch a part. For if the whole is going to touch the part, the whole, being shrunk down together with the part, will be a part, and the part, being stretched out alongside the whole, will be a whole. […] And the same argument applies to the converse. […] Hence if neither the whole touches the whole, nor the part the part, nor the whole the part, nor the reverse, nothing touches anything.
John of Damascus, The Fount of Knowledge, I, 8 (1958: 27)
Definition is the term for the setting of land boundaries taken in a metaphorical sense. For, just as the boundary separates that which belongs to one from that which belongs to another, so does the definition set off the nature of one thing from that of any other.
Boethius, Second Commentary on Porphyry’s Isagoge I, xi, 14–21 (1994: 23–24)
A line is something in a body. And what it is it owes to the body. That is, it keeps its being through the body. This is explained as follows. If it is separated from the body, it does not subsist. Who by any sense faculty ever grasped a line separated from a body?
Peter Abelard, Glosses on Porphyry, 8.1–4 (1994: 26)
There are two species of incorporeals. Some of them, such as God and the soul, can endure in their incorporeality outside sensibles. But others, such as a line without subject body, are entirely unable to be outside the sensibles they are in.
Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna), The Book of the Healing – Metaphysics, II, ii, 4–6 (2005: 50)
[T]he body is the substance for which it is possible for you to begin by postulating in it a dimension in whatever manner you desire. […] It is due to the body’s having this description that one refers to body as being long, wide, and deep, just as it is said that body is that which is divisible in [terms] of all dimensions.
Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna), The Book of the Healing – Physics, III, ii, 8–10 (2009: 269–271)
Continuous is an equivocal term that is said in three senses […] One […] is said of the magnitude that it is continuous with another when its limit and that of the other are one. […] The second […] is said of that which, when one side of the continuous thing is moved in a direction away from the other, the other follows it. […] Something is said to be continuous in itself when it is such that you can posit parts for it between which there is the continuity that is in the first sense.
Ibn Rušd (Averroes), On Aristotle’s Metaphysics, I, 7 (2010: 36)
[In the language of] the masses, ‘one’ generally signifies such things only inasmuch as they are isolated from other things and set apart by their essence […] Some of these things are isolated by the places which encompass them (this is the commonest meaning of being-isolated), others are isolated by their limits only (this [applies to] the contiguous), again others are those which are isolated only by imagination (this is how number is attached to what is continuous).
John Duns Scotus, Ordinatio, II, d. 2/2, q. 5, ad 2 (1973: 323–324; Eng. trans. by Peter L. P. Simpson)
If a point is only a privation, line too will be only a privation, as well as surface and solid; for a termed thing is defined by what terminates it and something positive does not essentially include a privation. […] And from this further is inferred something unacceptable, that if a surface is only the privation of depth, how will a point be the privation of a privation? […] In addition, there are on a surface many corporeal or sensible qualities, as it seems. Therefore a surface is not merely a privation.
William of Ockham, Quodlibetal Questions, I, q. 9, ad 2 (1991: 53)
[T]he spherical body does not touch the flat body primarily with a part that is such that each of its parts touches the flat body. Therefore, it does not touch it primarily with some part that is prior to all the other touching parts. Rather, any given touching part is still such that a half of it does not touch immediately, and a half of that half does not touch immediately, and so on ad infinitum.
Leonardo da Vinci, Notebooks (1938: 76)
What is it […] that divides the atmosphere from the water? It is necessary that there should be a common boundary which is neither air nor water but is without substance, because a body interposed between two bodies prevents their contact, and this does not happen in water with air. […] Therefore a surface is the common boundary of two bodies which are not continuous, and does not form part of either one or the other, for if the surface formed part of it, it would have divisible bulk, whereas, however, it is not divisible and nothingness divides these bodies the one from the other.
Mullā Ṣadrā, al-Asfār al-Arba‘a, IV, 274 (Eng. trans. from Rezaei and Bozorgi 2001: 34)
If there is no common boundary between water and air which is the warmest instance of water and the coldest of air, it will require that in an instance, that is when water transforms into air, hyle stays formless, which is impossible.
Michelangelo Buonarroti, Sonnet 151, 1–4 (1996: 195)
The greatest artist does not have any concept which a single piece of marble does not itself contain within its excess, though only a hand that obeys the intellect can discover it.
Francisco Suárez, Metaphysical Disputations 40, V, §41 (1861: 562–563; Eng. trans. by Robert Pasnau)
[I]t could plausibly be said that a line can be conserved by God without a limiting point, and a surface without a line, and a body without a surface.
Francisco Suárez, Metaphysical Disputations 40, V, §58 (1861: 567; Eng. trans. by Robert Pasnau)
Suppose that, in the continuous surface of a wall, one half is maximally white and the other half is maximally black, and those qualities each have their own indivisible boundaries [termini] by which they are contained and limited. It will then be necessary that, from that part in virtue of which they are contiguous, they each have their own boundaries inhering at the same time in the same line connecting the quantitative surface. […] From this it further happens that in the same indivisible boundary of matter there would be, at the same, time two specific substantial forms with respect to something that is indivisible in extension.
René Descartes, Principles of Philosophy, II.15 (1985: 229)
‘Surface’ here does not mean any part of the surrounding body but merely the boundary between the surrounding and surrounded bodies, which is no more than a mode. Or rather what is meant is simply the common surface, which is not a part of one body rather than the other but is always reckoned to be the same, provided it keeps the same size and shape.
Pierre Bayle, Historical and Critical Dictionary, art. ‘Zeno’, remark G.IV (1734–1738: 5/613)
[S]ome scholastic Philosophers […] suppose, that nature hath intermixed Mathematical points with the parts divisible in infinitum, to the end that they may serve to connect them, and compose the extremities of bodies. They thought by that means to answer also the objection of the penetrative contact of two surfaces: but this evasion is so absurd, that it doth not deserve to be refuted.
David Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, I, ii, 4 (1978: 44)
[I]f we have the idea of indivisible points, lines and surfaces conformable to the definition, their existence is certainly possible: but if we have no such idea, ’tis impossible we can ever conceive the termination of any figure; without which conception there can be no geometrical demonstration.
Margaret Cavendish, Observations upon Experimental Philosophy, I, xxxi (2001: 129)
[T]he opinion of atoms, is fitter for a poetical fancy, than for serious philosophy […] there cannot be atoms in nature, or else nature would be like a beggar’s coat full of lice: Neither would she be able to rule those wandering and straggling atoms, because […] each is a single body by itself, having no dependence upon each other. Wherefore, if there should be a composition of atoms, it would not be a body made of parts, but of so many whole and entire single bodies, meeting together as a swarm of bees.
Leonhard Euler, Lettres à une princesse d’Allemagne, CII (1795: 453)
As a general notion contains an infinite number of individual objects, we may consider it as a space in which they are all contained. Thus, for the notion of man we form a space […] in which we conceive all men to be comprehended. For the notion of mortal we form another, […] in which we conceive every thing mortal to be comprehended. And when I affirm, all men are mortal, it is the same thing with affirming, that the first figure is contained in the second.
John Venn, ‘On the Diagrammatic and Mechanical Representation of Propositions and Reasonings’ (1880: 1)
What we here represent is, of course, the extent or scope of each term of the proposition. We draw two circles, and make them include or exclude or intersect one another, according as the classes denoted by the terms happen to stand in relation to one another in this respect.
Jean Jacques Rousseau, Discourse on the Origin of Inequality (1992: 44)
The first person who, having enclosed a plot of land, took it into his head to say this is mine and found people simple enough to believe him, was the true founder of civil society. What crimes, wars, murders, what miseries and horrors would the human race have been spared, had someone pulled up the stakes or filled the ditch and cried out to his fellow men: ‘Do not listed to this impostor’.
Alphonse de Lamartine, ‘La Marseillaise de la paix’ (1841: 796)
Do we see any trace of boundaries in the sky? Does its dome have a wall, a marker, a center? Nations! A pompous word to say barbarity!
Immanuel Kant, Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, §57 (1783: 94)
In all bounds there is something positive (e.g., a surface is the boundary of corporeal space, and is therefore itself a space, a line is a space, which is the boundary of the surface, a point the boundary of the line, but yet always a place in space), whereas limits contain mere negations.
Georg Wilhelm F. Hegel, The Science of Logic, I, i, 1.2.B.b (1833: 98–99)
[I]n limit, something marks the boundary of its other. […] Something, as an immediate existence, is therefore the limit with respect to another something; but it has this limit in it and is something through the mediation of that limit, which is just as much its non-being. The limit is the mediation in virtue of which something and other each both is and is not.
Lobačevskij, New Principles of Geometry (1835–1938: 21–22)
Surfaces, lines, points, as geometry defines them, exist only in our imagination. […] We will attach ourselves only to ideas which in our mind unite themselves directly to the conception of bodies to which our imagination is habituated.
Bernard Bolzano Paradoxes of the Infinite, §66 (1851: 167–168)
I define the limit of a body as the aggregate of all the extreme [äusserst] ether-atoms which still belong to it. […] A closer consideration further shows that many bodies are at certain places altogether devoid of limiting atoms; none of their atoms can be described as the extreme ones among those which still belong to it and would accompany it if it started to move. [Two bodies are in contact] when the extreme atoms of the one, […] together with certain atoms of the other, form a continuous extension.
Franz Brentano, ‘Nativistic, Empiricist, and Anoetistic Theories of our Presentation of Space’ (1976: 146)
One of the two lines into which the line would be split upon division would […] have an end point, but the other no beginning point. This inference has been quite correctly drawn by Bolzano, who was led thereby to his monstrous doctrine that there would exist bodies with and without surfaces, the one class containing just so many as the other, because contact would be possible only between a body with a surface and another without. He ought, rather, to have had his attention drawn by such consequences to the fact that the whole conception of the line and of other continua as sets of points runs counter to the concept of contact and thereby abolishes precisely what makes up the essence of the continuum.
Franz Brentano, ‘On What Is Continuous’ (1976: 12 and 41)
Because a boundary, even when itself continuous, can never exist except as belonging to something continuous of more dimensions […], it is, considered for itself, nothing other than a universal, to which — as to other universals — more than one thing can correspond. And the geometer’s proposition that only one straight line is conceivable between two points, is strictly speaking false. […] If a red surface and a blue surface are in contact with each other, then a red and a blue line coincide.
Charles S. Peirce, ‘The Logic of Quantity’ (1893: 7.127)
A drop of ink has fallen upon the paper and I have walled it round. Now every point of the area within the walls is either black or white; and no point is both black and white. That is plain. The black is, however, all in one spot or blot; it is within bounds. There is a line of demarcation between the black and the white. Now I ask about the points of this line, are they black or white? Why one more than the other? Are they (A) both black and white or (B) neither black nor white? Why A more than B, or B more than A? […] The logical conclusion […] is that the points of the boundary do not exist.
Ambrose Bierce, ‘The Devil’s Dictionary’ (1881: 323)
Boundary, n. In political geography, an imaginary line between two nations, separating the imaginary rights of one from the imaginary rights of the other.
Gottlob Frege, The Foundations of Arithmetic §26 (1884: 35)
One calls the equator an imaginary line, but it would be wrong to call it a line that has merely been thought up. It was not created by thought as the result of a psychological process, but is only apprehended or grasped by thought. If its being apprehended were a matter of its coming into being, then we could not say anything positive about the equator for any time prior to this supposed coming into being.
Gottlob Frege, The Fundamental Laws of Arithmetic, Vol. II, §56 (1903: 159)
A definition of a concept (of a possible predicate) must […] unambiguously determine, as regards any object, whether or not it falls under the concept. […] We may express this metaphorically as follows: the concept must have a sharp boundary. To a concept without sharp boundary there would correspond an area that had not a sharp boundary-line all around, but in places just vaguely faded away into the background. […] The law of the excluded middle is really just another form of the requirement that the concept should have a sharp boundary.
George Nathaniel Curzon, Frontiers (1907: 13 and 54)
I have accepted the broad distinction between Natural and Artificial Frontiers, both as generally recognized, and as scientifically the most exact. […] There is also a class of so-called Natural Frontiers which I have been obliged to omit, as possessing no valid claim to the title, namely those which are claimed by nations as natural on grounds of ambition, or expediency, or more often sentiment. The attempt to realize Frontiers of this type has been responsible for many of the wars, and some of the most tragic vicissitudes in history. .
W. E. B. Du Bois, The Souls of Black Folk (1903: vi, 13, 40); also in ‘The Color Line Belts the World’ (1906: 30)
The problem of the Twentieth Century is the problem of the color-line.
Lucien Febvre, La Terre et l’évolution humaine (1922: 297)
For the whole problem is, or appears to us to be, a question of boundaries. Within us, so deeply implanted that we no longer notice its hold on us, there is a certain idea of the ‘natural limits’ of the great States which causes us to think of their boundaries as things in themselves, having an actual value, a kind of mechanical virtue, and a compulsory and at the same time creative power. […] A whole philosophy of history [is] comprised in that word ‘natural’.
William James, Pragmatism (1907: 247)
Hence, even in the field of sensation, our minds exert a certain arbitrary choice. By our inclusions and omissions we trace the field’s extent; by our emphasis we mark its foreground and its background; by our order we read it in this direction or in that. We receive in short the block of marble, but we carve the statue ourselves.
Ernst Cassirer, Philosophie der symbolischen Formen (1923: 280)
The beginning of thought and speech is not this: we do not simply seize on and name certain distinctions that are somewhere present in feeling or intuition; on the contrary, on our own initiative we draw certain dividing lines, effect certain separations and connections, by virtue of which distinct individual configurations emerge from the uniform flux of consciousness.
Ludwig Wittgenstein, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, 5.6
The limits [Grenzen] of my language mean the limits of my world.
Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, I, §99 (1953: 45e)
An indefinite boundary is not really a boundary at all. Here one thinks perhaps: if I say ‘I have locked the man up fast in the room — there is only one door left open’ — then I simply haven’t locked him in at all; his being locked in is a sham.
Ludwig Wittgenstein, Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, II, §626 (1980: 108e)
It is unnatural to draw a conceptual boundary line where there is not some special justification for it, where similarities would constantly draw us across the arbitrarily drawn line.
Alfred N. Whitehead, An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Natural Knowledge (1919: 5)
An investigation into the foundations of geometry has to explain space as a complex of relations between things. It has to describe what a point is, and has to show how the geometric relations between points issue from the ultimate relations between the ultimate things which are the immediate objects of knowledge. Thus the starting point of a discussion on the foundations of geometry is a discussion of the character of the immediate data of perception. It is not now open to mathematicians to assume sub silentio that points are among these data.
William Ernest Johnson, Logic, Part III: The Logical Foundations of Science (1924: 163–164)
We are thus led to distinguish between the parts of a whole, and the boundaries between these parts. The parts of a line are lines, the parts of an area are areas, the parts of a region are regions; but the boundary between contiguous parts of a line is a point, and the boundary between contiguous parts of an area is a line, and the boundary between contiguous parts of a region is an area or surface. The parts of a whole, therefore, are homogeneous with one another and with the whole; but […] the boundaries between two contiguous parts are always of one lower order of dimensions than the parts.
Susan Stebbing, A Modern Introduction to Logic (1930: 452 and 451)
[The] success of physics in dealing with the sensible world is inexplicable unless such expressions as ‘point’, ‘line’, ‘moment’, ‘instantaneous space’, ‘momentary configurations’ can be expressed in terms of what is sensible. […] It does not matter that a point should prove to be a complicated structure provided that its logical relations are simple and have the necessary formal properties. […] All that matters in deduction are the purely formal, or logical, properties of the terms that enter into the deduction; the nature of the term itself has no relevance.
Robert Musil, The Man Without Qualities (1930: 22)
Ultimately a thing exists only by virtue of its boundaries, which means by a more or less hostile act against its surroundings: without the Pope there would have been no Luther, and without the pagans no Pope.
H. H. Price, Perception (1932: 106)
A surface must be the surface of something; and not merely that, it must be the surface of some material thing. Indeed, there is really no such entity as a surface; there are only solid things thus and thus surfaced. ‘Surface,’ it is true, is a substantive in grammar; but it is not the name of a particular existent, but of an attribute.
Percy Stanley Fritz, Colorado, the Centennial State (1941: 3)
The State of Colorado is primarily a mental concept. It is an arbitrary political designation made for convenience sake. There are no natural boundaries whatsoever. If, when you leave the State of Colorado in your automobile, you should miss seeing the sign by the roadside which says ‘Colorado–Kansas’, you would never know that you had passed from one State to the other. […] If a windstorm happened to carry away the state boundary sign, it would require a surveyor with precision instruments to tell where the boundary was. The State of Colorado is simply a convenient legal fiction.
Jan O. M. Broek, ‘The Problem of Natural Frontiers’ (1941: 8)
One of the most powerful arguments to make a frontier seem just is to stamp it as a natural frontier.
Stephen Jones, Boundary-Making (1945: 3)
The goodness or badness of a boundary depends as much upon the general situation as upon the details of delimitation and demarcation. A boundary, like the human skin, may have diseases of its own or may reflect the illnesses of the body.
Martin Heidegger, ‘Building Dwelling Thinking’ (1952: 154)
A boundary is not that at which something stops but, as the Greeks recognized, the boundary is that from which something begins its presencing.
John L. Austin, Sense and Sensibilia (1962: 100)
It is […] wrong to imply that everything has a surface. Where and what exactly is the surface of a cat?
J. J. Gibson, The Ecological Approach to Visual Perception (1979: 23)
The surface is where most of the action is. The surface is where light is reflected or absorbed, not the interior of the substance. The surface is what touches the animal, not the interior. The surface is where chemical reactions mostly take place. The surface is where vaporization or diffusion of substances into the medium occurs. And the surface is where vibrations of the substance are transmitted into the medium.
George Spencer-Brown, Laws of Form (1969: 1)
Distinction is perfect continence. That is to say, a distinction is drawn by arranging a boundary with separate sides so that a point on one side cannot reach the other side without crossing a boundary. For example, in a plane space a circle draws a distinction.
Michael Dummett, Frege. Philosophy of Language (1973: 577)
The picture of reality as an amorphous lump, not yet articulated into discrete objects, thus proves to be a correct one, so long as we make the right use of it.
Nelson Goodman, ‘Notes on the Well-Made World’ (1983: 104)
Now as we thus make constellations by picking out and putting together certain stars rather than others, so we make stars by drawing certain boundaries rather than others. Nothing dictates whether the skies shall be marked off into constellations or other objects. We have to make what we find, be it the Great Dipper, Sirius, food, fuel, or a stereo system.
Alan Sidelle, ‘Rigidity, Ontology, and Semantic Structure’ (1992: 172)
The world is capable of being cut up in so many ways, and whenever we consider such a cut (some principle of individuation), we are considering the world cut that way, i.e., so articulated. An articulation will specify both actual conditions which must be met for something to be (an) F, and identity conditions for tracing Fs through space, time, and possible worlds. If there are portions of the world which meet the actual conditions, then there are Fs.
Roderick Chisholm, ‘Boundaries as Dependent Particulars’ (1984: 88)
If the continuous object is cut in half, then does the one boundary [that demarcates two adjacent parts] become two boundaries, one thing thus becoming two things? […] But how can one thing — even if it is only a boundary — become two things? And does this mean that when two things become continuous, then two things that had been diverse become identical with each other, two things thus becoming one thing?
David K. Lewis, The Plurality of Worlds (1986: 212)
The reason why it’s vague where the outback begins is not that there’s this thing, the outback, with imprecise borders; rather there are many things, with different borders, and nobody has been fool enough to try to enforce a choice of one of them as the official referent of the word ‘outback’.
Michael Tye, ‘Vague Objects’ (1990: 535)
There is no line which sharply divides the matter composing [Mount] Everest from the matter outside it. Everest’s boundaries are fuzzy. Some molecules are inside Everest and some molecules outside. But some have an indefinite status: there is no objective, determinate fact of the matter about whether they are inside or outside.
Mark Sainsbury, ‘Concepts without Boundaries’ (1990: 257)
A vague concept is boundaryless in that no boundary marks the things which fall under it from the things which do not, and no boundary marks the things which definitely fall under it from the things which do not definitely do so; and so on. Manifestations are the unwillingness of knowing subjects to draw any such boundaries, the cognitive impossibility of identifying such boundaries, and the needlessness and even disutility of such boundaries.
Peter Simons, ‘Faces, Boundaries, and Thin Layers’ (1991: 91)
If a macroscopic body consists of spatially separate particles […] a connected boundary would need to bridge the gaps between the [particles] and thus would be both am ‘imaginary’ rather than real entity (like saying a fakir bed of nails has a flat top) and to some extent arbitrary (like the curves scientists draw through the scattered and inexact data to give a smooth graph).
Eviatar Zerubavel, The Fine Line (1991: 5)
We transform the natural world into a social one by carving out of it mental chunks we then treat as if they were discrete, totally detached from their surroundings. The way we mark off islands of property is but one example of the general process by which we create meaningful social entities.
Catherine Elgin, ‘Unnatural Science’ (1995: 297)
Our parochial concerns pretty clearly influence our choice of categories for macroscopic objects and kinds. […] It would be rather remarkable if, for example, a taxonomy that draws the distinction between horses and zebras where we do aligned at all well with natural categories suitable for describing the cosmos as a whole, but indifferent to human faculties and ends.
Barry Smith, ‘On Drawing Lines on a Map’ (1995: 479)
The interiors of fiat objects are […] autonomous portions of autonomous reality. Only the respective external boundaries are created by us; it is these which are the products of our mental and linguistic activity, and of associated conventional laws, norms and habits.
Barry Smith, ‘On Substances, Accidents and Universals’ (1997b: 122)
Delineation is, be it noted, an immensely powerful faculty of cognition; the scope of delineatory intentionality, the effortlessness with which we can comprehend highly complex wholes — which may be scattered throughout the length and breadth of the universe, in both space and time — with a simple delineatory act (‘the legacy of the Renaissance’, ‘the Austro-Hungarian Empire and its successor states’, ‘English poetry’) is wondrous to behold, and bears comparison with the magic of single-rayed intentionality, whereby, on the basis of a list of entries which might be drawn up entirely at random, we can be directed, in succession, to mountains in Siberia, teapots in Halifax, and black holes in the galaxy of Mog.
Raviel Netz, 2009, Barbed Wire (2009: xi)
Define, on the two-dimensional surface of the earth, lines across which motion is to be prevented, and you have one of the key themes of history. With a closed line (i.e., a curve enclosing a figure), and the prevention of motion from outside the line to its inside, you derive the idea of property. With the same line, and the prevention of motion from inside to outside, you derive the idea of prison. With an open line (i.e., a curve that does not enclose a figure), and the prevention of motion in either direction, you derive the idea of border. Properties, prisons, borders: it is through the prevention of motion that space enters history.
Gloria E. Anzaldúa, Borderlands/La Frontera (1987: 3)
Borders are set up to define the places that are safe and unsafe, to distinguish us from them. A border is a dividing line, a narrow strip along a steep edge. A borderland is a vague and undetermined place created by the emotional residue of an unnatural boundary. It is in a constant state of transition. The prohibited and forbidden are its inhabitants. Los atravesados live here: the squint-eyed, the perverse, the queer, the troublesome, the mongrel, the mulato, the half-breed, the half dead; in short, those who cross over, pass over, or go through the confines of the ‘normal’.
Sally Haslanger, ‘Feminism in Metaphysics: Negotiating the Natural’ (2000: 116; 2012: 148–149)
[T]here is an unmistakable pattern of projecting onto women and people of color, as their ‘nature’ or as ‘natural’, features that are instead (if manifested at all) a product of social forces. This projective error has led feminists to be extremely suspicious of natural kinds and objective types: if one function of references to ‘nature’ or ‘natures’ is to mark the boundaries of what is socially possible, thereby ‘justifying’ pernicious institutions, we must be wary of the suggestion that any category is ‘natural’. […] Is there any meaningful (and politically viable) distinction between the natural and the social, and if so, where does the line fall? Is there any way to theorize about what’s natural that does not depend on the projection of our political biases? If so, how?
Sarah Green, ‘A Sense of Border’ (2012: 580)
While it is clear that borders do not independently exist as self-evident entities in the landscape […] it is also the case that once constructed (which includes all the various associated bordering practices, both formal and informal), borders can take on thing-like qualities, both in practice and in people’s imaginations.
Jody Azzouni, Ontology without Borders (2017: 143)
[T]here are no worldly ontological borders between purported objects; there are no properties, no relations — no aspects of anything in the world — that constitute or amount to worldly individuation conditions for objects […] we project object boundaries onto the world.


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